Max Scheler

First published Thu Dec 8, 2011; substantive revision Tue Jan 9, 2024

At the time of his death, Max Ferdinand Scheler was one of the most prominent German intellectuals and most sought after philosophers of his time. A pioneer in the development of phenomenology in the early part of the 20th century, Scheler broke new ground in many areas of philosophy and established himself as perhaps the most creative of the early phenomenologists. Relative to the attention his work received and the attention his contemporaries now enjoy, interest in Scheler’s work and thought has waned considerably. This decrease in attention is in part due to the suppression of Scheler’s work by the Nazis from 1933 to 1945, a suppression stemming from his Jewish heritage and outspoken denunciation of fascism and National Socialism. Nevertheless, his work has survived and continues to be read and translated throughout the world, serving as evidence of the creative depth and richness of his thought.

1. Biographical Sketch

Max Scheler was born on August 22, 1874. He was raised in a well-respected orthodox Jewish family in Munich. Although he was not a particularly strong student, Scheler did show early promise and interest in philosophy, particularly in the works of Friedrich Nietzsche. As a youth, he identified himself as a social democrat and enthusiastic Marxist. In the fall of 1894, Scheler started his university studies in Munich, but by the fall of 1895 had enrolled in Berlin. Although he had applied to study medicine in Berlin, he studied primarily philosophy and sociology, attending most notably the lectures of Wilhelm Dilthey and Georg Simmel.

From Berlin, Scheler moved to Jena in 1896 to finish his studies under the guidance of Rudolf Eucken. Rudolf Eucken was a tremendously popular philosopher at the time, winning the Nobel Prize for literature in 1908, but it was Eucken’s ideas regarding the inner quest for a spiritual life of every human being that primarily drew Scheler’s attention. It was in Jena that Scheler completed both his dissertation and habilitation, and where he began his career in philosophy. It was also during his time in Jena that he took a trip to Heidelberg in 1898 and met Max Weber, who also had a significant impact on his thought.

While holding his position as Privatdozent in Jena, Scheler met Edmund Husserl at a party in 1901 and then, a year later, read Husserl’s Logical Investigations. The remainder of his life would be dedicated to the development and the progress of phenomenology. During this time, Scheler was also reading much of French philosophy and was a major factor in introducing Henri Bergson’s work to Germany’s intellectual circles.

In 1906, Scheler moved his family to Munich and started his position there as Privatdozent. With Theodor Lipps, Scheler established a circle of the “Munich Phenomenologists.” The early group consisted of Alexander Pfänder, Moritz Geiger and Theodor Conrad, all of whom were students of Lipps. Dietrich von Hildebrand, Hedwig Martius, Herbert Leyendecker and Maximillian Beck later joined the group.

Due to controversies surrounding the separation from his first wife and reported affairs with students, Scheler lost his teaching privileges. From 1910 to 1919, he would have to earn a living as a private scholar, lecturer and freelance writer. Despite the economic hardships brought about by the loss of his position in Munich, these years were some of Scheler’s most productive: he published major works such as Phenomenology and Theory of the Feeling of Sympathy and of Love and Hate (1913), Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Value (Part 1 1913, Part 2 1916), The Genius of War and the German War (1915).

A major contributing factor to Scheler’s productivity at this time was his introduction to the Göttingen circle of phenomenology. Along with the great master, Husserl, this circle included such young and promising thinkers as Adolf Reinach, Hedwig Martius, Roman Ingarden, Alexandre Koyré and Edith Stein. He met and later joined the circle after the invitation in 1912 to give private lectures in Göttingen. Because Scheler was forbidden to teach at a German university his lectures would often have to be held in hotel rooms rented by his close friend Dietrich von Hildebrand. It was also at this time that Scheler became co-editor, along with Husserl, Alexander Pfänder, Moritz Geiger and Adolf Reinach, of the greatly influential journal, Jahrbuch für Philosophie und phänomenologische Forschung.

After years of struggling to make ends meet as a private lecturer and freelance writer, Scheler received an invitation in 1918 from Konrad Adenaur to join the faculty of the newly founded research institute for the social sciences in Cologne. The intent was to have Scheler serve as the Catholic thinker for the institute. Scheler, officially joining the faculty in 1919, was once again allowed to teach at a German university. During his time in Cologne, he wrote his major work on religion, On the Eternal in Man (1921).

The circle of influence continued to grow for Scheler. During his time in Berlin and in Cologne, Scheler would meet and correspond regularly with prominent, German intellectuals such as Max Brod, Franz Werfel, Martin Buber, Arnold Zweig, Ernst Troeltsch, Werner Sombart, Albert Einstein, Alfred Kerr, Walter Rathenau, Paul Tillich, Romano Guardini and Ernst Bloch. His circle of collaboration and discussion was not limited to philosophy. Scheler corresponded with the leading psychologists and natural scientists such as Wertheimer, Köhler, Buytendijk, and Wasserman. Musicians, poets and literary scholars such as Eduard Erdmann, Otto Klemperer, Paul Valéry, Rainer Maria Rilke, Romain Rolland, Ernst Robert Curtius were also part of his circle of influence. A very close friend of Scheler’s in Cologne up until his death was the painter Otto Dix.

This diverse array of friends and collaborators is reflected in both the diversity and originality of Scheler’s thought at this time. For example, Scheler’s work, Die Wissenformen und die Gesellschaft (The Forms of Knowledge and Society), was responsible for the promulgation of a new field of study, the sociology of knowledge, and was one of the first works in Germany that provided an in depth analysis of American pragmatism. As was common for Scheler, he wrote many different manuscripts at once. While writing on the sociology of knowledge, he was working on his philosophical anthropology (Die Sonderstellung des Menschen and the manuscripts compiled in Gesammelte Werke 12), metaphysics (Idealismus und Realismus and manuscripts compiled in Gesammelte Werke 11), politics (Politik und Moral, Die Idee des Ewigen Friedens) and history (Der Mensch im Weltalter des Ausgleichs). During this time, Scheler lectured extensively throughout Germany, focusing much of his effort to confront the rise of fascism in Germany and Europe.

Once again, Scheler’s personal life (the divorce from his second wife and marriage to his third) conflicted with his position at the university as the Catholic philosopher. The restrictions Scheler felt were not merely personal, but also intellectual. Disappointed by the Catholic Church’s conservatism and political failures in the reconstructive efforts after the war, Scheler became increasingly critical of religious institutions and dogmas. He made considerable effort to distance himself from the Catholic Church and characterize his work as philosophical, not religious, in nature. With the growing tensions at Cologne, Scheler welcomed the offer of a professorial position in Frankfurt in 1927 and was eager to work with the Critical Theorists in Frankfurt such as Max Horkeimer and the young Theodor Adorno. During the spring of 1928, Scheler’s health continued to worsen and he suffered from a series of heart attacks most likely due to the 60–80 cigarettes he smoked each day. His deteriorating health forced him to cancel his extensive travel plans abroad, and on May 19, 1928 Scheler died in a hospital in Frankfurt from complications of a severe heart attack.

2. The Meaning of Philosophy and Phenomenology

At the end of his life, Scheler wrote that the central issue in his thought and writing was the question regarding the meaning of the human being (GW IX, 9). This question not only guided his ever expanding philosophical endeavors, but also defined his approach and understanding of philosophy. Like many of the Lebensphilosophen (philosophers of life) who had influenced him, Scheler strove to save philosophy and thought from the reductive mindset of the positive sciences and to a degree, American pragmatism, a mindset that defined the human being as mere homo faber (tool-maker). The human being is without a doubt a practical being, seeking to master and manipulate his or her environment to achieve desired results and avoid future suffering. For Scheler, practical knowledge and practical consciousness are genetically the first form of knowledge for the individual. Yet, human beings are not necessarily tied to practical affairs and have the ability to comprehend and regard the world in terms of its essence or being. Philosophy, for Scheler, is the “loving act of participation by the core of the human being in the essence of all things” (GW V, 68). Practical knowledge is only the first of three types of knowledge. In addition to practical or mastery knowledge, Scheler describes two other types, erudition (Bildungswissen) and knowledge of revelation. All three types have their own integrity and are irreducible to one another. Each knowledge types thus has its own origin and is motivated by a different feeling. While practical knowledge is motivated by physical pain or fear of error, erudition is motivated by wonder and knowledge of revelation by awe. Philosophical knowledge belongs to the type, erudition.

Wonder is a loving concern for the world as it is in itself and marks the transition from the practical to the philosophical (GW VIII, 208). This “loving participation” of philosophy is, however, distinct from the classical notion of love (eros) as a lack. Love is understood by Scheler here in terms of the Christian sense of agape, loving as giving. The human being as a loving, philosophical being is not motivated to know by a sense of a lack, as is the case with eros, but is rather motivated by the abundance and surfeit of the meaning of the world (GW VI, 84). Modernity’s ethos of control and domination has transformed the world into a mere object of utility. As a means to reawaken a sense of wonder, Scheler called for a rehabilitation of virtue, in particular the virtues of humility and reverence (GW III, 15). The philosopher lives in reverence of the world, in astonishment of the world’s inexhaustible depth and secrets (GW III, 26).

