Theories of the Common Law of Torts

First published Thu Jun 2, 2022

Tort is a branch of private law. It focuses on interpersonal wrongdoing primarily between private persons. Unlike the law of contract, tort obligations are not normally entered into voluntarily; unlike the criminal law, the state is not necessarily a party to a tort action. Private persons can often contract around the rights and obligations of tort law; those rights and obligations provide the background against which other private arrangements can be made. Prominent examples of torts include negligent injury, battery, deceit, and defamation. In each case, the existence of the legal right that has been violated does not depend on any prior act of the injured party. Instead, everyone has rights against these types of conduct on the part of others. Tort law engages with two of the most fundamental questions of morality and social life: how people are permitted to treat each other, and whose problem it is when things go wrong.

This entry examines philosophical accounts of tort law, distinguishing its obligations from other types of private legal obligation, and distinguishing its characteristic remedies from the punitive responses of the criminal law and from administrative regulation. It focuses exclusively on tort law within common law systems, that is, legal systems descended from English law, including Australia, Canada, New Zealand, Singapore, the United States. Other legal systems, originating in continental Europe, are usually described as “civilian” systems. They have detailed civil codes covering many of the same issues as the common law of torts. Some civilian systems share many doctrinal features with common-law system; others, particularly France, offer fundamentally different ways of dealing with the same set of interactions and the problems to which they give rise.

1. The Range of Torts

In common law legal systems, as well as in what are often described as “mixed” common law/civil law systems such as those of Israel and South Africa, most of tort doctrine developed through decisions made by judges addressing private disputes. In the past century and a half, the diversity of common law jurisdictions and the introduction of statutes and competing regulatory regimes have introduced considerable diversity into the common law, in some cases entirely displacing parts of it. Despite such variation, the broad doctrinal structure of the law of torts is fairly clear. It addresses two fundamental questions of human social interaction.

First, tort law lays out the minimal forms of conduct that people are legally entitled to demand of each other, prior to any arrangements that they have made with each other. It does so by identifying and articulating a range of wrongs for which one person can claim against another before a court and, if successful, be awarded a remedy. The most prominent of these wrongs, both in the business of courts and in scholarly (particularly philosophical) discussions, is the tort of negligence, which involves careless injury of one person by another. Other wrongs include defamation, deceit, trespasses to land and chattel, intentional torts against persons (such as battery, false imprisonment and private nuisance) and liability for dangerous or defective products, as well as a range of more specialized torts, such as public nuisance, misfeasance in public office, the tort of statutory breach, and constitutional torts (cases in which a private citizen sues an official for a violation of the citizen’s constitutional rights).

Second, tort law addresses a question about whose problem it is when things go wrong by generating and enforcing a remedial structure within which those who have been wronged can claim a remedy from the person who has wronged them. In order to establish the remedial claim, the complaining party (the “plaintiff”) must establish that the act of the alleged wrongdoer (the “defendant”) satisfies each of the elements of the tort of which they complain.

Tort law protects each person’s bodily integrity against both intentional and negligent interference; it protects each person against deceit by others; it protects each person’s mental health against intentional infliction of emotional distress and negligent infliction of psychiatric injury; it protects each person’s reputation against misstatements by others; it protects privacy and freedom of movement against certain interferences; and it protects property against various forms of interference, including unauthorized use, willful or careless damage and, in the special case of land, against unauthorized entry and loss of usefulness. No less significantly, the common law of torts declines to protect other interests that might be thought equally pressing, such as the interest in adequate resources or a favorable context in which to pursue one’s purposes, the interest in assistance in times of urgent need, and the interest in the continued availability of objects and people on which one relies. Different explanations of the principle on which tort law decides which interests to protect will be considered below. It protects the interests that it does by articulating basic norms of conduct, most of which are continuous with familiar moral ideas. For example, the basic norm of negligence requires that people exercise appropriate care around the bodies and property of others, a moral and social norm that figures in warnings given to children at playgrounds. So, too, the basic norm of battery—which in English law is characterized as “unauthorized touching” and in American law as “harmful or offensive touching”—reflects the admonition given to children to keep their hands to themselves. In each case, tort law specifies and systematizes these familiar ideas and makes them legal rather than merely social or moral norms.

2. The Remedial Structure of Tort Law

The remedial structure of tort law reflects its nature as a part of private law. Unlike a criminal prosecution (but like an action for breach of contract) a tort action is initiated by the aggrieved party rather than the state. Unlike a criminal prosecution, the remedy sought in a tort action does not involve incarceration or the payment of a fine to the state, but rather either the payment of damages to the aggrieved party or, in a limited range of cases, an injunction requiring the defendant to cease their wrongful activity. Courts also give a range of more particular damage awards, including nominal damages (to recognize the existence of a wrong), “general damages” for the tort of defamation (awarded for the fact of injury in addition to “special damages” for clearly quantifiable losses), and aggravated damages for particularly egregious instances of wrongdoing. In some instances, a court will award punitive damages, over and above those damages that are tied to the magnitude of the wrong. As their name suggests, such damages have a punitive dimension, but they differ in important ways from punishment for violation of the criminal law, both in the standard of proof that is applied to them and in the fact that they are awarded to the injured party. The relation between punitive damages and the broader structure and nature of tort law remains a matter of controversy, both in legal doctrine (punitive damages are very rare outside the United States) and in philosophical accounts.

As an area of private law, tort law also differs procedurally from other areas of law. Unlike a criminal case in which the standard of proof is “beyond a reasonable doubt”, the plaintiff in a tort action must only establish that it is more probable than not that the defendant satisfied each of the elements of the tort. In the United States, tort cases are heard before civil juries. In the rest of the common law world, civil juries in tort actions for anything other than defamation are unusual; in these jurisdictions cases are decided before a judge. In virtually all jurisdictions the vast majority of tort litigation is settled before coming to trial.

3. Tort Law in the History of Philosophy

Tort law has been an object of philosophical reflection at least since Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics. It also figured in medieval discussions by Thomas Aquinas and Francisco Suárez (Gordley 2006), as well as in early modern discussions of the law of obligations by writers such as Hugo Grotius and Samuel Pufendorf. Aristotle distinguished between the role of a court in providing a remedy in a private dispute from the role of other public officials in seeing to it that some good or burden was allocated in accordance with a specified criterion. Justinian’s Digest (533), a compilation of Roman law from the sixth century, included extended discussions of tort cases and principles. Civil law jurisdictions also drew heavily on the writings of legal scholars. Historically, the common law did not begin with any attempt at theoretical systematization, but rather developed through the decisions of judges who considered it important to limit their reasoning to the particular case and pleading before them. Until the nineteenth century, English law had highly specialized “forms of action” determining the ways in which the plaintiff could plead a case. The forms of action did not classify various specific wrongs as falling under a general category of tort. Academic writing tended to stay close to the doctrine, with only occasional general pronouncements and with little by way of systematic elaboration (Seavey 1942). Some writers continue to express doubts about whether tort law can be systematized (Weir 2006; Murphy 2019; Stapleton 2021; for further discussion, see Thomas 2019).

