Supplement to Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism

Embedding Problem Response Strategies

Much if not all of the recent innovations in non-cognitivist theorizing stem from attempts to answer the Frege-Geach objection. It might thus be helpful to go into somewhat greater depth about the embedding problem and responses to it. This supplement does that by going into more detail than the main text about various non-cognitivist strategies for addressing that objection. It roughly corresponds to the last several sections of section 4.1 of the main entry but goes into more detail than the main text.

A logic of attitudes

It is a condition of adequacy for the project of extending moral semantics to embedded normative claims that the embedded sentences and the judgements stand in the intuitively correct logical relations to one another. One standard cognitivist way of explaining the logical relations between attitudes is to offer an account of the contents of the states that are also good candidates for being the contents of the sentences that express those attitudes, for example by postulating propositions as the semantic values of sentences and the contents of beliefs. Beliefs and sentences can then each inherit their logical relations from the logical relations among the contents they express. And the norms of belief revision then include constraints which reflect responses to those logical relations. For example, one such proposal would postulate norms of belief revision that require us to try (other things equal) to eschew inconsistency in the contents of our thoughts. That norm would be responsive to the independent fact that such contents stand in the logical relation of contradiction to one another.

An influential contrasting non-cognitivist approach to explaining the logic of normative sentences and attitudes starts from the other end, postulating norms governing combinations of attitude that do not (much) depend on prior relations of implication or consistency among their contents. From there the strategy goes on to generate relations of implication and consistency between the sentences that express these attitudes as reflections of the norms which in the first instance govern attitudes directly. If there are norms governing the co-acceptance of attitudes such that certain combinations are ruled out perhaps those norms can also underwrite the relation of logical inconsistency that we intuitively find among the sentences expressing those judgments. And from there perhaps we can explain logical implication by deploying the fact that the premises of valid arguments are inconsistent with the negation of the conclusions of those arguments. If the general idea is promising, non-cognitivists should aim to provide a systematic story linking simple and complex sentences to attitudes of the right sort to capture intuitive logical relations among those sentences.

Several such accounts begin with conditionals with evaluative antecedents. The focus on these no doubt stems from concern with the examples that Geach used to motivate his worry. One popular approach has been to suggest that conditional judgements are higher order attitudes aimed at the judgements that would be expressed by the sentences which they embed. These higher order attitudes might either be complex beliefs (Blackburn 1971) or further non-cognitive judgments (Blackburn 1984) expressed by the complex sentences. The hope is that these judgments will have rational connections to the other judgments that are likely to play a role in valid arguments. If all goes well, a kind of pragmatic incoherence or irrationality will be involved when someone accepts the judgments of a valid argument so analyzed while at the same time rejecting the conclusion. Such a speaker would be in a state similar to those uttering sentences of the sort that feature in Moore’s paradox, such as ‘It is raining but I don’t believe that it is.’

A simple example of this sort of approach comes from Blackburn. Conditionals express higher order attitudes towards accepting certain conjunctions of attitudes. “If lying is wrong, telling your little brother to lie is wrong,” (when sincerely uttered) expresses approval of making disapproval of getting one’s brother to lie “follow upon” disapproval of lying.

…Anyone holding this pair [the above attitude, plus the attitude expressed by ‘lying is wrong’] must hold the consequential disapproval: he is committed to disapproving of getting little brother to lie, for if he does not his attitudes clash. He has a fractured sensibility which cannot itself be an object of approval. (Blackburn 1984, 195)

Logical entailments involving moral judgments are explained as follows: A complete constellation of attitudes which includes the attitudes expressed by the conditional and by the seemingly assertive premises but not also including the attitude expressed by the conclusion is irrational, because it goes against the purposes of moral discourse. Somewhat more sophisticated ways of working out this strategy can be found in several places, including further work by Blackburn himself (1988b), but the basic idea is well exemplified in this proposal.

The proposal also well exemplifies the program of quasi-realism. By displaying our practices of inference as making sense despite their non-cognitivist roots, Blackburn hopes to vindicate those practices. If the program goes through for enough of our standard ways of speaking and reasoning, including the other embedded contexts not currently under discussion, he hopes to show how we can “earn the right” to talk as if these judgments are true.

