Wesley Salmon

First published Fri Jul 13, 2018; substantive revision Sun Jul 17, 2022

Wesley Charles Salmon (1925–2001) was a central figure in twentieth century philosophy of science. Working in the tradition of Hume, Salmon developed a sophisticated version of empiricism combining a genuinely probabilistic approach with realism about theoretical entities. Salmon’s writings, characterized by a systematic and crystal-clear style, cover a wide range of topics including logic, the philosophy of space and time, the foundations of probability and scientific inference, rationality, realism, and scientific explanation, a major focus of his production for more than thirty years. Unlike the Hempelian “received view”, Salmon developed a concept of explanation according to which to explain means to exhibit the causal mechanisms responsible for the occurrence of phenomena. Convinced that our knowledge is uncertain and that causality ought to be defined in probabilistic terms, he pursued a probabilistic version of mechanicism, opening a new trend of research in the literature on explanation, known as “neo-mechanicism”. Salmon’s views on all the topics he addressed continue to nurture fresh reflection and ongoing debate.

After a biographical note (section 1), this entry surveys Salmon’s views on probability (section 2), confirmation (section 3), space and time (section 4), explanation and causality (section 5), rationality and realism (section 6). Albeit necessary in this kind of essay, such partitioning is somewhat artificial, because Salmon’s ideas are strictly interconnected: his conception of causal explanation relies on his frequency view of probability and substantiates a concept of rationality that regards causal knowledge of phenomena as crucial for our understanding of both the world and human action.

1. Biographical Note

Wesley Charles Salmon was born in Detroit on 9 August 1925, to Wallis, a mechanical and electrical engineer, and Ruth Springer Salmon, a schoolteacher. After completing primary and secondary school in Detroit, and studying at Wayne University (now Wayne State University) from 1943–44, in 1944 Salmon moved to the University of Chicago. Taken with admiration for the charismatic minister of his family’s Methodist church, Salmon entered the University of Chicago Divinity School with the intention to become a minister himself. However, as he writes in the autobiographical note published in What? Where? When? Why? (1982), once in Chicago he left his “belief in virtually every tenet of Christianity, as well as all confidence in the social value of religion” (Salmon 1982c: 281). He then decided to turn to philosophy and in 1947 obtained his MA in Philosophy with a thesis on Whitehead’s conception of freedom.

In Chicago, Salmon was quite unhappy with the Thomistic focus of the Philosophy department, where the scientifically oriented philosophy he favored was somewhat disregarded, in spite of the presence there of Rudolf Carnap, with whom at that time he did not have much interchange. Closer interaction between them took place in 1963, while Salmon was visiting the University of Minnesota Center for Philosophy of Science for the Winter and Spring terms, and was given the opportunity to pay a one week visit to Carnap in Los Angeles, together with Herbert Feigl, and Grover Maxwell. That visit was the occasion for daily discussions on the nature of confirmation and inductive logic. Such a stimulating exchange fueled many writings, including the masterpiece The Foundations of Scientific Inference (1967a), whose fiftieth anniversary edition was re-published in 2017 with an introduction by Christopher Hitchcock.

After receiving his MA, Salmon decided to move to UCLA. Although he claimed to have taken that decision attracted by the warm Californian climate, his choice proved decisive, because there he encountered Hans Reichenbach, who supervised his Ph.D. dissertation on John Venn, and who exercised a dominant influence on all of his subsequent work. After obtaining his Ph.D. in 1950, Salmon held teaching positions at Washington State College; UCLA; Northwestern University, and Brown University.

In 1963 Salmon moved to the recently founded (1960) department of History and Philosophy of Science of Indiana University, where his philosophical attitude underwent an important turn, that he so describes:

At Indiana, for the first time, I found myself dealing with graduate students and colleagues who had strong scientific backgrounds and a fair degree of scientific sophistication. It became essential for me to treat philosophy of science, not as a discipline looking inward upon other branches of philosophy, but as one which looks outward toward the various scientific disciplines. […] I came to the conviction, which I still hold, that philosophy which remains out of contact with other disciplines runs the great risk of becoming quite sterile. (Salmon 1982c: 282)

As a result of such developments, besides continuing to work on the issues which had always been on his mind, namely induction, confirmation, probability and the nature of scientific inference, Salmon became deeply interested in the philosophy of space and time, publishing the introductory book Space, Time, and Motion (1975a), which can be considered a pearl of clarity; the collection Zeno’s Paradoxes (1970a); and a number of subsequent papers. During his years at Indiana University Salmon started working also on explanation, a subject that remained at the heart of his production for the rest of his life.

After his first marriage ended in divorce, in 1971 Salmon married Merrilee Ashby, herself a philosopher of science. In 1973 Salmon and his wife left Indiana and took positions at the University of Arizona, to stay there until 1981 when they both moved to the University of Pittsburgh. There, in 1983 Salmon was appointed University Professor at the Philosophy department as a successor of Carl Gustav Hempel, a position he held until his retirement in 1999. In Pittsburgh philosophy of science was flourishing, thanks to a large community belonging not only to the department of Philosophy, but also the department of History and Philosophy of Science, the Center for Philosophy of Science, and the Philosophy department of Carnegie Mellon University. As a member of such a lively philosophical community Salmon enjoyed a most congenial atmosphere for twenty extremely productive years, leading to the publication of the book Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World (1984), a milestone of the literature on scientific explanation and the apex of Salmon’s work on the topic, the collection, edited with Philip Kitcher, Scientific Explanation (1989), which included as a chapter the essay “Four Decades of Scientific Explanation”, to be published one year later as a book (1990a), and a long series of articles which later merged into the two collections Causality and Explanation (1998) and Reality and Rationality, edited by P. Dowe and M.H. Salmon, which appeared posthumously in 2005.

Along the years Salmon gave lectures and courses as a visiting professor in many universities and other prestigious institutions around the world, including the university of Bologna, where in 1988 he delivered a lecture course on “Forty years of scientific explanation”; the university of Melbourne (1978), and Kyoto University, where in the Spring 2000 he last taught for one term. Salmon was also very active in promoting philosophy of science, and served as President of the Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science division of the International Union of History and Philosophy of Science (now IUHPST: International Union of History and Philosophy of Science and Technology) from 1996 to 2000.

On 22 April 2001 Salmon died in a car accident on his way home from a family visit in Indiana.

From his first book Logic (1963a), which was translated into Spanish, Chinese, Japanese, Italian, French, Portuguese, and German, to his last publication, the article “The Causal Structure of the World” (2010), Salmon published fifteen authored and edited books, and over two hundred articles, reviews and comments of other authors. All of his publications, written in a crystal clear style, are characterized by rigorous argumentation and original thought. Introductory books like Logic, Space, Time and Motion, and Foundations of Scientific Inference are masterpieces which have served as reference books for generations of students and researchers operating in various fields, while Statistical Explanation and Statistical Relevance, Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World, Explanation and Causality, and Reality and Rationality are unparalleled sources of inspiration for philosophers of science working on explanation, causality, and scientific rationality. An ardent admirer of Italian culture, in the 1990s Salmon enjoyed a fruitful cooperation with Dennis Looney, at the time a professor of Italian at the University of Pittsburgh. They taught a few courses focused on the intersections between the Italian cultural tradition and the history of science, considering among others Dante, Leonardo, Galileo, Leopardi, Galvani, Fermi, Calvino, and Primo Levi. At the time of his sudden death Salmon was working on a book, co-authored by Looney, a draft of which, bearing the title “Italian Science and Letters: Draft”, is accessible as part of the Wesley C. Salmon Papers collection, Archives of Scientific Philosophy (Doc. 31735033465448, Box 26, Folder 1 – see Other Internet Resources).

2. Probability and Induction

Salmon regarded probability as an essential component of science and human knowledge at large, and induction as the fundamental ingredient of scientific method. In so doing, he followed in the steps of his mentor Reichenbach, of whom he said:

Just as Hume was the great empiricist of the eighteenth century, so it may be, will Reichenbach be remembered as the great empiricist of the twentieth century. (Salmon 1979b: 2–3)

David Hume is undoubtedly a major source of inspiration for both Reichenbach and Salmon, who placed themselves in the empiricist tradition, and shared Hume’s conviction that prediction is the main task of science, to be fulfilled using induction. By embracing a probabilistic version of inductivism Reichenbach and Salmon intended to make a step forward in the direction indicated by Hume.

2.1 Probability and Frequency

Reichenbach was one of the first to criticize the verifiability theory of meaning embraced by the Viennese school on account that

it would be illusory to imagine that the terms ‘true’ or ‘false’ ever express anything else than high or low probability values. (Reichenbach 1936: 156)

This brought probability to the foreground. Reichenbach embraced an empirical approach to probability and maintained that probability values must be determined on the basis of experience alone. What can be extracted from experience are frequencies, and it is on their basis that probability must be fixed. Reichenbach called the method for obtaining probability values induction by enumeration. This consists in counting the relative frequency of a given attribute in the initial section of a sequence of observations and inferring that such frequency will persist approximately for the rest of the sequence when this is indefinitely prolonged. This procedure forms the content of the canon according to which the frequency interpretation prescribes fixing prior probabilities, a tenet Reichenbach called Rule of induction:

if the sequence has a limit of the frequency, there must exist an n such that from there on the frequency \(f^{i} (i \gt n)\) will remain within the interval \(f^{n} \pm \delta\), where \(\delta\) is a quantity that we can choose as small as we like, but that, once chosen, is kept constant. Now if we posit that the frequency \(f^{i}\) will remain within the interval \(f^{n} \pm \delta\), and we correct this posit for greater n by the same rule, we must finally come to the correct result. (Reichenbach 1935 [1949: 445])

Every probability statement obtained by means of this method is a wager, or a posit, namely a statement allowing us to infer unknown from known frequencies in such a way that, if the sequence of observations has a limit, the method will assure convergence to a unique result.

