First published Mon Jul 15, 2019; substantive revision Sat May 25, 2024

Socialism is a rich tradition of political thought and practice, the history of which contains a vast number of views and theories, often differing in many of their conceptual, empirical, and normative commitments. Going back a century, Angelo Rappoport in his 1924 Dictionary of Socialism canvassed no fewer than forty definitions of socialism, telling his readers in the book’s preface that “there are many mansions in the House of Socialism” (Rappoport 1924: v, 34–41). To take even a relatively restricted subset of socialist thought, Leszek Kołakowski could fill over 1,300 pages in his magisterial survey of Main Currents of Marxism (Kołakowski 1978 [2008]). Our aim is of necessity more modest. In what follows, we are concerned to present the main features of socialism, both as a critique of capitalism, and as a proposal for its replacement. Our focus is predominantly on literature written within a philosophical idiom, focusing in particular on philosophical writing on socialism produced during the past forty-or-so years. Furthermore, our discussion concentrates on the normative contrast between socialism and capitalism as economic systems. Both socialism and capitalism grant workers legal control of their labor power, but socialism, unlike capitalism, requires that the bulk of the means of production workers use to yield goods and services be under the effective control of workers themselves, rather than in the hands of the members of a different, capitalist class under whose direction they must toil. As we will explain below, this contrast has been articulated further in different ways, and socialists have not only made distinctive claims regarding economic organization but also regarding the processes of transformation fulfilling them and the principles and ideals orienting their justification (including, as we will see, certain understandings of freedom, equality, solidarity, and democracy).[1]

1. Socialism and Capitalism

Socialism is best defined in contrast with capitalism, as socialism has arisen both as a critical challenge to capitalism, and as a proposal for overcoming and replacing it. In the classical, Marxist definition (G.A. Cohen 2000a: ch. 3; Fraser 2014: 57–9), capitalism involves certain relations of production. These comprise certain forms of control over the productive forces—the labor power that workers deploy in production and the means of production such as natural resources, tools, and spaces they employ to yield goods and services—and certain social patterns of economic interaction that typically correlate with that control. Capitalism displays the following constitutive features:

  • (i) The bulk of the means of production is privately owned and controlled.
  • (ii) People legally own their labor power. (Here capitalism differs from slavery and feudalism, under which systems some individuals are entitled to control, whether completely or partially, the labor power of others).
  • (iii) Markets are the main mechanism allocating inputs and outputs of production and determining how societies’ productive surplus is used, including whether and how it is consumed or invested.

An additional feature that is typically present wherever (i)–(iii) hold, is that:

  • (iv) There is a class division between capitalists and workers, involving specific relations (e.g., whether of bargaining, conflict, or subordination) between those classes, and shaping the labor market, the firm, and the broader political process.

The existence of wage labor is often seen by socialists as a necessary condition for a society to be counted as capitalist (Schweickart 2002 [2011: 23]). Typically, workers (unlike capitalists) must sell their labor power to make a living. They sell it to capitalists, who (unlike the workers) control the means of production. Capitalists typically subordinate workers in the production process, as capitalists have asymmetric decision-making power over what gets produced and how it gets produced. Capitalists also own the output of production and sell it in the market, and they control the predominant bulk of the flow of investment within the economy. The relation between capitalists and workers can involve cooperation, but also relations of conflict (e.g., regarding wages and working conditions). This more-or-less antagonistic power relationship between capitalists and workers plays out in a number of areas, within production itself, and in the broader political process, as in both the economic and political domains decisions are made about who does what, and who gets what.

There are possible economic systems that would present exceptions, in which (iv) does not hold even if (i), (ii) and (iii) all obtain. Examples here are a society of independent commodity producers or a property-owning democracy (in which individuals or groups of workers own firms). There is debate, however, as to how feasible—accessible and stable—these are in a modern economic environment (O’Neill 2012).

Another feature that is also typically seen as arising where (i)–(iii) hold is this:

  • (v) Production is primarily oriented to capital accumulation (i.e., economic production is primarily oriented to profit rather than to the satisfaction of human needs). (G.A. Cohen 2000a; Roemer 2017).

In contrast to capitalism, socialism can be defined as a type of society in which, at a minimum, (i) is turned into (i*):

  • (i*) The bulk of the means of production is under social, democratic control.

Changes with regard to features (ii), (iii), and (v) are hotly debated amongst socialists. Regarding (ii), socialists retain the view that workers should control their labor power, but many do not affirm the kind of absolute, libertarian property rights in labor power that would, e.g., prevent taxation or other forms of mandatory contribution to cater for the basic needs of others (G.A. Cohen 1995). Regarding (iii), there is a recent burgeoning literature on “market socialism”, which we discuss below, where proposals are advanced to create an economy that is socialist but nevertheless features extensive markets. Finally, regarding (v), although most socialists agree that, due to competitive pressures, capitalists are bound to seek profit maximization, some puzzle over whether when they do this, it is “greed and fear” and not the generation of resources to make others besides themselves better-off that is the dominant, more basic drive and hence the degree to which profit-maximization should be seen as a normatively troubling phenomenon. (See Steiner 2014, in contrast with G.A. Cohen 2009, discussing the case of capitalists amassing capital to give it away through charity.) Furthermore, some socialists argue that the search for profits in a market socialist economy is not inherently suspicious (Schweickart 2002 [2011]). Most socialists, however, tend to find the profit motive problematic.

An important point about this definition of socialism is that socialism is not equivalent to, and is arguably in conflict with, statism. (i*) involves expansion of social power—power based on the capacity to mobilize voluntary cooperation and collective action—as distinct from state power—power based on the control of rule-making and rule enforcing over a territory—as well of economic power—power based on the control of material resources (Wright 2010). If a state controls the economy but is not in turn democratically controlled by the individuals engaged in economic life, what we have is some form of statism, not socialism (see also Arnold in Other Internet Resources (OIR), 2022; Dardot & Laval 2014).

2. Three Dimensions of Socialist Views

When characterizing socialist views, it is useful to distinguish between three dimensions of a conception of a social justice (Gilabert 2017a; Gilabert 2023a: ch. 4). We identify these three dimensions as:

  • (DI) the core ideals and principles animating that conception of justice;
  • (DII) the social institutions and practices implementing the ideals specified at DI;
  • (DIII) the processes of transformation leading agents and their society from where they are currently, to the social outcome specified in DII.

The characterization of capitalism and socialism in the previous section focuses on the social institutions and practices constituting each form of society (i.e., on DII). We step back from this institutional dimension in section 3, below, to consider the central normative commitments of socialism (DI) and to survey their deployment in the socialist critique of capitalism. We then, in section 4, engage in a more detailed discussion of accounts of the institutional shape of socialism (DII), exploring the various proposed implementations of socialist ideals and principles outlined under DI. We turn to accounts of the transition to socialism (DIII) in section 5.

3. Socialist Critiques of Capitalism and their Grounds (Dimension DI)

Socialists have condemned capitalism by alleging that it typically features exploitation, domination, alienation, and inefficiency. Before surveying these criticisms, it is important to note that they rely on various ideals and principles at DI. We first mention these grounds briefly, and then elaborate on them as we discuss their engagement in socialists’ critical arguments. We set aside the debate, conducted mostly during the 1980s and largely centered on the interpretation of Marx’s writings, as to whether the condemnation of capitalism and the advocacy for socialism relies (or should rely), on moral grounds (Geras 1985; Lukes 1985; Peffer 1990). Whereas some Marxist socialists take the view that criticism of capitalism can be conducted without making use—either explicitly or implicitly—of arguments with a moral foundation, our focus is on arguments that do rely on such grounds.

3.1 Socialist Principles

Socialists have deployed ideals and principles of equality, democracy, individual freedom, self-realization, and community or solidarity. Regarding equality, they have proposed strong versions of the principle of equality of opportunity according to which everyone should have “broadly equal access to the necessary material and social means to live flourishing lives” (Wright 2010: 12; Roemer 1994a: 11–4; Nielsen 1985). Some, but by no means all, socialists construe equality of opportunity in a luck-egalitarian way, as requiring the neutralization of inequalities of access to advantage that result from people’s circumstances rather than their choices (G.A. Cohen 2009: 17–9). Socialists also embrace the ideal of democracy, requiring that people have “broadly equal access to the necessary means to participate meaningfully in decisions” affecting their lives (Wright 2010: 12; Arnold n.d. [OIR]: sect. 4; Love 2020). Many socialists say that democratic participation should be available not only at the level of governmental institutions, but also in various economic arenas (such as within the firm). Third, socialists are committed to the importance of individual freedom. This commitment includes versions of the standard ideas of negative liberty and non-domination (requiring security from inappropriate interference by others). But it also typically includes a more demanding, positive form of self-determination, as the “real freedom” of being able to develop one’s own projects and bring them to fruition (Elster 1985: 205; Gould 1988: ch. 1; Van Parijs 1995: ch. 1; Castoriadis 1979). An ideal of self-realization through autonomously chosen activities featuring people’s development and exercise of their creative and productive capacities in cooperation with others sometimes informs socialists’ positive views of freedom and equality—as in the view that there should be a requirement of access to the conditions of self-realization at work (Elster 1986: ch. 3; Gilabert 2023a: ch. 3; Kandiyali 2020). Finally, and relatedly, socialists often affirm an idea of community or solidarity, according to which people should organize their economic life so that they treat the freedom and well-being of others as intrinsically significant. People should recognize positive duties to support other people, or, as Einstein (1949) put it, a “sense of responsibility for [their] fellow men”. Or, as Cohen put it, people should “care about, and, where necessary and possible, care for, one another, and, too, care that they care about one another” (G.A. Cohen 2009: 34–5; see also Arnold 2020). Community is sometimes presented as a moral ideal which is not itself a demand of justice but can be used to temper problematic results permitted by some demands of justice (such as the inequalities of outcome permitted by a luck-egalitarian principle of equality of opportunity (G.A. Cohen 2009)). However, community is sometimes presented within socialist views as a demand of justice itself (Gilabert 2012). Some socialists also take solidarity as partly shaping a desirable form of “social freedom” in which people are able not only to advance their own good but also to act with and for others (Honneth 2015 [2017: ch. I]).

