First published Fri Sep 24, 2010; substantive revision Wed Sep 9, 2020

The idea of multiculturalism in contemporary political discourse and in political philosophy reflects a debate about how to understand and respond to the challenges associated with cultural diversity based on ethnic, national, and religious differences. The term “multicultural” is often used as a descriptive term to characterize the fact of diversity in a society, but in what follows, the focus is on multiculturalism as a normative ideal in the context of Western liberal democratic societies. While the term has come to encompass a variety of normative claims and goals, it is fair to say that proponents of multiculturalism find common ground in rejecting the ideal of the “melting pot” in which members of minority groups are expected to assimilate into the dominant culture. Instead, proponents of multiculturalism endorse an ideal in which members of minority groups can maintain their distinctive collective identities and practices. In the case of immigrants, proponents emphasize that multiculturalism is compatible with, not opposed to, the integration of immigrants into society; multiculturalism policies provide fairer terms of integration for immigrants.

Modern states are organized around the language and culture of the dominant groups that have historically constituted them. As a result, members of minority cultural groups face barriers in pursuing their social practices in ways that members of dominant groups do not. Some theorists argue for tolerating minority groups by leaving them free of state interference (Kukathas 1995, 2003). Others argue that mere toleration of group differences falls short of treating members of minority groups as equals; what is required is recognition and positive accommodation of minority group practices through what the leading theorist of multiculturalism Will Kymlicka has called “group-differentiated rights” (1995). Some group-differentiated rights are held by individual members of minority groups, as in the case of individuals who are granted exemptions from generally applicable laws in virtue of their religious beliefs or individuals who seek language accommodations in education and in voting. Other group-differentiated rights are held by the group qua group rather by its members severally; such rights are properly called “group rights,” as in the case of indigenous groups and minority nations, who claim the right of self-determination. In the latter respect, multiculturalism is closely allied with nationalism.

Multiculturalism is part of a broader political movement for greater inclusion of marginalized groups, including African Americans, women, LGBTQ people, and people with disabilities (Glazer 1997, Hollinger 1995, Taylor 1992). This broader political movement is reflected in the “multiculturalism” debates in the 1980s over whether and how to diversify school curricula to recognize the achievements of historically marginalized groups. But the more specific focus of contemporary theories of multiculturalism is the recognition and inclusion of minority groups defined primarily in terms of ethnicity, nationality, and religion. The main concern of contemporary multiculturalism are immigrants who are ethnic and religious minorities (e.g. Latinx people in the U.S., Muslims in Western Europe), minority nations (e.g. the Basque, Catalans, Québécois, Welsh) and indigenous peoples (e.g. Native peoples and indigenous groups in Canada, the U.S., Australia, and New Zealand).

1. The claims of multiculturalism

Multiculturalism is closely associated with “identity politics,” “the politics of difference,” and “the politics of recognition,” all of which share a commitment to revaluing disrespected identities and changing dominant patterns of representation and communication that marginalize certain groups (Gutmann 2003, Taylor 1992, Young 1990). Multiculturalism involves not only claims of identity and culture as some critics of multiculturalism suggest. It is also a matter of economic interests and political power: it includes demands for remedying economic and political disadvantages that people suffer as a result of their marginalized group identities.

Multiculturalists take for granted that it is “culture” and “cultural groups” that are to be recognized and accommodated. Yet multicultural claims include a wide range of claims involving religion, language, ethnicity, nationality, and race. Culture is a contested, open-ended concept, and all of these categories have been subsumed by or equated with the concept of culture. Disaggregating and distinguishing among different types of claims can clarify what is at stake (Song 2008). Language and religion are at the heart of many claims for cultural accommodation by immigrants. The key claim made by minority nations is for self-government rights. Race has a more limited role in multicultural discourse. Antiracism and multiculturalism are distinct but related ideas: the former highlights “victimization and resistance” whereas the latter highlights “cultural life, cultural expression, achievements, and the like” (Blum 1992, 14). Claims for recognition in the context of multicultural education are demands not just for recognition of aspects of a group’s actual culture (e.g. African American art and literature) but also for acknowledgment of the history of group subordination and its concomitant experience (Gooding-Williams 1998).

Examples of cultural accommodations or “group-differentiated rights” include exemptions from generally applicable law (e.g. religious exemptions), assistance to do things that members of the majority culture are already enabled to do (e.g. multilingual ballots, funding for minority language schools and ethnic associations, affirmative action), representation of minorities in government bodies (e.g. ethnic quotas for party lists or legislative seats, minority-majority Congressional districts), recognition of traditional legal codes by the dominant legal system (e.g. granting jurisdiction over family law to religious courts), or limited self-government rights (e.g. qualified recognition of tribal sovereignty, federal arrangements recognizing the political autonomy of Québec) (for a helpful classification of cultural rights, see Levy 1997).

Typically, a group-differentiated right is a right of a minority group (or a member of such a group) to act or not act in a certain way in accordance with their religious obligations and/or cultural commitments. In some cases, it is a right that directly restricts the freedom of non-members in order to protect the minority group’s culture, as in the case of restrictions on the use of the English language in Québec. When the right-holder is the group, the right may protect group rules that restrict the freedom of individual members, as in the case of the Pueblo membership rule that excludes the children of women who marry outside the group. Now that you have a sense of the kinds of claims that have been made in the name of multiculturalism, we can now turn to consider different normative justifications for these claims.

