Newton’s Views on Space, Time, and Motion

First published Thu Aug 12, 2004; substantive revision Mon Aug 22, 2011

Isaac Newton founded classical mechanics on the view that space is distinct from body and that time passes uniformly without regard to whether anything happens in the world. For this reason he spoke of absolute space and absolute time, so as to distinguish these entities from the various ways by which we measure them (which he called relative spaces and relative times). From antiquity into the eighteenth century, contrary views which denied that space and time are real entities maintained that the world is necessarily a material plenum. Concerning space, they held that the idea of empty space is a conceptual impossibility. Space is nothing but an abstraction we use to compare different arrangements of the bodies constituting the plenum. Concerning time, they insisted, there can be no lapse of time without change occurring somewhere. Time is merely a measure of cycles of change within the world.

Associated with these issues about the ontological status of space and time was the question of the nature of true motion. Newton defined the true motion of a body to be its motion through absolute space. Those who, before or shortly after Newton, rejected the reality of space, did not necessarily deny that there is a fact of the matter as to the state of true motion of any given body. They thought rather that the concept of true motion could be analyzed in terms of the specifics of the relative motions or the causes thereof. The difficulty (or, as Newton alleged, the impossibility) of so doing constituted for Newton a strong argument for the existence of absolute space.

In recent literature, Newton's theses regarding the ontology of space and time have come to be called substantivalism in contrast to relationism. It should be emphasized, though, that Newton did not regard space and time as genuine substances (as are, paradigmatically, bodies and minds), but rather as real entities with their own manner of existence as necessitated by God's existence (more specifically, his omnipresence and eternality).

1. Overview of the Scholium

Today, Newton is best known as a physicist whose greatest single contribution was the formulation of classical mechanics and gravitational theory as set out in his Philosophae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy), first published in 1687, and now usually referred to simply as “Newton's Principia”. Newton's views on space, time, and motion not only provided the kinematical basis for this monumental work and thus for the whole of classical physics up until the early twentieth century, but also played an integral role in Newton's general system of philosophy and theology (largely developed prior to the Principia). Because Newton never drafted a treatise on, or even a digest of, this general system, his stature as one of the great philosophers of the seventeenth century, indeed, of all time, is no longer widely appreciated.

A “Scholium” at the beginning of the Principia, inserted between the “Definitions” and the “Laws of Motion”, lays out Newton's views on time, space, place, and motion. He begins by saying that, since in common life these quantities are conceived of in terms of their relations to sensible bodies, it is incumbent to distinguish between, on the one hand, the relative, apparent, common conception of them, and, on the other, the absolute, true, mathematical quantities themselves. To paraphrase:

  • Absolute, true, and mathematical time, from its own nature, passes equably without relation to anything external, and thus without reference to any change or way of measuring of time (e.g., the hour, day, month, or year).
  • Absolute, true, and mathematical space remains similar and immovable without relation to anything external. (The specific meaning of this will become clearer below from the way it contrasts with Descartes' concept of space.) Relative spaces are measures of absolute space defined with reference to some system of bodies or another, and thus a relative space may, and likely will, be in motion.
  • The place of a body is the space which it occupies, and may be absolute or relative according to whether the space is absolute or relative.
  • Absolute motion is the translation of a body from one absolute place to another; relative motion the translation from one relative place to another.

Newton devotes the bulk of the Scholium to arguing that the distinction between the true quantities and their relative measures is necessary and justified.

It is evident from these characterizations that, according to Newton:

  1. space is something distinct from body and exists independently of the existence of bodies,
  2. there is a fact of the matter whether a given body moves and what its true quantity of motion is, and
  3. the true motion of a body does not consist of, or cannot be defined in terms of, its motion relative to other bodies.

The first of these theses was a point of major contention in 17th-century natural philosophy and one assailed by Newton's critics such as Leibniz, Huygens, and Berkeley. The second was not in general dispute. Descartes, Leibniz, and Berkeley all believed that, to put it in somewhat scholastic terms, the predicate ‘x is in true motion’ is a complete predicate in the sense that it holds or fails to hold for any given body. (Huygens, at least in his post-Principia views, constitutes a special case.) Thus, for those who denied the first thesis, it was necessary to secure a definition, or an analysis, of what it means for a body be in true motion (and what determines the quantity of that motion), so as to be as adequate to the facts as Newton's characterization of true motion. The figures mentioned above all deemed that motion relative to other bodies is a necessary condition for true motion, although not, by itself, a sufficient condition.

Over the course of years, the consensus in the 17th and early 18th Centuries on thesis (2) was lost sight of, and it became common to characterize Newton's opponents as denying that there is a fact of the matter as to whether a body is in true motion and maintaining instead that all motion is merely relative motion. Thus, modern readers expect that Newton's Scholium on space, time, and motion should be read as arguing not only thesis (1) above, but also thesis (2), that all motion is not merely relative motion, but that some motions are true and absolute. Newton's arguments concerning motion, however, are designed to show, not that true motion is distinct from merely relative motion (which is granted by all), but rather that the only feasible analysis of true motion requires reference to absolute places, and thus the existence of absolute space.

