Max Weber

First published Fri Aug 24, 2007; substantive revision Wed Sep 21, 2022

Arguably the foremost social theorist of the twentieth century, Max Weber is known as a principal architect of modern social science along with Karl Marx and Emil Durkheim. Weber’s wide-ranging contributions gave critical impetus to the birth of new academic disciplines such as sociology as well as to the significant reorientation in law, economics, political science, and religious studies. His methodological writings were instrumental in establishing the self-identity of modern social science as a distinct field of inquiry; he is still claimed as the source of inspiration by empirical positivists and their hermeneutic detractors alike. More substantively, Weber’s two most celebrated contributions were the “rationalization thesis,” a grand meta-historical analysis of the dominance of the west in modern times, and the “Protestant Ethic thesis,” a non-Marxist genealogy of modern capitalism. Together, these two theses helped launch his reputation as one of the founding theorists of modernity. In addition, his avid interest and participation in politics led to a unique strand of political realism comparable to that of Machiavelli and Hobbes. As such, Max Weber’s influence was far-reaching across the vast array of disciplinary, methodological, ideological and philosophical reflections that are still our own and increasingly more so.

1. Life and Career

Maximilian Carl Emil “Max” Weber (1864–1920) was born in the Prussian city of Erfurt to a family of notable heritage. His father, Max Sr., came from a Westphalian family of merchants and industrialists in the textile business and went on to become a lawyer and National Liberal parliamentarian in Wilhelmine politics. His mother, Helene, came from the Fallenstein and Souchay families, both of the long illustrious Huguenot line, which had for generations produced public servants and academicians. His younger brother, Alfred, was an influential political economist and sociologist, too. Evidently, Max Weber was brought up in a prosperous, cosmopolitan, and cultivated family milieu that was well-plugged into the political, social, and cultural establishment of the German Bürgertum [Roth 2000]. Also, his parents represented two, often conflicting, poles of identity between which their eldest son would struggle throughout his life – worldly statesmanship and ascetic scholarship.

Educated mainly at the universities of Heidelberg and Berlin, Weber was trained in law, eventually writing his dissertation on medieval trading companies under Levin Goldschmidt and Rudolf von Gneist (and examined by Theodor Mommsen) and Habilitationsschrift on Roman law and agrarian history under August Meitzen. While contemplating a career in legal practice and public service, he received an important research commission from the Verein für Sozialpolitik (the leading social science association under Gustav Schmoller’s leadership) and produced the so-called East Elbian Report on the displacement of the German agrarian workers in East Prussia by Polish migrant labours. Greeted upon publication with high acclaim and political controversy, this early success led to his first university appointment at Freiburg in 1894 to be followed by a prestigious professorship in political economy at Heidelberg two years later. Weber and his wife Marianne, an intellectual in her own right and early women’s rights activist, soon found themselves at the center of the vibrant intellectual and cultural life of Heidelberg. The so-called “Weber Circle” attracted such intellectual luminaries as Georg Jellinek, Ernst Troeltsch, and Werner Sombart and later a number of younger scholars including Marc Bloch, Robert Michels, and György Lukács. Weber was also active in public life as he continued to play an important role as a Young Turk in the Verein and maintain a close association with the liberal Evangelische-soziale Kongress (especially with the leader of its younger generation, Friedrich Naumann). It was during this time that he solidified his reputation as a brilliant political economist and outspoken public intellectual.

All these fruitful years came to an abrupt halt in 1897 when Weber collapsed with a nervous-breakdown shortly after his father’s sudden death (precipitated by a confrontation with Weber) [Radkau 2011, 53–69]. His routine as a teacher and scholar was interrupted so badly that he eventually withdrew from regular teaching duties in 1903, to which he would not return until 1919. Although severely compromised and unable to write as prolifically as before, he still managed to immerse himself in the study of various philosophical and religious topics. This period saw a new direction in his scholarship as the publication of miscellaneous methodological essays as well as The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism (1904–1905) testifies. Also noteworthy about this period is his extensive trip to America in 1904, which left an indelible trace in his understanding of modernity in general [Scaff 2011].

After this stint essentially as a private scholar, he slowly resumed his participation in various academic and public activities. With Edgar Jaffé and Sombart, he took over editorial control of the Archiv für Sozialwissenschaften und Sozialpolitik, turning it into a leading social science journal of the day as well as his new institutional platform. In 1909, he co-founded the Deutsche Gesellschaft für Soziologie, in part as a result of his growing unease with the Verein’s conservative politics and lack of methodological discipline, becoming its first treasurer (he would resign from it in 1912, though). This period of his life, until interrupted by the outbreak of the First World War in 1914, brought the pinnacles of his achievements as he worked intensely in two areas – the comparative sociology of world religions and his contributions to the Grundriss der Sozialökonomik (to be published posthumously as Economy and Society). Along with the major methodological essays that he drafted during this time, these works would become mainly responsible for Weber’s enduring reputation as one of the founding fathers of modern social science.

With the onset of the First World War, Weber’s involvement in public life took an unexpected turn. At first a fervent patriotic supporter of the war, as virtually all German intellectuals of the time were, he grew disillusioned with the German war policies, eventually refashioning himself as one of the most vocal critics of the Kaiser government in a time of war. As a public intellectual, he issued private reports to government leaders and wrote journalistic pieces to warn against the Belgian annexation policy and the unlimited submarine warfare, which, as the war deepened, evolved into a call for overall democratization of the authoritarian state (Obrigkeitsstaat) that was Wilhelmine Germany. By 1917, Weber was campaigning vigorously for a wholesale constitutional reform for post-war Germany, including the introduction of universal suffrage and the empowerment of parliament.

When defeat came in 1918, Germany found in Weber a public intellectual leader, even possibly a future statesman, with unscathed liberal credentials who was well-positioned to influence the course of post-war reconstruction. He was invited to join the draft board of the Weimar Constitution as well as the German delegation to Versaille; albeit in vain, he even ran for a parliamentary seat on the liberal Democratic Party ticket. In those capacities, however, he opposed the German Revolution (all too sensibly) and the Versaille Treaty (all too quixotically) alike, putting himself in an unsustainable position that defied the partisan alignments of the day. By all accounts, his political activities bore little fruit, except his advocacy for a robust plebiscitary presidency in the Weimar Constitution.

Frustrated with day-to-day politics, he turned to his scholarly pursuits with renewed vigour. In 1919, he briefly taught in turn at the universities of Vienna (General Economic History was an outcome of this experience) and Munich (where he gave the much-lauded lectures, Science as a Vocation and Politics as a Vocation), while compiling his scattered writings on religion in the form of massive three-volume Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Religionssoziologie [GARS hereafter]. All these reinvigorated scholarly activities came to an end in 1920 when he died suddenly of pneumonia in Munich (likely due to the Spanish flu). Max Weber was fifty-six years old.

2. Philosophical Influences

Putting Weber in the context of philosophical tradition proper is not an easy task. For all the astonishing variety of identities that can be ascribed to him as a scholar, he was certainly no philosopher at least in the narrow sense of the term. His reputation as a Solonic legislator of modern social science also tends to cloud our appreciation of the extent to which his ideas were embedded in the intellectual context of the time. Broadly speaking, Weber’s philosophical worldview, if not coherent philosophy, was informed by the deep crisis of the Enlightenment project in fin-de-siècle Europe, which was characterized by the intellectual revolt against positivist reason, a celebration of subjective will and intuition, and a neo-Romantic longing for spiritual wholesomeness [Hughes 1977]. In other words, Weber belonged to a generation of self-claimed epigones who had to struggle with the legacies of Darwin, Marx, and Nietzsche. As such, the philosophical backdrop to his thoughts will be outlined here along two axes — epistemology and ethics.

2.1 Knowledge: Neo-Kantianism

Weber encountered the pan-European cultural crisis of his time mainly as filtered through the jargon of German Historicism [Beiser 2011]. His early training in law had exposed him to the sharp divide between the reigning Labandian legal positivism and the historical jurisprudence championed by Otto von Gierke (one of his teachers at Berlin); in his later incarnation as a political economist, he was keenly interested in the heated “strife over methods” (Methodenstreit) between the positivist economic methodology of Carl Menger and the historical economics of Schmoller (his mentor during the early days). Arguably, however, it was not until Weber grew acquainted with the Baden or Southwestern School of Neo-Kantians, especially through Wilhelm Windelband, Emil Lask, and Heinrich Rickert (his one-time colleague at Freiburg), that he found a rich conceptual template suitable for the clearer elaboration of his own epistemological position.

