Moral Particularism

First published Wed Jun 6, 2001; substantive revision Fri Sep 22, 2017

Moral Particularism, at its most trenchant, is the claim that there are no defensible moral principles, that moral thought does not consist in the application of moral principles to cases, and that the morally perfect person should not be conceived as the person of principle. There are more cautious versions, however. The strongest defensible version, perhaps, holds that though there may be some moral principles, still the rationality of moral thought and judgement in no way depends on a suitable provision of such things; and the perfectly moral judge would need far more than a grasp on an appropriate range of principles and the ability to apply them. Moral principles are at best crutches that a morally sensitive person would not require, and indeed the use of such crutches might even lead us into moral error.

The particularist’s opponent is the generalist. Ethical generalism is the view that the rationality of moral thought and judgement depends on a suitable provision of moral principles.

This entry provides a high-level introduction. For a more detailed presentation, see the entry on the debate between moral particularism and moral generalism.

1. Two Conceptions of Moral Principles

If we are going to debate the question whether there is a need for moral principles, we need some idea of what we mean by a ‘moral principle’. Unfortunately there are two radically different conceptions of what moral principles are. The first conception, the ‘absolute’ conception, takes a moral principle to be a universal claim to the effect that all actions of a certain type are overall wrong (or right). The principle ‘don’t break your promises’can be expressed in various ways: ‘it is wrong to break one’s promises’; ‘all actions that involve breaking a promise are wrong’—and so on. On the absolute conception, these all mean that each and every action of breaking a promise is a wrong action, whatever else there may be to be said for it. Each such action is wrong overall, despite any redeeming features it may have.

There is a very different way of understanding a moral principle, as ‘contributory’ rather than as absolute. Understood in this second way, our principle maintains that if an action involves breaking a promise, that counts against it. The action is the worse for being a promise-breaking. Of course it may be the worse for being a promise-breaking but the better for some other feature that it has—that of being kindly meant, say. The contributory conception of moral principles allows that more than one principle can apply to the case before us, since it holds that each principle is, as it were, partial; each specifies how things are only in a certain respect. But actions have many relevant features, some counting in favour and others against. Whether the action is overall right or wrong can only be determined by the overall balance of right and wrong in it. The contributory principles do not themselves tell us how to determine that balance. They only specify contributions one by one, and leave us to work out how these add up. Some people suppose that the principles can themselves be ranked in order of importance; if that were right, it would be of some help to us in working out what matters most in a given case. Others suppose that there is no available lexical ordering of such a sort, and that the matter is left to unaided ‘judgement’.

Since there are these two quite different conceptions of what a moral principle says, our discussion will need to address both possibilities. If particularism is true, there is not much room for moral principles of either sort.

2. What the Particularist Does Not Believe

It is standard, at least in cultures informed by the Christian tradition, to think of the moral person as the person of principle. This person is the person who has learnt, or developed for herself, a sufficient range of sound moral principles (of either type), and who has sufficient skill at applying these principles to cases as they crop up. There is no need to underestimate the sort of skill that would be required for this; the matter is certainly far from mechanical. One needs judgement both to discern whether a principle applies at all and, if it does, what exactly it requires of one. Nonetheless, however difficult it may be, moral judgement is conceived here as the application of principles to cases.

If moral judgement is a rational enterprise, it must be subject to constraints of consistency. What is demanded of us when we are required to be consistent in our moral judgements? The answer is that we are required to apply our principles consistently, that is, to apply the same principle to similar cases. It is inconsistent to apply the principle ‘don’t lie’ to cases involving one’s friends and not to those that involve strangers. If you want to behave in that sort of way, your principle is going to have to be ‘don’t lie to your friends’. What this tells us, of course, is that consistency is not the only requirement. Our moral principles are supposed to be impartial, and it is not obvious that the principle ‘don’t lie to your friends’meets this condition. But at least someone who takes it as his principle can tell the truth to his friends and lie to strangers without inconsistency.

Why do we think of the moral person as the person of principle, and why do we think of moral judgement as subject to this sort of consistency constraint? (As we will see later, there are other forms that the consistency constraint could have taken.) The answer, I think, is that we suppose that without moral principles there could be no such thing as the difference between right and wrong. Rightness and wrongness are peculiar properties, and the only way that an action can get them is by being related to a principle in one way or another. So unless there are principles saying which sorts of actions are right and which wrong, none would be right and none wrong. If this were so, it would hardly be surprising that the good moral judge would be the person capable of following in her mind the way in which actions get to be right or wrong, which requires knowing the relevant principles and seeing that they have this effect here and that effect there. And it would be hardly surprising that consistency in judgement would amount to no more than applying similar principles to similar cases.