The logic of attitudes strategy has met with much resistance on the part of cognitivists. It seems to many that the answer conflates genuine inconsistency with mere pragmatic incoherence (Hale 1986; Schueler 1988; Brighouse 1990; Zangwill 1992; van Roojen 1996). In fact it might seem that this is obvious; if we define validity or entailment in terms of truth preservation, arguments with purely non-cognitive premises will not even be candidates for validity and relations among them will not be entailments.

This quick way of arguing that the strategy involves conflation is probably too quick as these critics largely recognize. Even before Geach raised his version of the challenge to non-cognitivism, Hare pointed out that there can be relations between commands that are very much like the logical relations between descriptive utterances, so much like them that we would expect them to receive a common explanation. ‘If it is raining, take an umbrella,’ and ‘If it is raining, you will take an umbrella,’ interact logically with ‘It is raining’ in very similar ways and seemingly for similar reasons. This inspired Hare to invent a model of linguistic meaning with two components. Recall that one, the phrastic, represents a proposition or state of affairs, and the other, the neustic, functions as something like a force indicator, insofar as the neustic indicates what speech-act is being performed with the phrastic. The proposition represented might be asserted or denied, prescribed or proscribed, and so on (Hare 1952, 17–22). Hare hoped that the logical connectives could be included as parts of the phrastic (Hare 1952, 21), so that a common set of logical rules could be used to explain most of the standard inferences in any mood using some standard logical principle relating judgments involving those connectives. Nevertheless he did include some extra rules, such as a rule forbidding imperatival conclusions based on premises that include no imperatives.

The payoff was supposed to be a unification of logic for sentences in various moods, including moral sentences which Hare thought were a species of universal imperative. A full assessment of the adequacy of the system would be beyond the scope of this entry. It is not obvious how the proposal is supposed to work in full generality, and it is hard to see how treating logical connectives solely as components of the phrastics can do all the needed work. But the phenomenon that Hare was pointing to – that the relations between certain imperatives are very much like those between similar descriptions – gives non-cognitivists a response to the objection that only genuinely truth-apt judgments can stand in logical relations to one another. While some have doubted the possibility of a logic of imperatives (Ross 1944; Williams 1963) some contemporary theorists still hope to put imperative logic on a firm foundation (Lemmon 1965; Green 1997; Vranas 2008, 2010). It is an interesting question how a successful completion of that project will impact the debates over embedding.

Critics of explaining logic in terms of rational or pragmatic relations between attitudes can grant Hare’s basic point. That prescriptions can stand in logical relations to one another does not entail that pragmatic or similar coherence or incoherence forms the basis of these relations. Furthermore, they argue, the reduction of logical inconsistency to pragmatic inconsistency carries with it a potential liability: it requires us to find the former whenever we find the latter. Those who employ the reduction are committed to finding logical inconsistency in what seem to be merely Moore-paradoxical sentences involving morality, such as ‘Laughing is wrong, but I don’t believe that it is.’ If other sentences may express the very same attitudes as moral sentences express, these too will have to stand in the same logical relations to other sentences that moral judgments expressive of those attitudes do. That can force the theory to be highly revisionary of our ordinary judgments about logical consistency and implication. For example, most theorists regard Moore-paradoxical sentences as consistent but self defeating. But if the Moore-paradoxicality of a set of moral attitudes is supposed to justify counting moral judgements that express them as inconsistent, we should regard these sentences as inconsistent. We seem to have two unattractive options, treat all such sentences as logically contradictory or limit the move to those with normative content (van Roojen 1996).

There are ways to resist this line of objection (Weintraub 2011). One is to be extra careful about the kind of expression that grounds the assignment of attitudes as the semantic values of sentences (Gibbard 2003, 75 ff.; Schroeder 2008a, 2008c at 28, 2011,70 ff.). Not every sentence which expresses a higher order attitude in an everyday sense of expression may stand in the semantic expression relation that expressivists postulate. We’ll look more closely of some of the more sophisticated systematic approaches to these problems in the final section of this supplement.

Many theorists skeptical of non-cognitivism have done some of their best work to reconstruct the details of the suggested logic of attitudes and assess their adequacy. By considering various intuitively available judgments and applying the non-cognitivist accounts to them they have aimed to uncover logical relations that are not easily captured using this approach (Hale 1993, 354). Many of the specific criticisms turn on the details of the particular proposals up for assessment, but there are some more general complaints that seem to recur.

