Moral Realism

First published Mon Oct 3, 2005; substantive revision Tue Feb 3, 2015

Taken at face value, the claim that Nigel has a moral obligation to keep his promise, like the claim that Nyx is a black cat, purports to report a fact and is true if things are as the claim purports. Moral realists are those who think that, in these respects, things should be taken at face value—moral claims do purport to report facts and are true if they get the facts right. Moreover, they hold, at least some moral claims actually are true. That much is the common and more or less defining ground of moral realism (although some accounts of moral realism see it as involving additional commitments, say to the independence of the moral facts from human thought and practice, or to those facts being objective in some specified way).

As a result, those who reject moral realism are usefully divided into (i) those who think moral claims do not purport to report facts in light of which they are true or false (noncognitivists) and (ii) those who think that moral claims do carry this purport but deny that any moral claims are actually true (error theorists).

It is worth noting that, while moral realists are united in their cognitivism and in their rejection of error theories, they disagree among themselves not only about which moral claims are actually true but about what it is about the world that makes those claims true. Moral realism is not a particular substantive moral view nor does it carry a distinctive metaphysical commitment over and above the commitment that comes with thinking moral claims can be true or false and some are true. Still, much of the debate about moral realism revolves around either what it takes for claims to be true or false at all (with some arguing that moral claims do not have what it takes) or what it would take specifically for moral claims to be true (with some arguing that moral claims would require something the world does not provide).

The debate between moral realists and anti-realists assumes, though, that there is a shared object of inquiry—in this case, a range of claims all involved are willing to recognize as moral claims—about which two questions can be raised and answered: Do these claims purport to report facts in light of which they are true or false? Are some of them true? Moral realists answer ‘yes’ to both, non-cognitivists answer ‘no’ to the first (and, by default, ‘no’ to the second) while error theorists answer ‘yes’ to the first and ‘no’ to the second. (With the introduction of “minimalism” about truth and facts, things become a bit more complicated. See the section on semantics, below.) To note that some other, non-moral, claims do not (or do) purport to report facts or that none (or some) of them are true, is to change the subject. That said, it is strikingly hard to nail down with any accuracy just which claims count as moral and so are at issue in the debate. For the most part, those concerned with whether moral realism is true are forced to work back and forth between an intuitive grasp of which claims are at issue and an articulate but controversial account of what they have in common such that realism either is, or is not, defensible about them.

By all accounts, moral realism can fairly claim to have common sense and initial appearances on its side. That advantage, however, might be easily outweighed; there are a number of powerful arguments for holding that it is a mistake to think of moral claims as true.

1. Moral Disagreement

Perhaps the longest standing argument is found in the extent and depth of moral disagreement. The mere fact of disagreement does not raise a challenge for moral realism. Disagreement is to be found in virtually any area, even where no one doubts that the claims at stake purport to report facts and everyone grants that some claims are true.

But disagreements differ and many believe that the sort of disagreements one finds when it comes to morality are best explained by supposing one of two things: (i) that moral claims are not actually in the business of reporting facts, but are rather our way of expressing emotions, or of controlling others’ behavior, or, at least, of taking a stand for and against certain things or (ii) that moral claims are in the business of reporting facts, but the required facts just are not to be found.

Taking the first line, many note that people differ in their emotions, attitudes and interests and then argue that moral disagreements simply reflect the fact that the moral claims people embrace are (despite appearances) really devices for expressing or serving their different emotions, attitudes, and interests.

Taking the second line, others note that claims can genuinely purport to report facts and yet utterly fail (consider claims about phlogiston or astrological forces or some mythical figure that others believed existed) and then argue that moral disagreements take the form they do because the facts that would be required to give them some order and direction are not to be found.

On either view, the distinctive nature of moral disagreement is seen as well explained by the supposition that moral realism is false, either because cognitivism is false or because an error theory is true.