Given the diversity of fundamental principles to which socialists commonly appeal, it is perhaps unsurprising that few attempts have been made to link these principles under a unified framework. A suggested strategy has been to articulate some aspects of them as requirements flowing from what we might call the Abilities / Needs Principle, following Marx’s famous dictum, in The Critique of the Gotha Program, that a communist society should be organized so as to realize the goals of producing and distributing “From each according to [their] abilities, to each according to [their] needs”. This principle, presented with brevity and in the absence of much elaboration by Marx (Marx 1875 [1978b: 531]) has been interpreted in different ways. One, descriptive interpretation simply takes it to be a prediction of how people will feel motivated to act in a socialist society. Another, straightforwardly normative interpretation construes the Marxian dictum as stating duties to contribute to, and claims to benefit from, the social product—addressing the allocation of both the burdens and benefits of social cooperation. Its fulfillment would, in an egalitarian and solidaristic fashion, empower people to live flourishing lives (Carens 2003, Gilabert 2015, 2023a: ch. 3). The normative principle itself has also been interpreted as an articulation of the broader, and more basic, idea of human dignity. Aiming at solidaristic empowerment, this idea could be understood as requiring that we support people in the pursuit of a flourishing life by not blocking, and by enabling, the development and exercise of their valuable capacities, which are at the basis of their moral status as agents with dignity (Gilabert 2017b; Gilabert 2023a: chs. 1 and 3).

3.2 Socialist Charges against Capitalism

3.2.1 Exploitation

The first typical charge leveled by socialists is that capitalism features the exploitation of wage workers by their capitalist employers. Exploitation has been characterized in two ways. First, in the so-called “technical” Marxist characterization, workers are exploited by capitalists when the value embodied in the goods they can purchase with their wages is inferior to the value embodied in the goods they produce—with the capitalists appropriating the difference. To maximize the profit resulting from the sale of what the workers produce, capitalists have an incentive to keep wages low. This descriptive characterization, which focuses on the flow of surplus labor from workers to capitalists, differs from another common, normative characterization of exploitation, according to which exploitation involves taking unfair, wrongful, or unjust advantage of the productive efforts of others. An obvious question is when, if ever, incidents of exploitation in the technical sense involve exploitation in the normative sense. When is the transfer of surplus labor from workers to capitalists such that it involves wrongful advantage taking of the former by the latter? Socialists have provided at least four answers to this question. (For critical surveys see Arnsperger and Van Parijs 2003: ch. III; Vrousalis 2018; Wolff 1999).

The first answer is offered by the unequal exchange account, according to which A exploits B if and only if in their exchange A gets more than B does. This account effectively collapses the normative sense of exploitation into the technical one. But critics have argued that this account fails to provide sufficient conditions for exploitation in the normative sense. Not every unequal exchange is wrongful: it would not be wrong to transfer resources from workers to people who (perhaps through no choice or fault of their own) are unable to work.

A second proposal is to say that A exploits B if and only if A gets surplus labor from B in a way that is coerced or forced. This labor entitlement account (Holmstrom 1977; Reiman 1987) relies on the view that workers are entitled to the product of their labor, and that capitalists wrongly deprive them of it. In a capitalist economy, workers are compelled to transfer surplus labor to capitalists on pain of severe poverty. This is a result of the coercively enforced system of private property rights in the means of production. Since they do not control means of production to secure their own subsistence, workers have no reasonable alternative to selling their labor power to capitalists and to toil on the terms favored by the latter. Critics of this approach have argued that it, like the previous account, fails to provide sufficient conditions for wrongful exploitation because it would (counterintuitively) have to condemn transfers from workers to destitute people unable to work. Furthermore, it has been argued that the account fails to provide necessary conditions for the occurrence of exploitation. Problematic transfers of surplus labor can occur without coercion. For example, A may have sophisticated means of production, not obtained from others through coercion, and hire B to work on them at a perhaps unfairly low wage, which B voluntarily accepts despite having acceptable, although less advantageous, alternatives (Roemer 1994b: ch. 4).

The third, unfair distribution of productive endowments account suggests that the core problem with capitalist exploitation (and with other forms of exploitation in class-divided social systems) is that it proceeds against a background distribution of initial access to productive assets that is inegalitarian. A is an exploiter, and B is exploited, if and only if A gains from B’s labor and A would be worse off, and B better off, in an alternative hypothetical economic environment in which the initial distribution of assets was equal (with everything else remaining constant) (Roemer 1994b: 110). This account relies on a luck-egalitarian principle of equality of opportunity. (According to luck-egalitarianism, no one should be made worse-off than others due to circumstances beyond their control.) Critics have argued that, because of that, it fails to provide necessary conditions for wrongful exploitation. If A finds B stuck in a pit, it would be wrong for A to offer B rescue only if B signs a sweatshop contract with A—even if B happened to have fallen into the pit after voluntarily taking the risk to go hiking in an area well known to be dotted with such perilous obstacles (Vrousalis 2013, 2018). Other critics worry that this account neglects the centrality of relations of power or dominance between exploiters and exploited (Veneziani 2013).

A fourth approach directly focuses on the fact that exploitation typically arises when there is a significant power asymmetry between the parties involved. The more powerful instrumentalize and take advantage of the vulnerability of the less powerful to benefit from this asymmetry in positions (Goodin 1987). A specific version of this view, the domination for self-enrichment account (Vrousalis 2013, 2018, 2022), says that A exploits B if A benefits from a transaction in which A dominates B. (On this account, domination involves a disrespectful use of A’s power over B.) Capitalist property rights, with the resulting unequal access to the means of production, put propertyless workers at the mercy of capitalists, who use their superior power over them to extract surplus labor. A worry about this approach is that it does not explain when the more powerful party is taking too much from the less powerful party. For example, take a situation where A and B start with equal assets, but A chooses to work hard while B chooses to spend more time at leisure, so that at a later time A controls the means of production, while B has only their own labor power. We imagine that A offers B employment, and then ask, in light of their ex ante equal position, at what level of wage for B and profit for A would the transaction involve wrongful exploitation? To come to a settled view on this question, it might be necessary to combine reliance on a principle of freedom as non-domination with appeal to additional socialist principles addressing just distribution—such as some version of the principles of equality and solidarity mentioned above in section 3.1 (Gilabert 2023a: ch. 5).

3.2.2 Interference and domination

Capitalism is often defended by saying that it maximally extends people’s freedom, understood as the absence of interference. Socialism would allegedly depress that freedom by prohibiting or limiting capitalist activities such as setting up a private firm, hiring wage workers, and keeping, investing, or spending profits. Socialists generally acknowledge that a socialist economy would severely constrain some such freedoms. But they point out that capitalist property rights also involve interference. They remind us that “private property by one person presupposes non-ownership on the part of other persons” (Marx 1991: 812) and warn that often, although

liberals and libertarians see the freedom which is intrinsic to capitalism, they overlook the unfreedom which necessarily accompanies capitalist freedom. (G.A. Cohen 2011: 150)

Workers could and would be coercively interfered with if they tried to use means of production possessed by capitalists, to walk away with the products of their labor in capitalist firms, or to access consumption goods they do not have enough money to buy. In fact, every economic system opens some zones of non-interference while closing others. Hence the appropriate question is not whether capitalism or socialism involve interference—they both do—but whether either of them involves more net interference, or more troubling forms of interference, than the other. And the answer to that question is far from obvious. It could very well be that most agents in a socialist society face less (troublesome) interference as they pursue their projects of production and consumption than agents in a capitalist society (G.A. Cohen 2011: chs. 7–8).

Capitalist economic relations are often defended by saying that they are the result of free choices by consenting adults. Wage workers are not slaves or serfs—they have the legal right to refuse to work for capitalists. But socialists reply that the relationship between capitalists and workers actually involves domination. Workers are inappropriately subject to the will of capitalists in the shaping of the terms on which they work (both in the spheres of exchange and production, and within the broader political process). Workers’ consent to their exploitation is given in circumstances of deep vulnerability and asymmetry of power. According to Marx, two conditions help explain workers’ apparently free choice to enter into a nevertheless exploitative contract: (1) in capitalism (unlike in feudalism or slave societies) workers own their labor power, but (2) they do not own means of production. Because of their deprivation (2), workers have no reasonable alternative to using their entitlement (1) to sell their labor power to the capitalists—who do own the means of production (Marx 1867 [1990: 272–3]). Through labor-saving technical innovations spurred by competition, capitalism also constantly produces unemployment, which weakens the bargaining power of individual workers further. Thus, Marx says that although workers voluntarily enter into exploitative contracts, they are “compelled [to do so] by social conditions”.

