Einstein’s Philosophy of Science

First published Wed Feb 11, 2004; substantive revision Fri Sep 13, 2019

Albert Einstein (1879–1955) is well known as the most prominent physicist of the twentieth century. His contributions to twentieth-century philosophy of science, though of comparable importance, are less well known. Einstein’s own philosophy of science is an original synthesis of elements drawn from sources as diverse as neo-Kantianism, conventionalism, and logical empiricism, its distinctive feature being its novel blending of realism with a holist, underdeterminationist form of conventionalism. Of special note is the manner in which Einstein’s philosophical thinking was driven by and contributed to the solution of problems first encountered in his work in physics. Equally significant are Einstein’s relations with and influence on other prominent twentieth-century philosophers of science, including Moritz Schlick, Hans Reichenbach, Ernst Cassirer, Philipp Frank, Henri Bergson, Émile Meyerson.

1. Introduction: Was Einstein an Epistemological “Opportunist”?

Late in 1944, Albert Einstein received a letter from Robert Thornton, a young African-American philosopher of science who had just finished his Ph.D. under Herbert Feigl at Minnesota and was beginning a new job teaching physics at the University of Puerto Rico, Mayaguez. He had written to solicit from Einstein a few supportive words on behalf of his efforts to introduce “as much of the philosophy of science as possible” into the modern physics course that he was to teach the following spring (Thornton to Einstein, 28 November 1944, EA 61–573). Here is what Einstein offered in reply:

I fully agree with you about the significance and educational value of methodology as well as history and philosophy of science. So many people today—and even professional scientists—seem to me like somebody who has seen thousands of trees but has never seen a forest. A knowledge of the historic and philosophical background gives that kind of independence from prejudices of his generation from which most scientists are suffering. This independence created by philosophical insight is—in my opinion—the mark of distinction between a mere artisan or specialist and a real seeker after truth. (Einstein to Thornton, 7 December 1944, EA 61–574)

That Einstein meant what he said about the relevance of philosophy to physics is evidenced by the fact that he had been saying more or less the same thing for decades. Thus, in a 1916 memorial note for Ernst Mach, a physicist and philosopher to whom Einstein owed a special debt, he wrote:

How does it happen that a properly endowed natural scientist comes to concern himself with epistemology? Is there no more valuable work in his specialty? I hear many of my colleagues saying, and I sense it from many more, that they feel this way. I cannot share this sentiment. When I think about the ablest students whom I have encountered in my teaching, that is, those who distinguish themselves by their independence of judgment and not merely their quick-wittedness, I can affirm that they had a vigorous interest in epistemology. They happily began discussions about the goals and methods of science, and they showed unequivocally, through their tenacity in defending their views, that the subject seemed important to them. Indeed, one should not be surprised at this. (Einstein 1916, 101)

How, exactly, does the philosophical habit of mind provide the physicist with such “independence of judgment”? Einstein goes on to explain:

Concepts that have proven useful in ordering things easily achieve such an authority over us that we forget their earthly origins and accept them as unalterable givens. Thus they come to be stamped as “necessities of thought,” “a priori givens,” etc. The path of scientific advance is often made impassable for a long time through such errors. For that reason, it is by no means an idle game if we become practiced in analyzing the long commonplace concepts and exhibiting those circumstances upon which their justification and usefulness depend, how they have grown up, individually, out of the givens of experience. By this means, their all-too-great authority will be broken. They will be removed if they cannot be properly legitimated, corrected if their correlation with given things be far too superfluous, replaced by others if a new system can be established that we prefer for whatever reason. (Einstein 1916, 102)

One is not surprised at Einstein’s then citing Mach’s critical analysis of the Newtonian conception of absolute space as a paradigm of what Mach, himself, termed the “historical-critical” method of philosophical analysis (Einstein 1916, 101, citing Ch. 2, §§ 6–7 of Mach’s Mechanik, most likely the third edition, Mach 1897).

The place of philosophy in physics was a theme to which Einstein returned time and again, it being clearly an issue of deep importance to him. Sometimes he adopts a modest pose, as in this oft-quoted remark from his 1933 Spencer Lecture:

If you wish to learn from the theoretical physicist anything about the methods which he uses, I would give you the following piece of advice: Don’t listen to his words, examine his achievements. For to the discoverer in that field, the constructions of his imagination appear so necessary and so natural that he is apt to treat them not as the creations of his thoughts but as given realities. (Einstein 1933, 5–6)

More typical, however, is the confident pose he struck three years later in “Physics and Reality”:

It has often been said, and certainly not without justification, that the man of science is a poor philosopher. Why then should it not be the right thing for the physicist to let the philosopher do the philosophizing? Such might indeed be the right thing at a time when the physicist believes he has at his disposal a rigid system of fundamental concepts and fundamental laws which are so well established that waves of doubt can not reach them; but it can not be right at a time when the very foundations of physics itself have become problematic as they are now. At a time like the present, when experience forces us to seek a newer and more solid foundation, the physicist cannot simply surrender to the philosopher the critical contemplation of the theoretical foundations; for, he himself knows best, and feels more surely where the shoe pinches. In looking for a new foundation, he must try to make clear in his own mind just how far the concepts which he uses are justified, and are necessities. (Einstein 1936, 349)

What kind of philosophy might we expect from the philosopher-physicist? One thing that we should not expect from a physicist who takes the philosophical turn in order to help solve fundamental physical problems is a systematic philosophy:

The reciprocal relationship of epistemology and science is of noteworthy kind. They are dependent upon each other. Epistemology without contact with science becomes an empty scheme. Science without epistemology is—insofar as it is thinkable at all—primitive and muddled. However, no sooner has the epistemologist, who is seeking a clear system, fought his way through to such a system, than he is inclined to interpret the thought-content of science in the sense of his system and to reject whatever does not fit into his system. The scientist, however, cannot afford to carry his striving for epistemological systematic that far. He accepts gratefully the epistemological conceptual analysis; but the external conditions, which are set for him by the facts of experience, do not permit him to let himself be too much restricted in the construction of his conceptual world by the adherence to an epistemological system. He therefore must appear to the systematic epistemologist as a type of unscrupulous opportunist: he appears as realist insofar as he seeks to describe a world independent of the acts of perception; as idealist insofar as he looks upon the concepts and theories as free inventions of the human spirit (not logically derivable from what is empirically given); as positivist insofar as he considers his concepts and theories justified only to the extent to which they furnish a logical representation of relations among sensory experiences. He may even appear as Platonist or Pythagorean insofar as he considers the viewpoint of logical simplicity as an indispensable and effective tool of his research. (Einstein 1949, 683–684)

But what strikes the “systematic epistemologist” as mere opportunism might appear otherwise when viewed from the perspective of a physicist engaged, as Einstein himself put it, in “the critical contemplation of the theoretical foundations.” The overarching goal of that critical contemplation was, for Einstein, the creation of a unified foundation for physics after the model of a field theory like general relativity (see Sauer 2014 for non-technical overview on Einstein’s approach to the unified field theory program). Einstein failed in his quest, but there was a consistency and constancy in the striving that informed as well the philosophy of science developing hand in hand with the scientific project.

Indeed, from early to late a few key ideas played the central, leading role in Einstein’s philosophy of science, ideas about which Einstein evinced surprisingly little doubt even while achieving an ever deeper understanding of their implications. For the purposes of the following comparatively brief overview, we can confine our attention to just five topics:

  • Theoretical holism.
  • Simplicity and theory choice.
  • Univocalness in the theoretical representation of nature.
  • Realism and separability.
  • The principle theories-constructive theories distinction.