In opposition to a Hegelian emanationist epistemology, briefly, Neo-Kantians shared the Kantian dichotomy between reality and concept. Not an emanent derivative of concepts as Hegel posited, reality is irrational and incomprehensible, and the concept, only an abstract construction of our mind. Nor is the concept a matter of will, intuition, and subjective consciousness as Wilhelm Dilthey posited. According to Hermann Cohen, one of the early Neo-Kantians, concept formation is fundamentally a cognitive process, which cannot but be rational as Kant held. If our cognition is logical and all reality exists within cognition, then only a reality that we can comprehend in the form of knowledge is rational – metaphysics is thereby reduced to epistemology, and Being to logic. As such, the process of concept formation both in the natural (Natur-) and the cultural-historical sciences (Geisteswissenschaften) has to be universal as well as abstract, not different in kind but in their subject matters. The latter is only different in dealing with the question of values in addition to logical relationships.

For Windelband, however, the difference between the two kinds of knowledge has to do with its aim and method as well. Cultural-historical knowledge is not concerned with a phenomenon because of what it shares with other phenomena, but rather because of its own definitive qualities. For values, which form its proper subject, are radically subjective, concrete and individualistic. Unlike the “nomothetic” knowledge that natural science seeks, what matters in historical science is not a universal law-like causality, but an understanding of the particular way in which an individual ascribes values to certain events and institutions or takes a position towards the general cultural values of his/her time under a unique, never-to-be-repeated constellation of historical circumstances. Therefore, cultural-historical science seeks “ideographic” knowledge; it aims to understand the particular, concrete and irrational “historical individual” with inescapably universal, abstract, and rational concepts. Turning irrational reality into rational concept, it does not simply paint (abbilden) a picture of reality but transforms (umbilden) it. Occupying the gray area between irrational reality and rational concept, then, its question became twofold for the Neo-Kantians. One is in what way we can understand the irreducibly subjective values held by the historical actors in an objective fashion, and the other, by what criteria we can select a certain historical phenomenon as opposed to another as historically significant subject matter worthy of our attention. In short, the issue was not only the values to be comprehended by the seeker of historical knowledge, but also his/her own values, which are no less subjective. Value-judgment (Werturteil) as well as value (Wert) became a keen issue.

According to Rickert’s definitive elaboration, value-judgment precedes values. He posits that the “in-dividual,” as opposed to mere “individual,” phenomenon can be isolated as a discrete subject of our historical inquiry when we ascribe certain subjective values to the singular coherence and indivisibility that are responsible for its uniqueness. In his theory of value-relation (Wertbeziehung), Rickert argues that relating historical objects to values can still retain objective validity when it is based on a series of explicitly formulated conceptual distinctions. They are to be made firmly between the investigator’s values and those of the historical actor under investigation, between personal or private values and general cultural values of the time, and between subjective value-judgment and objective value-relations. In so positing, however, Rickert is making two highly questionable assumptions. One is that there are certain values in every culture that are universally accepted within that culture as valid, and the other, that a historian free of bias must agree on what these values are. Just as natural science must assume “unconditionally and universally valid laws of nature,” so, too, cultural-historical science must assume that there are “unconditionally and universally valid values.” If so, an “in-dividual” historical event has to be reduced to an “individual” manifestation of the objective process of history, a conclusion that essentially implies that Rickert returned to the German Idealist faith in the meaningfulness of history and the objective validity of the diverse values to be found in history. An empirical study in historical science, in the end, cannot do without a metaphysics of history. Bridging irrational reality and rational concept in historical science, or overcoming hiatus irrationalis (à la Emil Lask) without recourse to a metaphysics of history still remained a problem as acutely as before. While accepting the broadly neo-Kantian conceptual template as Rickert elaborated it, Weber’s methodological writings would turn mostly on this issue.

2.2 Ethics: Kant and Nietzsche

German Idealism seems to have exerted another enduring influence on Weber, discernible in his ethical worldview more than in his epistemological position. This was the strand of Idealist discourse in which a broadly Kantian ethic and its Nietzschean interlocution figure prominently.

The way in which Weber understood Kant seems to have come through the conceptual template set by moral psychology and philosophical anthropology. In conscious opposition to the utilitarian-naturalistic justification of modern individualism, Kant viewed moral action as principled and self-disciplined while expressive of genuine freedom and autonomy. On this Kantian view, freedom and autonomy are to be found in the instrumental control of the self and the world (objectification) according to a law formulated solely from within (subjectification). Furthermore, such a paradoxical compound is made possible by an internalization or willful acceptance of a transcendental rational principle, which saves it from falling prey to the hedonistic subjectification that Kant found in Enlightenment naturalism and which he so detested. Kant in this regard follows Rousseau in condemning utilitarianism; instrumental-rational control of the world in the service of our desires and needs just degenerates into organized egoism. In order to prevent it, mere freedom of choice based on elective will (Willkür) has to be replaced by the exercise of purely rational will (Wille) [Taylor 1989, 364]. The so-called “inward turn” is thus the crucial benchmark of autonomous moral agency for Kant, but its basis has been fundamentally altered; it should be done with the purpose of serving a higher end, that is, the universal law of reason. A willful self-transformation is demanded now in the service of a higher law based on reason, or an “ultimate value” in Weber’s parlance.

Weber’s understanding of this Kantian ethical template was strongly tinged by the Protestant theological debate taking place in the Germany of his time between (orthodox Lutheran) Albrecht Ritschl and Matthias Schneckenburger (of Calvinist persuasion), a context with which Weber became acquainted through his Heidelberg colleague, Troeltsch. Suffice it to note in this connection that Weber’s sharp critique of Ritschl’s Lutheran communitarianism seems reflective of his broadly Kantian preoccupation with radically subjective individualism and the methodical transformation of the self [Graf 1995].

All in all, one might say that “the preoccupations of Kant and of Weber are really the same. One was a philosopher and the other a sociologist, but there… the difference ends” [Gellner 1974, 184]. That which also ends, however, is Weber’s subscription to a Kantian ethic of duty when it comes to the possibility of a universal law of reason. Weber was keenly aware of the fact that the Kantian linkage between growing self-consciousness, the possibility of universal law, and principled and thus free action had been irrevocably severed. Kant managed to preserve the precarious identification of non-arbitrary action and subjective freedom by asserting such a linkage, which Weber believed to be unsustainable in his allegedly Nietzschean age.

According to Nietzsche, “will to truth” cannot be content with the metaphysical construction of a grand metanarrative, whether it be monotheistic religion or modern science, and growing self-consciousness, or “intellectualization” à la Weber, can lead only to a radical skepticism, value relativism, or, even worse, nihilism. According to such a Historicist diagnosis of modernity that culminates in the “death of God,” the alternative seems to be either a radical self-assertion and self-creation that runs the risk of being arbitrary (as in Nietzsche) or a complete desertion of the modern ideal of self-autonomous freedom (as in early Foucault). If the first approach leads to a radical divinization of humanity, one possible extension of modern humanism, the second leads inexorably to a “dedivinization” of humanity, a postmodern antihumanism [Vattimo 1988, 31–47].

Seen in this light, Weber’s ethical sensibility is built on a firm rejection of a Nietzschean divination and Foucaultian resignation alike, both of which are radically at odds with the Kantian ethic of duty. In other words, Weber’s ethical project can be described as a search for non-arbitrary freedom (his Kantian side) in what he perceived as an increasingly post-metaphysical world (his Nietzschean side). According to Paul Honigsheim, Weber’s ethic is that of “tragedy” and “nevertheless” [Honigsheim 2013, 113]. This deep tension between the Kantian moral imperatives and a Nietzschean diagnosis of the modern cultural world is apparently what gives such a darkly tragic and agnostic shade to Weber’s ethical worldview.