The silent compulsion of economic relations sets the seal on the domination of the capitalist over the worker…. [The worker’s] dependence on capital … springs from the conditions of production themselves, and is guaranteed in perpetuity by them. (Marx 1867 [1990: 382, 899])

Because of the deep background inequality of power resulting from their structural position within a capitalist economy, workers accept a pattern of economic transaction in which they submit to the direction of capitalists during the activities of production, and surrender to those same capitalists a disproportional share of the fruits of their labor. Although some individual workers might be able to escape their vulnerable condition by saving and starting a firm of their own, most would find this extremely difficult, and they could not all do it simultaneously within capitalism (Elster 1985: 208–16; G.A. Cohen 1988: ch. 13).

Socialists sometimes say that capitalism flouts an ideal of non-domination as freedom from being subject to rules one has systematically less power to shape than others (Gourevitch 2013; Arnold 2017; O’Shea 2020; Cicerchia 2022; Gilabert 2017b: 566–7—on which this and the previous paragraph draw). Capitalist relations of production involve domination and the dependence of workers on the discretion of capitalists’ choices at three critical junctures. The first, mentioned above, concerns the labor contract. Due to their lack of control of the means of production, workers must largely submit, on pain of starvation or severe poverty, to the terms capitalists offer them. The second concerns interactions in the workplace. Capitalists and their managers rule the activities of workers by unilaterally deciding what and how the latter produce. Although in the sphere of circulation workers and capitalists might look (misleadingly, given the first point) like equally free contractors striking fair deals, once we enter the “hidden abode” of production it is clear to all sides that what exists is relationships of intense subjection of some to the will of others (Marx 1867 [1990: 279–80]). Workers effectively spend many of their waking hours doing what others dictate them to do. Third, and finally, capitalists have a disproportionate impact on the legal and political process shaping the institutional structure of the society in which they exploit workers, with capitalist interests dominating the political processes which in turn set the contours of property and labor law. Even if workers manage to obtain the legal right to vote and create their own trade unions and parties (which labor movements achieved in some countries after much struggle), capitalists exert disproportionate influence via greater access to mass media, the funding of political parties, the threat of disinvestment and capital flight if governments reduce their profit margin, and the past and prospective recruitment of state officials in lucrative jobs in their firms and lobbying agencies (Wright 2010: 81–4). At the spheres of exchange, production, and in the broader political process, workers and capitalist have asymmetric structural power. Consequently, the former are significantly subject to the will of the latter in the shaping of the terms on which they work (see further Wright 2000 [2015]). This inequality of structural power, some socialists claim, is an affront to workers’ dignity as self-determining, self-mastering agents (Gilabert 2023a: ch. 7).

The third point about domination mentioned above is also deployed by socialists to say that capitalism conflicts with democracy (Wright 2010: 81–4; Arnold n.d. [OIR]: sect. 4; Bowles and Gintis 1986; Meiksins Wood 1995). Democracy requires that people have roughly equal power to affect the political process that structures their social life—or at least that inequalities do not reflect morally irrelevant features such as race, gender, and class. Socialists have made three points regarding the conflict between capitalism and democracy. The first concerns political democracy of the kind that is familiar today. Even in the presence of multi-party electoral systems, members of the capitalist class—despite being a minority of the population—have significantly more influence than members of the working class. Governments have a tendency to adapt their agendas to the wishes of capitalists because they depend on their investment decisions to raise the taxes to fund public policies, as well as for the variety of other reasons outlined above. Even if socialist parties win elections, as long as they do not change the fundamentals of the economic system, they must be congenial to the wishes of capitalists. Thus, socialists have argued that deep changes in the economic structure of society are needed to make electoral democracy fulfill its promise. Political power cannot be insulated from economic power. They also, secondly, think that such changes may be directly significant. Indeed, as radical democrats, socialists have argued that reducing inequality of decision-making power within the economic sphere itself is not only instrumentally significant (to reduce inequality within the governmental sphere), but also intrinsically significant to increase people’s self-determination in their daily lives as economic agents. Therefore, most democratic socialists call for a solution to the problem of the conflict between democracy and capitalism by extending democratic principles into the economy (Fleurbaey 2006). Exploring the parallel between the political and economic systems, socialists have argued that democratic principles should apply in the economic arena as they do in the political domain, as economic decisions, like political decisions, have dramatic consequences for the freedom and well-being of people. Returning to the issue of the relations between the two arenas, socialists have also argued that fostering workers’ self-determination in the economy (notably in the workplace) enhances democratic participation at the political level (Coutrot 2018: ch. 9; Arnold 2012; see survey on workplace democracy in Frega et al. 2019). A third strand of argument, finally, has explored the importance of socialist reforms for fulfilling the ideal of a deliberative democracy in which people participate as free and equal reasoners seeking to make decisions that actually cater for the common good of all (J. Cohen 1989).

3.2.3 Alienation

As mentioned above, socialists have included, in their affirmation of individual freedom, a specific concern with real or effective freedom to lead flourishing lives. This freedom is often linked with a positive ideal of self-realization, which in turn motivates a critique of capitalism as generating alienation. This perspective informs Marx’s views on the strong contrast between productive activity under socialism and under capitalism (Marx 1844 [1978a]; 1844 [2000]; see also Kandiyali 2000; Brixel, forthcoming). In socialism, the “realm of necessity” and the correspondingly necessary, but typically unsavory, labor required to secure basic subsistence would be reduced so that people also gain increasing access to a “realm of freedom” in which a desirable form of work involving creativity, cultivation of talents, and meaningful cooperation with others is available. This realm of freedom would unleash “the development of human energy which is an end in itself” (Marx 1991: 957–9). This work, allowing for and facilitating individuals’ self-realization, would enable the “all-round development of the individual”, and would in fact become a “prime want” (Marx 1875 [1978b: 531]). The socialist society would feature “the development of the rich individuality which is all-sided in its production as in its consumption” (Marx 1857–8 [1973: 325]); it would constitute a “higher form of society in which the full and free development of every individual forms the ruling principle” (Marx 1867 [1990: 739]). By contrast, capitalism denies the majority of the population access to self-realization at work. Workers typically toil in tasks which are uninteresting and even stunting. They do not control how production unfolds or what is done with the outputs of production. And their relations with others are often not ones of fellowship, but rather of domination (under their bosses) and of competition (against their fellow workers). When alienated,

labor is external to the worker, i.e., it does not belong to his essential being; … in his work, therefore, he does not affirm himself but denies himself, does not feel content but unhappy, does not develop freely his physical and mental energy but mortifies his body and ruins his mind. … It is therefore not the satisfaction of a need; it is merely a means to satisfy needs external to it. (Marx 1844 [1978a: 74])

Recent scholarship has developed these ideas further. Elster has provided the most detailed discussion and development of the Marxian ideal of self-realization. The idea is defined as “the full and free actualization and externalization of the powers and the abilities of the individual” (Elster 1986: 43; 1989: 131). Self-actualization involves a two-step process in which individuals develop their powers (e.g., learn the principles and techniques of civil engineering) and then actualize those powers (e.g., design and participate in the construction of a bridge). Self-externalization, in turn, features a process in which individuals’ powers become visible to others with the potential beneficial outcome of social recognition and the accompanying boost in self-respect and self-esteem. However, Elster says that this Marxian ideal must be reformulated to make it more realistic. No one can develop all their powers fully, and no feasible economy would enable everyone always to get exactly their first-choice jobs and conduct them only in the ways they would most like. Furthermore, self-realization for and with others (and thus also the combination of self-realization with community) may not always work smoothly, as producers entangled in large and complex societies may not feel strongly moved by the needs of distant others, and significant forms of division of labor will likely persist. Still, Elster thinks the socialist ideal of self-realization remains worth pursuing, for example through the generation of opportunities to produce in worker cooperatives.

Others have construed the demand for real options to produce in ways that involve self-realization and solidarity as significant for the implementation of the Abilities / Needs Principle (Gilabert 2015: 207–12; Gilabert 2023a: 105-15), and defended a right to opportunities for meaningful work against the charges that political views oriented by an ideal of self-realization violate a liberal constraint of neutrality about conceptions of the good, rest on problematic assumptions about human nature, or are prone to supporting paternalistic impositions (Gilabert 2023a: 51–3, 92–5, 103–5, 224–37)

Kandiyali meanwhile has defended a reciprocal social interpretation of the Marxian ideas of self-realisation and non-alienation according to which unalienated production would involve workers’ achieving self-realisation precisely through helping to provide each other with the goods and services that those others need for their self-realisation (Kandiyali 2020). On this view, there is an internal relationship between the preconditions for one’s own self-development and the requirement that one stand in a relationship of mutual care and support with others. In other recent work on alienation, Maguire has advanced the view that efficient markets are unavoidably sources of alienation, insofar as they inhibit the ability of market participants to manifest relations of care with their fellow market participants; hence on this view market efficiency always carries an opportunity cost in terms of its undermining the manifestation of mutual care, and thereby alienates individual agents from valuable opportunities to realise a broader range of important values in the course of their productive activity (Maguire 2022).