The emphasis on the continuity and coherence in the development of Einstein’s philosophy of science contrasts with an account such as Gerald Holton’s (1968), which claims to find a major philosophical break in the mid-1910s, in the form of a turn away from a sympathy for an anti-metaphysical positivism and toward a robust scientific realism. Holton sees this turn being driven by Einstein’s alleged realization that general relativity, by contrast with special relativity, requires a realistic ontology. However, Einstein was probably never an ardent “Machian” positivist,[1] and he was never a scientific realist, at least not in the sense acquired by the term “scientific realist” in later twentieth century philosophical discourse (see Howard 1993). Einstein expected scientific theories to have the proper empirical credentials, but he was no positivist; and he expected scientific theories to give an account of physical reality, but he was no scientific realist. Moreover, in both respects his views remained more or less the same from the beginning to the end of his career.

Why Einstein did not think himself a realist (he said so explicitly) is discussed below. Why he is not to be understood as a positivist deserves a word or two of further discussion here, if only because the belief that he was sympathetic to positivism, at least early in his life, is so widespread (for a fuller discussion, see Howard 1993).

That Einstein later repudiated positivism is beyond doubt. Many remarks from at least the early 1920s through the end of his life make this clear. In 1946 he explained what he took to be Mach’s basic error:

He did not place in the correct light the essentially constructive and speculative nature of all thinking and more especially of scientific thinking; in consequence, he condemned theory precisely at those points where its constructive-speculative character comes to light unmistakably, such as in the kinetic theory of atoms. (Einstein 1946, 21)

Is Einstein here also criticizing his own youthful philosophical indiscretions? The very example that Einstein gives here makes any such interpretation highly implausible, because one of Einstein’s main goals in his early work on Brownian motion (Einstein 1905b) was precisely to prove the reality of atoms, this in the face of the then famous skepticism of thinkers like Mach and Wilhelm Ostwald:

My principal aim in this was to find facts that would guarantee as much as possible the existence of atoms of definite size.… The agreement of these considerations with experience together with Planck’s determination of the true molecular size from the law of radiation (for high temperatures) convinced the skeptics, who were quite numerous at that time (Ostwald, Mach), of the reality of atoms. (Einstein 1946, 45, 47)

Why, then, is the belief in Einstein’s early sympathy for positivism so well entrenched?

The one piece of evidence standardly cited for a youthful flirtation with positivism is Einstein’s critique of the notion of absolute distant simultaneity in his 1905 paper on special relativity (Einstein 1905c). Einstein speaks there of “observers,” but in an epistemologically neutral way that can be replaced by talk of an inertial frame of reference. What really bothers Einstein about distant simultaneity is not that it is observationally inaccessible but that it involves a two-fold arbitrariness, one in the choice of an inertial frame of reference and one in the stipulation within a given frame of a convention regarding the ratio of the times required for a light signal to go from one stationary observer to another and back again. Likewise, Einstein faults classical Maxwellian electrodynamics for an asymmetry in the way it explains electromagnetic induction depending on whether it is the coil or the magnet that is assumed to be at rest. If the effect is the same—a current in the coil—why, asks Einstein, should there be two different explanations: an electrical field created in the vicinity of a moving magnet or an electromotive force induced in a conductor moving through a stationary magnetic field? To be sure, whether it is the coil or the magnet that is taken to be at rest makes no observable difference, but the problem, from Einstein’s point of view, is the asymmetry in the two explanations. Even the young Einstein was no positivist.

First generation logical empiricists sought to legitimate their movement in part by claiming Einstein as a friend. They may be forgiven their putting a forced interpretation on arguments taken out of context. We can do better.

Einstein’s philosophy of science is an original synthesis drawing upon many philosophical resources, from neo-Kantianism to Machian empiricism and Duhemian conventionalism. Other thinkers and movements, most notably the logical empiricists, drew upon the same resources. But Einstein put the pieces together in a manner importantly different from Moritz Schlick, Hans Reichenbach, and Rudolf Carnap, and he argued with them for decades about who was right (however much they obscured these differences in representing Einstein publicly as a friend of logical empiricism and scientific philosophy). Starting from the mid-1920s till the end of the decade Einstein show some interest in the rationalistic realism of Émile Meyerson (Einstein, 1928; cf. Giovanelli 2018; on the contemporary debate between Einstein and Bergson, see Canales 2015). Understanding how Einstein puts those pieces together therefore sheds light not only on the philosophical aspect of his own achievements in physics but also upon the larger history of the development of the philosophy of science in the twentieth century.

2. Theoretical Holism: The Nature and Role of Conventions in Science

Any philosophy of science must include an account of the relation between theory and evidence. Einstein learned about the historicity of scientific concepts from Mach. But his preferred way of modeling the logical relationship between theory and evidence was inspired mainly by his reading of Pierre Duhem’s La Théorie physique: son objet et sa structure (Duhem 1906). Einstein probably first read Duhem, or at least learned the essentials of Duhem’s philosophy of science around the fall of 1909, when, upon returning to Zurich from the patent office in Bern to take up his first academic appointment at the University of Zurich, he became the upstairs neighbor of his old friend and fellow Zurich physics student, Friedrich Adler. Just a few months before, Adler had published the German translation of La Théorie physique (Duhem 1908), and the philosophy of science became a frequent topic of conversation between the new neighbors, Adler and Einstein (see Howard 1990a).

Theoretical holism and the underdetermination of theory choice by empirical evidence are the central theses in Duhem’s philosophy of science. His argument, in brief, is that at least in sciences like physics, where experiment is dense with sophisticated instrumentation whose employment itself requires theoretical interpretation, hypotheses are not tested in isolation but only as part of whole bodies of theory. It follows that when there is a conflict between theory and evidence, the fit can be restored in a multiplicity of different ways. No statement is immune to revision because of a presumed status as a definition or thanks to some other a priori warrant, and most any statement can be retained on pain of suitable adjustments elsewhere in the total body of theory. Hence, theory choice is underdetermined by evidence.

That Einstein’s exposure to Duhem’s philosophy of science soon left its mark is evident from lecture notes that Einstein prepared for a course on electricity and magnetism at the University of Zurich in the winter semester of 1910/11. Einstein asks how one can assign a definite electrical charge everywhere within a material body, if the interior of the body is not accessible to test particles. A “Machian” positivist would deem such direct empirical access necessary for meaningful talk of a charge distribution in the interior of a sold. Einstein argues otherwise:

We have seen how experience led to the introd. of the concept of the quantity of electricity. it was defined by means of the forces that small electrified bodies exert on each other. But now we extend the application of the concept to cases in which this definition cannot be applied directly as soon as we conceive the el. forces as forces exerted on electricity rather than on material particles. We set up a conceptual system the individual parts of which do not correspond directly to empirical facts. Only a certain totality of theoretical material corresponds again to a certain totality of experimental facts.

We find that such an el. continuum is always applicable only for the representation of el. states of affairs in the interior of ponderable bodies. Here too we define the vector of el. field strength as the vector of the mech. force exerted on the unit of pos. electr. quantity inside a body. But the force so defined is no longer directly accessible to exp. It is one part of a theoretical construction that can be correct or false, i.e., consistent or not consistent with experience, only as a whole. (Collected Papers of Albert Einstein, hereafter CPAE, Vol. 3, Doc. 11 [pp. 12–13])

One can hardly ask for a better summary of Duhem’s point of view in application to a specific physical theory. Explicit citations of Duhem by Einstein are rare (for details, see Howard 1990a). But explicit invocations of a holist picture of the structure and empirical interpretation of theories started to prevail at the turn of the 1920s.