A rather different argument appeals not so much to a metaphysical need for principles as to an epistemological need. If there is a distinction between right and wrong actions, how are we to detect it? There must be a detectable difference between the properties of the right ones and the properties of the wrong ones. Now if an action is wrong, it is wrong because of certain other features it has—the non-moral features that make it wrong. Those non-moral features will be detectable in the ordinary way, whatever that is. Good moral judges, having detected them, can somehow work out whether they make the action right or wrong. But if this ability is not a matter of magic, it must rest on an at least implicit knowledge of regularities connecting the non-moral features of actions and their moral properties. Moral principles specify such regularities. So if moral judgement is to be even possible, there must be a set of principles connecting moral properties to non-moral properties, contrary to what the particularist claims.

If this is our picture of the individual trying to decide what she ought to do, how are we likely to conceive of the way to resolve disagreements between two individuals? Of course there are the facts of the matter to be sorted out between them. Then presumably they have to try to agree at least on which principles are to be taken as relevant (that is, to agree on the principles, and to agree that they are the relevant ones in the present case). Finally, they have to agree on the course of action that those principles recommend in the situation that faces them. This would be, as we might put it, a full resolution of any initial disagreement. Otherwise we are looking for a compromise of one form or another. It is possible, for instance, for a disagreement on the principles not to make any practical difference as things turn out, so that it can be left to be sorted out another day.

Overall, then, we are offered a way in which moral reasons work, and an account of the perfectly moral agent whose decision processes fit the way the reasons work, that is, fit the way in which an action can get to be right or wrong. But the way moral reasons work is probably very different from the way that other reasons work. Other reasons are not principle-driven. Morality is special, since without principles it is impossible. (Remember that the two arguments given above for the need for principles appealed to the special nature of rightness and wrongness, or of moral properties in general.)

3. What the Particularist Believes

The particularist believes, like the generalist, that the perfectly moral person is the person who is fully sensitive to the moral reasons present in the case. But the particularist paints a very different picture of what it is to be fully sensitive to those reasons. The particularist picture is one which takes moral reasons to operate in ways that are not noticeably different from the way in which other reasons function—more ordinary reasons for action, say, or reasons for belief rather than for action. Morality may be distinguished by its subject matter, but moral thought does not have a distinctive structure.

If we are to form a view about what a full sensitivity to the reasons amounts, to, we need to have some picture of how moral reasons work. The core of particularism is its insistence on variability. Essentially the generalist demands sameness in the way in which one and the same consideration functions case by case, while the particularist sees no need for any such thing. A feature can make one moral difference in one case, and a different difference in another. Features have, as we might put it, variable relevance. Whether a feature is relevant or not in a new case, and if so what exact role it is playing there (the ‘form’ that its relevance takes there) will be sensitive to other features of the case. This claim emerges as the consequence of the core particularist doctrine, which we can call the holism of reasons. This is the doctrine that what is a reason in one case may be no reason at all in another, or even a reason on the other side. In ethics, a feature that makes one action better can make another one worse, and make no difference at all to a third.

Particularists suppose that this doctrine is true for reasons in general, so that its application to moral reasons is just part and parcel of a larger story. For an example that comes from a non-moral context, suppose that it currently seems to me that something before me is red. Normally, one might say, that is a reason (some reason, that is, not necessarily sufficient reason) for me to believe that there is something red before me. But in a case where I also believe that I have recently taken a drug that makes blue things look red and red things look blue, the appearance of a red-looking thing before me is reason for me to believe that there is a blue, not a red, thing before me. It is not as if it is some reason for me to believe that there is something red before me, but that as such a reason it is overwhelmed by contrary reasons. It is no longer any reason at all to believe that there is something red before me; indeed it is a reason for believing the opposite.

Examples like this establish the variability of reasons for belief. Turning to reasons for action, we might point out that in some contexts the fact that something is against the law is a reason not to do it, but in others it is a reason to do it (so as to protest, let us say, against the existence of a law governing an aspect of private life with which the law should not interfere). Examples of this sort can be multiplied at will. They appear to establish the holism, or variability of reasons for belief and of ordinary reasons for action. The particularist suggests that there is no reason to suppose that moral reasons function in a radically different way from other reasons. Indeed, there is a sort of presumption that they don’t. That presumption is partly grounded on the fact that nobody is able to say with any confidence just which reasons are moral ones and which are not. This means that providing a radical difference between the way in which reasons of the two sorts function should seem rather peculiar. But the presumption is also partly grounded in the fact that the difference suggested by the generalist is very radical, since it affects what one might call the very logic of moral thought. To suppose that moral thought has a different logic from other thought is to adopt a bifurcated conception of rationality. Moral rationality is principle-bound, based on invariant reasons. Other forms of rationality are nothing like this at all. Particularists think that this suggestion is very strange.

