Moral Relativism

First published Thu Feb 19, 2004; substantive revision Wed Mar 10, 2021

Moral relativism is an important topic in metaethics. It is also widely discussed outside philosophy (for example, by political and religious leaders), and it is controversial among philosophers and nonphilosophers alike. This is perhaps not surprising in view of recent evidence that people’s intuitions about moral relativism vary widely. Though many philosophers are quite critical of moral relativism, there are several contemporary philosophers who defend forms of it. These include such prominent figures as Gilbert Harman, Jesse J. Prinz, J. David Velleman and David B. Wong. The term ‘moral relativism’ is understood in a variety of ways. Most often it is associated with an empirical thesis that there are deep and widespread moral disagreements and a metaethical thesis that the truth or justification of moral judgments is not absolute, but relative to the moral standard of some person or group of persons. Sometimes ‘moral relativism’ is connected with a normative position about how we ought to think about or act towards those with whom we morally disagree, most commonly that we should tolerate them.

1. Historical Background

Though moral relativism did not become a prominent topic in philosophy or elsewhere until the twentieth century, it has ancient origins. In the classical Greek world, both the historian Herodotus and the sophist Protagoras appeared to endorse some form of relativism (the latter attracted the attention of Plato in the Theaetetus). It should also be noted that the ancient Chinese Daoist philosopher Zhuangzi put forward a nonobjectivist view that is sometimes interpreted as a kind of relativism.

Among the ancient Greek philosophers, moral diversity was widely acknowledged, but the more common nonobjectivist reaction was moral skepticism, the view that there is no moral knowledge (the position of the Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus), rather than moral relativism, the view that moral truth or justification is relative to a culture or society. This pattern continued through most of the history of Western philosophy. There were certainly occasional discussions of moral disagreement—for example in Michel de Montaigne’s Essays or in the dialogue David Hume attached to An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. These discussions pertained to moral objectivity, but moral relativism as a thesis explicitly distinguished from moral skepticism ordinarily was not in focus. Prior to the twentieth century, moral philosophers did not generally feel obliged to defend a position on moral relativism.

Nonetheless, the increased awareness of moral diversity (especially between Western and non-Western cultures) on the part of Europeans in the modern era is an important antecedent to the contemporary concern with moral relativism. During this time, the predominant view among Europeans and their colonial progeny was that their moral values were superior to the moral values of other cultures. Few thought all moral values had equal or relative validity, or anything of that sort. The main impetus for such a position came from cultural anthropology. Anthropologists were fascinated with the diversity of cultures, and they produced detailed empirical studies of them—especially “primitive,” non-Western ones. At the beginning anthropologists accepted the assumption of European or Western superiority. But this assumption began to be challenged in the twentieth century, especially by some social scientists in the United States. An early dissent came from the sociologist William Graham Sumner, who proposed a version of moral relativism in his 1906 Folkways. But the most influential challenge originated with the anthropologist Franz Boas. He and his students—in particular, Ruth Benedict, Melville J. Herskovits, and Margaret Mead—explicitly articulated influential forms of moral relativism in the first half of the twentieth century. In 1947, on the occasion of the United Nations debate about universal human rights, the American Anthropological Association issued a statement declaring that moral values are relative to cultures and that there is no way of showing that the values of one culture are better than those of another. Anthropologists have never been unanimous in asserting this, and more recently human rights advocacy on the part of some anthropologists has mitigated the relativist orientation of the discipline. Nonetheless, prominent anthropologists such as Richard A. Shweder and the late Clifford Geertz have defended relativist positions in recent years.

An important early bridge from anthropology to philosophy was established by Edward Westermarck (1906–8 and 1932), a social scientist who wrote anthropological and philosophical works defending forms of empirical as well as metaethical moral relativism. In the latter half of the 20th century, moral philosophers began devoting considerable attention to moral relativism and some—most notably Richard B. Brandt (1954) and John Ladd (1957)—took quite seriously the empirical effort of anthropology to understand the moralities of different cultures, to the point of making such empirical inquiries themselves (an anticipation of the recent emphasis on experimental philosophy, to be discussed in section 3). In the past several decades there has been increasing consideration of moral relativism, and there is now an enormous literature on the subject (the Bibliography below is very limited). Most of these discussions are situated in the domain of “pure metaethics,” but not all. For example, there is considerable work on moral relativism in connection with human rights (Donnelly 2013, part 2 and Okin 1998), political philosophy (Accetti 2015, Bilgrami 2011 and Long 2004) and feminist philosophy (Code 1995 and Khader 2019). There are also discussions of moral relativism in applied fields such as medical ethics (Earp 2016).

2. Forms and Arguments

In general, the term ‘relativism’ refers to many different ideas. For example, in anthropology it sometimes connotes, among other things, the rather uncontroversial notion that anthropologists should strive to be impartial and unprejudiced in their empirical inquires. However, in moral philosophy ‘relativism’ is usually taken to suggest an empirical, a metaethical, or a normative position. The empirical position is usually:

Descriptive Moral Relativism (DMR). As a matter of empirical fact, there are deep and widespread moral disagreements across different societies, and these disagreements are much more significant than whatever agreements there may be.

Sometimes what is emphasized is moral diversity rather than strict disagreement. DMR is often thought to have been established by anthropology and other empirical disciplines. However, it is not uncontroversial: Empirical as well as philosophical objections have been raised against it. Hence, it is one focal point of debate.

The metaethical position usually concerns the truth or justification of moral judgments, and it has been given somewhat different definitions. Metaethical relativists generally suppose that many fundamental moral disagreements cannot be rationally resolved, and on this basis they argue that moral judgments lack the moral authority or normative force that moral objectivists usually contend these judgments may have. Hence, metaethical relativism is in part a negative thesis that challenges the claims of moral objectivists. However, it often involves a positive thesis as well, namely that moral judgments nonetheless have moral authority or normative force, not absolutely or universally (as objectivists contend), but relative to some group of persons such as a society or culture. This point is typically made with respect to truth or justification (or both), and the following definition will be a useful reference point:

Metaethical Moral Relativism (MMR). The truth or falsity of moral judgments, or their justification, is not absolute or universal, but is relative to the traditions, convictions, or practices of a group of persons.

With respect to truth-value, this means that a moral judgment such as ‘Polygamy is morally wrong’ may be true relative to one society, but false relative to another. It is not true, or false, simply speaking. Likewise, with respect to justification, this judgment may be justified in one society, but not another. Taken in one way, this last point is uncontroversial: The people in one society may have different evidence available to them than the people in the other society. But proponents of MMR usually have something stronger and more provocative in mind: That the standards of justification in the two societies may differ from one another and that there is no rational basis for resolving these differences. This is why the justification of moral judgments is relative rather than absolute.

In recent years, there has been a proliferation of different formulations of relativism (for discussion of some of these, see Fricker 2013, Krausz 2011 and López de Sa 2011). It is important to note several distinctions that may be made in formulating different metaethical relativist positions. First, a distinction is sometimes drawn between content relativism, the view that sentences may have different contents (meanings) in different frameworks, and truth relativism, the view that sentences have the same content in different frameworks, but their truth-value may vary across these frameworks (for a discussion of this distinction in terms of moral relativism, see Prinz 2007: 180–3). In the discussions that follow, truth relativism is ordinarily assumed. Second, it is sometimes said that the truth or justification of moral judgments may be relative to an individual person as well as a group of persons. In this article, the latter will be assumed, as in the definition of MMR, unless otherwise noted. Third, that to which truth or justification is relative may be the persons making the moral judgments or the persons about whom the judgments are made. These are sometimes called appraiser and agent relativism respectively. Appraiser relativism suggests that we do or should make moral judgments on the basis of our own standards, while agent relativism implies that the relevant standards are those of the persons we are judging (of course, in some cases these may coincide). Appraiser relativism is the more common position, and it will usually be assumed in the discussion that follows. Finally, MMR may be offered as the best explanation of what people already believe, or it may be put forward as a position people ought to accept regardless of what they now believe. There will be occasion to discuss both claims below, though the latter is probably the more common one.

