Supplement to Neo-Kantianism

Philosophy of Mathematics in the Marburg School

The distinctive Marburg philosophy of mathematics has its origins in Cohen’s Kant’s Theory of Experience (1885, esp. Ch.5 and Ch.12, §I), where Cohen gives a response to Helmholtz’s philosophy of geometry. Helmholtz (1868, 1878) had argued that, though the representation of space is a priori, the axioms of Euclidean geometry are not, since (he argued) empirical research on the human sensory system shows that we always process sensations spatially, but that it is possible for us to experience a non-Euclidean world. Space is innate, but the axiom of parallels is not. Cohen argued that Helmholtz was operating with a faulty conception of the a priori. On his preferred “transcendental” conception of the a priori (see section 2.1), the axioms of geometry are in fact a priori, since they are necessary premises in mathematical natural science; whether or not they are psychologically necessary is simply irrelevant (Cohen 1885: 226–238). (Of course, mathematical physics could be revised over time, and then we would no longer hold that Euclid’s axioms are a priori, but this only illustrates the revisability of the a priori, and is not unique to geometry.) Helmholtz had sought to analyze the representation of space as it arises in perceptual psychology, which he took to be prior to and independent of the representation of space in physics. Cohen argues that this is a mistake. Since geometry concerns determinate magnitudes in space, it requires not only the pure form of space, but also the categories, which have to be schematized in time. Geometry thus requires time, and so uses the very same concept of space that is utilized in physics (i.e., in kinematics). The upshot of this is that (pace Helmholtz and others), there cannot be a clean distinction between pure and applied mathematics:

by means of this explicit and repeated emphasis on the necessity of producing space in successive synthesis, the dialectical opposition between applied and pure mathematics is now, from a transcendental point of view, dissolved. (1885 [NKR: 114 =420 in 1885 edition] Ch.12, §I)

To argue otherwise is to fall into “dogmatic realism”, where mathematics is true of platonic objects independent of the empirical world.

Cohen’s philosophy of mathematics is presented systematically in his Principle of the Infinitesimal Method (1883). The topic of the book is the old problem of the conceptual foundations of the calculus. Cohen advocates for infinitesimal methods over limit methods, despite the widespread philosophical view that infinitesimals are incoherent. Through a detailed history of the development of the calculus from Leibniz to the present day, Cohen argues that the calculus originated in problems from physics, not in problems in pure mathematics. Finite spatial magnitudes (which, in Kantian terminology, he calls “extensive magnitudes”) are generated from infinitesimals (which in Kantian terminology he calls “intensive magnitudes”). Echoing Kant’s “Anticipations of Perception”, Cohen argues that infinitesimals are the “real”, which he interprets as the feature of empirical objects that corresponds to sensation. Because infinitesimals are the real, and they generate all finite magnitudes, he also calls them the “origin”.

Cohen’s defense of infinitesimals was wildly unpopular with philosophers and mathematicians, both because it defends infinitesimals at exactly the time when a consensus of mathematicians was forming for limit methods, and because of its unusual mix of highly abstract philosophical argumentation and history of mathematics. But it is important to see the real philosophical advantages that Cohen derived from it. First, his historical argument that infinitesimals arose as a response to problems in physics prevents a clean distinction between pure and applied calculus, and since he argues that all magnitudes are generated through infinitesimals, he can extend this argument against the pure/applied mathematics distinction more generally. Second, since a differential is like a “law” from which one can generate a curve, Cohen is reinforcing the distinctly Marburg view that objecthood depends on laws (section 2.2) when he argues that the differential is the real from which all magnitudes are generated. Third, the apparently paradoxical nature of infinitesimals—how they seem to violate our everyday conception of magnitudes, how far they differ from our ordinary conception of physical things—simply reinforces Cohen’s idealism by showing the necessity of “ideal” elements in experience. Fourth, the claim that the real that corresponds to sensation is itself “ideal” and that finite magnitudes are “generated” from these “ideal” elements, accords with the Marburg rejection of the given. If anything were given in experience, it would be the real—the simple elements that correspond to sensation. But if even infinitesimals are more “intellectual” than “sensible”, this surely undercuts the idea that there is a kind of content derived from sensibility independently of the understanding.

The style of argumentation of Principle of the Infinitesimal Method—with its mix of detailed history of mathematics, analysis of contemporary mathematics, and abstract philosophical argumentation—became the paradigm for the Marburg School. But its defense of infinitesimals did not. Both Natorp and Cassirer gave detailed and sustained defenses of a philosophy of mathematics that they felt was truer to the contemporary mathematical work of Weiserstrass, Dedekind, Cantor, Frege, and Russell: logicism. In fact, in Cassirer’s review (1907b) of Russell’s Principles of Mathematics (1903), he argued that logicism was now simply a proven mathematical fact. Given the widespread philosophical view that logicism and Kantianism are opposed philosophies of mathematics, it is surprising that Marburg Neo-Kantians endorsed logicism. However, as Natorp (1910: Ch.1) argued, logicism is what Kant’s philosophy of mathematics becomes when one rejects (i) the distinction between thinking and intuiting, understanding and sensibility (section 2.2), and (ii) the distinction between formal and transcendental logic (see the supplement, Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School). Since mathematics is necessary for formulating the laws of nature, which (on the Marburg view) make objective validity possible, the concepts and principles of mathematics are part of (transcendental, but not formal) logic.

For Natorp and Cassirer, number is purely intellectual and independent of space and time (Natorp 1910: Ch.3). In particular, Cassirer and Natorp applauded Frege’s Foundations of Arithmetic (1884) for decisively refuting empiricist, psychologist, and formalist philosophies of mathematics. But they disagreed with Frege and Russell in a few key respects. First, they did not think that Frege and Russell had an acceptable philosophy of logic (see the supplement, Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School), and for this reason they felt that Frege and Russell lapsed into an unacceptable “metaphysical” platonism, which left an unbridgeable gap between the empirical world and pure mathematics. Second, they did not believe that logicism required grounding arithmetic in set theory. In general, they believed that the appeal of set theory derived from a faulty view of knowledge. Sets are formed from concepts, and so presuppose the ability to subsume particulars under concepts. But, on the Marburg view, the application of concepts to particulars objectifies the representation of the particulars, and so set theory presupposes (but does not explain) the capacity for objective validity. Objective validity is derived from the subsumption of phenomena under laws, and laws are mathematical. So any attempt to found mathematics in set theory is epistemologically circular, presupposing the possibility of objective validity that it is supposed to explain. Natorp’s alternative logicism about number started with the idea that thinking is fundamentally relating: relating phenomena to one another into that unity under laws that makes objective validity possible. Numbers are then expressions of relations, and their function in knowledge is to order phenomena. The “structuralist” flavor of this position was developed self-consciously and systematically in Cassirer 1910, which argues that all mathematical objects are purely structural, in the sense that all of their properties are relational properties to other mathematical objects. (As Cassirer recognized, this kind of logicism is closer to Dedekind’s than Frege’s or Russell’s.)

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeremy Heis <>

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