Notes to Neo-Kantianism

1. There were, of course, other members of the two schools. For reasons of space, this article covers only Cohen, Natorp, Cassirer, Windelband, Rickert, and Lask.

2. Please note that this article concerns what might be called “classical” Neo-Kantianism: the self-identified philosophical schools of late nineteenth and early twentieth century Germany centered around Marburg and southwestern Germany. Many philosophers are “neo-Kantian” in the broader sense that they draw significant inspiration from aspects of Kant’s philosophy: for instance, earlier nineteenth century philosophers such as Herbart or Schopenhauer were neo-Kantian in this broad sense, as were other philosophers contemporary with the classical Neo-Kantians—for instance, Hans Vaihinger or Wilhelm Dilthey in Germany, Alois Riehl in Austria, Émile Boutroux or Léon Brunschvicg in France, and Robert Adamson or T.H. Green in Britain. There are principled reasons, articulated in section 1 of this article, for distinguishing the classical Neo-Kantians of the Marburg and SW schools from “neo-Kantians” in this broader sense. An article on neo-Kantianism in this broad sense would almost constitute a complete history of philosophy from Kant up into the twentieth century.

3. Indeed, as Friedman (2000) argues, Neo-Kantianism is the common root out of which both the so-called “analytic” and “continental” traditions grew.

4. Though the Southwest and Marburg Neo-Kantians did not initially present themselves as part of a common movement, this tendency softened among “third generation” Neo-Kantians, i.e., the Neo-Kantians contemporary with Cassirer and Lask. For instance, the Neo-Kantians Bruno Bauch, Jonas Cohn, and Richard Hönigswald all freely borrowed from both schools and did not emphasize the differences between the schools so strongly.

5. Citing the writings of the Neo-Kantians presents some serious challenges, since few of the key works have been translated in full into English, and many of these works went through many editions, which often differ significantly from one another. To address these difficulties, the following conventions are adopted. Whenever possible, passages are cited by section number or chapter (which are usually common between editions) instead of by page number. When citing page numbers, citations are from English translations whenever an English translation is listed in Bibliography. Otherwise, the page citation is to the original language edition cited in the Bibliography (unless an original language passage is being cited that is not translated in the listed translation: such cases are noted as they arise). Translations are from the cited translations, unless otherwise noted. Whenever possible, texts with English translations are referenced over texts that currently lack English translations, in order to aid the Anglophone reader. In particular, this entry aims to refer as much as possible to English-language editions that are widely available, such as the texts collected in the Neo-Kantian Reader [abbreviation: NKR] (Luft 2015).

6. As Neo-Kantians were quick to point out, this is just Kant’s old point: there is a difference between a question of fact (quid facti) and a question of justification (quid juris), between an empirical deduction that shows how we humans come to acquire some representation and transcendental deduction that shows its justification (Kant 1781/7: A84-5/B116-7). (Citations to Kant 1781/87 are according to the pagination in the first (“A”) and second (“B”) edition. Page references to Kant’s other works are to the pagination in the Akademie [Ak] edition: Kant 1902–.)

7. In this respect, the Neo-Kantians followed the lead of Kant himself. In the first Critique, Kant himself characterized mathematics not in terms of its object (number and extensive magnitude), but in terms of its method (the construction of concepts). In the third Critique, Kant claims that biology is unique because of its method: the use of teleological judgments. And according to the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, physics is distinctive because it delivers properly scientific knowledge by allowing for the right kind of application of mathematics.

8. In this way, again, they were following Kant, whose argument in the first Critique for the objective validity of the categories utilized a more general account of the objective validity of all knowledge.

9. After his retirement from Marburg in 1912, Cohen wrote a series of books in the philosophy of religion, articulating a vision of Judaism as a “religion of reason”, an “ethical monotheism”. Cohen’s book The Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Monotheism (1919) is perhaps the most significant book in Jewish thought written in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, and is surely (in terms of intellectual and real world impact) the most significant book produced by the Marburg Neo-Kantians. But its relations to the core doctrines of the Marburg school are indirect, and so it is not discussed in this article.

