The Theology of Aristotle

First published Thu Jun 5, 2008; substantive revision Thu May 13, 2021

In the ninth century, Plotinus was translated into Arabic. Long sections of this translation went under the title Theology of Aristotle. The attribution of the work to Aristotle helped the text to become an influential source of Neoplatonic ideas in the Arabic-speaking world. But the Arabic Plotinus materials are important not only as a conduit for Plotinus’ ideas; they also differ on numerous points from their ultimate source. Thus the Theology, along with other texts derived from the Arabic version of Plotinus, in fact constitute an interpretation of Plotinus’ thought, and not just a translation. The Theology in turn becomes the chief text conveying Plotinian ideas to the Arabic-speaking tradition.

1. The Theology and other Arabic Plotinus texts

The so-called Theology of Aristotle is the longest, and most famous, text to preserve an Arabic version of the Enneads of Plotinus. The Theology is split into ten sections (each called a mimar, a Syriac word for ‘chapter’). It also has, at its beginning, a preface and some mysterious ‘headings’ which seem to itemize points drawn from a stretch of Enneads IV.4. The preface begins with an important statement of the provenance of the text, and is the source for the title Theology of Aristotle. More on this below in §2.

In addition to the Theology, there are two other extant sources for the Arabic Plotinus materials. First, the so-called Letter on Divine Science, falsely ascribed to al-Farabi but in fact based on passages from the fifth Ennead of Plotinus. Second, a group of fragments or sayings ascribed to a ‘Greek sage’. Both the sayings of the Greek sage and the Letter on Divine Science have been shown to derive from the same Arabic version of Plotinus as the Theology. In fact there are passages that show verbatim overlap between the Theology and the sayings.

Thus one may speak more generally of ‘the Arabic Plotinus’, where this refers to the entire body of Arabic versions of Plotinus’ works. The original version of the Arabic Plotinus would have been more extensive than what is covered by our extant materials, since these materials sometimes break off in a fragmentary fashion. However there is no direct textual evidence for an Arabic version of any part of the first three of Plotinus’ six Enneads. That is, the texts just mentioned are based entirely on passages from Enneads IV, V and VI. These passages do not follow the order of the Enneads. Rather the extant translation jumps around from one part of the Enneads to another. This re-ordering may be an intentional or unintentional change to an original Arabic version, which could have followed the order of the Greek. It is thus quite possible that the original translation covered most or all of the second half of the Enneads. But the coverage provided by the extant materials is patchy.

In fact the term ‘translation’ is somewhat misleading. Although the Arabic Plotinus does translate Plotinus’ Greek, it is often a free paraphrase. Also there are frequent interpolations, with passages (sometimes as long as a whole paragraph) appearing in the midst of the text with no direct basis in the Greek. These interpolations, and in many cases the way the Greek original is translated or paraphrased, bring new philosophical ideas and concerns into the text (see below, §4). Thus the Arabic Plotinus is an interpretation or reworking of Plotinus, and not just a translation. The interest of the texts lies in this philosophical reworking, which needs to be borne in mind when assessing the historical influence exercised by Plotinus in his Arabic guise (see below, §5).

There is an Arabic edition of the Arabic Plotinus materials in Badawi 1955, and an English version (with the exception of some of the sayings ascribed to the ‘Greek sage’) in Henry and Schwyzer 1959. Gutas 2007 announces the project of re-editing the Theology.

2. Historical questions

The most thorough inquiry into the provenance and history of the texts is to be found in Zimmermann 1986, and his major conclusions have been accepted in most subsequent work on the Theology. Yet much remains a matter of doubt and speculation.

One thing that seems certain is that the Arabic version was produced in the circle of al-Kindi, a ninth century philosopher who guided the work of several translators. Endress 1973, in a groundbreaking study, showed that the Arabic Plotinus materials can be grouped linguistically and thematically with other works produced by this circle (see further below, §3). Furthermore, there is the evidence of the preface of the Theology itself. The preface begins:

The first chapter of the book of Aristotle the philosopher, called in Greek ‘Theologia’, that is, ‘discourse on divinity’. The exposition of Porphyry of Syria, translated into Arabic by Ibn Na‘ima al-Himsi, and corrected for Ahmad ibn al-Mu‘tasim by al-Kindi. [Note: the Arabic names have been shortened for clarity.]