Metaethical moral relativist positions are typically contrasted with moral objectivism. Let us say that moral objectivism maintains that moral judgments are ordinarily true or false in an absolute or universal sense, that some of them are true, and that people sometimes are justified in accepting true moral judgments (and rejecting false ones) on the basis of evidence available to any reasonable and well-informed person. There are different ways of challenging moral objectivism. Moral skepticism says that we are never justified in accepting or rejecting moral judgments. Other views—variously called moral non-cognitivism, expressivism, anti-realism, nihilism, etc.—contend that moral judgments lack truth-value, at least beyond the truth-value implied by the minimalist claim that to assert that S is true is simply to assert S (a related view, the error theory, claims that moral judgments are always false). MMR is often distinguished from all of these views: Instead of denying truth-value or justification, it affirms relative forms of these. However, metaethical moral relativist views are sometimes regarded as connected with positions that say moral judgments lack truth-value, since the relativist views contend that moral judgments lack truth-value in an absolute or universal sense. This is sometimes simply a question of terminology, but not always. If it is said that moral judgments lack truth-value (beyond the claim of minimalism), then there cannot be relative truth-value in the sense that moral relativists usually intend (though it might be contended that there is a sense in which there could still be justification). As will be seen below, there is a debate about the relationship between MMR and non-cognitivist or expressivist positions.

Most arguments for MMR are based on DMR and the contention that it is implausible to suppose fundamental moral disagreements can always be resolved rationally (for overviews of these arguments, see Plakias 2020 and Seipel 2020b). Sometimes it is said that some moral disagreements are faultless, meaning that neither party has made a mistake (see Kölbel 2004). For instance, Harman (1996), Prinz (2007) and Wong (1984 and 2006) have all stressed the importance of moral disagreements in arguing for MMR, and such arguments will be considered in some detail in subsequent sections. However, some arguments for MMR have a rather different approach, and two of these should be noted here.

First, MMR might be defended as a consequence of the general relativist thesis that the truth or justification of all judgments is not absolute or universal, but relative to some group of persons. For example, this general position might be maintained on the ground that each society has its own conceptual framework and that conceptual frameworks are incommensurable with one another. Hence, we can only speak of truth or justification in relative terms (see the discussion of incommensurability in the Summer 2015 archived version of the entry on relativism (section 4.2)). This position might be thought to have the disadvantage that it can only be put forward as true or justified relative to some conceptual framework (the suggestion is usually that this framework is our own), and many find it implausible with regard to common sense judgments and judgments in the natural sciences. However, this is one avenue to MMR. But most proponents of MMR focus on distinctive features of morality and reject general relativism. In fact, they often contrast morality and science with respect to issues of truth and justification. For example, Harman (2000b), Prinz (2007) and Wong (1996 and 2006) all associate moral relativism with naturalism, a position that usually presupposes the objectivity of the natural sciences.

Second, a metaethical moral relativist position might be defended by emphasizing aspects of morality other than disagreement. For example, Rovane (2011 and 2013) has maintained that relativism is best understood, not as a response to disagreement, but as a response to alternative conceptual schemes that portray different worlds that are normatively insulated from one another. On this account, the truth-bearers in one world are not logically related to the truth-bearers in another world (so there cannot be strict disagreement), and yet it is not possible to embrace both worlds (so they are alternatives). Rovane argues that in the moral domain, but not in the domain of the natural sciences, there may be different worlds in this sense. Hence, a moral judgment may be true for the occupant of one world, but not for the occupant of another. An implication of this view, she says, is that learning and teaching across different moral worlds might not be possible.

In a partially similar view, Velleman (2015) has claimed, on the basis of ethnographic and historical data, that different communities construct available action types differently. Moreover, reasons for action are always dependent on the perspective of the particular community since they arise out of the drive for mutual interpretability needed for social life within the community. Hence, there are no perspective-independent reasons. There cannot be straight-forward disagreement across these communities because they do not have common sets of action types. The communities may nonetheless address the basic themes of morality, but in incompatible ways given their different perspectives. So moralities can only have local validity.

Both Rovane and Velleman stress moral diversity rather than moral disagreement. They maintain, not that disagreements cannot be rationally resolved, but that there is no basis for showing that, among various incompatible alternatives, one is rationally superior to another.

In addition, it is worth noting that MMR is sometimes justified by appealing in a significant way to a distinctive analysis of moral judgments in combination with a claim about moral disagreement. For example, Prinz (2007) argues that what he calls “moral sentimentalism” implies a form of MMR once we acknowledge moral disagreements. According to moral sentimentalism, an action is morally right (wrong) if and only if some observer of the action has a sentiment of approbation (disapprobation) concerning it. Prinz defends this position on the basis of a metaethical argument that it is the most plausible account in light of empirical studies linking moral judgments and emotions. Since people often have conflicting sentiments about the same action, a judgment of the form ‘Action X is right’ may be true (when expressed by a person who approves of X), and ‘X is wrong’ may also be true (when expressed by a person who disapproves of X). On this view, the truth of such moral judgments is relative to the sentiments of the persons who make them. Moral sentimentalism is a crucial feature of this argument and many philosophers would deny that moral rightness and wrongness depend on our sentiments in this way. But most arguments for MMR are not based on moral sentimentalism.

In another example, Harman (2000a) argues that a moral judgment that a person ought to do X (an “inner judgment”) implies that the person has motivating reasons to do X, and that a person is likely to have such reasons only if he or she has implicitly entered into an agreement with others about what to do. Hence, moral judgments of this kind are valid only for groups of persons who have made such agreements. An action may be right relative to one agreement and wrong relative to another (this combines agent and appraisal relativism insofar as Harman assumes that the person making the judgment and the person to whom the judgment is addressed are both parties to the agreement).

Harman’s relativism is presented as a thesis about logical form, but the relativist implication arises only because it is supposed that the relevant motivating reasons are not universal and so probably arose from an agreement that some but not all persons have made. In this sense, moral disagreement is an important feature of the argument. But the main focus is on the internalist idea that inner judgments imply motivating reasons, reasons that are not provided simply by being rational, but require particular desires or intentions that a person may or may not have. Internalism in this sense is a controversial view, and many would say that a moral judgment can apply to a person whether or not that person is motivated to follow it (see the section on ‘Psychological: Moral Motivation’ in the entry on moral epistemology). However, internalism is not a standard feature of most arguments for moral relativism, and in fact some relativists are critical of internalism (for example, see Wong 2006: ch. 7)

It is worth noting that internalism is one expression of a more general viewpoint that emphasizes the action-guiding character of moral judgments. Though Harman and others (for example, Dreier 1990 and 2006) have argued that a form of moral relativism provides the best explanation of internalism, a more common argument has been that the action-guiding character of moral judgments is best explained by a non-cognitivist or expressivist account according to which moral judgments lack truth-value (at least beyond the claim of minimalism). In fact, some have claimed that the expressivist position avoids, and is superior to, moral relativism because it accounts for the action-guiding character of moral judgments without taking on the problems that moral relativism is thought to involve (for instance, see Blackburn 1998: ch. 9 and 1999, and Horgan and Timmons 2006). By contrast, others have maintained that positions such as non-cognitivism and expressivism are committed to a form of moral relativism (for example, see Bloomfield 2003, Foot 2002b, and Shafer-Landau 2003: ch 1). For an assessment of this debate, see Miller 2011, and for a discussion of non-cognitivism and related positions, see the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.

Finally, the term ‘moral relativism’ is sometimes associated with a normative position concerning how we ought to think about, or behave towards, persons with whom we morally disagree. Usually the position is formulated in terms of tolerance. In particular, it is said that we should not interfere with the actions of persons that are based on moral judgments we reject, when the disagreement is not or cannot be rationally resolved. This is thought to apply especially to relationships between our society and those societies with which we have significant moral disagreements. Since tolerance so-understood is a normative thesis about what we morally ought to do, it is best regarded, not as a form of moral relativism per se, but as a thesis that has often been thought to be implied by relativist positions such as DMR and MMR. Despite the popularity of this thought, most philosophers believe it is mistaken. The main question is what philosophical relationship, if any, obtains between moral relativism and tolerance.

The remainder of this entry will discuss DMR, the contention that it is unlikely that fundamental moral disagreements can be rationally resolved, arguments for and challenges to MMR, mixed positions that combine moral relativism and moral objectivism, and the relationship between moral relativism and tolerance. But first there needs to be some consideration of the recent contributions of experimental philosophy to these discussions.