Interestingly, the two lines of argument are not really compatible. If one thinks that moral claims do not even purport to report facts, one cannot intelligibly hold that the facts such claims purport to report do not exist. Nonetheless, in important ways, the considerations each mobilizes might be used to support the other. For instance, someone defending an error theory might point to the ways in which moral claims are used to express or serve peoples’ emotions, attitudes, and interests, to explain why people keep arguing as they do despite there being no moral facts. And someone defending noncognitivism might point to the practical utility of talking as if there were moral facts to explain why moral claims seem to purport to report facts even though they do not.

Moreover, almost surely each of these views is getting at something that is importantly right about some people and their use of what appear to be moral claims. No one doubts that often peoples’ moral claims do express their emotions, attitudes, and do serve their interests and it is reasonable to suspect that at least some people have in mind as moral facts a kind of fact we have reason to think does not exist.

Moral realists are committed to holding, though, that to whatever extent moral claims might have other uses and might be made by people with indefensible accounts of moral facts, some moral claims, properly understood, are actually true. To counter the arguments that appeal to the nature of moral disagreement, moral realists need to show that the disagreements are actually compatible with their commitments.

An attractive first step is to note, as was done above, that mere disagreement is no indictment. Indeed, to see the differences among people as disagreements—rather than as mere differences—it seems as if one needs to hold that they are making claims that contradict one another and this seems to require that each side see the other as making a false claim. To the extent there is moral disagreement and not merely difference, moral realists argue, we need at least to reject noncognitivism (even as we acknowledge that the views people embrace might be heavily influenced by their emotions, attitudes, and interests). While this is plausible, noncognitivists can and have replied by distinguishing cognitive disagreement from other sorts of disagreement and arguing that moral disagreements are of a sort that does not require cognitivism. Realists cannot simply dismiss this possibility, though they can legitimately challenge noncognitivists to make good sense of how moral arguments and disagreements are carried on without surreptitiously appealing to the participants seeing their claims as purporting to report facts.

In any case, even if the nature of disagreements lends some plausibility to cognitivism, moral realists need also to respond to the error theorist's contention that the arguments and disagreements all rest on some false supposition to the effect that there are actually facts of the sort there would have to be for some of the claims to be true. And, however moral realists respond, they need to avoid doing so in a way that then makes a mystery of the widespread moral disagreement (or at least difference) that all acknowledge.

Some moral realists argue that the disagreements, widespread as they are, do not go very deep—that to a significant degree moral disagreements play out against the background of shared fundamental principles with the differences of opinion regularly being traceable to disagreements about the nonmoral facts that matter in light of the moral principles. On their view, the explanation of moral disagreements will be of a piece with whatever turns out to be a good explanation of the various nonmoral disagreements people find themselves in.

Other moral realists, though, see the disagreements as sometimes fundamental. On their view, while moral disagreements might in some cases be traceable to disagreements about nonmoral matters of fact, this will not always be true. Still, they deny the anti-realist's contention that the disagreements that remain are well explained by noncognitivism or by an error theory. Instead, they regularly offer some other explanation of the disagreements. They point out, for example, that many of the disagreements can be traced to the distorting effects of the emotions, attitudes, and interests that are inevitably bound up with moral issues. Or they argue that what appear to be disagreements are really cases in which the people are talking past each other, each making claims that might well be true once the claims are properly understood (Harman 1975, Wong 1984). And they often combine these explanatory strategies holding that the full range of moral disagreements are well explained by some balanced appeal to all of the considerations just mentioned, treating some disagreements as not fundamentally moral, others as a reflection of the distorting effects of emotion and interest, and still others as being due to insufficiently subtle understandings of what people are actually claiming. If some combination of these explanations works, then the moral realist is on firm ground in holding that the existence of moral disagreements, such as they are, is not an argument against moral realism. Of course, if no such explanation works, then an appeal either to noncognitivism or an error theory (i.e. to some form of anti-realism) may be the best alternative.