Salmon wholeheartedly embraced the frequency interpretation, and in particular Reichenbach’s version of it, which embodies a way of making single case probability assignments. The key notion in this regard is that of weight, taken to represent the predictive value of sentences referring to single events. The idea is that the weight assigned to such sentences derives from the probabilities attached to the reference class to which the event in question belongs. The reference class should obey a criterion of homogeneity, namely it should be chosen so as to include as many cases as possible similar to the one under consideration, excluding dissimilar ones. While Reichenbach recommended choosing “the narrowest class for which we have reliable statistics” (Reichenbach 1938: 316) Salmon opted for “the broadest homogeneous reference class”, because

we do not want to try to refer single cases to classes that are too narrow, for if we do we will not have enough evidence upon which to base our inference […] at the same time, we want our reference class to contain other relevant cases, not irrelevant ones. Statistical relevance is the key concept here. (Salmon 1967a: 91)

The reference class containing all and only the relevant properties is objectively homogeneous. Salmon is well aware that

it would be most unrealistic to suppose that we can fulfill the requirement of selecting the broadest homogeneous reference class in all cases in which we have to make practical decisions about single events. We may suspect that a given reference class is inhomogeneous, but not know of any way to make a relevant partition of it. Under these circumstances let us say that the class is epistemically homogeneous. […] Sometimes we know that a reference class is inhomogeneous, but it would simply be impractical to carry out a relevant subdivision. […] Under these circumstances, let us say the reference class is practically homogeneous. (Salmon 1967a: 92)

As we shall see (§ 5.2), in addition to playing a crucial role in scientific inference by providing the key to singular prediction, statistical relevance is no less essential for Salmon’s conception of explanation, and the same holds for reference class homogeneity.

2.2 The Justification of Induction

Deeply convinced of the indispensability of induction, Salmon maintained that

there is a crucial sense in which the logic of science is inescapably inductive, and that a justification of induction is essential to a full understanding of the logic of science. (Salmon 1968a: 24)

To Popper’s uncompromising deductivism he opposed the claim that corroboration, the core of Popper’s falsificationist methodology, is a non-demonstrative kind of inference: “Modus tollens without corroboration is empty; modus tollens with corroboration is induction” (Salmon 1968a: 28; see also Salmon 1981 [1988a]). A number of Salmon’s papers published in the Fifties and Sixties argued against various attempts to deny or dissolve the problem of justifying induction, including those of A.J. Ayer, M. Black and P. Strawson (Salmon 1957, 1963b, 1965, 1978b). By contrast, he took seriously Hume’s argument showing the impossibility of giving a logical solution to the problem of the justification of induction. Adopting Herbert Feigl’s distinction between validation and vindication (Feigl 1950), Salmon embraced a pragmatic approach according to which induction is justified in terms of the knowledge-extending function to which it happens to be necessary.

2.2.1 Reichenbach’s Argument

In a similar vein, Reichenbach (1935 [1949] and 1938) had set himself the task of justifying induction as the best possible method for prediction and action. Given his commitment to frequentism, he meant to show that the rule of induction satisfies the “principle of the greatest number of successes”, namely that it leads us to act in the most successful way possible. Accordingly, the rule of induction is justified on account that if successful predictions are attainable at all, its application will assure the attainment of that goal. Reichenbach’s justification relies on the self-correcting character of the method, whose repeated application guarantees convergence to a unique value in the long run whenever there exists a limit of the relative frequency. However, his argument applies to a whole class of asymptotic rules, all of which satisfy the convergence property. The thing is that one can add to the relative frequency a corrective term which modifies the observed frequency to obtain a slightly different posit. The particularity of the rule of induction is that it makes no use of the corrective term. Well aware of the fact that his argument applied to an infinite class of asymptotic rules, Reichenbach privileged the rule of induction on the grounds of its descriptive simplicity. This applies to descriptions (statements) which are semantically equivalent, as opposed to inductive simplicity which applies when one of two or more descriptions, or hypotheses, which are not semantically equivalent, is believed to be more likely to be true.

2.2.2 Salmon’s Requirements

Salmon praised Reichenbach’s approach for not assuming that there exists an order in nature:

the whole force of the justification is that the use of induction is reasonable whether or not nature is uniform, whatever may be meant by the assertion “Nature is uniform”. (Salmon 1953: 48)

Nevertheless, he found fault with Reichenbach’s argument for the justification of the rule of induction. Both descriptive and inductive simplicity apply to statements, not to rules, and even if one wanted to apply them to rules, one would have to consider that asymptotic rules do not converge uniformly, which means that they “are not in any sense empirically equivalent” (Salmon 1963c: 28). Simplicity would be a sufficient criterion for justifying the choice of a particular rule from the class of asymptotic rules only if such rules were empirically equivalent, but they are not. Salmon set himself the task of spelling out the conditions under which all asymptotic rules could be rejected except the rule of induction.

His first move was to fix two regularity, or normalizing, conditions imposing that no relative frequency \(m/n\) observed in any initial section of a sequence can be negative, and that for every possible n so obtained all the corresponding values of \(m_i\) must add up to one. He then added a requirement of linguistic invariance stating that the inferences made by means of a given rule must be invariant with respect to the language in which the evidence taken into consideration is expressed. In other words, what matters to inductive inferences is the content of evidence statements, not their linguistic form. For a while Salmon thought that these requirements could fulfill the purpose for which they had been proposed. He was able to demonstrate that the normalizing conditions could eliminate a large subclass of Reichenbach’s asymptotic rules (Salmon 1956), and that the criterion of linguistic invariance could do the same with all the methods belonging to Carnap’s continuum, except the one Carnap called the straight rule—alias the rule of induction (Salmon 1961). Among other things, the criterion of linguistic invariance allowed Salmon to suggest an original solution to Goodman’s paradox (Salmon 1963c).

Salmon’s hope to have solved the problem left open by Reichenbach’s argument for the justification of inductive methods was soon disappointed, especially after the criticism raised by Ian Hacking (1965 and 1968). Hacking showed that the three conditions of consistency, symmetry and invariance taken together are necessary and sufficient to select the rule of induction among the class of asymptotic rules. Hacking’s consistency and invariant conditions are stronger versions of Salmon’s requirements of regularity and linguistic invariance, while the symmetry condition (corresponding to the property usually called exchangeability) requires that for any given value of the relative frequency observed in a sample, the posited value of the limiting frequency must be insensitive to the order in which the items of the sample were observed to occur. This requirement is commonly accepted by the upholders of the subjective interpretation of probability, but for a frequentist like Salmon, who held that the evaluation of probability must be entirely based on empirical data, symmetry (exchangeability) can only mean a factual assumption on the nature of the population under study. This clashes with a justification in tune with Reichenbach’s perspective. As Salmon observed, Reichenbach’s rule of induction

is a method for primitive knowledge, and this is what he was attempting to justify. Thus, he would argue, since we have no results of previous inductions to establish these factual assumptions, we are not entitled to make them. (Salmon 1991: 117)

2.2.3 A Further Attempt

In order to overcome this difficulty Salmon put forward a new argument based on Reichenbach’s distinction between a context of discovery and a context of justification. The decision to examine a certain sequence to calculate the relative frequency of its attributes, Salmon claimed, belongs in the context of discovery, and in addition

the use of the rule of induction to arrive at a value to posit is also part of the context of discovery; at the same time, it looks like part of the context of justification as well, for the posit is justified by virtue of the rule of induction. (Salmon 1991: 117–118)

The interplay between the two contexts offers the key to attempt a solution, because assumptions introduced as hypotheses at the discovery level are to be confirmed or rejected at the justification level. The symmetry condition would then represent a wager in the context of discovery, to be tested in the context of justification. The conclusion Salmon reached is that:

Reichenbach sought to solve Hume’s problem of the justification of induction by means of a pragmatic vindication that relies heavily on the convergence properties of his rule of induction. His attempt to rule out all other asymptotic methods by an appeal to descriptive simplicity was unavailing. We found that important progress in that direction could be made by invoking normalizing conditions (consistency) and methodological simplicity (as a basis for invariance), but that they did not do the whole job. I am proposing that, in the end, Reichenbach’s own distinction between discovery and justification holds the key to the solution. (Salmon 1991: 119)

The methodological simplicity mentioned in this passage was suggested to Salmon by John Clendinnen. It is a version of simplicity that applies to rules instead of statements, and requires the adoption of “the simplest system of predicting rules which are compatible with, and exemplified in, the set of known facts” (Clendinnen 1982: 20). Salmon accepted Clendinnen’s suggestion as a significant, if not decisive, contribution to the justification of induction (Salmon 1982c and 1991).

2.3 Criticism of Other Interpretations of Probability

In The Foundations of Scientific Inference Salmon compared the major interpretations of probability against three criteria: admissibility, ascertainability, and applicability. Admissibility requires satisfaction of the formal properties of probability spelled out by the probability calculus; ascertainability demands that there must exist a method of ascertaining the values of probability; applicability stipulates that the concept of probability must have a practical predictive import.

Laplace’s classical interpretation was deemed defective with respect to admissibility, because it suffers from the difficulty known as “Bertrand’s paradox”, which applies to problems involving an infinite range of possibilities, in which case the classical definition can lead to conflicting probability values. Salmon also considered the subjective interpretation, according to which probability “is simply a measure of degree of belief”, to be inadmissible (Salmon 1967a: 68). Salmon dealt separately with the interpretation he called personalistic, which he attributed to Savage. The distinctive feature of this approach—matching what is meant by the subjective interpretation today – is that it appeals to the betting scheme in order to determine probability values, and imposes coherence on systems of bets. Salmon claimed that the personalistic outlook satisfies the criteria of admissibility and ascertainability, but does not comply with applicability because it

leaves entirely unanswered our questions about inductive inference. It tolerates any kind of inference from the observed to the unobserved. (Salmon 1967a: 82)

Applicability also represented an obstacle for the logical interpretation, which was reputed “to provide no basis for expecting the probable in preference to the improbable” (Salmon 1967a: 79). In Salmon 1967a and elsewhere, notably Salmon 1967b, 1969 [2005], and 1975b [2005], Salmon discussed in great detail Carnap’s inductive logic, which he rated highly for shedding light on a number of important aspects of confirmation and induction. At the same time, he deemed that

the conception of inductive logic as based upon a logical relation is fundamentally misconceived […] although deductive logic requires and exploits logical relevance relations, induction is involved with factual relevance relations instead. (Salmon 1969 [2005: 202])

Moreover, Salmon disagreed with Carnap’s justification of induction in terms of inductive intuition (Carnap 1968). Salmon held the frequency interpretation to come closest to satisfying all of the adequacy requirements, although it faced serious difficulties with ascertainability, especially in connection with single case probability attributions. However, Salmon deemed the solution promising in terms of weight referred to homogeneous reference classes (§ 2.1). In addition, he regarded the frequency theory as the only interpretation offering a viable approach to the justification of induction.

