Reasons for Action: Justification, Motivation, Explanation

First published Sun Apr 24, 2016

Why are you always lying? Why did the Ancient Egyptians mummify their dead? Should Huck Finn have turned Jim in? Why is she selling her car? Questions that ask for reasons, and in particular, reasons for action, are among the commonest questions humans have. Philosophers have sought to understand the nature of such reasons. Most contemporary philosophers start by distinguishing two types of reason for action: “normative” reasons—that is, reasons which, very roughly, favour or justify an action, as judged by a well-informed, impartial observer; and “motivating” reasons—which, again roughly, are reasons the “agent” (that is, the person acting) takes to favour and justify her action and that guides her in acting. But there are, in addition, “explanatory” reasons, reasons that explain an action without necessarily justifying it and without being the reasons that motivated the agent.

A clear understanding of reasons for action in their justifying, motivating and explanatory functions is of relevance to the philosophy of action, to ethics, political philosophy and the philosophy of law. The essential issues about reasons—what they are, and how they relate to human actions—are of wider concern.

This entry examines the various accounts that philosophers have given of these different kinds of reasons and their interconnections, as well as the disagreements among them about these matters. The focus will be on reasons for acting—what are commonly called “practical reasons”, leaving aside questions that are specific to other reasons, for instance, reasons for believing, wanting, feeling emotions, and having attitudes, such as hope or resentment.

1. The Variety of Reasons

Humans engage in practical reasoning: they deliberate about what to do and how to do it. And they often act in light of reasons which can then explain their actions, and may also justify them. These ideas go back to Plato (Protagoras and Republic, Book 4) and Aristotle (De Anima, see esp. III.10; see also Price 2011). They have been a constant theme in discussions of the character of human behaviour in the history of philosophy. In the 18th century, David Hume and Immanuel Kant offered radically different views about the role and importance of Reason (the faculty of reason) in guiding and justifying human actions. Their contributions remain influential today, but in the second half of the 20th century, the focus shifted from discussion of the faculty of reason to discussion of the very concept of a reason and to questions about different kinds of reasons and their interconnections.

As mentioned in the introduction, a distinction is commonly drawn in contemporary debates between two kinds of reason: “normative” and “motivating” reasons. Jonathan Dancy (2000: 20ff. and Appendix) discusses the history of this distinction. It is sometimes said to date back to Francis Hutcheson (1730), though Dancy notes that the modern distinction does not clearly map on to earlier ones. Whatever its history, the distinction is now accepted by most if not all contemporary philosophers who write on this topic (Raz 1975; Smith 1994; Parfit 1997; and Dancy 1995 and 2000 are representative examples).

A normative reason is a reason (for someone) to act—in T. M. Scanlon’s phrase, “a consideration that counts in favour of” someone’s acting in a certain way (1998 and 2004). A motivating reason is a reason for which someone does something, a reason that, in the agent’s eyes, counts in favour of her acting in a certain way. When an agent acts motivated by a reason, she acts “in light of that reason” and the reason will be a premise in the practical reasoning, if any, that leads to the action. Motivating reasons can also figure in explanations of actions that cite agents’ reasons, what are called “reason explanations” of actions. Because of that, they are sometimes called “explanatory” reasons, though we shall scrutinize this description more carefully below.

Dancy suggests that the distinction between different types of reason is best understood as one between questions we can ask about them (a view that he finds also in Baier 1958):

If we do speak in this way, of motivating and normative reasons, this should not be taken to suggest that there are two sorts of reason, the sort that motivate and the sort that are good. There are not. There are just two questions that we use the single notion of a reason to answer. When I call a reason “motivating”, all that I am doing is issuing a reminder that the focus of our attention is on matters of motivation, for the moment. When I call it “normative”, again all that I am doing is stressing that we are currently thinking about whether it is a good reason, one that favours acting in the way proposed (Dancy 2000: 2–3).

According to this suggestion, there is a single notion of a reason that is used to answer different questions: the question whether there is a reason for someone to do something (normative) and the question what someone’s reason for acting is (motivating). For instance, we can ask whether there is a reason for the government of a country to tax sugary drinks (normative), and ask also for the government’s reason for actually taxing the drinks (motivating). The same reason may answer both questions: the reason that favours taxing the drink may be that the tax will help reduce child obesity; and that may also be the government’s reason for taxing the drinks. In that case, the government is motivated to tax drinks by a reason that there is for it to do so, the reason that may justify its doing so. But we don’t always act for the reasons that favour our actions. For instance, the government may tax sugary drinks because (or in part because) some of its members own shares in a company that sells low-sugar drinks. In that case, the reason for which the government decides to tax sugary drinks is not, or not solely, the reason that favours its doing so. The distinction between normative and motivating reasons, therefore, enables us to separate the question what reasons motivate agents to act (a psychological question) and the question whether those are good reasons: reasons that favour and justify their acting thus.

If this way of understanding talk about different kinds of reasons is right, perhaps the picture is more complex than the dichotomy of “normative vs. motivating” suggests. For there seem to be at least three distinct questions about the relation between reasons and actions. There are questions about whether there is a reason that favours someone’s action; questions about what reason motivates someone to act; and also questions about what reasons explain his action. Consider the behaviour of Othello in Shakespeare’s play of the same name. Othello kills Desdemona in the belief, induced by Iago, that she has been unfaithful to him. The tragedy, however, is that she has not: Desdemona is innocent, she loves Othello and is faithful to him. Clearly, there is no reason that justifies the murder: no normative reason. But there are two things we can say about Othello’s reason for acting and his action. One is that Othello is motivated to kill Desdemona by the (putative) fact that Desdemona has been unfaithful. The other is that we can explain his action of killing her by citing the fact that he believes that Desdemona has been unfaithful. So here we seem to have two different reasons: one that motivates—the (putative) fact that Desdemona has been unfaithful; and one that explains—the (actual) fact that Othello believes that she has. We can distinguish, then, between the reason that explains Othello’s action (the fact that he believes that Desdemona has been unfaithful) and the reason that motivates him to act (the alleged infidelity itself). It might be tempting to think that Othello’s motivating reason is just the fact that he believes that Desdemona has been unfaithful. We shall examine below reasons why the temptation should be resisted. Because of this, the account that follows proceeds by dividing reasons for action initially into two categories: normative and motivating-explanatory. It will then present the case for treating motivating and explanatory reasons separately.