Perhaps the simplest criticism has to do with “the negation problem” for expressivist theories. One datum to be explained is the logical inconsistency of the sentences “Murdering is wrong,” and its negation, “Murdering is not wrong.” The attitudes-first approach does this by mapping each onto an attitude which it expresses and then showing that the attitudes in question are inconsistent or disagree with one another. Intuitively the first sentence expresses disapproval of murdering. The problem now is to find an attitude incompatible with it and which plausibly is expressed by the second sentence. And it turns out to be difficult to find an attitude to do the job.

There are three ways to negate the claim that Fred believes that murder is wrong:

(1) Fred does not believe that murdering is wrong.
(2) Fred believes that not murdering is wrong.
(3) Fred believes that murdering is not wrong.

Intuitively these ascribe different states of mind to Fred, and the third ascribes the attitude expressed by our target sentence. But when we negate the attitude ascription constitutive of the simple expressivist analysis (Fred disapproves of murdering) we don’t have enough candidate attitudes to capture all three. We have only:

(1*) Fred does not disapprove of murdering. And,
(2*) Fred disapproves of not murdering.

And these plausibly correspond to the first two attitudes towards murder expressed in (1) and (2). But it is the third which ascribes belief in the negation of the claim that murder is wrong, so we have not yet got our explanation (Unwin 1999, 2001; Hale 2002; Dreier 2006; Schroeder 2008b, 2008c).

This is not to say that there are not ways forward for the non-cognitivists (Dreier 2006, Horgan and Timmons 2006b, Schroeder 2008b, 2008c). One strategy is to back away from pragmatic incoherence as the explanation of the inconsistency in question while sticking with the idea that the basic explanatory resource is the incompatibility of some attitudes with others. Horgan and Timmons (2006b) postulate an infinite hierarchy of primitive inconsistency relations between the attitudes which are expressed using the sentences which we pre-theoretically regard as inconsistent. For example, they postulate that the attitude expressed by ‘Lying is wrong,’ is inconsistent with the attitude expressed by ‘Lying is not wrong’. But they say no more to explain why this is so. It is just a primitive fact about these attitudes (and many others) that they have this sort of incompatibility. The large number of primitive incompatibilities postulated by the theory makes critics worry that no real explanatory work is being done. (Schroeder 2008b, 2008c) All should agree we would have a more unified account if we could construct the story with fewer primative inconsistencies. But theorists might have different views about how much primative inconsistency is tolerable. Dreier (2006) suggests that non-cognitivists might be able to give a plausible explanation of inconsistency if they can find a way to distinguish between indifference and indecision. And he makes some suggestions for how that may be done using preference as the basic attitude. Silk (2015) takes up the idea of using preference (specifically weak preference) to generate an ordering relation. The logical constraints of preference can then be used to explain the logical relations among normative sentences if the meanings of these sentences can be defined in terms of these orderings. He calls the resulting view “Ordering Expressivism”.

The minimalist maneuver

Some have suggested that minimalism or deflationism about truth or truth aptness can ride to the rescue of non-cognitivists at this point (Stoljar 1993; Horwich 1993). If so, perhaps the non-cognitivist can bypass the above debates. A very rough characterization of minimalism about truth will hopefully suffice to explain. Minimalist theories are often presented by contrast with theories of truth according to which truth is some sort of “substantial” relation or property. For example correspondence theories which claim that truth involves a real relation between truth-bearers and reality are often cited as paradigm cases of a substantial theory of truth. Minimalists about truth suggest that truth is not such a substantial property. Others propound a version of minimalism by claiming that to understand what truth is one need not grasp anything more substantial than some rather minimal claims. These proponents suggest that the minimal claims needed are insufficient to require anything very substantial that all truths must have in common. Different minimalists formulate these claims in somewhat different ways: Some suggest that what one needs to know is simply that calling a sentence true is just to assert or affirm the sentence (Ramsey 1927). Others hold that sentences of the form ‘S is true’ can generally be replaced by ‘S’. Still others suggest that one has only to accept the theory consisting of all the sentences of Tarski’s Schema T – ‘S’ is true iff S – where the sentence ‘S’ is mentioned on the left hand side and used on the right hand side. And others require that one accept all propositions of the form: The proposition that P is true iff P (Horwich 1990, 18–22). Some minimalists extend these accounts further to proffer so-called “minimal truth-conditions”. Their idea is that the T-schema tells us how to generate such conditions. Just as ‘grass is green’ is true just in case grass is green, ‘nepotism is wrong’is true just in case nepotism is wrong. This, some minimalists believe, is all we need to know to understand the truth-conditions of moral sentences. More would need to be said to give a full explanation of deflationism about truth, but this should suffice for our purposes.