During the decade 1905–1915, Einstein had more or less explicitly assumed that in a good theory there are certain individual parts that can be directly coordinated with the behavior of physically-existent objects used as probes. A theory can be said to be ‘true or false’ if such objects respectively behave or do not behave as predicted. In special relativity, as in classical mechanics, the fundamental geometrical/kinematical variables, the space and time coordinates, are measured with rods and clocks separately from the other non-geometrical variables, say, charge electric field strengths, which were supposed to be defined by measuring the force on a charge test particle. In general relativity, coordinates are no longer directly measurable independently from the gravitational field. Still, the line element \(ds\) (distance between nearby spacetime points) was supposed to have a ‘natural’ distance that can be measured with rods and clocks. In the late 1910s, pressed by the epistemological objections raised by different interlocutors—in particular Hermann Weyl (Ryckman 2005) and the young Wolfgang Pauli (Stachel, 2005)—Einstein was forced to recognize that this epistemological model was at most a provisional compromise. In principle rod- and clock-like structures should emerge as solutions of a future relativistic theory of matter, possibly a field theory encompassing gravitation and electromagnetism. In this context, the sharp distinction between rods and clocks that serve to define the geometrical/kinematical structure of the theory and other material systems would become questionable. Einstein regarded such distinction as provisionally necessary, give the current state of physics. However, he recognized that in principle a physical theory should construct rods and clocks as solutions to its equations (see Ryckman 2017, ch. VII for an overview on Einstein view on the relation between geometry and experience).

Einstein addressed this issue in several popular writings during the 1920s, in particular, the famous lecture Geometrie und Erfahrung (Einstein 1921, see also Einstein, 1923, Einstein, 1924, Einstein 1926; Einstein 1926; see Giovanelli 2014 for an overview). Sub specie temporis, he argued, it was useful to compare the geometrical/kinematical structures of the theory with experience separately from the rest of physics. Sub specie aeterni, however, only geometry and physics taken together can be said to be ‘true or false.’ This epistemological model became more appropriate, while Einstein was moving beyond general relativity in the direction of theory unifying the gravitational and the electromagnetic field. Einstein had to rely on progressively more abstract geometrical structures which could not be defined in terms of the behavior of some physical probes. Thus, the use of such structures was justified because of their role in the theory as a whole. In the second half of the 1920s, in correspondence with Reichenbach (Giovanelli 2017) and Meyerson (Giovanelli 2018), Einstein even denied that the very distinction between geometrical and non-geometrical is meaningful (Lehmkuhl 2014).

A different, but especially interesting example of Einstein’s reliance on a form of theoretical holism is found in a review that Einstein wrote in 1924 of Alfred Elsbach’s Kant und Einstein (1924), one of the flood of books and articles then trying to reconcile the Kant’s philosophy. Having asserted that relativity theory is incompatible with Kant’s doctrine of the a priori, Einstein explains why, more generally, he is not sympathetic with Kant:

This does not, at first, preclude one’s holding at least to the Kantian problematic, as, e.g., Cassirer has done. I am even of the opinion that this standpoint can be rigorously refuted by no development of natural science. For one will always be able to say that critical philosophers have until now erred in the establishment of the a priori elements, and one will always be able to establish a system of a priori elements that does not contradict a given physical system. Let me briefly indicate why I do not find this standpoint natural. A physical theory consists of the parts (elements) A, B, C, D, that together constitute a logical whole which correctly connects the pertinent experiments (sense experiences). Then it tends to be the case that the aggregate of fewer than all four elements, e.g., A, B, D, without C, no longer says anything about these experiences, and just as well A, B, C without D. One is then free to regard the aggregate of three of these elements, e.g., A, B, C as a priori, and only D as empirically conditioned. But what remains unsatisfactory in this is always the arbitrariness in the choice of those elements that one designates as a priori, entirely apart from the fact that the theory could one day be replaced by another that replaces certain of these elements (or all four) by others. (Einstein 1924, 1688–1689)

Einstein’s point seems to be that while one can always choose to designate selected elements as a priori and, hence, non-empirical, no principle determines which elements can be so designated, and our ability thus to designate them derives from the fact that it is only the totality of the elements that possesses empirical content.

Much the same point could be made, and was made by Duhem himself (see Duhem 1906, part 2, ch. 6, sects. 8 and 9), against those who would insulate certain statements against empirical refutation by claiming for them the status of conventional definitions. Edouard Le Roy (1901) had argued thus about the law of free fall. It could not be refuted by experiment because it functioned as a definition of “free fall.” And Henri Poincaré (1901) said much the same about the principles of mechanics more generally. As Einstein answered the neo-Kantians, so Duhem answered this species of conventionalist: Yes, experiment cannot refute, say, the law of free fall by itself, but only because it is part of a larger theoretical whole that has empirical content only as a whole, and various other elements of that whole could as well be said to be, alone, immune to refutation.

That Einstein should deploy against the neo-Kantians in the early 1920s the argument that Duhem used against the conventionalism of Poincaré and Le Roy is interesting from the point of view of Einstein’s relationships with those who were leading the development of logical empiricism and scientific philosophy in the 1920s, especially Schlick and Reichenbach. Einstein shared with Schlick and Reichenbach the goal of crafting a new form of empiricism that would be adequate to the task of defending general relativity against neo-Kantian critiques (see Schlick 1917 and 1921, and Reichenbach 1920, 1924, and 1928; for more detail, see Howard 1994a). But while they all agreed that what Kant regarded as the a priori element in scientific cognition was better understood as a conventional moment in science, they were growing to disagree dramatically over the nature and place of conventions in science. The classic logical empiricist view that the moment of convention was restricted to conventional coordinating definitions that endow individual primitive terms, worked well, but did not comport well with the holism about theories

It was this argument over the nature and place of conventions in science that underlies Einstein’s gradual philosophical estrangement from Schlick and Reichenbach in the 1920s. Serious in its own right, the argument over conventions was entangled with two other issues as well, namely, realism and Einstein’s famous view of theories as the “free creations of the human spirit” (see, for example, Einstein 1921). In both instances what troubled Einstein was that a verificationist semantics made the link between theory and experience too strong, leaving too small a role for theory, itself, and the creative theorizing that produces it.

If theory choice is empirically determinate, especially if theoretical concepts are explicitly constructed from empirical primitives, as in Carnap’s program in the Aufbau (Carnap 1928), then it is hard to see how theory gives us a story about anything other than experience. As noted, Einstein was not what we would today call a scientific realist, but he still believed that there was content in theory beyond mere empirical content (on the relations between Einstein’s realism and constructism see Ryckman 2017, ch. 8 and 9). He believed that theoretical science gave us a window on nature itself, even if, in principle, there will be no one uniquely correct story at the level of deep ontology (see below, section 5). And if the only choice in theory choice is one among conventional coordinating definitions, then that is no choice at all, a point stressed by Reichenbach, especially, as an important positive implication of his position. Reichenbach argued that if empirical content is the only content, then empirically equivalent theories have the same content, the difference resulting from their different choices of coordinating definitions being like in kind to the difference between “es regnet” and “il pleut,” or the difference between expressing the result of a measurement in English or metric units, just two different ways of saying the same thing. But then, Einstein would ask, where is there any role for the creative intelligence of the theoretical physicist if there is no room for genuine choice in science, if experience somehow dictates theory construction?

