Moral Particularism and Moral Generalism

First published Tue Nov 22, 2016; substantive revision Mon May 1, 2023

Among the many questions that arise in the attempt to come to philosophical grips with morality is what role, if any, moral principles have to play. Moral generalists think morality is best understood in terms of moral principles; moral particularists deny this. To many people, ordinary moral practice seems suffused with principles (keep your promises; do not steal; do unto others as you would have them do unto you). To many moral theorists, the central task of moral theory has been to articulate and defend moral principles, or, perhaps, a single ultimate moral principle (maximize impersonal happiness; act only on maxims that can be willed as universal law). The debate between particularists and generalists thus has the potential to force a reassessment of both moral theory and moral practice.

This characterization of the debate is so far too impressionistic to provide a tractable framework for philosophical inquiry. The literature reveals many ways to sharpen the debate, and sharpening is indeed needed. But both generalism and particularism are best seen as intellectual traditions in moral philosophy, each of which has a number of distinct but related strands. This article attempts to disentangle some of those strands with the most attention being given to recent stages of this debate.

The arguments for and against both particularism and generalism are also diverse, arising from metaphysics, epistemology, normative theory and the philosophy of language. These arguments also interact in interesting ways with other debates in moral philosophy. Finally, it is very much an open and interesting question to what extent other areas of philosophy (e.g., the philosophy of language and epistemology) can usefully draw on ideas developed in the debate between moral particularists and moral generalists.

More recently, these debates have been juxtaposed with non-Western traditions. For example, there has been some discussion of whether some central works in Taoism presuppose particularism (Fraser 2022). There has also been some discussion of how these debates interact with the pragmatist tradition (Jackson 2017).

1. Historical Introduction

Aristotle might reasonably be characterized as the “forefather” of particularism. Aristotle famously emphasizes that ethical inquiry is mistaken if it aims for “a degree of exactness” too great for its subject matter, and added that moral generalizations can hold only “for the most part”. Moreover, Aristotle tirelessly emphasizes that ethics ultimately concerns particular cases, that no theory can fully address them all, and that “judgment depends on perception” (NE, 1109b). These ideas have all deeply inspired contemporary particularists (John McDowell is a prominent case, though he does not tend to label himself as a particularist; see McDowell 1981, 1998). Whether Aristotle should ultimately be interpreted as a particularist is a matter of debate (Irwin 2000; Leibovitz 2013).

Interestingly, no single major historic figure is most obviously characterized as the “forefather” of generalism. This is presumably because the most important historic generalists in effect defended generalism by defending specific moral theories or principles. The two most important traditions here are the deontological tradition which owes so much to Kant, and the consequentialist tradition which owes so much to the British utilitarians (Bentham, Mill and Sidgwick). Nonetheless, each of these traditions substantially enriched the generalist approach with a wealth of ideas and distinctions which need not be restricted to the theories in which they were originally formulated.

The Kantian tradition puts enormous weight on the idea that morality must be principled and that the ultimate principle of morality must be one we can know a priori. According to Kant, the moral law as applied to imperfect agents who are subject to temptations, provides what he called a “categorical imperative”—an imperative whose rational authority is not dependent on the agent’s contingent ends. Kant provided several formulations of the categorical imperative. The so-called “universal law” formulation holds that one must always act so that one’s maxim could at the same time be willed as a universal law. The humanity formulation holds that one must always act so as to treat humanity, whether in one’s own person or that of another, always as an end and never merely as a means. The Kantian tradition emphasizes common sense moral ideas like respect and dignity, and provides a distinctive interpretation of the role of universalizability in moral thought. On some readings of Kant, the moral law must itself be constitutive of being a rational agent at all. This idea has, in turn, been enormously influential, especially in the late twentieth and early twenty-first century.

Consequentialism enriched the generalist framework in other ways. Most notably, perhaps, consequentialists have often distinguished between two very different kinds of principles, corresponding to two rather different roles they may play. On the one hand, there are principles—call them “standards”—which provide the deepest explanation of why certain actions are right or wrong. On the other hand, there are the principles which ordinary agents ought to follow in their day to day deliberations. Such principles are “guides”. Consider a simple analogy with the stock market. The principle which explains what counts as success might simply be “buy low and sell high”, but this principle is woefully inadequate as a guide to making investment decisions in real time. A principle like “have a diversified portfolio” seems much more suitable for the latter role.

Each of these traditions (the Kantian and the consequentialist) faces a number of prima facie powerful objections. It is therefore perhaps not surprising that there was ultimately a reaction against the broader generalist aspirations that these theories embodied. On some readings, one of the earliest particularists in the modern sense was Ewing, who in The Morality of Punishment (1929) argued that consequentialism and deontology were the only plausible principled conceptions of morality, that neither was defensible, and that morality was therefore not principled (cf. Lind & Brännmark 2008 interview with Dancy, who explicitly characterizes Ewing in this way at p. 10).

Just one year after Ewing in effect defended a fairly radical form of moral particularism, W.D. Ross argued for a more moderate form. Ross occupies a very interesting place in the history of particularism, as he has served as both an inspiration and a foil to modern particularists. Ross put forward a battery of “prima facie duties” specifying types of conduct—for example acts of gratitude—that are always, in some sense, obligatory. The obligation in question need not be an all things considered one, however, since a conflicting prima facie duty might, in the circumstances, be more important.

Setting aside whether Ross thought anything theoretically useful could be said about how to adjudicate conflicts of prima facie duty, he did not think it useful to try to formulate exceptionless principles with regard to all things considered duty (cf. Postow 2006). Ross thus appears to be a generalist about prima facie duty, but a defender of particularism about overall duty. Some contemporary particularists, however, insist on going beyond Ross and casting doubt even on principles of prima facie duty, or principles specifying which considerations are pro tanto (or “contributory” in Jonathan Dancy’s terminology) reasons.

Jonathan Dancy has done more than anyone to articulate and defend an especially radical form of particularism. Although Ross was both a foil and an inspiration for Dancy, R.M. Hare was a more immediate opponent. Hare’s prescriptivism drew on ideas from both the Kantian and the consequentialist tradition. Hare defended a strong form of universalizability which can be traced to Kant, but Hare then argued that universalizability lent support not to a deontological moral theory, but to a form of consequentialism. Indeed it led to a form of consequentialism which emphasized the distinction between standards and guides (cf. Hare 1963).

In the introduction of Moral Reasons, Dancy summarizes his conclusions as the “mirror image” of Hare’s. Perhaps most notably, Dancy objected to an idea which he took to be implicit in Hare’s universalizability principle, that if a consideration is a reason in one context then it is a reason with the same valence in any possible context in which it occurs. (This reading of Hare is open to objection. See McNaughton and Rawlings (2000) for discussion.) Dancy calls this idea, which he also attributes to Ross, “atomism” in the theory of reasons and argues against it and in favour of what he calls “holism”.

As Dancy’s early work came to fruition, it inspired his then-colleague David McNaughton to advance distinct but complementary arguments for particularism. McNaughton was also heavily influenced by the work of John McDowell, who had argued that it was an advantage of his own brand of moral realism that it did not presuppose generalism (see McDowell 1981; see also Blackburn 1981). In Moral Vision, McNaughton defended a form of moral realism which he argued lent support to particularism. He also argued that particularism better accounts for moral conflict, fits reasonably well with ordinary practice and can explain why we might reasonably be suspicious of the very idea of a moral expert.

The work of Dancy and McNaughton inspired a host of other philosophers to carry forward the particularist research programme, sometimes in rather different directions. This eventually led to a wide variety of views all going under the heading of “particularism”. Nor were the challenges posed by these many moral particularisms ignored by those with more generalist sympathies. Woken from their generalist slumbers, they began to develop arguments for generalism which did not depend on the correctness of any particular moral principle(s). This generated a healthy debate, the contours of which the rest of this entry will outline.

