Transcendental Arguments

First published Fri Feb 25, 2011; substantive revision Fri Jul 7, 2023

As standardly conceived, transcendental arguments are taken to be distinctive in involving a certain sort of claim, namely that X is a necessary condition for the possibility of Y—where then, given that Y is the case, it logically follows that X must be the case too. Moreover, because these arguments are generally used to respond to sceptics who take our knowledge claims to be problematic, the Y in question is then normally taken to be some fact about us or our mental life which the sceptic can be expected to accept without question (e.g., that we have experiences, or make certain judgements, or perform certain actions, or have certain capacities, and so on), where X is then something the sceptic doubts or denies (e.g., the existence of the external world, or of the necessary causal relation between events, or of other minds, or the force of moral reasons). In this way, it is hoped, scepticism can be overturned using transcendental arguments that embody such transcendental claims.

At first sight, this anti-sceptical potential of such arguments makes them seem powerful and attractive, by offering a proof of what otherwise might seem to be known only through inductive reasoning or fallible experience. However, as we shall see, transcendental arguments conceived of in this ambitious form have struggled to live up to this promise, though they still have their devotees. Nonetheless, the potential for such arguments has been kept alive, by reassessing their possible uses, where it has been suggested that they can perhaps be given a more modest role, which then makes them more viable and enables their apparent difficulties to be set aside. Whether this is indeed the case, and whether even if it is, this then leaves them denuded of their anti-sceptical value and allure, remains an open question, and will be discussed further below. We will then discuss some recent developments in modal metaphysics and epistemology to see if they provide useful conceptual resources. We will also consider how far transcendental arguments can serve a role not just in epistemology in defending our claims to knowledge, but also in ethics, in persuading the sceptic of the force of certain moral considerations and principles. Moreover, we will briefly discuss how transcendental arguments have been used in philosophy of psychology and perception, where anti-scepticism is often not the goal.

1. History and Exemplars

Although Immanuel Kant rarely uses the term ‘transcendental argument’, and when he does it is not in our current sense (cf. Hookway 1999: 180 n. 8; cf. Austin 1961), he nonetheless speaks frequently of ‘transcendental deductions’, ‘transcendental expositions’, and ‘transcendental proofs’, which roughly speaking have the force of what is today meant by ‘transcendental argument’. Prior exemplars of such arguments may perhaps be claimed, such as Aristotle’s proof of the principle of non-contradiction (see Metaphysics 1005b35–1006a28; Illies 2003: 45–6, Walker 2006: 240 and 255–6); but Kant nonetheless formulated what are generally taken to be the central examples of such arguments, so the history of the topic is usually assumed to start here, with the Critique of Pure Reason and its Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, Second Analogy, and Refutation of Idealism. Briefly put, the Deduction is directed against Humean scepticism concerning the applicability of a priori concepts to our experience; the Second Analogy concerns Humean doubts over causal powers or forces; while the Refutation of Idealism focuses on Cartesian (methodological) doubts concerning the existence of the external world.

Perhaps because of its brevity and relative clarity, but also perhaps because of the hope it can be made ‘self-standing’ and independent of the (to some) disreputable machinery of transcendental idealism [see §3 of the entry on Immanuel Kant], it is the Refutation that has become the paradigm to many of a transcendental argument. While the wisdom of this can be questioned (cf. Bell 1999, where the Refutation is called ‘a mistaken paradigm’), the Refutation undoubtedly makes a useful place for us to start.

As presented by Kant, the Refutation is aimed at the ‘problematic idealism of Descartes’, who holds that the existence of objects outside us in space is ‘doubtful and indemonstrable’ (Kant 1781/1787 B274)—where, as Kant famously remarks in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique in which he comments on the Refutation, ‘it always remains a scandal of philosophy and universal human reason that the existence of things outside us (from which we after all get the whole matter for our cognitions, even for our inner sense) should have to be assumed merely on faith, and that if it occurs to anyone to doubt it, we should be unable to answer him with a satisfactory proof’ (Kant 1781/1787 Bxxxix note). Kant’s strategy in response then sets the canonical pattern for a transcendental argument, in beginning from what the sceptic takes for granted, namely that we have mental states which we experience as having a temporal order, and then arguing for the transcendental claim that experience of this sort would not be possible unless we also had generally veridical experience of things in space outside us, and thus knowledge of the external world. In more detail, the argument can be presented as follows (cf. Kant 1781/1787 B275–79 and Bxxxix–xli note):

You are aware of your inner mental states (thoughts and sensations) as having a temporal order (e.g., that the sensation of pain you are having now was preceded in time by a feeling of pleasure).
To be aware of your mental states as having a temporal order, you must be aware of something that existed from the time of your previous mental state to the present.
For that awareness of permanence to be possible, it is not sufficient to have awareness of your self (because no permanent self is revealed to us in inner sense, as Hume argued: see Hume 1739–40: 252) or to have impressions or representations (because these impressions have a ‘perishing existence’, as Hume also argued: see Hume 1739–40: 194).


