Sidney Hook

First published Thu May 8, 2008; substantive revision Tue Jul 2, 2024

Sidney Hook was a leading interpreter and proponent of Deweyan pragmatic naturalism from his years as Dewey’s graduate student at Columbia in the 1920s through the six decades of his philosophical teaching and writing until his death in 1989. A notoriously scrappy polemicist, Hook identified with the attribution given to him as “Dewey’s bulldog.”

Hook worked primarily in the areas of the pragmatic theory of knowledge, ethical naturalism, and social and political theory. In regard to theory of knowledge, Hook believed that only the pragmatic account of knowledge, with its instrumentalist emphasis, provided an adequate explanation of the value ascribed to knowledge in human experience and a satisfactory answer to the question of why knowledge was important for human life. In regard to ethical naturalism, Hook argued that a naturalistic account of the origin and justification of ethical statements offered a critical yet justified and objective basis for moral decisions. In his defense of ethical naturalism, Hook carried out a sustained criticism of opposing theses. These theses included all forms of moral absolutism that were derived from inherited religious traditions or metaphysical systems of Idealism or Intuitionism. They also included the variants of what he considered to be moral relativism or moral nihilism, whether these were derived from arbitrary commitments as in Existentialist philosophy, or were supported as expressions of emotive attitudes as in Logical Positivism.

Hook sought to apply the pragmatic interpretation of ethics to diverse areas of social action including issues of educational policy, cultural freedom and societal change. Hook’s application of normative ethical judgments to contemporary social and political issues led to an apparent shift in his political allegiances. In his earliest writings, Hook overtly embraced Marxism understood as an application of scientific method for the resolution of the problematic situation of capitalist societies. Hook’s interpretation Marxism, however, eventually led to his becoming a leading advocate of anti-communist policy, both domestically and in foreign affairs. In the later phase of his career, after his reaction to the programs of the “New Left” in the 1960s, Hook’s approach could be understood as a form of conservative liberalism, though he remained committed to social democracy. Hook’s initial stress upon freedom of inquiry in education practice was augmented by his emphasis upon the continuity in the curriculum of Western humanistic cultural traditions. Similarly, Hook’s support for social democracy was augmented by his opposition to the totalitarian potential that had emerged within socialist and radical movements in contemporary history. Accordingly, in Hook’s final phase as a public philosopher, his writings were identified with the neoconservative movement.

1. Sidney Hook’s Pragmatism: from the Justification of Naturalistic Metaphysics to the Commitment to Scientific Method

Hook studied philosophy as an undergraduate at the City College of New York in the early 1920s, where he was influenced by Morris Raphael Cohen. He then attended Columbia University, where he earned a PhD under the supervision of John Dewey. As the background for the development of Hook’s thought, the philosophical and intellectual discussion of this period was dominated by the reigning power of Deweyan pragmatism even as it also showed the emerging signs of the coming influence of Marxism. One illustration of the significance of Dewey for Hook’s intellectual development can be found in the fact that the completion of Dewey’s attempt to produce a naturalist metaphysics, Experience and Nature, took place in the mid-twenties and Sidney Hook’s doctoral dissertation, The Metaphysics of Pragmatism, was defended in 1927.

Hook’s study of the metaphysics of pragmatism placed his work within a series of successive reconsiderations by pragmatic philosophers of the relationship between the nature of metaphysical inquiry and a commitment to scientific method. The founders of pragmatism in the United States, Charles Peirce and William James, had each presented pragmatism as an anti-metaphysical program.

In two essays that founded pragmatism as a philosophical movement, Peirce argued that the experimental methods of the natural sciences provide the proper the model for philosophical inquiry. He understood the scientific method to be opposed to the methods used in traditional metaphysics which were identified by him with Cartesian rationalism and rationalist intuitionism. Further, Peirce’s account of the nature of “belief” could be interpreted as leading to a complete rejection of all metaphysical hypotheses on the ground that, as they are not verifiable by the methods of scientific inquiry, metaphysical beliefs were properly considered “meaningless gibberish.”

In a different idiom, James had criticized both the Materialism and the Idealism that he took to be dominant in the latter part of the nineteenth century. James had argued that both of these seemingly contrary philosophical hypotheses shared the philosophical flaw inherent in the metaphysical approach that he identified as a form of “looking backward.” James identified traditional metaphysics with the method of searching for the necessary presuppositions of empirical phenomena. This form of “looking backward” from the realm of contingent experience to a philosophical set of entities that necessarily existed, whether Materialistic or Idealistic, was contrasted by James with the pragmatic approach which looked to future experience. Accordingly, for James, metaphysical claims were to be interpreted as hypotheses whose adoption or acceptance by an agent was justified only if it would lead to verifiable or confirmable consequences in future human experience. This involved James in a redefinition of the nature of metaphysics, since it transformed metaphysical claims into predictions regarding the consequences for the human condition of adopting them. Thus the pragmatism of both Peirce and James could be understood as calling for the elimination of traditional metaphysics and replacing it with a “scientific” metaphysics, metaphysics within the bounds of scientific methodology

Dewey had sought to build upon the insights of Peirce and James in arguing for a naturalistic metaphysics. He stressed that scientific inquiry was an activity of human beings whose minds and intellectual habits had emerged in natural evolutionary processes and that scientific inquiry was carried out in a natural environment so that its results were applied in the transformation of the conditions of nature. Along these lines, it seemed to Dewey that philosophers of logic or science should be concerned not only with normative rules of logical and scientific inquiry but also with the features of the natural environment in which logical and scientific inquiry had taken place. Accordingly, logical and epistemological inquiry involved the broader investigation of the biological, psychological and sociological conditions of human knowledge. For pragmatism, naturalistic metaphysics as an extension of such investigations involved an account and analysis of the most general and pervasive features of human experience in its natural environment.

In Dewey’s naturalistic metaphysics, then, a contextual and empirical account of the origin and function of human knowledge is combined with a recognition of man’s biological quest for adaptation to and control of his environment. This emphasis upon human adaptation and control characterized the recognition within pragmatic philosophy of its debt to Darwinism in the development of its theory of mind’s place in nature and of the nature of human knowledge.

Hook followed Dewey in stressing the connection between a naturalistic metaphysics and the identification of human knowledge as an instrument in transforming the local environment. Significantly, this feature of naturalistic metaphysics heightened the pragmatic emphasis upon the capacity of human agency to function as an activist transformer of the world. To a significant degree, what was natural, whether in the sphere of the universe or the sphere of human affairs, could be considered in the idiom of pragmatism not so much as a “given,” but as a possibility for a “taken.” The theme of human transformation of the natural environment carried Hook from the initial interest in the metaphysics of pragmatism to the possibilities of pragmatism as a philosophy which could apply scientific method for social change.

Hook’s analysis of the metaphysics of pragmatism focused on the issue of whether the practice of scientific method presupposed a set of beliefs about the world or any set of ontological commitments. According to Hook, the primacy of scientific method did not require any prior set of foundational metaphysical beliefs but was justified instead by its consequences. Decades later, after the great emphasis ascribed to the nature of Being in existentialist metaphysics, Hook returned to an analysis of this issue in his essay “The Quest for ‘Being.’” He reaffirmed his earlier view that the practice of scientific method did not presuppose a set of ontological commitments or metaphysical theses about the world. Hook recognized that an empirical analysis of experience and of the way scientific knowledge originated and functioned in the human environment could justify statements that represented the “great commonplaces” of experience and of the world. These statements could even be identified as “empirical metaphysics” in the sense that they asserted general traits about experience. From Hook’s perspective, however, these “great commonplaces” did not constitute a set of metaphysical doctrines about the nature of reality which could be demonstrated philosophically or verified scientifically (Hook, The Quest for Being, 1961, Part 3, “The Quest for ‘Being’”).

Hook’s account of the naturalist metaphysics of pragmatism was driven by the longstanding focus among pragmatists on the interaction between human beings and their surroundings, and the potential of such interactions to result in a transformation of both. Thus Hook’s account did not lead him into the thicket of the debates concerning the elimination of metaphysics that were raging in the late 1920s and throughout 1930s. It is worth noting that many of these debates are implicit in the Peircean “pragmatic maxim”, which proposes a verificationist criterion for the meaningfulness of a statement. As Peirce himself saw, and as the Logical Positivists would quickly come to see, it is difficult to make sense of “verification” without making reference to certain metaphysical concepts, including those of counterfactual circumstances and unrealizable potential. In difficulties such as these would lay the collapse of many of the more stringent forms of anti-metaphysics. However, Hook did not pursue the hard line criticisms of metaphysics that were implicit in pragmatism; rather, his intellectual interest shifted to the significance of the pragmatic commitment to scientific method in other areas of philosophy. Hook’s subsequent philosophical activity was based upon his belief that the pragmatic commitment to scientific method had transformative implications, primarily in three areas of philosophy: the theory of knowledge, ethical theory, and social and political philosophy.

In theory of knowledge, Hook defended the scientific method as the paradigmatic way in which human beings could achieve reliable knowledge. In ethical inquiry, Hook argued that the application of the scientific method was crucial for the justification of normative ethical statements and for their confirmation as objectively true statements.

Given his Deweyan commitment to socially-engaged philosophy, it is no wonder that in the late 1930s and throughout the 1940s and 1950s, Hook’s attention turned increasingly towards social and political philosophy. Here, too, Hook sought to apply the scientific method. Hook’s writings on educational reform, socialist theory, political protest, academic freedom, civil liberties, segregation, and ideology often engaged with social concerns at a level of concreteness that had eluded Dewey. Though his views on these social issues combine what appear to us today as politically opposed categories, Hook claimed that his views reflected a consistent and univocal philosophical commitment to the epistemic and moral experimentalism that lay at the core of pragmatism. Hook recognized there was ample evidence that different political positions derived from divergent structures of perception which interpreted the empirical data in contradictory ways as well as from fixed attitudes which had been set through a person’s life experience. To a degree, he appreciated the significance of the dissimilarities in the application of scientific method between the confirmation of an experimental hypothesis in natural science by a community of inquiry and the empirical grounds that could be appealed to as providing a justification of a particular social or political policy in the context of decision-making in historical circumstances. Hook continued, both in his explicit thought about the nature of moral or political disagreement and in his implicit practice in discussion, to hold the pragmatic faith that critical intelligence – a generalized form of scientific method – could rationally resolve any conflict of opinion.