In 1979d Salmon discussed the propensity interpretation put forward by Popper to solve the single case problem arising within quantum mechanics. The idea is that probability should be taken as a dispositional property of the experimental set-up, or the generating conditions of experiments, liable to be reproduced over and over again to form a sequence (Popper 1959). Salmon argued that Popper’s proposal fares no better than the frequentist way of attaching probability values to single occurrences of events. In fact, the difficulties faced by frequentists in connection with identifying homogeneous reference classes are displaced rather than solved by the propensity account, which requires completeness of information in order to describe the chance set-up generating propensities.

In addition, Salmon endorsed Paul Humphreys’ objection that propensities cannot qualify as probabilities because their dispositional character ascribes them a peculiar asymmetry that goes in the opposite direction from that characterizing inverse probability, making the propensity theory inapplicable to Bayes’ rule (Humphreys 1985). To take Salmon’s example,

suppose we are given a set of probabilities from which we can deduce that the probability that a certain person died as a result of being shot through the head is ¾. It would be strange, under these circumstances, to say that this corpse has a propensity (tendency?) of ¾ to have had its skull perforated by a bullet. (Salmon 1979d: 213)

While clashing with the symmetrical character of probabilities, the asymmetry of propensities matches that of the causal relation. In view of this, Salmon preferred to take propensities to be probabilistic causal tendencies rather than probabilities (see § 5.6).

Further reading: On Reichenbach see Salmon 1979a; Glymour & Eberhardt 2008 [2016]; and the 2011 special issue of the journal Synthese 181(1). On the interpretation of probability see Gillies 2000; Galavotti 2005; and Hájek 2002 [2012]. The debate on context of discovery vs. context of justification is surveyed in Schickore 2014. On the problem of induction see Henderson 2020.

3. Confirmation

3.1 Absolute vs. Incremental Confirmation

Salmon tackled the issue of confirmation of scientific hypotheses in Chapter VII of The Foundations of Scientific Inference and in a number of papers including 1973 and 1975b [2005]. He called attention to the difference between absolute confirmation, taken to mean making highly probable, and incremental, or relevance confirmation, taken to mean increasing the probability of some hypothesis. According to Salmon, the distinction, already made by Carnap in Logical Foundations of Probability, was largely overlooked by subsequent literature, although failure to appreciate it can yield puzzling results. For instance, Carnap showed that it can be the case that two pieces of evidence incrementally confirm a given hypothesis, while their conjunction may disconfirm it. In addition, Salmon pointed out that a piece of evidence that logically entails the falsity of the conjunction of two hypotheses could incrementally confirm each of them. In view of this and other puzzles, Salmon emphasized that “we have said very little when we have stated merely that a hypothesis h has been confirmed by evidence i” (Salmon 1975b [2005: 229]). Conversely, by appealing to Bayes’ rule “we can aspire to a much fuller understanding of relations of confirmation (in both the absolute and the relevance senses)” (Salmon 1975b [2005: 236]).

3.2 Salmon’s Objective Bayesianism

Like Reichenbach, Salmon assigned Bayes’ rule a crucial role in the confirmation of scientific hypotheses, convinced that the hypothetico-deductive (H-D) method dear to logical empiricism “is a gross oversimplification” (1968b [2005: 72]) unable to capture essential aspects of confirmation. His main reason for rejecting the H-D method was its inability to accommodate plausibility judgments, even though many examples from the history of science show that they have entered the choice between alternative hypotheses. It is precisely for that reason, Salmon argued, that many philosophers have denied that plausibility considerations belong to the logic of science, or claimed that they are part of the context of discovery rather than the context of justification. On the contrary, for Salmon plausibility considerations “are pervasive in the sciences; they play a significant—indeed, indispensable—role” (Salmon 1990d [2005: 98]). In particular, they can contribute to fixing the prior probability of hypotheses and hence fit very well in the Bayesian scheme and as such belong in the context of justification. Incidentally, Salmon considered Reichenbach’s distinction between a context of discovery and a context of justification, which a number of authors deem debatable, not only fruitful, but even essential for a proper understanding of the nature of scientific knowledge.

Salmon followed Reichenbach in embracing an objective version of Bayesianism according to which prior probabilities should be determined on the basis of objective and empirical criteria. Prior probabilities represent the “best estimates of the frequencies with which certain kinds of hypotheses succeed” (Salmon 1990d [2005: 102]), and must be fixed by means of (objective) criteria such as simplicity, symmetry and analogy. Analogy, in particular, is apt to suggest comparisons with other similar theories, whose rate of success in the past can be assessed. Salmon conceded that priors are sometimes the expression of rough estimates, and can be stated in terms of interval probabilities. In any case, he regarded prior probabilities as an essential component of hypothesis confirmation, as testified by many cases offered by the history of science. The fruitfulness of assuming a Bayesian perspective in studying the history of science is strongly emphasized:

Without the Bayesian analysis, one could say that the study of the history of science might have some (at least marginal) heuristic value for the scientist and philosopher of science; but with the Bayesian analysis, the data provided by the history of science constitute, in addition, an essential segment of the evidence relevant to the confirmation or disconfirmation of hypotheses. Philosophers of science and creative scientists ignore this fact at their peril. (Salmon 1970c [2005: 92])

Salmon identified the decisive advantage of the Bayesian method over the H-D with its being a tool for theory comparison, for which reason he recommended adopting its formulation in terms of ratios:

\[ \frac{p(T_1\mid E)}{p(T_2\mid E)} = \frac{p(T_1)p(E\mid T_1)}{p(T_2)p(E\mid T_2)} \]

where \(T_1\) and \(T_2\) are two alternative hypotheses, and E is a piece of evidence. Given the pivotal importance Kuhn ascribed to theory comparison, Salmon regarded the Bayesian method as a way of bridging the gap between the vision of science as an objective and rational enterprise, embraced by logical empiricists, and Kuhn’s critique of such view (Salmon 1990d [2005]). That said, it is worth noticing that taking in some of Kuhn’s insights Salmon adopts a somewhat moderate attitude, arguing “I must state immediately and emphatically that I do not believe for one moment that scientists use algorithms for purposes of choosing among scientific theories but if there were any such algorithms the theorem of Bayes would be the prime candidate” (Salmon 2005: 123, italics original).

Further reading: On confirmation see Crupi 2013 [2016] and Talbott 2001 [2016]. Hájek & Hitchcock (eds.) 2016 contains a number of essays on probability, confirmation, probabilistic causation, and related issues.

4. Space and Time

Salmon took an interest in the philosophy of space and time while attending Reichenbach’s courses as a graduate student at UCLA, and continued working on the topic for many years. His first publication in the field was the collection of essays Zeno’s Paradoxes (1970a), including contributions by Abner Shimony, Bertrand Russell, Henri Bergson, Max Black, J.O. Wisdom, James Thomson, Paul Benacerraf, G.E.L. Owen, and Adolf Grünbaum, plus a long introduction and an appendix on “Sets and Infinity” by Salmon himself. As stated at the beginning of the introduction, Salmon’s goal in bringing together the essays forming the collection was systematic rather than historical. His motivation lay in the conviction that after a long period in which Zeno’s paradoxes had been regarded as mere sophisms, from the middle of the Nineteenth and even more in the Twentieth century they had become the focus of sophisticated philosophical discussion. The articles included in the book tackle five of Zeno’s arguments, namely four paradoxes of motion and the paradox of plurality. At the heart of the paradoxes lies the problem of defining the notions of continuum and infinity. According to Salmon, such paradoxes cannot be solved in purely logical or mathematical terms because “it is also necessary to show how the abstract mathematical system can be used for the description of concrete physical reality” (Salmon 1970a: 16). It is worth noting that one of the chapters consists of a few pages taken from Russell’s Our Knowledge of the External World (1929) outlining his at-at theory of motion, which later played a key role within Salmon’s theory of causal processes (see § 5.5.2).

In 1975 Salmon published a second book called Space, Time and Motion: A Philosophical Introduction (1975a) which contains a masterly introduction to the topic. The four chapters of the book lead the non-specialist reader through the essentials of the philosophy of space and time from non-Euclidean geometries and Zeno’s paradoxes to special relativity and simultaneity. The book, which presupposes only an elementary background knowledge of geometry and mathematics on the part of the reader, is meant as an invitation to pursue the topics addressed in a more systematic and specialized way. Salmon fully achieved this purpose, whose treatment of thorny subjects succeeded in being both “scientifically sound” and “intuitive and easy” (Salmon 1988c: 276).

Salmon addressed simultaneity in other writings, including the article “The Philosophical Significance of the One-Way Speed of Light” (1977c) which contains a defense of simultaneity’s conventionality, dating back to Einstein and argued for in detail by Reichenbach (1928 [1957]). After surveying a number of experimental methods devised for the measurement of the speed of light, from Galileo to J. Bradley, H.L. Fizeau, and J.L. Foucault, Salmon went on to discuss synchrony, arguing that a conventional element is involved in all of such accounts. Since simultaneity rests on synchrony and ultimately on the one way speed of light, by showing that the latter cannot be ascertained experimentally Salmon intended to “give substance to the abstract conventionality issue” (Salmon 1977c: 255), namely to Einstein’s claim that the relation between the speed of light in two different directions is not a matter that can be established empirically, but only by convention.

Further reading: For a classical introduction to the philosophy of space and time see Grünbaum 1973. For a more recent account see Malament 2012. A collection of essays on the key problems of the philosophy of physics is contained in Batterman (ed.) 2013. An overview of the debate on the topic is to be found in Huggett, Nick, Carl Hoefer, and James Read, 2022.