3. History

3.1 Rationalization as a Thematic Unity

Weber’s main contribution as such, nonetheless, lies neither in epistemology nor in ethics. Although they deeply informed his thoughts to an extent still under-appreciated, his main concern lay elsewhere. He was after all one of the founding fathers of modern social science. Beyond the recognition, however, that Weber is not simply a sociologist par excellence as Talcott Parsons’s quasi-Durkheimian interpretation made him out to be, identifying an idée maîtresse throughout his disparate oeuvre has been debated ever since his own days and is still far from settled. Economy and Society, his alleged magnum opus, was a posthumous publication based upon his widow’s editorship, the thematic architectonic of which is unlikely to be reconstructed beyond doubt even after its recent reissuing under the rubric of Max Weber Gesamtausgabe [MWG hereafter]. GARS forms a more coherent whole since its editorial edifice was the work of Weber himself; and yet, its relationship to his other sociologies of, for instance, law, city, music, domination, and economy, remains controvertible. Accordingly, his overarching theme has also been variously surmised as a developmental history of Western rationalism (Wolfgang Schluchter), the universal history of rationalist culture (Friedrich Tenbruck), or simply the Menschentum as it emerges and degenerates in modern rational society (Wilhelm Hennis). The first depicts Weber as a comparative-historical sociologist; the second, a latter-day Idealist historian of culture reminiscent of Jacob Burckhardt; and the third, a political philosopher on a par with Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Rousseau. Important as they are for in-house Weber scholarship, however, these philological disputes need not hamper our attempt to grasp the gist of his ideas. Suffice it for us to recognize that, albeit with varying degrees of emphasis, these different interpretations all converge on the thematic centrality of rationality, rationalism, and rationalization in making sense of Weber.

At the outset, what immediately strikes a student of Weber’s rationalization thesis is its seeming irreversibility and Eurocentrism. The apocalyptic imagery of the “iron cage” that haunts the concluding pages of the Protestant Ethic is commonly taken to reflect his fatalism about the inexorable unfolding of rationalization and its culmination in the complete loss of freedom and meaning in the modern world. The “Author’s Introduction” (Vorbemerkung to GARS) also contains oft-quoted passages that allegedly disclose Weber’s belief in the unique singularity of Western civilization’s achievement in the direction of rationalization, or lack thereof in other parts of the world. For example:

A child of modern European civilization (Kulturwelt) who studies problems of universal history shall inevitably and justfiably raise the question (Fragestellung): what combination of circumstances have led to the fact that in the West, and here only, cultural phenomena have appeared which – at least as we like to think – came to have universal significance and validity [Weber 1920/1992, 13: translation altered]?

Taken together, then, the rationalization process as Weber narrated it seems quite akin to a metahistorical teleology that irrevocably sets the West apart from and indeed above the East.

At the same time, nonetheless, Weber adamantly denied the possibility of a universal law of history in his methodological essays. Even within the same pages of Vorbemerkung, he said, “rationalizations of the most varied character have existed in various departments of life and in all areas of culture” [Ibid., 26]. He also made clear that his study of various forms of world religions was to be taken for its heuristic value rather than as “complete analyses of cultures, however brief” [Ibid., 27]. It was meant as a comparative-conceptual platform on which to erect the edifying features of rationalization in the West. If merely a heuristic device and not a universal law of progress, then, what is rationalization and whence comes his uncompromisingly dystopian vision?

3.2 Calculability, Predictability, and World-Mastery

Roughly put, taking place in all areas of human life from religion and law to music and architecture, rationalization means a historical drive towards a world in which “one can, in principle, master all things by calculation” [Weber 1919/1946, 139]. For instance, modern capitalism is a rational mode of economic life because it depends on a calculable process of production. This search for exact calculability underpins such institutional innovations as monetary accounting (especially double-entry bookkeeping), centralization of production control, separation of workers from the means of production, supply of formally free labour, disciplined control on the factory floor, and other features that make modern capitalism qualitatively different from all other modes of organizing economic life. The enhanced calculability of the production process is also buttressed by that in non-economic spheres such as law and administration. Legal formalism and bureaucratic management reinforce the elements of predictability in the sociopolitical environment that encumbers industrial capitalism by means of introducing formal equality of citizenship, a rule-bound legislation of legal norms, an autonomous judiciary, and a depoliticized professional bureaucracy. Further, all this calculability and predictability in political, social, and economic spheres was not possible without changes of values in ethics, religion, psychology, and culture. Institutional rationalization was, in other words, predicated upon the rise of a peculiarly rational type of personality, or a “person of vocation” (Berufsmensch) as outlined in the Protestant Ethic. The outcome of this complex interplay of ideas and interests was modern rational Western civilization with its enormous material and cultural capacity for relentless world-mastery.

3.3 Knowledge, Impersonality, and Control

On a more analytical plateau, all these disparate processes of rationalization can be surmised as increasing knowledge, growing impersonality, and enhanced control [Brubaker 1991, 32–35]. First, knowledge. Rational action in one very general sense presupposes knowledge. It requires some knowledge of the ideational and material circumstances in which our action is embedded, since to act rationally is to act on the basis of conscious reflection about the probable consequences of action. As such, the knowledge that underpins a rational action is of a causal nature conceived in terms of means-ends relationships, aspiring towards a systematic, logically interconnected whole. Modern scientific and technological knowledge is a culmination of this process that Weber called intellectualization, in the course of which, the germinating grounds of human knowledge in the past, such as religion, theology, and metaphysics, were slowly pushed back to the realm of the superstitious, mystical, or simply irrational. It is only in modern Western civilization, according to Weber, that this gradual process of disenchantment (Entzauberung) has reached its radical conclusion.

Second, impersonality. Rationalization, according to Weber, entails objectification (Versachlichung). Industrial capitalism, for one, reduces workers to sheer numbers in an accounting book, completely free from the fetters of tradition and non-economic considerations, and so does the market relationship vis-à-vis buyers and sellers. For another, having abandoned the principle of Khadi justice (i.e., personalized ad hoc adjudication), modern law and administration also rule in strict accordance with the systematic formal codes and sine ira et studio, that is, “without anger or passion.” Again, Weber found the seed of objectification not in material interests alone, but in the Puritan vocational ethic (Berufsethik) and the life conduct that it inspired, which was predicated upon a disenchanted monotheistic theodicy that reduced humans to mere tools of God’s providence. Ironically, for Weber, modern inward subjectivity was born once we lost any inherent value qua humans and became thoroughly objectified vis-à-vis God in the course of the Reformation. Modern individuals are subjectified and objectified all at once.

Third, control. Pervasive in Weber’s view of rationalization is the increasing control in social and material life. Scientific and technical rationalization has greatly improved both the human capacity for a mastery over nature and institutionalized discipline via bureaucratic administration, legal formalism, and industrial capitalism. The calculable, disciplined control over humans was, again, an unintended consequence of the Puritan ethic of rigorous self-discipline and self-control, or what Weber called “innerworldly asceticism (innerweltliche Askese).” Here again, Weber saw the irony that a modern individual citizen equipped with inviolable rights was born as a part of the rational, disciplinary ethos that increasingly penetrated into every aspect of social life.

4. Modernity

4.1 The “Iron Cage” and Value-fragmentation

Thus seen, rationalization as Weber postulated it is anything but an unequivocal historical phenomenon. As already pointed out, first, Weber viewed it as a process taking place in disparate fields of human life with a logic of each field’s own and varying directions; “each one of these fields may be rationalized in terms of very different ultimate values and ends, and what is rational from one point of view may well be irrational from another” [Weber 1920/1992, 27]. Second, and more important, its ethical ramification for Weber is deeply ambivalent. To use his own dichotomy, the formal-procedural rationality (Zweckrationalität) to which Western rationalization tends does not necessarily go with a substantive-value rationality (Wertrationalität). On the one hand, exact calculability and predictability in the social environment that formal rationalization has brought about dramatically enhances individual freedom by helping individuals understand and navigate through the complex web of practice and institutions in order to realize the ends of their own choice. On the other hand, freedom and agency are seriously curtailed by the same force in history when individuals are reduced to a “cog in a machine,” or trapped in an “iron cage” that formal rationalization has spawned with irresistible efficiency and at the expense of substantive rationality. Thus, his famous lament in the Protestant Ethic:

No one knows who will live in this cage (Gehäuse) in the future, or whether at the end of this tremendous development entirely new prophets will arise, or there will be a great rebirth of old ideas and ideals, or, if neither, mechanized petrification, embellished with a sort of convulsive self-importance. For the “last man” (letzten Menschen) of this cultural development, it might well be truly said: “Specialist without spirit, sensualist without heart; this nullity imagines that it has attained a level of humanity (Menschentums) never before achieved” [Weber 1904–05/1992, 182: translation altered].

