Conventionality of Simultaneity

First published Mon Aug 31, 1998; substantive revision Sat Jul 21, 2018

In his first paper on the special theory of relativity, Einstein indicated that the question of whether or not two spatially separated events were simultaneous did not necessarily have a definite answer, but instead depended on the adoption of a convention for its resolution. Some later writers have argued that Einstein’s choice of a convention is, in fact, the only possible choice within the framework of special relativistic physics, while others have maintained that alternative choices, although perhaps less convenient, are indeed possible.

1. The Conventionality Thesis

The debate about the conventionality of simultaneity is usually carried on within the framework of the special theory of relativity. Even prior to the advent of that theory, however, questions had been raised (see, e.g., Poincaré 1898) as to whether simultaneity was absolute; i.e., whether there was a unique event at location A that was simultaneous with a given event at location B. In his first paper on relativity, Einstein (1905) asserted that it was necessary to make an assumption in order to be able to compare the times of occurrence of events at spatially separated locations (Einstein 1905, 38–40 of the Dover translation or 125–127 of the Princeton translation; but note Scribner 1963, for correction of an error in the Dover translation). His assumption, which defined what is usually called standard synchrony, can be described in terms of the following idealized thought experiment, where the spatial locations A and B are fixed locations in some particular, but arbitrary, inertial (i.e., unaccelerated) frame of reference: Let a light ray, traveling in vacuum, leave A at time t1 (as measured by a clock at rest there), and arrive at B coincident with the event E at B. Let the ray be instantaneously reflected back to A, arriving at time t2. Then standard synchrony is defined by saying that E is simultaneous with the event at A that occurred at time (t1 + t2)/2. This definition is equivalent to the requirement that the one-way speeds of the ray be the same on the two segments of its round-trip journey between A and B.

It is interesting to note (as pointed out by Jammer (2006, 49), in his comprehensive survey of virtually all aspects of simultaneity) that something closely analogous to Einstein’s definition of standard simultaneity was used more than 1500 years earlier by St. Augustine in his Confessions (written in 397 CE). He was arguing against astrology by telling a story of two women, one rich and one poor, who gave birth simultaneously but whose children had quite different lives in spite of having identical horoscopes. His method of determining that the births, at different locations, were simultaneous was to have a messenger leave each birth site at the moment of birth and travel to the other, presumably with equal speeds. Since the messengers met at the midpoint, the births must have been simultaneous. Jammer comments that this “may well be regarded as probably the earliest recorded example of an operational definition of distant simultaneity.”

The thesis that the choice of standard synchrony is a convention, rather than one necessitated by facts about the physical universe (within the framework of the special theory of relativity), has been argued particularly by Reichenbach (see, for example, Reichenbach 1958, 123–135) and Grünbaum (see, for example, Grünbaum 1973, 342–368). They argue that the only nonconventional basis for claiming that two distinct events are not simultaneous would be the possibility of a causal influence connecting the events. In the pre-Einsteinian view of the universe, there was no reason to rule out the possibility of arbitrarily fast causal influences, which would then be able to single out a unique event at A that would be simultaneous with E. In an Einsteinian universe, however, no causal influence can travel faster than the speed of light in vacuum, so from the point of view of Reichenbach and Grünbaum, any event at A whose time of occurrence is in the open interval between t1 and t2 could be defined to be simultaneous with E. In terms of the ε-notation introduced by Reichenbach, any event at A occurring at a time t1 + ε(t2t1), where 0 < ε < 1, could be simultaneous with E. That is, the conventionality thesis asserts that any particular choice of ε within its stated range is a matter of convention, including the choice ε=1/2 (which corresponds to standard synchrony). If ε differs from 1/2, the one-way speeds of a light ray would differ (in an ε-dependent fashion) on the two segments of its round-trip journey between A and B. If, more generally, we consider light traveling on an arbitrary closed path in three-dimensional space, then (as shown by Minguzzi 2002, 155–156) the freedom of choice in the one-way speeds of light amounts to the choice of an arbitrary scalar field (although two scalar fields that differ only by an additive constant would give the same assignment of one-way speeds).

It might be argued that the definition of standard synchrony makes use only of the relation of equality (of the one-way speeds of light in different directions), so that simplicity dictates its choice rather than a choice that requires the specification of a particular value for a parameter. Grünbaum (1973, 356) rejects this argument on the grounds that, since the equality of the one-way speeds of light is a convention, this choice does not simplify the postulational basis of the theory but only gives a symbolically simpler representation.