2. Justifications for multiculturalism

2.1 Recognition

One justification for multiculturalism arises out of the communitarian critique of liberalism. Liberals tend to be ethical individualists; they insist that individuals should be free to choose and pursue their own conceptions of the good life. They give primacy to individual rights and liberties over community life and collective goods. Some liberals are also individualists when it comes to social ontology (what some call methodological individualism or atomism). Methodological individualists believe that you can and should account for social actions and social goods in terms of the properties of the constituent individuals and individual goods. The target of the communitarian critique of liberalism is not so much liberal ethics as liberal social ontology. Communitarians reject the idea that the individual is prior to the community and that the value of social goods can be reduced to their contribution to individual well-being. They instead embrace ontological holism, which acknowledges collective goods as, in Charles Taylor’s words, “irreducibly social”and intrinsically valuable (Taylor 1995).

An ontologically holist view of collective identities and cultures underlies Taylor’s argument for a “politics of recognition.” Drawing on Rousseau, Herder, and Hegel, among others, Taylor argues that we do not become full human agents and define our identity in isolation from others; rather, “we define our identity always in dialogue with, sometimes in struggle against, the things our significant others want to see in us” (1994, 33). Because our identities are formed dialogically, we are dependent on the recognition of others. The absence of recognition or mis-recognition can cause serious injury: “A person or a group of people can suffer real damage, real distortion, if the people or society around them mirror back to them a confining or demeaning or contemptible picture of themselves” (25). The struggle for recognition can only be satisfactorily resolved through “a regime of reciprocal recognition among equals” (50). Taylor distinguishes the politics of recognition from the traditional liberal “politics of equal respect” that is “inhospitable to difference, because (a) it insists on uniform application of the rules defining these rights, without exception, and (b) it is suspicious of collective goals” (60). By contrast, the politics of recognition is grounded on “judgments about what makes a good life—judgments in which the integrity of cultures has an important place” (61). He discusses the example of the survival of French culture in Quebec. The French language is not merely a collective resource that individuals might want to make use of and thereby seek to preserve, as suggested by a politics of equal respect. Instead, the French language is an irreducibly collective good that itself deserves to be preserved: language policies aimed at preserving the French language in Québec “actively seek to create members of the community” by assuring that future generations continue to identify as French-speakers (58). Because of the indispensable role of cultures in the development human agency and identity, Taylor argues, we should adopt the presumption of the equal worth of all cultures (66).

2.2 Equality

A second justification for multiculturalism comes from within liberalism but a liberalism that has been revised through critical engagement with the communitarian critique of liberalism. Will Kymlicka has developed the most influential liberal theory of multiculturalism by marrying the liberal values of autonomy and equality with an argument about the value of cultural membership (1989, 1995, 2001). Rather than beginning with intrinsically valuable collective goals and goods as Taylor does, Kymlicka views cultures as instrumentally valuable to individuals, for two main reasons. First, cultural membership is an important condition of personal autonomy. In his first book, Liberalism, Community, and Culture (1989), Kymlicka develops his case for multiculturalism within a Rawlsian framework of justice, viewing cultural membership as a “primary good,” things that every rational person is presumed to want and which are necessary for the pursuit of one’s goals (Rawls 1971, 62). In his later book, Multicultural Citizenship (1995), Kymlicka drops the Rawlsian scaffolding, relying instead on the work of Avishai Margalit and Joseph Raz on national self-determination (1990). One important condition of autonomy is having an adequate range of options from which to choose (Raz 1986). Cultures serve as “contexts of choice,” which provide meaningful options and scripts with which people can frame, revise, and pursue their goals (Kymlicka 1995, 89). Second, cultural membership plays an important role in people’s self-identity. Citing Margalit and Raz as well as Taylor, Kymlicka views cultural identity as providing people with an “anchor for their self-identification and the safety of effortless secure belonging” (1995, 89, quoting Margalit and Raz 1990, 448 and also citing Taylor 1992). This means there is a deep and general connection between a person’s self-respect and the respect accorded to the cultural group of which she is a part. It is not simply membership in any culture but one’s own culture that must be secured in order for cultural membership to serve as a meaningful context of choice and a basis of self-respect.

Kymlicka moves from these premises about the instrumental value of cultural membership to the egalitarian claim that because members of minority groups are disadvantaged in terms of access to their own cultures (in contrast to members of the majority culture), they are entitled to special protections. It is important to note that Kymlicka’s egalitarian argument for multiculturalism rests on a theory of equality that critics have dubbed “luck egalitarianism” (Anderson 1999, Scheffler 2003). According to luck egalitarians, individuals should be held responsible for inequalities resulting from their own choices, but not for inequalities deriving from unchosen circumstances (Dworkin 1981; Rakowski 1993). The latter inequalities are the collective responsibility of citizens to address. For example, inequalities stemming from one’s social starting position in life are unchosen yet so strongly determine our prospects in life. Luck egalitarians argue that those born into poor families are entitled to collective support and assistance via a redistributive tax scheme. Kymlicka adds cultural membership to this list of unchosen inequalities. If one is born into the dominant culture of society, one enjoys good brute luck, whereas those who belong to minority cultures suffer disadvantages in virtue of the bad brute luck of their minority status. Insofar as inequality in access to cultural membership stems from luck (as opposed to individual choices) and one suffers disadvantages as a result of it, members of minority groups can reasonably demand that members of the majority culture must share in bearing the costs of accommodation. Minority group rights are justified, as Kymlicka argues, “within a liberal egalitarian theory…which emphasizes the importance of rectifying unchosen inequalities” (Kymlicka 1995, 109).