Ahmad ibn al-Mu‘tasim is the son of the ‘Abbasid caliph who reigned from 833–842 AD, so this gives us a fairly reliable date for the production of the Theology, or at least for al-Kindi’s ‘correction’ of it. This date may in fact apply to the whole original Arabic translation of Plotinus. It is worth noting that this makes the Greek exemplar on which the translation was based earlier than our oldest Greek manuscripts of the Enneads. In fact we know that the Greek basis of the Arabic version represented an independent branch of the tradition, since all our Greek manuscripts lack a section (at Enn. IV.7.8) from the Enneads that is transmitted indirectly by Eusebius, but is found in the Arabic translation (in chapter three of the Theology).

We know of Ibn Na‘ima al-Himsi from other sources, too: he was a translator of the Kindi circle, and also rendered Aristotle (the Sophistical Refutations and parts of the Physics) into Arabic. Al-Himsi, like many translators of the period, was a Syrian Christian. This raises the question of whether he translated directly from Greek or from an intermediary Syriac version, which was a common practice in the Arabic translation movement. Zimmermann argues that there is no need to postulate a Syriac intermediary, though this has been questioned more recently (Bucur and Bucur 2006, but against postulating a Syriac intermediary Brock 2007).

More provocative is the mention of Porphyry. He was a student of Plotinus and edited the latter’s works into the six groupings of nine that are known as the Enneads. We know that the Theology depends on this edition, because it preserves breaks imposed by Porphyry as he split up longer treatises in order to get the number of Plotinian works up to 54. So when the preface suggests that we are dealing with a commentary or ‘exposition’ of the Enneads by Porphyry, this might just refer to the fact that the original Arabic version was based on his edition. But since Porphyry tells us himself that he wrote comments on Plotinus, some have wished to see in the Arabic Plotinus a translation of a work by Porphyry, which would be a reworking of his master’s thought even more closely based on the text of the Enneads than Porphyry’s extant Sentences. If this is right, the aforementioned paraphrasing and philosophical additions would be an important body of evidence for Porphyry’s thought and his understanding of the thought of his teacher, Plotinus. However, this Porphyrian hypothesis was rejected by Zimmermann, and in this he has again been followed by later scholarship. It may however be that the so-called ‘headings’ do stem from Porphyry. It has been noted that these show a familiarity with Plotinus’ system that would fit with Porphyrian authorship, and that there is philosophical and philological evidence to suggest that Porphyry’s lost index of main points in the Enneads could well stand behind this element of the Arabic Plotinus (D’Ancona 2012a, Chase 2021).

Suppose then that the Arabic Plotinus is based directly on the Greek of the Enneads, and not a Syriac version or a Greek paraphrase by Porphyry or anyone else. This would leave us with the simpler hypothesis that al-Kindi’s circle itself was responsible for the re-working of the Enneads. But even here, a question could be raised: which member of al-Kindi’s circle is to be credited with transforming Plotinian thought in this fashion? One might further wonder whether the rather chaotic order of the passages in the Theology and Letter on Divine Science is merely the result of textual catastrophe (with loose sections stitched back together to form the chapters of the Theology), or also preserves some deliberate re-ordering of the text. Both of these issues are matters of dispute. Thus Zimmermann 1986 and Adamson 2002 think that al-Himsi is primarily responsible for the text, with al-Kindi having contributed relatively little; D’Ancona 1995, 2001 has suggested that al-Kindi may have played a larger role. However Adamson and D’Ancona, but not Zimmermann, believe that there may have been deliberate selection and re-ordering of the text at an early stage. One reason to suspect this is that the individual chapters do seem to have internal thematic unity, though the order of chapters does not match the order of topics set out in the preface (D’Ancona 2011a).