For more detail on minimalism see the entry on deflationary theories of truth.

It should be reasonably obvious how deflationism about truth can help with one sort of embedded context – those in which a moral sentence follows ‘It is true that.’ If expressivists can give us an adequate account of a moral sentence, such as ‘Teasing the cat is wrong,’ then deflationism tells us that the same account should be sufficient for sentences like ‘It is true that teasing the cat is wrong.’ But it has been suggested that minimalism can provide help in other contexts as well (Blackburn 1988; Stoljar 1993; Horwich 1993). The thought seems to be that all it takes to solve the embedding problem is for it to be appropriate to call moral sentences true, for those sentences to embed grammatically in longer sentences in the usual ways, and lastly for us to have a relatively clear set of conditions on the appropriate use of the target sentences. Minimalism about truth secures the first requirement so long as the target sentences are meaningful, the indicative form of the relevant atomic moral sentences plus our linguistic practices secure the second, and the positive non-cognitivist proposal for the meanings of the terms brings along a story about appropriate and inappropriate use. The motivating ideas here may be as follows: We know how to explain the meanings of more complicated truth-functional embeddings by showing how the truth values of the whole are functions of the truth-values of the component sentences. Minimalism allows us to generate a minimal truth condition for any meaningful indicative sentence, such as ‘Lying is wrong’ is true iff lying is wrong. So minimalism might put the non-cognitivist in a position to make sense of sentences embedding moral predications just as we make sense of any sentences embedding any predications by building up from the truth conditions of the component sentences. The minimalist non-cognitivist can then attempt to avoid Geach’s charge of equivocation by suggesting that the minimal truth condition is the meaning of normative predications whether asserted or embedded. The resulting position will be a version of non-cognitivism so long as minimal truth conditions can be distinguished from more robust truth conditions, and so long as the negative non-cognitivist claims are construed in a more robust non-minimal way (Stoljar 1993, 93). Alternatively non-cognitivists might give up formulations of their favored contrast in terms of truth and truth-aptness and employ robust notions of representation or propertyhood. They can then deny the representational nature of moral sentences or that they predicate properties, and contrast them with other, fully cognitive discourse, while deploying minimalist truth and minimalist truth-conditions to handle embeddings.

Things may not be as easy as this for the minimalist non-cognitivist. An example of Dreier’s can be used to make the point. He imagines a predicate, ‘hiyo’. The term is used in getting someone’s attention. It evolved in the following way: Early on speakers would say ‘Hiyo Bob!’ upon meeting up with Bob as a way of getting Bob’s attention. Soon the practice evolved further. Speakers began to utter ‘Bob is hiyo,’ to perform the same speech act as they had previously performed by uttering ‘Hiyo Bob!’ Suppose now that a theorist wants to explain the meaning of ‘hiyo’. The theorist can begin by presenting a speech act account of that meaning – ‘hiyo’ is used in the speech act of accosting someone. The theorist then adds to this explanation an inference-rule account of the meanings of sentential connectives, such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘if … then’. The sentence, ‘Bob is hiyo’ is well formed, and it embeds grammatically in longer sentences. The theorist has explained the functioning of those longer sentences by specifying via inference-rules how they interact with yet further sentences to mediate inference. It would thus seem that the account is on a par with those versions of non-cognitivism which try to use minimalism by itself to solve the embedding problem. If those accounts are adequate we should know what ‘If Bob is hiyo, then there is a dingo about,’ means. But, Dreier suspects we won’t know and he concludes that the same holds for the parallel strategy with respect to moral utterances. More than what minimalism provides will be needed to elucidate the meanings of normative predications in such embedded contexts (Dreier 1996a, 42–44). At this stage of the literature, it remains controversial what more, if anything, is needed, but the general point is quite powerful (Sinnott-Armstrong 2000, Dreier 2004b, Dreier 2018, Simpson 2018, Golub 2021).

Using descriptive content in a hybrid theory,

We’ve noted that skeptics about the expressivist program often complain that logical relations are first and foremost relations between the contents of attitudes and sentences that express them. Non-cognitivists can grant this point if one of several strategies that combine a logic of attitudes with a logic of their contents can be made to work. There are several different ways this might be accomplished.