Until relatively recently, the distinction between different kinds of reasons was assumed, whether explicitly or not, to imply that these reasons were things of different kinds. Normative reasons were conceived of as facts, and so were regarded as mind-independent: the facts are what they are independently of whether anyone knows them or thinks about them. By contrast, motivating and explanatory reasons were conceived of as mental states of agents and, as such, as entities which depend on someone’s thinking or believing certain things (Audi 2001 and Mele 2003 are representative examples—but see also Mele 2013). In recent years, however, this assumption has been challenged, giving rise to a number of disputes about the ontology of reasons—that is, disputes about what kind of thing or things reasons are. As we examine different kinds of reasons, we shall encounter some of these ontological debates. We start with normative reasons.

2. Normative Reasons

A reason is said to be a “normative reason” for acting because it favours someone’s acting. But what does it mean to say that a reason “favours” an action? One way of understanding this claim is in terms of justification: a reason justifies or makes it right for someone to act in a certain way. This is why normative reasons are also called “justifying” reasons.

The term “normative reason” derives from the idea that there are norms, principles or codes that prescribe actions: they make it right or wrong to do certain things. To take a relatively trivial, culturally-determined example, the norms of etiquette in some countries say that when meeting someone for the first time, the right thing to do is to shake hands, whereas in other countries, the right thing to do is to kiss them on both cheeks. So the fact that in the UK shaking hands is the norm of etiquette is a reason that makes it right to do so in the UK when you meet someone for the first time. There are many other, often more important, norms, principles and values, implicit or explicit, that make it right to do or not do certain things. The existence of these norms or values depends on a variety of things: logical and natural relations, conventions, rules and regulations, etc. And the norms or values may be moral, prudential, legal, hedonic (relating to pleasure) or of some other kind. There are normative reasons, therefore, corresponding to the variety of values and norms: normative reasons that are moral, prudential, legal, hedonic, etc.

The variety of norms or values that underpin normative reasons requires some modification of the claim that reasons that favour actions make those actions right. If a reason favours my doing something, then I have a “pro-tanto” reason to do it: it is pro tanto (i.e., to that extent) right for me to do it. But there may be a reason against my doing it: a pro-tanto reason not to do it. The fact that a joke is funny may be a reason to tell it; but the fact that it’ll embarrass someone may be a reason against doing so. In that case, I have a pro-tanto reason to tell the joke and a different pro-tanto reason not to tell it. Whether it would be right for me to tell the joke, whether I have an “all-things-considered” reason to tell it, will depend on whether either of the reasons is stronger than the other. If so, that reason will override or “defeat” the other reason. Only if the pro-tanto reason for telling the joke is undefeated will it be right or justified all things considered for me to tell the joke.

But what sort of thing is a normative reason? What gives reasons their normative force, so that they can make it right for someone to do something? And what determines whether there is such a reason and to whom it applies? These and related questions have received much philosophical attention in recent years.

There is consensus that normative reasons are facts (Raz 1975; Scanlon 1998), though the consensus is not universal. The question is complicated by disagreement about what facts of any kind are: are they concrete or abstract entities? Is a fact the same as the corresponding true proposition, or is the fact the “truth-maker” of the proposition? Are there any facts other than empirical facts, e.g., logical, mathematical, moral or aesthetic facts? For instance, it has been argued, notably by John Mackie, that there are no moral facts. Mackie argued against the existence of moral facts partially on the grounds that they would be metaphysically “queer”. He held that, if there are any moral facts, they would have to be both objective and necessarily motivating to those who are aware of them, and he claimed that it was wholly implausible that anything could have such properties (Mackie 1977). If Mackie is right that there are no moral facts, then either moral reasons are not normative reasons; or at least some normative reasons namely, moral reasons, are not facts.

Among those who hold that normative reasons are facts, some hold that facts are true propositions and hence that reasons are also true propositions (Darwall 1983; Smith 1994; Scanlon 1998). Others reject the idea that normative reasons could be true propositions; for instance, Dancy (2000) does so on the grounds that propositions are abstract and representational (they represent the way the world is) but reasons must be concrete and non-representational (they are ways the world is). These problems are complex and have many ramifications but we cannot and perhaps need not resolve them here because the view that normative reasons are facts is generally meant to imply a very undemanding notion of facts. Thus Raz says that, “when saying that facts are reasons” he is using the term “fact” to designate

that in virtue of which true or justified statements are true or justified. By “fact” is meant simply that which can be designated by the use of the operator “the fact that …”. (1975: 17–18)

There is less consensus about the basis of the normativity of practical reasons: the capacity of reasons to justify actions. On one proposal, the normativity of practical reasons depends on the goodness, intrinsic or instrumental, of doing what there is reason to do. This view is associated with Aristotle who, in the Nicomachean Ethics, links what is right to do (what one has reason to do) with what is conducive to the good (whether intrinsically or instrumentally). The idea was prevalent among medieval philosophers, for example Thomas Aquinas (Summa Theologiae, 1a, q.82), and in the 20th century it was central to Elizabeth Anscombe’s discussion of intentional actions (1957). Many contemporary philosophers (e.g., Raz 1999 and Dancy 2000) have offered accounts of the normativity of reasons in line with this idea, so a reason is a normative reason to do something because it picks the good-making features or value of the relevant action. As Raz puts it, “reasons are facts in virtue of which (…) actions are good in some respect and to some degree” (1999: 23). There are other accounts that ground the normativity of reasons on the concept of rationality (e.g., Korsgaard 1996, who is influenced by Kant; and Smith 1994 and Gert 2004, who base their accounts on the concept of the “ideally rational agent”). A different proposal, which echos Hume’s views about the relation between reason and passions, claims that the normativity of reasons is based on their relation to our desires. Accordingly, what one has reason to do depends ultimately on one’s desires and motivations. Roughly, someone’s having a reason to act requires their having some motivation that would be served by acting in the way favoured by the putative reason. The motivation may be such things as desires, plans, long-standing projects or values. And it may be something the agent actually has, or something she would have if she reasoned properly from her current motivations. Desire-based accounts of this sort have been defended recently by Williams 1979 and 1989, Schroeder 2008, and Goldman 2009.

However we explain their normativity, normative reasons should be capable of motivating agents to act—though of course they may often fail to do so. Therefore, any account of normative reasons must offer a plausible explanation of the relationship between the normativity of reasons and the capacity that reasons have to motivate agents to act. An account must explain how thinking that there is a reason for me to do something can motivate me to act, and to act for that reason. Desire-based accounts of reasons might seem to have the edge here. If the reasons that apply to me depend on my antecedent motivations (desires, plans), then it is plausible that I shall be motivated to do what I believe will contribute to the satisfaction or furthering of those motivations. But desire-based accounts fare less well in accommodating another central claim about normative reasons. For it seems equally plausible that there are reasons (for instance, moral reasons) that apply to agents regardless of their motivations. Arguably, we all have reason to do what morality dictates, whether or not we are (or would be, if we reasoned consistently from our current motivations), motivated by those reasons. (For a detailed discussion of these issues, see the entry on reasons for action: internal vs. external.)