Third, Weber envisions the future of rationalization not only in terms of “mechanized petrification,” but also of a chaotic, even atrophic, inundation of subjective values. In other words, the bureaucratic “iron cage” is only one side of the modernity that rationalization has brought about; the other is a “polytheism” of value-fragmentation. At the apex of rationalization, we moderns have suddenly found ourselves living “as did the ancients when their world was not yet disenchanted of its gods and demons” [Weber 1919/1946, 148]. Modern society is, Weber seems to say, once again enchanted as a result of disenchantment. How did this happen and with what consequences?

4.2 Reenchantment via Disenchantment

In point of fact, Weber’s rationalization thesis can be understood with richer nuance when we approach it as, for lack of better terms, a dialectics of disenchantment and reenchantment rather than as a one-sided, unilinear process of secularization. Disenchantment had ushered in monotheistic religions in the West. In practice, this means that ad hoc maxims for life-conduct had been gradually displaced by a unified total system of meaning and value, which historically culminated in the Puritan ethic of vocation. Here, the irony was that disenchantment was an ongoing process nonetheless. Disenchantment in its second phase pushed aside monotheistic religion as something irrational, thus delegitimating it as a unifying worldview in the modern secular world.

Modern science, which was singularly responsible for this late development, was initially welcomed as a surrogate system of orderly value-creation, as Weber found in the convictions of Bacon (science as “the road to true nature”) and Descartes (as “the road to the true god”) [Weber 1919/1946, 142]. For Weber, nevertheless, modern science is a deeply nihilistic enterprise in which any scientific achievement worthy of the name must “ask to be surpassed and made obsolete” in a process “that is in principle ad infinitum,” at which point, “we come to the problem of the meaning of science.” He went on to ask: “For it is simply not self-evident that something which is subject to such a law is in itself meaningful and rational. Why should one do something which in reality never comes to an end and never can?” [Ibid., 138: translation altered]. In short, modern science has relentlessly dismantled all other sources of value-creation, in the course of which its own meaning has also been dissipated beyond repair. The result is the “Götterdämmerung of all evaluative perspectives” including its own [Weber 1904/1949, 86].

Irretrievably gone as a result is a unifying worldview, be it religious or scientific, and what ensues is its fragmentation into incompatible value spheres. Weber, for instance, observed: “since Nietzsche, we realize that something can be beautiful, not only in spite of the aspect in which it is not good, but rather in that very aspect” [Weber 1919/1946, 148]. That is to say, aesthetic values now stand in irreconcilable antagonism to religious values, transforming “value judgments (Werturteile) into judgments of taste (Geschmacksurteile) by which what is morally reprehensible becomes merely what is tasteless” [Weber 1915/1946, 342].

Weber is, then, not envisioning a peaceful dissolution of the grand metanarratives of monotheistic religion and universal science into a series of local narratives and the consequent modern pluralist culture in which different cultural practices follow their own immanent logic. His vision of polytheistic reenchantment is rather that of an incommensurable value-fragmentation into a plurality of alternative metanarratives, each of which claims to answer the same metaphysical questions that religion and science strove to cope with in their own ways. The slow death of God has reached its apogee in the return of gods and demons who “strive to gain power over our lives and again … resume their eternal struggle with one another” [Weber 1919/1946, 149].

Seen this way, it makes sense that Weber’s rationalization thesis concludes with two strikingly dissimilar prophecies – one is the imminent iron cage of bureaucratic petrification and the other, the Hellenistic pluralism of warring deities. The modern world has come to be monotheistic and polytheistic all at once. What seems to underlie this seemingly self-contradictory imagery of modernity is the problem of modern humanity (Menschentum) and its loss of freedom and moral agency. Disenchantment has created a world with no objectively ascertainable ground for one’s conviction. Under the circumstances, according to Weber, a modern individual tends to act only on one’s own aesthetic impulse and arbitrary convictions that cannot be communicated in the eventuality; the majority of those who cannot even act on their convictions, or the “last men who invented happiness” à la Nietzsche, lead the life of a “cog in a machine.” Whether the problem of modernity is accounted for in terms of a permeation of objective, instrumental rationality or of a purposeless agitation of subjective values, Weber viewed these two images as constituting a single problem insofar as they contributed to the inertia of modern individuals who fail to take principled moral action. The “sensualists without heart” and “specialists without spirit” indeed formed two faces of the same coin that may be called the disempowerment of the modern self.

4.3 Modernity contra Modernization

Once things were different, Weber claimed. An unflinching sense of conviction that relied on nothing but one’s innermost personality once issued in a highly methodical and disciplined conduct of everyday life – or, simply, life as a duty. Born in the crucible of the Reformation, this archetypal modern subjectivity drew its strength solely from within in the sense that one’s principle of action was determined by one’s own psychological need to gain self-affirmation. Also, the way in which this deeply introspective subjectivity was practiced, that is, in self-mastery, entailed a highly rational and radically methodical attitude towards one’s inner self and the outer, objective world. Transforming the self into an integrated personality and mastering the world with tireless energy, subjective value and objective rationality once formed “one unbroken whole” [Weber 1910/1978, 319]. Weber calls the agent of this unity the “person of vocation” (Berufsmensch) in his religious writings, “personality” (Persönlichkeit) in the methodological essays, “genuine politician” (Berufspolitiker) in the political writings, and “charismatic individual” in Economy and Society. The much-celebrated Protestant Ethic thesis was indeed a genealogical reconsturction of this idiosyncratic moral agency in modern times [Goldman 1992].

Once different, too, was the mode of society constituted by and in turn constitutive of this type of moral agency. Weber’s social imagination revealed its keenest sense of irony when he traced the root of the cohesive integration, intense socialization, and severe communal discipline of sect-like associations to the isolated and introspective subjectivity of the Puritan person of vocation. The irony was that the self-absorbed, anxiety-ridden and even antisocial virtues of the person of vocation could be sustained only in the thick disciplinary milieu of small-scale associational life. Membership in exclusive voluntary associational life is open, and it is such membership, or “achieved quality,” that guarantees the ethical qualities of the individuals with whom one interacts. “The old ‘sect spirit’ holds sway with relentless effect in the intrinsic nature of such associations,” Weber observed, for the sect was the first mass organization to combine individual agency and social discipline in such a systematic way. Weber thus claimed that “the ascetic conventicles and sects … formed one of the most important foundations of modern individualism” [Weber 1920/1946, 321]. It seems clear that what Weber was trying to outline here is an archetypical form of social organization that can empower individual moral agency by sustaining group disciplinary dynamism, a kind of pluralistically organized social life we would now call a “civil society” [Kim 2007, 57–94].

To summarize, the irony with which Weber accounted for rationalization was driven by the deepening tension between modernity and modernization. Weber’s problem with modernity originates from the fact that it required a historically unique constellation of cultural values and social institutions, and yet, modernization has effectively undermined the cultural basis for modern individualism and its germinating ground of disciplinary society, which together had given the original impetus to modernity. The modern project has fallen victim to its own success, and in peril is the individual moral agency and freedom. Under the late modern circumstances characterized by the “iron cage” and “warring deities,” then, Weber’s question becomes: “How is it at all possible to salvage any remnants of ‘individual’ freedom of movement in any sense given this all-powerful trend” [Weber 1918/1994, 159]?

5. Knowledge

Such an appreciation of Weber’s main problematic, which culminates in the question of modern individual freedom, may help shed light on some of the controversial aspects of Weber’s methodology. In accounting for his methodological claims, it needs to be borne in mind that Weber was not at all interested in writing a systematic epistemological treatise in order to put an end to the “strife over methods” (Methodenstreit) of his time between historicism and positivism. His ambition was much more modest and pragmatic. Just as “the person who attempted to walk by constantly applying anatomical knowledge would be in danger of stumbling” [Weber 1906/1949, 115; translation altered], so can methodology be a kind of knowledge that may supply a rule of thumb, codified a posteriori, for what historians and social scientists do, but it could never substitute for the skills they use in their research practice. Instead, Weber’s attempt to mediate historicism and positivism was meant to aid an actual researcher make a practical value-judgment that is fair and acceptable in the face of the plethora of subjective values that one encounters when selecting and processing historical data. After all, the questions that drove his methodological reflections were what it means to practice science in the modern polytheistic world and how one can do science with a sense of vocation. In his own words, “the capacity to distinguish between empirical knowledge and value-judgments, and the fulfillment of the scientific duty to see the factual truth as well as the practical duty to stand up for our own ideals constitute the program to which we wish to adhere with ever increasing firmness” [Weber 1904/1949, 58]. Sheldon Wolin thus concludes that Weber “formulated the idea of methodology to serve, not simply as a guide to investigation but as a moral practice and a mode of political action” [Wolin 1981, 414]. In short, Weber’s methodology was as ethical as it was epistemological.