3. Experimental Philosophy

Experimental philosophy is an approach to philosophy that explicitly draws on experimental knowledge established by the sciences to address philosophical questions (see the entry on experimental moral philosophy). There are three significant ways in which experimental philosophy has played an important role in discussions of moral relativism. These concern the extent to which there is moral disagreement or moral diversity among people (that is, DMR), the extent to which folk morality is committed to an objectivist or relativist understanding of moral judgments (that is, the views of ordinary people concerning MMR), and the extent to which acceptance of moral relativism affects moral attitudes such as tolerance (that is, ways in which views concerning MMR causally influence whether or not people have tolerant attitudes).

The first of these has a long history in discussions of moral relativism and in fact may be considered one of the earliest instances of experimental moral philosophy. As was seen in section 1, for more than a century the work of anthropologists and other social scientists has contributed to the development of thought about moral relativism, both by purporting to provide empirical evidence for extensive cross-cultural disagreement and diversity about morality, and by proposing the notion that moral codes are true only relative to a culture as the best explanation of this. That is, these scientists have provided empirical grounds for accepting DMR, and they have suggested that some form of MMR is a reasonable inference from this data (though these positions were not always clearly distinguished). More importantly, the work cited in section 1 by Brandt (1954) and Ladd (1957), involving both empirical investigations into the moral values of Native Americans and philosophical reflection on the significance of these investigations vis-à-vis moral relativism, are significant examples of moral philosophers engaging in empirical inquiry in support of philosophical aims. Their empirical work did not immediately inspire other other philosophers to engage in similar research. Experimental philosophy in this sense—experiments or other empirical investigations conducted by philosophers—did not become prominent until nearly a half-century later. Nowadays philosophers do sometimes conduct experiments to investigate the extent of moral disagreement (for example, see the study of Western and East Asian values cited in Doris and Plakias 2008). What has been much more common in recent decades has been the citation by philosophers of empirical studies by anthropologists to establish facts about moral disagreement or diversity (for example, see Prinz 2007, Velleman 2015, and Wong 1984 and 2006). There has been a renewed interest in ethics by some anthropologists in the last few years (see Klenk 2019 and Laidlaw 2017), but this has not yet attracted much attention by philosophers. There is more about these issues in section 4.

The second concern, the extent to which ordinary people accept some form of moral objectivism or some form of MMR (or some other non-objectivist position), has been the subject of considerable experimental research in recent years. This research has sometimes been conducted by psychologists (or other scientists), sometimes by philosophers, and increasingly sometimes by both working together (for overviews of this literature, see Pölzler and Wright 2019 and Sarkissian 2016). In the past, philosophers with a variety of meta-ethical commitments have sometimes claimed that in everyday moral practices people implicitly suppose that moral objectivism in some sense is correct (for example, see Blackburn 1984: 180 and Jackson 1998: 137). By contrast, on occasion some philosophers have maintained that ordinary people sometimes have attitudes that conflict with objectivism. For instance, Wong has argued that in some moral disagreements people grant that the person with the conflicting moral judgment is reasonable in accepting the judgment to the extent that these people are unsure if their own position is uniquely right—what he calls “moral ambivalence” (see Wong 2006: ch. 1). So who are correct, philosophers who claim that ordinary people accept a form of objectivism (folk moral objectivism) or philosophers who think that ordinary people at least sometimes accept something closer to MMR (folk moral relativism)?

Recent empirical research suggests that both positions may have some merit: the meta-ethical views of ordinary people are rather complex. A common method for measuring whether people are objectivists or relativists about a moral statement is to present them with a disagreement between two parties concerning the statement and to ask them if at most only one party could be correct. A response that only one could be correct indicates commitment to objectivism, while a response that more than one could be correct suggests commitment to relativism (or some non-objectivist position). Several studies employing this and related methodologies have provided evidence that, while many people are objectivists about morality, a significant number are not objectivists (for example, see Nichols 2004). Moreover, some studies have shown interesting correlations with these differences. For instance, being in a competitive rather than cooperative interaction and belief in a punishing God correlate with more objectivist intuitions (see Fisher et al. 2017 and Sarkissian and Phelan 2019) while openness to experience and to alternative possibilities are more common among those with non-objectivist intuitions (see Feltz and Cokely 2008 and Goodwin and Darley 2010). In addition, some studies purport to show that there may be causal relationships as well as correlations. For example, the desire to punish generates objectivist intuitions (see Rose and Nichols Forthcoming).

Other studies have shown different kinds of complexity. People are more likely to be objectivists about some moral issues (such as robbery) than they are about other moral issues (such as abortion). These differences also have correlations that might be partly explanatory: regarding an issue as objective correlates with strength of belief and perception of consensus on the issue (see Goodwin and Darley 2008 and 2010; cf. Ayars and Nichols 2020). Moreover, people are more likely to be objectivists about some issues than others even when they are allowed to determine for themselves which issues count as moral issues (see Wright et al. 2013).

Finally, it is more more probable that people give objectivist responses when they think that the parties to a moral disagreement share the same culture than when they think that the disagreeing parties belong to a very different culture. This might suggest that many of those who give objectivist responses are tacitly assuming a kind of objectivity on the assumption that the disagreeing parties have a common moral framework, but not in circumstances in which there are different moral frameworks (see Sarkissian et al. 2011).

In short, empirical work about folk meta-ethical outlooks suggests that there is considerable diversity in the extent to which, and the circumstances under which, people express moral objectivist views or moral non-objectivist views such as MMR. This might be taken to indicate that some people are objectivists and some are not. But it might also be taken to show that some people are “meta-ethical pluralists”: they are objectivists about some moral issues, but they are relativists about other moral issues (see Pölzler 2017, Wright 2018, and Wright, Grandjean and McWhite 2013). That is, perhaps some people implicitly deny the common assumption among philosophers that all moral beliefs should be given the same meta-ethical analysis.

Various questions may be raised about the value and significance of this experimental work. In recent years an important issue in psychology has been the extent to which experimental results can be replicated. It has been argued that the replication rate in experimental philosophy is comparatively high (see Cova et al. 2018) and some studies of people’s acceptance of moral objectivity have been replicated (for example, see Wright 2018). Another issue is whether the samples of these studies are sufficiently diverse to be indicative of the meta-ethical commitments of all human beings. Once again, there have been concerns that psychology studies have been unrepresentative (for example, because they rely too heavily on undergraduate students in the United States). However, at least some studies pertaining to moral objectivity have included a more diverse group of subjects (for example, Beebe et al. 2015 and Sarkissian et al. 2011). A different question is to what extent these studies actually measure acceptance of moral objectivism or moral relativism. Many studies focus on moral objectivism and these may leave unclear people’s views about a position such as MMR (Since there are a variety of positions that reject objectivism). However, some studies have focused on moral relativism specifically (for example, Sarkissian et al. 2011).

In any case, some philosophers may wonder about the philosophical relevance of this experimental research. One response is that it could affect criteria of success in meta-ethics. For example, it is sometimes suggested that most people are moral objectivists rather than moral relativists, and that a meta-ethical position such as moral realism gains credibility because it is in accord with folk morality so understood (see Smith 1991). The studies just cited and others appear to challenge the factual premise of this meta-ethical criterion (see Sarkissian 2017), and it has been argued that the best interpretation of the empirical data is that many people accept a form of relativism (see Beebe Forthcoming). Another response is that some of the complexity revealed in these studies might lead philosophers to consider more seriously the philosophical viability of a pluralist or mixed meta-ethical position according to which, for instance, moral objectivism is correct in some respects, but MMR is correct in other respects (in this connection, see Gill 2008 and Sinnott-Armstrong 2009). There is more on this issue in section 7. In any case, there is increasing recognition of the importance of interpreting the significance of the experimental evidence for meta-ethics with care (see Bush and Moss 2020, Hopster 2019 and Pölzler and Wright 2020).

The final area in which experimental philosophy has contributed to discussions of moral relativism pertains to the relationship between relativism and moral attitudes such as tolerance. It is sometimes claimed that some forms of moral relativism provide a reason for tolerance (see section 8). But are moral relativists more likely to be tolerant than moral objectivists? Some recent psychological studies suggest that the answer may be “yes.” There is some correlation between accepting moral relativism and being more tolerant (Collier-Spruel et al. 2019), and there is some correlation between regarding a moral issue as objective and being less tolerant (Wright et al. 2008 and 2014), though it is also clear that other factors are relevant to whether behavior is tolerant or intolerant.