Further scholarship explores recent changes in the organization of production. Boltanski and Chiapello argue that since the 1980s capitalism has partly absorbed (what they dub) the “artistic critique” against de-skilled and heteronomous work by generating schemes of economic activity in which workers operate in teams and have significant decision-making powers. However, these new forms of work, although common especially in certain knowledge-intensive sectors, are not available to all workers, and they still operate under the ultimate control of capital owners and their profit maximizing strategies. They also operate in tandem with the elimination of the social security policies typical of the (increasingly eroded) welfare state. Thus, the “artistic” strand in the socialist critique of capitalism as hampering people’s authenticity, creativity, and autonomy has not been fully absorbed and should be renewed. It should also be combined with the other, “social critique” strand which challenges inequality, insecurity, and selfishness (Boltanski and Chiapello 2018: Introduction, sect. 2). Other authors find in these new forms of work the seeds of future forms of economic organization—arguing that they provide evidence that workers can plan and control sophisticated processes of production on their own and that capitalists and their managers are largely redundant (Negri 2008).

The critique of alienation has also been recently developed further by Forst (2017) by exploring the relation between alienation and domination. On this account, the central problem with alienation is that it involves the denial of people’s autonomy—their ability and right to shape their social life on terms they could justify to themselves and to each other as free and equal co-legislators. (For further discussion on alienation and self-realization, see Jaeggi 2014: ch. 10. See also the general analysis of the concept of alienation in Leopold 2022a.)

3.2.4 Inefficiency

A traditional criticism of capitalism (especially amongst Marxists) is that it is inefficient. Capitalism is prone to cyclic crises in which wealth and human potential is destroyed and squandered. For example, to cut costs and maximize profits, firms choose work-saving technologies and lay off workers. But at the aggregate level, this erodes the demand for their products, which forces firms to cut costs further (by laying off even more workers or halting production). Socialism would, it has been argued, not be so prone to crises, as the rationale for production would not be profit maximization but need satisfaction. Although important, this line of criticism is less widespread amongst contemporary socialists. Historically, capitalism has proved quite resilient, resurrecting itself after crises and expanding its productivity dramatically over time. In might very well be that capitalism is the best feasible regime if the only standard of assessment were productivity.

Still, socialists point out that capitalism involves some significant inefficiencies. Examples are the underproduction of public goods (such as public transportation and education), the underpricing and overconsumption of natural resources (such as fossil fuels and fishing stocks), negative externalities (such as pollution), the costs of monitoring and enforcing market contracts and private property (given that the exploited may not be so keen to work as hard as their profit-maximizing bosses require, and that the marginalized may be moved by desperation to steal), and certain defects of intellectual property rights (such as blocking the diffusion of innovation, and alienating those who engage in creative activities because of their intrinsic appeal and because of the will to serve the public rather than maximize monetary reward) (Wright 2010: 55–65). Really existing capitalist societies have introduced regulations to counter some of these problems, at least to some extent. Examples are taxes and constraints to limit economic activities with negative externalities, and public funding and subsidies to sustain activities with positive externalities which are not sufficiently supported by the market. But, socialists insist, such mechanisms are external to capitalism, as they limit property rights and the scope for profit maximization as the primary orientation in the organization of the economy. The regulations involve the hybridization of the economic system by introducing some non-capitalist, and even socialist elements.

There is also an important issue of whether efficiency should only be understood in terms of maximizing production of material consumption goods. If the metric, or the utility space, that is taken into account when engaging in maximization assessments includes more than these goods, then capitalism can also be criticized as inefficient on account of its tendency to depress the availability of leisure time (as well as to distribute it quite unequally). This carries limitation of people’s access to the various goods that leisure enables—such as the cultivation of friendships, family, and community or political participation. Technological innovations create the opportunity to choose between retaining the previous level of production while using fewer inputs (such as labor time) or maintaining the level of inputs while producing more. John Maynard Keynes famously held that it would be reasonable to tend towards the prior option, and expected societies to take this path as the technological frontier advanced (Keynes 1930/31 [2010]; Pecchi and Piga 2010). Nevertheless, in large part because of the profit maximization motive, capitalism displays an inherent bias in favor of the second, arguably inferior, option. Capitalism thereby narrows the realistic options of its constituent economic agents—both firms and individuals. Firms would lose their competitive edge and risk bankruptcy if they did not pursue profits ahead of the broader interests of their workers (as their products would likely be more expensive). And it is typically hard for workers to find jobs that pay reasonable salaries for fewer hours of work. Socialists concerned with expanding leisure time—and also with environmental risks—find this bias quite alarming (see, e.g., G.A. Cohen 2000a: ch. XI). If a conflict between further increase in the production of material objects for consumption and the expansion of leisure time (and environmental protection) is unavoidable, then it is not clear, all things considered, that the former should be prioritized, especially when an economy has already reached a high level of material productivity.

3.2.5 Liberal egalitarianism and inequality in capitalism

Capitalism has also been challenged on liberal egalitarian grounds, and in ways that lend themselves to support for socialism. (Rawls 2001; Barry 2005; Piketty 2014; O’Neill 2008a, 2012, 2017, 2020, 2021; Ronzoni 2018). While many of John Rawls’s readers long took him to be a proponent of an egalitarian form of a capitalist welfare state, or as one might put it “a slightly imaginary Sweden”, in fact Rawls rejected such institutional arrangements as inadequate to the task of realizing principles of political liberty or equality of opportunity, or of keeping material inequalities within sufficiently tight bounds. His own avowed view of the institutions that would be needed to realize liberal egalitarian principles of justice was officially neutral as between a form of “property-owning democracy”, which would combine private property in the means of production with its egalitarian distribution, and hence the abolition of the separate classes of capitalists and workers; and a form of liberal democratic socialism that would see public ownership of the preponderance of the means of production, with devolved control of particular firms (Rawls 2001: 135–40; O’Neill and Williamson 2012). While Rawls’s version of liberal democratic socialism was insufficiently developed in his own writings, he stands as an interesting case of a theorist whose defense of a form of democratic socialism is based on normative foundations that are not themselves distinctively socialist, but concerned with the core liberal democratic values of justice and equality (see also Edmundson 2017; Ypi 2018; O’Neill 2020).

In a similar vein to Rawls, another instance of a theorist who defends at least partially socialist institutional arrangements on liberal egalitarian grounds was the Nobel Prize winning economist James Meade. Giving a central place to decidedly liberal values of freedom, security and independence, Meade argued that the likely levels of socioeconomic inequality under capitalism were such that a capitalist economy would need to be extensively tempered by socialist elements, such as the development of a citizens’ sovereign wealth fund, if the economic system were to be justifiable to those living under it (Meade 1964; O’Neill 2015 [OIR], 2017; O’Neill and White 2019). Looking back before Meade, J. S. Mill can also be seen as a theorist who traveled along what we might describe as “the liberal road to socialism”, with Mill in his Autobiography describing his own view as the acceptance of a “qualified socialism” (Mill 1873 [2018]), and arguing for a range of measures to create a more egalitarian economy, including making the case for a steady-state rather than a growth-oriented economy, arguing for workers’ collective ownership and self-management of firms in preference to the hierarchical structures characteristic of most firms under capitalism, and endorsing steep taxation of inheritance and unearned income (Mill 2008; see also Ten 1998; O’Neill 2008b, Pateman 1970). The recent scholarship of Helen McCabe has both provided a clearer picture of the depth and centrality of J. S. Mill’s socialist thinking, and provided a clearer account of the ways in which Mill’s position can be viewed as work jointly authored with Harriet Taylor Mill, whose influence seems to have radicalised Mill’s political thinking (McCabe 2021, 2023)

Within recent liberal egalitarian political philosophy, the argument has been advanced that as capitalist economies tend towards higher levels of inequality, and in particular with the rapid velocity at which the incomes and wealth of the very rich in society is increasing, many of those who had seen their normative commitments as requiring only the mild reform of capitalist economies might need to come to see the need to endorse more radical socialist institutional proposals (O’Neill 2020; Ronzoni 2018). Other philosophers have begun to put some pressure on mainstream liberal egalitarian assumptions about freedom of occupational choice. For example, the argument has been advanced that traditional liberal occupational freedoms, when viewed against the background of significant economic inequalities, can to the under-provision of vital public services to those in certain deprived areas. The absolute protection of freedom of occupational choice could also to an unjust distribution of effective freedom, whereby those with access to income from capital can live free of the demands of the labour market, while those from less privileged backgrounds find themselves forced to take whatever jobs the market pushes them towards. Lucas Stanczyk has argued that there are therefore compelling liberal grounds both for condemning existing ways of organising the division of labour (Stanczyk 2022) and for accepting some degree of “labour conscription” on grounds of social justice (Stanczyk 2012; see also Walzer 1984; Nielsen 1985; Gomberg 2007; Kandiyali 2023; by contrast, for the canonical liberal rejection of “the central direction of labour” see Rawls 1999, §42; see also Cohen 2008, p. 186, where he states that on this issue his own “inclinations are more liberal” in contrast to “Old-style Stalinistically inclined egalitarians” who would allow coercive imposition of occupational roles).