The ‘permanent’ of which you are aware must be something that is neither you qua subject nor your subjective impressions but must be something distinct from both of these, that is, an object outside you in the external world.


Your awareness of the external world cannot come from a prior awareness of your subjective impressions because the latter awareness is not possible without the former, and so awareness of the external world cannot be based on the imagination but rather comes from generally veridical experiences.

In this way, Kant hoped to ‘turn the game played by idealism against itself’ (cf. B276), by working from the inner experience that it takes for granted and showing that this depends on an outer experience which the idealist doubts, so that in this manner the ‘scandal to philosophy’ posed by such doubts can finally be resolved.

However, despite its brevity, the Refutation has given rise to considerable dispute and discussion, not only because questions can be raised about the details of the argument, but also because Kant’s wider theoretical commitments to transcendental idealism have also rendered the Refutation problematic and his intentions unclear: for example, doesn’t the argument undermine Kant’s own idealism in some way, and how does the Refutation relate to the somewhat similar argument in the Fourth Paralogism of the first edition of the Critique (A366–80), but in which an appeal to transcendental idealism plays a greater role? These complications have led to a range of disputes concerning the Refutation, from whether or not it can be made cogent, to whether or not it fits within Kant’s own philosophical project, and indeed whether focusing on this as Kant’s response to scepticism distorts his conception of scepticism, and how he thought it should be resolved. (For further discussion of the Refutation, see Guyer 1987: 279–332, Caranti 2007, Dicker 2008.)

Transcendental arguments found a place in philosophy after Kant, including in the post-Kantian German idealist tradition (cf. Franks 1999, Franks 2005: 201–59, Taylor 1976, Beiser 2005: 174–91, Rockmore & Breazeale 2014, Nance 2015, Tse 2020, Schüz 2022; but for some critical discussion of Taylor see Stern 2013 and Houlgate 2015, and of Beiser see Stern 2012). However, their prominence in more contemporary analytic philosophy is largely due to the work of P. F. Strawson, and particularly his earlier books Individuals and The Bounds of Sense—the latter of which is a commentary on Kant’s Critique, while the former is written under its influence in a broader way (cf. Grundmann 1994; Niquet 1991; Callanan 2011). One example from these works is the ‘objectivity argument’ to be found in The Bounds of Sense, which aims to show that ‘[u]nity of diverse experiences in a single consciousness requires experience of objects’; the argument may be outlined as follows (see Strawson 1966: 97–112, esp. 108; also see Cassam 1997, Cheng 2021a):

Being self-conscious is a matter of being able to ascribe diverse experiences to oneself, while being conscious of the unity of that to which they are ascribed.
To be in a position to think of experiences as one’s own, one must be able to think of them as experiences.
For experience to be such as to provide room for thought of experience itself, it must provide room for a distinction between ‘This is how things are’ and ‘This is how things are experienced as being’.
Only experience of objects that are subject-independent could provide room for this is/seems distinction.


Subject-independent objects exist.

In this way, Strawson hoped to capture what he took to be the central core of Kant’s position, but without appeal to the ‘doctrines of transcendental psychology’ (Strawson 1966: 97), which he found to be problematic. Likewise, in Individuals, Strawson presented an argument starting from the premise that we think of the world as containing objective particulars in a single spatiotemporal system, to the conclusion that objects continue to exist unperceived, where the latter is said to be required in order to make possible the kind of identification and re-identification necessary for the former (cf. Strawson 1959: 31–58). Thus, as Strawson famously put it, the sceptic ‘pretends to accept a conceptual scheme’ of a world containing objects in a spatio-temporal system, ‘but at the same time quietly rejects one of the conditions of its employment’ (Strawson 1959: 35).