Insofar as these studies suggest that there is some correlation between acceptance of moral relativism and tolerance, this might be regarded as an unsurprising result for those who have argued that moral relativism provides a rational basis for tolerance. Of course, a psychological relationship does not show that there is a logical relationship. But some support might be derived from the fact that people are behaving in what, for this position, is a rational way. In addition, it has been claimed that an advantage of moral relativism is that, even though it does not provide a reason for tolerance, acceptance of it makes people more tolerant (see Prinz 2007: 208). These studies would provide support for this empirical claim.

4. Descriptive Moral Relativism

Most discussions of moral relativism begin with, and are rooted in, DMR. Though this is not sufficient to establish MMR, the most common rationales for MMR would be undermined if DMR (or some descriptive thesis about significant moral disagreement or diversity) were incorrect. Moreover, if DMR were generally rejected, it is likely that MMR would have few proponents. Hence, it is important to consider whether or not DMR is correct. Defenders of DMR usually take it to be well-established by cultural anthropology and other empirically-based disciplines, and many believe it is obvious to anyone with an elementary understanding of the history and cultures of the world. Examples of moral practices that appear sharply at odds with moral outlooks common in the United States are not hard to come by: polygamy, arranged marriages, suicide as a requirement of honor or widowhood, severe punishments for blasphemy or adultery, female circumcision or genital mutilation (as it is variously called), and so on (for a review of some of the literature, see Prinz 2007: 187–95). At a more general level, Wong (1984) has argued that at least two different approaches to morality may be found in the world: a virtue-centered morality that emphasizes the good of the community, and a rights-centered morality that stresses the value of individual freedom.

Though it is obvious that there are some moral disagreements, it is another matter to say that these disagreements are deep and widespread, and that they are much more significant than whatever agreements there may be. Philosophers have raised two kinds of objection to this contention: a priori arguments that DMR could not be true, and a posteriori arguments that DMR is probably not true or at least has not been established to be true.

A priori objections maintain that we can know DMR is false on the basis of philosophical considerations, without recourse to empirical evidence. One argument, expressed in general form by Donald Davidson (1984a), states that disagreement presupposes considerable agreement (see the entry on Donald Davidson). According to Davidson, a methodological constraint on the translation of the language of another society is that we must think they agree with us on most matters. For example, suppose we believed there were numerous disagreements between us and another society about trees. As the disagreements piled up, we reasonably would begin to think we had mistranslated a word in the language of the other society as ‘tree’: It is more likely that (what we take to be) their false beliefs about trees are really beliefs about something else. By generalization, it follows that there could not be extensive disagreements about trees between our society and the other one. Of course, there could be some disagreements. But these disagreements would presuppose substantial agreements in other respects. Davidson (1984b [2004a] and 1995 [2004b]) and others (for example, Cooper 1978 and Myers 2004) have claimed that this argument applies to moral concepts. If they are right, then there cannot be extensive disagreements about morality, and the agreements are more significant than the disagreements. DMR cannot be true.

Davidson’s argument is controversial. One response is that, even if it were compelling in some cases, it would not have force with respect to moral concepts. ‘Tree’ is an ordinary, descriptive concept based on direct observation. In view of this, mistranslation seems more likely than substantial disagreement. But what about concepts concerning what is amusing, interesting, or exciting? These have to do with human reactions to the world, and it may be said that our knowledge of human nature suggests that some reactions vary widely. A claim that there is much disagreement about what people find amusing—about what makes them laugh—does not immediately generate the suspicion of mistranslation. If moral concepts were more similar to ‘amusing’ than to ‘tree’, as some believe, then the Davidsonian argument might not undermine DMR even if it were convincing in other cases. Davidson, however, believed the argument applies across the board, to evaluations as well as empirical beliefs. Another response to his argument is to claim that, even if it does apply to evaluations, it would only apply to very basic ones and would leave room for substantial disagreements beyond these (if this were the case, then Davidson would have established only what I call a mixed position in section 7). For some critical responses to the Davidsonian critique of relativism, see Gowans 2004: 144–6, Prinz 2007: 195–9 and Rovane 2013: 247–62.

Another a priori objection to DMR was suggested by Philippa Foot (1978a and 1978b) in a response to emotivism. Just as there are shared criteria of ‘rude’ such that not just anything could be considered rude, she argued, there are shared criteria of moral concepts such that not just anything could be a moral virtue or obligation. For example, there are substantial constraints on what could be considered courage. Hence, there are significant limits to the extent of moral disagreements.

One response to this argument, interpreted as an objection to DMR, is that it faces a dilemma. On the one hand, if ‘courage’ is understood broadly, in terms of confronting a difficulty to achieve some perceived good, then it is likely that most everyone values courage. However, this leaves room for very different conceptions of courage. Both warriors and pacifists may value it, but they may regard very different kinds of actions as courageous. This puts less pressure on DMR, a point Foot later conceded to some extent (see section 7)). On the other hand, if courage is defined narrowly, for example, as the virtue of a warrior who faces the threat of death in battle (as suggested by Aristotle), then there may be little disagreement about the scope of the concept, but considerable disagreement about whether courage so-defined should be valued (pacifists would say no). A proponent of DMR might say that this is also a significant moral disagreement. Against this, it may be said that our understanding of human nature and culture shows that everyone values courage understood within some fairly significant limits. This is a more empirical point, in line with the objections in the last paragraph of this section.

Some versions of the a priori approach emphasize the constraints imposed by “thinner” moral concepts such as goodness, rightness, or morality itself (for example, see Garcia 1988). Once again, a defender of DMR might say that, if these concepts have enough content to preclude significant disagreement in their application, then it is likely that many societies do not apply them at all—a form of moral disagreement in itself. Another response would be to argue, following R.M. Hare (1981), that a formal analysis, for example in terms of a kind of prescriptivity, is plausible with respect to some thinner moral concepts, and that this is consistent with significant moral disagreements. However, the a priori critics question the adequacy of any such analysis. Much of this debate concerns the acceptability of formal versus material definitions of morality (see the entry on the definition of morality).

The second approach to rejecting DMR focuses on the interpretation of the empirical evidence that purportedly supports this thesis. Some objections point to obstacles that face any attempt to understand human cultures empirically. For example, it may be said that the supposed evidence is incomplete or inaccurate because the observers are biased. In support of this, it may be claimed that anthropologists often have had preconceptions rooted in disciplinary paradigms or political ideologies that have led them to misrepresent or misinterpret the empirical data. Or it may be said that even the most objective observers would have difficulty accurately understanding a society’s actual moral values on account of phenomena such as self-deception and weakness of will. These concerns point to substantial issues in the methodology of the social sciences. However, even if they were valid, they would only cast doubt on whether DMR had been established: They would not necessarily give us reason to think it is false. Of course, this would be an important objection to someone who claims DMR is established or relies on DMR to argue for MMR.

Another objection, more directly pertinent to DMR, is that anthropologists have tacitly and mistakenly assumed that cultures are rather discrete, homogenous, and static entities—rather like the shapes in a Piet Mondrian painting or a checkerboard. In fact, according to this contention, cultures typically are rather heterogeneous and complex internally, with many dissenting voices. Moreover, they often interact and sometimes influence one another, and they may change over time. From this perspective, the world of cultures is closer to an animated Jackson Pollock painting than to the unambiguous configuration suggested by the first image. If these contentions were correct, then it would be more difficult to know the moral values of different cultures and hence to know whether or not DMR is true. As before, this would not show that it is false (in fact, the point about heterogeneity might point the other way). However, we will see later that these contentions also pose challenges to MMR.

Other critics try to establish that the empirical evidence cited in support of DMR does not really show that there are significant moral disagreements, and is consistent with considerable moral agreement. A prominent contention is that purported moral disagreements may result from applying a general moral value (about which there is no disagreement) in different circumstances or in the same circumstances where there is a factual disagreement about what these circumstances are. Either way, there is no real moral disagreement in these cases. For example, everyone might agree on the importance of promoting human welfare (and even on the nature of human welfare). But this may be promoted differently in different, or differently understood, circumstances. Another contention is that moral disagreements may be explained by religious disagreements: It is only because specific religious assumptions are made (for instance, about the soul) that there are moral disagreements. Once again, the apparent moral disagreement is really a disagreement of a different kind—here, about the nature of the soul. There is no genuine moral disagreement. Of course, these possibilities would have to be established as the best explanation of the disagreements in question to constitute an objection to DMR.