2. Hook’s Defense of the Pragmatic Theory of Knowledge

At the center of Hook’s support for pragmatism was the justification of the pragmatic theory of knowledge. This justification characteristically took the form of setting the pragmatic theory against two opposing conceptions of truth which were identified as the “correspondence” theory of truth, which was advocated by philosophical Realists, and the “coherence” theory of truth, which was advanced by philosophical Idealists. For Hook, the superiority of pragmatism was most evident in the recognition that it was the only theory of knowledge which explained why the attainment of knowledge was important for human activity in its interaction with the environment. In the pragmatic theory of knowledge, the discovery and confirmation of true hypotheses about the nature of the world was understood as the realization of an instrument that enabled human beings to predict and control aspects of their environment.

In contrast, whatever the merit of the correspondence theory of truth, it could not ground a theory of knowledge that could explain why why the attainment of truth should make a difference in human affairs. In such theories, as truth is a matter of statements “mirroring” or “copying” reality, knowledge is not connected with the human ability to experimentally alter the environment. Here Hook remained faithful to the early pragmatism of Peirce and James, which featured a standard criticism of the correspondence theory as presupposing human beings as “passive spectators” whose role in knowledge is that of mirroring the objects and events of the environment in which the knower finds himself. The pragmatist indictment was that the correspondence theory of truth relegated the knower to the role of “passive spectator” in a completed universe, an image that is at odds with the success of experimental scientific inquiry. Picking up on themes in Dewey’s work on experimental method, Hook argued that knowledge is best conceived as an instrument for human prediction and control of the environment. This remained a significant pragmatist insight to be recognized even in the context of later and more sophisticated interpretations of the correspondence theory, like Alfred Tarski’s “semantic theory of truth.” Despite the pragmatic criticism of the correspondence theory, Dewey, Hook and other pragmatists like C.I. Lewis recognized the legitimacy of the goal of this theory in its aspiration to realize a connection between human language about the world and the facts of the world, or between linguistic assertions and what actually “is the case” in the world.

To appreciate the full force of the pragmatist theory of knowledge, it must be positioned in opposition not only to Realist views rooted in the correspondence theory of truth, but also to Idealist views that are based in the coherence theory of truth. Idealists, from the pre-pragmatic generation of Bradley and Royce to the later writings of Brand Blanshard, had identified truth with consistency or coherence. Pragmatists could accept that the truth of logical or mathematical systems could be defined in terms of their consistency since such systems could be understood as abstract formal structures of language without requiring confirmation or applicability to empirical experience. A coherence theory, however, could not provide a criterion for truth. In a contingent universe, where empirical events were not derived from a set of consistent axioms but were parts of the flux of experience of nature, no criterion of consistency or coherence could provide the basis for an account of truth. From the pragmatic perspective, the coherence theory presupposed and required a metaphysical conception of the world as forming parts of the absolute mind so that inconsistent and incoherent events were excluded. The rejection of an Idealist theory of absolute mind in metaphysics by Peirce, James and Dewey brought with it their rejection of a coherence theory of truth in epistemology. Thus for pragmatism, truths about the world were not arrived at by the criterion of coherence but by a method through which verifiable empirical hypotheses were confirmed in experimental practice.

Against both competitors, pragmatists claim the advantage of being able to tether knowledge to successful inquiry. With successful inquiry understood as the controlled and deliberate transformation of one’s surroundings, Dewey and Hook were able to draw an explicit tie between their pragmatist theory of knowledge and at least one instance of highly impactful science, namely Darwinian biology. That is, they saw it as an attractive feature of their conception of knowledge that it was friendly to a conception of the human mind as an evolved instrument for improved prediction and control of the environment.

Both Hook and Dewey sought to place the application of the scientific method and the pragmatic theory of knowledge in the maelstrom of human social, cultural and political issues. Even in these difficult domains, they believed that the Peircian model of scientific method could be realized. Just as Peirce had suggested that a history of experimental method would demonstrate a movement from fallible hypotheses to their progressive replacement by other fallible hypotheses with greater degrees of confirmation approaching the asymptotic limit ascribed to truth, Dewey and Hook argued that the pragmatic theory of knowledge or truth should pursue this scientific method with respect to what Dewey had termed the “problems of men.”

While the contrast between the convergence in the natural sciences within the community of inquiry and the divergence and disagreement over political and social issues within a political community is historically evident, there is a theoretical basis for the pragmatic thesis of a unitary method. Scientific method requires that inquirers are committed to the rational and open-minded investigation and analysis of experimental consequences. The celebrated illustration that Galileo cites is that he is unable to persuade his critics of the truth of scientific results if they refuse to look through the telescope. Similarly, the existence of persons whose antecedent attitudinal framework or whose bias within their structuring of their perceptions limits their ability to observe the empirical evidence that is relevant for resolving an issue does not negate the objectivity of the factual evidence or the legitimacy of the acceptance of the hypotheses that represent the optimal interpretation of the data. Along these lines, the optimal policy option or decision for resolving a problematic situation is also open, to a degree, to objective confirmation or refutation. Thus Hook identified his foundational belief to be a pragmatic theory of knowledge derived from Dewey as the basis for his extended forays into public debate over a host of political and social questions.

The broadness of this justification of pragmatic theory of knowledge was one aspect of Hook’s endeavor, eventually abandoned, to ally pragmatism with Marxism. One parallel which provided a basis for Hook’s effort was the pragmatists’ identification of truth as instrumental in transforming the human condition. Thus for Hook, the pragmatic theory of knowledge was paralleled by the well-known passage in Marx’s “Theses on Feuerbach.” Marx’s gnomic statement that “Philosophers have hitherto only interpreted the world in various ways; the point is to change it” could be interpreted as indicating the distinction between an account of knowledge in which the knower or spectator sought to duplicate or interpret in language the phenomena of the real world, as opposed to the ways in which an experimentalist knower would develop hypotheses which would result in the transformation of the environment according to predictable hypotheses. From this perspective, the vindication of the Marxist hypothesis by the consequences of its transformational activity paralleled the general pragmatic thesis of the vindication of an hypothesis by its success in modifying the natural and human environment.

The truth of the hypothesis could not be recognized except as confirmed by the changes that its application to experience generated for future experience. By stressing this parallel between Marx and Deweyan instrumentalism, Marxism was not interpreted by Hook as a dogmatic thesis about historical inevitability but as an experimental hypothesis to be confirmed by its future consequences. In developing this parallel, Hook also asserted that his interpretation of Marx differed from the materialist variant of an Hegelian dialectic of history, which he ascribed to “orthodox idolaters” of Marxism (Hook, The Meaning of Marx, 1934, “The Meaning of Marx”). The analogy to Deweyan pragmatism also enabled Hook to differentiate his interpretation of Marxism from what he referred to as the misinterpretation by Stalin and the Soviet authorities which, according to Hook, had transmuted Marxism into a secular religion.

Yet for Hook, the connection between Marxism and pragmatism ran deeper than this. On Hook’s interpretation, Marx’s theory was to be identified as an application of scientific method to social and economic history. The Marxist theory would then be justified in the same way that any scientific hypothesis would be justified, that is, through confirmation by empirical evidence. Thus, the Marxist interpretation of the “contradiction of capitalism” could be interpreted as a verifiable empirical hypothesis about the ways in which the class relations of production blocked the ability of such enterprises to produce a much greater volume of products that could satisfy the needs of persons in a society. The revolutionary slogan calling for the liberation of the social forces of production directed against the class relations of capitalist society could be interpreted as a verifiable empirical hypothesis that socializing the means of production would bring about a far greater volume of products and their distribution to a much greater range of persons in the society. Along these lines, Marxism represented the application of scientific method to the current empirical realities of society. Hook did not balk at referring to Marxism as developing a “science of history.” Similarly, he referred to the Marxist theory and practice of revolution as analogous to the Deweyan model of the application of scientific method to the resolution of a problematic situation.

On this interpretation of Marxism, the philosophical presupposition of Marx and Engels which were identified as dialectical materialism were incompatible with the delineation of Marxism as a scientific and experimental hypothesis. Thus, while, or even because Hook asserted his belief in a version of Marxism as compatible with pragmatism as an experimental hypothesis, the various theses of Marxist dialectical materialism were subjected to an intensely probing and extremely skeptical criticism. Consequently, Hook found himself to be identified as a supporter of Marxism through an unorthodox interpretation of that theory, while at the same time he was castigated as an opponent of Marxism by the recognized authoritative figures of the Marxist movement because of his severe criticism of the metaphysical claims within the Marx-Engels canon regarding dialectical materialism. Hook’s interpretation of Marxism as a scientific hypothesis would appear to be compatible with the Marxist movement’s preferred characterization of its theory as “scientific socialism” in opposition to “utopian socialism.” Yet, scientific socialism was asserted by its followers to be a species of ultimate philosophical truth rather than, as Hook’s pragmatic interpretation required, a set of fallible and corrigible hypotheses about the historical situation, including contemporaneous economic processes and their eventual outcomes. It was evident to believers in Marxism as a kind of secular faith or religion that its interpretation as a species of experimental science left the way open for its refutation and revision or rejection in light of the analysis of future consequences. For Marxists, and to a significant degree for Hook, Marxism in the early 1930s was a commitment of faith and a normative guide to revolutionary action. Yet as an experimental theory rooted in Peircean pragmatic principles, it would admit of “disconfirmation” or refutation in the light of future historical evidence. From this perspective, in the context of the 1920s, the empirical nature of the institutions of the socialist society in the Soviet Union and their development in the near future could be identified as representing factors that would confirm or refute the Marxist hypothesis.

Hook’s philosophical position was characterized by his affirmation of Marxism and activist commitment to its implementation in the United States, even as he concluded that the evidence of the failure of socialist institutions and Marxist practices in the Soviet Union had increasing weight. Even as Hook became deeply involved in the socialist and communist political movements during the late 1920s and early 1930s, the analysis of the negative evidence derivable from developments within Soviet society was reshaping his assessment of Marxism. Consequently, Hook’s involvement with Marxism oscillated between his continuous exploration of Marxist theory including its historical origins and his increasing criticism of Soviet institutions and Communist Party practice. The critical approach to Soviet society and pro-Soviet movements gradually displaced the previous vindication of Marxist theory.