2. Metaphysics

Putting aside the arguments that appeal to moral disagreement, a significant motivation for anti-realism about morality is found in worries about the metaphysics of moral realism and especially worries about whether moral realism might be reconciled with (what has come to be called) naturalism. It is hard, to say the least, to define naturalism in a clear way. Yet the underlying idea is fairly easy to convey. According to naturalism, the only facts we should believe in are those countenanced by, or at least compatible with, the results of science. To find, of some putative fact, that its existence is neither established by, nor even compatible with science, is to discover, as naturalism would have it, that there is no such fact. If moral realism requires facts that are incompatible with science (as many think it does) that alone would constitute a formidable argument against it.

Noncognitivists and error theorists alike have no trouble respecting naturalism while offering their respective accounts of moral claims. In both cases, their accounts appeal to nothing not already embraced by naturalism. Of course noncognitivists and error theories disagree in crucial ways about the nature of moral thought, and noncognitivists and error theorists disagree among themselves too about which versions of their preferred accounts are better. But they all are, from the point of view of naturalism, on safe ground.

Moral realists, in contrast, are standardly seen as unable to sustain their accounts without appealing, in the end, to putative facts that fly in the face of naturalism. This standard view can be traced to a powerful and influential argument offered by G.E. Moore (1903). As Moore saw things, being a naturalist about morality required thinking that moral terms could be defined correctly using terms that refer to natural properties. Thus one might define ‘good’ as ‘pleasant’, thus securing naturalistic credentials for value (so long as pleasure was a natural property) or one might define ‘good’ as ‘satisfies a desire we desire to have’ or as ‘conforms to the rules in force in our society’ or ‘promotes the species.’ Any one of these proposed definitions, if true, would establish that the facts required to make claims about what is good true or false were compatible with naturalism. Yet, Moore argued, no such definition is true. Against every one, he maintain, a single line of argument was decisive. For in each case, whatever naturalistic definition of moral terms was on offer, it always made sense to ask, of things that had the naturalistic property in question, whether those things were (really) good.

Consider someone who held not merely that pleasure was something good but (as a definition would have it) that pleasure was goodness—that they were one and the same property. According to that person, in claiming that something is pleasant one is claiming that it is good, and vice versa. In that case, though, it would not make sense for people to acknowledge that something is pleasant and then wonder, nonetheless, whether it was good. That would be like acknowledging that something is a triangle and then wondering, nonetheless, whether it has three sides. Yet, Moore maintained, the two cases are not alike. A person who wonders whether a triangle has three sides shows he does not understand what it is to be a triangle. His competence with the terms in question is revealed to be inadequate. In contrast, Moore observed, for any natural property whatsoever it was always an open question whether things that had that natural property were good. A person who raised that question did not thereby reveal himself not to be competent with the terms in question. What this shows, Moore argued, was that moral terms did not refer to natural properties and so a proper account of moral claims would have to recognize that they purport to report non-natural facts.

Now of course moral realists can consistently acknowledge this and then argue against naturalism—perhaps, at least in part, on the grounds that naturalism is incompatible with acknowledging moral facts. This was, in fact, Moore’s position. Yet one then has the burden of explaining how moral facts are related to natural facts and the burden of explaining how we might manage to learn of these non-natural facts. A good deal of the work that has been done defending moral realism is devoted either to meeting these burdens or to showing that they do not pose a special problem just for morality. Moral realists of this sort allow that moral facts are not natural facts, and moral knowledge is not simply of a piece with scientific knowledge, even as they defend the idea that there are moral facts and (at least in principle) moral knowledge. They thus reject the idea that science is the measure and test of all things (Shafer-Landau 2003, Parfit 2011, Scanlon 2014).

Impressed by the plausibility of naturalism, though, many moral realists have tried, in one way or another, to show that the moral facts they are committed to are either themselves natural facts or are at least appropriately compatible with such facts (Boyd 1988, Brink 1989, Railton 1986). If they are right, then naturalism poses no special threat to moral realism.

For a long time, people thought that Moore’s Open Question Argument (as it has come to be called) established that no version of moral naturalism was defensible. However, recent developments in the philosophy of language and metaphysics have raised concerns about Moore’s argument. Of special concern is the fact that the argument seems to rule out inappropriately the possibility of establishing—on grounds other than semantic analysis—that two terms actually refer to the same property, substance, or entity.