2. Phenomenological Counterarguments

Many of the arguments against the conventionality thesis make use of particular physical phenomena, together with the laws of physics, to establish simultaneity (or, equivalently, to measure the one-way speed of light). Salmon (1977), for example, discusses a number of such schemes and argues that each makes use of a nontrivial convention. For instance, one such scheme uses the law of conservation of momentum to conclude that two particles of equal mass, initially located halfway between A and B and then separated by an explosion, must arrive at A and B simultaneously. Salmon (1977, 273) argues, however, that the standard formulation of the law of conservation of momentum makes use of the concept of one-way velocities, which cannot be measured without the use of (something equivalent to) synchronized clocks at the two ends of the spatial interval that is traversed; thus, it is a circular argument to use conservation of momentum to define simultaneity.

It has been argued (see, for example, Janis 1983, 103–105, and Norton 1986, 119) that all such schemes for establishing convention-free synchrony must fail. The argument can be summarized as follows: Suppose that clocks are set in standard synchrony, and consider the detailed space-time description of the proposed synchronization procedure that would be obtained with the use of such clocks. Next suppose that the clocks are reset in some nonstandard fashion (consistent with the causal order of events), and consider the description of the same sequence of events that would be obtained with the use of the reset clocks. In such a description, familiar laws may take unfamiliar forms, as in the case of the law of conservation of momentum in the example mentioned above. Indeed, all of special relativity has been reformulated (in an unfamiliar form) in terms of nonstandard synchronies (Winnie 1970a and 1970b). Since the proposed synchronization procedure can itself be described in terms of a nonstandard synchrony, the scheme cannot describe a sequence of events that is incompatible with nonstandard synchrony. A comparison of the two descriptions makes clear what hidden assumptions in the scheme are equivalent to standard synchrony. Nevertheless, editors of respected journals continue to accept, from time to time, papers purporting to measure one-way light speeds; see, for example, Greaves et al. (2009). Application of the procedure just described shows where their errors lie.

3. Malament’s Theorem

For a discussion of various proposals to establish synchrony, see the supplementary document:

Transport of Clocks

The only currently discussed proposal is based on a theorem of Malament (1977), who argues that standard synchrony is the only simultaneity relation that can be defined, relative to a given inertial frame, from the relation of (symmetric) causal connectibility. Let this relation be represented by κ, let the statement that events p and q are simultaneous be represented by S(p,q), and let the given inertial frame be specified by the world line, O, of some inertial observer. Then Malament’s uniqueness theorem shows that if S is definable from κ and O, if it is an equivalence relation, if points p on O and q not on O exist such that S(p,q) holds, and if S is not the universal relation (which holds for all points), then S is the relation of standard synchrony.

Some commentators have taken Malament’s theorem to have settled the debate on the side of nonconventionality. For example, Torretti (1983, 229) says, “Malament proved that simultaneity by standard synchronism in an inertial frame F is the only non-universal equivalence between events at different points of F that is definable (‘in any sense of “definable” no matter how weak’) in terms of causal connectibility alone, for a given F”; and Norton (Salmon et al. 1992, 222) says, “Contrary to most expectations, [Malament] was able to prove that the central claim about simultaneity of the causal theorists of time was false. He showed that the standard simultaneity relation was the only nontrivial simultaneity relation definable in terms of the causal structure of a Minkowski spacetime of special relativity.”

Other commentators disagree with such arguments, however. Grünbaum (2010) has written a detailed critique of Malament’s paper. He first cites Malament’s need to postulate that S is an equivalence relation as a weakness in the argument, a view also endorsed by Redhead (1993, 114). Grünbaum’s main argument, however, is based on an earlier argument by Janis (1983, 107–109) that Malament’s theorem leads to a unique (but different) synchrony relative to any inertial observer, that this latitude is the same as that in introducing Reichenbach’s ε, and thus Malament’s theorem should carry neither more nor less weight against the conventionality thesis than the argument (mentioned above in the last paragraph of the first section of this article) that standard synchrony is the simplest choice. Grünbaum concludes “that Malament’s remarkable proof has not undermined my thesis that, in the STR, relative simultaneity is conventional, as contrasted with its non-conventionality in the Newtonian world, which I have articulated! Thus, I do not need to retract the actual claim I made in 1963…” Somewhat similar arguments are given by Redhead (1993, 114) and by Debs and Redhead (2007, 87–92).