In particular it has been assumed that Newton's so-called “rotating bucket experiment”, together with the later example of a pair of globes connected by a chord and revolving about their center of gravity, is supposed to argue, or provide evidence for, the existence of true, or absolute, motion. Not only is this false, but the two cases have distinct purposes in the framework of the Scholium. The rotating bucket experiment is the last of five arguments from the “properties, causes, and effects of motion” designed to show cumulatively that an adequate analysis of true motion must involve reference to absolute space. In contrast, the example of the revolving globes is intended to illustrate how it is that, despite the fact that absolute space is invisible to the senses, it is nonetheless possible to infer the quantity of absolute motion of individual bodies in various cases.

2. The Legacy from Antiquity

2.1 The Void

The most important question shaping 17th-century views on the nature of space, time and motion is whether or not a true void or vacuum is possible, i.e., a place devoid of body of any sort (including rarified substances such as air). Ancient atomism, dating back at least to the pre-Socratic philosopher Democritus (5th century, B. C.), held that not only is such possible, but in fact actually exists among the interstices of the smallest, indivisible parts of matter and extends without bound infinitely. Following Plato, Aristotle rejected the possibility of a void, claiming that, by definition, a void is nothing, and what is nothing cannot exist.

2.2 Aristotle's Doctrines

According to Aristotle, the universe is a material plenum, finite in extent, bounded by the outermost sphere of the fixed stars. Beyond that there is no void, i.e., empty places, since, as Aristotle defines ‘place’, the place of something is the outermost of “the innermost motionless boundary of what contains it.” Hence, since there are no boundaries outside the outermost celestial sphere, there are no places or space outside of it.

Time, according to Aristotle, is just the measure of motion, where by ‘motion’ he means change of any sort, including qualitative change. In order to define the uniformity of time, that is, the notion of equal intervals of time, Aristotle was guided by astronomical practice, which in antiquity provided the most practical and accurate measures of time. He identified uniform motion with the rate of motion of the fixed stars, a choice for which he found a dynamical justification in his celestial physics.

“Local” motion is but one species of motion, viz., change of place. Motion, in general, he defined as the actualization of potentiality, a notion commonly held in the 17th century to be so obscure as to be either useless or meaningless. However, as far as local motion is concerned, there is no difficulty as to what constitutes the true or absolute motion of a body in a finite geocentric universe. Indeed, elementary substances in the sub-lunar realm (earth, air, fire, and water) move of their own accord either up or down, i.e., toward the center or away from the center by their very nature. The celestial realm, beginning with the orbit of the moon, consists of an interlocking network of celestial spheres composed of a fifth element (aether), which by its nature is disposed to circular motion about the center of the of universe (i.e., the center of the earth). If the motion of this substance is taken to be the measure of time, the celestial spheres necessarily rotate uniformly. Since the net motion of an embedded sphere is the sum of its natural motion superimposed on the natural motions of the spheres in which it is embedded, and since the axes of rotation are in general set at slightly different angles in order to account for why the sun does not move on the celestial equator and the planets and the moon do not move strictly on the ecliptic (i.e., the path of the sun against the fixed stars), the motions of the moon, planets, and even the sun are not necessarily uniform. However, since the sphere of the fixed stars is embedded in no other celestial sphere in motion, the motion of the fixed stars is de facto the measure of all motion.

The motions spoken of so far are all natural motions of the substances in questions, motions induced by the body being the very substance that it is. In contrast, other motions, in which the cause of the motion is external rather that internal to the body, Aristotle subsumed under the concept of violent motion. Violent motion required for its continuation the constant application of an external cause.

2.3 Sixteenth-Century Innovations

Although Aristotle's views dominated medieval scholasticism, there occurred a renewed interest in atomism in the early 17th Century. Apart from general factors such as the Renaissance, Humanism, and the Reformation, specific innovations of the 16th Century made it attractive. Although Copernicus' introduction of a helio-static system was motivated by a strict adherence to Aristotle's dynamics of celestial spheres, it brought into question his terrestial physics. Galileo's telescopic observations of the surface of the moon and his discovery of moons orbiting about Jupiter brought into question the very distinction between the terrestial and the celestial. Moreover, the visibility of an abundance of new stars, apparently without end, suggested that the universe may in fact be without bound.

2.4 Charleton and the Seventeenth-Century Revival of Atomism

An important representative of the revival of atomism and its concomitant views concerning the void is Walter Charleton's Physiologia Epicuro-Gassendo-Charltoniana: Or a Fabrick of Science Natural, upon the Hypothesis of Atoms, “Founded by Epicurus, Repaired by Petrus Gassendus, Augmented by Walter Charleton”, which appeared in English in 1654, twelve years after Newton's birth. It is a text with which Newton became familiar as an undergraduate, and some of the core theses concerning time and space later put forth in the Principia and various unpublished manuscripts in Newton's hand can be found in Charleton. These include:

  • that time and space are real entities even though they fit neither of the traditional categories of substance or accident (i.e., property of a substance),
  • that time “flow[s] on eternally in the same calm and equal tenor,” while the motion of all bodies is subject to “acceleration, retardation, or suspension”,
  • that time is distinct from any measure of it, e.g., celestial motion or the solar day,
  • that space is “absolutely immoveable” and incorporeal,
  • that bodies, or “Corporeal Dimensions” are everywhere “Coexistent and Compatient” with the “Dimensions” of the parts of space they occupy,
  • that space distinct from body existed before God created the world and that God's omnipresence is his literal presence everywhere, and
  • that motion is the translation or migration of body from one place, as an immovable part of space, to another.