One continuing aspect of Hook’s involvement in Marxism was the completion in 1935 of his most significant scholarly contribution to the development of Marxist thought: From Hegel to Marx. This research had been undertaken during his residence in Europe, primarily in Germany and briefly in Moscow, after the completion of his doctoral dissertation at Columbia. In Moscow, Hook had carried out research at the Marx-Engels Institute in 1929, which was then headed by a scholar of the history of Marxism, David Riazanov. A tension between two opposing attitudes was paradigmatic of Hook’s involvement in Marxism during that period. On the one hand, Hook was immersing himself in what were considered canonic texts of Leninism; on the other hand, Hook was to discover himself reacting with abhorrence to the purge of Riazanov from the Institute, in part, presumably, on account of his objectivity in his approach to the sacred texts of the new State.

From Hegel to Marx provided an analysis of the origins of Marxist theory through an account of Marx’s intellectual confrontation with each of the Young Hegelians who had sought to interpret the relevance of Hegel for developments in European society. Hook tried to show how Marx’s successive rethinking of the writings of David Strauss, Bruno Bauer, Arnold Ruge, Max Stirner, Moses Hess and Ludwig Feuerbach led to the emergence of his own “scientific theory of history.” Hook’s study did justice to the subtleties of the polemics that flourished among the Young Hegelians on diverse issues including the nature of emancipation in bourgeois society or the function of religion in relationship to class consciousness in European society. Further, by selecting these thinkers as the originating background for Marx rather than focusing upon Marx’s earlier philosophical manuscripts, Hook was able to provide evidence for the interpretation of Marx that indicated links with a pragmatic theory of knowledge and a nascent experimental social science. Accordingly, Hook could suggest that just as the pragmatists like Dewey had moved beyond the Hegelian tradition toward a naturalistic account of mind and of human self-consciousness, so Marxism had moved beyond the idealistic framework of Hegelian thought toward a materialistic and potentially scientific account of historical change as the process of dialectic.

Hook’s final attempt to provide an interpretation of Marxism which was consistent with pragmatism was developed in his 1933 book Toward the Understanding of Karl Marx. In this work, arguably for the last time, Hook defended the closeness of the analogy between the Marxist theory of knowledge as connected to revolutionary activism and the pragmatic theory of knowledge as requiring confirmation of hypotheses by their experimental consequences. In this work, also arguably for the last time, Hook sustained the interpretation of Marx as a critical and experimental science of history which was to be tested by the future historical relationship between the social forces of production or technology and the class relations of production in a capitalist society.

Since, as previously noted, Hook’s interest in Marxism was not an abstract theoretical one, but involved his personal commitment and activity in the arena of contemporaneous politics, it was virtually inevitable that the focus of his concern would shift toward the major events that emerged as the dominant historical realities of the 1930s. Hook’s political thought was pioneering in the critical intensity that he brought to bear upon two major movements of the 1930s: Stalinism and Nazism.

Hook went against the grain of the growing radical movements in the United States which had become more pro-Soviet as the economic depression lengthened and the New Deal was perceived on the left as having failed to solve the problems of the depression. Hook became a severe critic of the movement of policy in the Soviet Union, including the formulation of the charge that the Soviet rehabilitation camps were actually a form of slave labor, that the purges of writers and artists represented brutal repression, and that the trials of leading members of the Communist Party and the Politburo were show trials which involved framing the accused in order to strengthen Stalin’s position in his struggle for complete power. Hook’s criticism of communism in the Soviet Union went through several phases and the earliest phase was not anti-socialist, perhaps not even anti-communist, but could be identified as anti-Stalinist. It also represented a degree of identification with the thought and political approach of what was termed during that time Trotskyism.

Hook was distinguished from many in the radical movement in the 1930s in his recognition of the novel threat of Nazism to European and Western society. For most Marxist theorists, the emergence of Nazism could not be considered a major historical threat since the laws of historical inevitability were believed to prove that socialism must follow the capitalist crisis. The success of Nazism in Germany must then be explained away as a passing phenomenon in the decadent “last phase of capitalism.” Even as a post-doctoral student in Germany in the late 1920s, Hook had expressed criticism of the approach to the elections in Germany of the Communist Party in their confidence that any Nazi triumph would be brief and would necessarily be followed by the transfer of power toward socialism and the Communist Party. Hook’s opposition to Nazism included a partial recognition of the extreme price that even a brief transitional period of Nazi rule could exact in Europe. It was this opposition to Nazism that led Hook to subsequently break decisively with the Trotskyite position in the early 1940s.

It is significant that Hook’s vindication of Marxism by reference to its scientific character paves the way for the refutation of Marxism when its predicted consequences are not verified in practice. Hook’s practical political involvement throughout the 1930s with the record of Soviet dictatorship as well as with the regressive oppression by the National Socialist regime in Germany provided strong evidence that his own predictions about the future of capitalism and socialism that had been derived from Marxist theory were not being verified by the historical events. Even more generally, the idea that there could be a “science of history” which would allow human prediction and control of historical outcomes was refuted for any open-minded observer of the facts whose vision was not blinkered or blinded by faith in a theoretical construction.

Hook’s enduring commitment to Deweyan pragmatism contributed to his ultimate rejection of Marxism. The understanding of verification in pragmatic theory as requiring experimental confirmation of hypotheses by an appeal to derived, predictable consequences illuminated crucial dissimilarities between pragmatism and a Marxist theory of verification through revolutionary activism in societal transformation. Further, the interpretation of the scope and limits of scientific method in the attainment of knowledge led to a clarification of the extreme difficulties, insuperable in methodological terms, between the establishment of a natural science and the realization of a “science of history.” Thus Hook’s continuing commitment to the exploration of Deweyan pragmatism led him to the abandonment of his support for Marxism. To a degree, Hook’s focus on foundational moral issues shifted by the late 1930s from the investigation of the compatibility of Deweyan pragmatism with Marxism toward the defense of Deweyan ethical naturalism against the tide of opposition from moral absolutism and from moral emotivism.

Before turning to Hook’s defense of ethical naturalism in moral theory, the practical issues that dominated contemporaneous political discussion merit review. There are three elements that were connected to contemporaneous political controversy.

The first issue was the question of the nature of Stalin’s rule in the Soviet Union, which was highlighted by the trials of leading figures of the Russian Revolution, including, most prominently, Leon Trotsky. A second major issue was the interpretation of the character of the Nazi regime which was given primary significance by the question of American support for Britain at the risk of war with Nazi Germany. The policy options raised by the discussion of these two practical issues brought to the fore, for Hook, the more general issue of the relative weight to be ascribed to political factors as opposed to economic factors, that is, the value of the existence of institutions of democracy or dictatorship compared with the value of the institutions of capitalism or socialism.

On the first issue, Hook acted directly by enlisting John Dewey to serve as the judge of a proposed impartial tribunal which would examine the justice of the charges that had been brought by the Soviet government against Leon Trotsky. To a degree, such a tribunal could be justified as an extension and application of the pragmatic method. The tribunal would seek to resolve conflicting opinions by an appeal to evidence and by undertaking a form of free inquiry. Dewey accepted Hook’s argument that Trotsky may have been the victim of injustice by a socialist society. Presumably, such an injustice merited some attempt at rectification, particularly since the Soviet Union had assumed a role of a morally progressive society in its relation to Western societies and Dewey himself had lauded Soviet education experiments as progressive on his visit to that country in 1928. Accordingly, Dewey agreed to become the judge of a quasi-formal trial of Leon Trotsky to be held in the country of Trotsky’s exile, Mexico, on the charges that the Soviet Union had brought against him. This form of trial does not have a juridical function so that the goal of the trial may be considered as carrying out an educational rather than judicial function. The moral authority of John Dewey enhanced the credibility of the proceedings. The trial involved a rigorous examination of the evidence against Trotsky. Trotsky himself was cross-examined as a witness at the trial. The result was a verdict rendered by Dewey which was essentially recognized as a declaration that Trotsky was not guilty of the charges brought against him by the Soviet authorities.

One byproduct of this trial was Dewey’s published analysis of the set of Trotsky’s beliefs about Marxism, freedom, scientific method and democracy. Dewey had concluded that Trotsky did not understand the nature of democracy and its required toleration for the rights of the minority in the process of government. Dewey argued that Trotsky’s approach revealed a mind that was “locked in absolutes” and failed to recognize the variable and contingent nature of historical processes. Trotsky’s belief that Marxism had provided a theory of scientific socialism which was a blueprint for the development of the historical future was not consistent with the pragmatic understanding of the scientific method. Although Hook had taken the initiative in generating Dewey’s involvement in the vindication of Trotsky, he shared Dewey’s negative conclusions about the compatibility of Trotsky’s beliefs with pragmatism, freedom and democracy.

In the debate over the second issue–opposition to Nazism including the risk of American entry into the Second World War–Hook further distanced himself from the Marxist or the Trotskyist approach. The leading intellectual journal of political discussion of the left during this period was Partisan Review. This magazine, which had been founded as a communist literary journal devoted to the unlikely union of Marxism with aesthetic modernism, had been taken over by the Trotskyist movement in the mid-1930s. Sidney Hook served on its editorial board along with his colleague in the New York University Philosophy Department, James Burnham, and the Columbia University Professor of English and literary critic, Lionel Trilling. The editors of Partisan Review published a controversial editorial against American support for Britain and the anti-Nazi cause on the ground that such support could lead the United States into the war against Nazi Germany. The Partisan Review editorial followed the Trotskyist theoretical position that had been formulated during the period shortly before the Second World War. The Trotskyist view was that the United States was a corporate capitalist society whose militarization would be facilitated by its entry into the war. Consequently, a war between the United States and Nazi Germany would represent a war between two forms of corporate capitalist militarism. This kind of war was identified as one during which the forces of socialism, which were considered as the forces of democracy, would probably experience repression and from which, in any event, they could expect no benefit.

Hook’s rejection of this argument indicates the distance he had moved from Marxism and Trotskyism. The empirical facts regarding National Socialism could not be identified as a phase within the decadent death throes of international capitalism. Rather, the empirical facts of Nazi aggression and Nazi aims required a practical assessment and appropriate response freed from the blinders of Marxist historical determinism. The policy options had to be examined from the perspective of political and moral realism with an evaluation of their potential consequences.