For further discussion, see the supplement document:

Further Discussion of Malament’s Theorem

4. Other Considerations

Since the conventionality thesis rests upon the existence of a fastest causal signal, the existence of arbitrarily fast causal signals would undermine the thesis. If we leave aside the question of causality, for the moment, the possibility of particles (called tachyons) moving with arbitrarily high velocities is consistent with the mathematical formalism of special relativity (see, for example, Feinberg 1967). Just as the speed of light in vacuum is an upper limit to the possible speeds of ordinary particles (sometimes called bradyons), it would be a lower limit to the speeds of tachyons. When a transformation is made to a different inertial frame of reference, the speeds of both bradyons and tachyons change (the speed of light in vacuum being the only invariant speed). At any instant, the speed of a bradyon can be transformed to zero and the speed of a tachyon can be transformed to an infinite value. The statement that a bradyon is moving forward in time remains true in every inertial frame (if it is true in one), but this is not so for tachyons. Feinberg (1967) argues that this does not lead to violations of causality through the exchange of tachyons between two uniformly moving observers because of ambiguities in the interpretation of the behavior of tachyon emitters and absorbers, whose roles can change from one to the other under the transformation between inertial frames. He claims to resolve putative causal anomalies by adopting the convention that each observer describes the motion of each tachyon interacting with that observer’s apparatus in such a way as to make the tachyon move forward in time. However, all of Feinberg’s examples involve motion in only one spatial dimension. Pirani (1970) has given an explicit two-dimensional example in which Feinberg’s convention is satisfied but a tachyon signal is emitted by an observer and returned to that observer at an earlier time, thus leading to possible causal anomalies.

A claim that no value of ε other than 1/2 is mathematically possible has been put forward by Zangari (1994). He argues that spin-1/2 particles (e.g., electrons) must be represented mathematically by what are known as complex spinors, and that the transformation properties of these spinors are not consistent with the introduction of nonstandard coordinates (corresponding to values of ε other than 1/2). Gunn and Vetharaniam (1995), however, present a derivation of the Dirac equation (the fundamental equation describing spin-1/2 particles) using coordinates that are consistent with arbitrary synchrony. They argue that Zangari mistakenly required a particular representation of space-time points as the only one consistent with the spinorial description of spin-1/2 particles.

Another argument for standard synchrony has been given by Ohanian (2004), who bases his considerations on the laws of dynamics. He argues that a nonstandard choice of synchrony introduces pseudoforces into Newton’s second law, which must hold in the low-velocity limit of special relativity; that is, it is only with standard synchrony that net force and acceleration will be proportional. Macdonald (2005) defends the conventionality thesis against this argument in a fashion analagous to the argument used by Salmon (mentioned above in the first paragraph of the second section of this article) against the use of the law of conservation of momentum to define simultaneity: Macdonald says, in effect, that it is a convention to require Newton’s laws to take their standard form.

Many of the arguments against conventionality involve viewing the preferred simultaneity relation as an equivalence relation that is invariant under an appropriate transformation group. Mamone Capria (2012) has examined the interpretation of simultaneity as an invariant equivalence relation in great detail, and argues that it does not have any bearing on the question of whether or not simultaneity is conventional in special relativity.

A vigorous defense of conventionality has been offered by Rynasiewicz (2012). He argues that his approach “has the merit of nailing the exact sense in which simultaneity is conventional. It is conventional in precisely the same sense in which the gauge freedom that arises in the general theory of relativity makes the choice between diffeomorphically related models conventional.” He begins by showing that any choice of a simultaneity relation is equivalent to a choice of a velocity in the equation for local time in H.A. Lorentz’s Versuch theory (Lorentz 1895). Then, beginning with Minkowski space with the standard Minkowski metric, he introduces a diffeomorphism in which each point is mapped to a point with the same spatial coordinates, but the temporal coordinate is that of a Lorentzian local time expressed in terms of the velocity as a parameter. This mapping is not an isometry, for the light cones are tilted, which corresponds to anisotropic light propagation. He proceeds to argue, using the hole argument (see, for example, Earman and Norton 1987) as an analogy, that this parametric freedom is just like the gauge freedom of general relativity. As the tilting of the light cones, if projected into a single spatial dimension, would be equivalent to a choice of Reichenbach’s ε, it seems that Rynasiewicz’s argument is a generalization and more completely argued version of the argument given by Janis that is mentioned above in the third paragraph of Section 3.

The debate about conventionality of simultaneity seems far from settled, although some proponents on both sides of the argument might disagree with that statement. The reader wishing to pursue the matter further should consult the sources listed below as well as additional references cited in those sources.


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