5. Explanation and Causality

5.1 Beyond the Received View

Salmon tackled explanation in a highly original manner which left a most remarkable legacy. He worked intensively on the topic for the last thirty years of his life, refining his approach in response to comments and critiques raised by a number of authors, and shedding new light on various details. At the turn of the Seventies, when Salmon published his groundbreaking paper “Statistical Explanation” (Salmon 1970b [1971]) the literature was dominated by Hempel’s “covering law” model of explanation, which held sway since the Forties, and is often referred to as the received view. Salmon’s motivation for developing an alternative view of explanation stemmed from his dissatisfaction with certain aspects of Hempel’s account. In Four Decades of Scientific Explanation (Salmon 1990a) Salmon discussed a number of counterexamples showing that the requirements Hempel imposed on explanation, and more in particular the requirement of maximal specificity and the requirement of high inductive probability of the explanandum, are neither necessary nor sufficient to identify a tenable account of scientific explanation. In short, Salmon’s discontents focused on the impossibility of explaining low probability events, the secondary role assigned to causality, the thesis of the symmetry between explanation and prediction, the epistemic relativization of statistical explanation, and the insufficient importance ascribed to the notion of relevance.

Unlike Hempel, Salmon did not regard statistical explanation as somewhat incomplete compared to deductive explanation, taken as the optimum. By contrast, his approach to explanation takes statistical generalizations to be the general case, with explanations making use of universal generalizations as a special case. A pivotal role is assigned to the notion of relevance, more particularly statistical relevance, placed at the core of the Statistical-Relevance (or S-R) model. Equal importance is assigned to causality interpreted in a probabilistic fashion. By the Seventies, probabilistic causality had already attracted the attention of a number of authors including Hans Reichenbach (see Reichenbach 1956); building on this work Salmon intended to revive the mechanistic ideal of explanation, convinced that the time had come to put the “cause” back into “because”.

The notions of statistical relevance and probabilistic causality inform the two components of Salmon’s theory, namely the S-R model, aimed at identifying the network of statistical relations holding between the properties relevant to the events to be explained, and causal explanation, aimed at locating such events within the mechanisms responsible for their occurrence (Salmon 1984).

5.2 The S-R Model

According to the S-R model, in order to explain an event one must exhibit all the factors that are statistically relevant to its happening, without mentioning irrelevant elements, so that an explanatory account should include only information that is genuinely explanatory. In order to accomplish this task, the event explanandum must be referred to a homogeneous reference class, namely to the class containing all and only the relevant properties. Homogeneity is obtained through statistically relevant partitions of non-homogeneous reference classes into mutually exclusive and exhaustive sub-classes. Statistical relevance, providing the tool to attain homogeneity, is defined as follows. Let A stand for the reference class including some event of which one wants to establish the probability of possessing the property B; \(p (B \mid A)\) be the probability of B within the reference class A, and C be another property by which the class A can be divided into two sub-classes \((A \amp C)\) and \((A \amp \msim C)\); the property C is statistically relevant with respect to B in A if and only if \(p (B \amp C \mid A) \ne p (B \mid A)\). A homogeneous partition of a reference class does not admit further relevant partitions, and the resulting sub-classes must be maximal, in the sense that no irrelevant properties are retained.

In some cases partitioning a reference class A can result in two sub-classes \((A \amp C)\) and \((A \amp \msim C)\) both homogeneous with respect to a given property B. This means that property B is held by all elements belonging to class \((A \amp C)\), but none of the elements belonging to \((A \amp \msim C)\). In all other cases the class A will be partitioned into k homogeneous sub-classes \((A \amp C_{k})\) such that

\[p (B \mid A \amp C_{i}) \ne p (B \mid A \amp C_{j}),\]

for \(i \ne j\). Such a procedure is the content of a rule of multiple homogeneity which “expresses the fundamental condition for adequate explanation of particular events” (Salmon 1970b [1971: 59]). Fulfillment of this rule guarantees against the inclusion of irrelevant information in the explanatory account. Once the process leading to the specification of a homogeneous reference class is completed, the event to be explained is associated with a probability distribution. The shift from a non-homogeneous to a homogeneous reference class embodies the explanatory power of the S-R model, according to which

an explanation is an assemblage of factors that are statistically relevant to the occurrence of the event to be explained, accompanied by an associated probability distribution. (Salmon 1979c: 68)

The shift in question involves an increase in information, although not necessarily an increase in probability. Given that Salmon does not require relevance to be positive, the procedure described can result in a higher as well as a lower probability of the explanandum. In this perspective what counts for the sake of explanation is not high probability, as required by Hempel, but being in a position to assert that the probability distribution associated with the explanandum reflects the most complete and detailed information attainable. This information is conveyed by a homogeneous partition of the reference class, together with a statement specifying to which cell of that partition the explanandum event belongs.

As observed (§ 2.1), the objective homogeneity of the reference class is an ideal not free from difficulties, because one can hardly ever be sure to have taken into account all relevant information. Well aware of this, Salmon admits that in practice

we often lack full knowledge of the properties relevant to a given attribute, so we do not know whether our reference class is homogeneous or not. (Salmon 1970b [1971: 44])

Therefore, in most cases use is made of epistemically homogeneous reference classes, namely those relative to a given knowledge situation.

5.3 Explanations vs. Arguments

Salmon rejected Hempel’s tenet that an explanation is an argument, which he deemed the “third dogma of empiricism” (Salmon 1977a [1998]). His main objection was that although irrelevancies are harmless to arguments, they are fatal to explanations. In Salmon’s words:

Inference, whether deductive or inductive, demands a requirement of total evidence—a requirement that all relevant evidence be mentioned in the premises. This requirement, which has substantive importance for inductive inferences, is automatically satisfied for deductive inferences. Explanation, in contrast, seems to demand a further requirement—namely, that only considerations relevant to the explanandum be contained in the explanans. (Salmon 1977a [1998: 104])

Furthermore, arguments are not well suited to account for explanatory asymmetry, for there is a disparity of temporal asymmetry in explanations and in arguments that makes the latter fit for prediction and retrodiction, but unfit for explanation. Take for instance a lunar eclipse, which can be predicted on the basis of the laws of motion and a suitable set of initial conditions holding prior to it. The same eclipse can also be retrodicted making use of posterior conditions and the same laws. However, explanations are temporally asymmetric in a very specific sense: they go from antecedent conditions to subsequent events. Such asymmetry is not embodied by arguments, which often move in the opposite direction. There emerges a divergence between prediction, which is an inferential activity, and explanation, which is not.

The asymmetry of explanation reflects that of causation, which for Salmon is the key to a satisfactory explanatory account. While knowledge of correlations is usually sufficient to bolster prediction, explanation requires more, namely establishing causal relations between events. A favorite example mentioned by Salmon is that of “the barometer and the storm”. Based on the correlation between the behavior of the barometer and the occurrence of storms, one can predict a storm after having observed a sudden drop in the barometer, but nobody would say that the drop in the barometer explains the storm. In similar situations one would look for causal information, such as the sudden drop in atmospheric pressure in the area surrounding the occurrence of the storm. On the one hand, not all statistically relevant properties convey causal information; on the other, statistical correlations themselves invoke an explanation. In view of this, in the course of the Seventies Salmon gradually came to the conclusion that the S-R model cannot substantiate a satisfactory account of explanation. In a paper entitled “Why Ask ‘Why?’?” he maintained:

I no longer believe that the assemblage of relevant factors provides a complete explanation—or much of anything in the way of an explanation. We do, I believe, have a bona fide explanation of an event if we have a complete set of statistically relevant factors, the pertinent probability values, and causal explanations of the relevance relations (1978a [1998: 137]).

5.4 Causal Explanation

First of all, a theory of probabilistic causal explanation requires that a distinction can be made between statistical and causal relevance. The tool for that purpose is the screening off relation, defined as follows. Going back to the example of the barometer and the storm, let B stand for the barometer drop, S for the storm, and P for the drop in atmospheric pressure. There is a correlation between B and S, so that \(p (S \mid B) \gt p (S)\)—namely B is statistically relevant to S. But if we take into account P, we see that \(p (S \mid P \amp B) = p (S \mid P)\), namely B becomes irrelevant to S in the presence of P. This means that P screens off B from S. It should not pass unnoticed that the screening off relation is asymmetrical; in our example B does not screen off P from S, for \(p (S \mid P \amp B) \ne p (S \mid B)\). Salmon formulates a screening off rule requiring that those properties which are screened off by other properties are removed from the reference class. This makes screening off the canon guiding the search for homogeneous reference classes. Moreover, by virtue of its asymmetric character the screening off relation forges a bridge between statistical and causal relevance, obviously taken in a probabilistic sense.

5.4.1 The Principle of the Common Cause

Embedded in the Principle of the common cause, that Salmon borrowed from Reichenbach, screening off has the capacity to discern genuine from spurious causal links. In Reichenbach’s formulation, such principle states that “if an improbable coincidence has occurred, there must exist a common cause” (Reichenbach 1956: 157). Reichenbach named the structure underlying the principle of the common cause conjunctive fork, to be defined as follows. Take two events A and B which happen simultaneously more frequently than would be expected on the basis of pure chance. Then we have that \(p (A \amp B) \gt p (A) \times p (B)\), namely the two events are not independent. If in the presence of a third event C the correlation between A and B is absorbed, so that the two events become reciprocally independent if taken relative to C and \(\msim C\), we have a conjunctive fork. For a conjunctive fork the following relations hold:

\[ \begin{align} p (A \amp B\mid C) &= p (A\mid C) \times p (B\mid C)\\ p (A \amp B\mid \msim C) &= p (A\mid \msim C) \times p (B\mid \msim C)\\ p (A\mid C) &\gt p (A\mid \msim C)\\ p (B\mid C) &\gt p (B\mid \msim C). \end{align} \]

In other words, the common cause C screens off irrelevant properties from their effects. Salmon offers many examples of conjunctive forks. Here is one:

Suppose that two siblings contract mumps at the same time, and assume that neither caught the disease from the other. The coincidence is explained by the fact that they attended a birthday party and, by virtue of being in the same locale, both were exposed to another child who had the disease. This would constitute a typical example of a conjunctive fork. (Salmon 1984: 164)

Conjunctive forks possess a peculiar asymmetry, namely they are open to the future, never to the past. In Salmon’s words:

Since the statistical relations found in conjunctive forks are said to explain otherwise improbable coincidences, it follows that such coincidences are explained only in terms of common causes, never common effects. (Salmon 1984: 163)

Conjunctive forks provide the connection between the S-R model and causal explanation.