These points about holism or the variability of reasons need to be expressed in different ways, according to the conception of principles that they are aimed at—the absolute or the contributory. Principles of both sorts aim to specify invariant reasons, but the reasons they specify are rather different in style. Absolute principles, which specify a feature or combination of features that always succeed in making an action wrong (or right) wherever they occur, purport to specify an invariant overall reason, as we might put it. Counter-examples to suggested principles of this sort will consist in cases where the supposed feature or combination of features is present but the action concerned is not wrong overall (or right overall). Contributory principles are different. They purport to specify features that always make the same contribution, irrespective of context. Counter-examples to suggested contributory principles consist of cases where the feature cited is present but either does not count at all or counts the wrong way (a supposed right-making feature actually making an action worse rather than better, for instance). Particularists take their holism to be a reason to reject any invariance of reasons, of either sort—whether at the overall or at the contributory level. Reasons as such, they say, do not need to behave in this sort of way. It is consistent with this to allow that there might be some invariant reasons. What the particularist says, however, is that the possibility of morality in no way depends upon a suitable provision of invariant reasons of the sorts that principles are attempting to specify. Principle-based accounts of morality, such as those that specify ten (or some other number) of basic moral principles (e.g., Gert 1998), are left looking rather peculiar.

The picture so far is that actions get to be right or wrong in a wide variety of ways. Particularists are ‘pluralists’, believing that there is more than one morally relevant property. Many properties (or features) are capable of making a difference to how one ought to act, and are therefore capable of being morally relevant. But a property can be relevant on one occasion and not on another, and can count in favour of action here and against action there. Isn’t this all terribly confusing? If it is all as much of a mess as this, how are we capable of keeping track of it? Are we reduced to looking at the case before us and hoping that the complex interrelations between the various features that happen to be relevant here will just strike us, somehow? Is there no such thing as general moral knowledge that one can extract from experience and bring to bear on a new case? Particularists need not deny this possibility. The question will be what form such general moral knowledge will take if it is not knowledge of the sort of invariabilities that particularism sets its face against, and that principles try to capture. I suggest that what the experienced moral judge knows is a range of ways in which a feature can contribute to determining how to act. There need be no hard core to this set of ‘sorts of contribution’, no common element, no limited set of paradigm cases. Instead, in understanding the practical purport of a concept such as cruelty, what one knows is the sort of difference it can make that what one proposes to do would be cruel, in a way that enables one to see new differences made in situations rather different from those one has encountered so far. Particularists may suggest that this is rather like what one knows when one knows the semantic purport of a term. In knowing the semantic purport (= the meaning) of ‘and’, one is in command of a range of contributions that ‘and’ can make to sentences in which it occurs. There need be no ‘core meaning’ to ‘and’; it would be wrong to suggest that ‘and’ basically signifies conjunction. If you only know about conjunction, you are not a competent user of ‘and’ in English, for there are lots of uses that have little or nothing to do with conjunction. For example: two and two make four; ‘And what do you think you are doing? (said on discovering a child playing downstairs in the middle of the night); John and Mary lifted the boulder; the smoke rose higher and higher. Those competent with ‘and’ are not unsettled by instances such as these, but nor are they trying to understand them in terms of similarity to a supposed conjunctive paradigm or core case. Particularists in ethics will want to say the same sort of thing about what one knows when one knows the practical purport of a concept; one becomes familiar with its practical grammar. There is complexity, then, but it is manageable complexity.

This tells us how particularists will conceive of moral deliberation, when an individual tries to work out for herself how to act. There is no attempt to bring principles to bear on the situation, but there is an attempt to work out what matters here and how it matters, in ways that may involve an indirect appeal to the way things were or might be elsewhere. And when two particularists are engaged in dispute, it is not as if they are reduced to saying ‘I see it this way’. There are ways of supporting or defending the way one takes the situation to be. A particularist can perfectly well point to how things are in another perhaps simpler case, and suggest that this reveals something about how they are in the present more difficult one. There need be no generalist suggestion that since this feature made a certain difference there, it must make the same difference here. But our judgement can be informed, and indeed defended, by seeing the way in which a feature functions in situations that resemble the present one in various ways. What we learn is not how things must be here, but how they might very well be. Argument between two people who differ on the way to see the present case can make progress as each brings to bear other situations that are both appropriately different from and also appropriately similar to the one before them. There is no guarantee that this process will lead to agreement, any more than the generalist understanding of how disagreements get resolved leads us to suppose that all disagreements are resoluble, if treated properly. But things can happen even where there is no guarantee that they will happen.