The problem becomes clear if one thinks of, for instance, the claim that water is H2O. That water is H2O cannot be discovered simply by appreciating the meanings of the terms involved, so if a person were to wonder of some water whether it is really H2O he would not thereby be revealing some incompetence with the terms in question. His question would be, in the relevant way, an Open Question, even if, in fact, water is H2O. Similarly, some moral realists argue that value might, in fact, be properly identified with, say, what satisfies desires we desire to have (to take one proposal Moore considered) even though this cannot be discovered simply by appreciating the meanings of the terms involved. As a result, a person might intelligibly wonder whether something that satisfied a desire she desired to have was actually good. The question might be, in the relevant way, an Open Question, even if, in fact, value is whatever satisfies a desire we desire to have. Of course the point here is not that one or another such proposal is true, but that the openness of the Open Question is not good grounds for supposing such proposals could not be true.

Pursing a different response to Moore's Open Question Argument, others have defended the possibility of a successful semantic analysis reducing moral claims to claims expressible in entirely naturalistic terms (Jackson 1998, Finlay 2014). Accordingly, they argue that the openness Moore points to, such as it is, is compatible with a correct semantic analysis—albeit not obvious—showing that moral facts are nothing over and above natural facts.

Once the Open Question is sidelined as being, at least, not decisive, room is left for thinking a correct account of the moral facts might identify them as natural facts. Just which facts those might be, and what arguments one might offer for one account rather than another, remains open, but the idea that we can know ahead of time that there are no good arguments for such an account is no longer widely accepted.

3. Psychology

Nonetheless, realists and anti-realists alike are usually inclined to hold that Moore’s Open Question Argument is getting at something important—some feature of moral claims that makes them not well captured by nonmoral claims.

According to some, that ‘something important’ is that moral claims are essentially bound up with motivation in a way that nonmoral claims are not (Ayer 1936, Stevenson 1937, Gibbard 1990, Blackburn 1993). Exactly what the connection to motivation is supposed to be is itself controversial, but one common proposal (motivation internalism) is that a person counts as sincerely making a moral claim only if she is motivated appropriately. To think of something that it is good, for instance, goes with being, other things equal, in favor of it in ways that would provide some motivation (not necessarily decisive) to promote, produce, preserve or in other ways support it. If someone utterly lacks such motivations and yet claims nonetheless that she thinks the thing in question is good, there is reason, people note, to suspect either that she is being disingenuous or that she does not understand what she is saying. This marks a real contrast with nonmoral claims since the fact that a person makes some such claim sincerely seems never to entail anything in particular about her motivations. Whether she is attracted by, repelled by, or simply indifferent to some color is irrelevant to whether her claim that things have that color are sincere and well understood by her.

Noncognitivists often appeal to this apparent contrast to argue that moral claims have this necessary connection to motivation precisely because they do not express beliefs (that might be true or false) but instead express motivational states of desire, approval, or commitment (that might be satisfied or frustrated but are neither true nor false). Nonmoral claims, they maintain, commonly express beliefs and for that reason are rightly seen as purporting to report facts and as being evaluable as true or false. Yet, because beliefs alone are motivationally inert, the fact that someone is sincerely making such a claim (that is, is expressing something she actually believes) is compatible with her having any sort of motivation, or none at all. In contrast, claims that commonly express desires, preferences, and commitments do not purport to report facts and are not evaluable as true or false. Yet, because these are all motivationally loaded, the fact that someone sincerely makes such a claim (that is, is expressing something she actually feels) is incompatible with her failing to have the corresponding motivations. As soon as the contrast is in place, noncognitivists argue, we can well explain the motivational force of sincere moral claims and explain too the insight behind Moore’s Open Question Argument, by seeing moral claims as not beliefs but (perhaps a distinctive kind of) desire, preference, or commitment.