One might question whether cultural minority groups really are “disadvantaged” and thereby, owed positive accommodations. Why not just enforce antidiscrimination laws, stopping short of any positive accommodations for minority groups? Kymlicka and other liberal theorists of multiculturalism contend that antidiscrimination laws fall short of treating members of minority groups as equals; this is because states cannot be neutral with respect to culture. In culturally diverse societies, we can easily find patterns of state support for some cultural groups over others. While states may prohibit racial discrimination and avoid official establishment of any religion, they cannot avoid establishing one language for public schooling and other state services (language being a paradigmatic marker of culture) (Kymlicka 1995, 111; Carens 2000, 77–78; Patten 2001, 693). Linguistic advantage translates into economic and political advantage since members of the dominant cultural community have a leg up in schools, the workplace, and politics. Linguistic advantage also takes a symbolic form. When state action extends symbolic affirmation to some groups and not others by adopting a particular language or by organizing the work week and public holidays around the calendar of particular religions, it has a normalizing effect, suggesting that one group’s language and customs are more valued than those of other groups.

In addition to state support of certain cultures over others, state laws may place constraints on some cultural groups over others. Consider the case of dress code regulations in public schools or the workplace. A ban on religious dress burdens religious individuals, as in the case of Simcha Goldman, a U.S. Air Force officer, who was also an ordained rabbi and wished to wear a yarmulke out of respect to an omnipresent God (Goldman v. Weinberger, 475 US 503 (1986)). The case of the French state’s ban on religious dress in public schools, which burdens Muslim girls who wish to wear headscarves to school, is another example (Bowen 2007, Laborde 2008). Religion may command that believers dress in a certain way (what Peter Jones calls an “intrinsic burden”), not that believers refrain from attending school or going to work (Jones 1994). Yet, burdens on believers do not stem from the dictates of religion alone; they also arise from the intersection of the demands of religion and the demands of the state (“extrinsic burden”). Individuals must bear intrinsic burdens themselves; bearing the burdens of the dictates of one’s faith, such as prayer, worship, and fasting, just is part of meeting one’s religious obligations. When it comes to extrinsic burdens, however, liberal multiculturalists argue that justice requires assisting cultural minorities bear the burdens of these unchosen disadvantages.

It is important to note that liberal multiculturalists distinguish among different types of groups. For instance, Kymlicka’s theory develops a typology of different groups and different types of rights for each. It offers the strongest form of group-differentiated rights—self-government rights—to indigenous peoples and national minorities for the luck egalitarian reason that their minority status is unchosen: they were coercively incorporated into the larger state. By contrast, immigrants are viewed as voluntary migrants: by choosing to migrate, they relinquished access to their native culture. Immigrant multiculturalism, what Kymlicka calls “polyethnic rights”, is understood as a demand for fairer terms of integration into the broader society through the granting of exemptions and accommodations, not a rejection of integration or a demand for collective self-determination (1995, 113–115).

2.3 Freedom from domination

Another set of arguments for multiculturalism rests on the value of freedom. Some theorists such as Phillip Pettit (1997) and Quentin Skinner (1998) have developed the idea of freedom from domination by drawing on the civic republican tradition. Building on this line of argument to argue for recognition, Frank Lovett (2009) maintains that domination presents a serious obstacle to human flourishing. In contrast to the conception of freedom as non-interference dominant in liberal theory, freedom as non-domination, drawn from the civic republic tradition, focuses on a person’s “capacity to interfere, on an arbitrary basis, in certain choices that the other is in a position to make” (Pettit 1997, 52). On this view of freedom, we can be unfree even when we are not experiencing any interference as in the case of a slave of a benevolent master. We are subject to domination to the extent that we are dependent on another person or group who can arbitrarily exercise power over us (Pettit 1997, ch. 2).

Frank Lovett has explored the implications of the value of freedom from domination for questions of multicultural accommodation (2010). He begins from the premise that freedom from domination is an important human good and that we have a prima facie obligation to reduce domination. He argues that the state should not accommodate social practices that directly involve domination. Indeed, if freedom from domination is a priority, then one should “aim to bring such practices to an end as quickly as possible, despite any subjective value they happen to have for their participants” (2010, 256). As for practices that do not involve subjecting individuals to domination, accommodation is permissible but not necessarily required. Accommodation is only required if accommodation would advance the goal of reducing domination. He discusses one stylized example based on a familiar real-world case: the practice among Muslim women and girls of wearing headscarves. Suppose, Lovett suggests, a detailed study of a particular Muslim community in a liberal democratic society is undertaken and it reveals that women’s educational and employment opportunities are discouraged, generating “severe patriarchal domination,” but the study also shows that the practice of wearing headscarves does not (2010, 258). Lovett argues that the practice of wearing headscarves should be accommodated because failure to do so might strengthen the community’s commitment to other shared practices that reinforce patriarchal domination.