On the basis of the promise of arguments of this sort from Strawson, and from others (such as Shoemaker 1963: 168–9), together with growing interest in the work of Kant himself within analytic philosophy, this period of the late 1950s and early 1960s was a significant one for the history of transcendental arguments, leading to much subsequent discussion. At the same time, central Wittgensteinian doctrines prominent at the time (such as the notion of ‘criteria’: see §1.3 of the entry on other minds) were also given a transcendental inflection, so certain Wittgensteinian claims came to take on the form of transcendental arguments (cf. Rorty 1971: 3, where he comments that ‘Many admirers of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations and of Strawson’s Individuals have taken the theme of both books to be an analysis of philosophical skepticism and their distinctive contribution to be a new way of criticizing the skeptic’). However, crucial to the debates of the period were also a number of critical articles pointing to the perceived limitation of the transcendental approach, including those by Stefan Körner (Körner 1966, 1967, 1969) and by Barry Stroud (Stroud 1968), where the latter in particular shaped the ensuing discussion over the value of transcendental arguments and what they could be expected to achieve, as we shall see in section 3.

Nonetheless, while the intervention by Stroud and others led to doubts about the value of transcendental arguments, as theorists asked if these critiques held good and if so what might remain of the transcendental approach, this did not deter prominent philosophers continuing to produce transcendental arguments. Two of these may serve as further exemplars of the genre, where both have gone on to be much discussed. The first was offered by Hilary Putnam in relation to external world skepticism once again, and the second by Donald Davidson, this time relating more directly to the problem of other minds.

Putnam’s argument comes in Chapter 1 of Reason, Truth and History, where his goal is to refute a modern-day version of Descartes’ evil demon hypothesis, according to which I do not inhabit a world containing ordinary physical objects (trees, tables, houses), but I am a brain in a vat in a lab whose experiences are caused by a computer artificially stimulating my nerve endings, so that none of these objects actually exist beyond my hallucinatory impression of them (see the entries on Brains in a Vat and Skepticism and Content Externalism). This is the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, and it stands for the possibility that, for all I know, nothing rules out the world being very different from how it appears to me to be, given the gap that exists between appearance (our experience of it) and reality.

Now, Putnam’s response to the sceptic is to argue that though we cannot rule out the possibility that we are brains-in-vats on the grounds of how things appear to us, we can rule it out nonetheless. How? Here is one reconstruction of the reasoning: we can rule it out because on a plausible theory of reference, it is self-refuting: that is, ‘I am a brain-in-a-vat [or BIV, for short]’ cannot be truly affirmed by anyone. The theory of reference Putnam uses as a premise is a causal one, which states that ‘one cannot refer to certain kinds of things, e.g., trees, if one has no causal interaction at all with them, or with things in terms of which they can be described’ (Putnam 1981: 16–17). Putnam defends this theory, on the grounds that it alone can explain how reference occurs in a way that is not ‘magical’, i.e., which does not assume that the connection is just somehow intrinsic between representations and their referents. It then follows, according to Putnam, that a BIV affirming ‘I am a BIV’ is saying something true only if the BIV is in what the BIV is calling a ‘vat’. But the BIV is not in one of those; rather, he is in a real vat. What he is calling a ‘vat’ is that to which his use of that term causally connects in a referential way—where for a BIV, that is something in the computer that prompts his applications of ‘vat’ by giving him hallucinations of the appearance of vats. Yet the BIV is not in that part of the computer. Thus, Putnam concludes, ‘I am a BIV’ cannot be truly asserted by anyone, much like ‘I do not exist’ or ‘I cannot construct a meaningful sentence’ (cf. Bardon 2005). It therefore cannot ever be wrong to assert that one is not a BIV, so that in this sense ‘I am not a BIV’ is an incorrigible claim (cf. Putnam 1981: 14–15). Putnam therefore holds that we can rule out the BIV hypothesis on a priori grounds, and thus refute the sceptic.

Putnam is keen to emphasise the transcendental nature of his enterprise in this respect. He stresses that the kinds of constraints on reference that operate here and disprove the BIV hypothesis are not physical or merely analytic, but involve limitations on what is possible that can be arrived at through philosophical reflection on the nature of representation and meaning, and hence fit into a broadly Kantian model of how to respond to scepticism, albeit with more empirical elements:

What we have been doing is considering the preconditions for thinking about, representing, referring to, etc. We have investigated these preconditions not by investigating the meaning of these words and phrases (as a linguist might, for example) but by reasoning a priori. Not in the old ‘absolute’ sense (since we do not claim that magical theories of reference are a priori wrong), but in the sense of inquiring into what is reasonably possible assuming certain general premisses, or making certain very broad theoretical assumptions. Such a procedure is neither ‘empirical’ nor quite ‘a priori’, but has elements of both ways of investigating. In spite of the fallibility of my procedure, and its dependence upon assumptions which might be described as ‘empirical’ (e.g., the assumption that the mind has no access to external things or properties apart from that provided by the senses), my procedure has a close relation to what Kant called a ‘transcendental’ investigation; for it is an investigation, I repeat, of the preconditions of reference and hence of thought—preconditions built in to the nature of our minds themselves, though not (as Kant hoped) wholly independent of empirical assumptions. (Putnam 1981: 16)

As a result of his attempt to respond to external world scepticism in this way, Putnam has had an important influence in reviving interest in the possibility of using transcendental arguments against scepticism. (For further discussion of Putnam’s position, see Brueckner 1986, Coppock 1987, Heil 1987, David 1991, Brueckner 1992, Caranti 2007: 110–13.)

Finally, we may turn to the work of Donald Davidson, who like Putnam bases his transcendental claim on a form of externalism, which links the content of our mental states to how we relate to our environment; but in his case, this idea is directed against scepticism concerning other minds. Thus, while the sceptic holds that the existence of such minds is doubtful, Davidson argues that it would not be possible for a creature like me to have thoughts unless I lived in a world with other creatures who also had thoughts, so the truth of the latter can be deduced from the fact that I am indeed capable of thinking: ‘What are the conditions necessary for the existence of thought, and so in particular for the existence of people with thoughts? I believe there could not be thoughts in one mind if there were no other thoughtful creatures with which the first mind shared a natural world’ (Davidson 1989: 193; note that he uses ‘existence,’ not ‘possibility’). On one interpretation, Davidson’s transcendental argument is based on his account of what it takes for a thought to have content, for which he argues that a process of ‘triangulation’ must occur, whereby the content of the thought someone is having is ‘fixed’ by the way in which someone else correlates the responses he makes to something in the world. Thus, Davidson argues, if there were no other people, the content of our thoughts would be totally indeterminate, and we would in effect have no thoughts at all; from the self-evident falsity of the latter, he therefore deduces the falsity of the former (cf. Davidson 1991: 159–60). Davidson therefore argues that the mistake the sceptic makes, in common with the Cartesian heritage of which he is part, is in the assumption that it is possible to be a lone thinker: Davidson’s transcendental argument is designed to show that this is not in fact the case, given the constraints on what it takes to have thoughts with content, so that the existence of a single thinking subject entails the existence of others.

As Davidson suggests (cf. Davidson 1991: 157), his position here might be said to have certain similarities to that put forward in Wittgenstein’s Private Language Argument, at least under the interpretation given by Kripke (see Kripke 1982). Kripke takes Wittgenstein as arguing that it is impossible to make sense of what it is to follow a rule correctly, unless this means that what one is doing is following the practice of others who are like-minded: what makes our continuation of some addition rule a case of rule-following at all (for example), is that the community goes on in the same way; and, unless addition were rule-governed as a practice, statements like ‘2+2=4’ could have no meaning. Thus, from the fact that we are able to make such statements meaningfully, the existence of a community of others that ‘fix’ this rule can be inferred, as a necessary pre-condition for the former (cf. Kripke 1982: 89). On this view, then, unless the sceptic is prepared to admit the existence of this community of fellow-speakers, and thus attribute a capacity for intentional rule-following to those around him, he cannot make sense of the idea of meaningful thought in his own case.

We have therefore seen that taking their inspiration from Kant to a greater or lesser degree, philosophers have come to develop a range of transcendental arguments that are intended to refute scepticism in a robust and ambitious manner, by establishing anti-sceptical conclusions on the basis of transcendental claims. From these exemplars and others, therefore, we may now say something further about how such arguments work and what makes them distinctive.

2. Key Features of Transcendental Arguments

From something like the canon of transcendental arguments outlined above, the characteristic marks and the significance of such arguments might be listed as follows:

1. Transcendental arguments are typically anti-sceptical, so that (as Strawson puts it) it is widely assumed that ‘the point of transcendental arguments in general is an anti-sceptical point’ (Strawson 1985: 10). Moreover, in the ambitious form in which we have considered them so far, they refute the sceptic in a direct manner, by purporting to prove what she doubts or questions, and they do so on their own, without bringing in any wider epistemological theories or considerations. And these arguments are what is sometimes called world-directed or ­truth-directed, as opposed to self-directed (cf. Peacocke 1989: 4; Cassam 1997: 33; Cassam 1999: 83): that is, they set out to establish the truth of some claim about how reality is and what it contains (such as subject-independent objects in space and time, or other minds, or causal laws).