Some moral realists respond to this line of argument by rejecting the idea that beliefs are all motivationally inert (Platts 1979). According to them moral beliefs stand as a counter example. But it is not the only apparent counter example. Consider, for instance, first person claims concerning the prospect of pain. If a person claimed that an experience would be painful and yet had no motivation whatsoever, other things equal, to resist, oppose, or in some way avoid that experience, there would be reason to suspect either that she is being disingenuous or that she does not understand what she is saying. That, though, is no reason to think a sincere claim that some experience would be painful does not express a belief, purport to report a fact, and open itself to evaluation as true or false. This all suggests, these realists argue, that moral claims might well carry motivational implications, and that might be the insight behind Moore’s Open Question Argument, even though those claims express beliefs and, as a result, purport to report facts and can be evaluated as true or false.

Other moral realists reject the idea that moral claims are as tightly bound up with motivation as the noncognitivist argument supposes. They point out that, while an absence of appropriate motivation would raise questions, there might be answers. The person making the claims might be so depressed or so weak-willed or so evil, that she remains utterly unmoved even when she sincerely thinks action would secure something valuable. To suppose this is not possible is to beg the question against those who would grant that beliefs are motivationally inert while holding that moral claims express beliefs.

Those that take this line can, and often do, go on to argue nonetheless both (i) that there is a distinctive connection between moral claims and action and (ii) that the connection helps to explain the insight behind Moore’s Open Question Argument. However, they maintain, the distinctive connection is either itself a normative connection between the claims and motivation or else it is a conceptual connection between the claims (or their truth) and which actions a person has reason to perform (Smith 1994). On the first suggestion, a person might well fail to be motivated appropriately by the moral claims she sincerely embraces, but in failing to be appropriately motivated she would thereby count as irrational. On the second suggestion, again a person might well fail to be motivated appropriately by the moral claims she sincerely embraces, but either the fact that she sincerely embraces the claims or the truth of the claims she embraces (if they are true) provide reasons for her to act in certain ways. All of these views involves rejecting motivational internalism even as they each maintain that there is a conceptual connection of some sort between moral claims (or their truth) and action (or the motivation to act). (The resulting views are often characterized as versions of reason internalism.) Nonmoral claims alone never imply anything in particular about what people have reason to do or refrain from doing, but moral claims, in contrast, do have such implications, they argue. On this view, there is a necessary connection between moral claims and action, but it is between these claims (or their truth) and reason (or rationality), and is not such that sincerely embracing a moral claim guarantees appropriate motivation.

None of this is to defend, as realists must, the idea that some of the claims are actually true. But it does suggest that moral realists can acknowledge a necessary connection between moral claims and action without abandoning the cognitivism that is central to their position.

Some error theorists do argue that combining cognitivism with motivational internalism results in an untenable position (Mackie 1977). According to them, the moral facts that would make motivating beliefs true would themselves have to be, in some way, intrinsically motivating states of the world. And, they add, there is no reason to think there are such states. Yet if the motivational internalism one embraces for moral claims has a parallel for pain claims, then this argument must be wrong (assuming it is true of some experiences that they are painful). Either motivational internalism does not require intrinsically motivating states of the world in order for the relevant claims to be true or else we have independent reason (provided by our awareness of pain) to think there are such states. While there may well be reason to think there are no moral facts, this argument does not provide it.

4. Epistemology

Suppose, for the sake of the argument, that there are moral facts. Suppose even that the moral facts are properly thought of as at least compatible with science. One thing Moore’s Open Question Argument still seems to show is that no appeal to natural facts discovered by scientific method would establish that the moral facts are one way rather than another. That something is pleasant, or useful, or satisfies someone’s preference, is perfectly compatible with thinking that it is neither good nor right nor worth doing. The mere fact that moral facts might be compatible with natural facts does nothing to support the idea that we could learn about the moral facts. David Hume seems to have been, in effect, pressing this point long before Moore, when he argued that no moral conclusion follows non-problematically from nonmoral premises (Hume 1739). No “ought,” he pointed out, followed from an “is”—without the help of another (presupposed) “ought.” More generally, there is no valid inference from nonmoral premises to moral conclusions unless one relies, at least surreptitiously, on a moral premise. If, then, all that science can establish is what “is” and not what ought to be, science cannot alone establish moral conclusions.