5.4.2 Interactive Forks

For several years Salmon thought that the combination of screening off and the common cause principle offered a solid basis on which causal explanation could be made to rest, but he later revised his position, after criticism from a number of authors including Bas van Fraassen (1977 and 1982). In order to cope with the difficulties besetting conjunctive forks Salmon formulated another type of fork, called interactive. Interactive forks depict causal interactions whose effects remain correlated even in the presence of the common cause; in other words the common cause does not screen off one effect from the other. The structure of interactive forks is analogous to that of conjunctive forks, with the difference that in this case the equality

\[p (A \amp B\mid C) = p (A\mid C) \times p (B\mid C)\]

does not hold, and in its place we have the inequality

\[p (A \amp B\mid C) \gt p (A\mid C) \times p (B\mid C).\]

To exemplify interactive forks Salmon mentions Compton scattering:

If, for example, an energetic photon collides with an electron in a Compton scattering experiment, there is a certain probability that a photon with a given smaller energy will emerge, and there is a certain probability that the electron will be kicked out with a given kinetic energy. […] However, because of the law of conservation of energy, there is a strong correspondence between the two energies: their sum must be close to the energy of the incident photon. Thus, the probability of getting a photon with energy \(E_1\) and an electron with energy \(E_2\), where \(E_1 + E_2\) is approximately equal to \(E\) (the energy of the incident photon), is much greater than the product of the probabilities of each energy occurring separately. (Salmon 1978a [1998: 133])

Although, in the absence of screening off, in interactive forks the common cause does not absorb the dependency between the effects, they play a crucial role within Salmon’s approach. Before this can be clarified some more notions must be introduced.

5.5 Causal Processes

The cornerstone of Salmon’s theory of probabilistic causality is the notion of a causal process, defined as a spatio-temporal continuous entity having the capacity to transmit “information, structure and causal influence” (Salmon 1994b [1998: 253]; see also Salmon 1984: 154–157). Processes are responsible for causal propagation, and provide the links connecting causes to effects. By opting for continuous processes, instead of causal chains conceived as collections of events, Salmon diverged from other theories of probabilistic causality, such as those put forward by Patrick Suppes, Irving John Good and Hans Reichenbach. Salmon was deeply convinced that the notion of a causal process can account for many puzzling cases, which other theories find difficult to handle (see Salmon 1980 [1998]). Furthermore, he regarded causal processes as “the kinds of causal connections Hume sought but was unable to find”, holding that “such connections do not violate Hume’s strictures against mysterious powers” (Salmon 1990b [1998: 71]). In order to characterize causal propagation, or transmission, Salmon borrowed from Reichenbach the concept of mark transmission, and from Bertrand Russell the at-at theory of causal propagation.

5.5.1 The Mark Method

Reichenbach introduced the mark method in The Philosophy of Space and Time (1928 [1957]) to distinguish causal processes from pseudo-processes. Unlike the latter, causal processes have the capacity to transmit marks, namely various sorts of signals or information. Salmon’s favorite example is that of a rotating spotlight placed at the center of a circular room, which casts a spot of light on the wall. The light beam that travels from the source to the wall is a causal process, whereas the light spot that moves around the wall is a pseudo-process. In order to convince us that the light ray is a genuine process, Salmon invites us to consider what happens if a red filter is placed near the source of the beam: the color of the beam will turn red, and so will the spot on the wall. By interposing a red filter between the source and the beam a mark has been introduced, which is then transmitted along the beam. By contrast, the moving spot on the wall is not a causal process, because it lacks the capacity to transmit information; if for instance someone were to place a piece of red cellophane on the wall at some point, the light would turn red when the beam hit the cellophane, but the color would not be retained as the spot moves on.

As Salmon emphasized, it is the ability to transmit marks that characterizes processes, not the fact that they actually do so:

a process is causal if it is capable of transmitting a mark, whether or not it is actually transmitting one. The fact that it has the capacity to transmit a mark is merely a symptom of the fact that it is actually transmitting something else. That other something I described as information, structure, and causal influence. (Salmon 1994b [1998: 253])

5.5.2 The At-At Theory

In order to account for mark transmission without violating the strictures of Hume’s critique and being exposed to the suspicion of introducing some occult causal power, Salmon drew inspiration from the theory of causal lines put forward by Russell in Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (1948). According to Salmon, Russell came very close to conceiving a notion of a causal process similar to his own, when he stated that

a causal line may always be regarded as the persistence of something—a person, table, a photon, or what not. Throughout a given causal line, there may be constancy of quality, constancy of structure. […] That there are such more or less self-determined causal processes is in no degree logically necessary, but is, I think, one of the fundamental postulates of science. (Russell 1948: 459, quoted from Salmon 1984: 144)

Although not completely satisfied with some aspects of Russell’s account, Salmon retained his at-at theory of motion, which he summarized as follows:

to move from A to B is simply to occupy the intervening points at the intervening instants. It consists in being at particular points of space at corresponding moments. (Salmon 1984: 153)

Applying the at-at theory to causal processes having the capacity to transmit marks results in stipulating that the transmission of a mark from a given point A in a process to some point B in the same process simply consists in the fact that it appears at each point between A and B. Incidentally, as observed earlier (§ 4) Salmon found Russell’s at-at theory of motion a satisfactory solution to Zeno’s arrow paradox (Salmon 1984: 151–153).

To the definition of processes in terms of the capacity to transmit a mark, Salmon added a counterfactual clause, to the effect that:

A mark that has been introduced into a process by means of a single intervention at point A is transmitted to point B if and only if it occurs at B and at all stages of the process between A and B without additional interventions. (Salmon 1977b [1998: 197], italics original; see also Salmon 1984: 148)

This move was made necessary to obviate a problem connected with a counterexample suggested by Nancy Cartwright. This can be summarized as follows: back to the example of the rotating spotlight, suppose that a few nanoseconds before a piece of red cellophane is placed on the wall and turns the moving spot red someone places a red lens on the rotating beacon, so that the beam remains red, not because of the cellophane placed on the wall, but because of the lens placed near the light source. In Salmon’s words:

in such a case the spot turns red owing to a local interaction and remains red without any additional local interaction. With or without the intervention on the wall, the spot of light moving around the wall would have been red from that point on. Considerations of such cases required a counterfactual formulation of the principle of mark transmission. (Salmon 1994b [1998: 252])

Notably, Salmon did not associate counterfactuals with the semantic view in terms of possible words, adopting instead an experimental interpretation according to which counterfactual statements make reference to observed statistical relations which can be tested by controlled experiments (Salmon 1984: 149–150).

Salmon’s view of processes has been criticized in various ways. In particular, Philip Kitcher (1989) found the experimental view of counterfactuals no more satisfactory than the attempts made by various authors to justify counterfactuals on semantic grounds. Phil Dowe also expressed dissatisfaction with Salmon’s account of causal processes, and suggested mark transmission to be abandoned in favor of an alternative definition in terms of conserved quantities, later adopted by Salmon.

5.5.3 The Conserved Quantities Approach

The process theory of causality in terms of conserved quantities proposed by Dowe is based on the following:

  • Definition 1. A causal interaction is an intersection of world lines which involves exchange of a conserved quantity.
  • Definition 2. A causal process is a world line of an object which manifests a conserved quantity (Dowe 1992: 210).

A world line is “the collection of points on a space-time (Minkowski) diagram which represents the history of an object”, and a conserved quantity “is any quantity universally conserved according to current scientific theories” (Dowe 1992: 210; see also Dowe 1995 and 2000). Examples of conserved quantities mentioned by Dowe are mass-energy, linear momentum, angular momentum, and charge. Salmon regarded with favor Dowe’s proposal and accepted a slightly modified version of it, according to which

A process transmits a conserved quantity between A and B \((A \ne B)\) if and only if it possesses [a fixed amount of] this quantity at A and at B and at every stage of the process between A and B without any interactions in the open interval \((A,B)\) that involve an exchange of that particular conserved quantity. (Salmon 1997: 462, italics original)

Salmon deemed a decisive advantage of conserved quantities over mark transmission the fact that causal processes are defined in terms of characteristics they actually possess, rather than of their capacity to transmit marks. This makes it unnecessary to appeal to counterfactuals. Moreover, the conserved quantities approach allows one to handle intersections that are untreatable by the mark method, such as those of Y and \(\lambda\) types. These obtain whenever two processes merge into one—for instance, when a snake swallows a mouse—or two processes emerge from one—for instance, when a single-celled organism splits into two cells. A major difference with Dowe’s approach is Salmon’s insistence upon causal transmission, as opposed to the mere possession of conserved quantities, so that “a process is causal if and only if it transmits a conserved quantity” (Salmon 2010: 10; see also Salmon 1997). The capacity to transmit conserved quantities provides an easy way to distinguish causal from pseudo processes, which do not have that capacity. The at-at theory of transmission is retained, to mean that a conserved quantity “is at the appropriate place at the appropriate stage in the process” (Salmon 2010: 10). The mark method keeps an important role as a tool for detecting causal relationships.

5.5.4 Causal Production

Another fundamental ingredient of Salmon’s theory of causality is the notion of production. Causal production takes place whenever two processes intersect each other in such a way that their structure is modified, and the modification will be propagated by processes until another interaction takes place. The kind of intersection between processes that gives rise to causal production is described by interactive forks.