Finally, some objections maintain that proponents of DMR fail to recognize that there is significant empirical evidence for considerable moral agreement across different societies (see Sauer 2019). Several kinds of agreement have been proposed. For example, the role-reversal test implied by the Golden Rule (“Do unto others as you would have them do unto you”) has been prominent beyond Western traditions: A version of it is also endorsed in The Analects of Confucius, some traditional Buddhist texts, and elsewhere (see Wattles 1996). Another form of this claim maintains that basic moral prohibitions against lying, stealing, adultery, killing human beings, etc. are found across many different and otherwise diverse societies. Yet another contention is that the international human rights movement indicates substantial moral agreement (see Donnelly 2013: ch. 4). On the basis of evidence of this kind, some such as Sissela Bok (1995) and Michael Walzer (1994) have proposed that there is a universal minimal morality, whatever other moral differences there may be. In a similar vein, Hans Küng (1996) and others have maintained that there is a common “global ethic” across the world’s major religious traditions regarding respect for human life, distributive justice, truthfulness, and the moral equality of men and women. These contentions, which have received increased support in recent years, must be subjected to the same critical scrutiny as those put forward in support of DMR. However, if they were correct, they would cast doubt on DMR. In the final analysis, there may be significant agreements as well as disagreements in people’s moral values. If this were the case, it would complicate the empirical background of the metaethical debate, and it might suggest the need for more nuanced alternatives than the standard positions.

5. Are Moral Disagreements Rationally Resolvable?

Philosophers generally agree that, even if DMR were true without qualification, it would not directly follow that MMR is true. In particular, if moral disagreements could be resolved rationally for the most part, then disagreement-based arguments for MMR would be undermined, and there would be little incentive to endorse the position. Such resolvability, at least in principle, is what moral objectivism would lead us to expect. One of the main points of contention between proponents of MMR and their objectivist critics concerns the possibility of rationally resolving moral disagreements. It might be thought that the defender of MMR needs to show conclusively that the moral disagreements identified in DMR cannot be rationally resolved, or again that the moral objectivist must show conclusively that they can be. Neither is a reasonable expectation. Indeed, it is unclear what would count as conclusively arguing for either conclusion. The center of the debate concerns what plausibly may be expected. Adherents of MMR attempt to show why rational resolution is an unlikely prospect, while their objectivist critics try to show why to a large extent this is likely, or at least not unlikely.

Moral objectivists can allow that there are special cases in which moral disagreements cannot be rationally resolved, for example on account of vagueness or indeterminacy in the concepts involved. Their main claim is that ordinarily there is a rational basis for overcoming disagreements (not that people would actually come to agree). Objectivists maintain that, typically, at least one party in a moral disagreement accepts the moral judgment on account of some factual or logical mistake, and that revealing such mistakes would be sufficient to rationally resolve the disagreement. They suggest that whatever genuine moral disagreements there are usually can be resolved in this fashion. In addition, objectivists sometimes offer an analysis of why people make such mistakes. For example, people may be influenced by passion, prejudice, ideology, self-interest, and the like. In general, objectivists think, insofar as people set these influences aside, and are reasonable and well-informed, there is generally a basis for resolving their moral differences. However, though these claims are often made, it is another matter to establish empirically that self-interest is the source of disagreement, and it has been argued that there are considerable obstacles to doing this (see Seipel 2020a). (Objectivists might also say that at least some agreements about moral truths reflect the fact that, with respect to matters pertaining to these truths, people generally have been reasonable and well-informed.)

Proponents of MMR may allow that moral disagreements sometimes are rationally resolved. In particular, they may grant that this often happens when the parties to a moral dispute share a moral framework. The characteristic relativist contention is that a common moral framework is often lacking, especially in moral disagreements between one society and another, and that differences in moral frameworks usually cannot be explained simply by supposing that one society or the other is making factual or logical mistakes. These moral disagreements are ultimately rooted in fundamentally different moral orientations, and there is usually no reason to think these differences result from the fact that, in relevant respects, one side is less reasonable or well-informed than the other. They are faultless disagreements. This conclusion might rest on the observation that it is not evident that mistakes are at the root of these disagreement. But it might also depend on a theory, developed to explain such observations, that the frameworks are incommensurable: They do not have enough in common, in terms of either shared concepts or shared standards, to resolve their differences, and there is no impartial third standpoint, accessible to any reasonable and well-informed person, that could be invoked to resolve the conflict.

Various objectivist responses may be made to this argument. One is the Davidsonian approach, already considered, that precludes the possibility of incommensurable moral frameworks. Another response is that incommensurability does not preclude the possibility of rationally resolving differences between moral frameworks. For example, Alasdair MacIntyre (1988: ch. 18 and 1994) has argued that, in some circumstances, it is possible to realize, through an exercise in imagination, that a conflicting and incommensurable moral tradition is rationally superior to one’s own tradition. However, the most common objectivist response is to claim that some specific moral framework is rationally superior to all others. For example, it might be argued, following Kant, that pure practical reason implies a fundamental moral principle such as the Categorical Imperative (see Kant’s moral philosophy), or it might be claimed, following Aristotle, that human nature is such that virtues such as courage, temperance, and justice are necessary for any plausible conception of a good life (see the sections on the human good and the function argument in the entry on Aristotle’s ethics, and the entry on virtue ethics). If such an argument were sound, it might provide a compelling response to the relativist contention that conflicts between moral frameworks cannot be rationally resolved.

Proponents of MMR are unimpressed by these responses. They may say that the Davidsonian account cannot assure sufficient common ground to resolve conflicts between moral frameworks (or to ensure that there is really only one framework), and that MacIntyre’s approach is likely to work at best only in some cases. And they usually consider debates about the Kantian and Aristotelian arguments to be as difficult to resolve rationally as the conflicts between moral frameworks the relativists originally invoked. They may add that the fact that moral objectivists disagree among themselves about which objectivist theory is correct is further indication of the difficulty of resolving fundamental moral conflicts.

A rather different objectivist challenge is that the position of the proponent of MMR is inconsistent. The relativist argument is that we should reject moral objectivism because there is little prospect of rationally resolving fundamental moral disagreements. However, it may be pointed out, the relativist should acknowledge that there is no more prospect of rationally resolving disagreements about MMR. By parity of reasoning, he or she should grant that there is no objective truth concerning MMR.

To this familiar kind of objection, there are two equally familiar responses. One is to concede the objection and maintain that MMR is true and justified in some metaethical frameworks, but not others: It is not an objective truth that any reasonable and well-informed person has reason to accept. This may seem to concede a great deal, but for someone who is a relativist through and through, or at least is a relativist about metaethical claims, this would be the only option. The other response is to contest the claim that there is parity of reasoning in the two cases. This would require showing that the dispute about the irresolvability of moral disagreements (a metaethical debate) can be rationally resolved in a way that fundamental moral disagreements (substantive normative debates) themselves cannot. For example, the metaethical debate might be rationally resolved in favor of the relativist, while the substantive normative debates cannot be resolved.

6. Metaethical Moral Relativism

Even if it were established that there are deep and widespread moral disagreements that cannot be rationally resolved, and that these disagreements are more significant than whatever agreements there may be, it would not immediately follow that MMR is correct. Other nonobjectivist conclusions might be drawn. In particular, opponents of objectivism might argue for moral skepticism, that we cannot know moral truths, or for a view that moral judgments lack truth-value (understood to imply a rejection of relative truth-value). Hence, proponents of MMR face two very different groups of critics: assorted kinds of moral objectivists and various sorts of moral nonobjectivists. The defender of MMR needs to establish that MMR is superior to all these positions, and this would require a comparative assessment of their respective advantages and disadvantages. It is beyond the scope of this article to consider the alternative positions (see the entries on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral anti-realism, moral epistemology, moral realism, and moral skepticism). What can be considered are the challenges the proponent of MMR faces and what may be said in response to them. Some critics of MMR have raised questions about the coherence of the position (for example, Boghossian 2011 and 2017).

For example, it might be thought that MMR, with respect to truth-value, would have the result that a moral judgment such as “suicide is morally right” (S) could be both true and false—true when valid for one group and false when invalid for another. But this appears to be an untenable position: most people would grant that nothing can be both true and false. Of course, some persons could be justified in affirming S and other persons justified in denying it, since the two groups could have different evidence. But it is another matter to say S is both true and false.