Charleton's arguments for his views concerning time have much the same tenor as those given by Newton in the Principia. In marked contrast, though, those for empty, immense, and immutable space are quite different. Charleton appeals to the explanation of such phenomena as rarefaction and condensation, the differences in “degrees of Gravity” of bodies, and the numerous ways in which bodies can interpenetrate at the micro-level in terms of solubility, absorption, calefaction, and diverse chemical reactions. However, Charleton does not introduce the terminology of “relative” time, “relative” spaces, or “relative” places, and nowhere raises concerns regarding true (absolute) motion versus merely relative motion. Oddly enough, although Charleton occasionlly mentions and criticizes Descartes with regard to other matters, no note of the fact is made that Descartes, a decade earlier, had proposed explanations, in detail or in outline, for just these sorts phenomena according to a system of nature in which the world is completely filled with matter and in which space distinct from body cannot exist. Descartes, it can be justly said, is the founder of the other main school of the “mechancal philosophy” of the 17th Century, which stood in direct opposition to atomism on the issue of the possibility of a vacuum and which adapted the Aristotelian doctrines on the nature of time, space, and motion to the new world view.

3. Descartes' Innovation

Although avowedly anti-Aristotelian in many regards, particularly on the view, shared with atomists, that all qualitative change on the macroscopic scale is reducible to the rearrangement and/or motion of matter on the microscopic scale, it was Descartes' ambition to carry out this program by retaining what is essentially Aristotle's notion of Prime Matter. The pure elements (earth, air, fire, and water) of Aristotle's physics could mutate into one another by alteration of the fundamental qualities definitive of them. These were the four haptic qualities of hot, cold, wet, and dry. Because of this, there had to be something distinguishable, at least in thought, from qualities that persist during elemental alteration. This quality-less substratum is what Aristotle referred to simply as matter, or as it is often called, Prime Matter, in order to avoid confusion with the macroscopically identifiable, quality-laden, homogenous portions of everyday objects. Unlike atomists, who attributed at least the quality of hardness (impenetrability) to the ultimate particles of matter, Descartes argued that matter, or synonymously, body [corpus] has no qualities whatsoever, but only quantity, i.e., extension. In other words, body and extension are literally one and the same [res extensa]. An immediate corollary is that there can be no vacuum, for that would require an extended region devoid of body --- a manifest contradiction. The task, then, was to show how all apparent qualities can be explained in terms of the infinite divisibility and rearrangement of extension with respect to itself. The task was grand indeed, for its goal was to develop a unified celestial and terrestrial physics that could account equally for the ductility of metals, magnetic attraction, the tides, the mechanism of gravity, the motion of the planets, the appearance and disappearance of comets, and the birth and death of stars (supernovae).

Descartes published his system of the world in 1644 as the Principles of Philosophy (Principia Philosophae). Part II of the Principles lays out the thesis of the identity of space (extension) and matter, develops a definition of motion in the “true, or philosophical sense”, and sets out the fundamental dynamical laws of his system. Motion, according to “the truth of the matter”, is defined to be “the translation of one part of matter, or one body, from the vicinity of those bodies, which are immediately contiguous to it and are viewed as if at rest, to the vicinity of others.” In consequence, Descartes points out, each body has a single motion proper to it (in contrast to the numerous relative motions that can be ascribed to it depending on which other bodies are selected in order to determine its place). It is this single proper motion that figures in his laws of motion. Of particular importance for Descartes' entire system, is that a body in circular motion has an endeavor [conatus] to recede from the center of rotation.

4. Newton's Manuscript De Gravitatione

This fact, together with Descartes' contention that a body also participates in the motion of a body of which it is a part, makes it difficult to reconcile Descartes' system of the world with his definition of proper motion. Newton concluded that the doctrine is in fact self-refuting and that, where Descartes needed to, he had surreptitiously helped himself to a notion of space independent of body, particularly in order to assign the desired degree of centrifugal conatus to the planets and their satellites as they are swept about by celestial vortices of “subtle” matter.

The untitled and unfinished manuscript which begins “De Gravitatione et aequipondio fluidorum et solidorum …”, written perhaps a decade or more before the Principia, consists for the most part of an extensive and scathing critique of Descartes' doctrine of motion. The document, published for the first time in (Hall and Hall, 1962), is well worth the study for a glimpse at the development of Newton's thinking at a relatively young age. It manifestly embraces the doctrines of space and time later codified in the Principia. Notable, as well, is that each of the five arguments from the properties, causes and effects of motion advanced in the Scholium has a clearly identifiable antecedent in De Gravitatione. (See Rynasiewicz 1995 for details.) This makes it clear the extent to which the Scholium is concerned to argue specifically against the Cartesian system (as pointed out by Stein 1967), which Newton perceived to be the only other viable contender at the time.