Processes and conjunctive and interactive forks are the ingredients of the mechanistic picture of the world that Salmon had in mind. Conjunctive and interactive forks represent two different ways in which processes can intersect one another, and fulfill different tasks within Salmon’s perspective. Thanks to their screening off capacity, conjunctive forks detect order and asymmetries among the causal connections forming mechanisms, whereas interactive forks are the sites of causal production. The temporal asymmetry characterizing conjunctive forks is absent from interactive forks, which describe physical interactions taking place at a certain moment in a certain place. Interactive forks are more basic than conjunctive forks, because they express a causal concept which can be “explicated without recourse to other causal concepts” (Salmon 1994b [1998: 249]). Salmon called attention to the fact that

there is a striking difference between conjunctive common causes on the one hand and causal processes and interactions on the other. Causal processes and causal interactions seem to be governed by basic laws of nature in ways that do not apply to conjunctive forks. […] Although I am not prepared to argue the case in detail, it seems plausible to suppose that all fundamental physical interactions can be regarded as exemplifications of the interactive fork. Conjunctive common causes are not nearly as closely tied to the laws of nature. […] in contrast to causal processes and causal interactions, conjunctive forks depend crucially on de facto background conditions. (Salmon 1982a [1998: 299])

5.6 Two Levels of Explanation

Unlike conjunctive forks, causal processes and interactions cannot be defined in purely statistical terms. To stress this crucial difference, Salmon referred to statistical causality in terms of screening off and conjunctive forks, and aleatory causality in terms of processes and interactive forks. Aleatory causality “places primary emphasis on the mechanisms of causality” (Salmon 1990c [1998: 207]) and informs us about how phenomena fit within the mechanisms responsible for their occurrence. Statistical regularities are all that is needed by statistical causality, whereas aleatory causality requires more, namely the possibility to speak of tendencies that are both causal and probabilistic. Salmon thought that propensities, taken as causal probabilistic tendencies (§ 2.3), prove fruitful in that connection, and held that:

if we think of propensities as probabilistic causes, we can use the concepts of causal processes and causal mechanisms in order to explain the mechanisms of probabilistic causality. (Salmon 1990c [1998: 205])

To the two kinds of causality described by Salmon there correspond two different levels of explanation: (1) the S-R model, which concerns connections between kinds of events, and (2) causal mechanical explanation, which bears upon single events. It should not pass unnoticed that while explanation of the first level, based on statistical correlations, provides a good basis for prediction, explanation in terms of aleatory causality traces back the history of events after their occurrence. In the Eighties, Salmon thought that only aleatory causality could offer an adequate understanding of causality and regarded the causal mechanical level as genuine explanation, assigning an ancillary role to the S-R level.

In a penetrating discussion Christopher Hitchcock observed that Salmon’s causal mechanical explanation was too weak, because it envisaged a geometrical network of processes and interactions but did not convey any hint as to what properties should be taken as explanatory. In agreement with Woodward (1984), Hitchcock held that explanation should answer “what-if-things-had-been-different” questions, and claimed that

a successful account of explanation had better make the relation of explanatory relevance look roughly like that of counterfactual dependence. (Hitchcock 1995: 311)

According to Hitchcock

our demand that explanations provide relevant information requires something stronger—that we be told which earlier properties the properties specified in the explanandum depend upon. (Hitchcock 1995: 311)

a requisite Salmon’s definition of processes and causal transmission does not meet. By way of a counterexample, Hitchcock observed that based on Salmon’s theory a blue spot impressed on a billiard ball by a stick on which a player had put blue chalk would count as a mark transmitted by a causal process, and furthermore one would be unable to tell why the linear momentum of the billiard ball should be included in the explanation of its movement, whereas the blue mark should not.

In reply to Hitchcock, Salmon revised his position by ascribing equal significance to the two levels of explanation. In “A Reply to Two Critiques” he wrote:

I would now say (1) that statistical relevance relations, in the absence of connecting causal processes, lack explanatory import and (2) that connecting causal processes, in the absence of statistical relevance relations, also lack explanatory import. […] Both are indispensable. (Salmon 1997: 476)

The causal model in terms of processes was compared to a telephone network which exhibits the lines of communications and the connections, but does not convey any information about the messages that are sent. In order to identify the properties pertinent to given outcomes one needs information on statistical relevance relations; the procedure of singling out such properties results from an interplay between causal and statistical relevance information. On the one hand, a network of causal processes and interactions serves to exclude irrelevant factors which are not there at the considered place and time; on the other, the network has to be filled with statistical relevance relations linking the properties present.

Contextually, Salmon admitted that counterfactual considerations play a role within explanation, and reaffirmed a close connection between statistical relevance relations and counterfactuals. To take Salmon’s example,

when asserting that a window was shattered because it was struck by a baseball traveling at a considerable velocity, we presumably have in mind that the window would not have broken if the intersection with the baseball had not occurred. (Salmon 1997: 475)

Such a counterfactual is deemed unproblematic because it is supported by well-established assertions of statistical relevance, which are nothing other than reports of observed relative frequencies.

5.7 Ontic Conception

Salmon termed his conception of explanation ontic, as opposed to the epistemic conception heralded by Hempel, and the erotetic approach defended by van Fraassen (Salmon 1985a [1998] and 1982b [1998]). According to the ontic viewpoint events are explained by showing how they fit into the mechanisms operating in the world, and the causal processes and interactions of which mechanisms are compounded are physical entities. In Salmon’s words:

To understand the world and what goes on in it, we must expose its inner workings. To the extent that causal mechanisms operate, they explain how the world works. […] A detailed knowledge of the mechanisms may not be required for successful prediction; it is indispensable to the attainment of genuine scientific understanding. (Salmon 1984: 133)

Albeit he never gave up the task of developing an objective and realistic concept of explanation, in the Nineties Salmon granted the importance of pragmatic considerations in connection with causal explanation. In this vein, he admitted that causal analysis can be performed at different levels of detail, depending on the circumstances. In some cases, phenomena can be analyzed in great detail, based on scientific theories, but more often they can be examined at varying degrees of abstraction, determined by the context. In “A Realistic Account of Causation”, published posthumously in 2002, Salmon argued that

the major obstacle to the creation of a fully objective and realistic theory of cause-effect relations is the fact that the instances we tend to select are highly context dependent. (Salmon 2002: 123)

After examining a number of examples he concluded that “cause-effect statements are almost always—if not always—context dependent” (Salmon 2002: 125).

That said, Salmon retained the idea of a complete causal structure including all the processes and interactions operating in a certain space-time region. Such a concept bears some resemblance to Peter Railton’s “ideal explanatory text” (Railton 1981), the difference being that Railton has a text in mind, while Salmon’s complete causal structure is a physical entity. The most important feature characterizing the complete causal structure is its objectivity: “the complete causal structure is a fact of nature that exists quite independently of our knowledge or interests” (Salmon 2002: 126).

The role played by scientific theories within Salmon’s mechanistic view should not pass unnoticed. Both causal production and processes defined in terms of conserved quantities include an appeal to theories and laws of nature, because only “our current theories tell us what quantities to think of as conserved” (Salmon 1994b [1998: 258]). Similarly, to describe causal interactions one must appeal to laws such as the conservation of energy and momentum. This led Salmon to conclude:

I realize that the theory I am proposing has a highly reductionistic flavor. It seems to me that my account should hold in the natural sciences—including biology, but not quantum mechanics—I am not confident that it is suitable for psychology and the social sciences. (Salmon 2002: 131)

A similar conclusion, which further clarifies Salmon’s attitude towards reductionism, is to be found in “The Causal Structure of the World”:

Finally, although my tone in this talk has been rather reductionistic, I do not hold a reductionist point of view. It is quite possible that other kinds of causation are present in such areas as psychology and sociology, where human intentions and interrelations are involved. Physical causation must apply at the basic level of perception and communication, but there may be more. I would not commit myself to a reductionist—or antireductionist—viewpoint unless I had at least an acceptable solution to the mind-body problem, and that is something I don’t have at present, and I doubt that I’ll ever find one in my lifetime. (Salmon 2010: 12)

Further reading: On Hempel’s theory of explanation see Hempel 1965 and Fetzer 2010 [2017]. On the notion of probabilistic causality and the relative debate see Hitchcock 1997 [2016] and Beebe, Hitchcock & Menzies (eds.) 2009. Salmon’s view of a causal process and Dowe’s conserved quantities theory are discussed in Dowe 2000. The debate on explanation is surveyed in Woodward 2003 [2017].

Salmon’s theory of causal explanation had a strong impact on the literature, especially in connection with the biological and medical sciences. Bringing to the fore the notion of mechanism, Salmon stimulated the formation of the so-called ‘new mechanicism’, see Glennan 2017, and spurred a renewed interest in the process approach to explanation, see among others Damman 2020, and Nicholson & Dupré (eds.) 2018.

6. Rationality and Realism

6.1 Rationality

Causal explanation, probability, and the Bayesian method are the key ingredients of Salmon’s view of rationality, which is strictly entrenched with his version of realism. A further ingredient is the notion of propensity taken as causal tendency (see § 2.3). Salmon’s “Rationality and Objectivity in Science” (1990d [2005]) defines three grades of rationality standing in different relationships with objectivity. The first kind of rationality has no connection with objectivity and is identified with the coherence of degrees of conviction, a key requirement of the Bayesian method. This is called static rationality. Bayesian conditionalization, offering a tool to update one’s degree of conviction, shapes a stronger type of rationality called kinematic. The highest grade of rationality is called dynamic, and involves a closer connection with objectivity.

Dynamic rationality is dealt with in some detail in “Dynamic Rationality: Propensity, Probability, and Credence” (1988b [2005]). This kind of rationality revolves around the tenet that rational action must obey the maxim: Respect the frequencies. For it to be accomplished, credence, or the degree of conviction leading to action, must be empirically informed, namely it should take into account objective facts. Salmon holds that explanation has a crucial role in that connection because causal knowledge of phenomena provides the optimal basis for action. The notion of propensity is deemed no less fundamental and is assigned the purpose of bridging the gap between objective probabilities, namely frequencies, and personal probabilities on whose basis people act. Personal probabilities should not be construed in a subjective sense, not only because for Salmon subjectivism is not an admissible interpretation of probability (§ 2.3), but more generally because subjective opinions cannot be taken to offer good grounds for rational action. Rational action can only be based on rational degrees of conviction, the emphasis being on rational as opposed to merely subjective.