A standard relativist response is to say that moral truth is relative in some sense. On this view, S is not true or false absolutely speaking, but it may be true-relative-to-X and false-relative-to-Y (where X and Y refer to the moral codes of different societies). This means that suicide is right for persons in a society governed by X, but it is not right for persons in a society governed by Y; and, the relativist may contend, there is no inconsistency in this conjunction properly understood.

It might be objected that the notion of relative truth fails to capture the sense in which ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ are normative terms about what ought to be as opposed to what is the case. The statement “suicide is morally right” is normative in this sense, but the statement “suicide is morally right for persons in a society governed by moral code X” is not normative, but descriptive: it tells us what persons who accept moral code X think, and as such it is something everyone could agree with, irrespective of their own moral code, if in fact this is what moral code X says. In response, it might be said that there are expressions of relativist moral statements that are normative. For instance, “suicide is morally right for us,” spoken by and to members of the group referred to by ‘us’, is not merely a description of what they believe: it tells them what they are morally permitted to do (in this sense, it is action-guiding).

Such relativist formulations may also give rise to a related and very common objection. Relativism often presents itself as an interpretation of moral disagreements: It is said to be the best explanation of rationally irresolvable or faultless moral disagreements. However, once moral truth is regarded as relative, the disagreements seem to disappear. For example, someone accepting X who affirms S is saying suicide is right for persons accepting X, while someone accepting Y who denies S is saying suicide is not right for persons accepting Y. It might well be that they are both correct and hence that they are not disagreeing with one another (rather as two people in different places might both be correct when one says the sun is shining and the other says it is not, or as two people in different countries may both be correct when one says something is illegal and the other says it is not). The relativist explanation dissolves the disagreement. But, then, why did it appear as a disagreement in the first place? An objectivist might say this is because people thinking this assume that moral truth is absolute rather than relative. If this were correct, the relativist could not maintain that MMR captures what people already believe. The contention would have to be that they should believe it, and the argument for relativism would have to be formulated in those terms. For example, the relativist might contend that MMR is the most plausible position to adopt insofar as moral judgments often give practically conflicting directives and neither judgment can be shown to be rationally superior to the other.

Another common objection, though probably more so outside philosophy than within it, is that MMR cannot account for the fact that some practices such as the holocaust in Germany or slavery in the United States are obviously objectively wrong. This point is usually expressed in a tone of outrage, often with the suggestion that relativists pose a threat to civilized society (or something of this sort). Proponents of MMR might respond that this simply begs the question, and in one sense they are right. However, this objection might reflect a more sophisticated epistemology, for example, that we have more reason to accept these objectivist intuitions than we have to accept any argument put forward in favor of MMR. This would bring us back to the arguments of the last section. Another relativist response would be to say that the practices in question, though widely accepted, were wrong according to the fundamental standards of the societies (for example, there were arguments against slavery presented in the United States prior to the Civil War). This would not show that the practices are objectively wrong, but it might mitigate the force of the critique. However, though this response may be plausible in some cases, it is not obvious that it always would be convincing.

This last response brings out the fact that a proponent of MMR needs a clear specification of that to which truth is relative. For example, if S is true-relative-to the moral code of a society, does this mean it is true-relative-to what people in the society think the moral code says or to what the fundamental standards of the moral code actually imply? These might not be the same. It is often supposed that truths can be undiscovered or that people can make mistakes about them. As just noted, a moral relativist could make sense of this by supposing that it is the fundamental standards of a moral code that are authoritative for people in a society that accepts that code. Hence, what is morally true-relative-to the moral code of a society is whatever the fundamental standards of the code would actually warrant. By this criterion, there could be moral truths that are unknown to people in the society that accepts the code, or these people could be mistaken in thinking something is a moral truth.

A similar point arises from the fact that it is sometimes thought to be an advantage of MMR that it maintains a substantial notion of intersubjective truth or justification: It avoids the defects of moral objectivism, on the one hand, and of moral skepticism and theories that disregard moral truth-value altogether, on the other hand, because it maintains that moral judgments do not have truth in an absolute sense, but they do have truth relative to the moral code of a society (and similarly for justification). This is thought to be an advantage because, notwithstanding the supposed difficulties with moral objectivism, morality is widely regarded as “not merely subjective,” and MMR can capture this. However, this purported advantage raises an important question for relativism: Why suppose moral judgments have truth-value relative to a society as opposed to no truth-value at all? If the relativist claims that a set of fundamental standards is authoritative for persons in a society, it may be asked why they have this authority. This question may arise in quite practical ways. For example, suppose a dissident challenges some of the fundamental standards of his or her society. Is this person necessarily wrong?

Various answers may be given to these questions. For example, it may be said that the standards that are authoritative in a society are those that reasonable and well-informed members of the society would generally accept. This might seem to provide a basis for normative authority. However, if this approach were taken, it may be asked why that authority rests only on reasonable and well-informed members of the society. Why not a wider group? Why not all reasonable and well-informed persons?

A different response would be to say that the standards that are authoritative for a society are the ones persons have agreed to follow as a result of some negotiation or bargaining process (as seen above, Harman has argued that we should understand some moral judgments in these terms). Once again, this might seem to lend those standards some authority. Still, it may be asked whether they really have authority or perhaps whether they have the right kind. For example, suppose the agreement had been reached in circumstances in which a few members of society held great power over the others (in the real world, the most likely scenario). Those with less power might have been prudent to make the agreement, but it is not obvious that such an agreement would create genuine normative authority—a point the dissident challenging the standards might well make. Moreover, if all moral values are understood in this way, how do we explain the authority of the contention that people should follow a set of values because they agreed to do so? Must there be a prior agreement to do what we agree to do?

A related objection concerns the specification of the society to which moral justification or truth are said to be relative. People typically belong to many different groups defined by various criteria: culture, religion, political territory, ethnicity, race, gender, etc. Moreover, while it is sometimes claimed that the values of a group defined by one of these criteria have authority for members of the group, such claims are often challenged. The specification of the relevant group is itself a morally significant question, and there appears to be no objective map of the world that displays its division into social groups to which the truth or justification of moral judgments are relative. A proponent of MMR needs a plausible way of identifying the group of persons to which moral truth or justification are relative.

Moreover, not only do people typically belong to more than one group, as defined by the aforementioned criteria, the values that are authoritative in each group a person belongs to may not always be the same. If I belong to a religion and a nationality, and their values concerning abortion are diametrically opposed, then which value is correct for me? This raises the question whether there is a basis for resolving the conflict consistent with MMR (the two groups might have conflicting fundamental standards) and whether in this circumstance MMR would entail that there is a genuine moral dilemma (meaning that abortion is both right and wrong for me). This point is not necessarily an objection, but a defender of MMR would have to confront these issues and develop a convincing position concerning them.

The fact that social groups are defined by different criteria, and that persons commonly belong to more than one social group, might be taken as a reason to move from relativism to a form of subjectivism. That is, instead of saying that the truth or justification of moral judgments is relative to a group, we should say it is relative to each individual (as noted above, relativism is sometimes defined to include both positions). This revision might defuse the issues just discussed, but it would abandon the notion of intersubjectivity with respect to truth or justification—what for many proponents of MMR is a chief advantage of the position. Moreover, a proponent of this subjectivist account would need to explain in what sense, if any, moral values have normative authority for a person as opposed to simply being accepted. The fact that we sometimes think our moral values have been mistaken is often thought to imply that we believe they have some authority that does not consist in the mere fact that we accept them.

Another set of concerns arises from purported facts about similarities among and interactions across different societies vis-à-vis morality. People in one society sometimes make moral judgments about people in another society on the basis of moral standards they take to be authoritative for both societies. In addition, conflicts between societies are sometimes resolved because one society changes its moral outlook and comes to share at least some of the moral values of the other society. More generally, sometimes people in one society think they learn from the moral values of another society: They come to believe that the moral values of another society are better in some respects than their own (previously accepted) values. The Mondrian image of a world divided into distinct societies, each with it own distinctive moral values, makes it difficult to account for these considerations. If this image is abandoned as unrealistic, and is replaced by one that acknowledges greater moral overlap and interaction among societies (recall the Pollock image), then the proponent of MMR needs to give a plausible account of these dynamics. This is related to the problem of authority raised earlier: These considerations suggest that people sometimes acknowledge moral authority that extends beyond their own society, and a relativist needs to show why this makes sense or why people are mistaken in this acknowledgement.