2. Because of their anti-sceptical ambitions, transcendental arguments must begin from a starting point that the sceptic can be expected to accept, the necessary condition of which is then said to be something that the sceptic doubts or denies. This will then mean that such arguments are ineffective against very radical forms of scepticism, which doubt the laws of logic, and/or which refuse to accept any starting point as uncontentious; and it will also mean that they may be effective against a sceptic who is prepared to accept some starting point, but then ineffective against another sceptic who is not. But neither of these features of transcendental arguments need be felt to be disabling: for the scepticism of the radical sceptics is perhaps of dubious coherence, or at least of little interest because they seem so unwilling to engage with us, while the second limitation may mean merely that different transcendental arguments are required for different sceptical audiences.

3. Because of the need to find an uncontentious starting point, transcendental arguments will also then characteristically be first personal, by beginning from how I or we experience, think, judge, and so on. Thus, while it is perhaps reasonable to hold that there are necessary conditions for the possibility of ‘extra-personal’ entities such as material objects, substances, the universe, time and so on, a transcendental argument which is directed against scepticism is unlikely to be concerned with exploring such conditions, as the sceptic is unlikely to admit the existence of the things to which the conditions belong.

4. Transcendental arguments involve transcendental claims, to the effect that X is a necessary condition for the possibility of Y, where in saying this, the arguments do not assume this to be a matter of merely causal, natural, or nomological necessity. Given that their target is the sceptic who challenges our claims about the world, there are clearly two good reasons for this. First, although our observation of the world might suggest that experience has certain necessary causal conditions (e.g., light and sound must be transmitted between particular wavelengths), we can hardly use such considerations against a sceptic of this sort, for whom all such empirical knowledge is in question, and against whom we are therefore required to adopt a position that is less open to doubt in this way. Second, if the transcendental argument’s claim is one of only natural necessity, then this allows that there are metaphysically possible worlds (for example, where the laws of physics do not hold) in which this claim is false, again opening us up to the sceptical challenge of showing we are not in such a world.

5. However, if the transcendental claims involved are not a matter of merely causal or natural necessity, this then raises the question of what form of necessity they do in fact involve. If they were true in virtue of their meaning alone (even if unobviously so), and thus analytic, then the necessity might be said to be purely logical, where to deny the claim is then to assert some form of logical contradiction (cf. Bennett 1979, Walker 1978: 18–23, Walker 1989: 63–4, Bell 1999). Assuming that the problematic analytic/synthetic distinction is viable, this may still not seem to be the case in many instances of such transcendental claims, where in fact they may be said to be synthetic a priori (cf. Wilkerson 1976: 199–213). To many, nonetheless, it has appeared that the transcendental claim is not a logical necessity, but stands somewhere between that and natural necessity, perhaps putting it into the camp of metaphysical necessity, as this is sometimes understood: that is, a necessary relation which holds not by virtue of logical or causal constraints on the nature of logical or physical possibilities, but by virtue of metaphysical constraints on how things can be—much as the fact that nothing can be red and green all over is arguably not determined by any law of logic or causal law, but the nature of colour, and how it can be exemplified in things. There will be more on this in section 5 below.

6. It is then partly because of the apparently rather special nature of these transcendental claims, that the suspicion arises that there will then turn out to be something distinctively Kantian about such arguments; for Kant made it the focus of his critical project to account for metaphysical knowledge of this sort, where transcendental idealism is then supposed to provide the answer to how such knowledge is possible. The idea, roughly speaking, is that it is too much for us to be able to know how things must be beyond the limits of our experience, and so claim metaphysical knowledge of things-in-themselves. By contrast, once we confine ourselves to how things appear to us given our ways of seeing and thinking about the world, then we can understand how we could at least acquire knowledge of how things must behave as phenomena, by knowing about the forms of intuitions and concepts through which such phenomena must appear to us if we are to experience them at all (cf. Williams 1974, Pippin 1988, Stroud 1999, Stroud 2000a). However, as we saw in the case of Strawson, whether or not such full-blooded Kantian commitments are necessary to the transcendental argument strategy is a matter of dispute. Indeed, some have argued that there is a ‘neglected alternative’ here: namely, while Kant might be right to hold that we cannot plausibly claim insight into the constraints on the world itself but only on the nature of our sensibility and understanding, nonetheless we can argue from this that the world must itself be a certain way to fit these conditions, without thereby thinking that it is mind-dependent or that all we thereby know is how things appear to us. The analogy is thus drawn to a case such as the following: once we know how our lungs work, we can know what the air must be like in order to allow us to breath, without the nature of air being determined by how our lungs work (cf. Harrison 1989, Westphal 2004: 68–126).