A key empirical assumption here is that combating patriarchal practices within minority communities would be easier if the burdens on more benign practices, such as wearing headscarves, are lessened. Cecile Laborde’s analysis of the headscarf controversy in France provides support for this assumption: the effect of preventing Muslim girls from wearing headscarves is to encourage their parents to withdraw their daughters from civic education and send them to religious schools where they would not be exposed to the diversity of world views found in public schools. Formal restrictions on Muslim religious expression in the public sphere may make, in Laborde’s words, “members of dominated groups close ranks around the denigrated practice, precipitating a defensive retreat into conservative cultural forms and identities” (2008, 164).

Another situation in which accommodation is warranted on Lovett’s account is when individuals’ subjective attachment to particular practices makes them vulnerable to exploitation. He discusses the case of Mexican immigrant laborers with limited English language skills and limited knowledge of American laws and policies. Lovett argues that extending “special public measures,” such as exceptions to general rules and regulations and public legal assistance, is required insofar as such measures would reduce the domination of these workers (2010, 260). In contrast to the communitarian or liberal egalitarian arguments considered above, the basis for the special accommodations is not a desire to protect intrinsically valuable cultures or considerations of fairness or equality but the desire to reduce domination.

Mira Bachvarova has also argued for the merits of a non-domination-based multiculturalism as compared to liberal egalitarian approaches. Because of its focus on the arbitrary use of power and the broader structural inequalities within which groups interact, a non-domination approach may be more sensitive to power dynamics in both inter-group and intra-group relations. Also, in contrast to approaches developed out of egalitarian theories of distributive justice that focus on distributing different types of rights, a non-domination approach focuses on the “moral quality of the relationship between the central actors” and insists on continuity of treatment between and within groups (2014, 671).

2.4 Addressing historical injustice

Other theorists sympathetic to multiculturalism look beyond liberalism and republicanism, emphasizing instead the importance of grappling with historical injustice and listening to minority groups themselves. This is especially true of theorists writing from a postcolonial perspective. For example, in contemporary discussions of aboriginal sovereignty, rather than making claims based on premises about the value of Native cultures and their connection to individual members’ sense of self-worth as liberal multiculturalists have, the focus is on reckoning with history. Such proponents of indigenous sovereignty emphasize the importance of understanding indigenous claims against the historical background of the denial of equal sovereign status of indigenous groups, the dispossession of their lands, and the destruction of their cultural practices (Ivison 2006, Ivison et al. 2000, Moore 2005, Simpson 2000). This background calls into question the legitimacy of the state’s authority over aboriginal peoples and provides a prima facie case for special rights and protections for indigenous groups, including the right of self-government. Jeff Spinner-Halev has argued that the history of state oppression of a group should be a key factor in determining not only whether group rights should be extended but also whether the state should intervene in the internal affairs of the group when it discriminates against particular members of the group. For example, “when an oppressed group uses its autonomy in a discriminatory way against women it cannot simply be forced to stop this discrimination” (2001, 97). Oppressed groups that lack autonomy should be “provisionally privileged” over non-oppressed groups; this means that “barring cases of serious physical harm in the name of a group’s culture, it is important to consider some form of autonomy for the group” (2001, 97; see also Spinner-Halev 2012).

Theorists adopting a postcolonial perspective go beyond liberal multiculturalism toward the goal of developing models of constitutional and political dialogue that recognize culturally distinct ways of speaking and acting. Multicultural societies consist of diverse religious and moral outlooks, and if liberal societies are to take such diversity seriously, they must recognize that liberalism is just one of many substantive outlooks based on a specific view of man and society. Liberalism is not free of culture but expresses a distinctive culture of its own. This observation applies not only across territorial boundaries between liberal and nonliberal states, but also within liberal states and its relations with nonliteral minorities. James Tully has surveyed the language of historical and contemporary constitutionalism with a focus on Western state’s relations with Native peoples to uncover more inclusive bases for intercultural dialogue (1995). Bhikhu Parekh contends that liberal theory cannot provide an impartial framework governing relations between different cultural communities (2000). He argues instead for a more open model of intercultural dialogue in which a liberal society’s constitutional and legal values serve as the initial starting point for cross-cultural dialogue while also being open to contestation.

More recent work has emphasized the importance of developing more contextual approaches that engage with actual political struggles for recognition and give greater voice to minority groups. Through detailed examination of how national museums in Canada and the U.S. have sought to represent and recognize indigenous groups, Caitlin Tom identifies three principles for the practice of recognition: self-definition, responsiveness, and internal contestation. Whether it be museum officials seeking to exhibit the history and culture of minority groups or government officials deciding whether official apologies for historical injustices are in order, they should respect individual and collective self-definition, respond to demands for recognition on terms that align with the terms of those being recognized, and accommodate internal contestation of group meanings. As Tom argues, practices of recognition guided by these principles come closer to fostering freedom and equality of minority groups than existing approaches (2018).

3. Critique of multiculturalism

3.1 Cosmopolitan view of culture

Some critics contend that theories of multiculturalism are premised on an essentialist view of culture. Cultures are not distinct, self-contained wholes; they have long interacted and influenced one another through war, imperialism, trade, and migration. People in many parts of the world live within cultures that are already cosmopolitan, characterized by cultural hybridity. As Jeremy Waldron argues, “We live in a world formed by technology and trade; by economic, religious, and political imperialism and their offspring; by mass migration and the dispersion of cultural influences. In this context, to immerse oneself in the traditional practices of, say, an aboriginal culture might be a fascinating anthropological experiment, but it involves an artificial dislocation from what actually is going on in the world” (1995, 100). To aim at preserving or protecting a culture runs the risk of privileging one allegedly pure version of that culture, thereby crippling its ability to adapt to changes in circumstances (Waldron 1995, 110; see also Appiah 2005, Benhabib 2002, Scheffler 2007). Waldron also rejects the premise that the options available to an individual must come from a particular culture; meaningful options may come from a variety of cultural sources. What people need are cultural materials, not access to a particular cultural structure. For example, the Bible, Roman mythology, and the Grimms’ fairy tales have all influenced American culture, but these cultural sources cannot be seen as part of a single cultural structure that multiculturalists like Kymlicka aim to protect.