Meanwhile another significant strand in recent liberal egalitarian thinking has emphasised the degree to which mainstream liberal egalitarianism has unjustifably neglected the role of the value of community (or solidarity). Cohen’s emphasis in Why Not Socialism? (Cohen 2009) on the need to endorse parallel normative commitments to both equality and community can be seen as a response to the shortcomings of a trend in luck egalitarian and related views that had emphasised the first value too often at the expense of the latter (e.g. Arneson 1989; Dworkin 2000). More recent work on the place of community within liberal egalitarianism has explored the ways in which social and economic institutions may need to be reimagined and redesigned so as to avoid “pitting people against each other” (Hussain 2020; see also Gilabert 2023b). These concerns with the value of community align more closely with the traditional socialist value of solidarity, as compared to the rather different approach taken in earlier ‘communitarian’ critiques of mainstream liberal egalitarianism (for guides to those earlier debates, see Mulhall & Swift 1996; Kymlicka 2002, Ch 5).

Alongside this return to considerations of solidarity within liberal egalitarian thought (on which see also Kolers 2016; Sangiovanni 2023; Sangiovanni and Viehoff 2023, 2024) there has also been a move towards more careful consideration of the institutional preconditions for nurturing and developing citizens’ shared sense of commitment to the collective project of creating just institutions, seen as potentially necessitating support for a range of institutions designed either to bring collective deliberation into market processes or to give citizens spaces to encounter each other outside the market (Hussain 2012; O’Neill 2020). Hussain has also recently made the case that, in order for free market economies to be rendered consistent with the value of human freedom, there is a need to embed deliberative “intermediary institutions” within markets, as with Nordic or Rhenish forms of industrial codetermination. On Hussain’s view, even a freedom-based defence of free markets should, when pursued seriously, lead us towards a range of more collective economic institutions that have more often been associated with forms of social democracy or democratic socialism (Hussain 2023).

4. Socialist Institutional Designs (Dimension DII)

The foregoing discussion focused on socialist critiques of capitalism. These critiques make the case that capitalism fails to fulfill principles, or to realize values, to which socialists are committed. But what would an alternative economic system look like which would fulfill those principles, or realize those values—or at least honor them to a larger extent? This brings us to dimension DII of socialism. We will consider several proposed models. We will address here critical concerns about both the feasibility and the desirability of these models. Arguments comparing ideal socialist designs with actual capitalist societies are unsatisfactory; we must compare like with like (Nove 1991; Rawls 2001; Brennan 2014; Corneo 2017). Thus, we should compare ideal forms of socialism with ideal forms of capitalism, and actual versions of capitalism with actual versions of socialism. Most importantly, we should entertain comparisons between the best feasible incarnations of these systems (Gilabert 2023a: ch.8). This requires formulating feasible forms of socialism. Feasibility assessments can play out in two ways: they may regard the (degree of) workability and stability of a proposed socialist system once introduced, or they may regard its (degree of) accessibility from current conditions when it is not yet in place. We address the former concerns in this section, leaving the latter for section 5 when we turn to dimension DIII of socialism and the questions of socialist transition or transformation.

4.1 Central and Participatory Planning

Would socialism do better than capitalism regarding the ideals of equality, democracy, individual freedom, self-realization, and solidarity? This depends on the availability of workable versions of socialism that fulfill these ideals (or do so at least to a greater extent than workable forms of capitalism). A first set of proposals envision an economic system that does away with both private property in the means of production and with markets. The first version of this model is central planning. This can be understood within a top-down, hierarchical model. A central authority gathers information about the technical potential in the economy and about consumers’ needs and formulates a set of production objectives which seek an optimal match between the former and the latter. These objectives are articulated into a plan that is passed down to intermediate agencies and eventually to local firms, which must produce according to the plan handed down. If it works, this proposal would secure the highest feasible levels of equal access to consumption goods for everyone. However, critics have argued that the model faces serious feasibility hurdles (Corneo 2017: ch. 5: Roemer 1994a: ch. 5). It is very hard for a central authority to gather the relevant information from producers and consumers. Second, even if it could gather enough information, the computation of an optimal plan would require enormously complex calculations which may be beyond the capacity of planners (even with access to the most sophisticated technological assistance). Finally, there may be significant incentive deficits. For example, firms might tend to exaggerate the resources they need to produce and mislead about how much they can produce. Without facing strong sticks and carrots (such as the prospects for either bankruptcy and profit offered by a competitive market), firms might well display low levels of innovation. As a result, a planned economy would likely lag behind surrounding capitalist economies, and their members would tend to lose faith in it. High levels of cooperation (and willingness to innovate) could still exist if sufficiently many individuals in this society possessed a strong sense of duty. But critics find this unlikely to materialize, warning that “a system that only works with exceptional individuals only works in exceptional cases” (Corneo 2017: 127).

Actual experiments in centrally planned economies have only partially approximated the best version of it. Thus, in addition to the problems mentioned above (which affect even that best version), they have displayed additional defects. For example, the system introduced in the Soviet Union featured intense concentration of political and economic power in the hands of an elite controlling a single party which, in turn, controlled a non-democratic state apparatus. Despite its successes in industrializing the country (making it capable of mobilizing in a war effort to defeat Nazi Germany), the model failed to generate sufficient technical innovation and intensive growth to deliver differentiated consumer goods of the kind available within advanced capitalist economies. Furthermore, it trampled upon civil and political liberties that many socialists would themselves hold dear.

Responding to such widespread disempowerment, a second model for socialist planning has recommended that planning be done in a different, more democratic way. Thus, the participatory planning (or participatory economy, “Parecon”) model proposes the following institutional features (Albert 2003, 2016 [OIR]). First, the means of production would be socially owned. Second, production would take place in firms controlled by workers (thus fostering democracy within the workplace). Third, balanced “job complexes” are put in place in which workers can both engage in intellectual and manual labor (thus fostering and generalizing self-realization). Fourth, in a fair and solidaristic fashion, remuneration of workers would track their effort, sacrifice, and special needs (and not their relative power or output—which would likely reflect differences in native abilities for which they are not morally responsible). Finally, and crucially, economic coordination would be based on comprehensive participatory planning. This would involve a complex system of nested worker councils, consumer councils, and an Iteration Facilitation Board. Various rounds of deliberation within, and between, worker and consumer councils, facilitated by this board, would be undertaken until matches between supply and demands schedules are found—with recourse to voting procedures only when no full agreement exists but several promising arrangements arise. This would turn the economy into an arena of deliberative democracy.

This proposal seems to cater for the full palette of socialist values stated in section 4.1. Importantly, it overcomes the deficits regarding freedom displayed by central planning. Critics have warned, however, that Parecon faces serious feasibility obstacles. In particular, the iterative planning constituting the fifth institutional dimension of the Parecon proposal would require immense information complexity (Wright 2010: 260–5). It is unlikely that participants in the operations of this board, even with the help of sophisticated computers, would manage it sufficiently well to generate a production plan that satisfactorily caters to the diversity of individuals’ needs. A defense of Parecon would retort that beyond initial stages, the process of economic decision-making would not be too cumbersome. Furthermore, it might turn out to involve no more paperwork and time devoted to planning and to assessment behind computer terminals than is found in existing capitalist societies (with their myriad individual and corporate budgeting exercises, and their various accounting and legal epicycles). And, in any case, even if it is more cumbersome and less efficient in terms of productivity, Parecon might still be preferable overall as an economic system, given its superior performance regarding the values of freedom, equality, self-realization, solidarity, and democracy (Arnold n.d. [OIR]: sect. 8.b).

4.2 Market Socialism

Some of the above-mentioned problems of central planning, regarding inefficiency and concentration of power, have motivated some socialists to explore alternative economic systems in which markets are given a central role. Markets generate problems of their own (especially when they involve monopolies, negative externalities, and asymmetric information). But if regulations are introduced to counter these “market failures”, markets can be the best feasible mechanism for generating matches between demand and supply in large, complex societies (as higher prices signal high demand, with supply rushing to cover it, while lower prices signal low demand, leading supply to concentrate on other products). Market socialism affirms the traditional socialist desideratum of preventing a division of society between a class of capitalists who do not need to work to make a living and a class of laborers having to work for them, but it retains from capitalism the utilization of markets to guide production. There has been a lively debate on this approach, with several specific systems being proposed.

One version is the economic democracy model (Schweickart 2002 [2011], 2016 [OIR]). It has three basic features. First, production is undertaken in firms managed by workers. Worker self-managed enterprises would gain temporary control of some means of production (which would be leased out by the state). Workers determine what gets produced and how it is produced, and determine compensation schemes. Second, there is a market for goods and services. The profit motive persists and some inequalities within and between firms are possible, but likely much smaller than in capitalism (as there would be no separate capitalist class, and workers will not democratically select income schemes that involve significant inequality within their firms). Finally, investment flows are socially controlled through democratically accountable public investment banks, which determine funding for enterprises on the basis of socially relevant criteria (such as efficiency and environmental sustainability). The revenues for these banks come from a capital assets tax. This system would (through its second feature) mobilize the efficiency of markets while also (through its other features) attending to socialist ideals of self-determination, self-realization, and equal opportunity. To address some potential difficulties, the model has been extended to include further features, such as a commitment of the government as an employer of last resort, the creation of socialist savings and loans associations, the accommodation of an entrepreneurial-capitalist sector for particularly innovative small firms, and some forms of protectionism regarding foreign trade.