5. Newton's Scholium on Time, Space, Place and Motion

The Scholium has a clearly discernible structure. Four paragraphs marked by Roman numerals I–IV follow the opening paragraph, giving Newton's characterizations of time, space, place and motion, respectively, as summarized in the third paragraph of Section 1 above. If we were to extend Newton's enumeration to the remaining paragraphs, then paragraphs V–XII constitute a sustained defense of the distinctions as characterized in I–IV. Paragraph XIII then states the general conclusion that the relative quantities are genuinely distinct from the respective absolute quantities and makes comments on the semantic issue of the meanings of these terms in the Bible. There follows one remaining, and quite extensive paragraph [XIV], which takes up the question how in practice one can ascertain the true motions of bodies and concludes: “But how we are to obtain the true motions from their causes, effects and apparent differences, and vice-versa, will be explained at length in the treatise that follows. For that is the end to which I composed it.”

In what follows, links have been inserted to the text of the Scholium according to the extended enumeration suggested above. Clicking on a link will open a new window in such a way that the reader can navigate back and forth between a given paragraph of the text and the commentary elucidating that paragraph.

5.1 Arguments for Absolute Time

Paragraph V appeals to the fact that astronomy distinguishes between absolute and relative time in its use of the so-called equation of time. This serves to correct for inequalities in the commonly adopted standard of time, the solar day, which most people mistakenly believe to be uniform. The solar day, defined as the period of time it takes the sun to return to zenith, varies by as much as 20 minutes over the course of a year. The standard of correction in the equation of time used in Ptolemaic astronomy was based upon the assumption that the sidereal day—the period of time it takes a fixed star to return to zenith—is constant, because the celestial sphere on which the fixed stars are located should not be assumed to speed up and slow down. With the demise of the Ptolemaic system and Aristotelian cosmology, this rationale was no longer compelling, and at least some astronomers, most notably Kepler, called into doubt whether the rate of rotation of the earth remained constant over the course of the year. (Kepler considered that its rotation would be faster when closer to the sun due to an excitatory effect of the sun.) Thus, the issue of the correct measure of time occupied considerable attention in 17th Century astronomy, especially because the ability to measure the rate of rotation of the earth is equivalent to the problem of determining longitude, which, for sea-faring nations, was critical for navigation (and hence military and economic dominance). Huygens' pendulum clock provided the first terrestrial candidate for a decently accurate measure of uniform time. Newton mentions this, as well as the eclipses of the moons of Jupiter, an alternative method based on Kepler's period law.

The invocation of the need for an equation of time in astronomy is not just an appeal to a well entrenched scientific practice. In the course of his discussion, Newton explains why he thinks the need is justified. Although he will argue in Book III of the Principia that the diurnal rotation of the earth is uniform, this is a contingent fact. It could have been otherwise. Indeed, it could have been that there are no uniform motions to serve as accurate measures of time. The reason is that all motion is subject to being accelerated or retarded (by the application of external forces). In contrast, absolute time (which is nothing other than duration or the perseverance of the existence of things) remains the same, whether the motions be be swift, slow, or null.

5.2 Direct Arguments for Absolute Space

Paragraph VI defends the thesis of the immobility of (absolute) space, which against the backdrop of Descartes, clearly means that the parts of space, just as the parts of time, do not change their relation with respect to one another. Newton argues that the parts of space are their own places, and for a place to be moved out of itself is absurd. A more expansive antecedent of this argument occurs in De Gravitatione, applied specifically to time: if yesterday and tomorrow were to interchange their temporal relations with respect to the remainder of time, then yesterday would become today, and today yesterday. Thus, Newton held an interestingly holistic identity criterion for the parts of space and time.

5.3 The Arguments from Properties, Causes, and Effects

Newton devotes five full paragraphs to justifying his characterization of the distinction between absolute and relative motion. The first three present arguments from properties of absolute motion and rest, the next presents an argument from their causes, and the final an argument from their effects. The force of these has confused modern commentators for a combination of reasons which, historically, are difficult to untangle. Since only those not already prejudiced by those commentaries, directly or indirectly, will find what follows unusual, it is best to defer an autopsy of those reasons until Section 6, after an exposition of the arguments.

Suffice it to say for the moment that it is a common misunderstanding that in these arguments Newton intends to develop empirical criteria for distinguishing cases of absolute motion from merely apparent motion and thereby to disprove the thesis that all motion is merely relative motion. To the contrary, the arguments take as their point of departure the assumption, common to Cartesian and Aristotelian philosophy, that each body has a unique state of true motion (or rest). Throughout the arguments, the terms ‘true motion’ and ‘absolute motion’ are treated synonymously. At issue is whether true motion (and rest) can be reduced to some special instance of relative motion (or rest) with respect to other bodies. In announcing at the outset of these arguments that “absolute and relative rest and motion are distinguished by by their properties, causes, and effects”, Newton indicates his intent to show that they cannot, at least if true motion and rest are to have those features we generally associate, or ought to associate, with them.

Argument 1 from Properties [Paragraph VIII]

Property: Bodies that are truly at rest are at rest with respect to one another.

Conclusion: True rest cannot be defined simply in terms of position relative to other bodies in the local vicinity.