In response, multicultural theorists agree that cultures are overlapping and interactive, but they nonetheless maintain that individuals belong to separate societal cultures. In particular, Kymlicka has argued that while options available to people in any modern society come from a variety of ethnic and historical sources, these options become meaningful to us only if “they become part of the shared vocabulary of social life—i.e. embodied in the social practices, based on a shared language, that we are exposed to... That we learn...from other cultures, or that we borrow words from other languages, does not mean that we do not still belong to separate societal cultures, or speak different languages” (1995, 103). Liberal egalitarian defenders of multiculturalism like Kymlicka maintain that special protections for minority cultural groups still hold, even after we adopt a more cosmopolitan view of cultures, because the aim of group-differentiated rights is not to freeze cultures in place but to empower members of minority groups to continue their distinctive cultural practices so long as they wish to.

3.2 Toleration requires indifference, not accommodation

A second major criticism is aimed at liberal multicultural theories of accommodation in particular and stems from the value of freedom of association and conscience. If we take these ideas seriously and accept both ontological and ethical individualism as discussed above, then we are led to defend not special protections for groups but the individual’s right to form and leave associations. As Chandran Kukathas (1995, 2003) argues, there are no group rights, only individual rights. By granting cultural groups special protections and rights, the state oversteps its role, which is to secure civility, and risks undermining individual rights of association. States should not pursue “cultural integration” or “cultural engineering” but rather a “politics of indifference” toward minority groups (2003, 15).

One limitation of such a laissez-faire approach is that groups that do not themselves value toleration and freedom of association, including the right to dissociate or exit a group, may practice internal discrimination against group members, and the state would have little authority to interfere in such associations. A politics of indifference would permit the abuse of vulnerable members of groups (discussed below in 3.6), tolerating, in Kukathas’s words, “communities which bring up children unschooled and illiterate; which enforce arranged marriages; which deny conventional medical care to their members (including children); and which inflict cruel and ‘unusual’ punishment” (Kukathas 2003, 134). To embrace such a state of affairs would be to abandon the values of autonomy and equality, values that many liberals take to be fundamental to any liberalism worth its name.

3.3 Diversion from a “politics of redistribution”

A third challenge to multiculturalism views it as a form of a “politics of recognition” that diverts attention from a “politics of redistribution.” We can distinguish analytically between these modes of politics: a politics of recognition challenges status inequality and the remedy it seeks is cultural and symbolic change, whereas a politics of redistribution challenges economic inequality and exploitation and the remedy it seeks is economic restructuring (Fraser 1997, Fraser and Honneth 2003). Working class mobilization tilts toward the redistribution end of the spectrum, and claims for exemption from generally applicable laws and the movement for same-sex marriage are on the recognition end. In the U.S. critics who view themselves as part of the “progressive left” worry that the rise of the “cultural left” with its emphasis on multiculturalism and difference turns the focus away from struggles for economic justice (Gitlin 1995, Rorty 1999). Critics in the United Kingdom and Europe have also expressed concern about the effects of multiculturalism on social trust and public support for economic redistribution (Barry 2001, Miller 2006, van Parijs 2004). Phillipe van Parijs invited scholars to consider the proposition, “Other things being equal, the more cultural... homogeneity within the population of a defined territory, the better the prospects in terms of economic solidarity” (2004, 8).

There are two distinct concerns here. The first is that the existence of racial and ethnic diversity reduces social trust and solidarity, which in turn undermines public support for policies that involve economic redistribution. For example, Robert Putnam argues that the decline in social trust and civic participation in the U.S. is strongly correlated with racial and ethnic diversity (2007). Rodney Hero has shown that the greater the racial and ethnic heterogeneity in a state, the more restrictive state-level welfare programs are (Hero 1998, Hero and Preuhs 2007). Cross-national analyses suggest that differences in racial diversity explain a significant part of the reason why the U.S. has not developed a European-style welfare state (Alesina and Glaeser 2004). The second concern is that multiculturalism policies themselves undermine the welfare-state by heightening the salience of racial and ethnic differences among groups and undermining a sense of common national identity that is viewed as necessary for a robust welfare state (Barry 2001, Gitlin 1995, Rorty 1999).

In response, theorists of multiculturalism have called for and collaborated on more empirical research of these purported trade-offs. With respect to the first concern about the tension between diversity and redistribution, Kymlicka and Banting question the generalizability of the empirical evidence that is largely drawn from research either on Africa, where the weakness of state institutions has meant no usable traditions or institutional capacity for dealing with diversity, or on the U.S., where racial inequality has been shaped by centuries of slavery and segregation. Where many minority groups are newcomers and where state institutions are strong, the impact of increasing diversity may be quite different (Kymlicka and Banting 2006, 287). Barbara Arneil has also challenged Putnam’s social capital thesis, arguing that participation in civil society has changed, not declined, largely as a result of mobilization among cultural minorities and women seeking greater inclusion and equality (Arneil 2006a). She argues that it is not diversity itself that leads to changes in trust and civic engagement but the politics of diversity, i.e. how different groups respond to and challenge the norms governing their society. The central issue, then, is not to reduce diversity but to determine principles and procedures by which differences are renegotiated in the name of justice (Arneil and MacDonald 2010).