Self-management market socialism has been defended as feasible by pointing at the experience of cooperatives (such as the Mondragón Corporation in the Basque Country in Spain, often described as the world’s largest cooperative, which has (as of 2015) over 70,000 worker-owners participating in a network of cooperative businesses (see O’Neill and Etxeberria 2019 [OIR])). But it has also been criticized on five counts (Corneo 2017: ch. 6). First, it would generate unfair distributions, as workers doing the same work in different enterprises would end up with unequal income if the enterprises are not equally successful in the market. Second, workers would face high levels of financial risk, as their resources would be concentrated in their firm rather than spread more widely. Third, it could generate inefficient responses to market prices, as self-managed enterprises reduce hiring if prices for their products are high—so that members keep more of the profit—and hire more if the prices are low—to cover for fixed costs of production. Given the previous point, the system could also generate high unemployment. Having the government require firms to hire more would lead to lower productivity. However, the further features in the model discussed above might address this problem by allowing for small private enterprises to be formed, and by having in the background the government play a role as an employer of last resort (although this might also limit overall productivity). Finally, although some of the problems of efficiency could be handled through the banks controlling investment, it is not clear that the enormous power of such banks could be made sufficiently accountable to a democratic process so as to avoid the potential problem of cooptation by elites. (See, however, Malleson 2014 on democratic control of investment.)

Another market socialist model, proposed by Carens (1981, 2003), does not impose worker self-management. The Carensian model mirrors the current capitalist system in most respects while introducing two key innovative features. First, there would be direct governmental provision regarding certain individually differentiated needs (via a public health care system, for example). Second, to access other consumption goods, everyone working full time would get the same post tax income. Pre-tax salaries would vary, signaling levels of demand in the market. People would choose jobs not only on the basis of their self-regarding preferences, but also out of a sense of social duty to use their capacities to support others in society. Thus, honoring the Abilities / Needs Principle, they would apply for jobs (within their competencies) in which the pre-tax income is relatively high. If it worked, this model would recruit the efficiency of markets, but it would not involve the selfish motives and inegalitarian outcomes typically linked to them in capitalism.

One worry about the Carensian model is that it might be unrealistic to expect an economic system to work well when it relies so heavily on a sense of duty to motivate people to make cooperative contributions. This worry could be assuaged by presenting this model as the long-term target of a socialist transformation which would progressively develop a social ethos supporting it (Gilabert 2011, 2017a), by noting empirical findings about the significant traction of non-egoistic motives in economic behavior (Bowles and Gintis 2011) and the feasibility of “moral incentives” (Guevara 1977, Lizárraga 2011), and by exploring strategies to mobilize simultaneously various motivational mechanisms to sustain the proposed scheme. Two additional worries are the following (Gilabert 2023a: 117-22). First, the model makes no explicit provision regarding real opportunities for work that fosters self-realization and proceeds in self-managed firms. (Shoikhedbrod 2021 specifically criticizes the Carensian model for failing to give centrality to the socialist demand that firms be democratically run by workers.) To cater more fully for ideals of self-realization and self-determination, a requirement could be added that the government promote such opportunities for those willing to take them. Second, the model is not sufficiently sensitive to different individual preferences regarding leisure and consumption (requiring simply that everyone work full time and wind up with the same consumption and leisure bundles). More flexible schedules could be introduced so that people who want to consume more could work longer hours and have higher salaries, while people who want to enjoy more free time could work fewer hours and have lower salaries. Considerations of reciprocity and equality could still be honored by equalizing the incomes of those working the same number of hours.

Many forms of market socialism allow for some hierarchy at the point of production. These managerial forms are usually defended on grounds of greater efficiency. But they face the question of how to incentivize managers to behave in ways that foster innovation and productivity. One way to do this is to set up a stock market that would help to measure the performance of the firms they manage and to push them to make optimal decisions. An example of this approach (there are others—Corneo 2017: ch. 8) is coupon market socialism. In Roemer’s (1994a) version, this economic system operates with two kinds of money: dollars (euros, pesos, etc.) and coupons. Dollars are used to purchase commodities for consumption and production, and coupons are used in a stock market to purchase shares in corporations. The two kinds of money are not convertible (with an exception to be outlined below). Each person, when reaching adulthood, is provided with an equal set of coupons. They can use them in a state-regulated stock market (directly or through mutual investment funds) to purchase shares in corporations at market price. They receive the dividends from their investments in dollars, but they cannot cash the coupons themselves. When they die, people’s coupons and shares go back to the state for distribution to new generations—no inherited wealth is allowed—and coupons cannot be transferred as gifts. Thus, there is no separate class of capital owners in this economy. But there will be income inequality resulting from people’s different fortunes with their investments (dividends) as well as from the income they gain in the jobs they take through the labor market (in managerial and non-managerial positions). Coupons can however be converted into dollars by corporations; they can cash their shares to pay for capital investments. The exchange is regulated by a public central bank. Further, public banks or public investment funds, operating with relative independence from the government, would steer enterprises receiving coupons so that they maximize profit in the competitive markets for the goods and services they produce (so that they maximize the returns on the coupons invested). Part of that profit is also taxed for direct welfare provisions by the state.

This model caters for ideals of equality of opportunity (given equal distribution of coupons) and democracy (given the elimination of capitalist dynasties that have the ability to transform massive economic power into political influence). It also gives people freedom to choose how to use their resources and includes solidaristic schemes of public provision to meet needs regarding education and health care. Via the competitive markets in consumption goods and shares, it also promises high levels of innovation and productivity. (In some versions of the model this is enhanced by allowing limited forms of private ownership of firms to facilitate the input of highly innovative entrepreneurial individuals—Corneo 2017: 192–7). The model departs from traditional forms of socialism by not exactly instituting social property in means of production (but rather the equal dispersal of coupons across individuals in each generation). But defenders of this model say that socialists should not fetishize any property scheme; they should instead see such schemes instrumentally in terms of how well they fare in the implementation of core normative principles (such as equality of opportunity) (Roemer 1994a: 23–4, 124–5). Critics have worries, however, that the model does not go far enough in honoring socialist principles. For example, they have argued that a managerial (by contrast to a self-management) form of market socialism is deficient in terms of self-determination and self-realization at the workplace (Satz 1996), and that the levels of inequalities in income, and the competitive attitudes in the market that it would generate, violate ideals of community (G.A. Cohen 2009). In response, a defender of coupon market socialism can emphasize that the model is meant to be applied in the short-term, and that further institutional and cultural arrangements more fully in line with socialist principles can be introduced later on, as they become more feasible (Roemer 1994a: 25–7, 118). A worry, however, is that the model may entrench institutional and cultural configurations which may diminish rather than enhance the prospects for deeper changes in the future (Brighouse 1996; Gilabert 2011).

4.3 Less Comprehensive, Piecemeal Reforms

The models discussed above envision comprehensive “system change” in which the class division between capitalists and wage laborers disappears. Socialists have also explored piecemeal reforms that stop short of that structural change. An important historical example is the combination of a market economy and the welfare state. In this model, although property in the means of production remains private, and markets allocate most inputs and outputs of production, a robust governmental framework is put in place to limit the power of capitalists over workers and to improve the life-prospects of the latter. Thus, social insurance addresses the risks associated with illness, unemployment, disability, and old age. Tax-funded, state provision of many of those goods that markets typically fail to deliver for all is introduced (such as high-quality education, public transportation, and health care). And collective bargaining gives unions and other instruments of workers’ power some sway on the determination of their working conditions, as well as providing an important foundation for the political agency of the working class (O’Neill and White 2018).

This welfare state model was developed with great success during the three decades after World War II, especially in Northern Europe, but also, in weaker but significant forms, in other countries (including some in the Global South). However, since the 1980s, this model has been in significant retreat, or even in crisis. Wealth and income inequality have been increasing dramatically during this time (Piketty 2014; O’Neill 2017). The financial sector has become extremely powerful and able largely to escape governmental regulation as globalization allows capital to flow across borders. A “race to the bottom” features states competing with each other to attract investment by lowering tax rates and other regulations, thus undermining states’ ability to implement welfare policies (see, e.g., Dietsch 2015, 2018). Some socialists have seen this crisis as a reason to abandon the welfare state and pursue more comprehensive changes of the kind discussed above. Others, however, have argued that the model should be defended given that it has been proven to work quite well while the alternatives have uncertain prospects.