Finally, and most famously, there is the preface’s claim that the work before us is ‘the book of Aristotle.’ While it is sometimes suggested that this misattribution was intentional—an attempt to win wider readership for the work or to give it authority under false pretences—Zimmermann hypothesized that it is just a later, ill-informed addition, based on a misunderstanding of the rest of the preface. After providing the information quoted above, the preface goes on to suggest how the Theology could be integrated into Aristotelian philosophy. Essentially, the preface gives us to understand that the Theology will say more about God and His relation to the world, and about the immaterial soul, than is divulged by Aristotle himself. On this plausible account, the Kindi circle saw Plotinus’ thought as compatible with, and even completing, Aristotle’s thought; but they did not actually think it was by Aristotle.

3. Relation to al-Kindi’s circle

This hypothesis would fit well with what we know about the Kindi circle, which was devoted to the promotion and Islamicization of Greek philosophy and science. Part of this project was the presentation of Greek thought as a coherent whole, and as relevant to the concerns of al-Kindi’s own time (see Adamson 2007a, ch.2). Towards this end the Kindi circle translated not only Plotinus and works of Aristotle (including a painfully literal version of the Metaphysics, and a paraphrase version of the De Anima which takes liberties with the text in a way reminiscent of the Arabic Plotinus). They also translated Proclus.

The story of Proclus in Arabic is similar ways to that of the Arabic Plotinus. It would seem that there was an original version of Proclus’ Elements of Theology in Arabic, which is preserved now only in the form of later partial redactions and re-workings (on this see most recently Wakelnig 2006; the pioneering study is Endress 1973). Again, the most famous text to derive from the Arabic Proclus is a pseudo-Aristotelian work: the Book on the Pure Good, known in Latin as the Book of Causes (Liber de Causis). Though not particularly influential in Arabic, the Book of Causes was a major source for Neoplatonic ideas in the Latin west. It was announced as being based on Proclus, and not Aristotle, by none other than Thomas Aquinas.

The Arabic Plotinus and Proclus not only have a similar textual history, but also overlap to a surprising degree philosophically. It has been persuasively argued (see especially the pieces collected in D’Ancona 1995; for the context of the Arabic Proclus in the Kindī circle see Taylor 2021) that this is no accident: the Arabic Plotinus exerted a direct influence on the Arabic Proclus. To give one obvious example, the more baroque system set forth in Proclus’ Elements is simplified in the Book of the Pure Good to yield a hierarchy identical to that of the Arabic Plotinus (God, Intellect, Soul, material world). On the other hand it has been suggested (D’Ancona 2011a) that the Elements helped to inspire the program of study outlined in the preface to the Theology.

Zimmermann hypothesized that the Arabic Plotinus and Proclus would have formed parts of a large ‘metaphysics file’ (also containing works of Alexander of Aphrodisias) assembled by the Kindi circle. Our preface might actually have been appended to the file as a whole, and not just the Plotinian materials. This file would have catered to the contemporary need to see how Greek philosophy was relevant to the Islamic milieu. In particular, Plotinus and Proclus speak at length about the unity of God and the way that God relates to His creation, as well as about the human soul, its immortality and immateriality.

4. Philosophical ideas

4.1 Paraphrasing and interpolating

Since the Arabic Plotinus is first and foremost just that—an Arabic version of Plotinus—philosophical ideas are primarily introduced into the text by means of subtle, but deliberate, variation from the original text. Here is a particularly clear example, juxtaposing the first sentences of Enneads V.2 and of the tenth chapter of the Theology:

The One is all things and no one of them (to hen panta kai oude hen) (Plotinus, Enneads V.2.1.1).

The pure One is the cause of all things and is not like any of them (Theology of Aristotle, Badawi 1955, 134).

Here the notion of ‘cause’ and the idea that the One is not ‘like (ka-)’ its effects are worked into the translation. The translation is still true to Plotinus’ thought. Indeed, in what immediately follows both Plotinus and the Arabic describe the One as a ‘principle,’ which in the Arabic becomes a kind of gloss on calling it a ‘cause’. Yet the changes soften the paradoxical effect of this opening sentence (which is itself based on Plato’s Parmenides, 160B). Nor is this an isolated case. We frequently find interesting, if subtle, changes introduced in the way that Plotinus is translated.