5.1 Understanding (Verstehen)

Building on the Neo-Kantian nominalism outlined above [2.1], thus, Weber’s contribution to methodology turned mostly on the question of objectivity and the role of subjective values in historical and cultural concept formation. On the one hand, he followed Windelband in positing that historical and cultural knowledge is categorically distinct from natural scientific knowledge. Action that is the subject of any social scientific inquiry is clearly different from mere behaviour. While behaviour can be accounted for without reference to inner motives and thus can be reduced to mere aggregate numbers, making it possible to establish positivistic regularities, and even laws, of collective behaviour, an action can only be interpreted because it is based on a radically subjective attribution of meaning and values to what one does. What a social scientist seeks to understand is this subjective dimension of human conduct as it relates to others. On the other hand, an understanding(Verstehen) in this subjective sense is not anchored in a non-cognitive empathy or intuitive appreciation that is arational by nature; it can gain objective validity when the meanings and values to be comprehended are explained causally, that is, as a means to an end. A teleological contextualization of an action in the means-end nexus is indeed the precondition for a causal explanation that can be objectively ascertained. So far, Weber is not essentially in disagreement with Rickert.

From Weber’s perspective, however, the problem that Rickert’s formulation raised was the objectivity of the end to which an action is held to be oriented. As pointed out [2.1 above], Rickert in the end had to rely on a certain transhistorical, transcultural criterion in order to account for the purpose of an action, an assumption that cannot be warranted in Weber’s view. To be consistent with the Neo-Kantian presuppositions, instead, the ends themselves have to be conceived of as no less subjective. Imputing an end to an action is of a fictional nature in the sense that it is not free from the subjective value-judgment that conditions the researcher’s thematization of a certain subject matter out of “an infinite multiplicity of successively and coexistently emerging and disappearing events” [Weber 1904/1949, 72]. Although a counterfactual analysis might aid in stabilizing the process of causal imputation, it cannot do away completely with the subjective nature of the researcher’s perspective.

In the end, the kind of objective knowledge that historical and cultural sciences may achieve is precariously limited. An action can be interpreted with objective validity only at the level of means, not ends. An end, however, even a “self-evident” one, is irreducibly subjective, thus defying an objective understanding; it can only be reconstructed conceptually based on a researcher’s no less subjective values. Objectivity in historical and social sciences is, then, not a goal that can be reached with the aid of a correct method, but an ideal that must be striven for without a promise of ultimate fulfillment. In this sense, one might say that the so-called “value-freedom” (Wertfreiheit) is as much a methodological principle for Weber as an ethical virtue that a personality fit for modern science must possess.

5.2 Ideal Type

The methodology of “ideal type” (Idealtypus) is another testimony to such a broadly ethical intention of Weber. According to Weber’s definition, “an ideal type is formed by the one-sided accentuation of one or more points of view” according to which “concrete individual phenomena … are arranged into a unified analytical construct” (Gedankenbild); in its purely fictional nature, it is a methodological “utopia [that] cannot be found empirically anywhere in reality” [Weber 1904/1949, 90]. Keenly aware of its fictional nature, the ideal type never seeks to claim its validity in terms of a reproduction of or a correspondence with reality. Its validity can be ascertained only in terms of adequacy, which is too conveniently ignored by the proponents of positivism. This does not mean, however, that objectivity, limited as it is, can be gained by “weighing the various evaluations against one another and making a ‘statesman-like’ compromise among them” [Weber 1917/1949, 10], which is often proposed as a solution by those sharing Weber’s kind of methodological perspectivism. Such a practice, which Weber calls “syncretism,” is not only impossible but also unethical, for it avoids “the practical duty to stand up for our own ideals” [Weber 1904/1949, 58].

According to Weber, a clear value commitment, no matter how subjective, is both unavoidable and necessary. It is unavoidable, for otherwise no meaningful knowledge can be attained. Further, it is necessary, for otherwise the value position of a researcher would not be foregrounded clearly and admitted as such – not only to the readers of the research outcome but also to the very researcher him/herself. In other words, Weber’s emphasis on “one-sidedness” (Einseitigkeit) not only affirms the subjective nature of scientific knowledge but also demands that the researcher be self-consciously subjective. The ideal type is devised for this purpose, for “only as an ideal type” can subjective value – “that unfortunate child of misery of our science” – “be given an unambiguous meaning” [Ibid., 107]. Along with value-freedom, then, what the ideal type methodology entails in ethical terms is, on the one hand, a daring confrontation with the tragically subjective foundation of our historical and social scientific knowledge and, on the other, a public confession of one’s own subjective value. Weber’s methodology in the end amounts to a call for the heroic character-virtue of clear-sightedness and intellectual integrity that together constitute a genuine person of science – a scientist with a sense of vocation who has a passionate commitment to one’s own specialized research, yet is utterly “free of illusions” [Löwith 1982, 38].

6. Politics and Ethics

Even more explicitly ethical than his methodology, Weber’s political project also discloses his entrenched preoccupation with the willful resuscitation of certain character traits in modern society. At the outset, it seems undeniable that Weber was a deeply liberal political thinker especially in German context which is not well known for political liberalism. This means that his ultimate value as a political thinker was locked on individual freedom, that “old, general type of human ideals” [Weber 1895/1994, 19]. He was also a bourgeois liberal, and self-consciously so, in a time of great transformations that were undermining the social conditions necessary to support classical liberal values and bourgeois institutions, thereby compelling liberalism to search for a fundamental reorientation. To that extent, he belongs to that generation of liberal political thinkers in fin-de-siècle Europe who clearly perceived the general crisis of liberalism and sought to resolve it in their own liberal ways [Bellamy 1992, 157–216]. Weber’s own way was to address the problem of classical liberal characterology that was, in his view, being progressively undermined by the indiscriminate bureaucratization of modern society.

6.1 Domination and Legitimacy

Such an ethical subtext is legible even in Weber’s stark realism that permeates his political sociology – or, a sociology of domination (Herrschaftssoziologie) as he called it [for the academic use of this term in Weber’s time, see Anter 2016, 3–23]. For instance, utterly devoid of moral qualities that many of his contemporaries attributed to the state, it is defined all too thinly as “a human community that (successfully) claims the monopoly of the legitimate use of physical force within a given territory” [Weber 1919/1994, 310]. With the same brevity, he asserted that domination of the ruled by the ruler, or more literally, “lordship” (Herrschaft), is an immutable reality of political life even in a democratic state. That is why, for Weber, an empirical study of politics cannot but be an inquiry into the different modalities by which domination is effectuated and sustained. All the while, he also maintained that a domination worthy of sustained attention is about something far more than the brute fact of subjugation and subservience. For “the merely external fact of the order being obeyed is not sufficient to signify domination in our sense; we cannot overlook the meaning of the fact that the command is accepted as a valid norm” [Weber 1921–22/1978, 946]. In other words, it has to be a domination mediated through justification and interpretation in which the ruler’s claim to authority, not mere threat of force or promise of benefits, is the reason for the obedience, not mere compliance, by the ruled. This bipolar emphasis on the factuality of coercive domination at the phenomenal level and the essentially noumenal nature of power (à la Rainer Forst) is what characterizes Weber’s political realism [Forst 2012].