Philosophical thought attends to the core meaning of knowledge as a Seinsverhältnis, an ontological relation. Knowledge, according to Scheler, is a relation between beings, a relation wherein a being ‘participates’ in what another being is in itself (GW VIII, 203). Scheler rejects the idea that knowledge is a an act of construction, as was the case for the neo-Kantians such as Ernst Cassirer. Rather knowledge is a form of discovery, a discovery that requires a humble divesting of oneself that opens one up to the other (GW VIII, 204) and presupposes the loving willingness to be open to that which is other.

Following Augustine, Scheler takes the emotional and affective life as foundational for any form of knowledge (GW VI, 87). Before the world is known, it is first given. Love is that which opens the human being up to the world, to that which is other. This openness demonstrates that there is a moral precondition for knowledge. Knowledge is possible only for a loving being (GW V, 83). This love is the movement of transcendence, a going beyond oneself, an opening to ever richer meaning. Love is always already directed to the infinite, to absolute value and being (GW V, 90). With this understanding of the relation of love to knowledge, Scheler declares that “knowledge is ultimately from the divine and for the divine” (GW VIII, 211).

It was not until he read Husserl’s Logical Investigations and learned of the idea of phenomenology, however, that Scheler came upon a style of thinking that best captured for him the loving disposition of philosophy. Although he was greatly indebted to Husserl’s genius and originality, Scheler was often critical of Husserl when describing the nature of phenomenology. For Scheler, phenomenology is unequivocally not a method, but an attitude (GW X, 380). Grasping the meaning or essence of an object has meant, since Plato, a type of disengagement from or suspension of an object’s immediate and present existence. The intent of this disengagement is not to abstract from an object of cognition as it exists, but rather to look at the object as it is itself. The natural worldview or attitude presupposes the practical and habitual context in which the object is given and thus uncritically assumes the meaning of the object in this context. The scientific worldview assumes a particular understanding of the natural world in its investigations and determination of meaning, an atomistic or mechanistic conception of a living being. In both cases, there is no reflection regarding the meaning presupposed in the intention. The phenomenological attitude does not negate the practical or scientific world and way of being. It merely holds them in abeyance, suspending judgment. Such a suspension is motivated not by a disdain or a devaluation of the practical life, but by a love of the world. It is in this respect that Scheler describes phenomenological attitude as a psychic technique comparable to Buddhist techniques of suffering (GW VIII, 139).

Scheler shares the conviction with realist phenomenologists such as Adolf Reinach that there are essential intuitions (Wesensanschauungen) or essential insights (Wesenseinsichten) (GW X, 383), in which we have intuitive and immediate graspings of the essence of the being of the objects. This grasping of the object is never complete and assumes merely a partial insight into the thing itself (GW V, 199). Modernity, for Scheler, suffers from a fundamental mistrust of the world, a mistrust that the world given in experience is not the world itself, but rather some construct produced by the human mind. Phenomenology assumes a trust in the world and in experience. It is the world that gives itself to intuition, beckoning us to participate ever more fully in its significance. By virtue of this loving trust, the world itself is given. The phenomenological attitude is an expression on this trust and seeks to describe the object as it gives itself, as it is brought to self-givenness.

3. Value Personalism

Scheler’s first and most influential work in phenomenology was his study of ethics, Formalism in Ethics and a Non-Formal (or Material) Ethics of Value. This work was motivated in part by a critique of the highly scientific or formalistic approaches to ethics introduced by Immanuel Kant and then later developed by the Neo-Kantians during the late nineteenth and early twentieth century. Kant’s influence on Scheler’s thought cannot be underestimated. With Kant, Scheler rejects both utilitarianism and eudaimonism, and holds that ethics rests upon an a priori, an obligation non-relative to future consequences or happiness. For Kant, the a priori is expressed in the form of a categorical imperative, an imperative that is universalizable. For Scheler, such a formulation of the a priori is abstract and as a consequence, fails to account for both the unique obligation one has to another person and the unique call to responsibility given in the ethical imperative (GW II, 34). The ethical imperative, Scheler insists, is given as what one ought to necessarily do, but it is also experienced as what ‘I,’ and not merely anyone, ought to do (GW II, 94).

Scheler argues that a material or a non-formal a priori arises in experience, specifically in the experience of value. All experience is already value latent (GW II, 35). An object of perception such as an oak tree is not only green or large, but also pleasurable, beautiful and magnificent. Objects of experience are bearers of values. Historical artifacts bear cultural values, religious icons bear the value of the “holy.” To suggest that an object bears a value is not to imply that a value inheres in an object. Just as the color red does not inhere in the tricycle, but is only given in the act of perception, the beauty of the painting is only given in the act of valuing. The value an object bears is given intuitively through a type of value-ception. We “see” the beauty of a painting just as we “see” its colors. The grasping of value is our most original and primordial relation to the world. An object has value for us before it is perceived or known (GW II, 40).

Following Franz Brentano, Scheler conceived of positive and negative values as given in a relation to being. Positive values are not only given as that which entices us, but also as that which ought to be. Similarly, negative values are given as that which ought not to be (GW II, 100). In the relation values bear to existence, an ideal ought is given. What ought to be is not logically derived or categorical, but is felt, i.e., experienced. Values not only draw our attention to the world and others, but they also bear an ideal “ought.”

Valuing is an act of meaning giving or creation and is therefore an intentional act. The act of valuing is not an intellectual act, but an act of the “heart,” i.e., an emotional act. For Scheler, there are two basic emotional acts, the act of love and the act of hate. These two acts found all value-ception and consciousness (GW VII, 185). Love and hate are further characterized by Scheler as movements (GW VII, 191). In the act of love, the value of an object or a person is deepened, revealing its highest or most profound significance. Hate, by contrast, is a movement of destruction, a movement wherein the value of an object or a person is demeaned or degraded.

The feelings of love and hate are the acts in which the world first comes to have meaning for us and a preferencing is inherent in this process. We tend toward or are attracted to that which is of greater or positive value, and tend to move away from or are repelled by that which is of lesser or negative value. Present in every experience is a ranking of values, a preference of certain values to others (GW II, 104). That there is an order of preferencing in experience is perhaps best demonstrated by the act of sacrifice. For the sake of a particular life value such as health, we may sacrifice pleasurable experiences such as an overindulgence of ice-cream. An order of value preferencing is present in every experience and every individual possesses such an ordering, what Scheler calls “an ethos.”

It is in the experience of value preferencing that Scheler further clarifies the ethical a priori. There is, according to Scheler, an objective ranking of values, a ranking of the “lower” to the “higher,” or better expressed, a ranking of the more superficial to the deeper. The ranking of value types from lowest to highest is as follows: pleasure, utility, vitality, culture, and holiness. How the different types of value stand in relation to one another is grasped intuitively in the experience of value. Evidence of this ranking is felt through experiences like duration (GW II, 108) or depth of fulfillment (GW II, 113). Claiming that there is an objective order of values, or in Pascal’s terminology, an “ordre du coeur” (order of the heart), necessarily entails that the higher values “ought” to be preferred to the lower. We ought to act in such a manner that promotes the higher or positive values. This non-formal or material a priori of value is not given prior to experience, but it is present in the experience of the particular value modalities. A religious icon is given not only as holy, but also as that which is to be preferred to the merely useful or vital. What types of value an object has is relative to the individual or culture. A cow certainly has a different value for the Hindu than for the rancher. Nonetheless, that the holy is to be preferred to the vital is not historically or culturally relative.

Both the experience of value and the objective rank ordering of values are felt by a distinctive type of being, what Scheler calls “persons.” “Person” is a notion that Kant also uses and this is one of the reasons why Scheler uses the term. In a manner quite similar to the problem of the a priori, Scheler wants to retain Kant’s understanding of “person” as absolute value, an end in itself Scheler is critical of Kant in so far as Kant grounds the absolute value of the person in the universal category of reason.

Scheler describes the person as the concrete unity of acts of different types and nature (GW II, 382). The person is present in each and every act, but the person is not reducible to any one act. “Unity” here is meant as a particular style, a style of act execution and being. Every individual has his or her unique style of loving, of assigning meaning, and necessarily has his or her own access to the world. When a person dies, not only is that unique style of loving and assigning meaning lost, but so is that world.

Understood as the unity of acts or an act center, the person is necessarily non-objectifiable (GW II, 386). Objects only take on the meaning as objects through intentional acts. Persons execute intentional acts. The meaning of a person is determined by the way in which a particular person brings meaning to the world. It is never a question of what a person is, but who a person is. Scheler takes great pains to distinguish his notion of person from the traditional notions of subject, ego, mind or psyche. All of these traditional, philosophical notions are objectifications, i.e. names given to particular states, functions or capacities. Who a person is cannot be captured by a definition and can only be grasped through value insight, an immediate and direct grasping of the other as a person in and through the act of love (GW II, 483)[1]. The human being is constituted as person most profoundly through loving.

The imperative that is given in the value a priori, the objective rank order of values, is only felt by persons and, consequently, persons are the only beings who are ethically responsible. Because every experience is value latent, a person is responsible to love the object or a being of that experience most fully, realizing the highest or deepest value of that being. In relation with other persons, this responsibility is ethical. In loving another person, one is called ethically to love ever more fully and deeply. Failing to do so and responding to this calling through acts of hate is not only ethically irresponsible but it is also morally evil. Any act that compromises or reduces the person to a lower value such as mere pleasure or utility is pernicious and evil.