But from where, then, can we get the moral premises needed? Of course no answer is to be found in a claim that certain norms are in force or that a powerful being commanded something since, in both cases, nothing about what ought to be done follows from these claims without assuming some further moral claim (e.g. that one ought to obey the norms in force or that one owes allegiance to the powerful being). If at least some fundamental moral principles were self-evident, or analytic truths, or at least reasonably thought to enjoy widespread consensus or to be such that eventually all would converge on those principles, there might be some plausible candidates. Yet the few principles that might be candidates—one ought to treat people with respect or one ought to promote human welfare or, other things equal, pleasure is good—are all either so abstract or inspecific in their implications that they could hardly alone work to justify the full range of moral claims people are inclined to make.

These considerations highlight a crucial difficulty moral realists face even if one grants the existence of moral facts: they need some account of how we might justify our moral claims. Otherwise, whatever the moral facts are, we would have reasonable grounds for worrying that what we count as evidence for any particular claim is no evidence at all.

In light of this concern, it is worth noting that the challenge posed here for our moral claims actually plagues a huge range of other claims we take ourselves to be justified in making. For instance, just as no collection of nonmoral premises will alone entail a moral conclusion, no collection of nonpsychological premises will alone entail a psychological conclusion, and no collection of nonbiological premises will alone entail a biological conclusion. In each case the premises will entail the conclusions only if, at least surreptitiously, psychological or biological premises, respectively, are introduced. Yet no one supposes that this means we can never justify claims concerning psychology or biology. That there are these analogues of course does not establish that we are, in fact, justified in making the moral claims we do. But they do show that granting the inferential gap between nonmoral claims and moral claims does not establish that we can have no evidence for the moral claims. And they refocus the challenge facing moral realists. Under what conditions, and why, are psychological and biological claims reasonably thought justified? Might similar conditions and considerations hold for moral claims?

At one time, philosophers thought there was a quick and easy answer to these questions, an answer that immediately discredited moral claims. That answer was that in psychology and biology our justifications can and do ultimately ground out in empirical observations, whereas nothing of the kind is available for moral theory. If true, this would explain in a sharp way why psychology and biology might have a real claim on our opinions while morality and alchemy and various crackpot theories do not. The former can be tested against experience and pass the test, while the latter, while testable, can be seen to fail utterly.

Moral realists have three sorts of reply to the epistemic challenge they face. One is to argue that a proper appreciation of the ways in which all observation is theory laden leaves no real contrast between the observations that support psychology and biology and those that are appealed to supporting moral theories. As proponents of this view would have it, the process of justifying various scientific theories, which involves moving back and forth between particular specific claims and more general principles seeking a mutually supporting system, is matched step for step by when people develop and defend moral theories. In both cases specific judgments (concerning observations or the badness of a certain act, for instance) are tentatively accepted and an attempt is made to make sense of them by appeal to more general principles that explain the judgments. When the more general principles are available the specific judgments are taken as evidence for the principles and the principles reciprocate by helping to justify the thought that the specific judgments are accurate. But if no general principles are available the specific judgments are called into question and the suspicion is rightly raised that they might be illusory or misleading. Whether they are taken to be warranted is decided in large part, and rightly, by appealing to other principles that so far have themselves found support in their fit with still other specific judgments. The process is of necessity tentative and piecemeal but it is, many argue, nonetheless no different in science than in morality. All of this is, of course, compatible with thinking the process might end in failure—alchemy and crackpot theories are prime examples of how the attempt to sustain a systematic and mutually supporting set of beliefs can fail. But absent special arguments that morality fails in the way they do, morality no less than psychology and biology can claim that experience may well provide confirmation for our moral claims (Sayre-McCord 1996).