One example of the approach of extending or retrenching the mixed economy and welfare state proposes a combination of two moves (Corneo 2017: ch. 10, Epilogue, Appendix). The first move is to revamp the welfare state by introducing mechanisms of greater accountability of politicians to citizens (such as regulation of the dealings of politicians with private companies, and more instances of direct democracy in order to empower citizens), an improvement of the quality of public services delivered by the welfare state (introducing exacting audits and evaluations and fostering the training and recruitment of excellent civil servants), and international coordination of tax policies to prevent tax competition and tax evasion. The second move in this proposal is to run controlled experiments of market socialism to present it as a credible threat to the powerful actors seeking to undermine the welfare state. This threat would help stabilize the welfare state as the menace of communist revolution did after 1945. Specifically, welfare states could create new institutions that would be relatively independent from governments and be run by highly competent and democratically accountable civil servants. “Sovereign Wealth Funds” would invest public money in well-functioning enterprises, to yield an equal “social dividend” for citizens (on Sovereign Wealth Funds, see also Cummine 2016, O’Neill and White 2019). The second institution, a “Federal Shareholder”, would go further by using some of these funds to buy 51% of the shares of selected enterprises and take the lead within their boards of directors or supervisory boards. The objective would be to show that these enterprises (which would include significant participation of workers in their management, and ethical guidelines regarding environmental impacts and other concerns) maximize profits and thus offer a desirable and feasible alternative to the standard capitalist enterprise. Effectively, this strategy would run controlled experiments of shareholder market socialism. The working population would learn about the feasibility of market socialism, and capitalist opponents of welfare entitlements would be disciplined by fear of the generalization of such experiments to settle again for the welfare state.

Another strategy is to introduce various experiments seeking to expand the impact of social power (as different from state and economic power) within society (as defined in sect. 1). (See survey in Wright 2010: chs. 6–7). A set of mechanisms would target the deepening of democracy. Forms of direct democracy could foster citizens’ deliberative engagement in decision-making, as exemplified by the introduction of municipal participatory budgeting in Porto Alegre, Brazil (which features citizens’ assemblies identifying priorities for public policy). The quality of representative democracy can be enhanced (and its subservience to the power of capitalists decreased) by introducing egalitarian funding of electoral campaigns (e.g., by giving citizens a sum of money to allocate to the parties they favor, while forcing parties to choose between getting funding from that source and any other source—such as corporations), and by creating random citizen assemblies to generate policy options which can then be subject to society-wide referenda (as in the attempt to change the electoral system in British Columbia in Canada). Finally, forms of associational democracy can be introduced that feature deliberation or bargaining between government, labor, business, and civil society groups when devising national economic policies or when introducing regional or local (e.g., environmental) regulations. A second set of mechanisms would foster social empowerment more directly in the economy. Examples are the promotion of the social economy sector featuring economic activity involving self-management and production oriented to use value (as displayed, e.g., by Wikipedia and child care units in Quebec), an unconditional basic income strengthening people’s ability to engage in economic activities they find intrinsically valuable, and the expansion of the cooperative sector. None of these mechanisms on its own would make a society socialist rather than capitalist. But if we see societies as complex “ecologies” rather than as homogeneous “organisms”, we can notice that they are hybrids including diverse institutional logics. An increase in the incidence of social empowerment may significantly extend the socialist aspects of a society, and even eventually make them dominant (a point to which we return in the next section).

We can also mention the vision of socialism offered by Piketty (2020: ch. 17; see also O’Neill 2021). Although Piketty’s “participatory socialism” does not recommend the complete elimination of private property in the means of production, it proposes significant reforms that would make property significantly more “social” and “temporary”. Thus, large firms would include schemes of codetermination that give workers a say on how production proceeds. Capital would be dispersed through progressive taxation on property, inheritance, and income, with the proceeds being used to fund a capital grant for young people, a secure basic income for all, and the public services of a social sate (such as education and health care). Piketty also envisions changes to the structure of democratic politics to reduce inequalities of influence among citizens, and proposes new international institutions that restrict capital flight.

A final point worth mentioning as we close our discussion of dimension DII of socialism concerns the growing interest in addressing not only the economic arena, but also the political and personal-private ones. Some scholars argue that classical socialists neglected the increasing “functional differentiation” of modern society into these three “spheres”, concentrating in an unduly narrow way on the economic one (Honneth 2015 [2017]). Thus, recent socialist work has increasingly explored how to extend socialist principles to the organization of relatively autonomous governmental institutions and practices and to the shaping of intimate relationships among family members, friends, and lovers, as well as to the relations between these diverse social arenas (see also Fraser 2009, 2014, 2022; Albert 2017). There is, of course, also a long-standing tradition of feminist socialism that has pushed for a wide scope in the application of socialist ideals and a broader understanding of labor that covers productive and reproductive activities beyond the formal workplace (see, e.g., Arruzza 2013, 2016; Dalla Costa and James 1972; Federici 2012; Ehrenreich 1976 [2018]; Gould 1973–4; Rowbotham et al 1979; Rowbotham 1998).

5. Socialist Transformation (Dimension DIII)

We turn now to the last dimension of socialism (DIII), which concerns the transformation of capitalist societies into socialist ones. The discussion on this dimension is difficult in at least two respects which call for philosophical exploration (Gilabert 2017a: 113–23, 2015: 216–20; 2023a: 157-68, 122-31). The first issue concerns feasibility. The question is whether socialist systems are accessible from where we are now—whether there is a path from here to there. But what does feasibility mean here? It cannot just mean logical or physical possibility, as these would rule out very few social systems. The relevant feasibility parameters seem instead to involve matters of technical development, economic organization, political mobilization, and moral culture. (For some discussion on these parameters see Wright 2010: ch. 8; Chibber 2017.) But such parameters are comparatively “soft”, in that they indicate probability prospects rather than pose strict limits of possibility, and can be significantly changed over time. When something is not feasible to do right now, we could have dynamic duties to make it feasible to do later by developing our relevant capacities in the meantime. The feasibility judgments must then be scalar rather than binary and allow for diachronic variation. These features make them somewhat murky, and not straightforwardly amenable to the hard-edged use of impossibility claims to debunk normative requirements (via contraposition on the principle that ought implies can).

A second difficulty concerns the articulation of all things considered appropriate strategies that combine feasibility considerations with the normative desiderata provided by socialist principles. The question here is: what is the most reasonable path of transformation to pursue for socialists given their understanding of the principles animating their political project, viewed against the background of what seems more or less feasible to achieve at different moments, and within different historical contexts? Complex judgments have to be formed about the precise social systems at which it would be right to aim at different stages of the sequence of transformation, and about the specific modes of political action to deploy in such processes. These judgments would combine feasibility and desirability to assess short-term and long-term goals, their intrinsic costs and benefits, and the promise of the former to enhance the achievement of the latter. The difficulty of forming such judgments is compounded by the uncertainty about the prospects of large societal changes (but also about the long-term consequences of settling for the status quo).

Marx (1875 [1978b]) himself seemed to address some of these issues in his short text “The Critique of the Gotha Program” of 1875. Marx here envisioned the process of socialist transformation as including two phases. The final phase would fully implement the Abilities / Needs Principle. But he did not take that scenario to be immediately accessible. An intermediate step should be pursued, in which the economy would be ruled by a Contribution Principle requiring that (after some provisions are put aside to fulfill basic needs regarding health care, education, and support for those unable to work) people gain access to consumption goods in proportion to how much they contribute. This lower phase of socialist transformation would be reasonable because it would enhance the prospects of transitioning away from capitalism and of generating the conditions for the full realization of socialism. The implementation of the Contribution Principle would fulfill the promise systematically broken by capitalism that people would benefit according to their labor input (as in capitalism capitalists get much more, and workers much less, than they give). It would also incentivize people to increase production to the level necessary for the introduction of socialism proper. Once such level of development is in place, the social ethos could move away from the mantra of the “exchange of equivalents” and instead adopt a different outlook in which people produce according to their diverse abilities, and consume according to their diverse needs. This sequential picture of transformation features diachronic judgments about changes in feasibility parameters (such as the expansion of technical capacity and a change in patterns of motivation). Marx also envisioned political dimensions of this process, including a “dictatorship of the proletariat” (which would not, as some popular interpretations hold, involve violation of civil and political rights, but a change in the political constitution and majoritarian policies that secure the elimination of capitalist property rights (Elster 1985: 447–9)). In time, the state (understood as an apparatus of class rule rather than, more generally, as an administrative device) would “wither away”.

History has not moved smoothly in the direction many socialists predicted. It has not been obvious that the following steps in the expected pattern materialized or are likely to do so: capitalism generating a large, destitute, and homogeneous working class; this class responding to some of the cyclical crises capitalism is prone to by creating a coherent and powerful political movement; this movement gaining control of government and resolutely and successfully implementing a socialist economic system (G.A. Cohen 2000b: ch. 6; Laclau and Mouffe 1985). Given the fact that this process did not materialize, and seems unlikely to do so, it turns out that it would be both self-defeating and irresponsible to fail to address difficult questions about the relative feasibility and moral desirability of different strategies of potential socialist transformation. For example, if the process of transformation involves two or more stages (be they the two mentioned above, or some sequence going, say, from the welfare state to shareholder or coupon market socialism and then to a version of the Carensian model), it might be asked who is to evaluate and decide upon what is to be done at each stage of the process, on what grounds can it be expected that earlier stages will enhance the likelihood of the success of later stages rather than undermine them (e.g., by enshrining institutions or values that will make it hard to move further along the path), what transitional costs can be accepted in earlier stages, and whether the costs expected are outweighed by the desirability and the increased probability of attaining the later stages. Such questions do not want for difficulty.