A more obvious sort of change comes in the form of interpolated excurses that have no direct basis in the Greek. A good example is found at the conclusion of the first mimar of the Theology (Badawi 1955, 27–8). This interpolation defends a ‘non-literal’ understanding of Plato’s account of the creation of the physical universe. We are told that, although Plato speaks as if the world came into being with a first moment of time, actually this is misleading. He speaks in this fashion only because of the difficulty of expressing causal priority without expressions that imply temporal priority. The passage would seem to relate to ancient Platonist treatments of the Timaeus, though that text is not mentioned explicitly here (for the Arabic Plotinus and Timaeus see D’Ancona 2003).

Again, this raises questions about the provenance of the text. Despite the continuity of vocabulary and style between the paraphrase and the interpolations, one cannot exclude the possibility that the interpolations are the work of a different author than the paraphrase. The interpolation just mentioned is particularly intriguing, since the non-temporal account of creation would fit badly with al-Kindi’s well-known rejection of the eternity of the world (Adamson 2007a, ch.4).

4.2 God

As shown by the examples just given, distinctive features of the Arabic Plotinus often have to do with the One or First Principle. In Arabic, the One is very clearly conceived as a creating God, frequently given epithets like ‘originator’ and ‘creator.’ On the other hand, the Arabic Plotinus acknowledges no tension between this idea of God as creator and the Plotinian metaphor of ‘emanation’ (Arabic words that mean ‘emanation’ or ‘flowing,’ such as fayd, are prominent throughout the text). In general the Arabic Plotinus agrees with Plotinus himself that God makes (creates) intellect directly, and then makes all other things ‘through the intermediary of intellect’ (on this see D’Ancona 1992, Adamson 2002, 137–42). On the other hand, it has been noted that the Arabic version frequently assimilates Plotinian nous to the One. The Arabic version embraces the idea that the First Cause thinks or is an intellect—an idea either rejected or mentioned only with great circumspection by Plotinus (see D’Ancona 1997). Here we see the Arabic version undoing, to some extent, Plotinus’ distinction between Aristotle’s self-thinking intellective god and the truly first, highest principle. This also affects the way that the ‘return to the One’ is conceived: the Arabic Plotinus tends to conflate this with the idea of returning to Intellect (Somma 2021, 87).

This is only one example of the Arabic version’s Aristotelianizing tendencies. Another case, again having to do with God, is a passage describing God as ‘pure actuality’ (al-fi‘l al-mahd, at Badawi 1955, 51-2) which intellect strives to imitate. This passage seems to betray the influence of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, book 12—and here it is apposite to reiterate that the Kindi circle produced an Arabic version of that work. On the other hand, one might argue that in such passages the Arabic version simply brings out the Aristotelian aspects of Plotinus himself. After all, he too occasionally (especially in the unusual treatise Enneads VI.8) flirts with the idea that the One thinks or is to be described as actuality. And Porphyry famously remarks in his Life of Plotinus (§14) that the whole of Aristotle’s Metaphysics is present in compressed fashion in the Enneads.

Aristotle’s views on god as actuality may have encouraged the author of the Arabic Plotinus in making the further claim that God is not just pure actuality, but pure being, in Arabic anniyya faqat (D'Ancona 2011b). The etymology of the term anniyya has been a matter of some debate, and the influence of the idea that God is ‘pure being’ has been traced as far forward as Aquinas (Taylor 1998).

A final theological theme in the Arabic Plotinus is the notion of divine ‘attributes’ (sifat). Some passages in the text deny attributes to God, while others claim that the attributes can be ascribed to God ‘in the manner of a cause’ or ‘in a higher way’ (see e.g. Badawi 1955, 130, 156–7, 183, 185). It has been suggested that this theme relates to theological controversies in ninth century Islam (Adamson 2002, ch.5) or to the negative theology of the Pseudo-Dionysius (D’Ancona 1995).

4.3 An ignorance better than knowledge

The problem of divine attributes and negative theology is closely related to one of the most striking interpolations in the Arabic Plotinus, which appears in the second mimar of the Theology of Aristotle (Badawi 1955, 37):

We say that, even if the soul has imagined this world before coming to it, nevertheless it imagined it intellectually. This activity is ignorance (jahl), not understanding (ma‘rifa). Yet this ignorance is more noble than any understanding, for the intellect is ignorant of what is above it through an ignorance more noble than knowledge (‘ilm). If it remembers the things that are there, it does not descend to here, because the memory of those noble things prevents it from coming down to here. If it remembers the lower world, it descends from the noble world, but that may be in various ways. For the intellect is ignorant of its cause above it, namely the First, Ultimate Cause, and has no complete understanding of [this cause], because if were completely aware, it would be above [that cause] and a cause for it.