7. Mixed Positions: A Rapprochement between Relativists and Objectivists?

Discussions of moral relativism often assume (as mostly has been assumed here so far) that moral relativism is the correct account of all moral judgments or of none. But perhaps it is the correct account of some moral judgments but not others or, more vaguely, the best account of morality vis-à-vis these issues would acknowledge both relativist and objectivist elements. Such a mixed position might be motivated by some of the philosophical questions already raised (recall also the suggestion in the section on experimental philosophy that some people may be “meta-ethical pluralists”). On the empirical level, it might be thought that there are many substantial moral disagreements but also some striking moral agreements across different societies. On the metaethical plane, it might be supposed that, though many disagreements are not likely to be rationally resolved, other disagreements may be (and perhaps that the cross-cultural agreements we find have a rational basis). The first point would lead to a weaker form of DMR The second point, the more important one, would imply a modified form of MMR (see the suggestions in the last paragraph of section 4). This approach has attracted some support, interestingly, from both sides of the debate: relativists who have embraced an objective constraint, and (more commonly) objectivists who have allowed some relativist dimensions. Here are some prominent examples of these mixed metaethical outlooks.

David Copp (1995) maintains that it is true that something is morally wrong only if it is wrong in relation to the justified moral code of some society, and a code is justified in a society only if the society would be rationally required to select it. Since which code it would be rationally required to select depends in part on the non-moral values of the society, and since these values differ from one society to another, something may be morally wrong for one society but not for another. Copp calls this position a form of moral relativism. However, he believes this relativism is significantly mitigated by the fact that which code a society is rationally required to select also depends on the basic needs of the society. Copp thinks all societies have the same basic needs. For example, every society has a need to maintain its population and system of cooperation from one generation to the next. Moreover, since meeting these basic needs is the most fundamental factor in determining the rationality of selecting a code, Copp thinks the content of all justified moral codes will tend to be quite similar. For instance, any such code will require that persons’s basic needs for such things as physical survival, self-respect and friendship be promoted (these are said to be necessary for minimal rational agency). The theory is mixed insofar as the rationality of selecting a code depends partly on common features of human nature (basic needs) and partly on diverse features of different societies (values). Whether or not justified moral codes (and hence moral truths) would tend to be substantially similar, despite differences, as Copp argues, would depend on both the claim that all societies have the same basic needs and the claim that these needs are much more important than other values in determining which moral code it is rational for a society to select.

Wong (1996) defended a partly similar position, though one intended to allow for greater diversity in correct moral codes. He argued that more than one morality may be true, but there are limits on which moralities are true. The first point is a form of metaethical relativism: It says one morality may be true for one society and a conflicting morality may be true for another society. Hence, there is no one objectively correct morality for all societies. The second point, however, is a concession to moral objectivism. It acknowledges that objective factors concerning human nature and the human situation should determine whether or not, or to what extent, a given morality could be one of the true ones. The mere fact that a morality is accepted by a society does not guarantee that it has normative authority in that society. For example, given our biological and psychological make-up, not just anything could count as a good way of life. Again, given that most persons are somewhat self-interested and that society requires some measure of cooperation, any plausible morality will include a value of reciprocity (good in return for good on some proportional basis). Since these objective limitations are quite broad, they are insufficient in themselves to establish a specific and detailed morality: Many particular moralities are consistent with them, and the choice among these moralities must be determined by the cultures of different societies.

Wong has developed this approach at length in more recent work (2006). His “pluralistic relativism” continues to emphasize that there are universal constraints on what could be a true morality. The constraints are based on a naturalistic understanding of human nature and the circumstances of human life. For Wong, given a variety of human needs and the depth of self-interest, morality’s function is to promote both social co-operation and individual flourishing. In addition, morality requires that persons have both effective agency and effective identity, and these can only be fostered in personal contexts such as the family. Hence, the impersonal perspective must be limited by the personal perspective. Any true morality would have to respect requirements such as these.

Nonetheless, according to Wong, the universal constraints are sufficiently open-ended that there is more than one way to respect them. Hence, there can be more than one true morality. This is pluralistic relativism. For Wong, the different true moralities need not be, and typically are not, completely different from one another. In fact, they often share some values (such as individual rights and social utility), but assign them different priorities.

Wong presents pluralistic relativism as the best explanation of what he calls “moral ambivalence,” the phenomenon of morally disagreeing with someone while recognizing that the person is still reasonable in making the conflicting judgment—to the point that one’s confidence in being uniquely right is shaken. The extent to which moral ambivalence is widespread is an empirical question (see section 3). In any case, Wong presents a sustained and detailed argument that an empirically-based understanding of the nature and conditions of human life both limits and underdetermines what a true morality could be. In many respects, his position is the most sophisticated form of relativism developed to date, and it has the resources to confront a number of the issues raised in the last section (for some critical responses to Wong and his replies, see Xiao and Huang 2014; for more recent discussion, see Li 2019, Vicente and Arrieta 2016, and Wong 2020).

A somewhat similar mixed position has been advanced, though more tentatively, by Foot (2002a and 2002b; see also Scanlon 1995 and 1998: ch. 8). She argued that there are conceptual limitations on what could count as a moral code (as seen in section 4), and that there are common features of human nature that set limits on what a good life could be. For these reasons, there are some objective moral truths—for example, that the Nazi attempt to exterminate the Jews was morally wrong. However, Foot maintained, these considerations do not ensure that all moral disagreements can be rationally resolved. Hence, in some cases, a moral judgment may be true by reference to the standards of one society and false by reference to the standards of another society—but neither true nor false in any absolute sense (just as we might say with respect to standards of beauty).

Foot came to this mixed view from the direction of objectivism (in the form of a virtue theory), and it might be contended by some objectivists that she has conceded too much. Since there are objective criteria, what appear as rationally irresolvable disagreements might be resolvable through greater understanding of human nature. Or the objective criteria might establish that in some limited cases it is an objective moral truth that conflicting moral practices are both morally permissible. In view of such considerations, objectivists might argue, it is not necessary to have recourse to the otherwise problematic notion of relative moral truth.

A position related to Foot’s has been advanced by Martha Nussbaum (1993). With explicit reference to Aristotle, she argued that there is one objectively correct understanding of the human good, and that this understanding provides a basis for criticizing the moral traditions of different societies. The specifics of this account are explained by a set of experiences or concerns, said to be common to all human beings and societies, such as fear, bodily appetite, distribution of resources, management of personal property, etc. Corresponding to each of these is a conception of living well, a virtue, namely the familiar Aristotelian virtues such as courage, moderation, justice, and generosity. Nussbaum acknowledged that there are disagreements about these virtues, and she raised an obvious relativist objection herself: Even if the experiences are universal, does human nature establish that there is one objectively correct way of living well with respect to each of these areas? In response, Nussbaum conceded that sometimes there may be more than one objectively correct conception of these virtues and that the specification of the conception may depend on the practices of a particular community.

As with Foot, Nussbaum came to this mixed position from the objectivist side of the debate. Some moral objectivists may think she has given up too much, and for a related reason many moral relativists may believe she has established rather little. For example, bodily appetites are indeed universal experiences, but there has been a wide range of responses to these—for example, across a spectrum from asceticism to hedonism. This appears to be one of the central areas of moral disagreement. In order to maintain her objectivist credentials, Nussbaum needs to show that human nature substantially constrains which of these responses could be morally appropriate. Some objectivists may say she has not shown this, but could, while relativists may doubt she could show it.

Mixed positions along the lines of those just discussed suppose that morality is objective in some respects, on account of some features of human nature, and relative in other respects. For the respects in which morality is relative, it is up to particular societies or individuals to determine which moral values to embrace. Hence, the authority of morality depends partly on objective factors and partly on the decisions of groups or individuals. Insofar as this is true, such mixed positions need to say something about the basis for these decisions and how conflicts are to be resolved (for example, when individuals dissent from groups or when people belong to different groups with conflicting values). The objective features of mixed positions may help resolve these issues, or may limit their import, but at the point where these features give out there remain some of the standard concerns about relativism (such as those raised in the last section).

Another approach might be construed as a mixed position, though it was not put forward in these terms. Isaiah Berlin (1998) argued that, though some moral values are universal, there are also many objective values that conflict and are not commensurable with one another. He called his position pluralism and rejected the label ‘relativism’ (see the entry on Isaiah Berlin). But if incommensurability implies that these conflicts cannot be rationally resolved, then it might suggest a concession to relativism.