Addressing questions such as these dilemmas of transitional strategy, socialists have envisaged different approaches to social and political transformation. Four significant examples (extensively discussed in Wright 2010: Part III, 2015b, 2016—which we follow here) are articulated by considering two dimensions of analysis regarding (a) the primary goal of the strategy (either (i) transcending the structures of capitalism, or (ii) neutralizing the worst harms of it) and (b) the primary target of the strategy (either (i) the state and other institutions at the macro-level of the system, or (ii) the economic activities of individuals, organizations, and communities). (See Wright 2019: 38-53 for a slightly more complex framework, and its discussion in Leopold 2022: sect. 5.4.)

The first strategy, smashing capitalism, picks out the combination of possibilities (a.i) and (b.i). A political organization (e.g., a revolutionary party) takes advantage of some of the crises generated by capitalism to seize state power, proceeding to use that power to counter opposition to the revolution and to build a socialist society. This is the strategy favored by revolutionary socialists and many Marxists, and pursued in the twentieth century in countries such as Russia and China. If we look at the historical evidence, we see that although this strategy succeeded in some cases in transitioning out of previously existing capitalist or proto-capitalist economic systems, it failed in terms of building socialism. It led instead to a form of authoritarian statism. There is debate about the causes of these failures. Some factors may have been the economically backward and politically hostile circumstances in which the strategy was implemented, the leaders’ deficits (in terms of their tactics or motives), and the hierarchical frameworks used to suppress opposition after the revolution which remained in place for the long-term to subvert revolutionaries’ aims. Large system changes normally have to face a “transitional trough” after their onset, in which the material interests of many people are temporarily set back (Przeworski 1985). A political dilemma arises, in that, if liberal democratic politics is retained (with a free press, liberty of association, and multiparty elections) the revolutionaries may be unseated due to citizens’ political response to the “valley of transition”, while if liberal democratic politics are supplanted, then authoritarian statism may be the consequence, eradicating the possibility of a socialist outcome to which it would be worthwhile to seek to transition.

A second strategy, picking out the combination of possibilities (a.ii) and (b.i), has been taming capitalism. It mobilizes the population (sometimes in sharp political struggles) to elect governments and implement policies that respond to the worst harms generated by capitalism, with the aim of neutralizing them. New policies include social insurance responding to risks faced by the population (e.g., illness and unemployment), tax funded, state provision of public goods which markets tend to fail to provide (e.g., education, public transportation, research and development, etc.), and regulation of negative externalities produced in markets (e.g., regarding pollution, product and workplace hazards, predatory market behavior, etc.). The strategy, implemented by social-democratic parties, worked quite well during the three decades of the “Golden Age” or Trente Glorieuses following World War II. However, progress was halted and partly rolled back since the retreat of social democracy and the introduction of neoliberalism in the 1980s. Possible explanatory factors are the financialization of capitalism, and the effects of globalization, as discussed above in section 4.3. There is a debate as to whether capitalism is really tameable—it may be that the Golden Age was only a historical anomaly, borne out of a very particular set of political and economic circumstances.

The third strategy, escaping capitalism, picks out the combination of possibilities (a.ii) and (b.ii). Capitalism might be too strong to destroy. But people could avoid its worst harms by insulating themselves from its dynamics. They could focus on family and friendships, become self-subsistence farmers, create intentional communities, and explore modes of life involving “voluntary simplicity”. However, this strategy seems available mostly to relatively well-off people who can fund their escape with wealth they have amassed or received from capitalist activities. The working poor may not be so lucky.

The final strategy, eroding capitalism, picks out the combination of (a.i) and (b.ii). Economic systems are here seen as hybrids. People can introduce new, socialist forms of collective activity (such as worker cooperatives) and progressively expand them, eventually turning them from marginal to dominant. Recently this kind of strategy of the erosion of capitalism through institutional transformation rather than piecemeal changes within existing economic structures, has been referred to as “the institutional turn” in leftist political economy (see Guinan and O’Neill 2018, 2019). Wright (2015b, 2016) suggests the analogy of a lake ecosystem, with the introduction of a new species of fish that at first thrives in one location, and then spreads out, eventually becoming a dominant species. Historically, the transformation from feudalism to capitalism in some parts of Europe has come about in this way, with pockets of commercial, financial, and manufacturing activity taking place in cities and expanding over time. Some anarchists seem to hold a version of this strategy today. It offers hope for change even when the state seems uncongenial, and likely to remain so. But critics find it far-fetched, as it seems unlikely to go sufficiently far given the enormous economic and political power of large capitalist corporations and the tendency of the state to repress serious threats to its rules. To go further, the power of the state has to be at least partially recruited. The fourth strategy then, according to Wright, is only plausible when combined with the second.

As discussed by Wright, this combined strategy would have two elements (we could see Corneo’s proposal discussed in section 4.3 as another version of this approach). First, it would address some important, problematic junctures to expand state action in ways that even capitalists would have to accept. And second, the solutions to the crises introduced by state action would be selected in such a way that they would enhance long-term prospects for socialist change. One critical juncture is global warming, and the social and political problems of the Anthropocene era (Löwy 2005; Purdy 2015; Wark 2016; Forrester and Smith 2018; Lawrence and Laybourn-Langton 2021; Saito 2017, 2023, 2024). Responding to its effects would require massive generation of state-provided public goods, which could remove neoliberal compunctions about state activism. A second critical juncture concerns the large levels of long-term unemployment, precariousness, and marginalization generated by new trends in automation and information technology. This involves threats to social peace, and insufficient demand for the products corporations need to sell on the consumption market. Such threats could be averted by introducing an unconditional basic income policy (Van Parijs and Vanderborght 2017), or by the significant expansion of public services, or by some other mechanism that secures for everybody a minimally dignified economic condition independent of their position within the labor market. Now, these state policies could foster the growth of social power and the prospects for socialist change in the future. Workers would have more power in the labor market when they came to be less reliant upon it. They could also be more successful in forming cooperatives. The social economy sector could flourish under such conditions. People could also devote more time to political activism. Together, these trends from below, combined with state activism from above, could expand knowledge about the workability of egalitarian, democratic, and solidaristic forms of economic activity, and strengthen the motivation to extend their scope. Although some critics find this strategy naïve (Riley 2016), proponents think that something like it must be tried if the aim is democratic socialism rather than authoritarian statism. (For specific worries about the political feasibility of a robust universal basic income policy as a precursor to rather than as a result of socialism, see Gourevitch and Stanczyk 2018; see also Gourevitch 2022).

Other significant issues regarding dimension DIII of socialism are the identification of appropriate political agents of change and their prospects of success in the context of contemporary globalization. On the first point, socialists increasingly explore the significance not only of workers’ movements, but also their intersection with the efforts of activists focused on overcoming gender- and race-based oppression (Davis 1981; Albert 2017). On many views, forms of gender-based injustice and racial injustice are ineradicably linked to the explanation of what is wrong with capitalism, and these connections also hold with regard to the forms of political agency that would be needed in order to overcome and replace capitalism (Basevich 2020; Gomberg 2007, 2024; Fraser 2022; Laurence 2021; Mills 2017). Some argue that the primary addressee of socialist politics should not be any specific class or movement, but the more inclusive, and politically equal group of citizens of a democratic community. For example, Honneth (2015 [2017: ch. IV]), following in part John Dewey and Jürgen Habermas, argues that the primary addressee and agent of change for socialism should be the citizens assembled in the democratic public sphere. Although normatively appealing, this proposal may face serious feasibility difficulties, as existing democratic arenas are intensely contaminated and disabled by the inequalities socialists criticize and seek to overcome. The second issue is also relevant here. There is a traditional question whether socialism is to be pursued in one country or internationally. The tendency to embrace an internationalist horizon of political change is characteristic among socialists as they typically see their ideals of freedom, equality, and solidarity as having global scope, while they also note that, as a matter of feasibility, the increasing porousness of borders for capitalist economic activity make it the case that socialist politics may not go very far in any country without reshaping the broader international context. A difficulty here is that despite the existence of international social movements (including workers’ movements, international NGOs, human rights institutions and associations, and other actors), institutional agency beyond borders that can seriously contest capitalist frameworks is not currently very strong. In addressing these difficulties, action and research on socialist justice must interact with ongoing work in the related areas of gender, race, democracy, human rights, and global justice.[2]


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Other Internet Resources


For helpful discussion, comments and suggestions we thank the Editors and two referees, Samuel Arnold, Elvira Basevich, Christopher Brooke, Lee Churchman, Michaela Collord, Chiara Cordelli, Katrina Forrester, Roberto Gargarella, Carol Gould, Alex Gourevitch, Alex Guerrero, Daniel J. Hill, Brendan Hogan, Juan Iosa, Jan Kandiyali, Bruno Leipold, Su Lin Lewis, Fernando Lizárraga, Barry Maguire, Tom O’Shea, Romina Rekers, Indrajit Roy, Sagar Sanyal, Igor Shoikhedbrod, Claire Smith, Lucas Stanczyk, Roberto Veneziani, Nicholas Vrousalis, Stuart White, Jonathan Wolff, Gabriel Wollner, and Lea Ypi.

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