As Salmon observed,

it is the operations of physical devices having […] propensities—chance setups, including our own actions—that produce the actual short-run frequencies, on which our fortunes depend, as well as the long-run frequencies which I am calling probabilities. (Salmon 1988b [2005: 148])

Assigning a propensity to a chance setup amounts to making a causal hypothesis, which can be evaluated by means of Bayes’ rule. Since Salmon’s objective Bayesianism (§ 3.2) holds that prior probabilities are determined on the basis of observed frequencies, the latter are the cornerstone on which the whole procedure of confirming the hypotheses about propensities rests. To sum up, dynamic rationality

consists in the attempt to use propensities—i.e., probabilistic causes—as the weighting factors that occur in the formula for expected utility. Since we cannot be sure that our choices and decisions will be fully efficacious in bringing about desired results, it is reasonable to rely on the strengths of probabilistic causes. This line of thought treats our voluntary choices, decisions, and actions as probabilistic causes of what happens as a result of our deliberations. Dynamic rationality involves a propensity-driven view of objective probabilities and short-run frequencies. (Salmon 1988b [2005: 150])

6.2 Realism

Deeply convinced of the tenability of scientific realism, Salmon argued in favor of its compatibility with empiricism. His argument revolves around what he calls the key question, phrased as follows:

Do we have empirical evidence that gives us just about as much reason to believe in the existence of such entities as molecules, atoms, ions, and subatomic particles as we have for our belief in middle-sized material objects? (Salmon 2005: 32)

The possibility of combining empiricism and realism is made to depend on an affirmative answer to this question, which Salmon claimed had not been given serious consideration by most philosophers of science, including van Fraassen, whose constructive empiricism implies a negative answer to the key question, and therefore the incompatibility between empiricism and realism.

In order to provide an affirmative answer to the key question, Salmon once again drew inspiration from Reichenbach’s work. In Experience and Prediction Reichenbach tackled the issue of our knowledge of the external world by means of a fictional example. He imagined a “cubical world” whose inhabitants cannot penetrate either the walls or the ceiling, made of a translucent substance. In Salmon’s words:

As a result of a complicated arrangement of lights and mirrors, shadows of the birds outside of the cube are projected onto the ceiling and the left-hand wall. The inhabitants of the cubical world can see the shadows cast by the external birds, but they cannot see the actual birds, mirrors, or lighting system. For beings in the cubical world, the birds are truly unobserved entities. (Salmon 1999: 303)

After careful observations, a scientist in the cubical world notices there are correlations between the shadows on the ceiling and those on the wall. After having repeatedly observed such correlations, the scientist infers the probabilistic hypothesis that there must exist something responsible for the shadows seen on the walls and ceiling. The reasoning leading to that conclusion is nothing other than an inference to a common cause. Although the principle of the common cause (see § 5.4.1) was introduced by Reichenbach in The Direction of Time, published posthumously in 1956, and does not appear at all in Experience and Prediction (1938), Salmon conjectured that the idea was already there, as testified by Reichenbach’s tenet that any physicist who happens to repeatedly observe some coincidences “will not believe in a matter of chance but will look for a causal connection” (Reichenbach 1938: 121).

For Salmon, the fundamental role played by the principle of the common cause in connection with realism was testified by a great many examples in the history of science, his favorite being Perrin’s ascertainment of Avogadro’s number around 1912. As recounted by Mary Jo Nye in Molecular Reality (1972), after Perrin showed that Avogadro’s number could be determined by means of thirteen different methods, all producing results in close agreement, the community of physicists was convinced of the reality of atoms and molecules. According to Salmon, Perrin’s conclusion was reached by means of an inductive reasoning which “can appropriately be schematized as a type of common cause argument” (Salmon 1985b [2005: 17]). From this and other examples Salmon concluded that a powerful method for inferring hypotheses from empirical evidence of regularities, the principle of the common cause provides a tool for inferring unobservables from observables.

This, however, is only part of the story. Salmon believed that the answer to the key question “lies in connecting the common cause principle and Bayes’s theorem” (Salmon 1994a [2005: 25]). Although crediting him for having grasped the same idea, Salmon found Reichenbach’s treatment incomplete, because it contains only sketchy remarks in that regard. He therefore set himself the task of working out a detailed argument, spelled out in “Ornithology in a Cubical World” (1999) and “An Empiricist Argument for Realism” published as Chapter 3 of Reality and Rationality. In Salmon’s own words, his purpose was:

to show how the considerations that convinced serious physical scientists of the reality of atoms and molecules in the early years of the twentieth century provide a philosophically sound argument for realism that does not exceed the bounds of empiricism. (2005: x)

In a nutshell, the fruitfulness of combining Bayes’ rule with the principle of the common cause amounts to the fact that those hypotheses which embody information on common causes are apt to be assigned higher prior probabilities than hypotheses which involve mere coincidences.

Salmon reached this conclusion by scrutinizing the way scientists achieved a number of important findings, such as the existence of atoms and molecules. His in-depth analysis of case studies belonging to the history of science, carried out with respect to both microscopic objects and the submicroscopic domain, confers on Salmon’s argument for realism a peculiar significance and originality.

Further reading: The volume Reality and Rationality (Salmon 2005) contains many articles on Salmon’s views on rationality and realism.


The reader is invited to see three collections of essays dealing with the various aspects of Salmon’s work: McLaughlin (ed.) 1982 including Salmon’s “Further Reflections” provoked by the essays appearing in the volume and his “Autobiographical Note”; Fetzer (ed.) 1988 ending with an “Epilogue” containing a very useful “Publications: An Annotated Bibliography” (up to 1986); and Galavotti & Pagnini (eds.) 1999 containing “Comments” by Wesley and Merrilee Salmon on the articles published in the collection. For a complete bibliography of Salmon’s writings up to 2005 see Salmon 2005. The 2002 Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association hosted “Wesley Salmon 1925–2001: A Symposium Honoring His Contribution to the Philosophy of Science” with papers by Adolf Grünbaum, Phil Dowe, Christopher Hitchcock, Paul Humphreys, and Lawrence Sklar: see Mitchell (ed.) 2004.

Primary Literature: Works by Salmon

  • 1953, “The Uniformity of Nature”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 14(1): 39–48. doi:10.2307/2104014
  • 1956, “Regular Rules of Induction”, Philosophical Review, 65(3): 385–388. doi:10.2307/2182147
  • 1957, “Should We Attempt to Justify Induction?”, Philosophical Studies, 8(3): 33–38. doi:10.1007/BF02308902
  • 1961, “Vindication of Induction”, in Herbert Feigl and Grover Maxwell (eds.), Current Issues in the Philosophy of Science, New York: Holt, Rinehart, and Winston, pp. 245–256.
  • 1963a, Logic, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall. Second edition 1973; third edition 1984.
  • 1963b, “Inductive Inference”, in Bernard H. Baumrin (ed.), Philosophy of Science: The Delaware Seminar (Volume II), New York: Wiley, pp. 341–370.
  • 1963c, “On Vindicating Induction”, in Philosophy of Science, 30(3): 252–261, doi:10.1086/287939; reprinted in Henry Ely Kyburg Jr. and Ernest Nagel (eds.), Induction: Some Current Issues, Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press, pp. 27–41 (page references to the reprint).
  • 1965, “The Concept of Inductive Evidence”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 2(4): 1–6.
  • 1967a, The Foundations of Scientific Inference, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press. 50th Anniversary edition, with a new introduction by Christopher Hitchcock, 2017.
  • 1967b, “Carnap’s Inductive Logic”, Journal of Philosophy, 64(21): 725–739. doi:10.2307/2023856
  • 1968a, “The Justification of Inductive Rules of Inference”, in Lakatos (ed.) 1968: 24–43. “Reply”, in Lakatos (ed.) 1968: 74–97.
  • 1968b [2005], “Inquiries into the Foundations of Science”, in David L. Arm (ed.), Vistas in Science, Albuquerque: University of New Mexico Press, pp. 1–24. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 65–82.
  • 1969 [2005], “Partial Entailment as a Basis for Inductive Logic”, in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), Essays in Honor of Carl G. Hempel, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 47–82. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 184–209.
  • 1970a, Zeno’s Paradoxes, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill (edited). Second edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2001.
  • 1970b [1971], “Statistical Explanation”, in Robert Colodny (ed.), The Nature and Function of Scientific Theories, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, pp. 173–232. Reprinted in Salmon 1971: 29–87.
  • 1970c [2005], “Bayes’s Theorem and the History of Science”, in Roger H. Stuewer (ed.), Historical and Philosophical Perspectives of Science, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 5), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 68–86. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 83–92. [Salmon 1970c available online]
  • 1971, Statistical Explanation and Statistical Relevance, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press (with contributions by Richard C. Jeffrey and James G. Greeno).
  • 1973, “Confirmation”, Scientific American, 228(5): 75–83.
  • 1975a, Space, Time, and Motion: A Philosophical Introduction, Encino, CA: Dickenson Publishing Co. Second edition 1981.
  • 1975b [2005], “Confirmation and Relevance”, in Grover Maxwell and Robert M. Anderson Jr. (eds.), Induction, Probability, and Confirmation, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 6), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 3–36. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 210–236. [Salmon 1975b available online]
  • 1977a, “A Third Dogma of Empiricism”, in Robert E. Butts and Jaakko Hintikka (eds.), Basic Problems in Methodology and Linguistics, Dordrecht: Reidel, 149–166. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 95–107. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-0837-1_10
  • 1977b [1998], “An ‘At-At’ Theory of Causal Influence”, Philosophy of Science, 44(2): 215–224. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 193–199. doi:10.1086/288739
  • 1977c, “The Philosophical Significance of the One-Way Speed of Light”, Noûs, 11(3): 253–292. doi:10.2307/2214765
  • 1978a [1998], “Why Ask ‘Why?’? An Inquiry Concerning Scientific Explanation”, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 51(6): 683–705. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 125–141. doi:10.2307/3129654
  • 1978b, “Unfinished Business: The Problem of Induction”, Philosophical Studies, 33(1): 1–19. doi:10.1007/BF00354278
  • 1979a, Hans Reichenbach: Logical Empiricist, Dordrecht: Reidel, edited.
  • 1979b, “The Philosophy of Hans Reichenbach”, in Salmon 1979a: 1–84. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-9404-1_1
  • 1979c, “Alternative Models of Scientific Explanation”, American Anthropologist, 81(1): 61–74 (with Merrilee H. Salmon). doi:10.1525/aa.1979.81.1.02a00050
  • 1979d, “Propensities: A Discussion Review”, Erkenntnis14(2): 183–216. doi:10.1007/BF00196732
  • 1980 [1998], “Probabilistic Causality”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 61(1–2): 50–74. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 208–232. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0114.1980.tb00004.x
  • 1981 [1988a], “Rational Prediction”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 32(2): 115–125. Reprinted in Salmon 1988a: 47–60. doi:10.1093/bjps/32.2.115
  • 1982a [1998], “Causality: Production and Propagation”, in Peter D. Asquith et al. (eds.), PSA 1980, East Lansing, Mich.: Philosophy of Science Association, volume 2, pp. 49–69. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 285–301. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1980.2.192586
  • 1982b [1998], “Comets, Pollen, and Dreams: Some Reflections on Scientific Explanation”, in McLaughlin (ed.) 1982: 261–275. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 50–67. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-7731-0_7
  • 1982c, “Further Reflections”, in McLaughlin (ed.) 1982: 231–283. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-7731-0_11
  • 1984, Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • 1985a [1998], “Scientific Explanation: Three Basic Conceptions”, in Peter D. Asquith and Philip Kitcher (eds.), PSA 1984, East Lansing, Mich.: Philosophy of Science Association, volume 2, pp. 293–305. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 320–329. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1984.2.192510
  • 1985b [2005], “Empiricism: The Key Question”, in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), The Heritage of Logical Positivism, Lanham, MD: University Press of America, pp. 1–21. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 7–18.
  • 1988a, The Limitations of Deductivism, Berkeley/Los Angeles/London: University of California Press (co-edited with Adolf Grünbaum).
  • 1988b, “Dynamic Rationality: Propensity, Probability, and Credence”, in Fetzer (ed.) 1988: 126–151. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 126–151. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-3997-4_1
  • 1988c, “Publications: An Annotated Bibliography”, in Fetzer (ed.) 1988: 271–336. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-3997-4_14
  • 1989, Scientific Explanation, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 13), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press (co-edited with Philip Kitcher). [Salmon 1989 available online]
  • 1990a, Four Decades of Scientific Explanation, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. Reprinted with a foreword by Paul Humphreys, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 2006.
  • 1990b [1998], “Scientific Explanation: Causation and Unification”, Critica, 22(66): 3–21. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 68–78. [Salmon 1990b available online]
  • 1990c [1998], “Causal Propensities: Statistical Causality vs. Aleatory Causality”, Topoi, 9(2): 95–100. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 200–207. doi:10.1007/BF00135890
  • 1990d [2005], “Rationality and Objectivity in Science, or Tom Kuhn Meets Tom Bayes”, in C. Wade Savage (ed.), Scientific Theories, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume 14), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 175–204. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 93–116. [Salmon 1990d available online]
  • 1991, “Hans Reichenbach’s Vindication of Induction”, Erkenntnis, 35(1/3): 99–122.
  • 1994a [2005], “Carnap, Hempel, and Reichenbach on Scientific Realism”, in Wesley C. Salmon and Gereon Wolters (eds.), Logic, Language, and the Structure of Scientific Theories, Pittsburgh/Konstanz: University of Pittsburgh Press/ Universitätsverlag Konstanz, pp. 237–254. Reprinted in Salmon 2005: 19–30.
  • 1994b, “Causality Without Counterfactuals”, Philosophy of Science, 61(2): 297–312. Reprinted in Salmon 1998: 248–260. doi:10.1086/289801
  • 1997, “Causality and Explanation: A Reply to Two Critiques”, Philosophy of Science, 64(3): 461–477. doi:10.1086/392561
  • 1998, Causality and Explanation, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195108647.001.0001
  • 1999, “Ornithology in a Cubical World: Reichenbach on Scientific Realism”, in Daniel Greenberger et al. (eds.), Epistemological and Experimental Perspectives on Quantum Physics, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 303–315. doi:10.1007/978-94-017-1454-9_32
  • 2002, “A Realistic Account of Causation”, in Michele Marsonet (ed.), The Problem of Realism, Aldershot and Burlington, VT: Ashgate Publishing, pp. 106–134.
  • 2005, Reality and Rationality, Phil Dowe and Merrilee H. Salmon (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • 2010, “The Causal Structure of the World”, Metatheoria, 1(1): 1–13. [Salmon 2010 available online]