10. The academic fate of the Marburg School, unfortunately, was significantly impacted by the rising tide of German anti-Semitism. Cohen was an observant Jew, and his promotion in Marburg in 1876 was made possible by a brief window of tolerance in German politics. The Marburg School was often subjected to thinly-veiled, and often even overt, anti-Semitic attacks. As institutional anti-Semitism hardened, Cohen had more difficulty placing his students, to the point that Cassirer had to struggle to find an institution that would accept his two volume Problem of Knowledge as a Habilitation. He eventually habilitated in Berlin, but was prevented from holding a professorship until after the war, when official discrimination was lessened in the Weimar Republic. (Because Cassirer was unable to hold a professorship, Hans Reichenbach, who took courses with him and always considered him his teacher, was forced to officially submit his dissertation under a different supervisor outside of Berlin.) Cassirer finally held a position in Hamburg in 1919, and indeed was the rector of the university in 1929–30, the first Jewish rector of a German university. But all of this collapsed in 1933 when Hitler was appointed Chancellor, and Cassirer was forced to flee the country.

11. In keeping with the Marburg tendency, the progressive development of culture is understood very abstractly, and not as historical or temporal. Natorp’s model is the progression from a number to its successor in the natural number sequence: the progression is not temporal or arbitrary, but is grounded in a law, i.e., the axioms of arithmetic (1910: Ch.1, §5).

12. There are a few reasons for this distinctive method. First, the transcendental method requires an initial stage of “data collection”, in which the goal is to lay out the detailed, concrete features of some area of culture, along with its historical development. To give systematic philosophical theories without first canvassing the history of the topic would amount to trying to carry out the second step of the transcendental method without the first. Second, the transcendental method prescribes that philosophical reflection not be done in isolation from the facts of culture. For this reason, the Marburg philosophers were keen to show that the core doctrines of past philosophers were in fact developed in continual conversation with other areas of culture, in particular with natural science. This way of doing history of philosophy—where the history of philosophy and the history of science are presented together as one narrative—culminated in Cassirer’s Problem of Knowledge. Third, the transcendental method (unlike the method of speculative idealism) is not foundationalist, but requires that philosophical reflection start up only after an area of culture has reached a stage of maturity where it can be self-reflective. Philosophy, then, always begins “in the middle”.

13. In his later book on quantum mechanics, Determinism and Indeterminism in the Philosophy of Physics, Cassirer argues (1936: Ch.12) that the real philosophical significance of QM is not its conflict with an alleged classical conception of causality, but rather its requirement that we rethink what it is to be an individual particle in a determinate state (and thus rethink the concepts substance and accident), given superposition and Heisenberg uncertainty.

14. Cohen (1898) recognized this possibility in his discussion of Hertz, since he allows that all three of the rival foundations for mechanics are equally consistent with the empirical data. Cassirer (1921: 354) later cited Einstein’s special theory and Lorentz’s theory as rival theories, the choice of which could not be decided on the basis of experiments alone.

15. Interestingly, Cassirer argues (1921: Ch.2) that Einstein’s principle of general covariance is supported by such a regulative principle. By requiring that the laws of nature be the same for any observer, whether the observer be at rest, undergoing inertial motion, or even accelerated motion, Einstein’s theory accords with the general demand that scientific laws be “de-anthropologized” and thus made fully objective (see Ryckman 2005: 45).

16. Lask self-consciously aligned himself with the Southwest school, and defended their core commitment, that the subject matter of philosophy is validity. However, he was in many ways an internal critic, who incorporated many of the ideas of Husserl’s Logical Investigations (Husserl 1900). See below, section 3.2.

17. Rickert put this idea more sharply by distinguishing two kinds of generality of values. A value is “factually general” if it is held by all humans (or all members of the relevant community); a value is normatively general if its “recognition is in fact required of all members of a certain community” (Rickert 1902: 376).

18. In Rickert’s The Object of Knowledge (Rickert 1915: 47, Chapter I, §7: “Das erkenntnistheoretische Subjekt”), and in Windelband’s later writings (1910: 319), the notion of a “normal” consciousness is expressed using Kant’s famous phrase “consciousness in general” from the Prolegomena (Kant 1783: §20; Ak 4:300). There, Kant argued that there is a difference between “judgments of perception”, which are subjectively valid and express only a consciousness of my own state, and “judgments of experience”, which are objectively valid and express a connection “in consciousness in general”. Rickert and Windelband self-consciously echo this argument, interpreting Kant’s distinction as a fact/value distinction: consciousness in general is what ought to be judged, not what in fact I do judge.

19. This claim that every universally valid norm has an a priori basis is made the defining feature of Neo-Kantianism in Anderson 2005. It may be more accurate to restrict this to SW Neo-Kantianism, since the fact/value distinction is not thematized by the Marburg Neo-Kantians.

This defining claim can again be extracted from Kant’s discussion of “consciousness in general”, given the SW Neo-Kantians’ reading of this as a normative consciousness. In Prolegomena §20, Kant argues that the ascent from consciousness of my own state to consciousness in general requires certain special a priori concepts, the categories. SW Neo-Kantianism takes on this idea as well, again interpreted normatively.