Reasoning: Suppose there were a body somewhere in the universe absolutely at rest, say far away, in the region of the fixed stars, or even farther. (Whether or not that body might ever be observed doesn't enter into what follows.) Clearly it is impossible to know just from considering the positions of bodies in our region relative to one another whether any of these latter bodies maintains a fixed position with respect to that hypothetical distant body. To amplify, let B be one of the local bodies, C the relative configuration over time of the set of local bodies, and A the far distant body at absolute rest. The specification of C alone fails to establish the position of B relative to A over time. In particular, C fails to establish whether B is relatively at rest with respect A, which, by the property stated above, is a necessary condition for B to be absolutely at rest. Hence, specification of the local configuration C underdetermines whether or not B is at absolute rest. Thus the conclusion: it is impossible to define what it is for a body such as B to be at absolute rest [i.e., to give necessary and sufficient conditions for when it is that B is at rest] simply in terms of how B fits into the local configuration C.

Argument 2 from Properties [Paragraph IX]

Property: If a part of a body maintains a fixed position with respect to the body as a whole, then it participates in the motion of the whole body.

Conclusion: True and absolute motion cannot be defined as a translation from the vicinity of (the immediately surrounding) bodies, viewing the latter as if they were at rest.

Reasoning: Newton first introduces two considerations that can be taken either to support, or to illustrate, or to amplify upon the import of the stated property. The first is that if a part of a rotating body is at rest relative to the body as a whole, it endeavors to recede from the axis of rotation. The second is that the impetus of a body to move forward arises from the combination of the impetus of its parts.

From the property it follows that if those bodies surrounding a given body move (either rotationally or progressively forward as a fixed configuration) while the surrounded body is at rest relative to the surrounding ones, then the surrounded body partakes in the (true) motion of the group of surrounding bodies. Hence, if the surrounding bodies move truly, then so does the surrounded body. But according to the (Cartesian) definition of motion—which identifies the true motion of a body with its transference from the vicinity of immediately surrounding bodies, regarding the surrounding bodies to be as though they are at rest—it would have to be said (wrongly) that the surrounded body is truly at rest. Hence that definition is untenable.

Argument 3 from Properties [Paragraph X]

Property: Anything put in a moving place moves along with that place, and hence a body participates in the motion of its place when it moves [relatively] away from that place.

Conclusion: The complete and absolute motion of a body cannot be defined except by means of stationary places.

Reasoning: From the property, the [relative] motion of a body out of a given place is only part of the motion of the body if the place in question is itself in motion. The complete and true motion of the body consists of its motion relative to the moving place added vectorially to whatever motion the place may have. Should the place be moving relative to a place which is in turn moving, then the motion of that place must be added, and so on. Barring infinite regress, the sum must terminate with a motion relative to a stationary place.

Addended Argument: After deriving this conclusion, Newton amplifies upon the consequences. The only places that are stationary are all of those that that stay in fixed positions with respect to one another from infinity to infinity, and since these always remain stationary, they make up what Newton calls immobile absolute space.

The Argument from Causes [Paragraph XI]

Causes: the forces impressed upon bodies. The major premise is that application of a [non-zero net] force on a body is both a necessary and sufficient condition for either generating or altering its true motion. More specifically:

(A) Impressed force is a necessary condition for generating or altering true motion (but not, as remains to be shown, merely relative motion).

(B) Application of a [non-zero net] force is a sufficient condition for the generation or alteration of true motion (but not, as will be shown subsequently, merely relative motion).

Conclusion: The true motion of an individual body cannot be defined as any particular sub-instance of its motion relative to other bodies.

Reasoning: Newton seeks to establish that application of a positive net force to a body is neither a necessary not a sufficient condition for the generation of motion relative to other bodies. The two lines of reasoning are given separately, call them ‘Prong A’ and ‘Prong B’, respectively.

Prong A: To be established is that, although an impressed force is necessary for the generation or alteration of true motion in a body, it is not necessary for the generation of motion relative to other bodies. The reasoning is quite simple: pick a given body and merely apply the same [accelerative] force to all other bodies in question. These other bodies will then remain in the same relative configuration with respect to one another, but a relative motion with respect to the original body [to which no force has been applied] will either be generated or altered.

Prong B: To be established is that, although an impressed force is sufficient for the generation or alteration of true motion in a body, it is not sufficient for the generation of motion relative to other bodies. Again, the line of reasoning is quite straightforward. Consider an arbitrarily given body amongst a system of bodies and simply apply the same [accelerative] force to all bodies in question. Then, despite the fact that a force has been impressed upon the originally given body, there is neither generation nor alteration of relative motion with respect to the remaining bodies.

The Argument from Effects [Paragraph XII]

Effects: the forces of receding from the axis of rotational motion [centrifugal endeavor]. The major premise is that the centrifugal endeavor of bodies [or parts of bodies] to recede from the axis of rotation is directly proportional to the quantity of the true circular motion.

Conclusion: True rotational motion cannot be defined as relative rotation with respect to the surrounding bodies.