The argument over the nature and role of conventions in science continued to the very end of Einstein’s life, reaching its highest level of sophistication in the exchange between Reichenbach and Einstein the Library of Living Philosopher’s volume, Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Physicist (Schilpp 1949). The question is, again, whether the choice of a geometry is empirical, conventional, or a priori. In his contribution, Reichenbach reasserted his old view that once an appropriate coordinating definition is established, equating some “practically rigid rod” with the geometer’s “rigid body,” then the geometry of physical space is wholly determined by empirical evidence:

The choice of a geometry is arbitrary only so long as no definition of congruence is specified. Once this definition is set up, it becomes an empirical question which geometry holds for physical space.… The conventionalist overlooks the fact that only the incomplete statement of a geometry, in which a reference to the definition of congruence is omitted, is arbitrary. (Reichenbach 1949, 297)

Einstein’s clever reply includes a dialogue between two characters, “Reichenbach” and “Poincaré,” in which “Reichenbach” concedes to “Poincaré” that there are no perfectly rigid bodies in nature and that physics must be used to correct for such things as thermal deformations, from which it follows that what we actually test is geometry plus physics, not geometry alone. Here an “anonymous non-positivist” takes “Poincaré’s” place, out of respect, says Einstein, “for Poincaré’s superiority as thinker and author” (Einstein 1949, 677), but also, perhaps, because he realized that the point of view that follows was more Duhem than Poincaré. The “non-positivist” then argues that one’s granting that geometry and physics are tested together contravenes the positivist identification of meaning with verifiability:

Non-Positivist: If, under the stated circumstances, you hold distance to be a legitimate concept, how then is it with your basic principle (meaning = verifiability)? Must you not come to the point where you deny the meaning of geometrical statements and concede meaning only to the completely developed theory of relativity (which still does not exist at all as a finished product)? Must you not grant that no “meaning” whatsoever, in your sense, belongs to the individual concepts and statements of a physical theory, such meaning belonging instead to the whole system insofar as it makes “intelligible” what is given in experience? Why do the individual concepts that occur in a theory require any separate justification after all, if they are indispensable only within the framework of the logical structure of the theory, and if it is the theory as a whole that stands the test? (Einstein 1949, 678).

Two years before the Quine’s publication of “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1951), Einstein here makes explicit the semantic implications of a thoroughgoing holism.

If theory choice is empirically underdetermined, then an obvious question is why we are so little aware of the underdetermination in the day-to-day conduct of science. In a 1918 address celebrating Max Planck’s sixtieth birthday, Einstein approached this question via a distinction between practice and principle:

The supreme task of the physicist is … the search for those most general, elementary laws from which the world picture is to be obtained through pure deduction. No logical path leads to these elementary laws; it is instead just the intuition that rests on an empathic understanding of experience. In this state of methodological uncertainty one can think that arbitrarily many, in themselves equally justified systems of theoretical principles were possible; and this opinion is, in principle, certainly correct. But the development of physics has shown that of all the conceivable theoretical constructions a single one has, at any given time, proved itself unconditionally superior to all others. No one who has really gone deeply into the subject will deny that, in practice, the world of perceptions determines the theoretical system unambiguously, even though no logical path leads from the perceptions to the basic principles of the theory. (Einstein 1918, 31; Howard’s translation)

But why is theory choice, in practice, seemingly empirically determined? Einstein hinted at an answer the year before in a letter to Schlick, where he commended Schlick’s argument that the deep elements of a theoretical ontology have as much claim to the status of the real as do Mach’s elements of sensation (Schlick 1917), but suggested that we are nonetheless speaking of two different kinds of reality. How do they differ?

It appears to me that the word “real” is taken in different senses, according to whether impressions or events, that is to say, states of affairs in the physical sense, are spoken of.

If two different peoples pursue physics independently of one another, they will create systems that certainly agree as regards the impressions (“elements” in Mach’s sense). The mental constructions that the two devise for connecting these “elements” can be vastly different. And the two constructions need not agree as regards the “events”; for these surely belong to the conceptual constructions. Certainly on the “elements,” but not the “events,” are real in the sense of being “given unavoidably in experience.”

But if we designate as “real” that which we arrange in the space-time-schema, as you have done in the theory of knowledge, then without doubt the “events,” above all, are real.… I would like to recommend a clean conceptual distinction here. (Einstein to Schlick, 21 May 1917, CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 343)

Why, in practice, are physicists unaware of underdetermination? It is because ours is not the situation of “two different peoples pursu[ing] physics independently of one another.” Though Einstein does not say it explicitly, the implication seems to be that apparent determination in theory choice is mainly a consequence of our all being similarly socialized as we become members of a common scientific community. Part of what it means to be a member of a such a community is that we have been taught to make our theoretical choices in accord with criteria or values that we hold in common.

3. Simplicity and Theory Choice

For Einstein, as for many others, simplicity is the criterion that mainly steers theory choice in domains where experiment and observation no longer provide an unambiguous guide. This, too, is a theme sounded early and late in Einstein’s philosophical reflections (for more detail, see Howard 1998, Norton 2000, van Dongen 2002, 2010, Giovanelli 2018). For example, the just-quoted remark from 1918 about the apparent determination of theory choice in practice, contrasted with in-principle underdetermination continues:

Furthermore this conceptual system that is univocally coordinated with the world of experience is reducible to a few basic laws from which the whole system can be developed logically. With every new important advance the researcher here sees his expectations surpassed, in that those basic laws are more and more simplified under the press of experience. With astonishment he sees apparent chaos resolved into a sublime order that is to be attributed not to the rule of the individual mind, but to the constitution of the world of experience; this is what Leibniz so happily characterized as “pre-established harmony.” Physicists strenuously reproach many epistemologists for their insufficient appreciation of this circumstance. Herein, it seems to me, lie the roots of the controversy carried on some years ago between Mach and Planck. (Einstein 1918, p. 31)

There is more than a little autobiography here, for as Einstein stressed repeatedly in later years, he understood the success of his own quest for a general theory of relativity as a result of his seeking the simplest set of field equations satisfying a given set of constraints.

Einstein’s celebration of simplicity as a guide to theory choice comes clearly to the fore in the early 1930s, when he was immersed his project of a unified field theory (see, van Dongen 2010 for a reconstruction of the philosophical underpinning of Einstein’s search of a unified field theory). Witness what he wrote in his 1933 Herbert Spencer lecture:

If, then, it is true that the axiomatic foundation of theoretical physics cannot be extracted from experience but must be freely invented, may we ever hope to find the right way? Furthermore, does this right way exist anywhere other than in our illusions? May we hope to be guided safely by experience at all, if there exist theories (such as classical mechanics) which to a large extent do justice to experience, without comprehending the matter in a deep way?