The good in itself is thus a movement and openness to the higher or deeper values. In the experience of positive values, we, as persons, are called to love others ever more profoundly. In the experience of negative values, we are called to act in such a manner that ends the destructive acts of hate and consequently brings an end to negative values. The call to act for the sake of the good itself is, for Scheler, not general or universal, but radically individual or rather, unique. There is no experience of the good in itself in general, but only the good in itself for me, and this constitutes in part the experience of vocation peculiar to each unique person as creatively becoming (GW II, 482). The deeper the value, the more individual, the more personal, the call to act for the sake of the good becomes. Ethical experience, the experience of being called to act for the good, is a process of individuation (GW II, 501). The call becomes ever more personal as the value deepens. In acting ethically, I come to realize my unique place and contribution, and as a result, I become more conscious of my obligation and duties to the world and to others. A material value ethic, in contrast to a formal ethic, reveals both the radically unique manner by which each person is called to act and the radically unique value of each and every person.

4. Others, Community and Solidarity

There is, for Scheler, no problem of the other. This is not to say that he rejects the alterity or difference of the other. What Scheler rejects is the presumed starting point of the so-called other minds, a starting point that posits one mind over and against another, assuming that we are first alone and then enter into relationships with others. The consciousness of oneself as a self and as a person is always experienced within the context of a “member of a totality” (GW II, 510). Every experience, in other words, assumes as background the “experiencing with one another” (Miteinander-erleben) as well as the responsibility for others and the co-responsibility for the community. All investigations that begin with the problem of the other presuppose this primordial communal background. Phenomenologically, the task is not to take this background for granted but to clarify the different types of experiences that constitute this communal background and those experiences that give rise to a sense of mine-ness and otherness.

Scheler’s investigation into this primordial background begins at the affective or emotional level of experience. The affective life precedes the intellectual life. In the case of the experience of others, there is an affective or emotional understanding of others prior to any intellectual or rational understanding. The work dedicated to this investigation is Scheler’s The Nature of Sympathy (original German title, Wesen und Formen der Sympathie literally means the Essence and Forms of Sympathy). His main intent in this work was to show that it is impossible to derive an ethic from merely shared feelings and consequently to show that ethics assumes as original an intention of love. In order to demonstrate this point, Scheler provides a detailed analysis of the different types of shared feelings, which are themselves irreducible to loving.

There are at least five different types of shared or co-feelings:

  1. Feeling with one another (Miteinanderfühlen):
    Two or more people feel the same feeling together. Scheler gives an example of two parents. They share a love for their child and they also share the pain or joy felt for that child. In the tragic death of a child, parents share the same pain, feeling the same sadness and loss together. Certainly, parents of a child will have many different feelings for their child between them. Scheler is only describing the phenomenon of when parents feel the same feeling together.

  2. Vicarious feeling (Nachfühlen):
    Scheler refers to this type of shared feeling throughout his analysis, but does not include it in his discussion of the specific types of co-feelings. In vicarious feeling, there is no genuine sharing or co-experiencing of a feeling. It is a type of grasping a feeling in the other without any subsequent feeling of the grasped pain or joy, a feeling at a distance. This grasping is not necessarily an intellectual comprehension, but an emotional or bodily comprehension. Any recognition of the feeling of others, including empathy, assumes some form of vicarious feelings.

  3. Fellow feeling (Mitgefühl):
    This form of co-feeling is often referred to as sympathy or pity. Here there is the intention of the other, a feeling for the other. When a friend is in pain, not only do I share his or her pain, but I feel for my friend. The shared feeling is not the same and there remains a clear distinction between me and the other. To distinguish fellow feeling from vicarious feeling, Scheler uses the example of cruelty (GW VII, 25). The reason why human beings are so good at torture is that we can vicariously feel and comprehend what it would be like to be harmed in such a manner. In vicarious feeling, we do not feel the other’s pain. In genuine cases of fellow feeling, we not only share in the suffering the other feels, but we also feel for the person who suffers, often motivated to act to end the suffering.

  4. Psychic Contagion (Gefühlansteckung):
    Experiences in which a person is overtaken by a feeling to such an extent that he or she gets lost in it with others is the phenomenon of psychic contagion. Scheler uses the example of being taken over by the joyous atmosphere in a bar to make his point. After a difficult day “at the office,” you walk into a bar and are immediately overtaken by the celebratory atmosphere, completely forgetting your day and troubles. In contrast to the other types of co-feeling, psychic contagion is the experience of losing yourself in the feeling or mood of the group. The “I” and “you” become a “we.” In the midst of this experience, we do things we would not necessarily do in a different setting. Psychic contagion can, thus, be quite dangerous, as is the case with mob violence, for instance.

  5. Identification (Einsfühlung):
    Not to be confused with Einfühlung (empathy), identification is a limit case of psychic contagion. In identification, the “I” is lost and literally becomes the other. I no longer feel the pain in me, but only in the other. There is no distance between the I and you and I am transported, so to speak, into the other, inhabiting his or her body as if it were mine. I may identify with the experience so deeply that I live it in the other. The experiences Scheler has in mind here are mystical experiences where a person “becomes” the god or hypnotic experiences where the individual thinks and wills according to the hypnotist. (GW VII, 31)

All of these experiences of co-feeling are involuntary and take place regardless of whether we want to experience them. We become conscious of them only after the fact, realizing perhaps that we are already laughing or crying. They demonstrate that at the most basic level, we are drawn to others and are inclined to participate in the lives and feelings of others (GW VII, 241). This is most clearly evident in cases of self-deception or confusion, cases when two or more persons confuse their ideas and experiences with each other’s, forgetting whose experiences or ideas they were originally.

In Formalism in Ethics and a Non-Formal Ethics of Value, Scheler builds upon these analyses to describe the distinctive types of communities in which human beings participate. This description falls under the heading of “Collective Person” (Gesamtperson). Persons are act-centers, the unity in the execution of acts. “Collective Person” refers to a distinctive unity of the execution, what Scheler calls “social acts.” Social acts are inherently directed at other persons and are only fully executed in relation to others. Examples of social acts are acts of promising, commanding, and obeying. A promise is not a promise until the other accepts it; a command is not a command if the other does not hear it, etc. These acts are distinct from the intimate or singularizing acts, acts such as self-consciousness, self-love, self-respect, etc. (GW II, 511) They are directed at the self and are fulfilled with reference only to the self. These different types of acts show that the person is both an individual and a member of a community or collectivity. Distinguishing between different types of acts does not entail that we are many different persons. It means, rather, that our person, our style of being, is expressed both as an individual and as a member of a community.

Scheler identifies four different types of communities or social unities.

  1. The Herd or Mass:
    This community type refers to a group formed through psychic contagion and other forms of involuntary repetition. As a member of a herd, one has no self-consciousness. In the herd, one’s actions are dictated by the whims and the irrationality of the masses. Caught up in the excitement or throes of the herd, one is no longer fully responsible for his or her actions. For this reason, mass movements are potentially liberating as well as dangerous and susceptible to dictatorship.

  2. Life-Community (Lebensgemeinschaft):
    This community type is formed through genuine acts of co-feeling and co-living. The subject of these shared feelings and experiences is, however, the community and not the individual. There is a sense of the self and a sense of belonging to a community with the others. But this self is not radically distinct from the community and the others. One’s striving is the striving of the community, a shared preferencing and valuing developed through traditions, rites, norms, etc. In a life-community, there is a sense of solidarity, a sense of being responsible for others and for the group. This responsibility is, however, not fully moral and the solidarity is a “representable solidarity.” By “representable,” Scheler means that anyone in the group can represent the others, can take responsibility for the others in the same manner.

  3. Society (Gesellschaft):
    All communal bonds in a society are formed artificially and consciously by each member (in contrast to the organic and unconscious bonds of a life-community). A society is made up of individuals who choose to form relations for the sake of personal welfare, particularly at the level of pleasure and utility. It has no reality beyond the individuals who make up the collectivity; the whole is equal to the sum of its parts (whereas a life-community is a whole that is greater than the sum of its parts). The formation of society is motivated by a fundamental mistrust in others, creating bonds for the sake of security.

    Much of Scheler’s characterization of society has a negative ring, particularly in comparison to what he says of the life-community. He does make clear that society is the introduction of the mature individual and the self-conscious human being. A member of the life-community, by contrast, is not yet an individual and is, in this respect, immature (unmündig). For Scheler, the rise of society is a genuine development in history. Nonetheless, the life-community is foundational for society. This is shown by virtue of the contracts forming the bonds of society. Contracts are grounded in the promise and assume a level of trust, a trust that is first cultivated in the life-community.