The features discussed above therefore have a reasonable claim to be what make transcendental arguments distinctive, at least of the sort we have considered so far. However, as we shall now go on to see, transcendental arguments of this type have turned out to be open to serious objections, so that alternative models have been proposed which do not incorporate all these features in quite the same way.

3. Objections to Transcendental Arguments

Just as the rise in interest in transcendental arguments within twentieth-century philosophy can largely be traced back to the work of Strawson, so too the subsequent disillusionment can largely be traced back to the work of one person, namely Barry Stroud, in his influential 1968 article (Stroud 1968). In that paper, Stroud focused on the nature of the transcendental claim that the truth of some proposition S is a necessary condition for the possibility of language, but then argued that ‘the sceptic can always very plausibly insist that it is enough to make language possible if we believe that S is true, or that it looks for all the world as if it is, but that S needn’t actually be true’ (Stroud 1968 [2000b: 24]). Moreover, the general problem this raises is that if such a response by the sceptic is plausible in the case of language, perhaps it is also plausible in the case of other starting-points too? Thus, for example, when it comes to scepticism about the existence of the external world or other minds, maybe no argument can be constructed to show there must actually be such a world or minds as a condition for inner experience or the having of thoughts, but just that we must believe them to exist, or that they must seem to us to do so—which hardly looks like enough to quash sceptical doubts on these matters.

Now, in the 1968 paper, Stroud appears to get to his conclusion by arguing from an analysis of specific cases (viz. arguments proposed by Strawson and Shoemaker in Strawson 1959 and Shoemaker 1963 respectively). But then, this may seem to leave open the hope that even if these arguments fall to his critique, others may not. However, in subsequent work, Stroud has said more to substantiate his objection and make it seem more likely to hold across the board. For, while he allows that we might reasonably be able to make modal claims about ‘how our thinking in certain ways necessarily requires that we also think in certain other ways’, he believes it is puzzling ‘how…truths about the world which appear to say or imply nothing about human thought or experience’ (for example, that things exist outside us in space and time, or that there are other minds) ‘[can] be shown to be genuinely necessary conditions of such psychological facts as that we think and experience things in certain ways, from which the proofs begin’. Stroud goes on: ‘It would seem that we must find, and cross, a bridge of necessity from the one to the other. That would be a truly remarkable feat, and some convincing explanation would surely be needed of how the whole thing is possible’ (Stroud 1994 [2000b: 158–9; cf. also 212]). Thus, Stroud is prepared to allow ‘that we can come to see how our thinking in certain ways necessarily requires that we also think in certain other ways, and so perhaps in certain other ways as well, and we can appreciate how rich and complicated the relations between those ways of thinking must be’ (Stroud 1994 [2000b: 158–9]); but he believes that anything more than this, which asserts that ‘non-psychological facts’ about the world outside us constitute necessary conditions for our thinking, is problematic.

Then, having apparently established that the strongest defensible transcendental claims concern merely how things must appear to us or what we must believe, the second stage of Stroud’s argument is that in order to bridge the gap that this has opened up, and to get to a conclusion about how things actually are, one must opt either for verificationism or idealism. The former holds that in order to be meaningful, a sentence must say something that we can determine to be true or false. If so, then we cannot be left in the limbo of sceptical doubt behind a veil of appearances wondering where the truth lies. The latter sees no gap between how the world is and how we think things are or merely appear to us. However, aside from the potentially problematic nature of both these positions, an appeal to either verificationism or idealism is also dialectically unsatisfactory, as any such appeal would appear to render the transcendental argument itself redundant—for each on its own is powerful enough to disarm sceptical worries, without the transcendental manoeuvre now being required (cf. Stroud 1968 [2000b: 24–5]). In this way, Stroud has convinced many that the proponent of transcendental arguments faces an unattractive dilemma: either to dispense with verificationism or idealism, but fall short of the anti-sceptical conclusion concerning how things are; or to accept verificationism or idealism, but then make the transcendental argument itself superfluous.