2. “Particularism” and “Generalism” are said in many ways

Particularists are united in their opposition to moral principles and generalists are united in their allegiance to them. What, though, is a moral principle? At least three conceptions of principles are worth distinguishing. First, there are principles qua standards. Standards purport to offer explanations of why given actions are right or wrong, why a given consideration is a reason with a certain valence and weight, why a given character trait is a virtue, and the like. An especially robust metaphysical spin on this conception understands standards as being truth-makers for moral propositions (cf. Armstrong 2004). Second, there are principles qua guides. These purport to be well suited to guiding action. Third, there are principles purporting to play both of these roles simultaneously—action-guiding standards.

It is not hard to see these different conceptions of moral principles at work in the history of moral philosophy. In the utilitarian tradition in moral philosophy, the principle of utility (however it is formulated) is characteristically understood as a standard. Even if some politically minded utilitarians see advantages to using the principle of utility to guide public choice and justification, moral philosophers tend to follow Mill in thinking that the principle is seldom apt for use in individual moral decision-making. They thus deny that it should be understood as a principle qua guide. Indeed, some utilitarians go further and argue that the principle of utility is self-effacing, in the sense that it recommends its own rejection (cf. Railton 1984; see also Parfit 1984). Utilitarians instead hold that various maxims of common sense morality should be understood as heuristics which work well enough for normal human beings, so there is room in this picture for principles qua guides.

Kant, on the other hand, seemed to have understood the categorical imperative as a kind of action-guiding standard. Kant’s discussion of examples in the Groundwork (1785) and his characterization of the Formula of Universal Law as appropriate method for testing our maxims makes clear that he thinks of it as appropriately guiding the actions of the morally virtuous agent. Equally clearly, the categorical imperative is to be understood as the most fundamental explanation of why given actions are right or wrong, and so also counts as a principle qua standard. On a constitutivist reading, the categorical imperative is meant to play both of these roles in virtue of its constituting our rational agency. Finally, it is worth noting in this context that a principle can function usefully as a guide even if its application requires judgment and sensitivity; principles qua guides need not be algorithmic.

Principles can also be distinguished in terms of their scope. Some principles have purely non-moral antecedents (e.g., the principle of utility), whereas others use moral concepts in both their antecedents and consequents (e.g., “if an action is just then it is morally permissible”). Finally, principles can be distinguished in terms of whether they are in some sense “hedged”, including a ceteris paribus clause of some kind (e.g., “other things equal, lying is wrong”), or unhedged.

One might be a particularist or a generalist about moral principles understood in any of these ways. Whether being a particularist or generalist about principles in one sense drives one to be a particularist or a generalist about principles in another sense is not a trivial question. Further complicating matters, there is more than one way to oppose principles (however those principles are conceived.) Last, the form a particularist’s opposition takes might reasonably vary across different types of principle. Let us now review different ways one might oppose principles.

The simplest form of opposition, Principle Eliminativism, simply denies that there are any moral principles. Of course, it must be borne in mind here and below that a principle eliminativist may deny that there are any principles of one sort, while allowing for principles of another sort. For example one might be an eliminativist about principles purporting to give the application conditions for moral predicates in entirely non-normative terms (McNaughton 1988) or an eliminativist about exceptionless principles (Little 2000). Principle Scepticism holds, more modestly, that we do not have sufficient reason to believe there are any moral principles. Principled Particularism holds that while any given moral truth is explained by a moral principle, no finite set of moral principles can explain all the moral truths (Holton 2002). Anti-Transcendental Particularism, which at one point at least was Dancy’s favoured gloss of the view, holds that moral thought and judgment does not depend on the supply of a suitable stock of moral principles. Finally, Principle Abstinence asserts a more practical opposition to moral principles, holding that we ought not be guided by moral principles. For each of these forms of particularism, there is a corresponding form of generalism which is simply the denial of the particularist thesis in question.

Although this taxonomy entails that the logical space for particularist (and generalist) views is wide and heterogeneous, it would be a mistake to assume that all of the positions which can be derived from a matrix constructed on the basis of these distinctions really are distinct in any deep way. For example, Principle Eliminativism about principles qua guides arguably is equivalent to Principle Abstinence about principles tout court.

3. Metaphysical Arguments

The debate between particularists and generalists is often framed in metaphysical terms. In this guise, the debate primarily concerns principles conceived as standards. Moral principles might then be thought of as true and law-like generalizations about moral properties or, alternatively, as nomic regularities involving moral properties. To be clear, generalizations in the relevant sense need not actually be instantiated to be true; plausibly, the moral law would still be true in a world with no agents and hence with no right or wrong actions. This view has been developed, in different ways, by McKeever and Ridge (2006), Väyrynen (2006, 2009) and Lance and Little (2007), though it is not universally accepted (see Robinson 2008, 2011). Thus understood, particularism is often taken to have an affinity with non-reductive or non-naturalist views in ethics. Furthermore, it has been noted that contemporary particularism arose alongside a resurgence of interest in non-naturalism (cf. Little, 1994). To a degree, this is understandable. After all some naturalist views appear to entail generalism. A form of reductive naturalism according to which being morally right is metaphysically identical with being an act which maximizes human happiness appears to entail a robust utilitarian principle and so, a fortiori, to entail generalism. Furthermore, if one denies any kind of reduction of moral properties to natural properties then it becomes more difficult to see how any informative statements connecting moral and non-moral properties could be sufficiently law-like to count as principles. Nevertheless, one ought not to take it as given that non-naturalists must be particularists or that naturalists must be generalists. Both classic and contemporary non-naturalists have endeavored to defend principles (Moore 1922 [1903]; Shafer-Landau 2003). Furthermore, there may be room for particularists to embrace naturalism by claiming that particular reasons are always grounded in some particular natural property instance while maintaining particularism by claiming that there are no law-like generalizations connecting moral and non-moral property types. Perhaps because the commitments and resources of non-naturalist and naturalist views in metaethics (and even how properly to distinguish these views from each other) remains contested, one cannot uncontroversially map the generalism/particularism debate onto the naturalism/non-naturalism debate.

Non-naturalism would seem to have less bearing on a further question: whether there are moral principles connecting one moral property to another. This issue is at play in Ross’s rejection of Moore’s claim that the right action is the action which maximizes the good. Even if Ross relied on Moore’s own “open question” strategy to challenge Moore’s utilitarian principle, it is nevertheless the case that Moore’s principle is at least consistent with non-naturalism. More recently, philosophers sympathetic to particularism have divided over the availability of intra-moral principles. Some are content to allow that a claim such as, “the fact that an action is just is a reason in its favour”, is true and informative (cf. McNaughton and Rawling 2000). Others propose a more radical particularism according to which even intra-moral principles—that is, principles linking one moral concept with another—are unavailable (cf. Dancy 2004: ch 7).

Naturalists and non-naturalists typically share a commitment to supervenience. Roughly put, supervenience says that, necessarily, there can be no moral difference without some natural (or non-moral) difference. There are various ways to interpret supervenience and its metaphysical significance. So long as we reject a global error theory, though, supervenience seems to guarantee some necessarily true universal generalizations involving moral predicates.

Nevertheless, it is generally agreed by all sides that such “supervenience functions” should not count as moral principles. The grounds offered for this are various, but include that such generalizations contain much potentially irrelevant information, that they are massively disjunctive, and that they lack explanatory import (cf. Little 2000; Dancy 2004; McKeever and Ridge 2005). The idea is that to be a successful moral principle (qua standard) requires more than a true or even necessary connection between the descriptive and the moral. The connection must be explanatory and not cite irrelevant features in the antecedent either. Even those who gesture at supervenience in mounting arguments for generalism concede that a successful argument requires significant additional semantic or epistemological premises (see below, and cf. Jackson, Pettit, & Smith 2000).