Finally, in this section, how does the particularist understand someone who says ‘that is stealing, and therefore you should not do it’? One way of understanding what is said here is as an abbreviated argument, which fully specified reads ‘that is stealing and stealing is always wrong; therefore that is wrong’. This reading introduces silent appeal to a principle—either absolute or contributory, according to one’s way of understanding ‘that is wrong’. And it suggests that what we have here is really an inference, or argument, with premises and a conclusion. This is not how the particularist is likely to see things. Particularism is likely to think of ‘that is stealing and therefore it is wrong’ as saying ‘that is stealing and wrong for that reason’. This is not an argument, and there is nothing going on here that really merits being called inference. It is simply an account of the presence of a reason and a statement of what reason it is, that is, of what it is a reason for (or against).

4. Problems for Absolute Principles

The previous section tried to lay out the main aspects of the particularist conception of moral thought, and of the way in which actions get to be right and wrong. Particularists do not, however, restrict themselves to expounding their own view. Of course, they are likely to say that their view is at least possible, and that generalism tends merely to assume otherwise and then to carry on blithely. The mere possibility that particularism should be true is of some importance in the dialectic. But there are also reasons for doubting whether any form of generalism can really be true. Some of these have already emerged; these involved the attempt to establish a broad holism of reasons, by appeal to examples. There are replies to such attempts, which we will consider in Section 8 (below); the replies amount to the claim that, despite appearances, holism must be false.

In the present section we consider reasons for thinking that morality cannot be a system of absolute principles.

The first reason is that absolute principles cannot conflict, and that if they cannot conflict a vital aspect of our moral lives (that is, conflict) has been left out of account altogether by any theory that supposes that morality is entirely governed by absolute principles.

If two supposed absolute principles conflict in a single case, one of them must be abandoned. Suppose, for instance that one principle says that all actions of type A are wrong and another says that all actions of type B are right. Suppose also that no action can be both overall wrong and overall right, and that it is possible for an action to be of both types, A and B. Things are all right so far, but if there were an action of both types, one or other of the principles would have to have abandoned. But this means that we have no room for conflict. What is meant by moral conflict here is not conflict between two individuals, but conflict between reasons for and against in a given case. There cannot be that sort of conflict, if all reasons are specified in absolute principles, because if the reasons conflicted the principles specifying them would conflict, and this would just show that one of the principles was a fraud. Conflict would, then, never be more than a product of our own misconceptions. There would be no real conflict.

What this criticism amounts to is the complaint that we need to be able to make sense of cases in which there are moral reasons on both sides, for and against. But we cannot do this effectively if all moral reasons are specified in absolute principles. Morality cannot, therefore, be just a system of absolute principles. The only way in which we could continue to think of morality as governed by absolute principles is to suppose that there is only one such principle, so that there is no possibility of conflict between principles, or to arrange things in some other way so that the principles are incapable of conflict. (Even then, of course, there would be the worry that conflict is real, and that to arrange things so that conflict is merely apparent is to erase something important.) We know of one position that offers only one principle: classical utilitarianism. The argument against this ‘monistic’ position is rather different. The argument is the direct claim that monism is false; there is more than one sort of relevant property, or more than one way in which features can get to be morally relevant. So a position with only one absolute principle is false, and one with more than one such principle cannot make proper sense of conflict.

5. Problems for Contributory Principles

The best form of generalism, therefore, probably tries to do the whole thing in terms of contributory principles—principles that specify considerations that always count as contributory reasons. In this picture it is quite possible for there to be reasons on both sides. The classic example of such a theory is W. D. Ross’s theory of Prima Facie Duties (Ross 1930, ch. 2). This is just an attempt to put into good theoretical order our untutored intuitions that there are many different sorts of things that can make a difference to how we should act. There is a principle that says ‘Be just’, but this does not mean that all just actions are in fact right; it only means that the justness of an action counts in its favour, or that an action is the better for being just. Sadly, an action can be just but still wrong for other reasons. This means that it can sometimes be morally required of us that we act unjustly. If it is, there will be features of the situation that require it of us; perhaps we owe an enormous debt of gratitude, or perhaps by this unjust action we can save Holland from flooding.

The generalist who takes this line supposes, qua generalist, that a feature that makes a difference in one case will make the same sort of difference in every case, and that there will be a contributory principle specifying its regular contribution. This is what particularism is concerned to rebut. Particularists applaud Ross’s insistence that there can be many features of the situation each of which makes some difference to how one should act; they merely want to say that the matter is not regular in the way that Ross, as a generalist, supposes. They have three points to make, then. The first involves producing counter-examples to suggested regular contributors. Ross supposes, for instance, in accordance with long tradition, that the fact that one has promised to do something is always some reason to do it. A counter-example to this claim would be a case where, for peculiar reasons no doubt, the fact that one has promised to do something is either no reason to do it or even a reason not to do it. Suppose, for instance, that I have promised not to keep my next three promises; what then? Again, does one always have at least some reason to tell the truth? A little bit of ingenuity enables one to come up with a case in which the fact that this is true is a reason not to say it. And so on.