The problem that Stroud has highlighted may be briefly illustrated by returning to the exemplars of transcendental arguments that we considered in Section 1. Thus, when it comes to Kant’s Refutation of Idealism, it can be said that the most that Kant really establishes is that we have experience as of things outside us in space, while all that Strawson’s objectivity argument shows is that we must apply the is/seems distinction to our experience, and so believe that things exist without us experiencing them, but that this doesn’t do enough to show that this distinction is really a valid one (cf. Wilkerson 1976: 57, Brueckner 1989). Likewise, against Putnam it is argued that the sceptic can challenge his externalist theory of reference, where on a more internalist view, you could then think about being in a vat even if you were in one, as the meaning of ‘vat’ no longer depends on your relations to the world; or, if Putnam insists on his externalism, it could be claimed that this is already a position that rules out scepticism because it assumes that the mind and world are linked in important ways, making it unnecessary to make appeal to the specific transcendental argument that Putnam rests upon it (cf. McCulloch 1999). Similarly, against Davidson it can be argued that thought would be possible, even if the ‘others’ with which one ‘triangulated’ were nothing but robots or automata; or again, if this is ruled out by appeal to some form of semantic externalism, this then renders the transcendental argument redundant. In all these cases, therefore, it may appear that Stroudian objections can be used to damaging effect.

Thus, applying Stroud’s concerns to a range of arguments in this way may seem to support the view that the transcendental arguments so far produced succumb to his dilemma (although, of course, attempts to bolster the arguments can also be made). Nonetheless, it might be felt that unless Stroud can substantiate his more principled objection to the very possibility of crossing the ‘bridge of necessity’ that is required by any sort of world-directed transcendental claim, he has still not yet established conclusively that no transcendental argument can be made to work, and must always either fall short or end up being superfluous. So the question arises: how powerful is his suggestion that a ‘truly remarkable feat’ is required here, one that we have good reason to think cannot feasibly be accomplished?

Perhaps one difficulty that can be raised for Stroud, is that while he thinks there is something inherently problematic in making a claim about how the world must be as a condition for our thought or experience, he does not think that there is anything particularly problematic about claiming that our thought or experience is a necessary condition for some other aspect of our thought or experience—indeed, he exploits such claims himself in his own arguments against the sceptic (cf. Stroud 1994 [2000b: 165–76]). But how can claims of necessary connections between some thoughts or experience and some others be defended more cogently than claims of necessary connections between some thoughts or experience and the world? Why are such ‘bridges’ or modal connections easier to make ‘within thought’ than between how we think and how the world must be to make that thought possible? Now, one might take this symmetry between the two to be reason to be suspicious of claims of necessary connections both between some thoughts and the world and between some thoughts and other thoughts about the world: but as we have seen, Stroud himself seems to think they are viable between ‘psychological facts’ (cf. Stroud 2000a [2000b: 224–44]). If so, it could be argued, he needs to give us some account of why they are less problematic here than between our thought and the world; but in fact he just seems to take it to be obvious, and so provides no such account (cf. Cassam 1987: 356–7; Glock 2003: 38–9).

However, even if Stroud’s position is indeed weaker than it may at first appear, this does not mean that transcendental arguments are in the clear when it comes to the world-directed transcendental claims they embody. For, a different worry to the same effect can also be urged against them, which in this case relates to the dialectics of our engagements with scepticism (cf. Stern 2007). The central thought is this: On the one hand, the sceptic is often conceived as grounding her doubts on the fallibility of our ordinary belief-forming processes, such as perception and memory. On the other hand, the proponent of a transcendental argument hopes to answer her doubts by advancing the claim that X is a necessary condition for the possibility of Y and so deduce the former from the latter. But the dialectical concern this raises is this: why, if the sceptic is dubious about cognitive methods like perception and memory, should she be any more sanguine about the methods we have used (whatever these are) to arrive at the modal claims embodied in the transcendental argument?

Now, one line of response might be to say that the doubts the sceptic raises over our modal knowledge here can themselves be blocked or shown to be spurious, for example, by providing evidence for the reliability of our methods in the modal case, or questioning the right of the sceptic to use the mere possibility of error against such knowledge. But then, it seems likely that similar claims could also be used to bolster the credentials of our non-transcendental bases for knowledge, such as perception and memory, in a way that would then render the transcendental argument redundant.