In terms of contemporary political realism, Weber seemed to hold that the primary concern of politics is the establishment of an orderly domination and its management within a given territory rather than the realization of such pre- or extra-political moral goals as justice (Kant) or freedom (Hegel) – thus the brevity with which the state is defined above. Sharing this Hobbesian outlook on politics, or what Bernard Williams calls the “First Political Question” (FPQ), enables Weber to square his diagnosis of agonistic value pluralism with an entrenched suspicion of natural-law foundation of liberalism to sustain a democratic politics that is uniquely his own [see 6.2 below]. He went beyond Ordorealism, however, when an evaluative perspective on politics is advocated without recourse to the moral commitments coming from outside the political sphere. The making of a workable political order cannot be authorized by virtue of its coming-into-being and has to satisfy what Williams called the “Basic Legitimation Demand” (BLD) to be an acceptable arrangement of social coordination. A legitimate political order is an institutionalized modus vivendi for collective life that “makes sense as an intelligible order” (MSIO) in the eyes of the beholder [Williams 2005, 1–17]. Since such an acceptance by those living under a particular arrangement depends on the political morality animating that particular community, the ruler’s claim to authority can meet with success only when based on a reasonable fit with the local mores, values, and cultures [Cozzaglio and Greene 2019, 1025–26]. Like Machiavelli’s Principe, then, Weber’s Herren do not behave in a normless vacuum. They rule under certain political-normative constraints that turn on the congruence between the way their domination is justified and the way such a public justification is interpreted as acceptable to the ruled. Weber’s concept of domination is as much noumenal as phenomenal. To that extent, it is little wonder that his name figures not only prominently but also uniquely in the pantheon of political realists [Galston 2010].

From this nuanced realist premise, Weber famously moved on to identify three ideal types of legitimate domination based on, respectively, charisma, tradition, and legal rationality. Roughly, the first type of legitimacy claim depends on how persuasively the leaders prove their charismatic qualities, for which they receive personal devotions and emotive followings from the ruled. The second kind of claim can be made successfully when certain practice, custom, and mores are institutionalized to (re)produce a stable pattern of domination over a long duration of time. In contrast to these crucial dependences on personality traits and the passage of time, the third type of authority is unfettered by time, place, and other forms of contingency as it derives its legitimacy from adherence to impersonal rules and general principles that can only be found by suitable legal-rational reasoning. It is, along with the traditional authority, a type of domination that is inclined towards the status quo in ordinary times as opposed to the charismatic authority that represents extraordinary, disruptive, and transformative forces in history. Weber’s fame and influence as a political thinker are built most critically upon this typology and the ways in which those ideal types are deployed in his political writings.

As such, Weber’s sociology of domination has been suspected variously of its embedded normative biases. For one, his theory of legitimacy is seen as endorsing a cynical and unrealistic rejection of universal morality in politics that makes it hard to pass an objective and moral evaluative judgment on legitimacy claims, a charge that is commonly leveled at political realism at large. Under Weber’s concept of legitimacy, anything goes, so to speak, as long as the ruler goes along with the local political morality of the ruled (even if it is formed independently of any coercive or corrosive interference by the ruler, thereby satisfying Williams’s “critical theory principle”). Read in conjunction with his voluminous political writings, especially, it is criticized to this day as harbouring or foreshadowing, among others, Bonapartist caesarism, passive-revolutionary Fordist ideology, quasi-Fascist elitism, and even proto-Nazism (especially with respect to his robust nationalism and/or nihilistic celebration of power) [inter alia, Strauss 1950; Marcuse in Stammer (ed.) 1971; Mommsen 1984; Rehman 2013]. In addition to these politically heated charges, Weber’s typology also reveals a crucial lacuna even as an empirical political sociology. That is to say, it allows scant, or ambiguous, a conceptual topos for democracy.

In fact, it seems as though Weber is unsure of the proper place of democracy in his schema. At one point, democracy is deemed as a fourth type of legitimacy because it should be able to embrace legitimacy from below whereas his three ideal types all focus on that from above [Breuer in Schroeder (ed.) 1998, 2]. At other times, Weber seems to believe that democracy is simply non-legitimate, rather than another type of legitimate domination, because it aspires to an identity between the ruler and the ruled (i.e., no domination at all), but without assuming a hierarchical and asymmetrical relationship of power, his concept of legitimacy takes hardly off the ground. Thus, Weber could describe the emergence of proto-democracy in the late medieval urban communes only in terms of “revolutionary usurpation” [Weber 1921–22/1978, 1250], calling them the “first deliberately non-legitimate and revolutionary political association” [ibid., 1302]. Too recalcitrant to fit into his overall schema, in other words, these historical prototypes of democracy simply fall outside of his typology of domination as non- or not-legitimate at all.

Overlapping but still distinguishable is Weber’s yet another way of conceptualizing democracy, which had to do with charismatic legitimacy. The best example is the Puritan sect in which authority is legitimated only on the grounds of a consensual order created voluntarily by proven believers possessing their own quantum of charismatic legitimating power. As a result of this political corollary of the Protestant doctrine of universal priesthood, Puritan sects could and did “insist upon ‘direct democratic administration’ by the congregation” and thereby do away with the hierarchical distinction between those ruling and those ruled [ibid., 1208]. In a secularized version of this group dynamics, a democratic ballot would become the primary tool by which presumed charisma of the individual lay citizenry are aggregated and transmitted to their elected leader who become “the agent and hence the servant of his voters, not their chosen master” [ibid., 1128]. Rather than an outright non-legitimate or fourth type of domination, here, democracy comes across as an extremely rare subset of a diffused and institutionalized form of charismatic legitimacy.

6.2 Democracy, Partisanship, and Compromise

All in all, the irony is unmistakable. It seems as though one of the most influential political thinkers of the twentieth century cannot come to clear terms with its zeitgeist in which democracy, in whatever form, shape and shade, emerged as the only acceptable ground for political legitimacy. Weber’s such awkwardness is nowhere more compelling than in his advocacy for “leadership democracy” (Führerdemokratie) during the constitutional politics of post-WWI Germany.

If the genuine self-rule of the people is impossible, according to his unsentimental outlook on democracy, the only choice is one between leaderless and leadership democracy. When advocating a sweeping democratization of defeated Germany, thus, Weber envisioned democracy in Germany as a political marketplace in which strong charismatic leaders can be identified and elected by winning votes in a free competition, even battle, among themselves. Preserving and enhancing this element of struggle in politics is important since it is only through a dynamic electoral process that national leadership strong enough to control the otherwise omnipotent bureaucracy can be made. The primary concern for Weber in designing democratic institutions has, in other words, less to do with the realization of democratic ideals, such as freedom, equality, justice, or self-rule, than with cultivation of certain character traits befitting a robust national leadership. In its overriding preoccupation with the leadership qualities, Weber’s theory of democracy contains ominous streaks that may vindicate Jürgen Habermas’s infamous dictum that Carl Schmitt, “the Kronjurist of the Third Reich,” was “a legitimate pupil of Weber’s” [Habermas in Stammer (ed.) 1971, 66].

For a fair and comprehensive assessment, however, it should also be brought into purview that Weber’s leadership democracy is not solely reliant upon the fortuitous personality traits of its leaders, let alone a caesaristic dictator. “[A] genuine charisma is radically different from the convenient presentation of the present ‘divine right of king’… the very opposite is true of the genuinely charismatic ruler, who is responsible to the ruled” [1922/1978, 1114]. Such responsibility is conceivable because charisma is attributed to a leader through a process that can be described as “imputation” from below [Joose 2014, 271]. In addition to the free electoral competition led by the organized mass parties, Weber saw localized, yet public associational life as a breeding ground for such an imputation of charisma. When leaders are identified and selected at the level of, say neighborhood choral societies and bowling clubs [Weber 1910/2002], the alleged authoritarian elitism of leadership democracy comes across as more pluralistic in its valence, far from its usual identification with demagogic dictatorship and unthinking mass following. Insofar as a vibrant civil society functions as an effective medium for the horizontal diffusion of charismatic qualities among lay people, his notion of charismatic leadership can retain a strongly democratic tone to the extent that he also suggested associational pluralism as a sociocultural ground for the political education of the lay citizenry from which genuine leaders would hail. Weber’s charismatic leadership has to be “democratically manufactured” [Green 2008, 208], in short, and such a formative political project is predicated upon a pluralistically organized civil society as well as such liberal institutions as universal suffrage, free elections, and organized parties.

In this respect, however, it should be noted that Weber’s take on civil society is crucially different from a communitarian-Tocquevillean outlook, and this contrast can be cast into sharper relief once put in terms of the contemporary democratic theory of partisanship [cf., inter alia, Rosenblum 2008; Muirhead 2014; White and Ypi 2016]. Like the contemporary advocates of partisanship, Weber is critical of the conventional communitarian view that simply equates civil society with voluntary associational life itself. For not all voluntary associations are conducive to democracy; some are in fact “bad” for its viability. Even in a “good” civil society, those “associative practice,” or Vergesellschaftung in Weber’s parlance [Weber 1910/2002], may cultivate the kind of civil virtues that regulate our private lives, but such social capital cannot be automatically transferred to the public realm as a useful set of civic virtues and skills for democratic politics. Political capital can be acquired by living political experiences daily. This realization led Weber as well as a growing number of contemporary democratic theorists to converge on an insistent call for the politicization of civil society in the form of not less, but better partisanship, making his politics of civil society crucially different from that of a communitarian-Tocquevillean persuasion [see Kim in Hanke, Scaff & Whimster (eds.) 2020].