More recently the metaphysical status of principles (as standards) has been taken up by philosophers exploring the metaphysical relation of grounding. These philosophers agree that moral principles must be law like and that they must be metaphysically explanatory but defend importantly different positions on the specific role principles play. On one view (Rosen 2017a; 2017b; Enoch 2019), we should allow that moral principles themselves serve as the partial grounds for particular moral facts. By analogy, one might think that a particular legal fact is partially grounded by non-legal facts, say facts about what someone did while also being partially grounded in legal facts to the effect that conduct such as that has a certain legal status. Similarly, entirely non-moral facts or properties would not be sufficient to ground particular moral facts. A moral principle or in Rosen’s terminology a bridge law is needed. If this bridge law is not itself grounded in non-moral facts, then this variety of generalism constitutes a form of non-naturalism. One route for the generalists to avoid any commitment to non-naturalism is to adopt a more deflationary of account of moral principles according to which moral principles do not serve as even the partial grounds of particular moral facts. On this view, developed and defended by Berker (2019), moral principles are “explanation serving” because they refer to the non-moral properties that, themselves, fully ground particular moral facts.

While particularism has strong affinities with non-naturalism, the most prominent argument for particularism—the argument from the holism of reasons—has proceeded from a more targeted and specific claim about the metaphysics of moral reasons (see McNaughton 1988; Dancy 1993; Little 2000). According to holism about reasons, a consideration that counts as a reason in one case may not count as a reason in another case, or may count as a reason, but in a different direction. By way of illustration, the fact that a remark would be funny might be, in one case a reason for making the remark, in another case a reason against making the remark, and in still another case no reason at all. In short it depends on context. Importantly, holism is meant to be a universal and modal claim. It says that for any consideration that is a reason it is possible that that consideration might behave differently in another case. Thus understood, holism is consistent with the possibility that some considerations are, as a matter of fact, reasons (of the same force and direction) in every case. Holism also seems to presuppose that the considerations that are reasons are not brutely unique; the insight of holism—if it is an insight—is built upon the thought that a consideration which is a reason in one case is repeatable in other cases. Only if, for example, the funniness of a remark is a consideration that is repeatable can we say, as the holist wants us to, that the funniness of a remark is a reason in one case but is not a reason in another.

Those attracted to holism about reasons agree that it is typically specific elements of context that further account for whether a consideration counts as a reason, and a rich language for characterizing context has been developed. For example, a putative reason might be defeated, enabled, or intensified by specific elements of the context. To continue the previous example, the fact that a genuinely funny remark would also be offensive might defeat whatever reason-giving force that the humor might otherwise have had. On this reading, the humor of the remark is no reason at all; not just a reason that is outweighed. To vary the case again, the fact that one’s audience will appreciate a (non-offensive) funny remark enables the humor to be a reason. Here the humor is a reason, but only against the background of a receptive audience; the background functions as an “enabler”. Finally, the fact that a funny remark will break an unduly somber mood may intensify the force of humor as a reason. Humor itself is especially apt, but only because the mood is unduly somber. Other factors could function as attenuators, weakening the force of a reason (see Dancy 2004: ch 5).

Holism depends crucially on the sustainability of the distinction between the particular considerations that count as reasons and the contextual factors (defeaters, enablers, etc.) that impact whether a consideration counts as a reason. Context-sensitivity without such a distinction would be unable to explain why a feature which is a reason in one context can fail to be a reason in another. Moreover, we need to know why the relevant features should not be “hoovered up” into the content of the reasons themselves. After all, atomists need not be simple atomists. A hedonist who held that pleasure and pain are both always reasons and the only reasons, would certainly count as an atomist. But atomists can allow for significant pluralism and complexity. One way to do so is to insist that the considerations that a holist calls, variously, reasons, defeaters, enablers, and so on are all but parts of a larger more complex “whole” reason. Such views have been proposed by Bennett (1995), Crisp (2000), Hooker (2003) and Raz (2000), and rejected by Dancy (2004: 6.2). One worry about the atomists’ appeal to whole reasons is that if reasons are identified with large complexes of facts, then the same reason may seldom recur across cases and the claim that agents act for reasons may fall under threat (Price 2013).

Setting aside whether holism is true, does it support particularism? Generalists have rejected the inference on the grounds that holism leaves open the possibility that the behaviour of reasons, defeaters, enablers, and intensifiers/attenuators is codifiable (see Väyrynen 2004; McKeever and Ridge 2005). They also observe that some paradigmatic generalists seem to have exploited this logical space. For example, Kant arguably thinks that the fact that a course of action would advance someone’s happiness is of variable moral significance, counting in favor whenever the happiness and its purchase is consistent with the categorical imperative and counting as no reason at all otherwise (McKeever and Ridge 2005). Particularists have countered that even if holism is logically consistent with principles it would nevertheless render them “cosmic accidents” (Dancy 2004: 82). If this were right it would be enough to cast doubt on the generalist tradition in moral philosophy. Why should the heart of a discipline be the search for cosmic accidents?! Generalists counter that whether principles are cosmic accidents depends entirely upon underlying metaphysical issues and not on whether principles tolerate holism. For example, if the property of being good is identical to the property of being non-malicious pleasure, then the associated holism tolerating principle does not look to be a cosmic accident (see McKeever and Ridge 2006: 2.2).

Selim Berker (2007) has challenged the particularist argument from holism in another way. He argues that the conjunction of holism with what he calls the particularist’s “noncombinatorialism” about the ways reasons combine to fix an overall verdict leaves the particularist with no coherent notion of a reason for action. To understand noncombinatorialism, one must first understand the idea of a “combinatorial function”. A combinatorial function takes as input all the reasons and their valences in a given situation and gives the rightness or wrongness of actions in that situation as an output. Noncombinatorialism simply asserts that the combinatorial function for reasons cannot be finitely expressed (and so, in particular, is not additive). Berker argues that particularists are committed to noncombinatorialism, but that this leaves them with no coherent notion of a reason for action. Particularists typically gloss being a reason as “counting in favour” of that for which the consideration is a reason. Berker’s point is that talk of a consideration “counting in favour” of something is itself hard to make intelligible once we abandon a combinatorial conception of how reasons combine to fix an overall verdict. We are left with a metaphor that cannot be cashed out in any helpful way. Particularists could of course abandon the noncombinatorial conception of reasons, but Berker argues that this would commit them to the truth of numerous exceptionless principles, thus compromising their particularism. (For critical discussion of Berker’s argument, see Lechler 2012.)

So far we have focused on generalist replies to metaphysical arguments for particularism. Generalists are not without positive metaphysical arguments for their own views, though. Most notably, so-called “constitutivists” sometimes invoke premises about the metaphysics of rational agency to argue for generalism. Kantian constitutivists are the most influential and clear-cut instance of this style of argument. Christine Korsgaard, for example, argues that the categorical imperative is constitutive of rational agency (Korsgaard 2008, 2009). The rough idea is that the principles of practical reasons unify us as agents, and allow us to take control over our representations of the world and our movements (Korsgaard 2008: 9). Insofar as simply being a rational agent commits one to the relevant principle(s), this strategy for defending generalism is also meant to be especially effective at silencing sceptical challenges, e.g., classic “why be moral?” challenges. The thought is that the sceptic has no coherent perspective from which to reject the relevant principles.

Whatever the success of these metaphysical arguments, some particularists have worried that an excessive focus on metaphysics threatens to lead us astray—not to falsehood so much as misplaced emphasis. The ontological status of moral laws and the grounding of moral reasons ought not predominate the particularist program. Instead, the particularist should emphasize how their account of moral psychology makes sense of moral development and competence (see Bakhurst 2008, 2013).

4. Epistemological Arguments

Particularists and generalists typically share a commitment to moral knowledge. This common ground is not strictly entailed by either view. For example, proponents of Hare’s universal prescriptivism will insist that moral thought is principled even if, in their rejection of the truth-aptness of moral language, they deny that there is moral knowledge. On the other side, a fictionalist might reject moral knowledge while insisting that the moral fiction is itself devoid of principled structure, just as the particularist insists. Nevertheless, both generalists and particularists do in fact typically see moral thought and judgment as achieving (sometimes) significant success and in this context the shared commitment to moral knowledge is not surprising.