The second prong of the particularist attack is to ask why we should suppose that a feature that counts in favour in one case must count the same way wherever it appears. To this question, I think, no real answer has been produced. Generalists tend to point out that if one claims that a feature counts in favour here and against there, one has something to explain. But the particularist is happy to admit this. It is true that if a feature counts in favour in one case and against in another broadly similar case, there must be an explanation of how this can be. That explanation will presumably be given by pointing to other differences between the cases. In the second case, perhaps, something that is required for the feature to count in favour is in fact absent, though it was present in the first case. Such explanations must be available, and they can be found. None of this does anything to restore a generalist conception of how reasons function.

The third prong of attack on contributory generalism involves asking for an appropriate epistemology. How are we to tell, from what we can discern case by case, that this feature will function in the same way wherever else it appears? Ross, our paradigm generalist, holds that we start with the recognition that this feature counts in favour here, but that we can immediately tell (by a process which he calls ‘intuitive induction’) that it must count in favour everywhere. The question is how this is supposed to work. What is it that is discernible in one case and tells us that what we have here must repeat in all other cases? (Ross rightly does not suppose that we learn our moral principles by ordinary induction.) The standard, and probably the only, answer to this question is wrong. This answer amounts to an account of what it is to make a difference in a particular case—what it is to be relevant here. That account understands a feature as relevant here if and only if, in any case where it is the only relevant feature, it would decide the issue. Now if this account of particular relevance were defensible, we would indeed have some reason to suppose that what is relevant here would be relevant in any other situation. For on each further situation it will still be true that if it were the only relevant feature, it would decide the issue. So relevance is indeed general relevance, on this showing. And this gives the generalist the epistemology he needs, for it is now easy to see how, in discerning that this feature matters here, we immediately see that it would make the same difference on every occurrence. For it is true of it on each occurrence that if it were the only relevant feature, it would decide the issue.

Sadly, the account of relevance that this all depends on is not defensible. It is, after all, true of any feature whatever that if it were the only relevant feature, it would decide the issue. The word ‘relevant’ appears within this formulation, and it cannot be removed. For if we said merely that if this feature were the only feature, it would decide the issue, we would have said something that is probably both false and, worse, incoherent. It would be incoherent because the idea that a feature could be present alone, without any other features whatever, is surely nonsense. The idea that an action could be merely kind, say, without having any other features at all, makes no sense at all. Further, there may be some features that can only be relevant if some other feature is also relevant—features that (in terms of reasons) only give us reasons if some other feature is giving us reasons as well. For instance, in the Prisoner’s Dilemma one prisoner only has reasons if the other one does. If this can occur, any ‘isolation test’ for reasons must miss some reasons out. Finally, trying to isolate the contribution of a feature by asking how things would have been if no other feature had made any contribution is, when one comes to think of it, a rather peculiar enterprise. It is uncomfortably like trying to determine the contribution made by one football player to his team’s success today by asking how things would have been if there had been no other players on the field. So the notion of relevance that is required as a basis for generalist epistemology is unacceptable.

6. The Generalists’ Reply

Generalists have two possible replies to these attacks, assuming always that they accept that many of the contributory principles that they originally suggested have been refuted by counter-example. The first thing they can do is to complicate the principles. The second thing they can do is to restrict their generalism to a limited group of reasons.

Taking the first tack, one might suggest that if the fact that one has promised is in some cases not a reason for doing what one promised to do, there will be some explanation of this. Suppose that the explanation is that what one promised to do was immoral. All one needs to do is to suck this feature into one’s account of the supposedly general reason. So now the reason in ordinary cases will be that one promised to do it and it is not immoral. We might object that not even this is always a reason. What if one’s promise has been extracted by duress? The response will be to suck that into the reason as well. This reason is growing all the time; now it is that one promised to do it, that it is not itself immoral, and one’s promise was not made under duress. This battle can continue; it has no obvious stopping point. Still, we might say, eventually ingenuity will give out, and we will reach a (now very complex) specification of a reason to which we can think of no appropriate counter-example.