  4. Collective Person:
    “Collective Person” is the deepest and the most profound level of community. To a certain extent, it is the evolutionary outcome of both the life-community and society. But “ontologically” speaking, the loving community (Liebesgemeinschaft) is foundational for the other forms listed above. What most distinctively characterizes the collective person is its sense of solidarity. Each member of the community is not only fully responsible for his or her actions, but is also co-responsible for the actions of others and of the community. In contrast to the life-community, each member is self-aware of him or herself as an individual, as a fully realized person. Yet, in contrast to society, the individual is caught up in a network of relations with others. The sense of solidarity in the collective person is that of an “unrepresentable” solidarity. Every member of the collective person is absolutely unique. No one can stand in for anyone else and each bears responsibility for others and for the group.

Within the notion of the collective person, Scheler describes three different types: the state (or nation), culture (or people) and the church. The main difference between these three types is the range or extent of responsibility. Every citizen of the state is co-responsible for every other citizen, a limit defined by state or national borders (as well as recognized members of the citizenry). A culture is demarcated by the borders created by shared values, beliefs, and ideas. These borders are often more expansive than a state, but many different cultures can be found in a state. The church is the most expansive of the types of collective persons and includes all finite persons. It is the fullest realization of what Scheler calls “the love community” (Liebesgemeinschaft). The sense of solidarity concerns the salvation of all finite persons, past, present and future. Although these different types of collective persons can be ranked with respect to their related values (life, spirit, holy), they enjoy their own autonomy and Scheler insists upon a clear divide between not only church and state, but also culture and state.

The most crucial notion that arises from Scheler’s analysis of the collective person is that of solidarity. Solidarity assumes two distinct types of responsibility: a responsibility for one’s own actions and a co-responsibility for the actions of others. Co-responsibility does not compromise the autonomy of the individual. Every person is fully responsible for his or her actions. For Scheler, co-responsibility is a radical form of questioning. When another person commits an act of hate or violence, the questions implied in solidarity are how such acts are possible and how I have participated in creating a world wherein such acts are possible. The act of hate committed by another person signals that I (and each member of the given community) have not loved deeply enough and that we as a community have failed to bring about a world wherein hate does not exist (GW II, 526). Solidarity assumes the manner in which we have shared our lives and feelings with one another in a community, but also the necessity for a person to act to end evil and injustice. The presence of evil in one’s community demonstrates that every member ought to love more fully and act so that evil is not possible. At the level of the collective person, this call to responsibility is felt uniquely by each person, revealing the uniqueness of one’s role in and for the community.

Sharing a community with others and sharing the responsibility for the community with others is the context in which the person is formed and realized. It is not the answer to the epistemological question regarding the knowledge of the other or of other minds. In his relatively brief analysis of this question, Scheler agrees that the core of the person is not given in perception, at least not in the sense that his or her physical body is given as an object of perception (GW VII, 238). Perception, however, is only one means of givenness and hence only one means of access to the other. It is only in the act of love that the other person is given (GW II, 483). The givenness of the other is irreducible to any physical or psychic characteristics. In the act of love, there is an immediate intuition of the person, an “ungrounded” plus (GW VII, 168). Evidence of this plus is our inability to state the reasons and prove why we love the other even though we are certain of our love.

Love, therefore, does not afford us a rational understanding of the other person. What it offers is a means by which to participate in the way of being and loving of the other. In order to “understand” the other, we have to love like the other (GW II, 169). Afforded in this experience of loving is access to the world of the other and the moral (or ideal) value of the other. It is not a matter of reading the other’s mind, of knowing what the other is thinking. Rather, love grants us an understanding of who the other is. The deepest experiences of love for the other reveals the absolute or holy value of the other, grasping who the other could be or ought to become. For Scheler, it is possible that another person may know me better than I know myself and he or she may be able to direct me to my ideal way of being (GW II, 483). The understanding of the other through love is a value comprehension. This is not a full disclosure of the other, but a deepening of appreciation of who the other is, an appreciation that calls me to love the other ever more profoundly.

5. Religious Experience

Scheler’s work on the phenomenology of religious experience is one of his most significant contributions to the phenomenological tradition. Contrary to his contemporaries such as Husserl and Heidegger who persist on bracketing out the question of God or the holy, Scheler examines the experience in a direct and explicit manner. Scheler’s insistence on the possibility of a phenomenology of religious experience, an insistence that it is possible to provide a description of the essential qualities and conditions of the experience of the holy, is itself a critique of modernity and of the positivistic tendencies growing in philosophical and scientific thought.

According to Scheler, the modern worldview harbors a prejudice with respect to what counts as an experience or what is evidential. For the modern thinker, only those experiences that can be proven in a rational or logical manner are true or evidential experiences (GW V, 104). The prejudice is not that matters of faith or religious experience are not meaningful, but that they are not subject to rigorous scientific or critical investigation. Because they lie outside the bounds of reason, we are, as Wittgenstein would say, to remain silent. For Scheler, the problem in modernity is that only one type or form of evidence is regarded as objective or true, the mode of rational proof. Inherent to the practice of phenomenology is the openness to distinctive modes of evidence. Any presupposition about what counts as objective or subjective, as true or merely psychological must be held in abeyance. For Scheler, the experience of the holy or of the absolute is not given through rational proof, but in the distinctive evidential mode of revelation (GW V, 150). All rational proofs already assume the experience or the revelation of God and thus come too late in the attempt to grasp how the holy or the absolute is experienced (GW V, 249). Scheler’s approach is to grant revelation its own integrity and to treat it as a meaningful experience subject to philosophical investigation.

It is important to note at the outset of a discussion of Scheler’s work on religious experience that he prefaces his major work on religious experience, Vom Ewigen des Menschens (On the Eternal in Man), with a description of the religious and existential crisis that humanity faced at the end of World War I. Many, including Scheler, had hoped that the Great War would reawaken a sense of dignity both in one’s culture and in humanity in general. The war failed miserably in this respect and has left humanity only “drunk” with suffering, death and tears (GW V, 103). In this moment of despair comes the call to a religious renewal, a call that concerns the very meaning and purpose of human existence. For Scheler, World War I was the first collective experience of humanity as such, i.e., an experience shared by all (GW V, 104). Consequently, the call to renewal, the desperate seeking of the meaning of existence, is a call experienced by all of humanity. It has thus never been so crucial to understand the meaning of revelation and the experience of the absolute, for the danger of the rise of an idol or a false god has never been so imminent. Whoever or whatever may step in to answer this call to renewal during these times of crisis potentially has the power to determine the meaning and course of humanity.

A phenomenology of religious experience is, for Scheler, a description of the essential characteristics and the meaning of revelation. Scheler defines revelation simply as the specific type of givenness wherein the divine or the holy is given (GW V, 249). “Givenness” is a term used by Scheler and other phenomenologists to name that which is experienced in a particular act. It is, more precisely, the objective correlate of the intentional act. There is the intending on the part of the person and that which is given, the object or meaning. To suggest that revelation is a peculiar mode of givenness is to say that the divine or the holy is given to the person in a unique manner that is wholly distinct from perceived objects or rational judgments. The attempt to describe the essential characteristics of revelation, characteristics that show how revelation is distinct from other modes of givenness, assumes that revelation has its own particular sense of lawfulness (GW V, 242). This means that the investigation into the nature of revelation must follow the logic demonstrated in the revelatory experience itself and on its own accord.

Scheler distinguishes three essential characteristics of the act of revelation that are unique to the religious act.

  1. The intention of the religious act is world transcendence. Scheler is committed to the idea that the religious act is an intentional act. The intention is the so-called subject correlate of the act of intentionality. In the case of revelation, this intention is a transcendence of anything finite (i.e.of this world) (GW V, 245). This is not to say that revelation is not of this world or does not take place in this world, nor does it mean that the holy is not experienced in a finite object such as a religious icon or a finite person. Rather, it means that what is posited in the act of revelation is always other than this world, a meaning transcending the finite or the relative.

  2. The objective correlate of the religious intention is also infinite in its meaning and value. Only the divine or the holy fulfills the intention of the religious act. No finite thing of any kind, no finite good or object of love can fulfill the religious act. This is not to say that we are not at times mistaken and erringly take a finite object as infinite, as in the case of idolatry. What is sought in the religious act is precisely that which in principle could not be experienced in this world. We are seeking a happiness that would never be possible on earth and we are hoping in the religious act for that which is impossible and unimaginable (GW V, 246).

  3. Finally, the religious act is only fulfilled through a reception (Aufnahme) of the divine that reveals itself to another being. (GW V, 245). In revelation, something is given, i.e., experienced. Scheler rejects the idea that the experience of the divine is wholly immanent and could be explained through an objectivization of an immanent experience, an experience motivated by and in the person. For this reason, the religious act is not subjective. It is a response to that which is given, a response to the divine that gives itself. The essential difference between so-called natural religion (where the world is given as God’s creation) and positive religion (where the experience of the divine is personal) lies in the way that the divine reveals itself. The revelation found in natural religion is generic: God is given in nature for all to see. Revelation in positive religion is the experience of a wholly unique relation. God gives him or herself to me in a manner that is particular to me (GW V, 249).

It is this third and final aspect of the religious act that marks Scheler’s contribution to the investigation of revelation. Scheler’s claim is that for there to be a religious act, the divine must be given in experience. The question that immediately arises, particularly within the context of the modern worldview, is how we know that this experience is real and not imaginary or merely subjective. Scheler agrees that there is no way to prove deductively or rationally that this experience was indeed real or that the divine exists. The givenness of the divine is its demonstration. Scheler uses the German term Aufweis to distinguish the particular way in which the reality or truth of the experience is given in revelation. An Aufweis is a pointing out or a showing of. The divine shows itself in such a manner that its existence cannot be proven by the use of reason. In the experience of the divine, the existence of the divine is given. For this reason, it is impossible to prove to anyone who has not had a religious experience that God or a god exists.