Particularists and generalists often treat moral knowledge as being on a par with other types of commonly accepted knowledge. Just as we can know that our internet connection is running slow, that the milk is on the verge of going stale, or that our friend is annoyed by the story just told at his expense, so too we can know that it would be wrong refuse directions to the person who is lost, that our co-worker was courageous to criticize her supervisor, and that the American justice system treats many people unfairly. Because the commitment to moral knowledge is a shared one, many of the arguments both for and against particularism have sought to use it for dialectical leverage. The questions at stake include whether particularism or generalism best explains our capacity to achieve moral knowledge and whether particularism or generalism best models the person who has and uses moral knowledge.

Some moral knowledge, it is agreed, involves the transmission or extension of other moral knowledge already achieved. If Solomon tells me the treaty is unjust, I may know this by relying on his testimony. If every member of the Diogenes Society whom I have met is honest, then I may know that Walter, who is also a member, is honest. Here, I rely on an induction from my other moral knowledge. While highly interesting, these types of knowledge are typically regarded as derivative (Zangwill 2006) and are therefore set aside in arguments over moral particularism. The question is what explains our most basic moral knowledge. How strong an assumption can be made about our moral knowledge while remaining on ground common to both generalists and particularists? Obviously, particularists will not grant that we have knowledge of moral principles, and the point of surest agreement is that we sometimes know the moral status of a particular case, e.g., that this act was wrong. However, most arguments both for and against particularism deploy somewhat stronger assumptions.

First, one may make a stronger assumption about the objects of moral knowledge. Of special interest is the possibility that we can know general truths about morality even while such general truths fall short of counting as moral principles. For example, while particularists will deny that there is any exceptionless moral principle to the effect that pain is bad, many sympathetic to particularism would agree that, as a general matter, pain is bad and that we can know this. On a deflationary reading, one might treat the claim that pain is bad as a useful heuristic, a reminder that pain has often been bad in the past and may well be so in the future (Dancy 1993). Alternatively, that pain is bad might capture an interesting metaphysical fact about pain; its default status is the status of being bad. We can understand default status in terms of an explanatory asymmetry. When pain is not bad there must be something that explains why it is not, but when pain is bad there needn’t be any further explanation of what makes pain bad (Dancy 1993, 2004). Finally, one might try to invest such generalizations with real explanatory power while insisting they remain exception laden. That pain is bad is a kind of defeasible generalization, where this amounts the claim that pain is bad in a privileged set of worlds (Little 2000; Lance and Little 2004; for critical discussion of each of these possibilities, see Stangl 2006).

Second, one may make a stronger assumption about the scope of moral knowledge, at least for some people. Some people, one may assume, are (or become) especially good at acquiring moral knowledge; they have a measure of practical wisdom or expertise. Their knowledge thus readily extends not just to their actual circumstances but to a broad array of novel circumstances as they arise. In so far as this is so, we should like to have a good explanation not only of how humans acquire specific knowledge but also of how they develop over time into more competent moral knowers (Bakhurst 2005, 2013).

Two models of moral knowledge predominate in defences of particularism: a perceptual model and a skill based model. According to the perceptual model successful moral judgment is properly analogous to sense perception even if it is not, literally, a form of sense perception (McDowell 1979, 1985; McNaughton 1988). Moral judgment on this view depends upon a range of sensibilities, developed through experience and acculturation. Once developed, however, one can just “see”, for example, that a certain response is merited by a situation. As John McDowell puts it,

Occasion by occasion, one knows what to do, if one does, not by applying universal principles, but by being a certain kind of person: one who sees situations in a certain distinctive way. (McDowell 1979: 350)

Since sensibilities may be more or less refined, the perceptual model appears to fit well with the idea that there are both moral novices and experts. Whatever further account is to be given of these sensibilities, the resulting knowledge is not dependent upon any deduction from general moral principles, at least not one transparently and readily available to the knower. Generalists have observed that similar perceptual metaphors seem equally apt in domains that admit of principles (McKeever and Ridge 2006: ch 4). For example, one might just “see” that a sentence is ungrammatical even if grammaticality is rule-governed. Furthermore, some who develop and defend a perceptual model are not led by it to particularism (Audi 2013). So the perceptual model of moral knowledge seems not to establish particularism, but it was likely never meant to. Instead, the perceptual model is intended to offer more indirect support. If our moral experts reliably achieve moral knowledge without self-consciously adverting to moral principles, then the generalist inherits at least some burden to explain why principles should be a centerpiece of moral theorizing.

Two related constraints confront the development of the perceptual model and may threaten the particularism the model is taken to support. The first is that the model must extend to prospective and hypothetical cases. Particularists and generalists typically agree that we sometimes have knowledge that if we were to perform an action (say maintain a confidence) in our actual circumstances, that action would be right. This seems essential if moral knowledge is to precede and guide virtuous conduct. Similarly, if slightly more controversially, we sometimes have knowledge that a certain course of conduct would be right in some hypothetical circumstance. While one might try to account for such cases by appeal to inductive reasoning from past actual cases, this is not, in fact, how proponents of the perceptual model have proceeded. The second constraint arises from the fact that moral properties are grounded in other properties. For example, it barely makes sense to say that an action’s wrongness is a brute fact about it; if wrong an action must be wrong on account of some otherwise specifiable features it has. While this “because constraint” admits of various explications, the basic idea is common ground and widely thought to be a priori (Zangwill 2006).

Generalists argue that, once spelled out, the perceptual model is not the a posteriori epistemology it might first have seemed but instead commits us to a priori intuitions relating moral features to their grounds. Particularists may grant that basic moral knowledge is a priori knowledge of “what is a moral reason for what” (Dancy 2004: 141) while maintaining that the object of knowledge remains particularized and does not implicate principles. One challenge for the particularist is that “what is a reason for what” in a particular case is contingent, and so the particularist risks being committed to a priori knowledge of contingent truths. In his defense of particularism, Dancy has been willing to embrace this apparent consequence (Dancy 2004; for criticism, see McKeever and Ridge 2006). Other particularists have sought to avoid the implication (Leibovitz 2014).

Particularists sometimes pursue a somewhat different model of moral knowledge, one that likens the practically wise agent to a person who has a developed skill. Just how different this model is from the perceptual one must depend upon how each is spelled out. But whereas the perceptual model directs our attention first to how the virtuous person understands her situation, the skill model draws attention to the knower as agent, someone who classifies actions, agents, and states of affairs as falling under moral categories, who reasons to moral conclusions, and ultimately puts their knowledge into outward action. How might this skill be understood and, relatedly, how much of an account of it does the particularist owe? Some particularists (sometimes) demur. For example, Dancy described the virtuous agent as someone possessed of a “contentless ability” to discern what matters when it matters (Dancy 1993: 50). But many sympathetic to particularism would want to say more (Garfield 2000; Leibovitz 2014). One might liken the skill of the virtuous person to a behavioral ability, such as the ability to ride a bicycle. While this analogy could prove apt, it risks underrating the extent to which the virtuous person’s action is rich with judgment and reasoning and is not simply a sequence of successful performance.

One way to develop the skill model is to urge that the skill of the virtuous person is akin to the skill of the person with conceptual competence and then rely on Wittgensteinian rule-following considerations to urge that conceptual competence cannot be fully understood in terms of rules or principles. This approach lends itself to a form of particularism that is less hostile to principles. The claim is not that there are no principles but that practical wisdom cannot be fully reduced to principles (McDowell 1979). A perhaps similar strategy can be pursued by focusing on principles of reasoning and urging that valid principles of reasoning cannot be treated simply as objects of propositional knowledge akin to premises (Carroll 1895; Thomas 2011). One seeming consequence of these strategies is that particularism it not something distinctive of morality and other cognate domains. Particularism would be true everywhere we apply concepts or everywhere we reason. Some might welcome such global particularism, but we would have lost what for some was initially attractive—that particularism seemed to identify something distinctive (even if not unique) about morality. A second worry is that particularism may no longer pose the threat to traditional moral theory that is sometimes supposed. If the categorical imperative were shown to have the same status as modus ponens, Kantians could sleep easily.