Some moral realists, particularists, reject the general picture of systematic justification just described and yet argue that, when it comes to the role of observation, moral claims are nonetheless actually on a par with non-moral claims (Dancy 1993). According to them, our justification for our particular nonmoral observations depends not at all on our having any sort of articulatable general grounds to offer as support. To suppose otherwise is to succumb to a misguided picture of when and why people are justified in believing as they do concerning what they observe. The situation is exactly the same, particularists maintain, with our moral claims. Here too someone can be perfectly justified in claiming, for instance, that some particular action was wrong or that some response was obligatory, without having articulatable general ground to offer as support. Such moral claims might, of course, still prove to be mistaken, but then the same is true of what people take themselves to have seen.

Another realist reply to the epistemic challenge is to argue that mathematics and logic, not science, are the right models of moral theory (Scanlon 2014). Neither mathematics nor logic, some maintain, rely on experience for their confirmation. They are, instead, supportable a priori by appeal to the nature of the concepts they involve. On this view, a sound defense of the principles we need to ground moral arguments can be found in a suitably subtle and careful bit of conceptual analysis. In light of Moore’s Open Question Argument, those who advocate an epistemology of conceptual analysis acknowledge that the correct analysis, whatever it is, is likely not at all obvious. And, they point out, this means that people who are genuinely competent with the relevant concepts might themselves not recognize the correct analysis as correct (Jackson 1998). Nonetheless, the analysis might be correct. If there is some such analysis to be had, and if it is rich enough to provide the sort of substantive principles needed to underwrite our various particular judgments, realism will have met well its epistemic burden. Of course putting things this way assumes we have a good epistemology of conceptual analysis, which might well be called into question. But worries about conceptual analysis are not specific to morality. And if they prove decisive, then those worries leave mathematics and logic, no less than morals, in need of some grounding or other. Whatever might be advanced on behalf of mathematics and logic, many think, should work as well for morality.

Still another reply, compatible with the first two but relying specifically on neither, shifts attention from science and from mathematics and logic, to epistemology itself. To think of any set of considerations that they justify some conclusion is to make a claim concerning the value (albeit the epistemic as opposed to moral value) of a conclusion. To hold of science, or mathematics, or logic, that there is a difference between good evidence or good arguments and bad ones is again to commit oneself evaluatively. This raises an obvious question: under what conditions, and why, are epistemic claims reasonably thought justified? Whatever answer one might begin to offer will immediately provide a model for an answer to the parallel question raised about moral judgments. There is no guarantee, of course, that our moral judgments will then end up being justified. The epistemic standards epistemology meets might well not be met by moral theory. But there is good reason to think the kinds of consideration that are appropriate to judging epistemic principles will be appropriate too when it comes to judging other normative principles, including those that we might recognize as moral. This means that any quick dismissal of moral theory as obviously not the sort of thing that could really be justified are almost surely too quick.

5. Semantics

Moral realists have here been characterized as those who hold that moral claims purport to report facts, that they are evaluable as true or false in light of whether the facts are as the claims purport, and that at least some such claims are actually true. Many have thought there are good reasons—even decisive reasons—for rejecting moral realism so conceived.

Yet, with the development of (what has come to be called) minimalism about talk of truth and fact, it might seem that this characterization makes being a moral realist easier than it should be. As minimalism would have it, saying that some claim is true is just a way of (re-)asserting the claim and carries no commitment beyond that expressed by the original claim. Thus, if one is willing to claim that “murdering innocent children for fun is wrong” one can comfortably claim as well that that “murdering innocent children for fun is wrong is true” without thereby taking on any additional metaphysical baggage. Since even noncognitivists would presumably be willing to claim that “murdering innocent children for fun is wrong,” they can acknowledge that the claim is true too and it would be a mistake to see that addition as any sort of renunciation of their noncognitivism. Having said that “it is true that murdering innocent children for fun is wrong,” it seems similarly innocuous for the non-cognitivists to grant that it is a fact. After all, they can argue, to say of some claim that what it says is a fact is itself just a way of (re-)asserting the claim and it too carries no commitment beyond that expressed by the original claim. Grammar alone, it seems, renders talk of truth and fact appropriate and does so without incurring the sort of metaphysical commitments that are rightly associated with genuine realism (see Gibbard 2003, Dreier 2005).