Reasoning: The line of reasoning is in fact parallel to the preceding argument from causes, although this may not be completely perspicuous due to the fact that the correlates of the two prongs above are here stages of a single on-going experimental situation, the so-called “rotating bucket” experiment, which, Newton intimates, he actually performed. In order to set up this experiment, one suspends a bucket using a long cord and by turning the bucket repeatedly, winds up the cord until it is strongly twisted, then fills the bucket with water. During the course of the experiment, the degree to which the water tries to climb up the sides of the bucket is used as a measure of its centrifugal endeavor to recede from the center. Newton uses the experiment to establish that centrifugal endeavor is neither a necessary condition nor a sufficient condition for the existence of relative circular motion [of the water] with respect to its surroundings [the bucket].

Stage 1: When the bucket is first released, it rotates rapidly with respect to the rest frame of the experimenter while the water remains at rest with respect to the experimenter. In other words, there is rapid relative motion of the water with respect to the bucket. However, the surface of the water remains flat, indicating that it has no tendency to recede from the axis of relative rotation. Thus, the existence of centrifugal endeavor in the parts of a body is not a necessary condition for the body to be rotating relative to its surroundings. That is, such relative rotation with respect to immediately adjacent bodies need not produce any centrifugal endeavor in the parts of the body to recede from the axis of relative rotation.

In the further course of the experiment, as the bucket continues to rotate, the water gradually begins to rotate with it, and as it does so, begins to climb up the sides of the bucket. Eventually, according to Newton, the water acquires the same rotation of the bucket relative to the lab frame, at which point we have the following situation.

Stage 2: The water and the bucket are at relative rest, yet the water has achieved its highest ascent up the sides of the bucket, indicating a maximum centrifugal endeavor to recede from the axis of common rotation. Hence, the existence of centrifugal endeavor is not a sufficient condition for the presence of relative circular motion between a body and its surroundings, i.e., if a body, or rather its parts, have a centrifugal endeavor to recede from a central axis, it does not follow that there is a relative circular motion of the body with respect to its immediate surroundings.

Astrophysical Application. After deriving the conclusion, Newton uses the premises of the first two arguments from properties, together with the premise of the argument from effects, to critique the vortex theory of planetary motion. According to that theory, each of the planets (and most notably the earth) is relatively at rest with respect to the “subtle” matter of the celestial vortex of our own sun. Hence, according to Descartes' own definition of true motion (as well as his explicit insistence), they have no true motion. However, it is manifest that they do not maintain fixed positions with respect to one another. So, according to the property invoked in the first argument, they cannot [all] be truly at rest. Moreover, from the property invoked in the second argument, they partake in the circular motion of the solar vortex [assuming that motion to be true motion, as Descartes implicitly assumed]. Finally, because they would accordingly participate in the true circular motion of this hypothetical vortex, they should have an endeavor to recede from the axis of its rotation.

This completes the sequence of arguments from the properties, causes, and effects of motion. The next paragraph [XIII] states the cumulative conclusions of the arguments marshalled beginning with the arguments for absolute time in paragraph V: “Hence relative quantities are not the quantities themselves, whose names they bear, but are only sensible measures of them (either accurate or inaccurate), which are commonly used in place of the quantities they measure.” Having made his case, Newton comments on the ordinary language meaning of the terms for these quantities in order to address contemporary issues of dogma and heresy.

Galileo's condemnation by the Catholic Church for asserting that the earth is in motion was still recent history at the time Newton composed the Principia. Descartes, who lived in reach of Papal authority and feared similar fate, had found a clever way of espousing Copernicanism without falling prey to accusation of heresy. According to his definition of motion “properly speaking”, he contends, the earth is truly at rest.

In Newton's system of the world as set out in Book III of the Principia, the earth patently moves absolutely. In anticipation, Newton indicates how to reconcile this with scripture by observing that, if usage determines the meanings of words, then in ordinary discourse (including the Bible) the terms ‘time’, ‘space’, ‘place’, and ‘motion‘ are properly understood to signify the relative quantities; only in specialized and mathematical contexts do they denote the absolute quantities. (Keep in mind Newton's title, The Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy.) He proceeds to chastise Descartes on two counts, first for doing violence to the scriptures by taking them to refer to the absolute quantities, and second, for confusing the true quantities with their relative measures.

5.4 Discriminating in Practice between Absolute and Apparent Motion

Having argued his case that true motion consists in motion with respect to absolute space, and thus having dealt to his satisfaction with the metaphysics of motion, Newton turns in the final paragraph of the Scholium to epistemological strategies available on his account. On an Aristotelian or Cartesian account, one can directly observe the allegedly absolute motion of a body if both it and its immediate surroundings are visible. In contrast, because the parts of absolute space are not directly accessible to the senses, it is very difficult, Newton confesses, to ascertain the true motion of individual bodies and to discriminate them in practice from the apparent motions. “Nevertheless,” he remarks in a rare moment of wit, “the situation is not entirely desperate.” Evidence is available in part from apparent motions, which are the differences of true motions, and in part from the forces, which are the causes and effects of true motions.

Newton illustrates with an example. Imagine a pair of globes, connected by a cord, revolving about their common center of gravity. The endeavor of the globes to recede from the axis of motion is revealed by the tension in the cord, from which the quantity of circular motion can be estimated. Furthermore, whether the direction of their revolution is clockwise or counterclockwise can be detected by applying forces to opposite faces of the globes to see whether the tension in the cord increases or decreases. All this can be done in empty space where no other bodies are present to serve as points of reference.