This text is only part of an longer insertion which deals with an ‘ignorance higher than knowledge.’ (This is often associated with the idea of ‘learned ignorance’ or docta ignorantia, though the phrase does not appear in our text.) In fact, the interpolation describes two forms of ignorance, both of which are superior to understanding or knowledge, albeit in different ways. The first sort of ignorance is the ignorance a higher principle has of what is lower than it. It is better for the soul not to remember or be aware of the lower world, for if it directs its attention to the lower world it will fall away from the intelligibles. The second sort of ignorance is the ignorance the lower has of the higher. For example, the intellect is necessarily ignorant of the One. If it had understanding or knowledge (ma‘rifa) of the One, it would have to be superior to the One, in the sense of being causally prior to it. And this, as the text adds in what follows, would be ‘very repugnant.’

One might again detect Aristotelian ideas behind the argument: if, with Aristotle, we believe that knowledge of something is the grasp of the cause or explanation of that thing, and, again with Aristotle, that intellect knows by being identical with what it knows, then the only way intellect could grasp the One would be for intellect to be its cause. Having said that, the strikingly paradoxical way the doctrine is presented has no parallel in Aristotle, and some have wanted to see in the passage some role or influence on the part of Porphyry (see Thillet 1971) or the Pseudo-Dionysius (see D’Ancona 1993).

4.4 Psychology

The subject given most coverage in the extant Arabic Plotinus materials is the soul. Unsurprisingly, on this topic too it is worth comparing and contrasting our text to the original Plotinus. Like its source, the Arabic Plotinus recognizes various types or levels of soul. The paraphrase is notably faithful to the idea of a world soul, which tends to drop out of the cosmologies of other Arabic philosophers (including already al-Kindi). It has been pointed out that the text maintains a clear distinction between world soul and intellect. This is a point of contrast with Porphyry and thus an additional reason to reject the idea that our text represents a Porphyrian reworking of Plotinus (see D’Ancona 1999).

At the beginning of the third mimar of the Theology, then, the world or ‘universal’ soul is listed as the first of four types of soul. The other three are rational soul, bestial soul, and nutritive soul (Badawi 1955, 45). Already here we see a gesture in the direction of Aristotle’s theory of soul. In another passage too, a Plotinian allusion to Plato’s tripartite soul is explained in an Aristotelian manner. Instead of giving the Platonic tripartition of soul into reason, spirit and appetite, the text glosses Plotinus’ remark by listing Aristotle’s three kinds of soul, namely reason, animal or sensitive, and vegetative or nutritive (Badawi 1955, 20).

Sympathy for Aristotle’s theory of soul is apparent too in the Arabic version of Enneads IV.7.85. In this chapter, Plotinus criticizes Aristotle’s doctrine that the soul is a perfection or entelecheia of the body. The Arabic version, preserved in the third chapter of the Theology, by contrast says that it is the ‘most excellent philosophers’ who described the soul as an entelecheia (using an Arabic transliteration of the Greek word), and therefore sets out to discover in what sense this doctrine is to be understood. In other words, the Arabic version takes it for granted that Aristotle’s position is correct, and that this position must therefore somehow be compatible with the Plotinian position (on this see Adamson 2002, ch.3). The solution, in brief, is that only the rational soul is the true soul, and it is independent from body. But soul is nevertheless, as Aristotle thinks, ‘the form of the body,’ insofar as it is the source of body’s form or perfection.

5. Influence

Because of all these differences between Plotinus and the Arabic Plotinus—and only a few of the most important have been mentioned here—it is worth bearing in mind that it was this reworked version used by later authors in the Arabic tradition. In light of the Aristotelianizing tendencies of the Arabic version, it is appropriate that the Theology is cited in the Harmony of the Two Sages, Plato and Aristotle, a work ascribed to al-Farabi. The Harmony cites the Theology in support of the compatibility of Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysics, on the issues of the a-temporal creation of the universe and the existence of Platonic Forms (Adamson 2021). When al-Farabi refers here to the Theology, he evidently has in mind a more capacious work than our Theology of Aristotle, because he includes propositions from the Arabic Proclus under this title.