As with much of his research, Scheler’s investigation into the religious act is ultimately rooted in a a study of the meaning of the human being. For Scheler, the religious act is a fundamental and essential aspect of being human (GW V, 261). Each and every human being executes the intending of the absolute or the divine and is always a response to the givenness of the absolute. A human being is a God-seeker. This is not to say that everyone believes that there is a God, but only that each and every one of us executes the religious intention, an intending of the absolute.

Atheism is not a disproof of Scheler’s claim; it is only a rejection of God’s existence. That there is a negation of the divine in atheism only demonstrates that even the atheist executes the religious act. The negation of the divine only makes sense in the context of the religious act. For the atheist, one may very well intend the divine, but such intentions are only met with great disappointment. The agnostic, on the other hand, holds open the possibility that the divine exists. For Scheler, the agnostic is a metaphysical nihilist, a person who rejects that we could ever know with certainty that there is a God.

Scheler’s claim that the human being is a God seeker allows for the beliefs of atheists and agnostics, but it leads him to a much stronger claim: “Every finite spirit believes either in a God or in an idol” (GW V, 261). An idol is a finite object that is treated as if it were infinite, as if it were God (GW V, 263). The atheist is not really, according to Scheler, a non-believer. Rather, the atheist believes in a no-God, that there is no absolute value or meaning. This is still a religious act and a religious belief. Scheler’s point is that there is always an intending of the absolute, a seeking of a God. What is in question is necessarily the object intended as absolute. In the act of idolatry, this God is a finite object or a good such as wealth, fame or power. The risk of idolatry is ever present, a risk entailed in the radical openness of the human being to absolute value. Whether God exists or not is irrelevant here. What the investigation of the religious act and religious experience demonstrates is that being human is an opening; a human being is open to the absolute and the divine.

A final note and a useful transition into the next subject heading concerns the relation between religions themselves and the question concerning the diversity or variety of religious experience. The image Scheler uses to depict the relation that different religions and cultures bear to one another is that of a tributary all flowing into the same river toward the same end point (GW XIII, 92). Religious experience yields only a glimpse of the holy and provides only a partial, but original insight. Although all religious insight yields such a partial glimpse, not all insights are of the same depth. Some of the deepest insights into the holy have formed and led to the major religions of the world. These rivers may intersect, divide or share certain pathways, but none serves or can serve as the disproof of the other. Religious faith and beliefs are of the most deeply rooted and significant, and consequently can often lead to great conflict with other faiths. In his more hopeful moments, Scheler thought that the increasingly shrinking world promised the opportunity to understand the different religious insights and form a greater understanding of the divine. Yet, he also warned that these conflicts of faith may continue to lead to the bloodiest of wars. Acknowledging a genuine religious diversity does not commit one to the view that all religious ideas or beliefs are of the same value, but rather to the realization that there are genuine and irreconcilable differences between them. How we reconcile and live in a smaller world with these differences will determine whether the future will be one of war or one of peace.

6. Social and Political Theory

Scheler’s social and political thought matures in the fertile intellectual ground of the sociological and political debates of the early 20th century. The context of Scheler’s thought is the creation of sociology as a discipline and Scheler seeks to place himself in the critical exchange with the major players of this time in sociology and politics, such as Max Weber, Emile Durkheim, Wilhelm Dilthey, Oswald Spengler, Herbert Spencer, Ferdinand Tönnies and Karl Schmitt. Scheler’s socio-political thought was born from within the cultural crisis experienced in Germany both preceding and most emphatically following World War I.

Early in his writings, Scheler represents the Christian voice of the left. The central question for Scheler and for socio-political thought at this time in Germany was whether an alternative to either liberalism or socialism was possible. Scheler argues early that Christian democracy is the most profound and viable alternative, showing how the resource for a cultural and political renewal is the Christian notion of love and solidarity. The explicitly religious aspect of Scheler’s socio-political thought lessens to a degree in the latter stages of his thought, but he never abandons the idea of solidarity as the basis for a more just and peaceful future, a future where the people collectively and in solidarity take up the task of transforming the world in which we live.

Scheler’s premature death would prevent him from experiencing firsthand the unthinkable and horrific consequences of the social and political crises Germany faced during the early 20th century. The crisis was for him not merely a German problem, but the problem of modernity in general. Scheler did not hesitate to speak in general and singularizing terms like “the German culture,” “the European culture” or even “the West.” With such generalities as “the modern worldview,” Scheler could identify the underlying ethos, i.e., the order of valuing, of a culture and describe the dominant tendencies responsible for the social and cultural crisis. However, Scheler used the terms “the German culture” or “the European culture” as a means to preserve a unique and irreplaceable spiritual development of a people. The attempt to defend the meaning and culture of a people continued to be a cause for tension in Scheler’s thought, a tension that would lead him to defend German aggression at the outset of World War I and a tension that motivated his critique of fascism and his support for the necessity of the ideal of peace.

The crisis of modernity was, for Scheler, the result of three central factors or mindsets: (1) the rise of late capitalism, (2) the mechanization of nature, and (3) liberal individualism. Scheler’s description of these three as “mindsets” (Denkformen) is purposeful. Particularly in respect to capitalism, he wants to distinguish his work from that of Weber and Sombart, specifically from their work on the “spirit” of capitalism. On the other hand, he wants to retain an understanding of capitalism, for instance, as not merely an economic system, but as an approach and a way of configuring the world.

Capitalism, the mechanization of nature and liberal individualism are reductive mindsets. A reductive mindset is a way of viewing the world that devalues all other possible views. The mechanization of nature, for example, becomes not merely one form of knowledge of nature, but the only way in which to know it. All reductive mindsets are, for Scheler, ultimately rooted in a value reversal. The value reversal that all three of these mindsets share is the promotion of utility over the value of life. As a consequence, a living being only has value in so far as it is useful. Late capitalism is the economic expression of the value reversal. All goods, objects and beings are valuable only in so far as they are able to generate more wealth. The mechanization of nature is the reduction of a living being to a mechanism or a machine for the purposes of manipulation and control and for achieving some useful end for human beings. Liberal individualism is the reduction of all forms of community to society. As a result, all interpersonal relations are regarded as artificial and contractual, relations formed for the benefit of the individual’s interests.

Together these different but related mindsets create a worldview, the modern Weltanschauung, and succeed in transforming the world into an object of utility. The value reduction to utility poses not only a threat to the life and the welfare of living beings, but also to the cultural and spiritual values. Utility, as the dominant value, does not destroy the higher values. It cultivates, rather, a type of value blindness. People lose sight of the value of spiritual pursuits such as the arts, philosophy and religion. Spiritual values are only noticed through their usefulness. When a culture becomes blind to the higher values, it also loses sight of its uniqueness as a culture and as a people. At the level of utility, people are more alike. Cultural differences matter very little when the goals become efficiency and productivity. It is the higher, spiritual values that reveal the uniqueness of a specific culture. The end of the modern worldview, Scheler maintains, is an internationalization of all cultures, a making of all peoples and cultures one and the same (GW IV, 600).

Scheler has little interest in merely remaining a spectator to the crisis and his writing offers the means to overcome it. While he analyzes the main factors responsible for the crisis of modernity, Scheler’s suggestions for overcoming it change dramatically. His first and most troublesome response to the crisis was war. During his time earning a living as a freelance writer, Scheler worked for the state’s office of propaganda during the year leading up to and immediately following the outbreak of World War I. Like many intellectuals at the time, Scheler was a vociferous defender of German aggression and thought that the war could function as a means to awaken the German people from cultural slumber and value blindness. In his major work on the war, Der Genius des Krieges und der deutsche Krieg (The Genius of War and the German War) Scheler distinguishes three different levels on which war functions as a cultural renewal.

  1. Scheler argues that war is quite natural to life as it is a natural consequence of the organism’s growth. More importantly, these conflicts among living beings function as an important reminder of the value of life and the types of trusting and communal relations that emerge through a sharing of life with other human beings.

  2. War is also a significant factor in the growth of a culture. The Great War was a war of culture and lifestyles. Through this conflict, Germany would be reminded of its uniqueness. Conflict serves as an incredibly stark reminder of how one’s own culture differs from someone else’s. This must not necessarily be a judgment of which culture is better, but rather functions as an awakening to one’s own particular culture and one’s particular role in preserving and promoting one’s own culture.

  3. Finally, Scheler discusses the value level of the holy and it is at this level that the war finds its greatest significance. Scheler begins this analysis by showing first how war and violence are not anti-religious acts, but are very much a part of religious belief, attempting to make sense of loving one’s enemy on the battlefield. These remarks are only preparatory. The genuine holy significance of the war for Germany comes from the realization that the war is a battle for justice. Scheler is not pro-war and argues that the only justified war is a defensive war that defends against the annihilation of the significant values of a culture (GW IV, 101). For Scheler, Germany is not the aggressor, but England is. This aggression is only made explicit through the type of worldview and mindset analysis that Scheler gives. At stake is the annihilation of the German people, a wholly unjust act. Hence, when Germany rises to battle, it is defending not only itself, but also justice, fighting against tyrannical forces aiming to destroy a culture and a people.