Suppose now that, in addition to the globes, there is second system of bodies maintaining fixed positions with respect to one another (for example, the fixed stars). If the two systems are in a state of relative rotation, one cannot gauge from just the relative rotation, which, if either, is at rest. However, from the tension in the cord connecting globes, one can establish whether the relative rotation is due entirely to the absolute rotation of the system of globes. Supposing so, the second system of bodies can then be exploited to provide an alternative technique for determining whether the globes revolve in a clockwise or counterclockwise direction—one simply consults the direction of rotation relative to the stationary system.

At this point Newton cuts off the Scholium, explaining that the whole point of having written the treatise to follow is to show how to infer the true motions from their causes, effects, and apparent differences, and conversely the causes and effects from either the true or the apparent motions.

6. Common Impediments to Understanding the Scholium

As remarked in Section 5.3 above, the purpose of the arguments from properties, causes, and effects has been widely misunderstood in both the historical and philosophical literature, and as a consequence, so too the relation of these to the example of the revolving globes in the final paragraph. Some diagnosis as to why may help those readers already steeped in tradition to overcome certain prejudices they bring to the Scholium and may also serve to further illuminate the framework in which Newton and his contemporaries struggle with the problem of motion.

6.1 What the Major Impediments Are

(1) Newton's stated intention in the Scholium is to maintain that absolute space, time, and motion are genuinely distinct from their relative counterparts. For the case of space, this clearly amounts to arguing the existence of an entity distinct from body in which bodies are located—something denied by relationists. Similarly, for the case of time, this involves arguing the existence of an entity distinct from the succession of particular events in which the events are located—again, something denied by relationists. It may seem then as a matter of course that, for the case of motion, Newton should argue for existence of something denied by relationists, presumably, absolute motion.

(2) It would amount to a virtual petitio principii were Newton to rest a case for absolute motion on the existence of absolute space. Hence, one would expect him to appeal to various physical phenomena that might provide independent warrant. Now it is well known that Newton's laws satisfy the principle of Galilean relativity, according to which there can be no experimental test to determine whether a system is at rest or in a state of uniform rectilinear motion. However, Newton's laws do support a distinction between inertial and non-inertial motion in that they predict, in non-inertial frames, the appearance of so-called “fictitious forces,” for instance, centrifugal forces in rotating frames, resulting in a tendency for bodies to recede from the axis of rotation. Since this is exactly the effect involved in the rotating bucket experiment, it is tempting to interpret Newton as marshaling it as a case in which this phenomenon suggests independent warrant for the existence of absolute motion.

(3) Moreover, since the same effect is operative in the example of the revolving globes, it is hard to see why that example does not serve the very same purpose. In fact, in his famous critique of Newton in the Science of Mechanics, Ernst Mach, in quoting from the Principia, cut out all of the intervening text to make it appear as though the two are but variant examples in the development of a single argument.

(4) Finally, the choice of language in Motte's 1729 translation, which is the basis for the most widely available twentieth century English translation by Cajori, tends to reinforce the presumption that the arguments from properties, causes, and effects seek to identify phenomena that empirically distinguish absolute from (merely) apparent motion. In the Cajori version, the conclusions of the first three arguments, the arguments from the properties of motion and rest, read:

  • … it follows that absolute rest cannot be determined from the position of bodies in our regions. [Paragraph VIII]
  • …the true and absolute motion of a body cannot be determined by the translation of it from those which only seem to rest; [Paragraph IX]
  • Wherefore, entire and absolute motions can be no otherwise determined than by immovable places; [Paragraph X]

Thus, it is tempting to assume that both the argument from causes and the argument from effects are likewise concerned to identify an empirical signature of absolute motion by which it can be distinguished from (merely) apparent motion. (Reading the arguments in this fashion, only the argument from effects, which deals with the centrifugal effects of circular motion, appears to help Newton's cause—a commonly registered complaint.)

6.2 Why They Are Indeed Impediments

It will be more illuminating to respond to these in reverse order.

(Ad 4) It is an artifact of Motte's translation that the Latin verb definiri (passive infinitive) is rendered occasionally as ‘be determined’ rather than as ‘be defined’. According to seventeenth-century English usage, either choice is acceptable. In appropriate contexts, the two function as synonyms, as in the Euclidean axiom, “Two points determine a line.” Motte's practice conforms with this. The conclusion of the argument from effects, ‘definiri’ is translated as ‘be defined’:

And therefore this endeavor does not depend upon any translation of the water in respect of the ambient bodies, nor can true circular motion be defined by such translation. [Paragraph XII]

If one now goes back and substitutes ‘be defined’ for ‘be determined’ into the conclusions from the arguments from properties quoted above, they take on, to the modern ear, a different meaning. They make claims as to what constitutes an adequate definition of the concepts of true, or absolute, motion and rest.