But note what has happened here. We started from a consideration that we took to count in favour of our action, and we have ended with a complex specification of something that plays rather a different role. What we got at the end was more like an elaborate guarantee that something mentioned in the guarantee counts in favour of the action. Consider the promising example above. That I promised does, let us suppose, count in favour of my acting. But that my promise was not made under duress does not do that at all. It functions as an enabling condition, one in whose absence the first feature (that I promised) would not have been the reason it is. It is not itself a reason to do the action; that role is distinctive, and it is played here only by the fact that I promised. Note, further, that the combination of that reason and this enabling condition is not itself a (further) reason in favour of doing the action. So the distinction between ‘counting in favour’ and ‘enabling something else to count in favour’ is significant, as particularists see things. What the generalist reached, in defending her supposed reason by complication, is therefore not itself a reason at all, but only a guarantee (when finally complete) that there is a reason somewhere within it. And why should we suppose that nothing can be a reason unless we can specify a condition that guarantees its status as a reason, and that it is only a reason when present in a larger state within which it is guaranteed to serve as such? No obvious answer suggests itself. The whole enterprise of defending one’s reason by complication begins to look strangely irrelevant, and its product unnecessary. One would have thought that there can be reasons that can function perfectly well without this sort of guarantee. And the reasons given on behalf of generalism in Section 2 (above) do nothing to show otherwise.

The second generalist line of defence involves drawing in one’s horns a little. Ross distinguishes between derived and underived prima facie duties. The underived ones are the duty to do the just thing, to act for the best, not to cause harm, to keep promises, and so on. Other duties are derived from these. So there is, as we might put it, a core of invariability surrounded by a variable periphery. I might have a duty to go up to London today to see my son Hugh. But this duty is derived from a general duty to do what I have promised to do. As we might put it, that Hugh is expecting to see me today sometimes gives me a reason to go up to London and sometimes does not; it is a derived, and therefore variable, reason. If it does give me a reason, it will because it is keyed in some way into an unvariable, underived reason. So derived reasons are variable, and underived ones invariant. On this account, counter-examples will only do damage if they are aimed at the supposed underived reasons. (See McNaughton and Rawling 2000.)

A different version of this picture maintains that invariant reasons derive from the virtues (Crisp 2000). That an action is generous, honest, just, thoughtful, or helpful is always a reason to do it. The invariant core is given by the virtues, therefore, and the variant periphery depends upon that invariant core. This last point is important, because this defence of generalism needs to show why it is that morality requires a basis of invariance. Just to come up with a few invariant reasons is nothing to the point. Those who suppose they can seriously damage particularism by specifying a few (probably fairly complex) invariant reasons do little to show that moral thought depends (as it was put in the Introduction above) on a suitable provision of principles (which we are now understanding as ‘invariant reasons’). The suggestion we are dealing with now does well in this respect. We are offered an invariant core and an account of why there must be such a core if moral thought is to be possible at all.

Of course, for the suggestion to work, it must be the case that the virtues function invariantly. Particularists are likely to say, for instance, that an action can be considerate without necessarily being the better for it. It may be considerate to wipe the torturer’s brow, but this fact hardly functions as a reason to wipe, or makes his sweat a reason for us to wipe it off. The torturer’s other activities prevent what would ordinarily give us a reason from doing so here. Similarly, it may be that a cruel response is exactly the one called for in the circumstances; cruelty, according to particularists, need not be an invariant reason. A generalist reply to these suggestions depends on showing that similar remarks cannot be made about (a sufficient range of) the other virtues.

What is at issue between particularism and generalism is the nature of moral rationality. Particularists maintain that there can be reasons—moral reasons—even if the features that give us those reasons function variably rather than invariably in their reason-giving. Generalists suppose that this is not possible. They claim either that all reasons, when properly understood, must function invariably, or that there is an invariant core even if there is a variable periphery. To argue for the first claim, they often demand, for each reason, that there be a discoverable guarantee of its status as such. But until they have offered some justification for this demand, their generalism will rest on nothing. Crisp’s position is a model of the second approach because it offers an account of why the variability that the particularist is so fond of pointing to must be built around an invariant core. But I would say that the supposed virtues do not in fact play the role required here.

7. Do Particularism and Generalism Differ in Practice or Only in Theory?

Particularists are fond of saying that generalists will make bad decisions. One reason for this is that generalism seems to validate certain patterns of argument that particularists would think of as invalid. For instance, a generalist might think ‘Feature F made a difference in that case; so it must make the same sort of difference here too’. If our decision in the second case was influenced by such ‘reasoning’, it would have been influenced by a mistake, according to the particularist. Particularism supposes that one cannot extract from one case anything that is guaranteed to make a difference to another. They recommend keeping one’s eyes firmly fixed on the case before one rather than trying to squeeze an answer to one problem out of the answer to another. This does not show that there is nothing to be learnt from other cases. Particularists can even allow that it might, on occasion, be impossible to see the right answer here if one does not work to that answer from consideration of other cases, suitably constructed or provided by experience. One can perfectly well say ‘this feature mattered there, and so it might well matter here—I had better have a look and see whether it does or not’. What one cannot and should not do is to say ‘it mattered there and so it must matter here’. So particularists allow a relevance to moral experience; they are not reduced to just gazing vacantly at the case before them and coming up with an answer that somehow seems appropriate. There is a practical difference between particularism and generalism, but it is not this.