To these questions, I answer with complete confidence, that, in my opinion, the right way exists, and that we are capable of finding it. Our experience hitherto justifies us in trusting that nature is the realization of the simplest that is mathematically conceivable. I am convinced that purely mathematical construction enables us to find those concepts and those lawlike connections between them that provide the key to the understanding of natural phenomena. Useful mathematical concepts may well be suggested by experience, but in no way can they be derived from it. Experience naturally remains the sole criterion of the usefulness of a mathematical construction for physics. But the actual creative principle lies in mathematics. Thus, in a certain sense, I take it to be true that pure thought can grasp the real, as the ancients had dreamed. (Einstein 1933, p. 183; Howard’s translation)

Einstein’s conviction that the theoretical physicist must trust simplicity is that his work was moving steadily into domains ever further removed from direct contact with observation and experiment. Einstein started to routinely claim that this was the lesson he had drawn from the way in which he had found general relativity (Norton 2000). There are, however, good reasons to think that Einstein’s selective recollections (Jannsen and Renn 2007) were instrumental to his defense of relying on a purely mathematical strategy in the search for a unified field theory (van Dongen 2010):

The theory of relativity is a beautiful example of the basic character of the modern development of theory. That is to say, the hypotheses from which one starts become ever more abstract and more remote from experience. But in return one comes closer to the preeminent goal of science, that of encompassing a maximum of empirical contents through logical deduction with a minimum of hypotheses or axioms. The intellectual path from the axioms to the empirical contents or to the testable consequences becomes, thereby, ever longer and more subtle. The theoretician is forced, ever more, to allow himself to be directed by purely mathematical, formal points of view in the search for theories, because the physical experience of the experimenter is not capable of leading us up to the regions of the highest abstraction. Tentative deduction takes the place of the predominantly inductive methods appropriate to the youthful state of science. Such a theoretical structure must be quite thoroughly elaborated in order for it to lead to consequences that can be compared with experience. It is certainly the case that here, as well, the empirical fact is the all-powerful judge. But its judgment can be handed down only on the basis of great and difficult intellectual effort that first bridges the wide space between the axioms and the testable consequences. The theorist must accomplish this Herculean task with the clear understanding that this effort may only be destined to prepare the way for a death sentence for his theory. One should not reproach the theorist who undertakes such a task by calling him a fantast; instead, one must allow him his fantasizing, since for him there is no other way to his goal whatsoever. Indeed, it is no planless fantasizing, but rather a search for the logically simplest possibilities and their consequences. (Einstein 1954, 238–239; Howard’s translation)

What warrant is there for thus trusting in simplicity? At best one can do a kind of meta-induction. That “the totality of all sensory experience can be ‘comprehended’ on the basis of a conceptual system built on premises of great simplicity” will be derided by skeptics as a “miracle creed,” but, Einstein adds, “it is a miracle creed which has been borne out to an amazing extent by the development of science” (Einstein 1950, p. 342). The success of previous physical theories justifies our trusting that nature is the realization of the simplest that is mathematically conceivable

But for all that Einstein’s faith in simplicity was strong, he despaired of giving a precise, formal characterization of how we assess the simplicity of a theory. In 1946 he wrote about the perspective of simplicity (here termed the “inner perfection” of a theory):

This point of view, whose exact formulation meets with great difficulties, has played an important role in the selection and evaluation of theories from time immemorial. The problem here is not simply one of a kind of enumeration of the logically independent premises (if anything like this were at all possible without ambiguity), but one of a kind of reciprocal weighing of incommensurable qualities.… I shall not attempt to excuse the lack of precision of [these] assertions … on the grounds of insufficient space at my disposal; I must confess herewith that I cannot at this point, and perhaps not at all, replace these hints by more precise definitions. I believe, however, that a sharper formulation would be possible. In any case it turns out that among the “oracles” there usually is agreement in judging the “inner perfection” of the theories and even more so concerning the degree of “external confirmation.” (Einstein 1946, pp. 21, 23).

As in 1918, so in 1946 and beyond, Einstein continues to be impressed that the “oracles,” presumably the leaders of the relevant scientific community, tend to agree in their judgments of simplicity. That is why, in practice, simplicity seems to determine theory choice univocally.

4. Univocalness in the Theoretical Representation of Nature

In the physics and philosophy of science literature of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, the principle according to which scientific theorizing should strive for a univocal representation of nature was widely and well known under the name that it was given in the title of a widely-cited essay by Joseph Petzoldt, “The Law of Univocalness” [“Das Gesetz der Eindeutigkeit”] (Petzoldt 1895). An indication that the map of philosophical positions was drawn then in a manner very different from today is to found in the fact that this principle found favor among both anti-metaphysical logical empiricists, such as Carnap, and neo-Kantians, such as Cassirer. It played a major role in debates over the ontology of general relativity and was an important part of the background to the development of the modern concept of categoricity in formal semantics (for more on the history, influence, and demise of the principle of univocalness, see Howard 1992 and 1996). One can find no more ardent and consistent champion of the principle than Einstein.

The principle of univocalness should not be mistaken for a denial of the underdetermination thesis. The latter asserts that a multiplicity of theories can equally well account for a given body of empirical evidence, perhaps even the infinity of all possible evidence in the extreme, Quinean version of the thesis. The principle of univocalness asserts (in a somewhat anachronistic formulation) that any one theory, even any one among a set of empirically equivalent theories, should provide a univocal representation of nature by determining for itself an isomorphic set of models. The unambiguous determination of theory choice by evidence is not the same thing as the univocal determination of a class of models by a theory.

The principle of univocalness played a central role in Einstein’s struggles to formulate the general theory of relativity. When, in 1913, Einstein wrongly rejected a fully generally covariant theory of gravitation, he did so in part because he thought, wrongly, that generally covariant field equations failed the test of univocalness. More specifically, he reasoned wrongly that for a region of spacetime devoid of matter and energy—a “hole”—generally covariant field equations permit the construction of two different solutions, different in the sense that, in general, for spacetime points inside the hole, they assign different values of the metric tensor to one and the same point (for more on the history of this episode, see Stachel 1980 and Norton 1984). But Einstein’s “hole argument” is wrong, and his own diagnosis of the error in 1915 rests again, ironically, on a deployment of the principle of univocalness. What Einstein realized in 1915 was that, in 1913, he was wrongly assuming that a coordinate chart sufficed to fix the identity of spacetime manifold points. The application of a coordinate chart cannot suffice to individuate manifold points precisely because a coordinate chart is not an invariant labeling scheme, whereas univocalness in the representation of nature requires such invariance (see Howard and Norton 1993 and Howard 1999 for further discussion).

Here is how Einstein explained his change of perspective in a letter to Paul Ehrenfest of 26 December 1915, just a few weeks after the publication of the final, generally covariant formulation of the general theory of relativity:

In §12 of my work of last year, everything is correct (in the first three paragraphs) up to that which is printed with emphasis at the end of the third paragraph. From the fact that the two systems \(G(x)\) and \(G'(x)\), referred to the same reference system, satisfy the conditions of the grav. field, no contradiction follows with the univocalness of events. That which was apparently compelling in these reflections founders immediately, if one considers that
  1. the reference system signifies nothing real
  2. that the (simultaneous) realization of two different \(g\)-systems (or better, two different grav. fields) in the same region of the continuum is impossible according to the nature of the theory.

In place of §12, the following reflections must appear. The physically real in the universe of events (in contrast to that which is dependent upon the choice of a reference system) consists in spatiotemporal coincidences.* [Footnote *: and in nothing else!] Real are, e.g., the intersections of two different world lines, or the statement that they do not intersect. Those statements that refer to the physically real therefore do not founder on any univocal coordinate transformation. If two systems of the \(g_{\mu v}\) (or in general the variables employed in the description of the world) are so created that one can obtain the second from the first through mere spacetime transformation, then they are completely equivalent. For they have all spatiotemporal point coincidences in common, i.e., everything that is observable.