Putting things this way, though, is misleading. It involves supposing that the noncognitivist has somehow made out what her position comes to without appealing to a contrast between, on the one hand, those claims that are properly seen as truth-evaluable and, on the other hand, those that are not. Traditional noncognitivism embraces this contrast and so traditional noncognitivists are able to argue intelligibly that moral claims are among those for which truth is genuinely not at issue. They often, against the background of the contrast, go on to explain why moral claims nonetheless mimic so well claims that might actually be true and why we might even talk of them being “true” in a sense (albeit not in the sense in which claims properly understood as cognitive might be true). If, though, the contrast cannot be drawn in terms of whether the claims are truth-evaluable, the noncognitivist needs to offer an alternative account of what marks the difference between the claims concerning which one should be a noncognitivist and those concerning which one should be a cognitivist. Absent such a contrast, the noncognitivists have no distinctive thesis.

Error theorists also can find no special comfort in minimalism about truth and fact. After all, to defend their view, error theorists need to advance grounds for thinking that, while moral claims are truth-evaluable, none of them are actually true. This requires resisting the minimalist urge to make truth so cheap that any sort of claim can have it. That is not to say that an error theorist cannot be a minimalist about truth and fact. But it is to say that the minimalism does not make her position easier (and it may actually make her position more difficult) to sustain.

Minimalism is, then, no panacea for moral anti-realists. But it is not poison for them either. Although minimalism undermines the standard way in which anti-realists mark out their distinctive territory, there is still room for them to defend some alternative grounds for drawing the contrast between the areas about which one is a realist and those about which one is an anti-realist. For instance, one might argue that to be a realist about some area (morality or whatever) is to hold that the properties distinctive to that area (in this case moral properties) figure in some fundamental way in our explanations. To be an anti-realist, on this view, is to hold that such properties do not so figure. Drawing the contrast in this way would allow an anti-realist still to acknowledge that the properties exist (albeit not as fundamental explainers) and that claims ascribing them are sometimes true. But it is unclear whether the main issues that divide those who consider themselves realists from their opponents are best seen as being about whether moral properties qualify as fundamental explainers. Alternatively, one might argue that to be a realist about some area is to hold that the truths expressed by the relevant claims are not mind-dependent. And, the suggestion would be, to be an anti-realist is to think that if there are such truths, they are mind-dependent. This way of drawing the contrast risks ruling out as impossible realism about psychology, which seems draconian. And it would immediately count as anti-realist those metaethical views that treat moral facts as response dependent or in other ways dependent upon human thought and practice. So, again, it is unclear whether this contrast lines up properly with the main issues that have divided realists from anti-realists. Nonetheless, one might rely on either explanation or mind-independence to mark an important contrast between various metaethical views. Paying attention to the stand particular views take on explanation and mind-independence inevitably helps to keep them in focus and works to mark important questions.

Whatever one thinks of minimalism, of the importance of explanation, and of mind-independence, moral realism travels with the burden of making sense of the semantics of moral terms in a way that will support seeing claims that use them as genuinely truth-evaluable. Various features of the way in which people rely on such claims in their thought and talk support the idea that they are. At the same time, though, some aspects of the ways in which children acquire moral terms and the ways in which those terms are bound up with various emotions pull against seeing the terms as simply on a par with nonmoral terms. Working through the ways in which moral claims differ from, as well as the ways in which they are the same as, other claims that people make is essential to getting a full understanding of our moral thought and practice. Whether such a full understanding will involve seeing us as having moral beliefs (and not just moral reactions) that might be true, is not at all clear. Perhaps even less clear is whether and why we might reasonably hold that some of those beliefs are actually true. Yet it is pretty clear that people do generally regard their moral claims, and the moral claims of others, as purporting to report facts, and to the extent they themselves sincerely advance such claims they seem to be regarding at least some such claims as actually true. The burden is on the anti-realists about morality to argue that that this involves a mistake of some sort.


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