The claim that something is a normative reason for action is generally thought to be a “relational” claim: it establishes a relation between a fact, an agent, and an action kind. The relation is that of “being a reason for” (see Raz 1975 and 1998, Dancy 2004, Cuneo 2007). For example, the fact that a person has ingested a lethal poison may be a reason for the paramedics to give the person an antidote. According to some, the relation involves not just a person, a reason and an action, but more aspects: a time, circumstances, etc. (Skorupski 2010 and Scanlon 2014). This relational view of reasons gives a minimal sense in which claims about normative reasons are “agent-relative”: they relate agents to reasons (a more substantial sense is developed in Nagel 1970 and 1986 and discussed in the entry reasons for action: agent-neutral vs. agent-relative). But even in the minimal sense, the agent-relativity of reasons raises questions about the conditions that determine when a reason for acting applies to a particular agent. One such question, mentioned in the previous paragraph, is whether the reasons that apply to you depend on your desires and motivations. Another question is whether they depend on your knowledge and beliefs. To go back to the example of Othello: on the one hand it seems clear that Othello has no reason to kill Desdemona, and the reason he thinks he has—that she is unfaithful—is no reason at all. On the other hand, it might seem that Othello does have a reason, for he believes that Desdemona is unfaithful and believes, moreover, that his reputation has been damaged and needs to be restored with her death. And those beliefs appear to give him a reason to do what he does, at least from his perspective.

Philosophers disagree about how to reconcile these competing claims. One way of resolving the tension between them is to say that Othello has no normative reason to kill Desdemona but has a motivating reason: viz., the falsehood he believes. Smith (1994) and Dancy (2000) both offer suggestions of this sort (though Smith calls Othello’s beliefs “his normative reasons”). Others, e.g., Schroeder (2008), talk about “objective” and “subjective” normative reasons, so that Othello would have a subjective normative reason but no objective normative reason to kill Desdemona. These positions are all “objectivist” in that they presuppose that whether an agent has an (objective) normative reason to act depends solely on the facts and not on the agent’s beliefs (see Williams 1979). “Perspectivists” take a different view. They claim that whether someone has a normative reason to do something is not independent of her perspective, which includes her beliefs (see Fantl and McGrath 2009 and Gibbons 2010). Certain cases of ignorance and mistake help to bring out their view. A much discussed case introduced by Williams (1979) concerns an agent, call him Sam, who orders a gin and tonic and, when served a glass with a liquid that looks like gin and tonic, forms the belief that it is gin and tonic, when in fact the glass contains petrol and ice. Does Sam have a normative reason to drink what’s in the glass? The objectivists say that the answer depends solely on the facts, so Sam has no normative reason to drink the liquid. Perspectivists, by contrast, say that given Sam’s perspective, which includes a reasonable (though false) belief that the liquid is gin and tonic, Sam does have a normative reason to drink what’s in the glass.

Perspectivists tend to defend their position by reference to considerations of rationality. Agents are often in situations in which they don’t know all the relevant facts. And yet, perspectivists say, these agents often do what is reasonable or rational for them to do, given their perspective. If, as seems plausible, one acts rationally when one acts for reasons that make it rational for one to so act, then perspectivism must be right: agents who act in error or ignorance often act rationally and, when they do, they act for reasons they have to do what they do. In short, as perspectivism says, the normative reasons an agent has depend in an important sense on his epistemic perspective, and so an agent can have a normative reason that is a false belief. Similar arguments are articulated in relation to justification (though often questions about rationality and justification are run together). Surely, the argument goes, what an agent is justified in doing depends on whether he has reasons that justify his doing that thing. But, again, there are cases where an agent would surely be justified in doing something even though there are conclusive reasons against doing it; and he would be justified precisely because he doesn’t know about those reasons. For example, the fact that the cake is poisoned is a conclusive reason not to offer it to your guests. But you might be justified in offering it to them, the perspectivist says, if you don’t know about the poison. So considerations about the justification of action also seem to support perspectivism because they show that what reasons you have depends on your perspective.

There are several moves that an opponent of perspectivism can make in response here. She can concede that an agent who acts according to his epistemic perspective but guided by a false belief acts rationally, but deny that acting rationally requires that the agent act for normative reasons. Instead, the objectivist may say, acting rationally only requires acting in a way that is consistent with one’s beliefs, so long as these are themselves rational. This response could rely on, e.g., Derek Parfit’s conception of rationality, which requires acting guided by one’s real or apparent reasons (Parfit 2001, an “apparent reason” is a falsehood that an agent believes to be true, and treats as a normative reason but which is not a normative reason; see also Kolodny 2005). As for the justification of action, the objectivist can deny that the actions of agents who act in ignorance or guided by a mistaken belief are justified. Whether the action is justified, the objectivist will say, depends purely on whether the facts make it the right thing to do, and not on the agent’s beliefs. So in the cake example above, the action of offering the poisoned cake to his guests is not justified: there is no normative reason that makes it the right thing to do. And that is so regardless of what the agent knows or believes. A different question, the objectivist will say, is whether an agent who does something wrong because of his false beliefs or ignorance is himself justified and/or blameworthy for so acting. If our host’s ignorance about the poison is not culpable, he will most likely not be blameworthy and the agent may be justified. But in saying this, the objectivist need not be conceding that the action was justified, i.e., done for a normative reason, only that the host may be exculpated for doing the wrong thing. As Austin noted (1957), we must distinguish between a justification and an excuse. When accused of wrongdoing, one may offer a justification, which aims to show that in fact the thing done was right because there was reason for doing it. Alternatively, one may offer an excuse: admit that one did the wrong thing but plead to be partly or wholly exculpated—for instance, because it was done out of ignorance or mistake. (There are other excuses, such as accidents or coercion but those need not concern us here.) To return to the cake example, our agent might be excused for doing the wrong thing (poisoning the guests) if he was non-culpably ignorant about the poison. By contrast, it might be possible to give a justification for poisoning the guests: for instance, that they were in fact some psychopaths intent on causing his family mortal harm. If so, poisoning them with the cake may have been the right thing to do and, depending on whether our agent was aware of the relevant facts and acted guided by them, it may be that he was justified in poisoning them. This example shows how questions about normative reasons bear directly on the justification of agents, as distinct from the justification of their actions, by raising questions about motivating reasons, to which we now turn.

3. Motivating and Explanatory Reasons

It was suggested above that although reasons are traditionally divided into two kinds: normative and motivating/explanatory, there may be a case for distinguishing between motivating reasons and explanatory reasons. The basis for doing so was said to be the existence of three distinct questions about reasons: whether a reason favours an action; whether a reason motivates an agent; and whether a reason explains an agent’s action. Accordingly, the thought goes, we should recognise three kinds of reasons: normative, motivating and explanatory. This way of classifying reasons is explicitly accepted and/or defended by various authors (Baier 1958; Alvarez 2007, 2009a, 2010; Hieronymi 2011); and it is hinted at, using different terminology, by others (Smith 1994; Darwall 2003; Mantel 2014).