Philosophical writing about the common law of torts developed in the twentieth century, largely but not exclusively in response to a series of seminal arguments by the legal scholar and jurist Oliver Wendell Holmes Jr. in his 1881 book The Common Law. Holmes set the stage for much of contemporary philosophy of torts by asking how we should understand tort law’s apparent use of straightforward moral terminology—duties, rights, wrongs, injustice, malice, intent. Holmes himself was concerned with responding to what he saw as the excessive formalism of legal scholarship and education, as exemplified in the writings and introduction of methods of study by Christopher Columbus Langdell, Dean of Harvard Law School. A central theme of Holmes’s book is captured by his famous claim that “the life of the law has not been logic; it has been experience” (1881: 1). Throughout his discussion of the common law, Holmes aimed to bring the resources of social science to bear on understanding law in terms of the facts available to decision-makers and the likely consequences of legal rules. He believed that this approach would make the study of law more practical and useful, enabling lawyers to better advise their clients about the likely consequences of various courses of action.

Tort law has a central place in this Holmesian shift of focus, not only because a lawyer would want assistance in advising clients on whether to settle tort claims, but also for a systematic philosophical reason. Holmes recognized the clear parallels between the law of torts and familiar parts of commonsense morality, and wanted to emphasize the differences. He therefore begins his discussion of tort law by noting that

The law of torts abounds in moral phraseology. It has much to say of wrongs, of malice, fraud, intent and negligence. Hence it may naturally be supposed that the risk of a man’s conduct is thrown upon him as a result of some moral short-coming. (1881: 79)

Holmes suggests that the appearance is misleading, and that the law is much more concerned with practical problem solving than with how a wrongdoer would be judged “in the courts of heaven” (1881: 108). Much of the philosophical discussion of tort law over the past half century has been focused on understanding the role and significance of the moral vocabulary that pervades tort law.

Together with the English legal scholar Sir Frederick Pollock, with whom he corresponded for many decades, Holmes also set a pair of questions for tort theory. The first is whether there is a general principle of liability underlying all of tort law or simply a miscellany of different causes of action. The Holmes/Pollock answer was affirmative: they each argued in their own way that the basis of liability was causing harm without justification or excuse. As Pollock put it:

All members of a civilised commonwealth are under a general duty towards their neighbors to do them no hurt without lawful cause or excuse. The precise extent of the duty, as well as the nature and extent of the recognised exceptions, varies according to the nature of the case. (1897: 1)

The Holmesian formulation of this idea is still a commonplace of legal education in North America; Holmes’s analysis draws attention to multiple factors that might serve to justify otherwise objectionable harms, most of which focused on the economic and social benefits of permitting people to harm each other in particular situations (1894).

Holmes and Pollock raised their second question by introducing a classification of bases for liability, with a distinction between wrongs for which liability was strict, wrongs for which liability was predicated on negligence, and wrongs for which intention was required (Stevens 2019). These classifications had an important role in shaping subsequent debates, raising questions of both conceptual analysis and normative justification.

Holmes’s main focus was the tort of negligence. It is the tort that generates the most litigation in contemporary legal systems. It is also the tort that has been most frequently supplanted by alternative systems, such as no-fault automobile insurance and workplace safety regulation and compensation schemes and, in the case of New Zealand, a general public insurance scheme which replaced actions in negligence in cases of personal injury (Woodhouse Report 1967; Price Waterhouse Cooper Report 2008). Policy debates about doing away with the tort of negligence give philosophical debates about its structure and purpose a special urgency. If, as most scholars are prepared to concede, a legal system acts within its proper authority in introducing these alternative responses to accidental injury, is anything of moral significance lost when they are?

Holmes’s discussion of the tort of negligence drew attention to another set of philosophical questions about tort law. One of the elements of the tort of negligence requires that the plaintiff establish that the defendant failed to exercise reasonable care. The standard of care is said to be “objective” in the sense that the inquiry is not about whether the defendant exercised the most care of which they were capable but rather whether the defendant exercised the degree of care that a reasonable person would exercise in the circumstances. The leading case involved a farmer who was warned that his hayrick was at risk of spontaneous combustion; his well-meaning attempt to reduce the risk increased it, and the resulting fire spread to some cottages owned by his neighbor. Although the court accepted his claim that he had acted to the best of his abilities, he was held liable anyway. Holmes marks the contrast in terms of the question before the court:

Suppose that a defendant were allowed to testify that, before acting, he considered carefully what would be the conduct of a prudent man under the circumstances, and, having formed the best judgment he could, acted accordingly. If the story was believed, it would be conclusive against the defendant’s negligence judged by a moral standard which would take his personal characteristics into account. But supposing any such evidence to have got before the jury, it is very clear that the court would say, Gentlemen, the question is not whether the defendant thought his conduct was that of a prudent man, but whether you think it was. (1881: 107)

Holmes points to the objectivity of the standard as evidence of the non-moral character of the law’s seemingly moral vocabulary, writing

If, for instance, a man is born hasty and awkward, is always having accidents and hurting himself or his neighbors, no doubt his congenital defects will be allowed for in the courts of heaven, but his slips are no less troublesome to his neighbors than if they sprang from guilty neglect. (1881: 108)

The character of the reasonable person is at once completely familiar and perplexing. English cases historically referred to the reasonable person as the “man in[on] the Clapham Omnibus” (McQuire v Western Morning News 1903), and American cases have described him as “the man who takes the magazines at home and in the evening pushes the lawn mower in his shirt sleeves” (Hall v Brooklands Auto Racing Club 1933), using these familiar stereotypes with all of their cultural baggage as exemplars. The philosophically interesting question is why these stereotypes are held out as the standard for people who differ from them: given differences in attention, strength, and ability, why is there a uniform standard for everyone?

Yet another central question in contemporary debates in tort theory concerns the point of the entire practice of tort liability. In his classic discussion, Holmes suggested that the point of tort liability could not be compensation, because a tort action is an extremely inefficient mechanism for delivering compensation. Compared to such things as the workplace safety compensation schemes that were being introduced in Holmes’s time, the tort system is extremely expensive in its delivery of compensation to injured parties, because it spends so much time and money litigating disputes, and only delivers compensation to those who are injured by others who have been found to be wrongdoers and who can afford to pay. Holmes’s own proposal, echoed by some in more recent decades, is to require each person to carry their own insurance against injury or property damage (Atiyah 1997). A system of first-party private or social insurance would compensate injured parties based on the seriousness of the injury they suffered, rather than based on a distinction, which is arbitrary from the point of view of compensation, between injuries suffered as a result of the careless acts of others and all other injuries.