Another way to develop the skill model could urge that the skill in question is the skill of applying (or reasoning with) generalizations of a certain kind. Here the claim may be that moral principles (or generalizations) require judgment to apply, or are defeasible, or come with implicit ceteris paribus clauses. This commits the particularist to principles of a kind, while also allowing both that morality is importantly distinctive and that some traditional moral theorists have erred by seeking a sort of principle that is not to be found. This path leads to interesting intermediate positions that are certainly more friendly to principles than Dancy’s particularism while at the same time concerned to emphasize the limitations of principles. For example, Richard Holton (2002) suggests that sound moral principles are conditionals containing an implicit “that”s it’ clause. The dictum that lying is wrong is then more perspicuously expressed as the claim that if an action amounts to lying and “that”s it’ then the action is wrong. In this context, “that’s it” expresses the idea that no other moral principle, given the facts at hand, supersedes the principle that lying is wrong.

A different but similar idea is developed by Mark Lance and Margaret Little, who advance a model of true but defeasible moral generalizations. Here, the claim that lying is morally wrong is elaborated as the claim that lying is wrong under privileged or normal conditions. Conditions might fail to be privileged for any number of reasons—perhaps because the murderer is at the door looking for your helpful information or, less dramatically, we might be playing a game in which deception is part of the fun. As this last possibility suggests, Lance and Little’s proposal seems more expansive than Holton’s in so far as they allow that a moral generalization might fail to govern a situation not only in the case that it is superseded by other moral principles but because the circumstances might be such that the point of the moral generalization is simply lost. (See Little 2000 and Lance and Little 2004. For discussion of the skill needed to apply generalizations see Garfield 2000 and Thomas 2011. For discussion of reasoning with defaults see Horty 2007.) Many of Lance and Little’s most effective examples are of generics like “tigers have stripes.” More recently, Ravi Thakral has argued that moral principles just are applications of generics (Thakral forthcoming). His work draws heavily on recent work in the philosophy of language and philosophy of mind on how generics work. Thakral shows the explanatory power of this framework by emphasizing how some generics admit of far more qualification than others. For example, compare ‘mosquitos have wings’ with ‘mosquitos carry West Nile virus’. Thakral makes good use of this range of generics to argue that a moral principle like ‘pleasure is good’ might on his model admit of far fewer exceptions than ‘stealing is wrong’. In a limiting case a moral principle on this approach may even be exceptionless, with ‘torturing babies just for fun’ being like the generic ‘in chess, bishops move diagonally’. Thakral also provides some very interesting discussion of how this bears on reasoning with principles, as well as the role of moral principles in explanation, in moral knowledge and in teaching morality to children.

One interesting question for this approach is whether the skill part of the equation can be further explicated in terms of principles, even if these further principles are grasped only implicitly. This issue has received significant attention from philosophers outside the particularism debate who are interested in the question whether knowledge-how can be reduced to knowledge-that (Ryle 1946; Stanley 2011). Perhaps surprisingly, the literature on particularism has not (to our knowledge) drawn significantly from that debate.

Some generalists, agreeing with particularists that moral knowledge presupposes a sensitivity to the moral landscape and skill in deploying what appear to be ceteris paribus laden principles, argue that such sensitivity and skill is possible only if the landscape itself is sufficiently patterned (McKeever and Ridge 2006) This argument is supposed to allow for holism about reasons, and so the relevant patterning consists in there being a finite number of considerations that can function as reasons, and that these can be affected by a finite number of enablers and defeaters operating in regular, “principled” ways. Particular pieces of moral knowledge, on this argument, presuppose only “default moral principles” which specify a feature which ground reasons, ceteris paribus. A full array of exceptionless principles, the argument continues, are presupposed by practical wisdom, characterized as including a capacity for reliably acquiring moral knowledge in a full range of novel circumstances.

Some resist this argument in its entirety on grounds that we can regularly gain knowledge in other areas without recourse to principles (Schroeder 2009). Some charge that the second stage of the argument depends on overly strong assumptions about the extent of practical wisdom (Schroeder 2009), and that more modest forms of practical wisdom can be explained without recourse to exceptionless principles. Some argue that a proper account of hedged moral principles is enough (Väyrynen 2009); others prefer to see moral wisdom as a skill which, while wide ranging, can fail in utterly novel circumstances (Leibowitz 2014). Still others have worried that the argument relies on inflated assumptions about what is required for justification and knowledge, for example that the knower must be in a position to affirmatively rule out any possible defeaters (Thomas 2011).

A recurring charge against generalism is that it assumes an outmoded deductive-nomological (D-N) account of successful explanation. According to that account, any successful explanation must take a deductive structure in which a covering law is identified that, together with empirical information, could yield a conclusion expressing the phenomenon to be explained. For many reasons, the D-N model is now widely thought to be misguided.

On behalf of the generalist, one might make two points. First, it is not clear that a generalist argument from practical wisdom needs to assume that all successful explanations must conform to the D-N model. The argument draws upon claims about the person of (highly ideal) practical wisdom and asks how best to explain her reliability. Second, while the argument does insist that we must credit the virtuous agent with at least an implicit grasp of a principle, it is less clear that the argument must treat this principle as functioning as the major premise in a deduction. Likewise, we might credit an agent with grasping modus ponens to explain her logical success without thereby assuming that she uses modus ponens as a premise.

5. Semantic/Conceptual Arguments

Generalists sometimes invoke premises about the nature of moral concepts or about the meanings of moral words to argue for their view. Ultimately these arguments appeal to what can be derived from a certain kind of competence—either semantic or conceptual competence. It is probably no accident that purely semantic/conceptual arguments to settle the debate over particularism/generalism have been monopolized by generalists. If the generalist could show that semantic/conceptual competence commits one to some specific moral principle(s), or to the existence and availability of some such principles, then that would already be enough to establish an ambitious form of generalism. By contrast, a particularist who showed only that such competencies do not yet commit one either to some specific moral principle(s) or to the existence and availability of such principles would not yet have established a very ambitious form of particularism. For that negative conclusion is logically consistent with the availability of a convincing epistemological, practical or metaphysical argument for the existence and availability of suitable moral principles.

Generalists can and have proceeded in one of two main ways here. First, they might argue that semantic/conceptual competence directly commits one to the truth of some specific moral principle(s). Second, they might argue that such competence commits one only to the weaker thesis that if there are any substantive moral truths then there must be some true moral principle(s). This second thesis is weaker both in that it takes a conditional form, so that an error theorist could endorse it but deny the existence of any true moral principles and in that it does not entail that there is some specific moral principle(s) to which one is committed insofar as one thinks there are substantive moral truths. Consider each of these strategies in turn.

The most ambitious and straightforward version of the first strategy is effectively just to argue for a form of analytic naturalism in meta-ethics. For example, consider the meta-ethical theory that “is morally right” just means “is an action which maximizes happiness”, where “happiness” is itself cashed out in purely naturalistic terms. Any convincing argument for that theory would provide a way of carrying out a very ambitious version of the first of the two strategies discussed above. Clearly, insofar as that theory is correct, semantic competence with “is morally right” is enough to commit one to the thesis that, necessarily, an action is morally right if and only if it maximizes happiness, and that certainly looks like just the right sort of generalization to function as a principle qua standard in the sense laid out in section 2.

Of course, this strategy for defending generalism is for good reason a highly controversial one. For a start, nobody has come close to offering a fully reductive definition of predicates like “is morally right” which has met with widespread assent. Moreover, some philosophers are sceptical of the very idea that knowing the meaning of a word (or possessing a concept) is already enough, in principle, to know how to live a good life. In way, this concern about pulling a highly substantive rabbit out of a purely semantic/conceptual hat can be seen as what lies behind one of the historically most influential arguments against analytic naturalism, namely G.E. Moore’s “Open Question Argument” (Moore 1922 [1903]). Finally, anyone who is initially sympathetic to particularism is very unlikely to find analytic naturalism an ex ante plausible view, given how trivially it entails a very robust form of generalism. There is a sense, then, in which this strategy for defending generalism, however sound it might turn out to be, is unlikely to convince anyone who needs convincing (cf. Jackson, Pettit, & Smith 2000—the argument there seems ultimately to turn into a version of this first strategy).