These reflections show at the same time how natural the demand for general covariance is. (CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 173)

Einstein’s new point of view, according to which the physically real consists exclusively in that which can be constructed on the basis of spacetime coincidences, spacetime points, for example, being regarded as intersections of world lines, is now known as the “point-coincidence argument.” Einstein might have been inspired by a paper by the young mathematician Erich Kretschmann (Howard and Norton 1993; cf. Giovanelli 2013) or possibly by a conversation with Schlick (Engler and Renn, 2017). Spacetime coincidences play this privileged ontic role because they are invariant and, thus, univocally determined. Spacetime coordinates lack such invariance, a circumstance that Einstein thereafter repeatedly formulated as the claim that space and time “thereby lose the last vestige of physical reality” (see, for example, Einstein to Ehrenfest, 5 January 1916, CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 180).

One telling measure of the philosophical importance of Einstein’s new perspective on the ontology of spacetime is the fact that Schlick devoted his first book, Raum und Zeit in den gegenwärtigen Physik (1917), a book for which Einstein had high praise (see Howard 1984 and 1999). But what most interested Einstein was Schlick’s discussion of the reality concept. Schlick argued that Mach was wrong to regard only the elements of sensation as real. Spacetime events, individuated invariantly as spacetime coincidences, have as much or more right to be taken as real, precisely because of the univocal manner of their determination. Einstein wholeheartedly agreed, though he ventured the above-quoted suggestion that one should distinguish the two kinds of reality—that of the elements and that of the spacetime events—on the ground that if “two different peoples” pursued physics independently of one another they were fated to agree about the elements but would almost surely produce different theoretical constructions at the level of the spacetime event ontology. Note, again, that underdetermination is not a failure of univocalness. Different though they will be, each people’s theoretical construction of an event ontology would be expected to be univocal.

Schlick, of course, went on to become the founder of the Vienna Circle, a leading figure in the development of logical empiricism, a champion of verificationism. That being so, an important question arises about Schlick’s interpretation of Einstein on the univocal determination of spacetime events as spacetime coincidences. The question is this: Do such univocal coincidences play such a privileged role because of their reality or because of their observability. Clearly the former—the reality of that which is univocally determined—is important. But are univocal spacetime coincidences real because, thanks to their invariance, they are observable? Or is their observability consequent upon their invariant reality? Einstein, himself, repeatedly stressed the observable character of spacetime coincidences, as in the 26 December 1915 letter to Ehrenfest quoted above (for additional references and a fuller discussion, see Howard 1999).[2]

Schlick, still a self-described realist in 1917, was clear about the relationship between observability and reality. He distinguished macroscopic coincidences in the field of our sense experience, to which he does accord a privileged and foundational epistemic status, from the microscopic point coincidences that define an ontology of spacetime manifold points. Mapping the former onto the latter is, for Schlick, an important part of the business of confirmation, but the reality of the spacetime manifold points is in no way consequent upon their observability. Indeed, how, strictly speaking, can one even talk of the observation of infinitesimal spacetime coincidences of the kind encountered in the intersection of two world lines? In fact, the order of implication goes the other way: Spacetime events individuated as spacetime coincidences are real because they are invariant, and such observability as they might possess is consequent upon their status as invariant bits of physical reality. For Einstein, and for Schlick in 1917, understanding the latter—physical reality—is the goal of physical theory.

5. Realism and Separability

As we have seen, Schlick’s Raum und Zeit in den gegenwärtigen Physik promoted a realistic interpretation of the ontology of general relativity. After reading the manuscript early in 1917, Einstein wrote to Schlick on 21 May that “the last section ‘Relations to Philosophy’ seems to me excellent” (CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 343), just the sort of praise one would expect from a fellow realist. Three years earlier, the Bonn mathematician, Eduard Study, had written another well-known, indeed very well-known defense of realism, Die realistische Weltansicht und die Lehre vom Raume (1914). Einstein read it in September of 1918. Much of it he liked, especially the droll style, as he said to Study in a letter of 17 September (CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 618). Pressed by Study to say more about the points where he disagreed, Einstein replied on 25 September in a rather surprising way:

I am supposed to explain to you my doubts? By laying stress on these it will appear that I want to pick holes in you everywhere. But things are not so bad, because I do not feel comfortable and at home in any of the “isms.” It always seems to me as though such an ism were strong only so long as it nourishes itself on the weakness of it counter-ism; but if the latter is struck dead, and it is alone on an open field, then it also turns out to be unsteady on its feet. So, away we go!

“The physical world is real.” That is supposed to be the fundamental hypothesis. What does “hypothesis” mean here? For me, a hypothesis is a statement, whose truth must be assumed for the moment, but whose meaning must be raised above all ambiguity. The above statement appears to me, however, to be, in itself, meaningless, as if one said: “The physical world is cock-a-doodle-doo.” It appears to me that the “real” is an intrinsically empty, meaningless category (pigeon hole), whose monstrous importance lies only in the fact that I can do certain things in it and not certain others. This division is, to be sure, not an arbitrary one, but instead ….

I concede that the natural sciences concern the “real,” but I am still not a realist. (CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 624)

Lest there be any doubt that Einstein has little sympathy for the other side, he adds:

The positivist or pragmatist is strong as long as he battles against the opinion that there [are] concepts that are anchored in the “A priori.” When, in his enthusiasm, [he] forgets that all knowledge consists [in] concepts and judgments, then that is a weakness that lies not in the nature of things but in his personal disposition just as with the senseless battle against hypotheses, cf. the clear book by Duhem. In any case, the railing against atoms rests upon this weakness. Oh, how hard things are for man in this world; the path to originality leads through unreason (in the sciences), through ugliness (in the arts)-at least the path that many find passable. (CPAE, Vol. 8, Doc. 624)

What could Einstein mean by saying that he concedes that the natural sciences concern the “real,” but that he is “still not a realist” and that the “real” in the statement, “the physical world is real,” is an “intrinsically empty, meaningless category”?

The answer might be that realism, for Einstein, is not a philosophical doctrine about the interpretation of scientific theories or the semantics of theoretical terms.[3] For Einstein, realism is a physical postulate, one of a most interesting kind, as he explained on 18 March 1948 in a long note at the end of the manuscript of Max Born’s Waynflete Lectures, Natural Philosophy of Cause and Chance (1949), which Born had sent to Einstein for commentary:

I just want to explain what I mean when I say that we should try to hold on to physical reality. We are, to be sure, all of us aware of the situation regarding what will turn out to be the basic foundational concepts in physics: the point-mass or the particle is surely not among them; the field, in the Faraday - Maxwell sense, might be, but not with certainty. But that which we conceive as existing (’actual’) should somehow be localized in time and space. That is, the real in one part of space, A, should (in theory) somehow ‘exist’ independently of that which is thought of as real in another part of space, B. If a physical system stretches over the parts of space A and B, then what is present in B should somehow have an existence independent of what is present in A. What is actually present in B should thus not depend upon the type of measurement carried out in the part of space, A; it should also be independent of whether or not, after all, a measurement is made in A.

If one adheres to this program, then one can hardly view the quantum-theoretical description as a complete representation of the physically real. If one attempts, nevertheless, so to view it, then one must assume that the physically real in B undergoes a sudden change because of a measurement in A. My physical instincts bristle at that suggestion.