Scheler’s analysis and justification of German aggression leading to the war is confused for many reasons, many of which Scheler himself acknowledges in his later writings. A central confusion Scheler recognizes concerns the meaning and the possibility of renewal. Renewal, as Scheler writes later, only takes place through an act of repentance and thus can never be motivated by hatred. Scheler writes specifically with respect to the possibility of a political reconstruction that what is necessary is a collective proclamation of guilt, not merely for the war, but also for the cultural depression and value degradation for which every member of the German and European community is responsible (GW V, 416). Acts of repentance, individual or collective, assume a moral transformation. Whereas war finds its resource for renewal through the violent conflict with the enemy, repentance grounds its renewal in the ethical insight into the person I ought to be. The act of repentance and the expression of guilt are acts of disclosure, revealing what kind of person one ought to be in contrast to the kind of person one has been. These acts demonstrate that the person has become a more loving human being. Transformation, either for the individual or for a people, is motivated by this moral ideal disclosed in the act of repentance.

Scheler describes this sense of transformation as a transformation “from above” (GW IV, 397). It is a rejection of what Scheler takes to be the socialist form of transformation, a transformation from below. What Scheler thinks is lacking in socialism and Marxism is a sense of the absolute value of the person. A transformation from below, a transformation fueled by class conflict or other economic factors, fails to recognize the uniqueness and the value of each person. Such recognition is possible only at the spiritual or ideal level of insight. Socialism, according to Scheler, regards the person only in terms of the basic life values and consequently seeks only to transform the given social and political context from this perspective, a perspective which treats all person as if they were the same.. A transformation from above takes the person as the highest value and transforms the given conditions in accord with uniqueness of each and every individual.

Scheler is not interested in a revolution and at no time speaks of a possible overthrow of the existing governments in Germany or in Europe. The revolutionary act comes in the form of an act of resurgence in the community and the specific sense of responsibility developed through the bonds of solidarity. Solidarity is the principle that guides the generation of a Christian community and it is on this form of community that Scheler hopes to found a new Germany and Europe (GW VI, 264). In this second phase of Scheler’s social and political thought, he was attracted to the manner by which the person as absolute value was realized in the bonds of solidarity. In solidarity, a person comes to realize not only his or her co-responsibility for every member of the group, but also his or her unique calling to act on behalf of the good and the just. The bonds of solidarity not only overcome the individualism of liberalism and the value reduction of socialism, but they also reveal the call to act and thus to participate in the social and political reconstruction.

“Christian democracy” is the title Scheler gives to the political expression of the sense of solidarity he develops in the second phase of his social and political thought (GW IV, 676–687). Scheler does not return to this notion again, but it does isolate the three basic aspects of his political thought that grew out of this period of his thought and that informed his later thought as well. These three aspects of Christian democracy are as follows: (1) Each and every member is called to act by virtue of a sense of co-responsibility for every other member and for the group as a whole, an expression of collective self-governance, (2) the basic vital needs and goods are provided to all, preserving the life-community of a people, and (3) dignity and humility are the central virtues that preserve the radical uniqueness of each and every person. A Christian democracy is a model of collective governance wherein each person is concerned about the basic welfare of all while promoting what makes each person unique. Or, in Scheler’s words, it maintains an aristocracy “in the heavens” and a democracy “on earth” (GW II, 500).

The beginning of the third phase in Scheler’s social and political thought is marked by the publication of his work, Problems of a Sociology of Knowledge. Although this idea of a sociology of knowledge is a new approach for Scheler, it does not raise a new question. In this work, Scheler investigates the manner in which values and ideals determine the course of history, i.e., what is both possible and actual for a culture. This is the same concern that Scheler raised in his work on value theory. What is novel about his later approach is an understanding of history as an interplay between two wholly distinct factors, real and ideal. Whereas Scheler’s earlier work focused primarily on the ideal or on the role of values in history, the later work places much greater emphasis on the so-called “real” factors or drives of life. This change of emphasis was motivated in part by his disappointment with the reconstructive efforts immediately after the war and the recognition that ideals and values are incapable on their own of instituting change.

There are, for a human society, three basic real factors: family, politics and economics. These three factors are rooted in the basic life-drive structure of the human being. The family is rooted in the sex drive, politics – in the power drive and economics – in the appetitive or the acquisition drive (GW VIII, 19). Life or existence is a basic urge to be (Drang) and in the human being, this urge to be is expressed in terms of the three basic drives. These drives are what makes all that is possible and in terms of the development of history, the drives are what makes history possible.

Ideal factors are activities such as art, philosophy, science and religion. These factors are rooted in spirit, a movement expressed in each human being that discloses the higher values and ideals. The ideal factors enjoy a development independent of the real and have their own logic of development. The real or actual does not determine what is or what can be thought. Culture is the arena in which spirit unfolds, but this unfolding is particular to each and every culture. Scheler adamantly rejects any idea of a world-spirit or eternal objective logos directing the course of human history and of every culture (GW VIII, 27). There is, by the very nature of spirit itself, a diversity of cultures, each having its own organizational structure and function (GW VIII, 25). The development of a culture rests on the particular insights of its people and proceeds along the course particular to that culture.

With respect to existence, however, the ideal factors are powerless. They cannot on their own accord realize any idea or value. Their power lies in their ability to direct and channel the real factors of history. They are parasitic in this manner upon the real factors, having power only in so far as they are able to determine the course of the real factors. The life drives are what gives spirit its power to exist. History, therefore, takes place through the interplay of the real and the ideal factors. Its course is determined by which ideas and values become dominant in directing the life drives.

This process of determining the real factors and realizing the ideal is the process of spiritualization and it defines the task of being human. A sociology of knowledge is an examination of how certain ideas and values have shaped the real factors, giving rise to diverse expressions of the family, politics and economics. Politically, spiritualization is not only the process by which the drive to power is directed by the higher values of spirit, the transformation of physical power into political power, but also an understanding that ideas alone do not change the course of history. Politics is an activity that engages the real and thus must unfold through action. The loving bonds of solidarity may give rise to deeper insights regarding the value of a person, but these insights only come to have an effective force if they are realized in the acts of persons.

Throughout his political writings, Scheler was prone to raising ultimatums for Germany and Europe. During the events leading up to World War I, either Germany would fight for its and Europe’s cultural dignity, or Europe would cease to exist. Immediately after the war, it was once again an “either/or” frame in terms of the existence of Europe: either Europe would generate itself again from the loving bonds of community and solidarity, or it would collapse under the pressures of capitalism, liberalism and the mechanization of nature. Scheler never stopped fearing the destructive ideals and values inherent to modernity. Yet, his greatest political fear was political indifference (GW XIII, 72). Indifference leads only to despotism, he writes, and with the looming threat of fascism throughout Europe it was more important than ever for the people of Europe to act. Despite a history that only knows violence and war, peace remains a possibility. In his essay on the eternal ideal of peace, Scheler writes that peace is always a future possibility, but that this eternal ideal will not realize itself. The realization of peace requires direct political action that must spring collectively from each and every member (GW XIII, 121). Scheler’s mature social and political thought demonstrates the necessity of action and the possible terror that will ensue when indifference and apathy become the cultural norm.

7. Philosophical Anthropology and Metaphysics

In the Preface to the volume, The Forms of Knowledge and Society, Scheler remarks that the works contained in the volume, The Sociology of Knowledge and Cognition and Work, are a means to understand both his philosophical anthropology and metaphysics (GW VIII, 11). Many of the themes present in this volume are developed in a more speculative manner. Scheler has been often criticized for taking this metaphysical turn, a turn apparently defying his earlier phenomenological investigations and a turn taken at a time that many were declaring to be the end of the metaphysics and metaphysical systems. For Scheler, the move was necessary to counteract the forces found in the mindsets that underpin those positive sciences that render metaphysical and philosophical investigations meaningless. More importantly, this metaphysical turn was also necessary to grasp more profoundly the crisis haunting modernity.

The social and political tensions erupting in Germany and Europe, tensions Scheler feared would lead to a second and even bloodier World War, had their roots in a much deeper crisis, an ontological crisis, a crisis of the human being. This crisis is perhaps best captured by Scheler in his essay, The Human Being and History. Scheler writes, “In our ten-thousand year history, we are the first time period in which the human being has become fully and totally ‘problematic’; the first time period in which the human being no longer knows who he or she is, but also knows that he or she does not know” (GW IX, 120). The purpose of the later speculative work was not merely to clarify the nature of the crisis, but also to problematize what had become unproblematic, to show that the human being is a question that ought to be considered.