One alternative, hybrid expressivism, uses the alleged descriptive component of the meanings of moral judgments to generate most of the required logical relations. We noted earlier that non-cognitivists have long granted evaluative utterances and thoughts some secondary “descriptive meaning” and that hybrid theorists have gone on to give that descriptive meaning nearly co-equal status. One motivation for such views is the present one: Hybrid theorists hope to explain logical relations by using the descriptive component of meaning to do much of the work.

According to this approach moral terms have descriptive content and that content is a property. Hybrid theorists don’t all agree on what that property is, nor do they agree on how it is determined by the semantics or even on whether it is determined by the semantics as opposed to pragmatics. On one influential implementation of the hybrid strategy the property is determined by the actual moral attitudes of the speaker. If the speaker morally approves of all and only sweet things, then this property is sweetness. An ordinary judgment that such and such is right might then predicate sweetness. If the speaker morally disapproves of all and only the sour things then her judgments of wrongness predicate sourness as the descriptive meaning of ‘wrong’. And so on. In embedded contexts, this secondary component becomes the semantic value of the embedded moral expression. ‘If lying is wrong, then he will lie,’ has an antecedent whose embedded content is the same as a statement predicating the property on which the speaker’s moral disapproval supervenes. Thus, continuing with our example, the sentence says the same thing as, ‘If lying is sour, then he will lie.’ And the content of this conditional will interact with the secondary descriptive meaning of the unembedded moral judgments to determine its logical functioning so that we get the implications we would expect. Differing proposals of this general sort say somewhat different things about exactly how the descriptive content is expressed. (Barker 2000; Ridge 2006a; Ridge 2006b) or quasi-expressed (Jackson 1999), but the basic idea is worked out in similar ways.

Hybrid theorists of this sort then propose to use the descriptive contents contributed by moral terms and moral sentences to explain the logical relations between these. Since moral predicates can contribute descriptive content of just the sort that cognitivists postulate, inconsistencies between the descriptive contents expressed will occur whenever cognitivism would predict inconsistency. But more needs to be done to get entailments wherever descriptivism would predict it. Insofar as normative conclusions are hybrid, the logic of just the descriptive components doesn’t ensure that the non-cognitive component is entailed wherever we have an intuitively valid argument (Schroeder 2009, 268 ff). The simplest suggestion is to have the normative terms contribute a constant non-cognitive attitude where ever they occur. The result, if all goes according to plan, is a logic for normative terms which generates all the entailments that would be generated if moral terms contributed only descriptive content.

Cognitivists have raised doubts about the adequacy of these proposals due to the manner in which the descriptive meaning is determined. If it is the actual attitudes of the speaker that determine the property, a speaker may not use the same term to pick out the same property on each occasion of use. For attitudes can change. They might even change quickly and this can lead to worries about the validity of arguments that employ moral terms. A speaker may have the relevant attitude towards one property when she considers earlier premises, only to change her attitude during the course of the overall argument. Thus Geach’s original charge of equivocation might still be appropriate in some circumstances (van Roojen 2005; Schroeder 2009; Lenman 2019). Furthermore, it isn’t at all obvious how moral terms thus construed can be used to communicate the descriptive property that is a component of the semantic value, unless we presuppose that the audience knows a lot about the speakers moral attitudes. In fact, it isn’t clear how they can communicate the specific attitude expressed either, if its object and hence its content differs from speaker to speaker as many of these views allow (Schroeder 2009). Hybrid theorists have, of course, resisted these complaints (Alm 2007; Ridge 2007, 2014; Eriksson 2010).

The aforementioned worries can be used to motivate a different implementation of the hybrid idea, one which takes slurs or epithets as a model. One such proposal suggests that simple slurs and moral statements in the indicative mode conventionally express two states of mind – a belief that the subject of which the term is predicated has a certain property and a pro or con attitude towards such subjects. These views differ from those discussed immediately above in holding that the descriptive properties picked out by the moral terms don’t vary depending on the speaker’s attitudes. Rather, as with slurs, there are supposed to be a nonvariable descriptive content as determined semantically. Proponents of this kind of view often suggest that the mechanism whereby the nondescriptive meaning gets communicated is analogous to conventional implicature (Copp 2001, 2009; Boisvert 2008). The details vary between different implementations of the idea, at least partly because there is controversy about conventional implicature (Bach 1999). In any case, the overall suggestion is that insofar as the descriptive contents are just what a cognitivist would take them to be, the logical relations among the descriptive components of meaning for any set of statements would stand in the relations they need to stand for a non-revisionary logic for moral terms and sentences.