Secondary Literature

  • Batterman, Robert (ed.), 2013, The Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Physics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780195392043.001.0001
  • Beebe, Helen, Christopher Hitchcock, and Peter Menzies (eds.), 2009, The Oxford Handbook of Causation, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Carnap, Rudolf, 1950, Logical Foundations of Probability, Chicago: Chicago University Press, 2nd edition 1962.
  • –––, 1968, “Inductive Logic and Inductive Intuition”, in Lakatos (ed.) 1968: 258–267.
  • Clendinnen, F. John, 1982, “Rational Expectation and Simplicity”, in McLaughlin (ed.) 1982: 1–25. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-7731-0_1
  • Crupi, Vincenzo, 2013 [2016], “Confirmation”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2016/entries/confirmation/>.
  • Damman, Olaf, 2020, Etiological Explanations. Illness Causation Theory, Boca Raton (FL): CRC Press.
  • Dowe, Phil, 1992, “Wesley Salmon’s Process Theory of Causality and the Conserved Quantity Theory”, Philosophy of Science, 59(2): 195–216. doi:10.1086/289662
  • –––, 1995, “Causality and Conserved Quantities: A Reply to Salmon”, Philosophy of Science, 62(2): 321–333. doi:10.1086/289859
  • –––, 2000, Physical Causation, Cambridge-New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511570650
  • Feigl, Herbert, 1950, “De Principiis non Disputandum?”, in Max Black (ed.), Philosophical Analysis: A Collection of Essays, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp. 119–156.
  • Fetzer, James H. (ed.), 1988, Probability and Causality: Essays in Honor of Wesley C. Salmon, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • –––, 2010 [2017], “Carl Hempel”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2017/entries/hempel/>.
  • Galavotti, Maria Carla, 2005, Philosophical Introduction to Probability, Stanford: CSLI.
  • Galavotti, Maria Carla and Alessandro Pagnini (eds.), 1999, Experience, Reality, and Scientific Explanation. Essays in Honor of Merrilee and Wesley Salmon, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Gillies, Donald, 2000, Philosophical Theories of Probability, London-New York: Routledge.
  • Glennan, Stuart, 2017, The New Mechanical Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Glymour, Clark and Frederick Eberhardt, 2008 [2016], “Hans Reichenbach”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2016/entries/reichenbach/>.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf, 1973, Philosophical Problems of Space and Time, (2nd enlarged edition) Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1965, “Salmon’s Vindication of Induction”, Journal of Philosophy, 62(10): 260–266. doi:10.2307/2023299
  • –––, 1968, “One Problem about Induction”, in Lakatos (ed.) 1968: 44–59.
  • Hájek, Alan, 2002 [2012], “Interpretations of Probability”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, (Winter 2012 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2012/entries/probability-interpret/>.
  • Hájek, Alan and Christopher Hitchcock (eds.), 2016, The Oxford Handbook of Probability and Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hempel, Carl Gustav, 1965, Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Other Essays in the Philosophy of Science, New York: The Free Press.
  • Henderson, Leah, “The Problem of Induction”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2020 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2020/entries/induction-problem/>.
  • Hitchcock, Christopher Read, 1995, “Discussion: Salmon on Explanatory Relevance”, Philosophy of Science, 62(2): 304–320. doi:10.1086/289858
  • –––, 1997 [2016], “Probabilistic Causation”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2016/entries/causation-probabilistic/>.
  • Huggett, Nick, Carl Hoefer, and James Read, 2022, “Absolute and Relational Space and Motion: Post-Newtonian Theories”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2022/entries/spacetime-theories/>.
  • Humphreys, Paul, 1985, “Why Propensities Cannot be Probabilities”, The Philosophical Review, 94(4): 557–570. doi:10.2307/2185246
  • Kitcher, Philip, 1989, “Explanatory Unification and the Causal Structure of the World”, in Salmon [with Kitcher] (eds.) 1989: 410–505. [Kitcher 1989 available online]
  • Lakatos, Imre (ed.), 1968, The Problem of Inductive Logic: Proceedings of the International Colloquium in the Philosophy of Science, London, 1965 (Volume II), Amsterdam: North-Holland.
  • Malament, David, 2012, Topics in the Foundations of General Relativity and Newtonian Gravitation Theory, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • McLaughlin, Robert (ed.), 1982, What? Where? When? Why?, Dordrecht: Reidel. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-7731-0
  • Mitchell, Sandra D. (ed.), 2004. PSA02, Part II: Symposia Papers, Philosophy of Science, 71(5): 922–959.
  • Nicholson, Daniel J. and Dupré, John (eds.), 2018, Everything Flows. Towards a Processual Philosophy of Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nye, Mary Jo, 1972, Molecular Reality: A Perspective on the Scientific Work of Jean Perrin, London: Macdonald.
  • Popper, Karl, 1959, “The Propensity Interpretation of Probability”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 10(37): 25–42. doi:10.1093/bjps/X.37.25
  • Railton, Peter, 1981, “Probability, Explanation, and Information”, Synthese, 48(2): 233–256. doi:10.1007/BF01063889
  • Reichenbach, Hans, 1928 [1957], The Philosophy of Space and Time, New York: Dover.
  • –––, 1935 [1949], The Theory of Probability, Berkeley-Los Angeles: University of California Press, page reference is to the 2nd edition, 1971.
  • –––, 1936, “Logicist Empiricism in Germany and the Present State of its Problems”, Journal of Philosophy, 33(6): 141–160. doi:10.2307/2015405
  • –––, 1938, Experience and Prediction, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • –––, 1956, The Direction of Time, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1929, Our Knowledge of the External World, New York: Norton & Company.
  • –––, 1948, Human Knowledge. Its Scope and Limits, New York: Simon and Schuster.
  • Schickore, Jutta, 2014, “Scientific Discovery”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2014/entries/scientific-discovery/>.
  • Talbott, William, 2001 [2016], “Bayesian Epistemology”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2016/entries/epistemology-bayesian/>.
  • van Fraassen, Bas, 1977, “The Pragmatics of Explanation”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 14(2): 143–150.
  • –––, 1982, “Rational Belief and the Common Cause Principle”, in McLaughlin (ed.) 1982: 193–209. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-7731-0_9
  • Woodward, James, 1984, “A Theory of Singular Causal Explanation”, Erkenntnis, 21(3): 231–262. doi:10.1007/BF00169275
  • –––, 2003 [2017], “Scientific Explanation”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2017/entries/scientific-explanation/>.

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