There is another possible practical difference between the two. This comes out when we consider two pretty similar cases of which we nonetheless want to make different judgements. Nobody supposes that this is impossible. The question is rather what is rationally required of the judge in such a case. The generalist might end up demanding that one make the same judgement in both cases unless one can provide a principle that distinguishes them. The particularist, by contrast, might demand only that one make the same judgement in both cases unless one can offer some reason for not doing so. Some, however, would not even demand that. All agree that there must be some relevant difference between any two cases of which one wants to make different judgements. Might it be enough to allow that there is some such difference, even though one has no idea what it is? Or is one rationally required to be able to make some suggestion about what it is? Or is one’s suggestion to be formulated as a possible principle governing all similar cases? Particularists might be distinguished from generalists by their answer to these questions.

8. Problems for Particularism

People reject the persuasive charms of particularism for, broadly, two sorts of reasons: reasons to do with rationality, and reasons to do with motivation. I take rationality first. Three points are made. The first and most direct is that thinking rationally requires at least that one think consistently, and in ethics this just means taking the same feature to be the same reason wherever it occurs. Particularism, therefore, denies the rationality of moral thought. Second, what is the difference between moral choice and choosing chocolates? The difference is that when choosing morally we are required to make similar choices in similar circumstances; not so for the choice between rum truffles and peppermint creams. Third, what account can the particularist give of our ability to learn from our moral experience? Such moral self-education is certainly possible. An adolescent who has so far refused to accept that tact is a virtue can be brought to see the importance of being tactful in a particular case, and is then in a position to apply this knowledge more generally. The generalist can understand this as the extraction of a principle from an earlier case, which we then apply to later ones. What can the particularist offer as an alternative account?

Of these three points, the third is the hardest. The answer to the first is that, when we are thinking of reasons for belief, the sort of consistency required of us is merely that we do not adopt beliefs that cannot all be true together. Why should we understand the consistency requirement in a different way when we turn to moral reasons? Simply to insist that this is so must be to beg the question against particularism.

The second question asks us to justify a distinction between matters of whim, such as the choosing of chocolates, and matters of weighty reasons, such as those involved in moral choice. But this need not be a problem. Moral reasons as the particularist understands them occur in the one case and not in the other. Nothing at all like them applies to the choosing of chocolates (normally). This does nothing to show that in morality, unlike in the area of whim, we are required to make similar choices in similar situations. There are quite enough other differences between morality and whim.

The third question asks us what relevance other cases do have to a new case, if not the sort of relevance that the generalist supposes. The answer to this is that experience of similar cases can tell us what sort of thing to look out for, and the sort of relevance that a certain feature can have; in this way our judgement in a new case can be informed, though it is not forced or constrained, by our experience of similar cases in the past. There is no need to suppose that the way in which this works is by the extraction of principles from the earlier cases, which we then impose on the new case.

So much for one sort of complaint. I now turn to questions which focus on motivation. The general idea here is that a particularist morality is a lax morality: without principles, anything goes. But there are various ways in which this thought can be built up. The first is just to say that morality is in the business of imposing constraints on our choices. For there to be constraints, there needs to be regulation, and regulation means rules, and rules mean principles. This, however, is just wrong. There can be fully particular constraints on action, and the judgement that this action would be wrong is surely just such a thing. Constraints do not need to be general constraints, any more than reasons need to be general reasons.

Another line is that the person of principle will be unbudgeable; having taken a stand on an issue, he will not be moved from it. A particularist will not be like this. But here I have two things to say. First, nothing prevents a particularist from being of firm conviction case by case; an unbudgeable conviction need not be founded on principle, but simply on the nature of the case. Unbudgeability and principle have nothing essentially in common. Second, even if it were true that a principled person will on some points be unbudgeable, the question is whether those points are the right points. The worrying thought is that they might not be—that in being driven by principle, our principled person will distort the relevance of relevant features by insisting on filtering them through principles, in a way that is at odds with the falsehood of generalism. In my view, unbudgeability and principles go very badly together. Unbudgeability may be a virtue in its place, but to be unbudgeably involved in a distortion is not a great triumph. If you are going to be incorrigible you had better always be right; incorrigible error is the worst of all worlds.

A different suggestion is that morality has the sort of authority over us that can only be provided by a rule. Here, however, I think that particularists should simply dig their heels in, and insist that moral reasons have all the authority they need already. She needs medical help, and I am the only person around to summon it. This situation demands a certain response from me, in a way that has authority over me because there is nothing that I can do to get out of it.