In assessing his support for the capitalist democratic societies like the United Kingdom and the United States against the socialist Soviet Union governed by a single Communist Party or the national socialism of Germany governed by a single National Socialist German Workers’ Party, Hook explicitly affirmed that the defense and preservation of the institutions of political democracy that permitted freedom for individuals and groups were a much more important priority than the transfer of the ownership of the means of production from individuals and corporations to a socialist state. This conclusion went directly counter to the Marxist view that the political organization of a society was secondary to the primary economic structure of the society, that is, in one Marxist phrasing, that a state is nothing but the executive committee of the bourgeoisie. This conclusion, which emerged during the debate over support for the United States against Nazi Germany, was subsequently to become a strong basis for Hook’s support for American policy against the Soviet Union during the period that is referred to as the Cold War.

One additional aspect of Hook’s consideration of the relationship between pragmatism and Marxism was his attempt to set up an “experimental” test for the vindication or refutation of Marxism as an historical theory. Hook’s analysis of the role of the heroic person at different periods in history that was carried out in his 1943 study The Hero in History can be interpreted as developing such a “crucial experiment.” In the final chapter of this study, the role of Lenin as the hero of the Russian Revolution is examined. It is evident on Hook’s account that the Russian Revolution cannot be adequately understood as an historical transformation that was carried out under inevitable dialectical laws. The empirical historical narrative of the period does not cohere with a theoretical construction according to which the social forces of production of pre-Soviet Russia were being fettered by the class relations of production of a capitalist society resulting in an inevitable revolutionary transformation.

For Hook, the realization of Leninist rule in Russia required that Lenin be interpreted as an “event-making” hero. This thesis is incompatible with Marxism. According to Marxism, the actions of those who are identified as heroes in history must be interpreted as “determined,” or strongly “conditioned,” by the economic substructure. In The Hero in History, Hook’s criticism of the Marxist theory of history hinges upon an account of the historical achievements of the hero, Lenin, who brought about a Marxist state in Russia. Thus, ironically, the work that marked Hook’s final break with Marxism was an un-Marxist interpretation of the achievement of Lenin in his founding of the Marxist socialist state. (Hook, The Hero in History, 1943, Chapter X).

3. Hook’s Defense of Ethical Naturalism

Hook’s activist involvement in many of the major moral issues that emerged in the political debates of the 1930s was connected to a major theoretical issue of ethical theory: the possibility of the determination and the justification of objective, normative statements. In ethical theory, Hook aimed to provide a clear and consistent formulation of Deweyan ethical naturalism. In his John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait of 1939, Hook began his discussion by quoting in full Dewey’s view about the centrality of ethics for philosophy. Dewey wrote, “the central problem of philosophy is the relation that exists between the beliefs about the nature of things due to natural science to beliefs about values – using that word to designate whatever is taken to have rightful authority in the direction of conduct.” Dewey continued: “the problem of restoring integration and co-operation between man’s beliefs about the world in which he lives and his beliefs about the values and purposes that should direct his conduct is the deepest problem of modern life” (Hook, John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait, 1939, 128).

In his discussion of Dewey’s ethical naturalism in the “portrait,” Hook proceeded to bring together different strands of Dewey’s ethical theory that had been developed throughout his philosophical career, from his early textbook on ethics in 1908 through Human Nature and Conduct to The Quest for Certainty and concluding with The Theory of Valuation of 1937. Hook stresses that a common feature of Dewey’s diverse presentations of his ethical theory is the location and derivation of morality within the scope of nature, particularly the understanding of human nature. Accordingly, for Dewey, there is an intimate connection, rather than a bifurcation, between value and fact, the “ought” and the “is,” or the prescriptive and the descriptive. A major argument of Dewey’s for this connection, which is the hallmark of his ethical naturalism, was developed in the chapter on the “Construction of Good” in The Quest for Certainty. Hook shares the Deweyan naturalist view that is developed in that chapter that the term “Good” can be understood by reference to the “desirable.” Emphasizing this naturalistic analysis, Hook, like Dewey, recognized the prescriptive component in desirability. “The desirable” refers to what ought to be desired, not only to what could be desired or what is desired. Hook insisted that the prescriptive component is not separated from the descriptive facts of desire. The connection between the desirable and the desired was not deemed to be a fallacy which overlooked the gulf between the “ought” and the “is,” but a justified recognition of the way in which the moral norms for human behavior were developed by recognizing the empirical needs, interests and desires of human beings. Dewey identified phrases like “the desirable” with similar terms, such as “likeable” and “enjoyable.” In each case, the dispositional term could not be reduced to a singular episodic term. To claim that an object, event or experience was likeable, desirable or enjoyable was not so much to claim that it had been liked, desired or enjoyed by a subject, but involved a species of predictive hypothesis, namely, that it could or would be enjoyed by other persons who possessed the relevant potential capacities. The denial that statements about “the Good” were subjective and the recognition that they involved a predictive hypothesis led to the more general thesis that statements about the good, or normative statements, were to be interpreted as statements regarding what would be desired by persons who understood the nature of their desires and knew the consequences of their desires. Accordingly, ethical norms were not subjective or relative but represented cognitive empirical predictions that could be verified or confirmed. They were hypotheses about what would be liked or enjoyed or desired by persons who had investigated critically the nature of their desires, analyzed rationally the optimal means required to satisfy those desires and were sensitive to the consequences of their desires. The derivation of a fundamental moral term like “Good” from the empirical and experiential elements of human desires determined the naturalist character of Deweyan ethics. While human desires could be perverse, such as malicious desires that would wreak havoc with the lives of other people, Hook’s belief was that such perverse desires could not withstand the tests required for normative acceptance. Without being able to appeal to an absolute intuitive exclusion of such malicious desires or of perverse policies that were motivated by these desires, Deweyan naturalism argued that such desires would not meet the criteria for acceptance as norms. Such desires could be understood as incoherent, self-contradictory or self-destructive, and they would inevitably conflict with other desires as well as lead to counter-productive consequences which would mandate their unacceptability. Thus, ethical norms were neither subjective expressions of likes, preferences or desires nor intuitive absolutes that were moral imperatives without any connection to human desires or interests, but were empirical hypotheses regarding optimal norms for realizing desirable ends. Accordingly, empirical statements were cognitive and could be shown in principle to be either true or false.

In his chapter on Dewey’s ethical theory in Intellectual Portrait, Hook also stressed Dewey’s belief that since normative ethical statements were cognitive empirical hypotheses, scientific method could be used to mediate between conflicting hypotheses (Hook, John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait, 1939, Chapter VII, “Standards, Ends, and Means”). Thus Hook assumed that there was a method of verification for normative hypotheses by an appeal to their consequences. Hook’s illustrations of this use of scientific method in ethics, however, are characteristically developed for cases of competing social, economic or educational policies. Even in these contexts, the question can be raised whether there is a blurring of the differences between the ways in which verification functions in scientific experiments and the ways verification can function in decisions evaluating social policy. Further, even if it were conceded that it is possible to achieve a kind of “verification” or “disconfirmation” of policy decisions on such issues as the desirability of minimum wage legislation or the prohibition of narcotics in American society, Hook’s critics were concerned about the distance between the notion of “mediation of conflicting opinions by an appeal to consequence” in such contexts of decision among policy options and the contexts of the emerging disputes over practices of racial genocide or the use of concentration camps as instruments of ideological rehabilitation. Consequently, Dewey’s ethical empiricism was subject to continuous challenge during the 1930s and 40s on the charge that it presupposed an optimistic interpretation of human nature which could not be sustained in light of the new realities of totalitarianism and genocide.

The focus of Hook’s concern in ethical theory over several decades was the continuing defense of Deweyan ethical naturalism. During the decade of the 1940s, a number of ethical and political works were written that represented reactions to the historical evils that had emerged into public consciousness after the Second World War. These works involved reconsiderations of the causes for the phenomena of human evil and of historical regression that were identified with the institutions of “the concentration camp universe” and of mass murder. These works generally involved a rejection of ethical naturalism and the recurrent claim that the Deweyan approach reflected an excessively optimistic and unrealistic interpretation of human nature.

Thus at one pole, anti-naturalist ethical theories were derived from interpretations of current historical phenomena. Some of the anti-naturalist doctrines in ethics developed theses that were analogous to the religious doctrine of “original sin.” This tendency was evidenced by the popularity achieved by the writings of theological critics of Deweyan ethical naturalism such as Reinhold Niebuhr in the 1950s. The dual theme of these works involved both a descriptive interpretation of the perversity, malice and imperfectability of human nature, as well as an ontological or meta-ethical thesis about the need for a non-natural, that is, religious or rational-intuitionist basis and source for moral imperatives in human society and history.

Hook’s defense of ethical naturalism against the anti-naturalist writings that were related to contemporaneous historical events also involved him in the rejection of Existentialist ethical theory. The empiricism and objectivity that were hallmarks of Dewey’s ethical theory were antithetical to the Heideggerian or Sartrean interpretation of normative ethical assertions as arbitrary commitments which represent the choices of persons who bear the burden of freedom and self-consciousness. Hook defended the pragmatic view that normative ethical judgments are evaluated and their truth or adequacy can be confirmed by an appeal to their consequences against the Existentialist thesis that the only criteria available for evaluation of a person’s moral commitments is one of their authenticity to the agent’s being engagée in the situation or accepting of the burden of responsibility for his personal commitments. The darkened canvass of moral phenomenology that emerged during the decade of the 1940s, with its scenes of total war, seemingly absurd resistance, and irrational genocide, did not alter Hook’s identification with the moral naturalism that had been developed as part of the moral canon of the earlier decades of the twentieth century.

At the opposite pole of philosophical methodology, the focus of inquiry was not upon contemporaneous historical phenomena but upon the analysis of language, particularly the constructed languages of logic and mathematics and upon the paradigm of knowledge as delineated in empirical discourse and the languages of the empirical sciences. At this pole also, ethical naturalism was rejected in favor of an account of ethical statements as expressions of emotive attitude. From this perspective, ethical theory was not to be derived from interpretations of history and human nature but from an analysis of logical language and the nature of the languages of the empirical sciences. Dewey and Hook believed that this interpretation of ethical language as expressions of emotive attitude was not justified by an analysis of the ways in which ethical propositions originated in human society or were supported in the context of ethical practice. The ground for the emotivist position, in their view, was the logical positivist thesis that there could be only two kinds of cognitive statements. One kind of statement was cognitively analytic, that is, a class of the statements that were true or false by virtue of the rules of language. The second kind of statement was cognitively empirical, that is, a class of statements that are asserted to be true or false by virtue of sense experience. Statements that were neither analytically true (or false) nor empirically verifiable were thus non-cognitive, that is, neither true nor false. Expressions of emotive attitude like “Hoorah for Stanford!” are exemplified as non-cognitive expressions of emotive attitude. There may be special circumstances in which moral statements admit of analytical truth or falsity, just as there are significant cases where moral statements are empirically verifiable and can be claimed to be probably true or probably false. Yet, in the logical positivist account, since most moral statements do not appear to be true or false by virtue of the rules of language or to be verifiable in the way in which statements are verifiable in the experimental sciences, they must be understood as expressions of emotive attitude. Against emotivism, Dewey and Hook argued that the pragmatic elucidation of moral statements considered them in the contexts of their use in framing moral policy and argument, while the logical positivist analysis of ethical statements did not derive from the consideration of the actual contexts in which ethical statements as judgments of practice functioned and received their justification.