This three-part classification may seem excessively refined: is it really necessary or advantageous to distinguish motivating and explanatory reasons? After all, a motivating reason can always explain the action that it motivates, so the question of what reason motivates an agent and what reason explains her action are, one might think, fundamentally the same. If so, “motivating” and “explanatory” are surely just different labels for the same kind of reason, at least in contexts of intentional actions. And there appears to be no obvious advantage in regarding motivating and explanatory reasons as distinct kinds.

These considerations against a three-part classification of reasons, though plausible, are not decisive. First, the fact that the same reason can answer different questions does not show that the questions are not importantly different and, consequently that the reasons that answer those questions are not of different kinds. We saw that to be so for normative and motivating reasons: the same reason can answer a question about motivation and one about justification. And yet, that does not blur the difference between those questions, nor does it undermine the importance of recognising the corresponding two kinds of reasons. So the same may be true for motivating and explanatory reasons.

Second, even if the same reason sometimes answers the two questions about motivation and explanation, this is not always so. Although a reason that motivates an action can always explain it, a reason that can explain the action is not always the reason that motivates it. For example, that he is jealous is a reason that explains why Othello kills Desdemona. But that is not the reason that motivates him to kill her. This example may appear not to be to the point because an explanation that refers to his jealousy is not a rationalisation of Othello’s action: it doesn’t explain his action by citing his reason. That is right and yet the example still shows that not all reasons that explain by citing psychological factors, e.g., jealousy, are reasons that motivate. Moreover, knowing that Othello acted out of jealousy gives an indication of Othello’s reason (Desdemona’s suspected unfaithfulness) and yet the reason of jealousy is not Othello’s motivating reason. Besides, the explaining and motivating reasons may differ even in cases where the reason that explains makes reference to the reason that motivates. For suppose that John punches Peter because he finds out that Peter has betrayed him. The fact that John knows that Peter has betrayed him is a reason that explains John’s action. This is an explanatory reason. But that fact about John’s mental state of knowledge is not the reason for which John punches Peter. That reason is a fact about Peter, namely that he has betrayed John. That is the reason that motivates John to punch Peter—his motivating reason. So in this case we have two different (though related) reasons: that Peter has betrayed John and that John knows that Peter has betrayed him, which play different roles. One reason motivates John to punch Peter (the betrayal); and the other explains why he does it (the knowledge of the betrayal). To be sure, the latter reason explains by reference to the former. Nonetheless, these are different reasons that answer different questions about motivation and explanation, respectively.

But isn’t this distinction superficial? After all, the fact that motivates John, i.e., that Peter has betrayed him, can also explain John’s action—we need not cite John’s knowledge of this fact. As we shall see below (3.2), this is controversial: some philosophers think that all reason explanations require reference to psychological states of the agent. Be that as it may, consider a different example. The fact that Othello believes that Desdemona is unfaithful explains why he kills her. But the fact that he believes in her infidelity is not the reason in light of which he kills her, the reason that, in his eyes, favours killing her. What he takes to favour killing her is the (putative) fact that she is unfaithful. Again, these are importantly different reasons: for it can be the case that Othello believes that Desdemona is unfaithful without it being the case that she is, and vice versa. Moreover, since Desdemona is not unfaithful, that putative fact cannot be what explains Othello’s action because something that is not the case cannot explain anything—though, as we shall see below (also 3.2), this view of explanation has proved controversial too.

The intricacies of these controversies suggest that it may indeed be helpful to keep apart questions of motivation and questions of explanation even when we are dealing with reason explanations of action. The advantages of drawing this distinction will be spelled out in examining debates concerning motivating reasons and the explanation of action. We shall see there that apparently competing claims about motivating reasons and the explanation of action are often best understood and resolved as claims about motivating or explanatory reasons, respectively. The following passage, in which Stephen Darwall comments on a putative disagreement between Dancy and Michael Smith, helps to illustrate the point of the distinction:

“Motivating reason” in Dancy’s pen means the agent’s reason, the (believed, putative) fact in light of which the agent acted. Smith, however, uses “the agent’s normative reason” to refer to this and “motivating reason” to refer to the desire/belief combination necessary to explain behavior teleologically. (Darwall 2003: 442–3)

Using the terminology introduced above, we can reframe Darwall’s point as follows. When Dancy says that reasons are (putative) facts that agents take to favour their actions, he is talking about motivating reasons. By contrast, when Smith says that reasons are combinations of mental states of believing and desiring, he is talking about explanatory reasons. So Dancy and Smith may not be disagreeing but, rather, using the same term, “motivating reason” for two different concepts: Dancy is using it to refer to the reasons in light of which an agent acts, while Smith is using it to refer to the reasons that explain an agent’s act.

One of the most intensely debated issues concerning both motivating and explanatory reasons is their ontology: what kind of thing are these reasons? The philosophical literature of the last half of the 20th century was premised on the more or less explicit assumption that motivating and explanatory reasons, which at the time were not normally explicitly distinguished, were psychological entities, in particular, mental states of agents, such as Othello’s believing that Desdemona is unfaithful to him. This view of the ontology of reasons is often called “Psychologism”. That consensus began to dissolve at the turn of the century and psychologism came under sustained attack. Opposition to it is variously labelled “non-psychologism”, “externalism” and “objectivism”. The last two labels are also used for a variety of other philosophical views so, to avoid confusion, I will stick with the term “Non-psychologism”.

Donald Davidson’s 1963 paper, “Actions, Reasons, and Causes” is often cited as the locus classicus of psychologism. In that paper he characterises a reason as follows:

C1. R is a primary reason why an agent performed the action A under the description d only if R consists of a pro attitude of the agent toward actions with a certain property, and a belief of the agent that A, under the description d, has that property. (1963: 687)

A primary reason is a combination of two mental states: a pro-attitude and a belief. These “primary reasons” are, in effect, explanatory reasons: reasons that explain actions. Davidson defended the “desire-belief” model of action explanation, according to which reasons are states of believing and desiring that explain actions because they cause them. This model is at the centre of Davidson’s account of intentional action, which he characterises as an event caused “in the right way” by a primary reason. Davidson’s paper was highly influential; as a result, psychologism became the dominant view for both motivating and explanatory reasons, which, as noted above, were then not explicitly distinguished.