Also different from this intensely political civil society is a liberal-Habermasian “public sphere,” a rational-communicative haven in which the open exchange and fair deliberation of impartial opinions take place until reasonable consensus emerges. By contrast, Weber’s civil society is to be an agonistic arena of organized rivalry, competition, and struggle on behalf of the irreducibly partial claims between which consensus – be that reasonable, overlapping, or bipartisan – may not always be found. Given the incommensurable value fragmentation of the modern politics and society, Weber would wholeheartedly embrace the so-called “circumstances of politics” under which deep disagreements are reasonable and permanent, agreeing that it is not necessarily a bad thing for democracy as long as those “permanent disagreements” remain peaceful [Waldron 1999]. From such an agonistic perspective, the best that can be expected is some kind of mixture of those partial claims – a compromise wherein lies the true meaning of political virtue. That is to say, although no “overlapping consensus” can be expected, it is precisely because all partisan claims are so partial that a political compromise can be made at least between good partisans. For neither too unprincipled (as in opportunistic power-seekers) nor too principled (as in moral zealots), good partisan citizens welcome a political compromise, albeit their passionate value convictions, because they know that some reasonable disagreements are permanent. Then, the kind of political capital expected to be accumulated in a good partisan civil society is a mixture of “principle and pragmatism” [Muirhead 2014, 41–42] – a political virtue much akin to Weber’s syncretic ethics of conviction (Gesinnungsethik) and responsibility (Verantwortungsethik) [see 6.3 below].

Together, Weber’s ethics also demand that the political leaders and public citizenry combine unflinching commitments to higher causes (which make them different from mere bureaucratic careerists) with sober realism that no political claim, including their own, can represent the whole truth (which makes them different from moral purists and political romantics). This syncretic ethic is the ultimate hallmark of those politicians with a sense of vocation who would fight for their convictions with fierce determination yet not without a “sense of pragmatic judgment” (Augenmaß)that a compromise is unavoidable between incommensurable value positions, and all they can do in the end is to take robust responsibility for the consequences, either intended or unintended, of what they thought was a principled compromise. This is why Weber said: “The politician must make compromises … the scholar may not cover them (Der Politiker muß Kompromisse machen … der Gelehrte darf sie nicht decken)” [MWG II/10, 983; also see Bruun 1972 (2007, 244)]. It is this type of political virtue that Weber wants to instill at the citizenship as well as leadership level, and the site of this political education is a pluralistically organized civil society in which leaders and citizens can experience the dynamic and institutionalized politicization (re)produced by partisan politics.

6.3 Conviction and Responsibility

What are, then, these two ethics of conviction and responsibility exactly that Weber wanted to foster through a “‘chronic’ political schooling [Weber 1894/1994, 26]. According to the ethic of responsibility, on the one hand, an action is given meaning only as a cause of an effect, that is, only in terms of its causal relationship to the empirical world. The virtue lies in an objective understanding of the possible causal effect of an action and the calculated reorientation of the elements of an action in such a way as to achieve a desired consequence. An ethical question is thereby reduced to a question of technically correct procedure, and free action consists of choosing the correct means. By emphasizing the causality to which a free agent subscribes, in short, Weber prescribes an ethical integrity between action and consequences, instead of a Kantian emphasis on that between action and intention.

According to the ethic of conviction, on the other hand, a free agent should be able to choose autonomously not only the means, but also the end; “this concept of personality finds its ‘essence’ in the constancy of its inner relation to certain ultimate ‘values’ and ‘meanings’ of life” [Weber 1903–06/1975, 192]. In this respect, Weber’s central problem arises from the recognition that the kind of rationality applied in choosing a means cannot be used in choosing an end. These two kinds of reasoning represent categorically distinct modes of rationality, a boundary further reinforced by modern value fragmentation. With no objectively ascertainable ground of choice provided, then, a free agent has to create purpose ex nihilo: “ultimately life as a whole, if it is not to be permitted to run on as an event in nature but is instead to be consciously guided, is a series of ultimate decisions through which the soul – as in Plato – chooses its own fate” [Weber 1917/1949, 18]. This ultimate decision and the Kantian integrity between intention and action constitute the essence of what Weber calls an ethic of conviction.

It is often held that the gulf between these two types of ethics is unbridgeable for Weber. Demanding an unmitigated integrity between one’s ultimate value and political action, that is to say, the deontological ethic of conviction cannot be reconciled with that of responsibility which is consequentialist in essence. In fact, Weber himself admitted the “abysmal contrast” that separates the two. This frank admission, nevertheless, cannot be taken to mean that he privileged the latter over the former as far as political education is concerned.

Weber keenly recognized the deep tension between consequentialism and deontology, but he still insisted that they should be forcefully brought together. The former recognition only lends urgency to the latter agenda. Resolving this analytical inconsistency in terms of certain “ethical decrees” did not interest Weber. Instead, he sought for a moral character that can manage this “combination” with a sheer force of will. In fact, he also called this synthetic ethic as that of responsibility without clearly distinguishing it from the merely consequentialist ethic it sought to overcome, thus creating an interpretive debate that continues to this day [de Villiers 2018, 47–78]. Be that as it may, his advocacy for this willful synthesis is incontrovertible, and he called such an ethical character a “politician with a sense of vocation” (Berufspolitiker) who combines a passionate conviction in supra-mundane ideals that politics has to serve and a sober rational calculation of its realizability in this mundane world. Weber thus concluded: “the ethic of conviction and the ethic of responsibility are not absolute opposites. They are complementary to one another, and only in combination do they produce the true human being who is capable of having a ‘vocation for politics’” [Weber 1919/1994, 368].

This synthetic political virtue seems not only hard to achieve, but also without a promise of felicitous ending. Weber’s synthesis demands a sober confrontation with the reality of politics, i.e., the ever-presence of “physical forces” and all the unintended consequences or collateral damages that come with the use of coercion. Only then may it be brought under ethical control by a superhuman deployment of passion and prudence, but, even so, Weber’s political superhuman (Übermensch) cannot circumvent the so-called “dirty-hands dilemma” [cf. Walzer 1973; Coady 2009]. For, even at the moment of triumph, the unrelenting grip of responsibility would never let him or her disavow the guilt and remorse for having employed the “physical forces,” no matter how beneficial or necessary. It is a tragic-heroic ethic of “nevertheless (dennoch)” [see 2.2] and, as such, Weber’s “tragicism” goes beyond politics [Honigsheim 2013, 115]. Science as a Vocation is a self-evident case in which the virtue of “value freedom” demands a scientist to confront the modern epistemological predicament of incommensurable value-fragmentation without succumbing to the nihilistic plethora of subjective values by means of a disciplined and willful devotion to the scholarly specialization and scientific objectivity [see 5.2]. From this ethical vintage point, The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism may as well be re-titled Labour as a Vocation. It was in this much earlier work (1904–5) that Weber first outlined the basic contours of the ethic of vocation (Berufsethik) and a person of vocation (Berufsmensch) and the way those work practices emerged historically in the course of the Reformation (and faded away subsequently). The Calvinist doctrine of predestination has amplified the innermost anxiety over one’s own salvation, but such a subjective fear and trembling was channeled into a psychological reservoir for the most disciplined and methodical life conduct (Lenbensführung), or labour in calling, that created the “spirit” of capitalism. Paradoxically combining subjective value commitments and objective rationality in the pursuit of those goals, in short, the making and unmaking of the Berufsmensch is where Weber’s ethical preoccupations in politics, science, and economy converge [cf. Hennis 1988].