With reference to the debate in ethical theory between logical positivism and pragmatism, there is a relevant and seemingly paradoxical event that forms an interesting part of the historical record. Despite the significant differences that were evident between the views of logical positivism and pragmatism in ethical theory, the editors of the Encyclopedia for Unified Science, a multivolume work which had been projected to represent the authoritative formulation of the position of logical positivism in several fields of philosophy, had decided to ask John Dewey to author the essay on ethical theory. The invitation for Dewey to contribute to the Encyclopedia was given by Otto Neurath in a meeting at Dewey’s home in New York City in 1937. Along with Neurath and Dewey, Sidney Hook, who had emerged as previously noted as a major expositor of Dewey’s ethical theory and Ernest Nagel, who had played a major role in advancing the dialogue between American pragmatism and European analytical philosophy, were present at the discussion. After Dewey had expressed an initial reluctance which stemmed from his perception of the distance between his own views and those of Neurath in epistemology, Dewey consented to write the volume which was published in the Encyclopedia as Theory of Valuation.

In that work, Dewey reiterated his strong disagreement with the view that ethical statements could be relegated to a class of non-cognitive expressions of emotive attitude. Dewey developed a distinction between moral statements in their function as “prizings” in contrast with their function as “appraisals.” Without making explicit reference to A.J. Ayer or any other logical positivist, Dewey suggested that the logical positivist doctrine that had categorized ethical statements as expressions of emotive attitude could be understood as an identification of the “prizing” function of moral statements. For Dewey, normative moral statements could be interpreted more adequately as “appraisals,” that is, as statements which went beyond the expression of personal attitudes of prizing in order to assert cognitive claims about the values of entities or experiences that could be tested by other persons. Although “prizings” could be analogized to emotive attitudes, appraisals were understood as empirical statements whose claims about the value of an object could be confirmed as true or false based upon intersubjective experience and upon their future empirical consequences.

The continuing debate on the issue of the linguistic status of normative statements generated an effort to clarify the nature of ethical disagreement as a means for the resolution of that debate. In C.L. Stevenson’s Ethics in Language, the analysis of the nature of ethical disagreement was considered as providing a method of mediation between pragmatist and logical positivist views in ethical theory. In his graduate seminars on ethical theory, Hook made use of Stevenson’s Ethics in Language as the point of departure for his defense of pragmatic ethics against the criticisms that derived from the analysis of moral language. Stevenson had located Dewey’s interpretation of ethical norms within the broad framework of patterns of moral discourse. For Stevenson, dispute over Deweyan norms or appraisals would represent a pattern that he identified as “disagreement-in-belief.” For this kind of disagreement Stevenson shared Dewey’s view that scientific method provided a competent mode of adjudication. Normative disagreement of this kind could be considered as a parallel to empirical disagreement on experimental scientific questions where true decisions between conflicting hypotheses could be arrived at by an appeal to the evidence of their future consequences.

Stevenson sought to demonstrate, however, that moral disagreement was more adequately represented by the linguistic pattern which he identified as disagreement in attitude. For this kind of disagreement, Stevenson shared the non-cognitivist conclusion of the logical positivists, according to which there would be no rational or scientific method for mediating among conflicting opinions by an appeal to their future consequences. Ethical disagreement of this type could be brought to an end only by a change in attitude. Along the lines of Stevenson’s approach, philosophers who rejected the ethical naturalism of Dewey and Hook have examined the ways in which disagreement in attitude can be related to different structures of perception, plural or diverse interpretive discourses, and conversion to alternative paradigms.

In examining the anti-naturalism in ethical theory that was derived from the analysis of language, Hook followed Dewey in stressing the distinction between prizings and appraisals. Thus, in Hook’s view, moral statements, like empirical scientific statements, were to be considered as hypotheses whose truth or falsity would depend upon their confirmation by future experience. Consequently, this naturalistic and empirical interpretation of ethical statements involved Hook in continuing debates with the proponents of competing interpretations of ethical statements, such as C.L. Stevenson. Stevenson had proposed two reasons in justification of his view that moral disagreement was most fundamentally disagreement in attitude and, therefore, differentiated from scientific or empirical disagreement. One reason, according to Stevenson, was that persons could agree about all the facts that were relevant to a moral dispute and yet hold different attitudes on the issue so that they supported different policies. The second reason cited by Stevenson was that a disagreement was considered to be resolved when the persons involved in the dispute converged on an agreement in attitude even if they maintained differing views about the facts. On the other hand, the moral dispute was not resolved if persons who had agreed on the facts continued to disagree in their attitudes about the question at issue.

Hook provided naturalistic rebuttals to these two arguments advanced by Stevenson on the attitudinal interpretation of ethical statements. Hook argued that in the case in which seeming agreement on all the facts was conjoined with a continuing disagreement in attitude, it was not legitimate to exclude the possibility of an undisclosed factual disagreement. Future investigation might uncover disagreement about relevant facts that could have an impact in changing attitudes. Hook’s claim is that the premise of Stevenson’s argument, namely, that all the facts relevant to attitudes in a moral dispute have been discovered, is not demonstrable. That is, there is no form of completeness theorem which would explicate the notion of all the facts. Thus, the pragmatic thesis that normative statements are empirical appraisals that are open to confirmation by future consequences is not refuted by Stevenson’s identification of disagreement in attitude, since the discovery of future facts may bring about a change in attitude.

Further, agreement in attitude by parties to a dispute does not necessarily imply, as Stevenson suggests, that the moral dispute has been resolved. It is notorious that a resort to force by one protagonist in a moral dispute can change the balance of power so that the other party to the dispute must adopt a different attitude toward the issue for prudential reasons. Yet the conclusion of such an episode would be that the use of force had brought about a settlement of the dispute but not necessarily that it had resolved the ethical disagreement. A change in attitude by a person who has been a party to a dispute which results in the resolution of the conflict does not necessarily mean that the moral issue which precipitated that conflict has been satisfactorily resolved. The end of a dispute through the convergence of attitudes differs in those cases where the change of attitude reflects the acceptance of the realities of power or is the product of conditioning, as in hypnotic submission, from those cases where the change of attitude has derived from convergence on the facts at issue in the dispute.

In this connection, it could be argued, apparently contra Stevenson, that attitudes of extreme prejudice are virtually always defended by an appeal to reasons or facts as supporting the prejudicial attitude. A person who has an ethnic or racial prejudice does not simply express his prejudicial attitude but tends to rationalize it by asserting justifying reasons in support of the attitude. It may be true that the demonstration that these reasons are in point of fact false does not customarily lead to the abandonment or withdrawal of the prejudicial attitude. Nonetheless, the phenomenon of rationalization suggests that over the long run, the sustaining of even prejudicial attitudes requires support by reasons. The demonstration that the supporting reasons are factually false tends to bring with it some degree of revision in attitude.

The issues in the debate between the Stevenson variant of non-naturalist emotivism and pragmatic naturalism were not resolved, but the locus of the debate over ethical naturalism shifted. This shift occurred because of a new turn in the reigning methodology of philosophy. The logical positivist focus on the language of science, like the more generalized Deweyan focus on scientific method, was replaced by the focus on understanding the rules governing the use of conceptual terms in ordinary language. In the context of ethical naturalism, the analysis of the moral vocabulary involved the explication or definition of “Good” as a term of commendation for reasons. Thus the emotive aspects of the moral vocabulary could be interpreted by identifying the commendatory goading or prescriptive functions of moral terms. At the same time, the empirical or pragmatic aspects of the moral vocabulary could be interpreted by identifying the way in which reasons were advanced in support of commendations or prescriptions. On the whole, Hook did not seek to develop a bridge between Deweyan naturalism and the works of ordinary language philosophy. He recognized that the works of Austin and Ryle involved theses about the nature of mind and the nature of experience which were compatible with and supportive of Dewey’s naturalism. Hook did not pursue, however, the defense of ethical naturalism in the vocabulary and methodology that had been advanced by philosophers of ethics like Stuart Hampshire and Philippa Foot. Rather, Hook’s pragmatism led him away from the ongoing debate in ethical theory toward the application of Deweyan naturalism and empiricism on contemporary issues in education, politics and society.

4. The Pragmatic Philosopher as Public Intellectual

Sidney Hook’s emergence as a major American philosopher and his accompanying prominence as an influential intellectual in the American cultural and political scene took place during the decades of the 1930s and 40s. During that period he was recognized as a forceful defender of pragmatic theses in theory of knowledge and ethical theory. Yet the greatest part of Hook’s oeuvre is comprised of writings on the issues that were brought into focus within American social and political thought in the post-War period. As a political philosopher, Hook had been involved from the outset in the fundamental issues of democracy, liberty, and equality. In the post-War period, however, Hook was embroiled in political controversy over the balance between individual liberty and national security occasioned by the exigencies of the Cold War. Hook’s support for a balance which recognized the need for limitations of liberty for the sake of national security led him to a critique of the dominant liberal position which argued against new executive or legislative efforts to enhance national security that could require limitations on individual liberty. On Hook’s view, the traditional liberal position of the Millian variety represented a form of what he termed “ritualistic liberalism.”

Hook’s belief in democracy involved a commitment to civil liberties and racial desegregation. Again, after the 1960s, he was involved in political controversy over the legitimacy of discrimination on grounds of race as an instrument for educational desegregation and racial integration.