Still, we might say, there is the ever-present danger of backsliding in ethics; we see the right, but somehow cannot bring ourselves to do it. With principles, we have something capable of stiffening our waning resolve. Without principles, we will fall short all too often. One answer to this is that it is an empirical hypothesis for which there is little real evidence. What is more, the need for moral stiffening only arises once we have already decided what morality requires of us here, and the real question was whether that decision needed to be based on principle. The point about backsliding does nothing to show that the decision from which we might otherwise slide needs to have been made on principle. The supposed need for principles comes after that decision, not before.

More to the point might be a worry about special pleading. This is different from backsliding, because the special pleader is the person who makes exceptions in their own favour. It would not be right for most people to do what I propose to do, but I am special; so I am left off the moral hook that others are caught by. This sort of special pleading occurs in the process of making our moral decision; it is not to do with motivation thereafter, as backsliding is. With backsliding I say ‘this is wrong but I am going to do it all the same’; with special pleading I say ‘this would be wrong for others, but not for me’.

The reason why there is a genuine worry about special pleading is that one can always find some difference between this act and a plain duty, and there seems to be no way, within the resources available to particularism, to prevent such differences from being appealed to by those who, in bad faith, want to let themselves off the moral hook. A principle, we might say, would, or at least should, stop this sort of thing.

What is really going on here is that we are appealing to principles to rectify a natural distortion in moral judgement. If such judgement focuses only on the reasons present in the case before us, it is all too easy to twist those reasons to suit oneself. So we use principles to stop ourselves from doing that. But really the remedy for poor moral judgement is not a different style of moral judgement, principle-based judgement, but just better moral judgement. There is only one real way to stop oneself distorting things in one’s own favour, and that is to look again, as hard as one can, at the reasons present in the case, and see if really one is so different from others that what would be required of them is not required of oneself. This method is not infallible, I know; but then neither was the appeal to principle.


The bibliography presented here is a short list of pieces recommended as further reading along with those referred to in the text above. A more comprehensive bibliography is available in the entry on moral particularism and moral generalism.

  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Roger Crisp (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Audi, R., 1998, ‘Moderate Intuitionism and the Epistemology of Moral Judgement’, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 1: 15–44 (especially pp. 36–41).
  • Bakhurst, D. J., Hooker, B. and Little, M. (eds.), 2013, Thinking about Reasons, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Berker, S., 2007, ‘Particular Reasons’, Ethics, 118: 109–39.
  • Crisp, R., 2000, ‘Particularizing Particularism’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 23–47.
  • Dancy, J., 1983, ‘Ethical Particularism and Morally Relevant Properties’, Mind, 92: 530–47.
  • –––, 1993, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 2004, Ethics without Principles, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Darwall, S., 2013, ‘Morality and Principle’, in Bakhurst et al. 2013, pp. 168‐91.
  • Dworkin, G., 1995, ‘Unprincipled Ethics’, Midwest Studies in Philosophy (Volume 20: Moral Concepts), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 224–39.
  • Hooker, B. W., 2000, ‘Moral Particularism—Wrong and Bad’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 1–23.
  • –––, and Little, M. (eds.), 2000, Moral Particularism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Jackson, F., Pettit, P., and Smith, M., 2000, ‘Ethical Particularism and Patterns’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 79–99.
  • Kagan, S., 1988, ‘The Additive Fallacy’, Ethics, 99: 5–31.
  • Lance M., Potrč, M. and Strahovnik, V. (eds.), 2008, Challenging Moral Particularism, London: Routledge.
  • Lance, M. and Little, M., 2007, ‘Where the Laws Are’, in R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics (Volume 2), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 149–71.
  • Little, M., 2000, ‘Moral Generalities Revisited’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 276–304.
  • –––, 1994, ‘Moral Realism: Non-Naturalism’, Philosophical Books, 35: 225–32.
  • McDowell, J., 1979, ‘Virtue and Reason’, The Monist, 62: 331–50.
  • McKeever, S. and Ridge, M., 2006, Principled Ethics: Generalism as a Regulative Ideal, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • McNaughton, D. A., 1988, Moral Vision, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1996, ‘An Unconnected Heap of Duties?’, Philosophical Quarterly, 46: 433–47.
  • McNaughton, D. A. and Rawling, P., 2000, ‘Unprincipled Ethics’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 256–75.
  • Raz, J., 2000, ‘The Truth in Particularism’, in Hooker and Little 2000, pp. 48–78.
  • –––, 2006, ‘The Trouble with Particularism (Dancy’s Version)’, Mind, 115: 99–120.
  • Richardson, H. S., 1990, ‘Specifying Norms’, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 19: 279–310.
  • Ross, W. D., 1930, The Right and the Good, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Shafer-Landau, R., 1997, ‘Moral Rules’, Ethics, 107: 584–611.
  • Väyrenen, P., 2009, ‘A Theory of Hedged Moral Principles’, in R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics (Volume 4), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 91–132.

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Jonathan Dancy

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