The remaining task is to ensure that the non-cognitive component plays by rules that do not either leave part of a normative conclusion unsupported or cause incoherence in the non-cognitive side in such a way as to generate inconsistency where there seems to be none. Again, the simplest way to secure the first desideratum is to let each normative term always contribute the same non-cognitive element to what is expressed (Boisvert 2008; Schroeder 2009, 2010). Then a normative term used in a set of premises will already express the normative content the term expresses in the conclusion. This is actually a pretty strict requirement. It doesn’t mean just that the term must express the same attitude type on each occurrence; it also requires that the attitude take the same object. For example, if the conclusion of an argument expresses a con attitude toward lying it is not sufficient that one of the premises expresses that attitude towards cheating. It must express that attitude towards lying so that the premises commit the speaker to the attitude expressed by the conclusion.

The simple strategy does raise some questions. It seems intuitive that belief reports don’t express attitudes but rather report the subject has the attitude that would be expressed by the complement of “So and so believes that …” In as much as non-cognitivists want to use their commitments to help explain internalism this is a result non-cognitivists have independent reason to endorse. If we want to explain why Sarah, who thinks that cursing is wrong should be expected not to curse, it is her attitude and not the attitude of the person attributing it to her that will do the explanatory work. But this feature is arguably not shared by slurs – a slur in a belief report is generally taken to express the negative attitude of the speaker and not the person whose beliefs are being reported (Schroeder 2010, 201ff). And it may be that expressives in general – that is terms which conventionally express an attitude – function to express the speaker’s attitudes even in belief reports and in indirect quotation (Potts 2005; Bach 2006). If so, that is some reason to doubt that moral terms could function as such expressives while working as required in belief reports. Schroeder (2013) and Toppinen (2013) each propose yet more complicated cousins of hybrid theory that in effect express a relationship between one’s relevant beliefs and attitudes. These views seem to somewhat abandon the hybrid theorists ambition to offload the logic to a descriptive component of the judgement.

Attitudes and contents, revisited.

Allan Gibbard’s two related proposals (Gibbard 1990, 2003) and Mark Schroeder’s Being For (2008c) constitute the most sustained assaults on the embedding problem to date. Both pay special attention to compositionality. That is they aim for the sort of generality that would enable a unified and systematic treatment of judgements including normative judgement that extends easily to more complex constructions. Each is thus worth some individual scrutiny on its own terms.

Gibbard’s two proposals were partly designed to solve the embedding problem. Gibbard suggests we can use an extension of possible worlds semantics to capture normative contents consistent with his norm expressivist analysis. The extension generates a set of world-norm pairs by pairing each possible world with each possible set of consistent and complete norms. Consistent complete sets of norms divide naturalistically described act-types into those which are permitted, required, or forbidden in such a way that no action can be both required or permitted and also forbidden. Sets of these pairs are then used to represent the contents of moral judgments. On Gibbard’s preferred way of doing this, particular judgments rule out sets of these pairs. For example, judging an action forbidden will rule out any pair in which the world member of the pair represents the action as satisfying a complete naturalistic description which is not sufficient to classify an action as forbidden according to the set of norms forming the second member. The set of the remaining pairs which the judgments do not rule out represent the contents of the judgments.

From here the approach is further extended to handle the contents of conjunctions, disjunctions, and conditionals and to explain how these interact logically. Contents of conjunctions are the intersections of the sets representing their conjuncts. Contents of disjunctions are the unions of the sets representing the contents of the disjuncts. Contents of conditionals will be the union of the set representing the negation of the antecedent and the set representing the consequent. Judgments are inconsistent if the intersection of their contents is empty. Arguments are valid if the premises are inconsistent with the denial of the conclusion (Gibbard 1990, chapter 5). A parallel structure works in basically the same way in Gibbard (2003) where plans take the place of norms. So both systems do a relatively nice job of capturing the logical relations between judgements involving the logical connectives, though there is still dispute on its adequacy to deal with negation as discussed above (Dreier 2006; Schroeder 2008b, 2008c).