The range of issues on which Hook wrote included the redirection and reshaping of his perennial interest in philosophy of education and in the relationship between the economic structure of a society and its political institutions. In the post-War period, Hook revisited his earlier position in philosophy of education as well as his support for socialism. His later work in philosophy of education involved him in a response to the emergence in the 1960s of an educational approach that advocated relevance as the most important criterion for the educational curriculum, as well as a response to the debate between an emphasis on the Western tradition and the thesis of multiculturalism in education. Along similar lines, his reexamination of the issues raised by socialist theory was engendered by the need to respond to the evidence that had emerged, particularly by the 1980s, regarding the failure of socialist economics in diverse countries where it had been practiced. The positions that Hook advanced in these areas were generally perceived as representing a shift from his self-identification as an anti-communist democratic socialist to his arrival at a prominent place in the diverse ranks of supporters of American conservative thought. Yet Hook had remained constant to his pragmatism which sought to resolve ideological issues on the basis of a continuing and ongoing inquiry, evaluation of evidence, and appraisal of values.

Hook followed Dewey in considering the philosophy of education to be a central focus of concern for any social and political philosophy. Hook argued that American educational institutions, in their bureaucratic structure and organization, were too authoritarian and were not sufficiently responsive to the needs of the individual student. As for the content of the curriculum and the methods of teaching, Hook argued that they were too rigidly bound by the traditional disciplines and was insufficiently concerned with the classroom as a community of inquiry or a forum for the development of critical and independent thinking. Under Dewey’s banner, a legion of advocates and supporters of progressive education had carried out a thoroughgoing reform of American educational institutions. These reforms included the development of alternative schools that defined themselves as “child-centered” and the development of curricula that abolished traditional requirements in favor of the rights of students to have a greater role in the determination of the course of their own of studies. Like Dewey, Hook came to the conclusion that the developments within progressive education that had been fostered in Dewey’s name had gone too far in their rejection of the need for authority and the importance of liberal education as an education in fundamental knowledge, including the knowledge of traditional subject matter. As a result, Hook tried to formulate a measured criticism that would balance the strengths of the American educational system and tradition while at the same time seeking to reform aspects of that system and that tradition. In his Education for Modern Man of 1946, Hook sought to develop a direction for American education that would conform to the ideals of pragmatic liberalism. For Hook, this required that the classroom should become a community of inquiry in which students would develop their potentiality for critical inquiry as a method which is analogous to scientific method. One of the strongest claims in Education for Modern Man was the primacy of method for education. To a degree, Hook’s belief in the primacy of scientific method presupposed the pragmatist account of a generalized methodology for all the sciences. Criticism of the pragmatic thesis of a single generalized scientific method as opposed to the recognition of the difference in the methods used in the writing of history, the study of literature and research on social problems as distinct from the methods of the natural sciences had an impact on Hook’s philosophy of education. Hook’s subsequent recognition of the ways in which the teaching of science involved the learning of substantive subject matter and experimental techniques rather than a generalized method for the criticism and testing of hypotheses marked a nuanced shift in his educational philosophy.

Although Education for Modern Man recognized the place of the major intellectual disciplines in the sciences and the humanities in the curriculum of the public school and the college, the stress was not laid upon the learning of the substantive subject matter as much as upon the development of the student’s ability for independent thinking and the fostering of his capacity for exercising critical intelligence. Similarly, although the authority of the teacher and administrator was recognized, the stress was placed upon the democratic character of the classroom as a community of free inquiry. In Hook’s interpretation of education, a condition for the identification of an educational institution as a democratic institution was the requirement that it sustain freedom of inquiry.

In Hook’s general theory of democracy, the idea of freedom of inquiry also retained pride of place. Thus constraint on freedom of inquiry by a democratic majority in an electoral democracy would represent not only a violation of freedom but a violation of the democratic process. Continuous with the value of freedom of inquiry, the idea of cultural freedom was identified as a condition for democratic society. Accordingly, Hook was to formulate his criticism of Soviet society during the period of the cold war by reference to the violations of cultural freedom within the Soviet Empire.

At the same time, Hook’s interpretation of a free and democratic society was consistent with the recognition that such a society could set limits to freedom of expression. Conceptually, this recognition of the limits of freedom related to pragmatic pluralism. Its philosophical justification rested on the belief that no single value was absolute and that every value was justified only as a result of a process of mediation, compromise, or balance with other values. Hook appreciated the pluralistic character of liberty as recognized in the later terminology of John Austin, according to which the “correlative opposites” of the term “liberty” are not only such terms as “slavery,” “repression” and “coercion,” but also such terms as “security,” “order,” “self-restraint” and “law.” The significance of this recognition of the duality of opposites of the concept of liberty is that it points to different contexts in the application of liberty. When “liberty” is opposed to “slavery” or “tyranny,” the realization of liberty involves the abolition of slavery or tyranny. When “liberty” is opposed to “security” or “order,” the realization of liberty involves a balance of values between liberty and security or order.

Hook’s formulation of the issue of the limits of freedom in a democracy could be traced back to his sensitivity to his observation of the rise of Nazism in Germany during his residency in that country in the late 1920s. The anti-Nazi neo-Kantian philosopher, Leonard Nelson, had pointed out at that time that totalitarian movements, particularly the National Workers Socialist movement, confronted democracy with a potentially fatal dilemma: if the democratic system were to outlaw or prohibit the National Workers Socialist Party from participation in political elections, it would be taking a significant step toward the destruction of democracy by excluding a party which had a mass following. If the democratic system were to fail to outlaw or prohibit the National Workers Socialist Party from participation in national electoral politics, however, it would be taking a potentially even more significant step toward the destruction of democracy. A single electoral victory of the National Workers Socialist Party, no matter by how small a margin, would result in the abolition of other political freedoms or in the termination of subsequent elections, as in the standard refrain of democracies that have committed suicide: “one person, one vote – one election.” Thus, Nelson’s dilemma recognized a possibly fatal flaw in democracy once a significant pro-totalitarian or anti-democratic party had achieved a degree of popular support.

Hook’s understanding of the dilemma led him to the belief that it was legitimate for a democratic system to take steps to constrain the influence of anti-democratic or totalitarian groups or parties within a democratic society. In the United States, the question of the right of the American Fascist Party or the American Communist Party to participate in electoral politics did not rise to the level of political controversy, probably because of the lack of popular support for these parties. The issue was drawn, however, over the legitimacy of excluding members or advocates of such parties from positions which involved access to national security decisions as well as their exclusion from positions of major influence in the cultural sphere. Hook sought to resolve this dilemma in a controversial book titled Heresy, Yes – Conspiracy, No. The line that Hook sought to draw was the granting of full cultural and political freedom to any heretical anti-democratic views. At the same time, if holders of such views were organized as a disciplined cadre which could represent a threat to national security or as a doctrinally controlled movement which could exercise coercive influence in a free marketplace of ideas, then the activities of such groups could be limited. Critics charged that in developing the thesis of Heresy, Yes – Conspiracy, No, Hook was in effect permitting the exclusion of Communist Party members or “fellow travelers” from holding jobs in universities or from holding positions of power or influence in cultural activities like films and theater. In Hook’s defense, the record shows that Hook was involved in the formulation of a thesis within the theory of democracy about the legitimacy of the line to be drawn in defense of democracy, rather than the application of this thesis to individual cases. Thus, Hook did not seek to resolve the question of what kind of evidence would constitute participation in a conspiracy as between such diverse considerations as the fact of membership in a political party, the criterion of “advocacy” for policies that were considered as “subversive,” indoctrination along lines laid down and enforced by a leadership cadre, or participation in an espionage ring.

Heresy, Yes – Conspiracy, No represented, from Hook’s perspective, a contribution to the defense of democracy and cultural freedom in an environment in which both democracy and cultural freedom were under attack from the Soviet Union. As previously mentioned, Hook was a leading member of the editorial board of Partisan Review. During the 1950s, this journal was the premier anti-communist publication in the United States. The leading intellectual figures who represented opposition to the policies of Joseph Stalin and the leaders of the Soviet Union in their internal policies and to the international policies of the Soviet Union wrote on the nature of Soviet society and policy for this journal. These figures included such leading writers from Western Europe as George Orwell, André Malreaux, and Ignazio Silone as well as the American black novelist Richard Wright and such intellectual luminaries from Eastern Europe as Czeslaw Milosz, Arthur Koestler and Manes Sperber. As the leading journal within the anti-communist spectrum, Partisan Review was confronted by the moral issue of McCarthyism. The activities of Senator Joseph McCarthy in the late 1940s and early 1950s represented a problem for anti-communism in two dimensions. On the one hand, from the public relations perspective, McCarthy’s inaccuracies and exaggerations provided a sword to the critics of anti-communism. One quip of the period that represented this aspect was the thesis of liberal opponents of McCarthy that they were “anti-anti-communists.” More significantly, on substantive moral grounds, as Hook recognized, it was not tenable for an intellectual movement that charged Stalinism with framing its enemies in purges, trials and rehabilitation camps to be complicit with a movement which would falsely accuse persons of being communist agents or members of the Communist Party. The result was the decision by a majority of the editorial board of Partisan Review, including Sidney Hook, to condemn McCarthyism and to lend its support to the opponents of Senator McCarthy. In terms of the contemporaneous moral context, it is relevant to note that Professor James Burnham, who was a colleague of Sidney Hook at the Department of Philosophy at New York University, disagreed with this position and resigned from the editorial board of Partisan Review. Burnham’s argument was that it was a fallacy of moral equivalence to compare the enormity of immoral evil carried out by communism in its attack on democratic institutions with the moral flaws that had taken place during Senator McCarthy’s strategy and tactics of seeking to uncover Soviet agents who were guilty of espionage in the U.S. State Department or Government.

The theoretical background of Heresy, Yes – Conspiracy, No was not limited to the analysis of the specific means that a democratic society could use to protect itself from internal totalitarian movements without impinging upon legitimate civil liberties, but involved the general conception of the absolute status of the right of liberty and the legitimacy of constraints upon freedom. In a subsequent work titled The Paradoxes of Freedom, Hook confronted the Jeffersonian theme of a right to liberty as an absolute and inalienable right. As a pragmatist, Hook argued that moral rights, like legal rights, could not be absolute, whether grounded in God or Nature. Rather, Hook sought to show how the language of rights presupposed obligations of other persons to protect a right and that these obligations to protect the rights of the individual person were derived from shared human interests in social life. It followed that although rights for Hook could not be reduced to utilities, preferences or expressions of emotive attitude, all rights, including the right to liberty, were defeasible by other values or interests. Thus, a right to liberty could be overridden by the need for a society to protect itself. This is evident when a person’s right to liberty is denied and he is imprisoned after committing a crime. The logic of the defeasibility of absolute rights, however, would also imply that the right of a citizen to hold a national security clearance or a job with a nation’s intelligence agency could be limited by reference to the value of national security. Hook’s practical position was buttressed by his theoretical account of the pragmatic nature of the concept of liberty. The pragmatic account of liberty, however, was not a rationalization for Hook’s political advocacy. The interpretation of natural rights as admitting of limitations upon rights by reference to other values is a constant aspect of the approach that pragmatism offered to the traditions of absolutism and imprescriptability on natural or human rights.