In the end, Weber’s project is not about formal analysis of moral maxims, nor is it about substantive virtues that reflect some kind of ontic telos. It is too formal or empty to be an Aristotelean virtue ethics, and it is too concerned with moral character to be a Kantian deontology narrowly understood. The goal of Weber’s ethical project, rather, aims at cultivating a character who can willfully bring together these conflicting formal virtues to create what he calls a “total personality” (Gesamtpersönlichkeit). It culminates in an ethical characterology or philosophical anthropology in which passion and reason are properly ordered by sheer force of individual will. As such, Weber’s political virtue resides not simply in a subjective intensity of value commitment nor in a detached intellectual integrity and methodical purposefulness, but in their willful combination in a unified soul. In this abiding preoccupation with statecraft-cum-soulcraft, Weber was a moralist and political educator who squarely belonged to the venerable tradition that stretches back to the ancient Greeks down to Rousseau, Hegel, and Mill.

7. Concluding Remarks

Seen this way, we find a remarkable consistency in Weber’s thought. Weber’s main problematic turned on the question of individual autonomy and freedom in an increasingly rationalized society. His dystopian and pessimistic assessment of rationalization drove him to search for solutions through politics and science, which broadly converge on a certain practice of the self. What he called the “person of vocation,” first outlined famously in The Protestant Ethic, provided a bedrock for his various efforts to resuscitate a character who can willfully combine unflinching conviction and methodical rationality even in a society besieged by bureaucratic petrification and value fragmentation. It is also in this entrenched preoccupation with an ethical characterology under modern circumstances that we find the source of his enduring influences on twentieth-century political and social thought.

On the left, Weber’s articulation of the tension between modernity and modernization found resounding echoes in the “Dialectics of Enlightenment” thesis by Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer; Lukács’s own critique of the perversion of capitalist reason owes no less to Weber’s problematization of instrumental rationality on which is also built Habermas’s elaboration of communicative rationality as an alternative. Different elements in Weber’s political thought, e.g., intense political struggle as an antidote to modern bureaucratic petrification, leadership democracy and plebiscitary presidency, stark realist outlook on democracy and power-politics, and value-freedom and value-relativism in political ethics, were selected and critically appropriated by such diverse thinkers on the right as Carl Schmitt, Joseph Schumpeter, Leo Strauss, Hans Morgenthau, and Raymond Aron. Even the postmodernist project of deconstructing the Enlightenment subjectivity finds, as Michel Foucault does, a precursor in Weber. All in all, across the vastly different ideological and methodological spectrum, Max Weber’s thought will continue to be a deep reservoir of fresh inspiration as long as an individual’s fate under (post)modern circumstances does not lose its privileged place in the political, social, cultural, and philosophical reflections of our time.


Primary Sources

Commissioned by the Bavarian Academy of Sciences (Bayerische Akademie der Wissenschaften), Max Weber Gesamtausgabe (Collected Works) have been published continuously since 1984 by J. C. B. Mohr (Paul Siebeck), the original publisher of Weber’s works in Tübingen, Germany. The first editorial committee of 1973 consisted of Horst Baier, M. Rainer Lepsius, Wolfgang Mommsen, Wolfgang Schluchter, and Johannes Winkelmann. This monumental project consists of a total of forty-five (plus two index) volumes in three divisions, i.e., I. Writings and Speeches, II. Correspondences, and III. Lectures and Lecture Notes. In 2020, it was finally brought to a completion in time for the centenary of Weber’s death. The original commissioner, the Bavarian Academy, has begun to go on-line with an open-access digital format; for updates, the reader is referred to the publisher’s web page for the Max Weber Gesamtausgabe (digital).

Primary Texts in English Translation

In English, new translations have appeared since the turn of the century. Most notable among them would be The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism by Peter Baehr/Gordon C. Wells (Penguin Books, 2002) and Stephen Kalberg (Roxbury Publishing Co., 2002). Reflecting the latest Weber scholarship, both editions have many virtues, especially in terms of enhanced readability and adequate contextualization. Talcott Parson’s classic edition is still listed below because it is the most widely available text in English. Even more welcoming is the new compilation and translation of Weber’s methodological writings in Max Weber: Collected Methodological Writings (eds. Hans Henrik Bruun and Sam Whimster, trans. Hans Henrik Bruun, Routlege, 2012). The earlier anthology, for all its uneven quality of translation, is still used in this article for the same reason of availability.

  • Weber, Max. 1895/1994. “The Nations State and Economic Policy (Freiburg Address)” in Weber: Political Writings, P. Lassman and R. Speirs (ed. and trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1903–06/1975. Roscher and Knies: The Logical Problems of Historical Economics, G. Oakes (trans.), New York: Free Press.
  • –––, 1904/1949. “Objectivity in Social Science and Social Policy” in The Methodology of the Social Sciences, E. A. Shils and H. A. Finch (ed. and trans.), New York: Free Press.
  • –––, 1904–05/1992. The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism, T. Parsons (trans.), A. Giddens (intro), London: Routledge.
  • –––, 1906/1949. “Critical Studies in the Logic of the Cultural Sciences: A Critique of Eduard Meyer’s Methodological Views,” in The Methodology of the Social Sciences.
  • –––, 1910/1978. “Antikritisches Schlußwort zum Geist des Kapitalismus,” in Max Weber: Die protestantische Ethik II: Kritiken und Antikritiken, ed. J. Winckelmann, Gerd Mohn: Gütersloher Verlaghaus.
  • –––, 1910/2002. “Voluntary Associational Life (Vereinswesen),” Sung Ho Kim (ed. and trans.), Max Weber Studies, 2:2 (2002).
  • –––, 1915/1946. “Religious Rejections of the World and Their Directions” in From Max Weber.
  • –––, 1917/1949. “The Meaning of ‘Ethical Neutrality’ in Sociology and Economics ” in The Methodology of the Social Sciences.
  • –––, 1918/1994. “Parliament and Government in Germany Under a New Political Order” in Max Weber: Political Writings.
  • –––, 1919/1994. “The Profession and Vocation of Politics” in Max Weber: Political Writing.
  • –––, 1919/1946. “Science as a Vocation” in From Max Weber.
  • –––, 1920/1946. “The Protestant Sects and the Spirit of Capitalism” in From Max Weber.
  • –––, 1920/1992. “Author’s Introduction (Vorbemerkung to GARS),” in The Protestant Ethic and the Spirit of Capitalism.
  • –––, 1920. Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Religionssoziologie, 3 volumes, Tübingen: J. C. B. Mohr/Paul Siebeck, 1978.
  • –––, 1921–22/1978. Economy and Society, 2 volumes, G. Roth and C. Wittich (eds.), Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • –––, 1924. Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Soziologie und Sozialpolitik, Tübingen: J. C. B. Mohr/Paul Siebeck.
  • Weber, Marianne (ed.), 1926/1988. Max Weber: A Biography, H. Zohn (trans.), G. Roth (intro), New Brunswick: Transaction.


  • Gerth, H.H., and C. Wright Mills (eds.), 1946. From Max Weber: Essays in Sociology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lassman, P. and R. Speirs (eds.), 1994. Weber: Political Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Shils, E.A. and H. A. Finch (eds.), 1949. The Methodology of the Social Sciences New York: Free Press.

Secondary Sources

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  • Brubaker, Rogers, 1992. The Limits of Rationality, London: Routledge.
  • Bruun, Hans Henrik, 1972 [2007]. Science, Values and Politics in Max Weber’s Methodology, Burlington, VT: Ashgate; new expanded edition, 2007.
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  • Forst, Rainer, 2012. The Right to Justification, New York: Columbia University Press.
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  • Gellner, Ernest, 1974. Legitimation of Belief, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Goldman, Harvey, 1992. Politics, Death, and the Devil: Self and Power in Max Weber and Thomas Mann, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Graf, Friedrich Wilhelm, 1987. “The German Theological Sources and Protestant Church Politics,” in H. Lehmann and G. Roth (eds.), Weber’s Protestant Ethic: Origins, Evidence, Contents, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • Rehmann, Jan, 2013. Max Weber: Modernisation as Passive Revolution, A Gramscian Analysis, Max Henniger (trans.), Leiden: Brill.
  • Rosenblum, Nancy, 2008. On the Side of the Angels: An Appreciation of Parties and Partisanship, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
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  • Wolin, Sheldon, 1981. “Max Weber: Legitimation, Method, and the Politics of Theory,” Political Theory, 9: 401–24.

Other Internet Resources

  • Max Weber Complete Edition (MWG), an English homepage of the Collected Works maintained by the Bavarian Academy of Sciences and Humanities where one can find various archival sources as well as information and updates related to the Weber scholarship:
  • Max Weber Studies, a London-based international journal devoted to the philological and interpretative studies of Weber’s works:

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