Considered as a system of compensation, Holmes concluded, tort liability is an abject failure. In its place, Holmes proposed that the point of tort liability was two-fold: to hold people responsible for damage that they cause and to deter others from creating dangers. Each of these ideas has been important to subsequent analyses of tort law. The idea of responsibility figures in Holmes’s threefold account of degrees of culpability. It sharpens the issue of the basis of the objective standard in negligence, which holds people to a standard they may be unable to meet. Various developments of this emphasis on responsibility figure prominently in some contemporary accounts of tort liability, particularly those of Tony Honoré and those influenced by him (Honoré 1999; Perry 2001; Gardner 2001; 2018). Holmes’s emphasis on deterrence, in turn, is the source of much writing seeking to show that the law of tort is a method of regulating safety by providing incentives for people to take precautions against the risk of injury. In the second half of the last century, this aspect of Holmes’s approach shaped the development of the economic analysis of law, which has become a dominant force in legal scholarship and education in the United States.

Holmes is not always explicit about whether he is proposing to explain the law as he finds it or to revise it; he suggests that the traditional law may be inadequate to its tasks of providing for safety in an industrialized world:

[o]ur law of torts comes from the old days of isolated, ungeneralized wrongs, assaults, slanders, and the like,


the torts with which our courts are kept busy today are mainly the incidents of certain well known businesses … railroads, factories, and the like… The public really pays the damages, and the question of liability, if pressed far enough, is really the question how far it is desirable that the public should insure the safety of those whose work it uses. (1897: 467)

As a judge on the US Supreme Court, Holmes decided cases in ways that some have argued are at odds with his theoretical pronouncements about the law of negligence, focusing on the rights of the parties rather than questions of insurance. One important case concerned the question of whether the defendant could be liable for causing economic losses in the absence of damage to the plaintiff’s property. Holmes held that there was no liability because no right had been violated. The absence of liability in such cases is largely settled, but this rationale for disallowing pure economic losses continues to be contested.

Holmes’s efforts to treat tort law as a unified subject and to analyze that unity in terms of its social and economic effects shaped doctrinal scholarship in the United States of America in the middle part of the twentieth century. Skeptical of the ways in which legal doctrine presents itself, scholars sought to analyze tort law in terms of how it functions to brings about certain social and economic effects. The rise of functionalism in tort theory interacted with the rise of legal realism with its more general skepticism about the ability of legal rules to generate determinate results and its related emphasis on the ways in which judges sought to achieve particular political and economic purposes through legal decisions. This approach was captured in the title of a prominent article, “Tort Law: Public Law in Disguise” (Green 1959). Some realist-inspired writers suggested that the function of tort law was to achieve both deterrence and compensation; others emphasized one or the other of these goals (Prosser 1941).

4. Contemporary Philosophical Approaches to Tort Law

4.1 Economic Analysis

The economic analysis of law treats tort law as a mechanism for regulating safety in the context of a broader focus on the efficient allocation of social resources. This approach follows Holmes in rejecting the law’s moral vocabulary as misleading. Legal economists frequently point out that we, as a society, have made a collective “Decision for Accidents” as Guido Calabresi put it in a widely discussed article (1965). We allow people to travel by car and truck even though we know statistically that this will lead to a certain number of deaths per year. We allow major infrastructure projects that will improve safety and convenience even though we know that people will be injured or killed in the course of constructing them. Similar decisions are made, implicitly or explicitly, in determining whether to permit a wide range of other activities with potential side effects on participants or non-participants. Some level of risk is unavoidable and justified, but, when activities are carried out on a large scale, some level of injury becomes inevitable; the economic problem is finding the correct level. Rather than analyzing negligence liability in terms of what the defendant did to the plaintiff, legal economists propose to understand it in terms of a more general social decision to determine the appropriate amount of safety for which we, as a society, are prepared to pay. Life could be made much safer by prohibiting a wide range of risk-imposing conduct; economic rationality demands that societies face the question of whether safety becomes too expensive at a certain point. For example, traffic accidents could be reduced dramatically by imposing speed limits of 5 mph; the cost in other goods, however, including not only convenience but such things as food spoilage and emergency services, would be too high. Economic analysis proposes to treat tort law as the solution to an optimization problem of setting the level of safety that is worth the cost of the steps taken to achieve it, and of allocating the costs of achieving such safety.

Analyzed in economic terms, the amount of risk that is acceptable in society should ideally be determined in the same way that every question about the creation of a cost or benefit should ideally be determined, that is, through efficient market transactions. In a perfectly competitive market, with complete information and no transaction costs, parties could be expected to negotiate, and determine the terms on which they exposed each other to risks (Posner 1983). As Ronald Coase puts it in one of the foundational texts of the economic analysis of law (1960), in conditions of perfect competition, parties concerned to advance their interests would always bargain around legal rules to reach an efficient result. A rational enterprise will be indifferent between engaging in a profitable activity and receiving equivalent payment to refrain from engaging in it. Without transaction costs, legal rules would make no difference to the allocation of resources; the only effect of the legal rule would be to determine the direction of payments. Coase acknowledges that we live in a world in which transaction costs make bargaining infeasible. The case of accidental injury illustrates this particularly starkly. Nobody is in a position to negotiate with everyone who might be injured through the side effects of their driving, cycling, or other activities, or through products they produce; conversely, nobody could be in a position to negotiate with everyone who potentially exposes them to such risks. Thus, there is a problem which economists identify as market failure: the parties are unable to reach a mutually beneficial arrangement. Economic analysis recommends the adoption of legal rules that will provide people with incentives to approximate the outcome that would have been achieved by market transactions with full information and no transaction costs.

Economic analysts of law disagree amongst themselves about the appropriate structure of rules to reach the market-ideal level of risk. Some advocate a rule of strict liability, according to which the person carrying out an activity is made to “internalize” all of its costs. A rational economic actor engaged is such activities who was forced to internalize is costs would be indifferent between paying the costs of avoiding the accident or paying the costs of the accident. They will therefore invest resources in avoidance costs up to the point at which doing so will reduce expected accident costs. Strict liability therefore will yield an optimal investment in safety. It would give potential injurers an incentive to find innovative ways to make their activities safer, particularly in a world in which most injuries are caused not by isolated acts but by ongoing activities such as the manufacture of consumer products or the operation of motor vehicles (Calabresi 1965).