Because the connectives are defined as functions that operate on the contents of the judgements they connect, Gibbard’s work presents a strategy for producing a semantics that delivers contents for all the more complex constructions. At the same time it also gives us a sense of which attitude each judgement expresses in virtue of Gibbard’s employment of the analogy with possible worlds semantics. Just as believing that P is ruling out possible worlds in the complement of the set that represents P, accepting a plan Q is ruling out those world-plan pairs that exclude Q. Accepting the complex P iff Q rules out accepting world-plan pairs that have one without the other. The story looks like it might generate a logic of attitudes from the logic of the contents of those attitudes. That idea looks particularly promising if one thinks that the moral of Geach and Searle’s objections is that we must distinguish attitudes from the contents of the sentences that express them. That seems to have been Searle’s verdict when he accused non-cognitivists of committing the “speech act fallacy.” He thought that sentences bear their logical relations to one another in virtue of their contents, and not in virtue of the speech act that they are used to accomplish (Searle 1962). Gibbard’s sets of world-norm pairs treated as the contents of moral sentences, looks to allow non-cognitivists to make the relevant distinctions (Dreier 1998). The suggestion is especially attractive in light of the fact that Gibbard’s apparatus can be adapted to work with any model theory for propositional attitudes that a theorist might use to replace possible worlds (Dreier 1999).

If the world-norm pair apparatus is used to generate genuine contents for the judgments in question – contents which are independent of the force with which sentences are used and which explain the logical relations among them, it might be worrisome that the contents are not distinctively non-cognitivist. Ruling out a norm might be a cognitive state for all the formal apparatus requires. World-norm pairs could be used to capture the thoughts of a moral realist who believes that there are genuine moral properties supervening on the natural properties of the world. The possible worlds component of the model would represent beliefs about the supervenience base, while the norms or plans would be needed to represent a person’s beliefs involving the supervenient moral properties. On this proposal the norms or plans are needed to represent the contents of the realist’s thought because different realist theories might have the moral properties supervene on different nonmoral properties and a person could be a realist without being committed to the truth of any particular realist theory. An opinionated realist might have views about the exact supervenience relation which would be represented by a set of pairs in which the second member – the norms or plans – was the same for each pair in the set. But a less opinionated realist might have her beliefs represented by a set in which the second member varied. Similarly, but in a somewhat different way, indexical relativism can make use of the apparatus to represent moral beliefs consistent with its analysis (Dreier 1999).

We noted above that negation raises some of the thorniest embedding issues. There may or may not be such a problem with Gibbard’s treatment of negation. Gibbard glosses negation of the judgement that X is permissible as an attitude of ruling out a set of lower order attitudes, those involved in the various plans to do X. And this may involve collapsing the distinction between plans as contents and plans as attitudes. In any case, Schroeder (2008b, 2008c) suggests that Gibbard has not quite succeeded in constructing a logic of attitudes which involves just one kind of attitude directed at various contents. Recall that Schroeder distinguishes A-type and B-type inconsistency with the former involving just one sort of attitude which inherits its consistency or inconsistency from the consistency or inconsistency of its content. Schroeder believes A-type inconsistency to be the most familiar. And he thinks it is the best candidate for providing an expressivist explanation of the logical relations moral judgements enter into. Schroeder’s Being For (2008c) is an attempt to work out such an account and assess it’s adequacy.

Once one opts for an A-type account, it becomes clear that it would be helpful to have some additional structure to capture the logical relations among judgements involving negation and so on. Schroeder suggests an expressivist can generate such structure by complicating the story about what the attitudes in question are attitudes towards. The specific proposal is to that ‘lying is wrong’ (for example) expresses a non-cognitive attitude not directly towards lying but towards blaming for lying. Adding this extra structure into the attitudes creates more places to fill with negations and promises to generate the full range of attitudes it seems a person can have. Recall that here are three ways to negate the claim that Fred believes that murder is wrong:

(1) Fred does not believe that murdering is wrong.
(2) Fred believes that not murdering is wrong.
(3) Fred believes that murdering is not wrong.

If being for is the attitude exploited by the account (attributed by ‘is for’), we can generate four distinct attitudes towards blaming for murdering:

(0*) Fred is for blaming for murdering.
(1*) Fred is not for blaming for murdering.
(2*) Fred is for blaming for not murdering.
(3*) Fred is for not blaming for murdering.