Hook’s theoretical interest in the issue of cultural freedom was overshadowed by his involvement in the forum of public policy. Hook’s rejection of Marxism led him to support the value of political freedom as an essential condition for a democratic society, whether in capitalist or socialist economic frameworks. The implication of this theoretical analysis, for Hook, was his support of the American commitment to political and cultural freedom as opposed to what he saw as a Soviet or communist commitment against political freedom in furthering the growth of a totalitarian state. For that reason, therefore, Hook could be counted as a “Cold Warrior” in support of the West during the Cold War. It should be noted that in the political terminology of the period, the identification of Hook as a Cold Warrior by persons who favored the use of that term did not mean a supporter of the Western democratic alliance or what was termed “the free world” against totalitarianism. Rather, “Cold Warrior” was used pejoratively to indicate a person who sought to influence American policy so that it would pursue a containment or adversarial strategy toward the Soviet Union as a corollary to an ideological and paranoiac interpretation of the Soviet Union as an aggressive and expansionist empire. Thus, critics of Cold Warriors and the Cold War saw the Soviet Union as an alternative, socialist system with which a realistic, moderate and non-ideological Western policy should pursue “constructive engagements” toward compromise, cooperation and mutual respect.

In his support for the idea of cultural freedom, Hook was a founder of the American Committee for Cultural Freedom. This Committee organized a number of symposia on issues related to cultural freedom among a wide intellectual community, including such figures as W.H. Auden and Arthur Schlesinger, Jr. Much more significant in political terms was the extension of this kind of activity to international forums, particularly in Western Europe. Among Western European intellectuals in the early 1950s, the issue of their choice among the options of European neutralism, ideological support for the Soviet Union or support for the United States was at the center of political debate. The Congress of Cultural Freedom conference that Hook helped organize in Paris at that time represented a rallying base for criticism of the Soviet Union and for support of a philosophy of liberal democracy that was compatible with the American foreign policy interest. One of the more remarkable results of the activities of the Congress of Cultural Freedom was the founding of a number of cultural journals modeled on Partisan Review. These journals included Encounter in England, Les Preuves in France and Der Monat in Germany, as well as similar periodicals in India and Australia. The high cultural standards adopted by these journals led to their becoming vanguard publications in their own national cultures, so that their advocacy of the anti-communist message was transcended by their literary achievement. The continued exposure of the abuses of human rights and democratic values in the Soviet Union and its satellites remained a constant theme even as they were in the forefront of literary and artistic culture and provided independent and open forums for the discussion of major questions of economic development and social policy.

Consequently, it was a source of embarrassment when the revelation broke that the CIA had helped finance the activities of the Congress of Cultural Freedom and of these publications. Inferentially, Hook believed that the funding source did not corrupt the integrity of these publications or taint their legitimacy as forums of critical inquiry. From the other direction, there was surprise that the CIA was prepared to fund publications that had been openly critical of many aspects of American foreign policy and domestic affairs. Interestingly, the acronym in the bureaucratic files of the CIA that referred to the funding of this project was “NCL,” that is, the non-communist left. Hook believed that it represented a degree of prudential wisdom by the United States government to be willing to support a non-capitalist, anti-communist cultural enterprise that was not necessarily faithful to the line projected in American foreign policy, since it had developed a significant body of criticism against both the theory and the practice of totalitarian communism.

Throughout this period, Hook’s political views could be identified as “democratic socialist.”

One significant evidence of the transition of Hook’s thought on economic issues is available in his early encounter with the writings of Friedrich von Hayek, the economist of the Austrian school which had developed the thesis that democratic socialism was incoherent from both economic and political perspectives. Hook wrote a review of Hayek’s Road to Serfdom which confirms the shift from his earlier view on Marxism and socialism. Far from asserting his earlier thesis that the achievement of political democracy require socialism or, at any rate, a greater degree of economic democracy in the form of lessened concentration of economic power in the capitalist class, Hook advanced the criticism that Hayek’s thesis paralleled in a significant sense the fallacious Marxist thesis of economic determinism.

Hayek had argued that socialist societies represented a state concentration of economic power which had a potential for totalitarianism that would be actualized over the long-run. For Hayek, the reverse also held, namely that free-market societies required the rule of law and constraints upon the exercise of monopolistic or arbitrary power so that free market economies would lead to the establishment of democratic institutions, again, over the long-run.

Hook’s counter-thesis was the independence of political structures and economic systems. According to Hook, authoritarian or tyrannical regimes have been established in countries in which both capitalist as well as socialist economic institutions have prevailed. Similarly, for Hook, there would be no bar to the realization of democracy in either a society that had free markets or in a society in which government owned or controlled the economic means of production.

In the decades since The Road to Serfdom was published, there has been significant evidence regarding the close relationship between the concentration of economic power and political power, particularly in many of the developing countries. At the same time, it could be argued that neither Hayek’s thesis nor Hook’s counter-thesis has been definitively proven. The democratic and socialist states of Western Europe could represent a refutation of Hayek’s thesis. The Hayek rebuttal, however, could point to the degree in which free markets operate in European societies alongside the governmental sector. The new phenomenon of one-party political dictatorships that embrace and encourage free-market economics in the People’s Republic of China or Vietnam would also suggest a refutation of Hayek’s close connection between free societies and free market economics. The Hayek rebuttal would be that the necessity for the rule of law as well as for greater freedom of movement of persons and goods in these developing economies have already limited to a degree the exercise of totalitarian power and arbitrary rule. Consequently, the thesis remains that the potential for change in the direction of liberal and democratic society is built into the continuing function of free markets even in these long-standing one-party dictatorial states.

Subsequently, Hook’s own views on economics underwent significant change. To a degree, this reflected his move from New York University, where he had been a professor of philosophy for four decades, to the Hoover Institution in California. At the Hoover Institution, Hook was closely involved with a number of the leading theoreticians of the economics of free-market societies. Although there was a shift in Hook’s approach to economic theory, the general change in his views on issues of political philosophy are not attributable to theoretical economics but to other social, political and cultural factors in the United States.

The legitimacy of the attribution of Hook as a conservative in his later views in political philosophy derives from his writings and activities across the entire gamut of social policy questions. To Hook’s long-standing opposition to the Left on foreign policy issues that had stemmed from his major commitment to anti-communism, there was added his stance against major positions of the left wing of the American political spectrum on domestic issues, particularly after the self-identified revolutionary activities of the New Left in the late 1960s.

As a response to campus turmoil of the late 1960s, Hook founded an organization called University Centers for Rational Alternatives. Through this organization, Hook aimed to advance his critical rejection of radical efforts to transform the American university and educational system. The newsletter of that organization, titled Measure, represented Hook’s belief in a balance between the traditional practices of the American university and the need for reform based on critical method and rational criticism.

The range of Hook’s political writings was extended broadly in his contributions to Measure. The issues that had dominated Hook’s criticism of totalitarianism, as well as his criticism of aspects of American liberalism through the 1950s had revolved around the pole of communism versus anti-communism. The emergence of the New Left in 1968 moved Hook’s application of what he believed was his pragmatic commitment to free inquiry from its previous emphasis on the reform of institutional practice toward the emphasis, expressed in Measure, on the balance between continuity and change. Consequently, in the spectrum of political philosophical thought Hook had moved from the liberal wing, in which the priority had been identified as the need to critically evaluate the flaws and faults of American institutional practices in order to reform or transform them, to the conservative wing, in which the priority was identified as the need to protect and sustain the strengths and values that were inherent in American institutional practices. Hook’s writings and positions became linked to American political conservatism on a range of issues from educational curriculum through affirmative action to constitutional questions of the limits of executive privilege and judicial authority.

The issues that were discussed most frequently by Hook in Measure related to American education, which, as previously noted, had been an enduring focus of his interests from the outset of his career. Hook’s changed approach to education was developed in his essay, Philosophy of the Curriculum, in 1976. In that essay, Hook sought to formulate the indispensable subject matter for a curriculum in higher education. While Hook maintained his previous thesis that the development of critical thinking was crucial to any valuable educational experience, his formulation of the curricular subject matter reveals the degree to which the critical method is intertwined with the learning of appropriate subject matter, whether in the humanities or the sciences. Further, Hook defended liberal education as requiring the reading and study of the Western canon even if such a requirement goes against perceived student needs and the expression of student preferences, or violates some proposed criterion of social relevance. Thus, without reneging on his earlier criticism in Education for Modern Man of any educational philosophy that assumed a fixed human nature, Hook recognized the legitimate role of a liberal education as the initiation of every human being into the cultural traditions of his society. Such initiation into a tradition was compatible with the development of a critical method and approach. The idea that the classroom was a community of free inquiry remained a central feature of Hook’s philosophy of education. At the same time, the identification of the classroom as a community of free inquiry was no longer directed against academic traditionalism in its curricular implications such as the tradition of reading the greatest works of the humanities or the classic texts of political and social thought. Rather, it was directed against the classroom as a community of faith or a forum for political advocacy. Thus, the growing curricular practice of “cultural studies” of “designated groups of victims” represented the transformation of the classroom into a community of shared substantive values with a political agenda rather than a community of inquiry with a shared critical method. To the degree to which multiculturalism did not represent the study of the languages and texts of other cultures but represented a species of political commitment to designated deprived cultural groups, it would entail, for Hook, an unjustified metamorphosis of the university from a community of free inquiry into a community of political faith and advocacy.