A second economic account, introduced by Richard Posner, analyzes the efficiency problem of safety differently. On this view, the negligence standard is the appropriate tool to ensure that people neither overinvest nor underinvest in safety (Posner 1972). Economically rational agents will not overinvest in safety because they will not assume expenses from which they expect no return. Underinvestment in safety is a potential problem, and so the key to an efficient level of investment in safety is to provide those imposing risks with the right incentive to reduce them. The appropriate level is set by making injurers bear the cost of excessive risks that they impose. A specific risk counts as excessive if the cost of reducing it is less than the expected cost—the seriousness of the injury discounted by its likelihood—of allowing it to occur. If the burden of precaution costs is greater than the discounted cost of the injury, then it is economically rational for the law to permit the defendant to impose the risk. If someone is injured because it was not efficient to take a precaution, the injurer should not be held liable; provided that the level of precaution taken was economically efficient, transferring funds from the injurer to the injured party is merely redistributive, and does not improve the overall social allocation of resources. Posner contends that the only point of tort liability is to provide incentives for optimal investment in safety; the fact that the defendant pays the plaintiff in particular is incidental to the account. Instead, Posner suggests that the plaintiff receives payment exclusively as an incentive to bring the lawsuit; in effect the plaintiff serves as a kind of private attorney general. The role of the plaintiff in Posner’s analysis tracks the role of the plaintiff in the standard economic analysis of US antitrust law, in which damages are awarded to plaintiffs to incentivize them to bring suits without those plaintiffs having been specially affected by the pervasive negative consequences of anticompetitive behavior.

Some of the ideas that inform economic accounts of tort law have been accepted by theorists who do not otherwise endorse such accounts. For example, as part of his broader scheme of distributive justice, Ronald Dworkin adopts one of its central claims, arguing that voluntary contracting is the ideal solution to problems of social coordination, and that other areas of law need to be understood as attempts to approximate contractual results in cases of market failure. Dworkin develops this view in detail in his discussion of tort law as a “principle of correction” in (1986: 295), although he is critical of the broader ambitions of economic analysis (Dworkin 1980).

Economic analysis has a straightforward explanation of the objective standard in the law of negligence: because tort liability is exclusively a matter of providing incentives for future conduct, the fact that the defendant was not in a position to avoid a particular injury is irrelevant. Economic analysis views injuries in the past as “sunk costs” which can never be recovered. Making an injurer pay for an injury that efficient precautions would have avoided will provide the same incentive even if the specific injurer did not realize precautions were required.

Economic analysis also proposes an explanation of why there is no liability for negligently causing economic loss in the absence of property damage. Posner illustrates his account with a case involving businesses on an island that customers are unable to reach because the defendant negligently damaged the only bridge leading to it. Posner suggests that those losses are not recoverable because the customers will simply take their business elsewhere, and so there will be no net loss to the economy. It is not clear whether this account can be reconciled with the fact that the law would grant consequential losses to the businesses if they had owned the bridge that was damaged. In that case, too, presumably the customers would have taken their business elsewhere resulting in no net loss to the economy. (For a different economic rationale for the law’s treatment of pure economic loss, see Sharkey 2018.)

4.2 Corrective Justice

Beginning in the 1980s, a number of scholars argued that the economic account of negligence fails to capture the most basic and familiar feature of a tort action of any kind, the fact that it is a private action that one person brings against another. The core argument is that instrumental accounts are unable to explain the characteristically private and transactional nature of tortious wrongdoing and so unable to explain the nature of the remedy appropriate in response to it. In a negligence action, the plaintiff comes before the court complaining of a wrong that the defendant has done to that plaintiff in particular. Unlike the pervasive harms of anticompetitive behavior that are regulated in US antitrust law, the plaintiff has a particular complaint against the defendant, namely, that the defendant’s carelessness was a violation of that very plaintiff’s right to security of person and property. As Ernest Weinrib formulates the point, economic analysis proposes separate explanations of why the defendant pays someone and why the plaintiff receives payment from someone, without explaining why the defendant owes compensation to the plaintiff in particular; each party faces separate incentives that make no reference to the other (1995). Jules Coleman develops the same general line of argument in slightly different terms: the familiar structural features of tort law—the fact that a particular plaintiff recovers from a particular defendant for a wrong that that defendant committed against that very plaintiff—cannot be adequately explained by economic analysis, because it leaves out the law’s central focus on the fact that the defendant has wronged the plaintiff in particular, focusing instead on incidental factors such as “search, administrative, and transaction costs” (2001: 23).

Instead of understanding the structure of the tort action in terms of incentives, Weinrib proposes to understand it in terms of Aristotle’s category of corrective justice. Aristotle notes that corrective justice rests on the transactional nature of wrongdoing and so imposes that transactional nature on the remedy. Corrective justice thus differs from what Aristotle calls distributive justice, which is concerned with the distribution of benefits or burdens in accordance with some external criteria, such as the distribution of food on the basis of need or of Olympic medals on the basis of athletic performance. Corrective justice is not comparative in this way. As Aristotle implies, the wrongdoer’s wrongful deed and the injured person’s suffering are a single act. If I wrongfully injure you, my wrongful act and your injury are the same thing: the wrong consists in what I did to you, and your injury consists in what you suffered by me. On Weinrib’s argument, the difficulty with economic analysis is that it undoes this unity of the wrong. Weinrib points to the ways in which the unity of the wrong structures the entire determination of liability: for each of the “elements” of a negligence action, the court only considers factors that relate the defendant to the plaintiff with respect to the particular transaction. Rather than asking whether the defendant was negligent, or imposed a higher than normal risk, the court instead asks whether the defendant was negligent-towards-the-plaintiff, that is, whether the defendant’s carelessness was careless towards the safety of the plaintiff in particular; so, too, the court asks whether the kind of thing that happened to plaintiff was the reason that the defendant was supposed to be more careful. So too, the court does not ask merely whether the defendant caused the plaintiff’s injury, but rather whether the aspect of the defendant’s act that made it negligent caused the plaintiff’s injury. The inquiry looks only at what transpired between the defendant and the plaintiff: was the defendant being careful enough in relation to the risk to the plaintiff? Did the defendant owe this specific plaintiff a duty to be careful? Did the injury of which the plaintiff complains fall within the scope of the duty that the defendant owed? Did the defendant’s carelessness cause the very injury of which the plaintiff complains? Weinrib’s argument, then, is that the factors that figure in a court’s analysis of a negligence action always relate the parties to each other, while the factors to which economic analysis points all focus exclusively on one of the parties without reference to the other (1995). For economic analysis the plaintiff’s injury by the defendant serves as the occasion for regulation and so for liability but not as its basis. The missing element in economic accounts is the transaction; it alone explains why a particular plaintiff is entitled to recover from a particular defendant. The same rationale explains why there is no duty to rescue in tort law: there is no transaction between the parties. The failure of economic analysis to attend to the transaction means that it has no principled explanation of why liability is imposed only for injury but not also for failure to assist where the cost of assisting another would be lower than the cost of that person’s anticipated loss. A focus on providing incentives to reduce risks has no principled basis for limiting its purview to incentives provided to those who have created the risks themselves; the net loss in economic terms is the same whether the risk is of natural or human origin. In either case, in a perfectly competitive market without transaction costs, people would pay others to protect them, yet the law of negligence does not suppose that there is therefore a duty (Ripstein 2016).