Psychologism is very appealing. For it seems right that when an agent acts for a reason, he acts motivated by an end that he desires (an end towards which he has a “pro-attitude”) and guided by a belief about how to achieve that end. Because of this, it is possible to explain his action by citing his desiring and his believing the relevant things. To return to our example, we can explain why Othello kills Desdemona by citing his wanting to defend his honour and his believing that, given that Desdemona has been unfaithful, killing her is the only way to do so. And this sort of explanation in terms of states of belief and desire supports the relevant counterfactuals: had Othello not believed that she had been unfaithful or had he not believed that killing her was the only way to defend his honour, he wouldn’t have killed her, even if he had still wanted to restore his reputation; and had he not cared about his reputation, he wouldn’t have killed her, despite his beliefs about her betrayal and what was necessary to defend his honour. This sort of consideration led to widespread acceptance of the view that explanatory reasons are mental states and, since the latter were not distinguished from motivating reasons, it also led to the view that motivating reasons are mental states.

Among psychologists, some say that motivating and explanatory reasons are mental or psychological facts, rather than mental states. This is because psychologism holds that reasons are mental states such as “an agent’s believing (or wanting, or knowing) something”, and it is easy to move from the claim that someone’s reason is his believing something (a mental state) to the claim that his reason is that he believes something (a psychological fact). For instance, it is easy to move from saying that Joe’s reason for running is his believing that he’s late (a mental state) to saying that Joe’s reason is (the fact) that he believes that he’s late.

These defenders of psychologism do not on the face of it disagree with champions of non-psychologism about the ontology of these reasons. For psychological facts are not themselves mental states, though they are facts about mental states. But they still disagree with non-psychologists about what these reasons are. Because of this, we need a way to distinguish between psychologism and non-psychologism other than in terms of ontology—the kind of thing that each camp says reasons are—in order to capture the deeper disagreement between them. Perhaps a better way to do so is to say that psychologism holds that motivating and explanatory reasons are mental states or facts about mental states of agents, whereas non-psychologism says that motivating and explanatory reasons, like normative reasons, are facts about all sorts of things, including mental states of agents.

The following sections examine current debates about psychologism, and other issues, concerning motivating and explanatory reasons. It does so separately for reasons of each kind, as that will facilitate clarity in the various debates. We start with motivating reasons.

3.1 Motivating Reasons

The term “motivating reason” is a semi-technical philosophical term. As we saw above, the phrase is now generally used in the literature to refer to a reason that the agent takes to favour her action, and in light of which she acts. Motivating reasons are also considerations that can figure as premises in the practical reasoning, if any, that leads to action. The terms “agential reason”, “the agent’s normative reason”, “subjective (normative) reasons”, “the agent’s operative reason” and “possessed reasons” are sometimes also used to capture this notion of a reason. Because the concept is somewhat technical, further clarification is needed.

First, the current use of the term excludes some otherwise plausible candidates from being motivating reasons. For instance, someone’s goal or intention in acting, which is something the agent desires (to grow vegetables; to kill Desdemona) seem to be motivating factors in acting. But because these are not considerations in light of which one acts, they do not fall under the category “motivating reasons” as currently understood (but see Audi 1993). Similarly, a state of desiring (wanting to have one’s revenge), or a motive or emotion (for instance, jealousy) can be states “that encompass motivation”, to use Mele’s phrase, 2003: if one is in any such a mental state, one is thereby motivated to act. But again, these are not motivating reasons in the sense at issue because they are not considerations that the agent takes to favour acting. Moreover, many hold that states of desiring are often grounded in considerations about the goodness or value of what is desired—a view defended by Anscombe 1957, Nagel 1970, Quinn 1993, Raz 1999, and Schueler 2003, among others. When this is so, the motivating reasons both for wanting and for acting accordingly are the considerations about the goodness or rightness of what is desired. To continue with our example, Othello’s desire to kill Desdemona is grounded in the thoughts that she is unfaithful to him and that killing her is a fitting way to restore his reputation (even if the desire is intensified by his jealousy). These considerations are his reason for wanting to kill her and his reason for doing so. In short, what Othello desires (to kill Desdemona), his goal (to redress her betrayal), his state of desiring those things, or his motive (jealousy) are things that motivate him to kill Desdemona but they are not his motivating reasons in the semi-technical sense of the phrase stipulated above. His motivating reasons, if we agree he has any, are, rather, the putative facts that she is unfaithful to him and that killing her is a fitting way to restore his reputation.

Second, talk of an agent’s motivating reason, or of “the agent’s reason”, always involves some simplification. It’s a simplification because an agent may be motivated to act by more than one reason: I may hoover the house early in the morning both because I won’t have time to do it later and because it will annoy my inconsiderate neighbour. Moreover, a fact will seem a reason for me to act only in combination with other facts: that I won’t have time to hoover later will seem a reason to do it now only if the house needs hovering. So my reason is, arguably, a combination of at least two facts: that the house needs hovering and that I won’t be able to do it later. Finally, I may consider a fact that counts against acting, for instance, that hoovering early will also disturb my other neighbour, who is very considerate. If I still decide to hoover, I do not act for that “con-reason” but, arguably, I am still guided by it if I give it some weight in my deliberation (see Ruben 2009 for a discussion of “con-reasons”).

Since motivating reasons are considerations that an agent takes to favour acting, and since the reasons that favour acting are facts, it might seem that motivating reasons are also facts or at least putative facts, rather than mental states. However, the view that they are mental states was, as noted earlier, the dominant view till the turn of the 20th century, and it is still very popular today. A seemingly compelling argument for adopting psychologism for motivating reasons is the following. For a reason to motivate you it must be a reason you have. This does not require that the reason should genuinely apply to you. But it requires that you “possess” the reason: you must know or believe the consideration that constitutes the reason. And this appears to support the view that reasons are mental states of agents, or facts about those states. The opponent of psychologism about motivating reasons can respond by noting that, while it is true that, for it to motivate you to act, you must know or believe the thing that constitutes a reason, that doesn’t imply that the reason that motivates you is your knowing or believing what you do. Rather your reason is what is known or believed: a (putative) fact. To put the point differently, motivating reasons are the contents of mental states but not mental states themselves. This argument about motivating reasons is not, therefore, decisive for psychologism. And in fact, there are several compelling arguments against psychologism.