However, if one renounces the assumption that what is present in different parts of space has an independent, real existence, then I do not at all see what physics is supposed to describe. For what is thought to by a ‘system’ is, after all, just conventional, and I do not see how one is supposed to divide up the world objectively so that one can make statements about the parts. (Born 1969, 223–224; Howard’s translation)

Realism is thus the thesis of spatial separability, the claim that spatial separation is a sufficient condition for the individuation of physical systems, and its assumption is here made into almost a necessary condition for the possibility of an intelligible science of physics.

The postulate of spatial separability as that which undergirds the ontic independence and, hence, individual identities of the systems that physics describes was an important part of Einstein’s thinking about the foundations of physics since at least the time of his very first paper on the quantum hypothesis in 1905 (Einstein 1905a; for more detail on the early history of this idea in Einstein’s thinking, see Howard 1990b). But the true significance of the separability principle emerged most clearly in 1935, when (as hinted in the just-quoted remark) Einstein made it one of the central premises of his argument for the incompleteness of quantum mechanics (see Howard 1985 and 1989). It is not so clearly deployed in the published version of the Einstein, Podolsky, Rosen paper (1935), but Einstein did not write that paper and did not like the way the argument appeared there. Separability is, however, an explicit premise in all of Einstein’s later presentations of the argument for the incompleteness of quantum mechanics, both in correspondence and in print (see Howard 1985 for a detailed list of references).

In brief, the argument is this. Separability implies that spacelike separated systems have associated with them independent real states of affairs. A second postulate, locality, implies that the events in one region of spacetime cannot physically influence physical reality in a region of spacetime separated from the first by a spacelike interval. Consider now an experiment in which two systems, A and B, interact and separate, subsequent measurements on each corresponding to spacelike separated events. Separability implies that A and B have separate real physical states, and locality implies that the measurement performed on A cannot influence B’s real physical state. But quantum mechanics ascribes different theoretical states, different wave functions, to B depending upon that parameter that is measured on A. Therefore, quantum mechanics ascribes different theoretical states to B, when B possesses, in fact, one real physical state. Hence quantum mechanics is incomplete.

One wants to ask many questions. First, what notion of completeness is being invoked here? It is not deductive completeness. It is closer in kind to what is termed “categoricity” in formal semantics, a categorical theory being one whose models are all isomorphic to one another. It is closer still to the principle discussed above—and cited as a precursor of the concept of categoricity—namely, the principle of univocalness, which we found doing such important work in Einstein’s quest for a general theory of relativity, where it was the premise forcing the adoption of an invariant and thus univocal scheme for the individuation of spacetime manifold points.

The next question is why separability is viewed by Einstein as virtually an a priori necessary condition for the possibility of a science of physics. One reason is because a field theory like general relativity, which was Einstein’s model for a future unified foundation for physics, is an extreme embodiment of the principle of separability: “Field theory has carried out this principle to the extreme, in that it localizes within infinitely small (four-dimensional) space-elements the elementary things existing independently of the one another that it takes as basic, as well as the elementary laws it postulates for them” (Einstein 1948, 321–322). And a field theory like general relativity can do this because the infinitesimal metric interval—the careful way to think about separation in general relativistic spacetime—is invariant (hence univocally determined) under all continuous coordinate transformations.

Another reason why Einstein would be inclined to view separability as an a priori necessity is that, in thus invoking separability to ground individuation, Einstein places himself in a tradition of so viewing spatial separability with very strong Kantian roots (and, before Kant, Newtonian roots), a tradition in which spatial separability was known by the name that Arthur Schopenhauer famously gave to it, the principium individuationis (for a fuller discussion of this historical context, see Howard 1997).

A final question one wants to ask is: “What does any of this have to do with realism?” One might grant Einstein’s point that a real ontology requires a principle of individuation without agreeing that separability provides the only conceivable such principle. Separability together with the invariance of the infinitesimal metric interval implies that, in a general relativistic spacetime, there are joints everywhere, meaning that we can carve up the universe in any way we choose and still have ontically independent parts. But quantum entanglement can be read as implying that this libertarian scheme of individuation does not work. Can quantum mechanics not be given a realistic interpretation? Many would say, “yes.” Einstein said, “no.”

6. The Principle Theories—Constructive Theories Distinction

There is much that is original in Einstein’s philosophy of science as described thus far. At the very least, he rearranged the bits and pieces of doctrine that he learned from others—Kant, Mach, Duhem, Poincaré, Schlick, and others—in a strikingly novel way. But Einstein’s most original contribution to twentieth-century philosophy of science lies elsewhere, in his distinction between what he termed “principle theories” and “constructive theories.”

This idea first found its way into print in a brief 1919 article in the Times of London (Einstein 1919). A constructive theory, as the name implies, provides a constructive model for the phenomena of interest. An example would be kinetic theory. A principle theory consists of a set of individually well-confirmed, high-level empirical generalizations, “which permit of precise formulation” (Einstein 1914, 749). Examples include the first and second laws of thermodynamics. Ultimate understanding requires a constructive theory, but often, says Einstein, progress in theory is impeded by premature attempts at developing constructive theories in the absence of sufficient constraints by means of which to narrow the range of possible constructive theories. It is the function of principle theories to provide such constraint, and progress is often best achieved by focusing first on the establishment of such principles. According to Einstein, that is how he achieved his breakthrough with the theory of relativity, which, he says, is a principle theory, its two principles being the relativity principle and the light principle.

While the principle theories-constructive theories distinction first made its way into print in 1919, there is considerable evidence that it played an explicit role in Einstein’s thinking much earlier (Einstein 1907, Einstein to Sommerfeld 14 January 1908, CPAE, vol. 5, Doc. 73, Einstein 1914). Nor was it only the relativity and light principles that served Einstein as constraints in his theorizing. Thus, he explicitly mentions also the Boltzmann principle, \(S = k \log W\), as another such:

This equation connects thermodynamics with the molecular theory. It yields, as well, the statistical probabilities of the states of systems for which we are not in a position to construct a molecular-theoretical model. To that extent, Boltzmann’s magnificent idea is of significance for theoretical physics … because it provides a heuristic principle whose range extends beyond the domain of validity of molecular mechanics. (Einstein 1915, p. 262).

Einstein is here alluding the famous entropic analogy whereby, in his 1905 photon hypothesis paper, he reasoned from the fact that black body radiation in the Wien regime satisfied the Boltzmann principle to the conclusion that, in that regime, radiation behaved as if it consisted of mutually independent, corpuscle-like quanta of electromagnetic energy. The quantum hypothesis is a constructive model of radiation; the Boltzmann principle is the constraint that first suggested that model.

