Supplement to Neo-Kantianism

Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School

According to Cohen and his followers, logic is distinct from and independent of psychology (Cohen 1883: §6). The confusion of logic and psychology, they argue, makes objectivity and thus knowledge itself impossible, since logic is concerned with what is objective and psychology concerns the subjective (see the supplement, Philosophy of Psychology in the Marburg School). Psychology concerns itself with the acts of thinking, but logic is concerned with the content, and the content of thinking is not a product of the thinker who thinks it (Natorp 1887: §3). If logic were a part of psychology or dependent on it, then it couldn’t be general, but this is contrary to logic’s character as the science of the laws of all thinking (Natorp 1887: §3). Indeed, the dependence of logic on psychology would have the absurd consequence that the other special sciences would have to consult results of psychology in order to know what is true.

The prescribed cure for psychologism, not surprisingly, is adherence to the transcendental method. Logic done according to this method is “transcendental logic”—indeed, for Cohen and his followers theoretical philosophy is transcendental logic, the study of those features of the method and content of science that make it possible. Transcendental logic, then, is “critique of knowledge”, or methodology of the sciences. Though “transcendental logic” is of course a Kantian phrase, it is important to recognize that the Marburg philosophers depart self-consciously from Kant’s philosophy of logic. Kant distinguishes “transcendental logic”, which identifies the a priori concepts and principles that make experience possible, from “formal logic”, which gives the rules of the operation of the understanding, abstracting completely from sensibility. Formal logic is “formal”, then, because it abstracts from all content, which for Kant is always supplied by sensibility (Kant 1781/7: A50-57/B74-82). Now, according to the transcendental method, the only way that a philosopher can discern the rules of the operation of the understanding is by reflecting on the concrete sciences, that is, by doing transcendental logic. The upshot, then, is that formal logic depends on transcendental logic (Cohen 1885: 241–2, 269, 408 (=108 in NKR); Cohen 1902: 60, §12; Natorp 1887: §1). In fact, as Cohen and Natorp developed their mature attack on the given (see section 2.2), they came to question the distinction between sensibility and understanding that Kant’s distinction between formal and transcendental logic employed. In (Cohen 1883: 102, §4), he still distinguished between formal logic and the theory of knowledge (that is, transcendental logic); but by 1902, he had come to reject

that tiresome distinction between a formal and a material [sachliche] logic; let the latter be now metaphysic, critique of cognition, or even the methodology of the sciences that is incorporated into them. What is not material is also not formal. (1902: 500–1; cf. Natorp 1911: 45)

The laws of so-called “formal” logic, such as the principles of contradiction and excluded middle, are arrived at in the same way as the laws of “transcendental” logic, such as the principle of causality: by reflecting on the content of the concrete sciences. And they have the same status: they are a priori conditions of the possibility of science. Formal logic, at best, is an abstraction from transcendental logic. This philosophy of logic has some interesting consequences. First, formal logic is in principle revisable, since it is an abstraction from transcendental logic, which must evolve as science does. Second, the laws of logic are not certain, since our access to them is through reflection on the sciences, which are themselves not certain (see section 2.3).

Natorp (1910: Ch.1, §§1–3; 1911: 44–6; 1912a: 181–2) and Cassirer (1907b: 1910) opposed their philosophy of logic to that found in Frege and Russell (Heis 2010). Cassirer (1907b) especially was a strong proponent of the new logic of Frege and Russell, and argued forcefully for its philosophical significance (see the supplement, Philosophy of Mathematics in the Marburg School). But they demurred at the philosophy of logic that Frege and Russell attached to their powerful technical tool (Cassirer 1907b: §VI). How do we know that the logical laws are true? How do we know that the concepts that they isolate are the fundamental concepts of logic, and how do they know that their basic laws are in fact properly basic (Natorp 1910: §3)? In virtue of what do the logical laws have content, as opposed to being just empty symbols? Why can we be sure that these laws will apply to the objects of experience? These questions motivate a philosophical project: “a new task begins at the very point where logistic leaves off” (Cassirer 1907b: 44). Satisfying answers to these questions cannot be obtained by appealing to the generality of logic (even if logical laws and concepts are general, we still need to know why they are general), nor its self evidence. Natorp (1910: §3) argues that there are then only three options left: formalism (the view that logical symbols are just symbols and have no meaning), the regressive method (we posit laws in a semi-inductive way until we find principles that are sufficient to infer all the truths we want proved), or the Marburg view (that logic is grounded in the most general form of experience). Formalism, besides being incompatible with Frege’s and Russell’s intentions, fails to explain how logic is applicable. And the bare positing required by the regressive method is only justified if formalism is true, since one cannot just posit that meaningful sentences are true. The only alternative left is the Marburg view. Logic is applicable to experience because its laws are discovered in an analysis of our empirical knowledge in science; it has content because its laws are parts of the content of science; we have no reason to doubt its truth since it is a part of science, and we treating science non-skeptically as a fact; and we have (admittedly fallible) reason to believe that its laws are basic because we have arrived at them as part of a comprehensive analysis of science and the conditions of its objective validity.

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeremy Heis <>

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