Educational issues were intertwined with broader issues of American society. The issue of affirmative action for college admissions, for example, related to the social issue of the nature of American democratic pluralism. Hook supported a conception of American democracy as a society that had been built upon individual rights and equality before the law, where greater equality was to be realized by virtue of the fact that the United States was a society of multiple opportunities with differing patterns for upward mobility. In contrast, Hook perceived affirmative action, with its corollary of quotas assigned to designated groups as a conception of American democracy as a system of group rights, where greater equality was to be realized by distributive measures. For Hook, rights were ascribed to the individual and not to individuals as members of majority or minority groups. Consequently, discrimination on grounds of race was illegitimate, whether it was designed as an expression of majority prejudice against a minority or as a benign instrument of rectificatory justice. Accordingly, for Hook, programs of affirmative action could be justified if they functioned to help a deprived individual student overcome deficiencies in his educational background or to eliminate any bars to opportunity that had been erected by discriminatory laws or practices. Programs of affirmative action, however, that resulted in quotas for minority group participation involved discrimination against the rights of other individuals. Since each individual was entitled to equality before the law and equality of rights, no individual was entitled, on grounds of membership in an historically deprived group or racial or ethnic minority, to advantages that violate equality of rights and justify discrimination against other individuals on racial or ethnic ground. While the social ideal of overcoming economic inequality was legitimate, the means for its realization could not involve replacing individual rights with group rights or justifying discrimination against individuals who were considered equal before the law. Hook took note of the great progress toward equality that had taken place in American society from the turn of the century through the 1980s. Hook expressed confidence in the capacities of a democratic society to overcome inequalities in economic distribution and in social participation of ethnic minorities without transforming the legal structure of the American system that had prevailed through those decades. As a lifelong supporter of John Dewey, Hook believed that democratic society, if it embodied the critical method, would be capable of progressive improvement.

In light of this Deweyan optimism, it is significant that Hook took as the subject of his Presidential Address for the American Philosophical Association the question of whether pragmatism had an appropriately “tragic sense of life.” Hook sought to counter the charge that the meliorism and optimism of pragmatism represented a failure to understand the tragic situation that is an inevitable part of the human condition. Hook had argued that Deweyan pragmatism did not represent an excessively optimistic faith in human perfectibility, on the model of Condorcé, and distanced itself from a logically dialectical faith in the inevitable historical progress along the lines of Hegel or Marx. Hook and the pragmatic philosophy recognized that there have been innumerable sites of human failure, self-destructive action and tragic defeat in history. Hook recognized the empirical phenomena of historical evil while believing that a philosophical or theological emphasis upon these phenomena as representing the essence of mankind or determining with historical inevitability the end of civilization could be identified as a “failure of nerve” which went beyond the required acceptance of the facts about the human condition. Rather, Hook’s thesis in his presidential lecture was that it was necessary to appreciate those enduring features of the human condition that rendered utopian thought untenable and incoherent even as they made possible progress through scientific method and an increase in human freedom that could occur at any particular time and place.

Accordingly, Hook’s conclusion recognized the recurrence of tragedy throughout human history and throughout the careers of individuals. Hook argued that this recognition of a tragic sense was compatible with the humanistic naturalism that Deweyan pragmatism had fostered. The tragic sense of this pragmatic naturalism did not require the acceptance of the inevitability of the triumph of fateful “Necessity” on the model of Greek tragedy or within the framework of an Ionian metaphysical perspective in which human achievement is unavoidably dwarfed and overwhelmed by the immense magnitudes of natural phenomena. Similarly, the tragic sense of pragmatic naturalism did not require the acceptance of the inevitability of human self-destruction because of the flawed constitution of human nature, as in the religious metaphors of original sin or the Freudian metaphor of the “death instinct.” So pragmatic naturalism could sustain the recognition of a tragic sense while retaining the Deweyan optimistic realism that human nature, interacting with the environing processes of Nature, could survive and develop a free society of free human beings, with the use of human reason and the methods of the sciences.

5. Hook’s Place in the History of Pragmatism

According to a narrative that is common in contemporary accounts of 20th Century philosophy in America, pragmatism fell into decline shortly following World War II. Professional philosophy, it is said, had become dominated by the pretensions to formalism and precision that is the mark of the “analytic philosophy” that had emigrated from the UK. Turning to technical topics in the philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and epistemology, American philosophers abandoned the vision of philosophy as a publicly engaged practice of social critique that had been championed by Dewey, opting instead for view of philosophy as a highly specialized and anemically academic discipline. Pragmatism, this account has it, was “eclipsed” and “marginalized” by analytic philosophy. The popular account continues that in the 1980s, pragmatism was revived in the form of the “neo-pragmatism” proposed by Richard Rorty, Cornel West, Hilary Putnam, and Stanley Cavell, among others. However, when this account is presented by advocates of the tradition of “classical” pragmatism, the emphasis is placed on the allegation that neo-pragmatism is no true pragmatism at all, but a counterfeit of the movement begun by Perice, James, and Dewey. According to those allied with the classical pragmatists, pragmatism remains in eclipse. Hence there has emerged a significant “back to Dewey” movement within contemporary American philosophy, a movement that overtly sets itself in opposition to mainstream analytic philosophy and seeks to reestablish pragmatism’s predominance.

What is puzzling in all of this is that those invested in the idiom of classical pragmatism nearly always write Sidney Hook out of pragmatism’s history. Once Hook is acknowledged, one sees the Deweyan vision of philosophy thriving throughout the period of alleged marginalization. That is, one finds in Hook not only a high-profile publicly engaged philosopher employing the methods of experimental inquiry to present social problems, but also an influential academic philosopher engaged with the professional debates of his day, and often making necessary concessions and adjustments to the pragmatist commitments in light of new objections and evidence. Although Hook’s results do not always reflect “chapter and verse” Deweyanism, they do retain what is far more important, namely, the unflagging commitment to the application of experimental intelligence to the social and political problems of the day.

Several studies of the history and mid-century development of pragmatism have appeared recently, including the landmark work of Cheryl Misak, which does much to dislodge the dominant “eclipse narrative” and recast pragmatism as continuous with the mainstream trends within the so-called “analytic” philosophy of C. I. Lewis, Nelson Goodman, W. V. O. Quine, and Donald Davidson. Nonetheless, apart from a suggestive but still only preliminary discussion by Cornel West in his study of American pragmatism and a new examination of Hook’s “disputed legacy” by Gary Bullert, Sidney Hook’s place in the pragmatist story remains largely unexplored.


Bibliographical Note: A complete bibliography of the writings of Sidney Hook from his initial publication in 1922 through 1980 has been compiled by Jo-Ann Boydston and Kathleen Poulos. This bibliography is published in Sidney Hook: Philosopher of Democracy and Humanism, edited by Paul Kurtz. This bibliography, which has been updated through 1988 by Matthew J. Cotter, is reprinted in Sidney Hook Reconsidered, edited by Matthew J. Cotter.

Primary Literature: Cited Works by Sidney Hook

  • 1927, The Metaphysics of Pragmatism, Chicago: Open Court Pub. Co.
  • 1933, Toward the Understanding of Karl Marx: A Revolutionary Interpretation, New York: John Day Co.
  • 1934 (ed.), The Meaning of Marx [Symposium by Bertrand Russell, John Dewey, Morris R. Cohen, Sherwood Eddy, and Sidney Hook], New York: Farrar and Rinehart.
  • 1936, From Hegel to Marx: Studies in the Intellectual Development of Karl Marx, New York: John Day Co.
  • 1939, John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait, New York: John Day Co.
  • 1943, The Hero in History, New York: John Day Co.
  • 1946, Education for Modern Man, New York: Dial Press.
  • 1952, Heresy, Yes – Conspiracy, No, New York: American Committee for Cultural Freedom.
  • 1960, “Pragmatism and the Tragic Sense of Life,” Commentary 30 (1960), pp 139–149.
  • 1961, The Quest for ‘Being,’ New York: St. Martin’s Press.
  • 1962, Paradoxes of Freedom, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • 1975, Paul Kurtz and Miro Todorovich (ed.), The Philosophy of the Curriculum, Buffalo: Prometheus Books.
  • 1987, Out of Step: An Unquiet Life in the 20th Century, New York: Harper & Row.

Secondary Literature

  • Bullert, Gary, 2022, The Disputed Legacy of Sidney Hook, Lanhan, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Capaldi, Nicholas, 1983, “Sidney Hook: A Personal Portrait,” in Kurtz 1983, pp. 17–27.
  • Cotter, Matthew J. (ed.), 2004, Sidney Hook Reconsidered, Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Konvitz, Milton R., 1983, “Sidney Hook: Philosopher of the Moral-Critical Intelligence,” in Kurtz 1983, pp. 3–6.
  • Kristol, Irving, “Life with Sidney: A Memoir,” in Kurtz 1983.
  • Kurtz, Paul (ed.), 1968, Sidney Hook and the Contemporary World, New York: John Day and Co.
  • Kurtz, Paul (ed.), 1983, Sidney Hook: Philosopher of Democracy and Humanism, Buffalo: Prometheus Books. [This Festschrift for Sidney Hook’s eightieth birthday contains four essays on Hook’s person and writings.]
  • Kurtz, Paul, 1983a, “Preface: The Impact of Sidney Hook in the Twentieth Century,” in Kurtz 1983.
  • Misak, Cheryl, 2013, The American Pragmatists, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Phelps, Christopher, 1962, Foreword to Sidney Hook, From Hegel to Marx: Studies in the Intellectual Development of Karl Marx, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, pp. 1–11.
  • Phelps, Christopher, 1997, Young Sidney Hook: Marxist and Pragmatist, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Ryan, Alan, 2002, Foreword to Sidney Hook, Sidney Hook on Pragmatism, Democracy, and Freedom: The Essential Essays, (Robert B. Talisse and Robert Tempio (eds.), Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, pp. 9–10.
  • Sidorsky, David, 2003, “Charting the Intellectual Career of Sidney Hook: Five Major Steps” in Partisan Review, Volume 70, Number 2, pp. 324–342. [This is a slightly edited version of the essay which is printed as the Introduction to Matthew J. Cotter’s collection of essays, Sidney Hook Reconsidered.]
  • Talisse, Robert, 2001, “Liberty, Community, and Democracy: Sidney Hook’s Pragmatic Deliberativism” in Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 15(4): 286–304.
  • West, Cornel, 1989, The American Evasion of Philosophy: A Genealogy of Pragmatism, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.

Other Internet Resources


As of the November 2018 update, Robert Talisse has taken responsibility for updating and maintaining this entry.

Copyright © 2024 by
David Sidorsky
Robert Talisse <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free