A less ambitious form of the first strategy focuses on so-called “thick” evaluative words or concepts. Such words/concepts in some sense have both specific descriptive and normative contents. Concepts associated with virtues and vices are classic examples of thick evaluative concepts—concepts like courage, justice, fairness and generosity are all paradigm cases. The argument for generalism focusing on these concepts takes the same form as the more ambitious argument just canvassed. That is, the argument derives a commitment to moral principle(s) from mere conceptual/semantic competence.

However, the intended conclusion of an argument in this style is more modest. For here the relevant principles do not take one from a purely descriptive antecedent to a purely normative all things considered consequent, as with (e.g.) the principle of utility. Rather, the relevant principles here take one from an antecedent deploying a thick evaluative concept (like the concept of justice) to a consequent deploying a thin normative concept (like the concept of a reason). Such an argument might maintain, for example, that competence with the concept of justice commits one to a moral principle of the form, “if an action is just then there is at least some reason to perform it (namely, its justice)”.

Even this modest form of generalism is not uncontroversial. Dancy, for example, argues that even thick evaluative features can vary in their normative valence from one context to another, going so far as to maintain that “almost all the standard thick concepts…are of variable relevance” (Dancy 2004: 121). Insofar as this sort of view is as much as semantically/conceptually coherent, there can be no straightforward derivation of moral principles of the sort canvassed above from mere semantic/conceptual competence. Of course, there may be more “hedged” principles linking thick evaluative concepts with thin normative concepts—principles which either enumerate or quantify over further conditions which must be met before the application of a thick evaluative predicate entails the application of a thin normative predicate. In effect, this is just the point about holism not entailing particularism again. However, it is also unclear just how one would plausibly argue that insofar as such hedged principles are not vacuous, they really do follow from mere semantic/conceptual competence.

There may also be some interesting asymmetries between virtue concepts and vice concepts which are relevant to how we should think about these arguments. In an interesting series of papers, Rebecca Stangl has argued for a view she calls “asymmetrical virtue particularism” (Stangl 2010). On this view, an action is right, all things considered, insofar as it is overall virtuous. However, the virtues of an action in any specific respect (justice, courage, or whatever) can vary in normative valence. However, vices on this view are invariable—they always count against an action. The deeper explanation of this asymmetry, on Stangl’s view, is that virtues have “targets” at which they aim, whereas vices are simply tendencies to miss the relevant targets. Vices are thus parasitic on virtues but not vice-versa. Thus a given virtue (e.g., mercy) can sometimes be wrong-making because it helps explain why the agent (badly) misses the target associated with some other virtue (e.g., justice). By contrast, Stangl argues, a vice always is a tendency to miss some relevant target, and so is therefore always to that extent wrong-making. Insofar as Stangl makes a convincing case for this asymmetry (and obviously a lot more could be said about this), we should be less sympathetic to arguments which hold that there is a semantic/conceptual link between the virtuousness of an action in a specific way and the presence of an associated reason for action.

A different take on the virtues in relation to particularism has been developed by Constantine Sandis (Sandis 2021). Sandis argues that we should be generalists about the moral virtues but particularists about deontic concepts like the concept of what one ought to do, a reason for action, moral duty, and the like. While a directive like “be kind” might hold without exception on this view, Sandis argues that this does not entail that you should always act kindly – and that we should reject principles of the latter form. One advantage of this combination of views, according to Sandis, is that it can more easily explain our practices of moral education. If the virtues have invariant moral value, then it is easier to see how moral education can proceed. Sandis also discusses the relationship between exemplifying a virtue and acting virtuously on his view, which he argues more radical particularists must say implausible things about.

Moreover, this more modest form of generalism presupposes that our thick concepts of justice, courage, generosity, and the like must be genuinely evaluative concepts. But this is controversial. Pekka Väyrynen (2013), for instance, argues that the evaluations we typically associate with thick terms such as “just” and “courageous” are conversational implications which arise from our use of those words in a wide range of contexts. Very roughly, the idea is that evaluative content is a kind of generalized content which is explained pragmatically. For example, it may become common knowledge that only people who disapprove of the sexually explicit tend to use the word “lewd”. In that case, someone who uses that word thereby implies that she disapproves of the sexually explicit – otherwise, why use the word “lewd” instead of “sexually explicit”, given that one’s interlocutors will reasonably infer from the use of the former that one disapproves of the sexually explicit.

If this is right, then the status of thick words as evaluative depends on contingent facts about the pragmatics of our use of those words. There is then an important sense in which thick terms are, on this view, descriptive in their semantic content. So although there is a broader kind of speaker competence which involves understanding the conversational defaults associated with the relevant words, this is not the kind of semantic competence that could ground an argument for generalism or particularism. Semantic competence with thick words is also unlikely to commit one to any interesting moral principles. Depending on our views of concepts, this view about thick language can allow that some thinkers’ concepts of justice, generosity, and courage may be evaluative. But that is unlikely to be essential to those concepts, nor will the capacity forthought about justice and other thick notions depend on having genuinely evaluative thick concepts (Väyrynen 2013: 123–4, 206). In that case, competence with concepts like justice, courage, and generosity is also unlikely to commit us to any interesting moral principles. Moreover, the more modest form of generalism may require that a concept isn’t a concept of justice, or courage, or generosity, unless it is evaluative. In that case the pragmatic view of thick evaluative language would support the view that there are no thick evaluative concepts and, therefore, no such thing as competence with thick evaluative concepts.

However, generalists do not have a monopoly on arguments which take theses about thick evaluative concepts/predicates as their main premise. Some particularists argue that thick evaluative concepts are “shapeless” with respect to the descriptive (see especially McDowell 1981). Others take a more metaphysical approach, and argue that thick evaluative properties are “irreducibly thick” in a way that puts pressure on the generalist. Indeed, some go so far as to suggest that this even undermines some important forms of supervenience (see, e.g., Roberts 2011). Whether these arguments are forceful may depend on the extent to which the argument that there really are thick evaluative concepts or properties in the needed sense can avoid begging the question. In this context, it is not enough that no “shape” at the descriptive level is built into the meaning of evaluative concepts. Such a weaker shapelessness thesis would seem to rule out only principles that are both analytic and reductive. But it seems compatible with the possibility that someone who did know the extension of evaluative concepts could then discover a unity or “shape” to that extension which could be expressed using descriptive concepts. To rule out this possibility would seem to require a stronger shapelessness thesis according to which the extension of evaluative terms, properly understood, has no shape at all. Generalists will want to see an argument for this stronger thesis. Perhaps more importantly, though, settling whether this stronger version of the shapelessness thesis is true would seem to require more than a priori theorizing about moral concepts and more than semantic theorizing about evaluative terms. (For discussion of shapelessness and the metaethical lessons to be drawn from it see Väyrynen 2014 and Miller 2003.)

So much for the first of the two strategies for giving a semantic/conceptual argument for generalism canvassed above. What about the second? Recall that the second strategy is less ambitious insofar as it aims to establish only a conditional thesis linking substantive moral truth to the existence of some moral principle(s) or other. The guiding idea here is that a proper analysis of our moral concepts will reveal that deploying those concepts to make a substantive moral judgment commits one to the existence and truth of some moral principle(s) or other which somehow explains the truth of that judgment. Crucially, though, this commitment to the existence of some such moral principle(s) does not entail that the speaker is committed to any particular moral principle(s), or even to the possibility in principle of discovering what the relevant principle(s) are.