Whether or not the Theology was by Aristotle, it was destined to become the key source for Neoplatonic ideas in Arabic. We see its influence over a period of many centuries, starting immediately with other versions of Greek texts produced in the ninth century. As mentioned above (§3) it was a chief influence on the Book of Causes, the Kindi circle adaptation of Proclus’ Elements of Theology. It also seems to have influenced the roughly contemporaneous version of Aristotle’s De Anima, and the treatment of the soul’s immateriality by the ninth-century Christian author Qusṭā Ibn Lūqā (Giommoni 2019).

The high-water mark of its influence may have been the tenth century, about one century after it was probably written. During this period, several Isma‘ili authors, such as Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani and al-Kirmani, adapt Plotinus’ hierarchy for their own Neoplatonizing metaphysics, and associate the levels of the hierarchy with elements of Islamic theology. Al-Sijistani goes the negative theology of the Arabic Plotinus one better, insisting that when speaking of God we must negate even negation (see further Walker 2005). Around the same time, Neoplatonic authors like al-‘Amiri and Miskawayh were influenced, directly or indirectly, by the Arabic Plotinus. The Shorter Healing (al-Fawz al-Asghar) of Miskawayh is full of terminology and doctrine from the Arabic Plotinus (see Adamson 2007b), and a compilation of philosophical material produced in his circle draws on the text too (Wakelnig 2014). Al-‘Amiri, meanwhile, is one of the authors to transmit the Plotinian version of materials from Proclus (see Wakelnig 2006). Neoplatonic ideas related to our text also appear in authors like Abu Sulayman al-Sijistani and his circle (on whom see Kraemer 1986). Somewhat earlier in the tenth century the Jewish philosopher Isaac Israeli drew on the Arabic Plotinus, as well as works by al-Kindi himself (see Altmann and Stern 1958).

Perhaps during this same period, a text was written which re-worked the Theology much in the way that the Theology re-worked Plotinus. This is the so-called ‘Long Version’ of the Theology, which may emanate from an Isma‘ili context. It introduces yet further philosophical ideas to the text, postulating for instance a logos or ‘word’ that mediates between God and the first intellect. (On the Longer Version see Stern 1983, Fenton 1986 and Zimmermann 1986.) The Longer Version was the basis for the Latin translation of the Theology, which was produced in the sixteenth century.

Contrary to what one might expect, the Theology’s status as an Aristotelian work was not necessarily the key to its influence and transmission. Avicenna, for instance, expressed some doubt as to its authenticity, yet he also composed a set of notes commenting on the text. These are based on our shorter version (for the notes see Badawi 1947, 37–84, translated into French in Vajda 1951 and discussed in Adamson 2004a and 2004b). The text went on to be influential in post-Avicennan philosophy. The twelfth-century thinker Suhrawardi ascribes material clearly drawn from the Theology to Plato, most likely because Plato is prominently mentioned in the Theology itself, at the end of the first chapter (D’Ancona 2004). Slightly later, the twelfth-thirteenth century author ‘Abd al-Latif al-Baghdadi provides us with the chief evidence for the original ‘metaphysics file’ that contained the Arabic Plotinus (see Zimmermann 1986 and above, §3). He paraphrased several works from this collection including the Book of Causes (see further Martini Bonadeo 2013).

Finally, we can mention the influence of the Theology in the Safavid period. Many of our manuscripts of the work were produced in Iran under the Safavids and Qajars. It seems to have been read eagerly from early in the Safavid age, as we can tell from a preface added to the text by the important early sixteenth-century philosopher Ghiyat-al-Din Dashtaki, who may also have written a commentary to the text (Di Branco 2014). It was also used by al-Nayrizi, a student of Dashtaki (on him see Pourjavady 2011). Commentaries to the text were written by later Safavid thinkers: the famous Mulla Sadra (for a work drawing on the Arabic Plotinus see Nasr 2014), and the seventeenth century by Sa‘id al-Qummi (for the latter see Rizvi 2007).


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