Against such a position, an objectivist may ask why we should think objective goods are incommensurable: If X and Y are both objectively good, then why not say that the statement ‘X is better than Y’ (or a more restrictive comparative statement specifying respects or circumstances) is objectively true or false, even if this is difficult to know? Berlin’s view was that there are many examples of conflicting goods—for example, justice and mercy, or liberty and equality—where it is implausible to suppose they are commensurable.

Finally, it should also be noted that a rather different kind of mixed position was proposed by Bernard Williams (1981 and 1985: ch. 9). He rejected what he called “strict relational relativism,” that ethical conceptions have validity only relative to a society. But he endorsed another form of relativism. This was explained by reference to a distinction between a “notional confrontation,” where a divergent outlook is known but not a real option for us, and a “real confrontation,” where a divergent outlook is a real option for us—something we might embrace without losing our grip on reality. Williams’s “relativism of distance” says ethical appraisals are appropriate in real confrontations, but not in notional ones. For example, we could never embrace the outlook of a medieval samurai: Since this is a notional confrontation, it would be inappropriate to describe this outlook as just or unjust. This is the sense in which relativism is correct. But in real confrontations, relativism unhelpfully discourages the evaluation of another outlook that is a genuine option for us (for a development of Williams’s position by reference to the recent experimental literature, see Gaitán and Viciana 2018).

Williams was a strong critic of most forms of moral objectivism, yet he also criticized many of the nonobjectivist alternatives to objectivism. His outlook is not easily classified in terms of standard metaethical positions. With respect to his relativism of distance, it may be wondered why appraisals are inappropriate in notional confrontations: Why should the fact that an outlook is not a real option preclude us from thinking it is just or unjust? On the other hand, in real confrontations Williams thought the language of appraisal was appropriate, but he also thought these confrontations could involve rationally irresolvable disagreements. Though Williams rejects strict relational relativism, objectivists may argue that his position suffers from defects as serious as those that attend MMR. If the confrontations are real because the two outlooks have something in common, objectivists might ask, could this not provide a basis for resolving these disagreements?

The central theme in mixed positions is that neither relativism nor objectivism is wholly correct: At least in the terms in which they are often expressed, these alternatives are subject to serious objections, and yet they are motivated by genuine concerns. It might seem that a mixed position could be developed that would give us the best of both worlds (there are a number of other proposals along these lines; for example see Hampshire 1983 and 1989). However, an implication of most mixed positions (this does not apply to Williams) seems to be that, in some respect, some moral judgments are objectively true (or justified), while others have only relative truth (or justification). This should not be confused with the claim that an action may be right in some circumstances but not others. For example, a consequentialist view that polygamy is right in one society and wrong in another because it has good consequences in the first society and bad consequences in the second would not be a mixed position because the judgments “Polygamy is right in circumstances A” and “Polygamy is wrong in circumstances B” could both be true in an absolute sense. By contrast, a mixed position might say that “Polygamy is right” is true relative to one society and false relative to another (where the two societies differ, not necessarily in circumstances, but in fundamental values), while other moral judgments have absolute truth-value. This is a rather disunified conception of morality, and it invites many questions. A proponent of a mixed view would have to show that it is an accurate portrayal of our moral practices, or that it is a plausible proposal for reforming them.

8. Relativism and Tolerance

Relativism is sometimes associated with a normative position, usually pertaining to how people ought to regard or behave towards those with whom they morally disagree. The most prominent normative position in this connection concerns tolerance. In recent years, the idea that we should be tolerant has been increasingly accepted in some circles. At the same time, others have challenged this idea, and the philosophical understanding and justification of tolerance has become less obvious (see Heyd 1996 and the entry on toleration). The question here is whether moral relativism has something to contribute to these discussions, in particular, whether DMR or MMR provide support for tolerance (for discussion, see Graham 1996, Harrison 1976, Ivanhoe 2009, Kim and Wreen 2003, Prinz 2007: pp. 207–13 and Wong 1984: ch. 12). In this context, tolerance does not ordinarily mean indifference or absence of disapproval: It means having a policy of not interfering with the actions of persons that are based on moral judgments we reject, when the disagreement is not or cannot be rationally resolved. The context of discussion is often, but not always, moral disagreements between two societies. Does moral relativism provide support for tolerance in this sense?

Though many people seem to think it does, philosophers often resist supposing that there is a philosophical connection between accepting a metaethical position and reaching a practical conclusion (however, see Gillespie 2016). Hence, it is often thought that, though DMR may provide the occasion for tolerance, but it could not imply that tolerance is morally obligatory or even permissible. DMR simply tells us there are moral disagreements. Recognition of this fact, by itself, entails nothing about how we should act towards those with whom we disagree. MMR fares no better. For one thing, MMR cannot very well imply that it is an objective moral truth that we should be tolerant: MMR denies that there are such truths. (A mixed position could contend that tolerance is the only objective moral truth, all others being relative; but it would have to be shown that this is more than an ad hoc maneuver.) It might be said that MMR implies that tolerance is a relative truth. However, even this is problematic. According to MMR, understood to concern truth, the truth-value of statements may vary from society to society. Hence, the statement, “people ought to be tolerant” (T), may be true in some societies and false in others. MMR by itself does not entail that T is true in any society, and may in fact have the result that T is false in some societies (a similar point may be made with respect to justification).

Some objectivists may add that in some cases we should be tolerant of those with whom we morally disagree, but that only objectivists can establish this as an objective moral truth (for example, by drawing on arguments in the liberal tradition from Locke or Mill). To the objection that moral objectivism implies intolerance (or imperialism), objectivists typically contend that the fact that we regard a society as morally wrong in some respect does not entail that we should interfere with it.

Nonetheless, the thought persists among some relativists that there is a philosophically significant connection between relativism and tolerance. Perhaps the conjunction of MMR and an ethical principle could give us a reason for tolerance we would not have on the basis of the ethical principle alone. Such an approach has been proposed by Wong (1984: ch. 12). The principle is, roughly speaking, that we should not interfere with people unless we could justify this interference to them (if they were rational and well-informed in relevant respects). Wong called this “the justification principle.” Of course, it is already a tolerance principle of sorts. The idea is that it gains broader scope if MMR is correct. Let us suppose the statement that there is an individual right to freedom of speech is true and justified for our society, but is false and unjustified in another society in which the press is restricted for the good of the community. In this case, given MMR, our society might not be able to justify interference to the restrictive society concerning freedom of the press. Any justification we could give would appeal to values that are authoritative for us, not them, and no appeal to logic or facts alone would give them a reason to accept our justification.

If the justification principle were widely accepted, this argument might explain why some people have had good reason to think there is a connection between relativism and tolerance. But there is a question about whether the position is stable. Wong derived the justification principle from Kant, and Kant rejected MMR. If we were to accept MMR, would we still have reason to accept the justification principle? Wong thought we might, perhaps on the basis of considerations quite independent of Kant. In any case, this argument would only show that MMR plays a role in an argument for tolerance that is relevant to people in a society that accepted the justification principle. The argument does not establish that there is a general connection between relativism and tolerance. Nor does it undermine the contention that MMR may have the result that T is true in some societies and false in others.

In his more recent defense of pluralistic relativism (2006), Wong has argued that, since some serious moral disagreements are inevitable, any adequate morality will include the value of what he calls accommodation. This involves a commitment to peaceful and non-coercive relationships with persons with whom we disagree. Accommodation appears to be related to tolerance, but Wong argues for more than this: we should also try to learn from others, compromise with them, preserve relationships with them, etc. Wong’s defense of accommodation is immune to the objection that relativism cannot be a basis for such a universal value because his defense purports to be based on considerations that any adequate morality should recognize. However, for this reason, though it presupposes the considerations supporting the relativist dimension of his position (there is no single true morality), it argues from the non-relativist dimension (there are universal constraints any morality should accept, in particular, that one function of morality is to promote social co-operation). Hence, it is not strictly speaking an argument from relativism to accommodation.

As was noted in section 3, aside from the philosophical question whether or not some form of moral relativism provides a reason for attitudes such as tolerance, there is the psychological question whether or not people who accept relativism are more likely to be tolerant. As was seen, there is some evidence that relativists are more tolerant than objectivists, and it has been claimed that, even if relativism does not justify tolerance, it would be a positive feature of relativism that acceptance of it makes people more tolerant (see Prinz 2007: 208). Of course, this judgment presupposes that, in some sense, it is good to be tolerant.


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