A modified version of T.M. Scanlon’s contractualist theory of “what we owe one another” (Scanlon 1998) helps to illustrate this strategy. Scanlon himself does not intend his theory as a conceptual analysis, in part because there are strands of moral thinking, like our thoughts about the moral status of nonhuman animals and the environment and certain forms of moralizing about human sexuality, which do not fit very well into his proposed framework. However, a version of his theory which was offered as an analysis of our moral concepts would provide a clear illustration of the strategy for defending generalism under consideration. On Scanlon’s view, to be morally wrong in the sense of “wrong” associated with what he calls the “morality of what we owe one another” is to be forbidden by principles for the general regulation of human behaviour which nobody could reasonably reject. The notion of the “reasonable” is a thick evaluative concept, so the view is not a reductive one. If the view were to be understood as following directly from an analysis of our moral concepts, then it would follow that anyone who makes a substantive moral judgment that some action is morally wrong would thereby be committed to the existence of at least a range of moral principles (the “reasonable” ones) which are such that they all forbid the action in question. At the same time, making such a judgment does not entail that one can articulate what the relevant principle(s) is (are), or even that they are such that one could in principle discover them.

Another way of arguing for this sort of view is to take a broader focus on normative and evaluative language. On some views (e.g., Ridge 2014), all uses of “good”, “reason”, “ought” and “must” advert to standards of some kind, but the context of utterance determines the relevant kind of standards. Sometimes, as in moral contexts, the relevant standards will be normative in some rich sense. Other times, the relevant standards will be purely conventional, as when we discuss what one ought to do as a matter of etiquette. In other contexts the standards will be purely strategic/instrumental, as when we discuss what move one ought to make in a game of chess, say, or what military strategy is best, but where one can sincerely make these judgments while finding chess a total waste of time or being a committed pacifist. The view aims to accommodate the context-sensitivity of the relevant words without implausibly postulating a brute ambiguity across the wide variety of contexts in which such words are used. As with the conceptual version of Scanlon’s view, this view is also one on which making a substantive moral judgment commits one to the existence of a range of moral standards which require the relevant action (or count the relevant consideration as a reason, or whatever).

An attraction of this strategy is that it draws its plausibility from high level semantic features of words like “good”, “reason”, “ought” and “must” which are not specific to normative contexts. It is therefore perhaps especially unlikely to beg the question against the particularist. This stands in sharp contrast with the attempt to derive specific moral principles from mere competence with moral words or concepts.

6. Practical Arguments

As the taxonomy of section 2 above emphasized, whether moral principles are necessary for moral understanding or moral explanation is not the only debate between particularists and generalists. Distinct questions remain about the place and value of principles in guiding moral decision-making and action and in interpersonal justification. Generalists typically see a larger and more important role for principles to play in these contexts. Particularists typically find at least some sympathy with David McNaughton’s claim that moral principles are “at best useless and at worst a hindrance” (McNaughton 1988: 191). In considering this aspect of the debate, it is helpful to treat as common ground the idea that it is at least possible for an agent to be (in some sense) guided by a principle. This assumption has, of course, been challenged, most prominently by some readings of Wittgenstein’s arguments concerning rule-following (Kripke 1982). If guidance by principle were utterly impossible, then questions about the value and importance of principled guidance would be largely moot. For similar reasons, it is helpful to assume, at least provisionally, that an agent can eschew being guided by principles and yet still act rationally and for reasons and with some measure of consistency.

Against this background, we may distinguish two questions. First, we might ask whether guidance by principles constitutes a superior strategy for acting well as compared to guidance by particular judgments untutored by principles. One familiar way to understand the superiority of a strategy is in terms of its reliability at leading an agent to act rightly and for morally good reasons (McKeever and Ridge 2006; Väyrynen 2008). Second, we might ask whether guidance by principles enables us to secure morally valuable goods (or avoid significant moral evils) that would otherwise be out of reach. If particularism tells us to eschew guidance by principles and if doing so comes with significant costs, then, to use Brad Hooker’s phrase, there is something “bad” about particularism (Hooker 2000, 2008). Similarly, if generalism tells us to use principles and this has serious costs, then there is something bad about generalism.

These questions leave one familiar and related question largely to the side. This is the question whether there is something inherently morally valuable about being a “person of principle” independent of the content of those principles and how, more specifically, they lead one to act. Generalists may, but need not, subscribe to such a view, and even particularists could (consistently with holism) allow that across some range of contexts being principled is, itself, a favoring consideration. Turning to the first question just noted, how might principles constitute a good strategy for moral action?

Most ambitiously, the ultimate principles qua standards—that is, the principles which provide the deepest explanations of why right actions are right—could be well suited to guiding action directly. Arguably this is the view we find in Kant and in many modern Kantian moral theories. The categorical imperative is both the ultimate standard of right action and at the same time is well suited to guide the decision-making of a conscientious moral agent. This view of principled guidance ought to be distinguished from a distinct meta-ethical view according to which an ultimate moral standard must, if it is to be valid at all, be such that agents can be (in some sense) guided by it (Bales 1971; Smith 2012). Such a view may be attractive to those (such as Kant) who think that moral principles must comport with autonomy and that morality is a species of rationality. It may also be attractive to those who believe that moral principles must provide reasons on which agents can act. But even a very ambitious generalist model of principled guidance need not subscribe to this meta-ethical view. Kant, at least in some passages, encourages optimism about our ability to apply the ultimate standard of right and wrong directly to our individual decisions. Other philosophers within the generalist tradition, such as Ross, defend principles which look, on their face, to be eminently usable, and if Ross is correct that such principles are ultimate standards, then one might feel entitled at least to a weak presumption in favour of the claim that using them would be a good strategy.

When we consider other candidates for the ultimate moral principle, however, many find reasons to be sceptical that the ambitious model just canvassed will carry us very far. This has been a recurring worry for act consequentialism and, for that reason, many of the most influential attempts to deal with it have emerged from philosophers working in that tradition. The basic idea is that the consequences of our action are so many, so various, and (often) so far reaching that agents cannot figure out in a timely fashion what the right act is by directly using a consequentialist principle. Using the consequentialist principle in this sense must of course include gathering the facts about the consequences, not just applying the principles to the facts as one believes or knows them to be. (For discussion of weaker and stronger senses in which an agent might “use” a principle, see Smith 2012.) Properly understood, the worry here is not that the act consequentialist principle provides no guidance whatsoever; it may point quite clearly to the kinds of information that must be gathered and heeded. The worry is that attempts to follow the principle will not reliably lead to morally right action. Moreover, the worry is not simply that the principle fails to constitute a complete and reliable strategy. Any model of principled guidance—even one such as Kant’s—is liable to require that we rely also on cognitive and emotional powers that go beyond the principle itself. The worry is that our normal cognitive and emotional powers together with the principle do not yield a reliable strategy for performing morally right actions.

Instead of concluding that principled guidance is hopeless, many act consequentialists have instead proposed that we replace the project of being guided by the ultimate moral standard (assuming this for the moment to be some form of act consequentialism) and instead be guided by some more tractable set of principles. According to such “indirect” consequentialism, the principles we typically employ in deliberation are not the ultimate standards of right conduct. However, an agent who employs them in deliberation will regularly and systematically act rightly. Such proposals have been a staple of consequentialist thinking dating back at least to the work of Mill and Sidgwick. An especially well known recent version of the idea is defended by R.M. Hare, who calls reliance on such principles “intuitive moral thinking”. By contrast, “critical moral thinking” proceeds in terms of the actual standards of moral conduct (Hare 1981). Importantly, neither indirect models of principled guidance nor the worry that inspires them need be married to a consequentialist view of moral standards. Kantian moral philosophers have sometimes stressed the need for “mid-level” principles (Hill 1989, 1992). Even particularists about standards could consistently embrace the use of such an indirect strategy and so embrace a kind of generalism about moral guidance, though so far as we know no one has actually adopted this position.