Just as someone who accepts that murdering is wrong disagrees with someone such as Fred as described by (3) who believes it is not wrong, the attitude attributed by (0*) seems to be inconsistent with that attributed by (3*). And the inconsistency seems to be of type-A as Schroeder intended (Schroeder 2008b, 2008c 59 ff). From this beginning Schroeder argues the approach can be extended to a plausible account of sentences with normative contents joined by various logical connectives. Natural language includes sentences embedding both normative and non-normative atomic sentences. These require additional work to tame. Without going into too much detail it should be apparent that a commitment to reducing all inconsistency to A-type inconsistency must require such sentences to express the same non-cognitive attitude as normative utterances. And it must also extend the approach back to simple non-normative sentences as well. For it is a commitment of the A-type approach that we work with one attitude whose logical relations are inherited from that of the contents. There is something a bit ironic about this given the motivations for non-cognitivism, which started out postulating a divide between normative and descriptive language. In any case, Schroeder suggests that believing P comes to being for proceeding as if P, in cases where P is representational (2008c).

As it turns out, the added structure required to handle evaluative negation causes trouble when applied to representational judgements and the solution involves postulating two different contents for atomic representational judgements. The belief that P must express a state of being for both proceeding as if P and for not proceeding as if not P. This tweak in turn requires parallel dual contents in normative judgements. This is accomplished trivially by just doubling the very same content already expressed. All of this extra work is required so as to remain with the A-type approach. And it engenders Schroeder’s name for the proposal, “bifurcated attitude semantics” (Schroeder 2008c).

So goes an outline of the basic theory. It is still unclear how much further the overall approach can be extended. Schroeder’s prediction at the end of the book is somewhat pessimistic (2008c, 177 ff). He suggests that there will be trouble extending the treatment to tense, modals and quantifiers and that this spells trouble for expressivism. The advocates of expressivism have also been pessimistic about prospects for bifurcated attitude semantics, suggesting that it is not the way forward. They typically disagree with Schroeder about the merits of a type-A strategy committed to working with one basic non-cognitive attitude type (Horgan and Timmons 2009; Mabrito 2009; Richard 2011). They suggest instead that extant B-type semantic theories will turn out to be adequate. Debate of these issues continues to be robust with much of the argument turning on issues which require a great deal of attention to detail.

Many non-cognitivists have remained unimpressed with cognitivist complaints about embedding (Blackburn 1998, 72). In fact it appears that there is not really even agreement on what the problem is. While some consider it an adequacy condition on any solution to the embedding problem that it vindicate certain inferences as valid, others think that the task is to explain why we reason as we do (Björnsson 2001), or perhaps why it is rational to reason as we do. And they may suggest that this last verdict is itself just one more non-cognitive judgment.

Fictionalism promises to bypass much of this debate while defending psychological non-cognitivism. Recall that hermeneutic fictionalists accept psychological non-cognitivism, but reject semantic nonfactualism. Thus the semantics of moral sentences is just as the realist says it is. Moral sentences do predicate properties both in their free-standing uses and when embedded (MacIntyre 1981; Kalderon 2005b). Hence such fictionalist postulates no equivocation and can use whatever a realist is entitled to use to explain relations of implications between contents. The fictionalist would be free from the task of solving Geach’s problem taken as the task of explaining why modus ponens and other forms of inference validly apply to moral sentences (Kalderon 2005b, 2008a, 2008b). But she does shoulder the related task of making sense of moral reasoning, and of explaining the point of fictive use of moral sentences. In this latter task she claims to have at her disposal many of the resources and arguments proposed by fully non-cognitivist theories. Where this leaves the overall argument has been the subject of some debate. Kalderon claims that quasi-realist interpretations of moral thought can be appropriated to make sense of our use of the relevant terms. But critics suggest that if these explanations turnout to be adequate quasi-realists would be able to solve the Frege-Geach problems on their own terms (Eklund 2007, 2009; Lenman 2008). A relevant issue seems to be whether the logical relations among the attitudes expressed must be the same as the logical relationships that hold among the sentences used to express them. And this in turn may depend on the nature of the expression relation posited in deploying the strategy. An expressivist semantics requires a one-one mapping of non-synonymous sentences to states of mind, but insofar as fictionalism doesn’t require a nonstandard semantics it may be able to get away with a looser connection between the mental states and the sentences that express them.

For a related discussion see section 4.6 of the entry on fictionalism.

Copyright © 2023 by
Mark van Roojen <>

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