20. Lask is echoing Kant’s famous analogy between what Copernicus accomplished in astronomy and what he takes himself to have accomplished in metaphysics: Kant 1781/7: Bxvi–xvii.

21. Rickert replies to this criticism from Lask in Rickert 1915: 282.

22. An excellent presentation and interpretation of Lask’s very difficult theory is Emundts 2008.

23. Since truth becomes a kind of correspondence, Lask holds that there needs to be some way of cognizing the object, prior to the act of judging, which furnishes that against which the content of the judgment can be compared. This kind of cognition, which is passive and prior to any act of judging, Lask calls “Hingabe” [abandonment] (Lask 1912: 135, Ch.2, §2). In so doing, Lask is rejecting a fundamental Neo-Kantian commitment that all cognizing is judging. (Compare Rickert 1915: 168: “Erkennen ist immer Urteilen”.) In accepting the correspondence theory in Die Lehre vom Urteil, Lask is also departing from his own view in Lask 1911, where he rejected the correspondence theory.

24. On this issue: see Beiser 2014a: Ch.4. On the place of SW Neo-Kantianism in this debate, and for an excellent treatment of the philosophy of history of SW Neo-Kantians, see Beiser 2011:, Chs. 9–11.

25. Of course, Windelband (as well as Rickert) were quite clear that a historian conducting her research will need to make use of general propositions from nomothetic sciences, just as nomothetic scientists can make use of results of idiographic sciences and can even make claims about singular things (e.g., the Milky Way, the Triassic period). Nevertheless, there is still a fundamental difference in the goals of the two kinds of sciences.

26. Windelband’s resistance to this positivist reductionism is another example of the non-revisionism intrinsic to the transcendental method: recognizing the autonomy of history is simply recognizing the way the best contemporary historians were in fact doing their research.

27. Windelband’s claim that psychology is nomothetic is opposed to the Marburg view that psychology is the science of the subjective, and so is not nomothetic. On the Marburg view of psychology, see the Supplement, Philosophy of Psychology in the Marburg School.

28. On the debate between Dilthey and Windelband and Rickert, see Makkreel 2010 and Makkreel & Luft 2010. Partially in response to Windelband’s criticisms, Dilthey 1894 introduces his well-known distinction between explanation and interpretation (or understanding), arguing that the Geisteswissenschaften depend, not on “mechanical” psychology, which “explains” mental phenomena in the nomothetic way Windelband identified, but on “descriptive” psychology, which “interprets” or “understands” some mental phenomenon. This view is like the SW view, in distinguishing history from the natural sciences in terms of a distinctive method. For Rickert’s criticism of this more mature Diltheyan position, see Rickert 1902: 369.

29. Here, Rickert is drawing on the view that the content of an intuition is always potentially infinitely complex, and it is the work of a concept to select out (in accordance with certain a priori norms) certain features. See section 3.2.

30. Rickert also clearly articulated two other senses of “generality” that are at play in the formation of the concepts of history. The concept of Caesar, though it only applies to one individual, Caesar, is nevertheless composed of general concepts (such as being Roman, being a soldier, being assassinated). The concept of Caesar ought also be integrated into a more “general” historical nexus, say, through showing its relation to the concept of the Late Roman Empire. In this sense, one historical individual, Caesar, is part of a larger historical individual, the Late Roman Empire.

31. Rickert makes his point with some care. Of course, even natural scientists are sensitive to values, inasmuch as they are concerned with truth; but only in history do we form concepts constrained by those features of a subject that are value-relevant. Furthermore, the historian is making theoretical claims, not aesthetic or practical claims. Everyone can agree that Goethe is a historical individual, and that certain facts about him are historically relevant, whether or not one happens to like his poetry, approve of his character, or even have any personal attachment to German culture. The historian qua historian does not make determinate value judgments about her subjects. (Still less should historians argue that history acts teleologically to realize certain values, such as freedom, reason, or the will of God.)

32. Rickert believes that the notion of a value-relevant historical individual explains why it seems natural to distinguish history from natural science in terms of Geist or mind. Any historical individual (whether it be a particular human, like Caesar, or not) is part of a wider historical nexus, which inevitably will include human subjects. Since the values employed by the historian are universally valid, this means that any historical individual will be part of a historical nexus that includes humans who value that individual. But valuing can only be done by minds. This explains the sense in which history is about what is mental. Still, though, Rickert argues that the truly important aspect of an historical individual is not that it is thought about by a mind, but that it is valued.

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeremy Heis <>

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