As for the second concern about the tradeoff between recognition and redistribution, the evidence upon which early redistributionist critics such as Barry and Rorty relied was speculative and conjectural. Recent cross-national research suggests that there is no evidence of a systematic tendency for multiculturalism policies to weaken the welfare state (Banting et al. 2006). Irene Bloemraad’s comparative study of immigrant integration in Canada and the U.S. offers support for the view that not only is there no trade-off between multiculturalism and the welfare-state but multiculturalism policies can actually increase attention and resources devoted to redistributive policies. She finds that Canada’s multiculturalism policies, which provide immigrants with a variety of services in their native languages and encourage them to preserve their cultural traditions even as they become Canadian citizens, are the main reason why the naturalization rate among permanent residents in Canada is twice that of permanent residents in the U.S. Multiculturalists agree more empirical research is needed, but they nonetheless maintain that redistribution and recognition are not either/or propositions. Both are important dimensions in the pursuit of equality for minority groups. In practice, both redistribution and recognition—responding to material disadvantages and marginalized identities and statuses—are required to achieve greater equality across lines of race, ethnicity, nationality, religion, sexuality, and class, not least because many individuals stand at the intersection of these different categories and suffer multiple forms of marginalization. A politics of recognition is important not only on account of its effects on socioeconomic status and political participation but also for the sake of full inclusion of members of marginalized groups as equal citizens.

3.4 Universalist ideal of equality

A fourth objection takes issue with liberal multiculturalist’s understanding of what equality requires. Brian Barry defends a universalist ideal of equality, in contrast to the group-differentiated ideal of equality defended by Kymlicka. Barry argues that religious and cultural minorities should be held responsible for bearing the consequences of their own beliefs and practices, just as members of the dominant culture are held responsible for bearing the consequences of their beliefs. He does think that special accommodations are owed to people with disabilities, but he believes religious and cultural affiliations are different from physical disabilities: the former do not constrain people in the way that physical disabilities do. A physical disability supports a strong prima facie claim to compensation because it limits a person’s opportunities to engage in activities that others are able to engage in. In contrast, religion and culture may shape one’s willingness to seize an opportunity, but they do not affect whether one has an opportunity. Barry argues that egalitarian justice is only concerned with ensuring a reasonable range of equal opportunities, not with ensuring equal access to any particular choices or outcomes (2001, 37). When it comes to cultural and religious affiliations, they do not limit the range of opportunities one enjoys but rather the choices one can make within the set of opportunities available to all.

In reply, one might agree that opportunities are not objective in the strong physicalist sense suggested by Barry. But the opportunity to do X is not just having the possibility to do X without facing physical encumbrances; it is also the possibility of doing X without incurring excessive costs or the risk of such costs (Miller 2002, 51). State law and cultural commitments can conflict in ways such that the costs for cultural minorities of taking advantage of the opportunity are prohibitively high. In contrast to Barry, liberal multiculturalists argue that many cases where a law or policy disparately impacts a religious or cultural practice constitute injustice. For instance, Kymlicka points to the Goldman case (discussed above) and other religion cases, as well as to claims for language rights, as examples in which group-differentiated rights are required in light of the differential impact of state action (1995, 108–115). His argument is that since the state cannot achieve complete disestablishment of culture or be neutral with respect to culture, it must somehow make it up to citizens who are bearers of minority religious beliefs and native speakers of other languages. Because complete state disestablishment of culture is not possible, one way to ensure fair background conditions is to provide roughly comparable forms of assistance or recognition to each of the various languages and religions of citizens. To do nothing would be to permit injustice.

3.5 Postcolonial critique

Some postcolonial theorists are critical of multiculturalism and the contemporary politics of recognition for reinforcing, rather than transforming, structures of colonial domination in relations between settler states and indigenous communities. Focusing on Taylor’s theory of the politics of recognition, Glen Coulthard has argued that “instead of ushering in an era of peaceful coexistence grounded on the Hegelian idea of reciprocity, the politics of recognition in its contemporary form promises to reproduce the very configurations of colonial power that indigenous peoples’ demands for recognition have historically sought to transcend” (2007, 438–9; see also Coulthard 2014). There are several elements to Coulthard’s critique. First, he argues that the politics of recognition, through its focus on reformist state redistributionist schemes like granting cultural rights and concessions to aboriginal communities, affirms rather than challenges the political economy of colonialism. In this regard, the politics of recognition reveals itself to be a variant of liberalism, which “fails to confront the structural/economic aspects of colonialism at its generative roots” (2007, 446). Second, the contemporary politics of recognition toward indigenous communities rests on a flawed sociological assumption: that both parties engaged in the struggle for recognition are mutually dependent on one another’s acknowledgement for their freedom and self-worth. Yet, no such mutual dependency exists in actual relations between nation-states and indigenous communities: “the master—that is, the colonial state and state society—does not require recognition from the previously self-determining communities upon which its territorial, economic, and social infrastructure is constituted” (451). Third, Coulthard argues that true emancipation for the colonized cannot occur without struggle and conflict that “serves as the mediating force through which the colonized come to shed their colonial identities” (449). He employs Frantz Fanon to argue that the road to true self-determination for the oppressed lies in self-affirmation: rather than depending on their oppressors for their freedom and self-worth, “the colonized must initiate the process of decolonization by recognizing themselves as free, dignified and distinct contributors to humanity” (454). This means that indigenous peoples should “collectively redirect our struggles away from a politics that seeks to attain a conciliatory form of settler-state recognition for Indigenous nations toward a resurgent politics of recognition premised on self-actualization, direct action, and the resurgence of cultural practices that are attentive to the subjective and structural composition of settler-colonial power” (2014, 24).