A very influential argument, found in Dancy 1995 and 2000, focuses on the relation between normative and motivating reasons. The argument hinges on Dancy’s claim that any account of motivating reasons must meet what he calls “the normative constraint”:

This [normative constraint] requires that a motivating reason, that in the light of which one acts, must be the sort of thing that is capable of being among the reasons in favour of so acting; it must, in this sense, be possible to act for a good reason. (2000: 103)

Dancy’s charge against psychologism about motivating reasons is that it fails to meet the constraint because, if psychologism is right, we can never act for a good reason. Why? In order to act for a good reason, we need to act for a reason that is or could be a fact. However, according to psychologism, motivating reasons are mental states. If so, the reasons for which we act are mental states, and not facts. If, by contrast, motivating reasons were, say facts and putative facts, then some of the reasons for which we act would be facts, and it would follow that we can, and sometimes do, act for a good reason. But in saying that motivating reasons are mental states, psychologism eliminates this possibility, for a mental state can never be a fact. As Dancy puts it, psychologism has the consequence that “the reasons why we act can never be among the reasons in favour of acting” (2000: 105). The argument relies on the “identity thesis” about reasons: the thesis that you act for a good reason, only if your motivating reason is identical to the normative reason that favours your action (see Heuer 2004 for a helpful explanation).

Dancy (2000: 106ff.) considers a possible response: that acting for a good reason may simply require your motivating reason to be a mental state whose content is a good reason. So, you act for a good reason if your motivating reason for, say, taking your umbrella is your believing that it is raining, which is a mental state whose content—“it is raining”—is a good reason to take your umbrella. The success of this response to Dancy’s argument is unclear. On the one hand, if the response is that the reasons that motivate us are the contents of our mental states of believing, this meets the normative constraint but it does not favour psychologism. It meets the normative constraint because the content is the fact that it is raining and that is a good reason. But this interpretation amounts to abandoning psychologism because the contents of mental states are not themselves mental states. On the other hand, the response might be just the assertion that a mental state with the right content can be a good reason for acting. But this does not seem so much a response to Dancy’s argument as a refusal to engage with it. For it remains unclear how, according to this response, we can ever act for a good (i.e., a normative) reason (but see Mantel 2014 for an attempt to develop the objection by rejecting the identity thesis).

This brings us to another, related argument against psychologism, which is simply that consideration of what agents take their reasons for acting to be, and of what they typically give and accept as their reasons for acting, count against psychologism. Thus, as Othello considers what to do, even while in the grip of his jealousy, his reasoning does not include considerations about whether he believes this or that but rather considerations about what Desdemona has or has not done. The things that Othello considers, then, are not his mental states but rather facts, or alleged facts, about the world around him, in particular about Desdemona. This argument is reinforced by considering that motivating reasons are the reasons that would figure as premises in a reconstruction of the agent’s practical reasoning, if any. Again, these premises are sometimes considerations to the effect that one believes this or that; but much more often, they are considerations about the world, about the value or goodness of things and people around us, the means of achieving those things, etc. In short, although practical reasoning sometimes includes psychological facts about oneself among its premises, much more often these premises refer to (perceived or real) facts about the world beyond our minds.

These arguments lend substantial support to non-psychologism and suggest that being motivated by a reason is not acting in light of, or guided by, a mental state, or by a fact about one’s mental states. Along with other arguments, they have led many philosophers (see Alvarez 2008, 2009b, 2010; Bittner 2001; Dancy 2000, 2008; Hornsby 2007, 2008: Hyman 1999, 2015; McDowell 2013; Raz 1999; Schueler 2003; Stout 1996; Stoutland 1998; Williamson 2000, among others) to reject psychologism. But non-psychologism is not free from difficulties. A central problem for non-psychologism is presented by “error cases”. If motivating reasons are facts, then what is the agent’s reason in cases, like Othello’s, where the agent is in error and is motivated to act by a false consideration? In such a case, what the agent would give as his reason—say, that Desdemona has been unfaithful—is false. So, Othello cannot act in light of the fact that Desdemona has been unfaithful. And non-psychologism does not seem to have a ready answer to what the motivating reason is in these cases.

Non-psychologists have offered different proposals to accommodate error cases. One proposal is to say that in error cases agents act for a reason that is a falsehood that the agent believes. So, in the example above, Othello’s reason is his false belief about Desdemona. Note—not his believing that she’s unfaithful, which would bring us back to psychologism, but his false belief (the content). According to this proposal, then, Othello did act for a reason: a false belief, which is a putative fact that the agent takes to be a fact. The view is defended or at least endorsed by many, among others: Dancy (2000, 2008, 2014), Hornsby (2007, 2008), McDowell (2013), Schroeder (2008), Setiya (2007), and Comesaña and McGrath (2014). Jennifer Hornsby defends the view in the process of offering a disjunctive conception of a reason for acting, analogous to McDowell’s “disjunctive conception of appearances” (Hornsby 2008: 251), summarized in the following passage:

We now have the two answers to the question What is a reason for acting? Reasons for acting are given when facts are stated: let us call these “(F)-type reasons”. Reasons for acting are given when it is said what an agent believes: let us call these “(B)-type reasons”. (2008: 247)

This response to problem of error cases is plausible but there are also considerations against it. One such consideration is that stating these alleged reasons often leads to paradox or infelicitous claims. For many would argue that a claim such as “Ellie’s reason for stepping on your toes is that you are stepping on her toes, although you are not stepping on her toes” is paradoxical. By contrast, there is no air of paradox whatsoever in the corresponding claim about Ellie’s beliefs: “Ellie believes that you’re stepping on her toes although you are not”. Thus, Unger writes:

it is inconsistent to say “His reason was that the store was going to close, but it wasn’t going to close”. (1975: 208)

If this is right, then the operator “her reason is that …”, unlike “her belief is that …” is factive: the truth of the propositions expressed by sentences formed with “her reason is that…” requires the truth of the proposition expressed with the “that” clause. This response to the error cases—that a reason can be a falsehood—is therefore problematic.

A related difficulty is that this view commits one to awkward claims about reasons, such as Dancy’s claim that one’s reason for acting may be “a reason that is no reason” (Dancy 2000: 3; he qualifies this with the parenthesis “no good reason, that is”), or Hornsby’s claim that sometimes it is the case that “there was no reason to do what he did, even though he did it for a reason” (Hornsby 2008: 249; though again, she clarifies that the first clause denies that there is an “F-type” reason, a fact, while the second asserts that the agent had a “B-type”). The awkwardness of these claims is further supported by considerations about usage, for it seems that claims about what someone’s reason is are often retracted and qualified on learning that the person was mistaken concerning what he or she believed. If I say that Lisa’s reason for attending the party is that James will be there, and you tell me that he won’t be at the party, it would sound paradoxical if I insist that her reason is that James will be at the party.