Discussions of indirect consequentialism often proceed as if the correct moral standard could, in principle, be applied directly to any given circumstance and, if so applied, would indicate the morally right action(s) to take. Leaving aside whether this is true of (some) consequentialist principles, many claim that it is not true of other candidate moral standards. Consider, for example, principles such as “all persons must be treated as moral equals”, or “property rights must be respected”, or, to borrow a less morally loaded example from Onora O’Neill, “teachers must assign work appropriate to their students’ abilities” (O’Neill 1996: 73–77). Such principles may not yield determinate guidance in concrete circumstances even given a full array of non-moral facts. To be properly applied, such principles may require additional moral judgment. We must determine just which individuals are persons and what it is to treat persons as moral equals. We must determine which claims to property correspond to valid rights and what invasions of property amount to a failure to respect those rights. May an exhausted runner harmlessly trespass in order to cool off beneath the shade of another person’s tree? We must even decide how difficult is too difficult when it comes to challenging students. The obstacle to using the standard as a direct guide to conduct is not that our cognitive resources come up short, but that the standard is itself not yet sufficiently determinate. This situation presents an opportunity for principles to play a guiding role by helping to fill in the normative content of higher level standards. (Whether such guiding principles would themselves count as non-ultimate standards is a question we here set aside.) Importantly, however, guiding principles in this sense need not make fully determinate the higher level principles that they help to fill out. They may, instead, explicitly identify further questions to be settled—whether by other principles or by judgment. For example, the principle that a duly convicted criminal ought to receive only the amount of punishment he deserves is highly abstract. How ought we to determine whether a punishment is deserved? The further principle that the punishment ought to be proportional to the crime may direct us to find a way to proportionately rank less and more serious crimes, and it may thus point us part, but not all, of the way towards complying with the higher level principle.

We now have at least three accounts of how principles might figure in a reliable strategy for acting well. But why think that principles do or must figure in the best strategies for moral action? Or, taking the other side, why think that principles are useless or even counterproductive? If one could establish or assume a specific generalist account of moral standards, this would open up many lines of argument for guidance by principle. The same would be true if one could establish particularism about standards. However, such assumptions are not dialectically available in the generalism/particularism debate. Accordingly, we here focus on arguments that are largely neutral about the content of the moral domain and whether it is “principled”.

Some generalists argue that moral principles help avoid “special pleading”—interpreting one’s moral duties in ways that favour one’s own interests and in ways that go beyond what a reasonable accommodation of self-interest would allow. Agents who engage in special pleading do not do so consciously, but rather think they are impartially assessing what morality demands in their circumstances. The adoption of moral principles might be thought to help with this problem. For one thing, principles can be adopted and internalized well before any conflict with the agent’s interests arises. Having internalized the relevant principle well in advance may make it easier to avoid special pleading when a conflict does arise (cf. McKeever and Ridge 2006: 202–203). Furthermore, a practice of articulating these principles publicly endows them with symbolic meaning. Violating explicitly endorsed principles or adding caveats in an ad hoc manner to suit one’s interests can come to stand for our lacking the right kind of commitment to morality more generally (see Nozick 1993: 29; McKeever and Ridge 2006: 204–205). Anecdotally, some people seem to think New Years’ resolutions work in this way, and George Ainslie has provided a body of empirical evidence that such public resolutions can help motivate agents to (e.g.) stop smoking in a way that somehow prevents the thought that “one cigarette won’t make any non-negligible difference” from undermining their resolve (Ainslie 1975 and Ainslie 1986).

Particularists agree that special pleading is a problem but they do not think that principles afford the proper solution to that problem. Instead, they typically suggest that one simply needs to “look harder” at the case at hand to avoid such special pleading:

…the remedy for poor moral judgment is not a different style of moral judgment, principle-based judgment, but just better moral judgment. There is only one real way to stop oneself distorting things in one’s favour, and that is to look again, as hard as one can, at the reasons present in the case, and see if really one is so different from others that what would be required of them is not required of oneself. The method is not infallible, I know; but then nor was the appeal to principle. (Dancy 2013)

Generalists worry that the exhortation to look again is simply unrealistic, given human nature, and is therefore not only fallible but unlikely to do much good. If so, then even if principles are far from infallible rejecting them wholesale is premature. The best way to avoid special pleading could involve an array of more specific strategies with principles playing some significant role.

On the other side particularists worry that reliance on principles breeds inflexibility and a problematic tendency to shoehorn a morally complex situation into some more familiar set of categories. McNaughton describes such inflexibility as a “serious vice” and claims that reliance on principles is partly to blame (McNaughton 1988: 203). Dancy remarks that,

We all know the sort of person who refuses to make the decision here that the facts are obviously calling for, because he cannot see how to make that decision consistent with one he made on a different occasion. (Dancy 1993: 64)

Importantly, this worry cannot be dismissed simply on the grounds that generalists can (and do) allow judgment to also play a role in our use and application of principles; the worry is that the use of principles has a distorting influence of its own. One interesting and empirically minded proposal for evaluating the force of the particularist’s concern looks to the literature on the comparative success of rules and expert judgment in other domains (Zamzow 2015). Much of this literature suggests that rules outperform expert judgment (see Grove et al. 2000).

Let us turn now to a second family of arguments for principled guidance. Setting aside whether principles are a winning strategy for the individual aiming at virtuous action, one might think that our collective use of principles enables us to achieve morally valuable goods. One such argument appeals to the value of predictability (Hooker 2000, 2008). Successful cooperation and coordination yield enormous benefits yet it requires an ability to predict the behaviour of others and a willingness to rely on those predictions when making one’s own choices. If principled guidance supports predictability, so much the better for principles. Not surprisingly, particularists have questioned whether principles are necessary for predictability. “People are quite capable of judging how to behave case by case, and in a way that would enable us to predict what they will in fact do” (Dancy 2004: 83). The key issue is comparative. Is the person guided by principles thereby more predictable than the person who eschews principles? Someone who rejects moral rules altogether and always just tries to judge each case on its own merits plausibly is less predictable than someone who has internalized and follows a set of moral principles. But as we saw above, assessing the force of this generalist argument would benefit from consideration of careful empirical research. One challenge for generalists who might further develop this argument is that it stands in some tension with other themes stressed by generalists, for example, that principles can incorporate various hedges and so exhibit the kind of flexibility particularists embrace (Väyrynen 2008) and that principles are often indeterminate and must be supplemented by judgment. To be consistent, generalists will need to show not only that guidance by crude principles makes one more predictable, but that guidance by a combination of hedged principles and judgment makes one more predictable than guidance by judgment alone.

A very different practical argument for generalism has roots in the Kantian tradition and has recently been advanced by Stephen Darwall (2013, see also Darwall 2006). He contends that publicly formulable principles are necessary for us to realize a valuable form of interpersonal accountability in our shared moral life. He further argues that such accountability is necessary for moral obligations (though not necessarily for moral reasons). Within the framework here developed, one might see Darwall’s argument as a defense of generalism about standards but with the argument restricted to standards of moral obligation. Alternatively, one might see it as a practical argument for attempting to formulate shared public principles because, if we fail to do so (or fail to continue to do so), we will lose something that we take to be valuable about morality, namely the respect for persons that is inherent in a practice of interpersonal accountability (Darwall 2013: especially 183–191). Darwall’s argument fits very well with Kantian contractualism of the sort defended by T.M. Scanlon, which emphasizes the value of our being able to justify ourselves to others and sees principles as mediating justification. It might also be instructive to compare Darwall’s argument with some of the ideas found in the tradition of discourse ethics associated with Jürgen Habermas (see, e.g., Habermas 1990). An important challenge for this argument is to persuasively establish the premise that accountability (or interpersonal justification) must advert to principles. Particularists may allow that accountability is an important value while urging that the interpersonal process of holding one another accountable can proceed entirely in terms of the reasons, defeaters, enablers, and intensifiers that are at play in the case at hand.


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Section 2 draws on McKeever and Ridge 2006: chapter 1, though this entry departs somewhat from the details of that taxonomy.

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Michael Ridge
Sean McKeever

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