There are anticipations of the principle theories-constructive theories distinction in the nineteenth-century electrodynamics literature, James Clerk Maxwell, in particular, being a source from which Einstein might well have drawn (see Harman 1998). At the turn of the century, the “physics of principles” was a subject under wide discussion. At the turn of 1900, Hendrik A. Lorentz (Lorentz 1900, 1905; see Frisch 2005) and Henri Poincaré (for example, Poincaré 1904; see, Giedymin 1982, Darrigol 1995) presented the opposition between the “physics of principles“ and the “physics of models“ as commonplace. In a similar vein, Arnold Sommerfeld opposed a “physics of problems“, a style of doing physics based on concrete puzzle solving, to the “practice of principles“ defended by Max Planck (Seth 2010). Philipp Frank (1908, relying on Rey 1909) defined relativity theory as a “ conceptual theory“ based on abstract, but empirically well confirmed principles rather than on intuitive models. Probably many other examples could be find. . But however extensive his borrowings (no explicit debt was ever acknowledged), in Einstein’s hands the distinction becomes a methodological tool of impressive scope and fertility. What is puzzling, and even a bit sad, is that this most original methodological insight of Einstein’s had comparatively little impact on later philosophy of science or practice in physics. Only in recent decades, Einstein constructive-principle distinction has attracted interest in the philosophical literature, originating a still living philosophical debate on the foundation of spacetime theories (Brown 2005, Janssen 2009, Lange 2014).[4]

7. Conclusion: Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Physicist

Einstein’s influence on twentieth-century philosophy of science is comparable to his influence on twentieth-century physics (Howard 2014). What made that possible? One explanation looks to the institutional and disciplinary history of theoretical physics and the philosophy of science. Each was, in its own domain, a new mode of thought in the latter nineteenth century, and each finally began to secure for itself a solid institutional basis in the early twentieth century. In a curious way, the two movements helped one another. Philosophers of science helped to legitimate theoretical physics by locating the significant cognitive content of science in its theories. Theoretical physicists helped to legitimate the philosophy of science by providing for analysis a subject matter that was radically reshaping our understanding of nature and the place of humankind within it. In some cases the help was even more direct, as with the work of Einstein and Max Planck in the mid-1920s to create in the physics department at the University of Berlin a chair in the philosophy of science for Reichenbach (see Hecht and Hartmann 1982). And we should remember the example of the physicists Mach and Ludwig Boltzmann who were the first two occupants of the new chair for the philosophy of science at the University of Vienna at the turn of the century.

Another explanation looks to the education of young physicists in Einstein’s day. Not only was Einstein’s own youthful reading heavily focused on philosophy, more generally, and the philosophy of science, in particular (for an overview, see Einstein 1989, xxiv–xxv; see also Howard 1994b), in which respect he was not unlike other physicists of his generation, but also his university physics curriculum included a required course on “The Theory of Scientific Thought” (see Einstein 1987, Doc. 28). An obvious question is whether or not the early cultivation of a philosophical habit of mind made a difference in the way Einstein and his contemporaries approached physics. As indicated by his November 1944 letter to Robert Thorton quoted at the beginning of this article, Einstein thought that it did.


Einstein’s Work

Einstein’s letters and manuscripts, if unpublished, are cited by their numbers in the Einstein Archive (EA) control index and, if published, by volume, document number, and, if necessary, page number in:

[CPAE] The Collected Papers of Albert Einstein, John Stachel, et al. (eds.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1987–present.

Works by year

1905a “Über einen die Erzeugung und Verwandlung des Lichtes betreffenden heuristischen Gesichtspunkt.” Annalen der Physik 17:132–148. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 2, Doc. 14.
1905b “Über die von der molekularkinetischen Theorie der Wärme geforderte Bewegung von in ruhenden Flüssigkeiten suspendierten Teilchen.” Annalen der Physik 17: 549–560. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 2, Doc. 16.
1905c “Zur Elektrodynamik bewegter Körper.” Annalen der Physik 17: 891–921. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 2, Doc. 23.
1907 “Bemerkungen zu der Notiz von Hrn Paul Ehrenfest: ‘Die Translation deformierbarer Elektronen und der Flächensatz’” Annalen der Physik 22: 206–208. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 2, Doc. 44.
1914 “Antrittsrede des Hrn.Einstein” Sitzungsberichte der Preussischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Halbband 1: 739–742. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 3, Doc. 18.
1915 “Theoretische Atomistik.” In Die Kultur der Gegenwart. Ihre Entwicklung und ihre Ziele. Paul Hinneberg, ed. Part 3, Mathematik, Naturwissenschaften, Medizin. Section 3, Anorganischen Naturwissenschaften. E. Lecher, ed. Vol. 1, Die Physik. Emil Warburg, ed. Leipzig and Berlin: B. G. Teubner, 251–263. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 4, Doc. 20.
1916 “Ernst Mach.” Physikalische Zeitschrift 17: 101–104. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 6, Doc. 29.
1918 “Motive des Forschens.” In Zu Max Plancks sechzigstem Geburtstag. Ansprachen, gehalten am 26. April 1918 in der Deutschen Physikalischen Gesellschaft. Karlsruhe: C. F. Müller, pp. 29–32. English translation: “Principles of Research.” In Einstein 1954, 224–227. Repr. in CPAE Vol. 7, Doc. 7.
1919 “Time, Space, and Gravitation.” Times (London). 28 November 1919, 13–14. Reprinted as “What is the Theory of Relativity?” In Einstein 1954, 227–232. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 7, Doc. 29.
1921 Geometrie und Erfahrung. Erweiterte Fassung des Festvortrages gehalten an der Preussischen Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Belin am 27. Januar 1921. Berlin: Julius Springer. English translation: “Geometry and Experience.” In Einstein 1954, 232–246. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 7, Doc. 52.
1923 “Grundgedanken und Probleme der Relativitätstheorie.” In Les Prix Nobel en 1921–1922. Carl Gustaf Santesson, ed., Stockholm: Nobel Foundation. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 14, Doc. 75.
1924 Review of Elsbach 1924. Deutsche Literaturzeitung 45, 1688–1689. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 14, Doc. 321.
1925 “Nichteuklidische Geometrie und Physik.” Neue Rundschau 36, no. 1: 16–20. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 14, Doc. 220.
1926 Space–Time Encyclopædia Britannica, 13th ed., edited by James Louis Garvin, Supplementary Vol. 3, London and New York: The Encyclopædia Britannica Co., Ltd., 1926, pp. 608–611. Repr. in CPAE, Vol. 15, Doc. 148.
1928 A propos de “La Déduction Relativiste” de M. Émile Meyerson [Meyerson 1925] Revue philosophique de la France et de l’étranger 45, 161–166. English translation: Meyerson 1985, 252–256.
1933 On the Method of Theoretical Physics. The Herbert Spencer Lecture, delivered at Oxford, 10 June 1933. Oxford: Clarendon Press. New translation by Sonja Bargmann in Einstein 1954, 270–276.
1930 “Das Raum-, Äther- und Feld-Problem der Physik.” English translation: In Einstein 1954, 276–285.
1935 with Boris Podolsky and Nathan Rosen, “Can Quantum-Mechanical Description of Physical Reality Be Considered Complete?” Physical Review 47: 777–780.
1936 “Physik und Realität.” Journal of The Franklin Institute 221: 313–347. English translation: “Physics and Reality.” Jean Piccard, trans. Journal of the Franklin Institute 221: 348–382. Reprinted in Einstein 1954, 290–323.
1946 “Autobiographical Notes.” In Schilpp 1949, 1–94. Quotations are taken from the corrected English translation in: Autobiographical Notes: A Centennial Edition. Paul Arthur Schilpp, trans. and ed. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1979.
1948 “Quanten-Mechanik und Wirklichkeit.” Dialectica 2: 320–24.
1949 “Remarks Concerning the Essays Brought together in this Co-operative Volume.” In Schilpp 1949, 665–688.
1950 “On the Generalized Theory of Gravitation.” Scientific American 182, April, 13–17. Reprinted in Einstein 1954, 341–356.
1954 Ideas and Opinions. New York: Bonanza Books.

Related Literature

  • Born, Max, 1949. Natural Philosophy of Cause and Chance, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brown, Harvey R., 2005. Physical Relativity. Space-time Structure from a Dynamical Perspective, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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