(Ad 3) We have already seen how paragraph XIII signals the conclusion, not just of the arguments from properties, causes, and effects, but the direct arguments for absolute time and absolute space as well, which, altogether, Newton takes establish the ontological distinction between the absolute and the relative quantities. That the next paragraph, in which the globes are introduced, concerns a different, epistemological issue would be apparent were it not for another artifact of the Motte translation, this time involving the Latin verb ‘distinguere’. Newton uses the word again and again, almost thematically, in characterizing and arguing for the ontological distinction between the absolute and the relative quantities; and Motte renders it in English as ‘to distinguish’. Unfortunately, the English verb appears in the Motte translation one more time at the start of the final paragraph:

It is indeed a matter of great difficulty to discover, and effectually to distinguish, the true motions of particular bodies from the apparent;

But in the Latin, the word ‘distinguere’ is nowhere to be found. Rather, the sentence reads:

Motus quidem veros corporum singulorum cognoscere, & ab apparentibus actu discriminare, difficillimum est;

Thus, to the Latin reader, it is clear that Newton is moving on to a different consideration.

(Ad 2) What has been said in connection with (4) suffices against the false expectations developed in (2). However, there may remain some sense that, even on a proper reading, Newton tried to bluff his way past the principle of Galilean relativity. Newton indeed acknowledges the principle, though not by name, in Corollary V to the laws of motion:

The motions of bodies in a given [relative] space are the same among themselves whether that space is at rest or moves uniformly in a straight line without uniform motion.

And there is no reason to think that he did not appreciate the limitation it poses for experimentally differentiating between absolute rest and uniform motion in a straight line. A particular instance of Corollary V is the solar system as a whole. Assuming the absence of external forces, it follows (from Corollary IV to the laws) that the center of gravity of the solar system is either at rest or moves uniformly in a straight line. But which? Because of Corollary V, when Newton wishes to attribute a definite state of motion to the center of mass of the solar system in Book III, he must introduce the hypothesis that “The center of the system of the world is at rest.” Should this not be some source of embarrassment?

Apparently not. Immediately following the hypothesis, he writes:

This is conceded by everyone, although some contend it is the earth, others the sun, that is at rest in the center. Let us see what follows from this.

According to Newton, the attribution of a state of absolute rest to one or the other of these bodies is universally taken for granted. What does confound all conventional wisdom in what follows is that neither the earth nor the sun is at rest, but rather the center of gravity of the solar system.

(Ad 1) Although arguing that absolute space and absolute time are distinct from any relative spaces and relative times involves, in each case, arguing for the existence of an additional entity, it does not follow that, in arguing that absolute motion is distinct from relative motion, Newton is obliged to argue yet another existence claim. Unfortunately, the term ‘absolute motion’ is prone to be read in two distinct ways. On one reading, it means, as a matter of stipulative definition, ‘change of absolute place’. In this sense of ‘absolute motion’, the existence of absolute motion (or more precisely, the possibility of the existence of absolute motion) follows immediately from the existence of absolute space and absolute time. As indicated before, nothing further needs to be said. On the other reading, ‘absolute motion’ is synonymous with ‘true motion’. And as we have just seen, Newton finds no reason to doubt that his audience does not grant that a body is either truly at rest or truly in motion. The venerable tradition that takes motion and rest to be contraries has yet to be questioned. So it is not incumbent on Newton make a case for the reality of absolute motion in the sense of true motion. What is incumbent is for him to argue that true motion just is change of absolute place. And that is the purpose of the arguments from properties, causes, and effects.

7. Newton's Legacy

Newton's views on space, time, and motion dominated physics from the 17th Century until the advent of the theory of relativity in the 20th Century. Nonetheless, these views have been subjected to frequent criticism, beginning with contemporaries, such as Leibniz and Berkeley, and continuing on to the close of the 19th Century, most notably with Ernst Mach, whose writings influenced Einstein. In the early twentieth century, Newton tended to be cast as a metaphysical dogmatist by the early philosophical interpreters of relativity, in particular Hans Reichenbach. Unfortunately, that stigma has tended to linger.

More recent scholarship reveals a more sober picture of why Newton felt fully justified in positing absolute space, absolute time, and absolute motion. Moreover, the novel feature of special relativity, the rejection of absolute simultaneity—something that never occurred to any of Newton's earlier critics—necessitated only that absolute space and absolute time be replaced with an absolute space-time (Minkowski spacetime). And although Einstein's development of general relativity was in large part motivated by a desire to implement a general principle of relativity, to wit that all motion is relative motion, that it succeeds in doing so was questioned shortly after the theory was introduced. As for the question of the absoluteness of space-time in general relativity, it no longer has the character of something which acts without being acted upon, as Einstein himself pointed out. The space-time metric tensor not only encodes for spatiotemporal structure, but also represents the gravitational potentials, and thus gravitational energy. By Einstein's famous equation for the equivalence of energy and mass, it follows that the gravitational field possesses mass. Only, since gravitational energy can not be localized in terms of an energy density tensor, but is possessed by the field holistically, neither can this mass be localized. Thus, philosophical controversy as to whether space-time can exist without matter becomes tendentious according whether one counts the gravitation field as something material or not.

Thus, the question whether the revolution in our views about space and time in the last century vindicates Newton's critics as more philosophically astute becomes a misplaced one. The distinction between what counts as matter in contrast to empty space presupposed in the earlier debates has been eclipsed by possibilities undreamt of before the introduction of modern field theory and relativity.[1]


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I'd like to thank John Norton for observations which led to many improvements.

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