This emphasis on the transactional nature of the unity of the wrong provides an alternative to the economic and Holmesian explanations of the objective standard in a negligence action. Anything relevant to any of the elements of negligence must concern the relation between the plaintiff and defendant; as such, no factor that is specific to only one of them could be relevant to the determination of wrongdoing and so of liability. On this analysis, a subjective standard—the one that Holmes contends would be relevant to the “courts of heaven”—focuses exclusively on the plaintiff rather than on how things stand as between the defendant and the plaintiff. As such, it is unilateral in a way that is foreign to the structure of a tort action. The corrective justice account offers a parallel explanation of the “ultrasensitive plaintiff rule” according to which an injured person does not recover for the defendant’s negligent or even knowing exposure of them to things for which they have unusual sensitivities, in either nuisance or negligence, even though a person of normal fortitude would recover for the full extent of their injuries (Ripstein 2016). Once again, an unusual sensitivity is a factor that is exclusive to one of the parties, and so insufficient to address how things stand between the defendant and the plaintiff. The corrective justice account, then, explains the role of “moral phraseology” in law by drawing attention to the interpersonal and relational nature of the relevant morality. That relational structure proposes a systematic response to the Holmesian insistence that concepts of justice must be concerned exclusively with good faith efforts. Instead, the corrective justice account focuses on the ordinary demands that ordinary people are entitled to make each other. The moral phraseology to which Holmes drew attention is a familiar feature of the way in which people are entitled to demand that others be careful around them.

Economic analysts have responded to the corrective justice critique by suggesting that courts engage in binary adjudication for a variety of pragmatic reasons, including historical accidents and the beneficial incentive effects of putting litigation in the hands of people with financial stakes in its outcome. In addition, they point to the fact that binary adjudication is a familiar feature of other legal areas where no private dispute is at issue, most notably US antitrust law.

This response arguably misunderstands the corrective justice critique: the claim is not that economic analysis cannot give a functional or instrumental explanation of binary adjudication. The suggestion that the plaintiff receives damages in order to provide an incentive to call out unsafe practices is just such a functional explanation. The corrective justice critique can be put in two different ways. First, the court’s analysis in a tort dispute is all grounded in the single transaction; it is exclusively backward looking rather than forward-looking. It is not just that the decision between the plaintiff and the defendant is binary, but rather that it is based only on the specific transaction between them—the remedy is explicable only in terms of the bipolar transactional nature of the wrong. Second, the economic analyst’s response represents the corrective justice theory differently than its proponents do, reading it as the claim that binary adjudication is effective for achieving corrective justice but for no other purpose. The corrective justice account is not an attempt to explain remedies and court processes by asking what goals they best promote. It argues that tort adjudication is binary because the wrongs to which it responds are binary: they are a matter of what the defendant has done to the plaintiff. The transactional nature of wronging underlies the transactional nature of tort litigation, and so explains why the particular plaintiff recovers from the particular defendant. The plaintiff’s entitlement to recover is not an attempt to achieve any other purpose.

Some transaction-focused accounts of corrective justice deploy the Kantian distinction between duties of right and duties of virtue to develop a positive account of the specific norms enforced by tort law (Kant 1797). On this view, the moral vocabulary to which Holmes draws attention is not the general moral vocabulary of virtue or the courts of heaven. The relational ideas of what one person does to another apply to separate persons, each with the purposes of their own. They thereby reconcile the ability of separate persons to pursue those purposes with the means that they have, centrally their body and their property. Kantian accounts conceive of rights relationally, rather than focusing on one side of the relation, such as the choices or interests of the rightholder. The violation of rights to person and property does not extinguish the plaintiff’s entitlement to be independent of the defendant’s choice. Instead, the plaintiff’s right to constrain the defendant’s conduct survives in the form of a claim to a remedy from the defendant in particular (Weinrib 1995; Ripstein 2016). The person who wrongfully injures another or damages the other person’s property can be compelled to return things to their prior condition, that is, to pay the costs of repairing or replacing the property or of enabling the injured party to get on with their life in light of the injuries. In addition, people who wrongfully use another person’s body (the tort of battery) or property (the torts of trespass and conversion) are required to repair any damage that they do because once again there is a wrongful transaction. This Kantian account also has a direct and straightforward explanation of the rules regarding economic loss: if the defendant damages something on which the plaintiff depends but does not own, the wrongful transaction is between the defendant and the owner of the damaged thing; if the plaintiff does not have a right to the damaged object, then although the plaintiff has suffered a loss, no right has been violated. As such, the plaintiff is not a party to the wrongful transaction, so there is no wrong between the person who damaged the object and the plaintiff to be corrected. In the example of the damaged bridge, whether the plaintiff’s right has been violated depends on whether the plaintiff owns the bridge. The economic loss rule is thus treated as an instance of a more general focus on rights to person and property; those who benefit from property lack the relevant form of right in it, and the law of negligence does require a person to protect others from natural perils or the acts of third parties (Ripstein 2016).

The corrective justice account does not deny that tort liability has the effect of deterring careless people and compensating injured people. The point is rather that these effects are insufficient to explain the law’s unwavering focus on the connection between the plaintiff and defendant: why this plaintiff is entitled to recover from this defendant and no one else, and why this defendant is liable to this plaintiff and no one else. Seen from the point of view of either deterrence or compensation, such a pairing of the defendant and the plaintiff is arbitrary, as is the law’s exclusive focus on the relation between them. From the standpoint of corrective justice, the transaction between the parties is the locus of the wrong and the court’s exclusive concern is in addressing that wrong.

4.3 Other Versions of Corrective Justice Theory

In the past three decades, multiple versions of corrective justice theory have been proposed. On Weinrib’s formulation, corrective justice is a principle that is limited to transactional wrongs, which includes both breaches of contract and violations of individual rights to person and property. On this view, the apparatus of corrective justice is brought to bear on only a certain class of transactions.

A more expansive conception of corrective justice was proposed by Jules Coleman (2001). Coleman compares the principle of corrective justice to that of retributive justice. He argues that, just as the principle of retribution does not contain a complete catalogue of the crimes worthy of punishment, but rather simply says that serious crimes merit retributive punishment, so, too, the theory of corrective justice is on its own silent on the question of the types of interpersonal wrongs that are its appropriate subject matter. For Coleman, then, the principle of corrective justice is a general principle of responsive conduct, which awaits an independent theory of tortious wrongdoing to which it is to be applied. Coleman offered several different accounts of the principle of corrective justice: on one version its purpose was to “annul” wrongful gains and losses; a different, later version emphasized the reversal of the effects of wrongful acts by the particular person responsible for them. On both of these accounts, the concepts of wrongdoing and responsibility are placeholders, consistent with a wide variety of views about which acts are wrongful and about the conditions under which someone can be responsible for an outcome.