Taylor, Kymlicka, and other proponents of the contemporary politics of recognition might agree with Coulthard that self-affirmation by oppressed groups is critical for true self-determination and freedom of indigenous communities, but such self-affirmation need not be viewed as mutually exclusive from state efforts to extend institutional accommodations. State recognition of self-government rights and other forms of accommodation are important steps toward rectifying historical injustices and transforming structural inequalities between the state and indigenous communities. Coulthard’s analysis redirects attention to the importance of evaluating and challenging the structural and psycho-affective dimensions of colonial domination, but by arguing that indigenous peoples should “turn away” (2007, 456) from settler-states and settler societies may play into the neoliberal turn toward the privatization of dependency and to risk reinforcing the marginalization of indigenous communities at a time when economic and other forms of state support may be critical to the survival of indigenous communities.

3.6 Feminist critique of multiculturalism

The set of critiques that has ignited perhaps the most intense debate about multiculturalism argues that extending protections to minority groups may come at the price of reinforcing oppression of vulnerable members of those groups—what some have called the problem of “internal minorities” or “minorities within minorities” (Green 1994, Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005). Multicultural theorists have tended to focus on inequalities between groups in arguing for special protections for minority groups, but group-based protections can exacerbate inequalities within minority groups. This is because some ways of protecting minority groups from oppression by the majority may make it more likely that more powerful members of those groups are able to undermine the basic liberties and opportunities of vulnerable members. Vulnerable subgroups within minority groups include religious dissenters, sexual minorities, women, and children. A group’s leaders may exaggerate the degree of consensus and solidarity within their group to present a united front to the wider society and strengthen their case for accommodation.

Some of the most oppressive group norms and practices revolve around issues of gender and sexuality, and it is feminist critics who first called attention to potential tensions between multiculturalism and feminism (Coleman 1996, Okin 1999, Shachar 2000). These tensions constitute a genuine dilemma if one accepts both that group-differentiated rights for minority cultural groups are justifiable, as multicultural theorists do, and that gender equality is an important value, as feminists have emphasized. Extending special protections and accommodations to minority groups engaged in patriarchal practices may help reinforce gender inequality within these communities. Examples that have been analyzed in the scholarly literature include conflicts over arranged marriage, the ban on headscarves, the use of “cultural defenses” in criminal law, accommodating religious law or customary law within dominant legal systems, and self-government rights for indigenous communities that reinforce the inequality of women.

These feminist objections are especially troublesome for liberal egalitarian defenders of multiculturalism who wish to promote not only inter-group equality but also intra-group equality, including gender equality. In response, Kymlicka (1999) has emphasized the similarities between multiculturalism and feminism: both aim at a more inclusive conception of justice, and both challenge the traditional liberal assumption that equality requires identical treatment. To address the concern about multicultural accommodations exacerbating intra-group inequality, Kymlicka distinguishes between two kinds of group rights: “external protections” are rights that a minority group claims against non-members in order to reduce its vulnerability to the economic and political power of the larger society, whereas “internal restrictions” are rights that a minority group claims against its own members. He argues that a liberal theory of minority group rights defends external protections while rejecting internal restrictions (1995, 35–44;1999, 31).

But many feminist critics have emphasized, granting external protections to minority groups may sometimes come at the price of internal restrictions. They may be different sides of the same coin: for example, respecting the self-government rights of Native communities may entail permitting sexually discriminatory membership rules enacted by the leaders of those communities. Whether multiculturalism and feminism can be reconciled within liberal theory depends in part on the empirical premise that groups that seek group-differentiated rights do not support patriarchal norms and practices. If they do, liberal multiculturalists would in principle have to argue against extending the group right or extending it with certain qualifications, such as conditioning the extension of self-government rights to Native peoples on the acceptance of a constitutional bill of rights.

There has been a wave of feminist responses to the problem of vulnerable internal minorities that is sympathetic to both multiculturalism and feminism (see, e.g., Arneil 2006b, Deveaux 2006, Eisenberg 2003, Lépinard 2011, Phillips 2007, Shachar 2001, Song 2007, Volpp 2000). Some feminists have emphasized the importance of moving away from essentialist notions of culture and reductive views of members of minority groups as incapable of meaningful agency (Phillips 2007, Volpp 2000). Other feminists have sought to shift the emphasis from liberal rights towards more democratic approaches. Liberal theorists have tended to start from the question of whether and how minority cultural practices should be tolerated or accommodated in accordance with liberal principles, whereas democratic theorists foreground the role of democratic deliberation and ask how affected parties understand the contested practice. By drawing on the voices of affected parties and giving special weight to the voice of women at the center of gendered cultural conflicts, deliberation can clarify the interests at stake and enhance the legitimacy of responses to cultural conflicts (Benhabib 2002, Deveaux 2006, Song 2007). Deliberation also provides opportunities for minority group members to expose instances of cross-cultural hypocrisy and to consider whether and how the norms and institutions of the larger society, whose own struggles for gender equality are incomplete and ongoing, may reinforce rather than challenge sexist practices within minority groups (Song 2005). There is contestation over what constitutes subordination and how best to address it, and intervention into minority cultural groups without the participation of minority women themselves fails to respect their freedom and is not likely to serve their interests.