Philosophical anthropology is an attempt to provide a unified account of the meaning of the human being. In a much earlier work, The Idea of the Human Being, Scheler writes that the human being is undefinable (GW III, 186). The human being is no thing, but rather a “becoming,” a “between,” a “self-transcending being.” An attempt at a unified account is thus not a search for a definition, but rather an attempt to clarify exactly that which makes the human being undefinable, that which reveals human being as a human becoming. A philosophical anthropology is historical in as much as it investigates the dominant worldviews that harbor a basic insight into the meaning of being human. The three dominant insights that Scheler wishes to unify are (1) the human being as “tool maker” (homo faber), the insight of Darwinian evolution and science, (2) the human being as rational animal, the insight directing the ancient Greek worldview, and (3) the human being as child of God, the insight of the Judeo-Christian worldview. Each insight, for Scheler, reveals a peculiar aspect of the human being. The problem is that no one has yet shown how these insights are united to form a singular whole, the unity that is the human being.

A rejection of any attempt to define the human being is a rejection of the traditional attempt in philosophy to think of the human being as a substance. Scheler describes the human being not as a substance, but as the meeting point of two distinct movements (GW IX, 70). These movements are life-urge (Lebensdrang) and spirit (Geist). The distinction between these two movements follows the distinction between the real and the ideal factors introduced in the sociology of knowledge. It is only in the human being that life and spirit find themselves in a process of becoming unified. In the human being, life becomes spiritualized and spirit becomes vitalized and embodied. Every act of the human being participates in this dual process, a process that is never completed, but is recreated in every new act. Either this process participates in the realization of the deeper, spiritual values, or it is a movement toward bestialization, a realization of the more shallow and superficial values.

Life-urge is the movement found in every living being, the movement or drive to seek the greatest amount of fulfillment and vivacity with the least amount of resistance. This urge can be found in the distinct stages of evolution, whether in the most basic living organism or in the higher primates and human beings. It expresses itself in the instinctual drives as well as in the highly sophisticated intelligence needed to solve problems related to survival in an environment. Scheler argues in Cognition and Work that pragmatism has offered to date the best and the most robust account of the human being as a living being who interacts with and learns from his or her environment.

Living beings relate to their environment and to other living beings erotically, through a type of cosmic love disclosed most emphatically in the person of Saint Francis of Assisi (GW VIII, 274). As erotic-vital beings, humans seek the most vivacious and beautiful of lives. A living being desires not merely to live, but to live most fully. As living beings, we bear an erotic relation to the natural world. This loving relation to other living beings affords us a connection to others as fellow living beings, an understanding of the other as living, as sharing in an environment. Having a body affords the human being a privileged access to the living world and the environment, an access threatened by the mechanization of nature and the modern drive to dominate it.

What it means to be a living being takes on a much more complex and elevated significance in Scheler’s later work and marks a genuinely new avenue of investigation for him. Yet, the questions concerning the meaning of being human remain very much the same. Are human beings merely intelligent living beings? Is the difference between the being human and being some other animal one of degree or is it a difference of kind? Is there anything “special” or unique about being human? The answer to these questions is decisive for Scheler. At stake is the meaning of the human being as person, as absolute value. In his philosophical anthropology, Scheler attempts to demonstrate that the human being also participates in the movement of spirit and that spirit is essentially different from the movement of life. The human being has a “special” place in the cosmos because the human being participates in both the movement of life and spirit, because each human being is an embodied spirit, i.e., a finite person.

There are at least four ways in which Scheler distinguishes spirit from life.

  1. Spirit is the activity of objectivizing, a rendering of the world and of beings in terms of what they mean. Mere living beings, by contrast, relate to objects in their environment not as objects, but as that which satisfies the drives. For example, for the living being, the apple is experienced as merely something to fulfill one’s desire, whereas for the spiritual being, the apple is given as apple, as a kind of food.

  2. Related to this first characteristic, is the value latent quality of spirit. The movement of spirit is the disclosure of value. According to Scheler, life-urge is value blind and is motivated solely by greater fulfillment. Spirit is motivated by the good and is structured according to agape, a charitable and self-sacrificing love.

  3. Spirit is self-consciousness. Each living being, by virtue of having a body, exhibits a type of body-consciousness, a relating of oneself to others in a given environment. Spiritual beings not only can take themselves to be objects of reflection, and thus can be critical of who or what they have become, but are also aware of themselves as being seen by others, as having a different world of experience than others.

  4. The final distinguishing characteristic is spirit’s quality of world-openness. Spiritual beings are not restricted in their reflections to the here and now, or even to the specific context of their immediate life concerns. This type of world-openness is what is captured by the Greek sense of wonder, a metaphysical wonder and astonishment that there is something rather than nothing. Spiritual beings are able to contemplate the meaning of being, time, death as well as the purpose of existence itself. These are not merely theoretical concerns, but that which transcends, or is beyond, life.

It is the sense of spirit as world-open that leads Scheler to undertake his final reflections regarding the ground of all being or Weltgrund. These final reflections are taken not from a religious perspective, but from a metaphysical one. In this final stage of his thought, Scheler becomes increasingly critical of religion and finds that philosophy remains more true to the significance of the human being as world-open. Religion, writes Scheler, tends to conceal this openness by positing some fixed or secure notion of God (GW IX, 69). The radical openness that is spirit reveals, to the contrary, that the ground of all being is itself caught up in a process of becoming. Scheler’s understanding of God also changes. In his later thought, God is a becoming that takes place in and through the acts of all spiritual beings. It requires great courage to face a world that has no fixed meaning, a world whose meaning hangs upon the actions of each and every human being.

Outright rejected by Scheler is the creator God of the Judeo-Christian tradition. Spirit wholly lacks the power to create ex nihilo, and God as pure spirit is utterly powerless in this sense. The power of spirit lies in its ability to guide and direct the becoming of the world. God did not create the world, but allowed it to become (GW XI, 203). The world, i.e., life-urge, is the realizing factor of spirit and, in allowing the world to become, God makes it possible for goodness to be realized. Hence, the becoming of the world is, by virtue of God’s love, agape. As the meeting place of spirit and life, the human being is responsible for the becoming of God, and consequently for the realization of goodness. This task of the realization of God is one and same as the task of the realization of the deeper spiritual values. As the deeper spiritual values are realized, existence takes on a more meaningful form and ultimately points to the deepest value, the divine. Scheler’s metaphysics is the revelation of human responsibility in its most profound designation. Whether human existence is the expression of the divine or is merely relative to the basest of values depends solely on the manner in which human beings take responsibility for a future that is open. Rather than shift responsibility for the uncertain future to a particular religious practice or dogma, each person must live out the wholly indeterminate becoming of the world, the human being and God.

Scheler’s commitment to the distinctive nature of the human being and to the two irreducible movements of the Weltgrund, spirit and life-urge, leaves his final thought in a kind of dualism. He is readily aware of this and argues that his is a new type of dualism. It does not suffer from the problems introduced by the Cartesian dualism of mind and body. Yet, due in part to the unfinished nature of both his philosophical anthropology and metaphysics, we are left with more questions than answers about the relation between life and spirit. For instance, how do spirit and life interact when life is value blind and spirit is powerless? How is the human being a unity when it participates in two essentially different movements? What is clear is that these two movements constituting the unique place of the human being interpenetrate one another through a discourse of loving, the eros of life and the agape of spirit. Through his or her existence, the human beings is the unification of both forms of loving and is afforded the unique insights that arise through eros and agape. Scheler’s attempt at a metaphysics is a more speculative approach to an examination of human existence, but this speculative move is motivated by a fuller understanding of the original and loving openness the human being bears to the world.

8. Concluding Remarks

Scheler occupies a precarious position in the history of the phenomenological movement. Unlike many of the giants in the tradition, Scheler was not a student of the master, Husserl. Phenomenology is an “attitude” to which Scheler arrives after he completes his formal studies. His first published works are not, strictly speaking, phenomenological. Husserl and the phenomenological approach provided Scheler access to phenomena he had previously only hinted at or viewed from afar, phenomena such as moral and emotional experience. When Scheler was introduced to phenomenology, it was in its infancy, still discovering itself as a distinctive approach. Both of these factors, Scheler’s maturity as a philosopher and phenomenology’s immaturity as a movement, provided Scheler the freedom to develop phenomenology in his own unique style as well as to test its limits.

Many of the differences between Scheler and his fellow phenomenologists, whether in terms of style or content, could be attributed to a difference in their personalities. Yet, there are at least notable and substantial differences between Scheler and other phenomenologists such as Husserl, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. For example, Scheler draws a much sharper line between existence and spirit, between the real and the ideal, between object and act. This can be seen most acutely in Scheler’s understanding of the intuition of essences and how such an intuition participates in the becoming-God. In terms of style, Scheler worked solely from insight and refused to follow any prescribed method or pedagogy. His tendency was to move directly to the most profound or deepest of insights, rather than develop levels of phenomenological analysis, e.g., static and genetic, or hermeneutic. As a result, Scheler does not hesitate to take up subjects such as ethics, politics and religion. This lack of method in Scheler is in part due to the foundational nature of the emotional life, his conviction that love is the ground for knowledge – a foundational relation in direct opposition to Husserl. If there is a single point or thought that best captures the distinctive nature of Scheler’s approach in contrast to that of his fellow phenomenologists, it is his notion of the human being as person. This “choice” of human being as person in contrast to Husserl’s transcendental ego, Heidegger’s Dasein or Merleau-Ponty’s lived-body gives a particular directedness to Scheler’s thought, an emphasis on the personal dimension of experience. Scheler’s world is cast in a much different relief and as a consequence, is illuminated by such personal experiences as the love of others and the divine.