The fact that these claims about reasons are prima facie paradoxical or infelicitous is not a decisive argument against the views that generate them, but it has led some non-psychologists to offer alternative accounts of error cases. One such alternative says that, in error cases, an agent acts on something that he treats as a reason and in light of which he acts but which is in fact not a reason. So, in these cases an agent acts for an “apparent reason” (Alvarez 2010 and Williamson forthcoming). The view is also defended by Parfit, who characterizes apparent reasons as follows: “We have some apparent reason when we have some belief whose truth would give us that reason” (2001: 25). On this view, an apparent motivating reason is not merely a bad reason but simply not a reason. So according to this alternative, agents who act on false beliefs are motivated by something, a false belief. They treat that belief as a reason and are guided by it in acting. Nonetheless, that false belief is not a motivating reason because it is not a fact, but merely an apparent fact, and hence only an apparent reason.

It might appear that the difference between these two non-psychological alternatives boils down to just a terminological dispute: some philosophers choose to call these false beliefs “false”, “subjective”, or “bad reasons”, etc., while others choose to call them “apparent reasons”. Surely, the thought would go, terminology is a matter of choice and nothing of substance depends on this choice. What matters is that every proposal contains clear definitions of how terms are being used. A response would be that some terminological choices are more apt than others because they reflect a more nuanced or precise understanding of the relevant concept. The substantial issue behind this debate seems to be whether the notion of a reason we apply in different contexts is a unified notion. If it is, the choice between the alternative non-psychological views outlined in the previous paragraphs will depend largely on what features are taken to be essential to that notion.

We noted above that most if not all accounts of acting for a motivating reason require as a condition that the agent be in some kind of epistemic relation to the reason that motivates her. And we saw also that a widespread view is that this epistemic relation is one of belief: for an agent to act for the reason that p, the agent must believe that p. It is this thought that led many to endorse the view that reasons are mental states (often as part of the “desire-belief” conception of reasons for action described above). But the view that mere belief is not sufficient to act for a reason has gained popularity in recent years. And many have argued that, in order to act in light of a fact that is a reason, an agent needs to know the relevant fact. The view is explicitly defended by Unger (1975), Hyman (1999, 2011 and 2015), Williamson (2000 and forthcoming), Hornsby (2007 and 2008 (as part of her disjunctive conception mentioned above)), and McDowell (2013)—but many others also endorse it. The basic idea behind this position is that an agent may act on the basis of a belief merely by treating that belief (i.e., what she believes) as a reason for acting. However, if there is a fact in virtue of which her belief is true, then she acts in light of that fact, or is guided by that fact, only if she knows that fact. If the agent does not know the fact, we cannot say that she was guided by it (Hyman), or that she was responding rationally to it (McDowell). If the agent does not know the fact, the argument goes, the relationship between the agent’s acting as she did and the fact is fortuitous, a matter of luck or coincidence, and hence not sufficient for the fact to be her reason for acting. And this, they argue, is so even in cases where an agent acts motivated by a belief that is both true and justified. For just as Gettier (1963) showed that having a justified true belief is not sufficient for having knowledge of the corresponding fact, so, these authors argue, acting on a justified true belief is not enough for acting in light of the corresponding fact: the connection between the fact and the action is fortuitous. (See entries on the analysis of knowledge and epistemology for discussions of Gettier’s arguments).

Those who think that acting for a reason requires merely treating something one believes as a ground, e.g., using it as a premise in one’s reasoning, reject this characterisation of acting for a reason—Dancy (2011 and 2014) is an example. But defenders of the knowledge condition complain that Dancy’s remarks are off-target. For their point is that there is a notion of acting for a reason—arguably, the central notion—that involves the idea of acting guided by a fact. This notion requires not mere belief but knowledge of the fact that is a reason. Others have argued that it is, however, possible to accept that there is this distinctive, central notion of acting for a reason but still deny that an agent needs to know a fact in order to act guided by it. Dustin Locke (2015), for example, argues that it is possible for someone to act guided by a fact that he does not know. Locke uses so-called “fake-barn” cases to make his point against the knowledge condition. These cases are due to Alvin Goldman (1967) who developed them in his defence of his theory of knowledge. Suppose that a man is driving in the countryside and sees a barn. Unbeknown to him, he’s driving in “fake-barn country”, which is littered with fake barns: barn façades designed to look like real barns. The widely held consensus is that a person in a fake-barn situation who, on seeing a real barn, forms the belief that there is a barn, does not know that there is a barn, even though he has a justified true belief to that effect. Locke uses this sort of case to argue that a person in this situation could, for instance, drive towards a barn guided by the fact that there is a barn over there, without knowing that there is. If so, Locke claims, the agent acts for the reason that there is a barn over there, since he is guided by that fact. Nonetheless, he doesn’t know that there is a barn. (For further discussion of practical reasoning, the knowledge condition and fake-barn situations see Hawthorne 2004, Brown 2008 and Neta 2009.)

These debates about motivating reasons focus primarily on what sort of thing motivating reasons are and what it takes for an agent to act for a reason. We now turn to when and how reasons explain actions.

3.2 Explanatory Reasons

A person’s action may be explained in a variety of ways: by reference to the agent’s goal, or habits, or character traits, or to her reasons for acting. For instance, we may say that Jess went to the hospital in order to reassure her father, or that she went because she always goes on Tuesdays, or because she is a dutiful daughter, or because her father was in intensive care. These statements explain why Jess went to the hospital because, given certain background assumptions, they enable a third person to understand Jess’s action: they make it intelligible. In the examples just given, the first explanation gives us Jess’s goal in going to the hospital (to reassure her father), the second and third place her action in the context of her habits (she does it every Tuesday) and her character (she’s dutiful), respectively, and the fourth explanation gives a reason why she did it that was her reason for doing it: a reason that, from her perspective, spoke in favour of going to the hospital (that her father was in intensive care). Among this variety of possible explanations (and there are more), the last one is a distinctive type that is of particular interest here because it is an explanation of an intentional action that rationalises the action: it explains the action by citing the agent’s reason for acting. In Davidson’s words:

A reason rationalizes an action only if it leads us to see something the agent saw, or thought he saw, in his action—some feature, consequence, or aspect of the action the agent wanted, desired, prized, held dear, thought dutiful, beneficial, obligatory, or agreeable. (Davidson 1963: 685)

One argument in favour of psychologism for explanatory reasons that rationalise actions depends on the following idea. For a reason to be able to rationalise your action, that reason must be part of your psychology: a fact that is merely “out there” cannot explain why you do anything. Your believing or knowing that fact, by contrast, can explain why you act. So the reasons that explain your actions must be mental states (believings, knowings, etc.).