A still more expansive account of corrective justice was proposed by John Gardner (2011). For Gardner, the principle of corrective justice is a general principle about inappropriate conduct, according to which the failure to do what one has reason to do does not mean those reasons come to an end; the normal response to such failure is to do the next best thing. Gardner illustrates this with the example of keeping a promise: having promised someone to meet them for lunch at noon, the promisor who is behind schedule must still show up at 12:15. The promised act of meeting at noon can no longer be done, and so, on Gardner’s analysis, there can be no duty to arrive at noon, and no right that the promisor arrive by noon. Instead, there is a new duty, the duty to do the next best thing. Gardner applies this analysis to tort liability. If I had a duty to avoid injuring you because I had sufficient reason not to injure you, and I injure you anyway, my duty to avoid injuring you can no longer be satisfied. But all of the reasons that supported the duty will normally still be in operation; as such, those reasons put me under a new duty, this time to repair the wrong that I have done. Gardner describes his view as an account of corrective justice because it regulates “the reversal of wrongful transactions on the ground of their wrongfulness” (2011: 22). Correction is thus the correction of a failure to conform to reasons that apply to you:

the reasons why one must pay for the losses that one occasions are the very same reasons why one must not occasion those losses in the first place, when it is true that one must not occasion them. (2011: 34)

Gardner’s account differs significantly from Weinrib’s because of its exclusive focus on the relation between wrongdoers and the reasons that apply to them, rather than the relation between the parties. The fact that those reasons make reference to the wronged party is not essential to the operation of Gardner’s conception of corrective justice. (For comparisons of different versions of corrective justice, see Steel 2020).

4.4 Civil Recourse

Over the past two decades, a new account of tort liability has emerged with the rise of “Civil Recourse Theory”. Initially introduced by Benjamin Zipursky (2003), and then developed further in jointly authored work by John Goldberg and Zipursky (2020), as well as by others, civil recourse theory accepts the corrective justice account of wrongdoing, but rejects its account of remedies. Civil recourse writers also accept the corrective justice critique of economic and other instrumental theories, arguing that tort law must be understood as in the first instance as law concerned with wrongdoing, rather than as law governing safety incentives or as an account of a privatized form of regulation. Instead, a tort is a civil wrong, a wrong that one person commits against another. Civil recourse theory shares with corrective justice theory the idea that the wrongs addressed by tort law are relational, that is, it shares the view that the plaintiff and defendant must be connected in the right way at every stage of the analysis of wrongdoing. Civil recourse accounts therefore reject instrumentalist accounts of wrongdoing, including what Goldberg and Zipursky characterize as “dual instrumentalism”, the idea that the point of tort liability is to advance both deterrence and compensation. Civil recourse theory also reject the economic analysis of tort law that focuses exclusively on providing incentives to potential defendants, pointing to the one-sidedness problem to which corrective justice writers also draw attention.

Civil recourse writers have also emphasized the plurality of torts, arguing that tort law provides a unified system, because it brings together the full range of relational wrongs, including not only negligence of the sort that has occupied so much legal scholarship over the past century, but also defamation, battery, intentional infliction of emotional distress and many other wrongs. Civil recourse theory emphasizes these wrongs, not because they are the main business of modern legal systems, but because a focus on their relational structure clarifies the ways in which torts are relational wrongs. An excessive focus on negligence makes non-relational accounts, whether focused on deterrence or compensation, appear at least superficially viable. If, however, tort law really is a unified doctrinal area, then focus on other torts clarifies that the basic form of tortious wrongdoing can only be understood relationally. The tort of fraud provides a particularly clear illustration: it requires that the defendant intentionally represented the subject matter of the deceit to the deceived plaintiff. If someone purchases a forged artwork based on a lie that the seller told to someone else, the purchaser has no action in fraud against the seller. So, too, in defamation, only the person who was defamed has a cause of action, even if that person’s family members or business associates will suffer as much or more from the defamation.

The fundamental disagreement between civil recourse writers and corrective justice writers turns on the remedial aspect of tort law. As a common-law subject, tort law develops largely (though not exclusively) through the litigation of concrete disputes; in the context of those disputes, the plaintiff is always seeking a remedy from the defendant. For corrective justice writers, the point of the remedy is to address the wrong; the relation between the defendant and the plaintiff that makes the defendant’s act towards the plaintiff wrongful is also the basis for the remedy. For civil recourse theorists, by contrast, the aim of a tort remedy is not to repair the wrong, but rather to empower plaintiffs to confront and make a demand on the persons who wronged them. The difference is subtle but important: although damages addressed to repairing the wrong provide one form of recourse, the idea of recourse is more general. Although remedies are occasioned by wrongdoing, their purpose is not simply to repair wrongs. Drawing on John Locke’s idea of the social contract, Goldberg and Zipursky suggest that, having prohibited self-help remedies, the state owes an obligation to persons who have been wronged to provide them with a civil avenue of recourse through which they can proceed against those who have wronged them; a tort remedy is something that the plaintiff is empowered to seek from the defendant rather than something that the plaintiff is entitled to receive from the defendant. Until the plaintiff initiates an action and prevails in it, the defendant is not under a duty to pay damages (Smith 2012; 2019). Rather than contending that a remedy repairs a wrong, civil recourse writers read the eighteenth-century Latin maxim ubi jus, ibi remedium—where there is a right there must be a legal remedy for its violation—as providing those who have been wronged with the opportunity to do something to those who have wronged them. Civil recourse writers point to advantages of understanding the nature of tort remedies in this way, notably in cases in which tort remedies are insufficient to repair wrongs. Monetary damages may allow the plaintiff to purchase a replacement for property that has been damaged or destroyed, but in many other cases they will not allow the plaintiff to continue life as if the wrong had not occurred. No amount of money can make up for the loss of a limb, or a child, or for the humiliation of a breach of privacy or the willful infliction of emotional distress (Hershovitz 2017). Civil recourse writers focus on such cases in order to argue that the point of damages is to enable the person who has been wronged to exact an appropriate remedy from the wrongdoer, even when that remedy would be inadequate by any compensatory measure. Even in the case of injuries that can be readily repaired, or of lost earnings that can be made up with their estimated monetary equivalent, civil recourse writers contend that the purpose of the remedy is better explained in terms of the recourse that it provides rather than the loss that it compensates. They argue that this provides a more unified account of tort law, rather than the one that is limited to a narrow class of interferences with agency and remedies that seek to restore agency (Sage 2021).