4. Political retreat from multiculturalism?

The biggest challenge to multiculturalism today may not be philosophical but political: a political retreat or backlash against immigrant multiculturalism in particular. Some scholars have diagnosed a “retreat” from multiculturalism in Europe and Australia, which they attribute to a lack of public support based partly on the limited success of such policies to foster the integration of minorities (Joppke 2004, McGhee 2008). But other scholars argue there is lack of evidence of any such retreat. Based on their analysis of British policies, Varun Uberoi and Tariq Modood find that legal exemptions for minority religious practices, anti-discrimination measures, and multicultural education policies remain in place, and there is no country-wide evidence suggesting that public services are no longer delivered in different languages (2013, 134). Further research is needed on whether and why there has been a retreat from multiculturalism policies.

Perhaps the claim about a “retreat” from multiculturalism has less to do with any actual changes in state policies and more with concerns about lack of social unity and increasing tensions among diverse groups in liberal democratic societies and the sense that multiculturalism is somehow to blame. Consider then-Prime Minister David Cameron’s 2011 speech: “Under the doctrine of state multiculturalism, we have encouraged different cultures to live separate lives, apart from each other and apart from the mainstream. We’ve failed to provide a vision of society to which they [young Muslims] feel they want to belong” (Cameron 2011). According to Cameron, multiculturalism stands for separation and division, not integration and unity. But the survey of different theories of multiculturalism above demonstrates that most theories of immigrant multiculturalism do not aim at separation but rather devising fairer terms of inclusion for religious and cultural minorities into mainstream society (Kymlicka 1995).

Going forward, public debate about immigrant multiculturalism should be pursued in a broader context that considers the politics of immigration, race, religion, and national security. Multiculturalism may become an easy rhetorical scapegoat for public fear and anxiety whenever national security is seen to be threatened and when economic conditions are bad. In Europe, concerns about the radicalization of Muslim minorities have become central to public debates about immigration and multiculturalism. This was especially true in the face of the European migration crisis as over a million people fleeing war and violence in Syria, Iraq, and elsewhere made perilous journeys by sea and land into Europe. This crisis tapped into fears about terrorism and security, especially after the November 2015 Paris and July 2016 Nice attacks; it also renewed concerns about the limits of past efforts to integrate newcomers and their descendants. Evidence from across Europe suggests that Muslims are struggling to succeed in education and the labor market in comparison to other religious and cultural minorities (Givens 2007).

Socioeconomic and political marginalization interacts with immigrants’ own sense of belonging: it is hard to imagine newcomers feeling integrated before they make significant steps toward socioeconomic integration. Integration is a two-way street: not only must immigrants work to integrate themselves, but the state itself must make accommodations to facilitate integration, as many multicultural theorists have emphasized. As Cecile Laborde observes, North African youth in France are “routinely blamed for not being integrated,” but this blame “confuses French society’s institutional responsibility to integrate immigrants with immigrants’ personal failure to integrate into society” (Laborde 2008, 208). The challenge of integrating immigrants has been heightened by increasing public acceptability of expressions of anti-Muslim sentiment. The rise of far-right political parties and their anti-Muslim publicity campaigns, coupled with the media’s willingness to report, often uncritically, their positions damage the prospects for integrating Muslims in Europe (Lenard 2010, 311). Muslim political leaders report that it is “part of mainstream public dialogue” to refer to the “menace of foreign cultures and the threat posed by immigrants in general, and Muslims in particular, to social solidarity and cultural homogeneity” (Klausen 2005, 123). Muslims have been, in Laborde’s words, “reduced to their presumed identity, culture, or religion, and consequently stigmatized as immigrant, Arab, or Muslim” (2008, 17). The challenges posed by integrating Muslims are thought to be more complex than the challenges of integrating earlier waves of immigrants, but as Patti Lenard argues, this alleged complexity derives from the simplistic and unfair elision between Islamic fundamentalism and the vast majority of Muslim minorities in Europe who desire integration on fairer terms of the sort that multiculturalists defend (Lenard 2010, 318).

In light of these concerns with immigrant multiculturalism, multicultural theorists need to continue to make the case that the ideal of multicultural citizenship stands for fairer terms of integration, not separation and division, and offer answers to questions such as: Why is multicultural citizenship more desirable than the traditional liberal ideal of common citizenship based on a uniform set of rights and opportunities for everyone? Are multiculturalism policies actually fostering greater integration of immigrants and their descendants? How should we think about the relationship between multiculturalism and struggles to address inequalities based on race, indigeneity, class, gender, sexuality, and disability? It is also important to study the development of multiculturalism beyond the West, including whether and how Western theories and practices of multiculturalism have traveled and been incorporated. For example, what lessons have states that only recently opened up to significant immigration, such as South Korea, drawn from the experiences of other states, and what sorts of multiculturalism policies have they adopted and why? (Lie 2014)


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