It might be responded that, although a fact cannot be a reason that explains one’s action unless the person is aware of it, it does not follow that the explanation of the action must mention their awareness of the reason. For instance, we can explain why Jess went to the hospital by citing her reason for going, namely that her father had been admitted to the intensive care unit—this points to something she saw in the action that made it desirable: e.g., that she could then be with her father in this difficult moment. The explanation does not need to mention any psychological fact, such as the fact that she knew that her father had been admitted, even though the explanation presupposes this fact. Against this suggestion, a defender of psychologism for explanatory reasons might urge that these explanations are elliptical and when fully spelled out their explanans (the part of the explanation that does the explaining) contains facts about what she knew or believed. But are these explanations really elliptical? It seems undeniable that a person cannot act for the reason that p, or on the grounds that p, unless she stands in some epistemic relation to p: she needs to believe, know, accept, etc. that p. However, it does not follow that all full rationalisations need mention psychological facts and that, when they don’t, this is because they’ve been given in elliptical form. Perhaps the fact that the agent knows the relevant things is simply a necessary condition for her reason to be the explanans in a reason explanation. Or as Dancy suggests, her knowing or believing may be an “enabling condition” for the explanation (Dancy 2000: 127).

However that issue about rationalisations is decided, two things should be noted. First, in “error cases”—cases when an agent acts on the basis of a falsehood that he believes and treats as a reason for acting—the explanans of a true explanation must be a psychological fact. For instance, the explanation of why Othello kills Desdemona cannot be what he believes, that Desdemona has been unfaithful, but rather the fact that he believes it. This is because explanations are, it is generally thought, factive: a true explanation cannot have a falsehood as its explanans: we cannot say that Othello kills Desdemona because she has been unfaithful when she hasn’t. The second thing to note is that, even if psychologism is right for explanatory reasons (that is, even if all reason explanations cite psychological facts), it does not follow that psychologism is right for motivating reasons because these reasons need not be the same. In other words, if one attends to the distinction between the roles of motivation and explanation that reasons can play, there should be no temptation to move from psychologism concerning explanatory reasons in some or in all cases, to psychologism concerning motivating reasons.

Not all opponents of psychologism accept the suggestion that explanatory reasons in rationalisations are mental states, or facts about them, even for error cases. For example, in his 2000 book, Dancy denies this and argues that we can always explain an action by specifying the reason for which it was done, even when an agent acted on a false consideration. The problem with this view is that it commits Dancy to the conclusion that some reason explanations are non-factive: an explanation may be true even though what does the explaining is not. For instance, it commits him to saying that what explains why I took my umbrella is that it was raining, even though it was not raining. To most philosophers this is an unacceptable conclusion: surely true explanations require the truth of both the explanandum (what is explained: that I took my umbrella) and the explanans (that it was raining). In a recent paper (2014), Dancy has abandoned his earlier view that reason explanations can be non-factive but he still retains his opposition to psychologism for explanatory reasons. So he still maintains that we can always explain an action by specifying the reason for which it was done, even when the “reason” is some falsehood that the agent believed and in light of which he acted. In those cases, he says,

we can say that what explains the action is that it was done for the reason that p, without committing ourselves to saying that what explains the action is that p. (2014: 90)

He adds that in such cases the reason itself “need not be the case and does not make the sort of distinct contribution to the explanation that would enable us to think of it as the explanans” (2014: 91). Philosophers may disagree about whether this new suggestion is satisfactory. Some may think that “Othello killed Desdemona for the reason that Desdemona had been unfaithful to him, although she had not been unfaithful to him” sounds paradoxical. Moreover, to say that the reason that explains an action is (the fact) that it was done for the reason that p enables Dancy to accommodate the view that explanations are factive. But it does so at the expense of undermining his claim that the reasons that explain are also the reasons that motivate. For Dancy says that the reason that motivates Othello is that Desdemona is unfaithful, while, according to this new suggestion, the reason that explains his action (i.e., the explanans) is that it was done for the reason that she is unfaithful.

Whatever one thinks about Dancy’s new proposal it is worth emphasizing again that the distinction between explanatory and motivating reasons enables one to bypass these issues. For one can say that the reason that explains why Othello kills Desdemona is the psychological fact that he believes that she has been unfaithful without accepting that that is the reason that motivates him. His motivating reason for killing her is the putative fact that she has been unfaithful (which, as we saw above, some would describe as merely an apparent reason). In short, even if some form of psychologism is right for explanatory reasons, it does not follow that it is right for motivating reasons: the two may differ from each other in some cases.

4. Conclusion

Space limitations preclude detailed examination of other debates about practical reasons. We shall close the entry with a brief description of a relatively new debate about reasons for action that derives from work in the social sciences. The debate relates to work in experimental psychology (some of it dating from the 1970s, e.g., Nisbett and Wilson 1977) that claims to identify our “real reasons” for acting. Briefly, experiments have shown that factors such as the way items are presented in a situation of choice influence people’s choices without their being aware of this influence. For example, in some of these experiments, when faced with a choice among what in fact are identical options, agents tend to choose the item on the right. This appears to be in fact the result of a right-hand bias in most humans. However, since people are not aware of this bias, when asked to justify their choice, agents cite reasons concerning some alleged superior feature of their chosen option. These and other phenomena, such as implicit bias (which occurs when agents display bias based on race, gender, etc. in their behaviour, while explicitly denying that they endorse such bias) and others, seem to show that agents are motivated by reasons they are not aware of, and in ways that they are not aware of, even after careful reflection on their reasons and motivations. The general claim, then, is that these phenomena undermine many of our ordinary and philosophical assumptions about our reasons for acting, for they show, it is said, that agents are often ignorant of their real reasons for acting, and as a result they often “confabulate” when explaining and attempting to justify their behaviour (see Hirstein 2009). These conclusions, if right, would appear to threaten fundamentally the authority we seem to enjoy about our own reasons for acting, as well as the explanatory power of the ordinary explanations of action that cite the agent’s reasons for acting.

The plausibility of these conclusions depends to a large extent on whether the notion of “the agent’s real reason” that these studies claim to uncover is the same as the notion of a motivating reason that has been examined in this entry. One suggestion might be that these so-called “real reasons” are explanatory but not motivating reasons. And, it has been argued that, while these explanatory reasons might make important contributions to explaining our actions, in a variety of ways, this fact is compatible with our ordinary psychological explanations in terms of agents’ motivating reasons. For instance, it may be that the sorts of reasons uncovered by these experiments help explain why agents are motivated by the reasons that they avow are their reasons for acting: the prevalence of a right-hand bias in most humans may explain why the item on the right seems more appealing to an agent. But this is consistent with the truth of the agent’s claim that her reason for choosing the item is the (putative) fact that it is better than the other items (see Sandis 2015 for suggestions along these lines).

The above is an overview of a range of problems about practical reasons and their widespread significance. It should be sufficient to show how the problems and their many ramifications reach into many aspects of our lives and have important consequences for our understanding of ourselves as rational agents.


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Thanks are due to Connie Rosati for many very helpful suggestions for improvement on earlier versions of this entry. The entry was completed during my tenure as a Leverhulme Major Research Fellow.

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