4.5 Assessing Civil Recourse Theory

One prominent objection to civil recourse theory, made both by defenders of corrective justice accounts and defenders of economic analysis, is that the principle of civil recourse is true but trivial. The founders of the economic analysis of tort law, Richard Posner and Guido Calabresi, both of whom were at the time federal appellate judges in the United States, have argued that the principle of civil recourse is empty, and could provide no possible guidance to any judge attempting to decide a case. Instead, other factors, including instrumental ones, must be introduced in order to explain the resolution of the case and the measure of damages; that it all takes place before a court at the initiative of the plaintiff is institutionally true but analytically insignificant for Posner (2013) and Calabresi (2013). More generally, the entitlement of someone to claim a remedy from the person who has wronged them is a generic feature of private legal relationships, and so fails to shed any distinctive light on tort law. Instead, just as contract law provides plaintiffs with remedies because they have been wronged, however imperfectly those remedies might repair those wrongs, so too does the law of tort. That legal structure does not, however, lead to the conclusion that contract remedies have some point other than to enforce the contractual right that was violated, however imperfect that remedy may be as a substitute. So, too, in the case of tort law, any obligation that the state has to provide a forum and avenue of recourse does not show that the principle of recourse is anything other than the enforcement of the right that was violated. The claim that there is no legal duty to pay damages unless the plaintiff brings suit has also been disputed (Steel & Stevens 2020).

A second objection to civil recourse theory charges that it is nothing more than a notational variant on corrective justice theory, sharing its focus on wrongdoing, as well as its accounts of the objective standard in negligence and its explanation of the lack of recovery for pure economic loss (Benson 1995; Zipursky 2003). One of the difficulties in assessing this objection is that, as we saw above, there are different formulations of corrective justice theory. Discussions of corrective justice in the civil recourse literature often associate it with the idea that the plaintiff must be made whole, that is, with a purely compensatory idea, which some civil recourse writers describe as moving from a less just state of affairs to a more just one. The idea that tort liability always leads to a net improvement in justice is difficult to fit to the world in which tort law actually operates (Goldberg & Zipursky 2020). Yet prominent writers about corrective justice, including Weinrib and Ripstein, do not claim that the point of corrective justice is to increase justice globally; instead, they characterize remedies in terms of the specific transaction. Aristotle explicitly rejects the suggestion the point of corrective justice is to produce greater justice along any further dimension when he states that duties of corrective justice apply even in cases in which a “decent” person is required pay damages to a “base” one (Nicomachean Ethics, Book V, Ch. 4). For Aristotle, the basis of liability is the past transaction between them, rather than the comparative magnitude of their holdings along any other dimension. Since civil recourse theory also begins with a focus on the wrongful transaction, corrective justice writers suggest that it adds nothing to corrective justice analysis and does not contrast with it.

Civil recourse theory does, however, differ in at least one important way from corrective justice theory. It contends that the purpose of a tort remedy is not to enforce the plaintiff’s right against the defendant, but to permit the plaintiff to exercise a power to proceed against the defendant; the state owes a duty to the plaintiff to provide a forum in which that power can be exercised. For corrective justice theory, the remedy enforces the right that was violated; for civil recourse theory, the remedy addresses the fact that some right was violated, rather than enforcing the specific right that was violated. On this view, damages seeking to repair the specific rights violated and the magnitude of the loss are only one form of recourse. The disparate remedies provided by tort law are unified by the fact that they are forms of recourse rather than by their aim of repairing rights violations.

This focus on the plaintiff’s right against the state distinguishes civil recourse theory from corrective justice but raises a further puzzle about the status of that right. As a doctrinal and interpretive matter, private rights of action in tort have been abolished in particular cases, as most prominently New Zealand has done for all personal injuries but, more pervasively, as virtually every common law country has done for a broad range of workplace accidents that take place in the course of employment. This raises two possibilities, each of which faces difficulties. One possibility is that abolishing the private cause of action abolishes the victim’s right against the state to be empowered to seek redress, in which case the principle that there is no right without a remedy is dramatically narrowed in scope. Rather than seeing a right to recourse as something the state must grant because self-help has been abolished, on this first alternative, the right of recourse appears to apply only to cases in which the state has granted both the right and the cause of action, since the state can abolish both self-help and the cause of action. While this first alternative describes a familiar structure of positive law, it detaches civil recourse theory from its roots in Lockean political philosophy and so deprives it of its broader explanatory ambitions. Alternatively, prohibiting self-help in cases of automobile accidents or workplace accidents while also failing to provide a private right of action could be characterized as a violation of the rights of those who have been denied both self-help and recourse, in which case the theory would require that the state must provide a remedy for that violation. Such an account fails to fit familiar features of legal doctrine, which does not require states limiting the rights of action to provide an alternative remedy to those who would otherwise be able to exercise them. Other critics have criticized the ways in which civil recourse theory characterizes legal powers (Herstein 2015), or suggested that it only applies in circumstances in which corrective justice cannot be realized (Stone 2022).

Some critics of civil recourse theory have charged it with focusing on revenge in a way that is morally suspect and at odds with the ideas of legality. Some defenders have suggested that a focus on revenge provides a more satisfying interpretation of tort law (Oman 2011; Hershovitz 2014; Gold 2020). On this interpretation, the Lockean idea of a social contract is framed in terms of a default moral position in which self-help motivated by resentment or outrage is the appropriate response to having been wronged. For understandable reasons, states do not permit self-help, particularly self-help carried out in anger, and so must provide a substitute for the conduct they have prohibited. On this understanding, civil recourse is plainly distinct from corrective justice, because the point of the remedy is not merely to grant power to the plaintiff but to enable the plaintiff to act out of anger in a controlled setting. Such an interpretation faces both analytical and normative challenges. The analytical challenge is in explaining how the entire account does not presuppose a prior and more fundamental principle of corrective justice: if recourse is a substitute for legitimate revenge, the most obvious interpretation of the imagined social contract would represent the right of recourse as the compensation due to those who have been improperly deprived of a natural right to exact revenge. The normative difficulty comes from the assumption that there is a right to take revenge, so that the state owes compensation for depriving people of it. However pervasive the desire for revenge might be in human psychology, prohibiting it does not seem to be the kind of wrongful act that requires compensation (Ripstein 2011; Steel 2021). A different interpretation of the revenge rationale understands the granting of a right of recourse not as something that is owed as a matter of justice but rather as a political compromise in order to maintain peace by giving certain moral emotions an output. As a piece of political sociology, this account would need to explain how that outlet is properly preserved in a system in which most cases are settled, and why it is required in cases of injury for which the law provides a remedy even though outrage would seem both inappropriate and idiosyncratic, such as mistaken but harmless trespasses to land and cases in which the defendant’s best efforts fell below the standard imposed by law.