A. Collected Works

The collected works of Max Scheler are published as Gesammelte Werke, in volumes as follows:

  1. Frühe Schriften, 1971, Maria Scheler and Manfred S. Frings (eds.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  2. Der Formalismus in der Ethik und die matierale Wertethik. Neuer Versuch der Grundlegung eines ethischen Personalismus, 1980, Maria Scheler (ed. 1st to 5th Edition), Manfred S. Frings (ed. 6th Edition), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  3. Vom Umsturz der Werte, 1972, Maria Scheler (ed.). Bern: Francke Verlag.
  4. Politisch Pädagogische Schriften, 1982, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  5. Vom Ewigen im Menschen, 1954, Maria Scheler (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  6. Schriften zur Soziologie und Weltanschauungslehre, 1963, Maria Scheler (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  7. Wesen und Formen der Sympathie, 1973, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  8. Die Wissensformen und die Gesellschaft, 1980, Maria Scheler (ed. 1st and 2nd Edition), Manfred S. Frings (ed. 3rd Edition), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  9. Späte Schriften, 1976, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  10. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, I. Zur Ethik und Erkenntnislehre, 1957, Maria Scheler (ed.), Bern: Francke Verlag.
  11. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, II. Erkenntnislehre und Metaphysik, 1979, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.
  12. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, III. Philosophische Anthropologie, 1987, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.
  13. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, IV. Philosophie und Geschichte, 1990, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.
  14. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, V. Varia I, 1993, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.
  15. Schriften aus dem Nachlass, VI. Varia II, 1997, Manfred S. Frings (ed.), Bonn: Bouvier Verlag.

B. Current English Translations

B.1 Books and Collection of Essays

  • Cognition and Work: A Study Concerning the Value and Limits of the Pragmatic Motifs in the Cognition of the World, 2021 Zachary Davis (tr.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values, 1973, Manfred S. Frings and Roger L. Funk (trs.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • Man’s Place in Nature, 1961, Hans Meyerhoff (tr.), NY: Noonday.
  • Max Scheler: The Constitution of the Human Being, 2008, John Cutting (tr.), Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • On the Eternal in Man, 1960, Bernard Noble (tr.), London: SCM Press.
  • Person and Self-Value. Three Essays, 1987, Manfred S. Frings (ed. and partial tr.), Dordrecht, Netherlands: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Philosophical Perspectives, 1958, Oscar Haac (tr.), Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Problems of a Sociology of Knowledge, 1980, Manfred S. Frings (tr.), Kenneth Stikkers (ed.), London: Routledge & Kegan Press.
  • Selected Philosophical Essays, 1973, David Lachterman (tr.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • The Constitution of the Human Being, 2008, John Cutting (tr.), Marquette University Press.
  • The Human’s Place in the Cosmos, 2009, Manfred S. Frings (tr.), Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • The Nature of Sympathy, 1970, Peter Heath, Hamden (tr.), CN: Archon Books (first printing, London: Routledge & Kegan Press, 1954).

B.2 Essays

  • “An a priori Hierarchy of Value-Modalities,” 1967, in Readings in Existential Phenomenology, Daniel O’Connor (tr.), Nathaniel Lawrence and Daniel O’Connor (eds.). Englewood, N.J.: Prentice Hall.
  • “Concerning the Meaning of the Feminist Movement,” 1978 (Fall), Manfred S. Frings (tr.), in Philosophical Forum, 9: 42–54.
  • “Future of Man,” 1928 (Feb.), Howard Becker (tr.), in Monthly Criterion, 7: 100–119.
  • “Humility,” 1981, Barbara Fiand (tr.), in Altheia, II: 200–209.
  • “Love and Knowledge,” 1992, in Max Scheler. On Feeling, Knowing, and Valuing. Selected Writings, Harold J. Bershady with Peter Haley (trs.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • “Max Weber’s Exclusion of Philosophy (on the Psychology and Sociology of Nominalist Thought,” 1989, in Max Weber Science as Vocation, R. C. Speirs (tr.), Peter Lassman, Irving Velody with Hermino Martins (eds.), London: Unwin Hyman.
  • “Metaphysics and Art,” 1974, in Max Scheler (1874–1928) Centennial Essays, Manfred S. Frings (tr. and ed.), The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • “On the Positivistic Philosophy of the History of Knowledge and Its Laws of Three Stages,” 1970, in The Sociology of Knowledge: A Reader, Rainer Koehne (tr.), James E. Curtis and John W. Petras (eds.), New York: Praeger.
  • “On the Tragic,” 1954, Bernard Stambler (tr.), Cross Currents, 4: 178–191.
  • “Reality and Resistance: On Being and Time, Section 43,” 1977 (Fall), Thomas Sheehan (tr.), in Listening, 12(3): 61–73.
  • “Sociology and the Study and Formulation of Weltanschauung,” 1989, in Max Weber’s Science as Vocation, R. C. Speirs (ed.), Peter Lassman, Irving Velody with Hermino Martins (eds.), London: Unwin Hyman.
  • “The Idea of Man,” 1978 (Oct.), Clyde Nabe (tr.), in Journal of the British Society for Phenomenology, 9: 184–198.
  • “The Idea of Peace and Pacifism,” 1976 (Oct.) and continued 1977 (Jan.), Manfred S. Frings (tr.), in Journal for the British Society for Phenomenology, 8 (October): 154–66, (January): 36–50.
  • “The Meaning of Suffering,” 1992, in Max Scheler, On Feeling, Knowing, and Valuing: Selected Writings, Harold Bershady (tr.), Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • “The Psychology of So-Called Compensation Hysteria and the Real Battle against Illness,” 1984 (Fall), Edward Vacek, S. J. (tr.), in Journal of Phenomenological Psychology, 15(2): 125–143.
  • “The Thomist Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism,” 1964, Gertrude Neuwith (tr.), in Sociological Analysis, 25: 4–19.
  • “Toward a Stratification of the Emotional Life,”1989, in Max Weber’s Science as Vocation, R. C. Speirs (tr.), Peter Lassman, Irving Velody with Hermino Martins (eds.). Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice Hall.

C. Suggested Secondary Literature

  • Barber, Michael, 1993, Guardian of Dialogue. Max Scheler’s Phenomenology, Sociology and Philosophy of Love, Lewisburg, PA: Bucknell University Press.
  • Bermes, Christian, Wolfhart Henckmann, Heinz Leonardy (eds.), 2000, Person und Wert, Schelers “Formalismus” – Perspektiven und Wirkungen, Freiberg: Albers.
  • ––– (eds.), 2003, Vernunft und Gefühl. Schelers Phänomenologie des emotionalen Lebens, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • ––– (eds.), 2006, Solidarität. Person und Soziale Welt, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • ––– (eds.), 2007, Die Bildung der Gesellschaft. Schelers Sozialphilosophie im Kontext, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Bermes, Christian, Ernst Wolfgang Orth (eds.), 2011, Religion und Metaphysik als Dimensionen der Kultur, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Blosser, Phillip, 1995, Scheler’s Critique of Kant’s Ethic, Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press.
  • Ferran, Ingrid Vendrell, 2008, Die Emotionen: Gefuehle in der realistischen Phaenomenologie, Berlin: Akademische Verlag.
  • Frings, Manfred S., 1997, The Mind of Max Scheler, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
  • ––– , 2003, Lifetime: Max Scheler’s Philosophy of Time, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Gabel, Michael, 1991, Intentionalität des Geistes: der phänomenologische Denkansatz bei Max Scheler: Untersuchung zum Verständnis der Intentionalität in Max Scheler “Der Formalismus in der Ethik und die materiale Wertethik”, Leipzig: Benno Verlag.
  • Gabel, Michael, Mathias Müller (eds.), 2015, Erkennen – Handeln – Bewähren. Phänomenologie und Pragmatismus (Scheleriana Band 2), Nordhausen: Traugott Bautz GmbH.
  • Gottlöber, Susan (ed.), 2022, Max Scheler in Dialogue, Cham: Springer.
  • Kelly, Eugene, 1997, Structure and Diversity: The Phenomenological Philosophy of Max Scheler, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kelly, Eugene, 2011, Material Ethics of Value: Max Scheler and Nicolai Hartmann, New York: Springer.
  • Leonardy, Heinz, 1976, Max Scheler Versuch eines “phänomenologischen” Personalismus, Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Luther, Arthur, 1972, Persons in Love: A Study of Max Scheler’s Wesen und Formen der Sympathie, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Mader, Wilhelm, 1995, Max Scheler in Selbstzeugnissen und Bilddokumenten, Hamburg: Rowohlt.
  • Ranly, E. W., Scheler’s Phenomenology of Community, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Schneck, St. F., 1987, Person and Polis, Albany: State University of New Press.
  • Spader, Peter, 2002, Scheler’s Ethical Personalism: Its Logic, Development and Promise, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Steinbock, Anthony J., 2014, Moral Emotions: Reclaiming the Evidence of the Heart, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press.
  • Wojtyla, K. (Pope John Paul II), 1979, The Acting Person, Analecta Husserliana X, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

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