4.6 Fairness Theories

Other writers have proposed different justice-based accounts of the common law of torts. George Fletcher proposed to understand tort liability as a violation of reciprocity; those who impose non-reciprocal risks on others must compensate for the harm that they do (1972). Other writers, drawing on John Rawls’s theory of justice have proposed to understand tort law in broadly contractarian terms. For example, Gregory Keating has argued that corrective justice is a subordinate principle in tort law, the purpose of which is to uphold entitlements—not only to property but also to personal security—that are themselves the product of a contractualist procedure (1996; 1997). Keating argues that corrective justice’s emphasis on the form of a tort action attends to remedies without adequately accounting for the way in which those remedies are secondary to the rights that they enforce. In order to identify the relevant rights, Keating suggests a contractualist procedure similar to those developed by Rawls and T.M. Scanlon. The proposed contractualist account would weigh the substantive interests of people in liberty and security, and would attach priority to bodily security in particular. It would therefore require two things. First, it would require that business enterprises that characteristically create risks to life and limb spend more on precautions than would be justified through an economic analysis of their expected costs and benefits. Second, it would require that those who suffer injuries, even if those injuries are unavoidable—as is likely in a world in which, as Holmes puts it, enterprises engaged in ongoing “activities” rather than isolated “acts” on a large scale will inevitably produce injuries no matter how careful they are—receive compensation even though nothing short of prohibiting those worthwhile and beneficial activities could have been done to prevent those injuries. Keating puts this point in terms of an idea of enterprise liability under which an enterprise that imposes costs on others should properly be made to bear those costs. Enterprise liability, in which manufacturers were required to insure against all injuries caused by their products, even those that could not be prevented through further care figured prominently in a number of decisions, particularly in California, in the second half of the twentieth century. A leading case involved a cola bottle that exploded, injuring the plaintiff, although there was no evidence of negligent manufacture. In recent decades, the prominence of enterprise liability has largely faded.

Like some versions of economic analysis, Keating’s social contract account is avowedly normative, proposing significant changes to tort doctrine. Like economic analysis, it sees tort law as one of many tools available to the state in dealing with safety (2021). It differs from economic analysis in the greater weight that it proposes to give to personal safety rather than convenience. Ultimately, however, it engages in the same type of balancing, and appears to be vulnerable to the interpretive objections that are frequently raised against economic analysis, in particular, that it leaves no place for some of tort law’s most familiar doctrinal structures, such as the relational structure of wrongdoing and the distinction between wronging someone and failing to confer a benefit on that person. For example, the priority attached to safety over convenience or profit-making applies not only to the taking of precautions but to assisting others who are endangered by natural perils; the same weighted cost/benefit analysis would seem to apply to the person who could make an easy rescue or, more generally, provide benefits to others. However morally meritorious such acts might be, and whatever might be said in favor of other forms of regulation mandating them, they are incongruous with the way in which tort law frames issues of interpersonal interaction.

4.7 Other Issues: Causation

Causation, which is a further element of the tort of negligence, has figured prominently in recent debates. Some of these debates are normative. They concern whether causation is relevant to liability, because the causal upshots of careless behavior are beyond the control of the person who is careless. This, too, is a debate prefigured in Holmes, who wrote

When a man commits an assault and battery with a pistol, his only act is to contract the muscles of his arm and forefinger in a certain way, but it is the delight of elementary writers to point out what a vast series of physical changes must take place before the harm is done. (1881: 91)

A number of writers have sought to explain the consistency of whichever moral ideas they suppose properly shape tort law with the role of luck in negligence liability, and with the fact that tort law has no analog of the criminal law’s category of attempt liability (Alexander 1987; Ripstein 1998; 2007; Ripstein & Zipursky 2001; Waldron 1997; Goldberg & Zipursky 2007).

Causation also raises conceptual issues. The basic legal rule for factual causation in a negligence action is that a defendant who has breached a duty of care to a plaintiff is not liable for an injury to that plaintiff unless the injury was caused by the defendant’s breach of the duty of care. The law understands the cause of an event as a necessary condition for its occurrence, typically cast in the vocabulary of “but-for” causation: but for the defendant’s negligence, would the plaintiff have been injured? If the plaintiff’s injury would have happened even had the defendant not been negligent, the plaintiff will not recover. This requirement raises puzzling cases involving overdetermination, as when a ship collides with two others in separate events, requiring it to be out of commission while each of its two sides is repaired, or when two defendants pass the plaintiff’s horse on opposite sides at the same time, startling it simultaneously, or when multiple fires merge. The but-for test is of no assistance in these cases, since it leads to the counterintuitive conclusion that neither defendant caused the plaintiff’s injury. Courts have developed various tools for dealing with these problems, and philosophers have offered interpretations of the problems.

A second causal issues arise in cases in which the ordinary burden of proof—the plaintiff must ordinarily establish each of the elements of a tort on the balance of probabilities—cannot be met because of factual uncertainty. In some cases, the factual uncertainty is itself the result of the negligence of multiple defendants, as when two hunters fire their guns negligently in the direction of a third, causing a piece of buckshot to lodge in the third hunter’s eye. Had the two defendants not been negligent, the plaintiff would not have been injured, but the presence of more than one defendant confounds the plaintiff’s hope of proving that either one caused the injury. The approach that most common-law courts (outside the UK) have adopted for dealing with these cases strike most commentators as both sensible and fair: both hunters are liable if they cannot causally exculpate themselves. There are, however, deep questions about whether the sensible rule about the burden of proof amounts to a limited rejection of the causation requirement, or whether instead it is a distinctive interpretation of causation. In cases involving large numbers of both plaintiffs and defendants, particularly in litigation involving mass torts, these questions are multiplied. Philosophers have tried to offer interpretations of the results in these cases, with some arguing that such cases require a different way of thinking about the place of causation in tort law (Thomson 1984; Ripstein & Zipursky 2001; Steel 2015a; 2015b).

A third causal issue arises in cases in which more than one precaution is available to a defendant that would render the defendant’s conduct safe enough (however that is to be determined). Some of those precautions might have prevented the specific injury suffered by the plaintiff and others not (although all would reduce the risk to an acceptable level). For example, two forms of medical precaution might make a procedure sufficiently safe but do so by reducing different aspects of its characteristic risks. If the defendant physician takes one of the precautions, but the other precaution would have prevented the injury suffered by the plaintiff, the injury was the realization of the risk, yet the defendant was not negligent. As both a legal and as a philosophical matter, the question “if the defendant had not been negligent, would the plaintiff have suffered the same injury?” seems to admit of no single answer, but rather to depend on which of the untaken precautions forms the relevant contrast case (Gilboa 2019).


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Legal Cases

  • Hall v Brooklands Auto Racing Club, [1933] 1 KB 205.
  • McQuire v Western Morning News [1903] 2 KB 100.

Other Internet Resources


I am grateful to Michael Law-Smith and Benjamin Zipursky for helpful comments

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Arthur Ripstein <>

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