Thus, even if Stroud’s own critique of transcendental arguments is found wanting, it seems that another along these lines can be put in its place, leading to a similar dilemma: either transcendental arguments are offered to try to establish what the sceptic questions, but are then vulnerable to sceptical doubts concerning the truth of the modal claims they employ; or they can successfully respond to those doubts, but in ways that then seem likely to render our non-transcendental grounds for knowledge legitimate too, so that our conviction concerning such knowledge no longer seems to need to make any appeal to a transcendental argument.

One further thought is that perhaps the main problem is a consequence of mistakenly supposing that transcendental arguments should be deductively valid. Note that Kant himself used the corresponding German phrase of ‘deduction’ in a different sense (see the entry on Kant’s Transcendental Arguments). One possibility is that such arguments should be taken as abductive ones, involving inference to the best explanation (Hoffmann 2019, Allen 2021, Reynolds 2022): the idea is that although one cannot deductively infer X from the possibility of Y, one can claim that X is the best explanation of Y’s being possible. In making such an inference, one needs to list various candidate explanations and give good reason to think that the one being favored is indeed the best explanation. If this path is taken, it might engender worries about the distinctness and power of transcendental arguments. In the next section we will see more responses to the above objections.

4. Responses to Objections

While it would be premature to say that attempts to construct ambitious world-directed transcendental arguments have been entirely abandoned (see e.g., Peacocke 1989, Grundmann & Misselhorn 2003), nonetheless the most common way of responding to these Stroudian difficulties has been to re-think how transcendental arguments might be best used, and to come up with strategies that are in various ways more modest than those we have discussed so far. What characterises such modest responses is the idea that Stroud is indeed right that all we can really substantiate by way of a transcendental claim is how things must appear to us or how we must believe them to be—but then attempt to make this weakened claim do some anti-sceptical work. We will briefly consider four such responses: one from Strawson’s earlier work; one from his later writings; one from Stroud; and one from Stern 2000. (For other recent examples of less ambitious transcendental arguments, see Chang 2008 and Massimi 2014; also see Coates 2017 on Strawson 1962).

The first response takes its inspiration from a re-consideration of the Strawsonian transcendental arguments that were criticised by Stroud, but offers a different interpretation of them in the light of that critique. Thus, it is suggested, the mistake is to see Strawson’s argument as straightforwardly world-directed in the way that it was presented earlier, as offering a direct response to the sceptic by proving what the sceptic doubts. Rather, it is said, the strategy is more like Aristotle’s elenchic response to the sceptic who doubts the principle of non-contradiction: namely, to show that her doubts cannot be intelligibly stated or expressed, as acceptance of this principle is a necessary condition for having meaningful thought at all. Likewise, therefore, it can be suggested that Strawson intended his transcendental approach to operate in the same way, where (as Strawson puts it) ‘[the sceptic’s] doubts are unreal, not simply because they are logically unresolvable doubts, but because they amount to the rejection of the whole conceptual scheme within which alone such doubts make sense’ (Strawson 1959: 35; cf. also 106 and 109, and also Glock 2003: 35–6 and Illies 2003: 44–56). Thus, it may seem, a modest transcendental claim is all that we require, to the effect that the sceptic cannot raise a doubt to challenge us here, given what she must believe in order for her to think or utter anything intelligible at all. The transcendental argument is effective, therefore, not by showing that what the sceptic doubts is false, but by showing that those doubts have violated the conditions of meaningfulness, and thus require no positive answer or response.

Now, whether or not this is the most charitable way of reading Strawson’s earlier position, he himself does not seem to have adopted quite this first response when he came to reply to Stroud in his later work. Rather, while he accepts Stroud’s insistence that the transcendental claim must be weakened (cf. Strawson 1985: 9), he then also offers what he call a naturalistic reply to the sceptic based on Hume and also on some Wittgensteinian ideas developed in On Certainty, according to which the right approach to sceptical doubts is not to try to answer them with an argument, but to show them to be ‘idle’, as unable to shift those core beliefs which are implanted in us by nature or which lie at the centre of our ways of thinking (cf. Strawson 1985: 13). Here, then, the approach is not about the meaninglessness or unintelligibility of sceptical doubt (as on the first response), but on its inability to shift or dislodge our beliefs because of their embeddedness within our thinking (where semantic issues need not be the only consideration in rendering them embedded in this way). Within this naturalistic approach, therefore, Strawson suggests that transcendental arguments can do valuable work, in precisely helping us to show the sceptic that some beliefs are fundamental to us in this way, and thus impervious to sceptical doubt just as the naturalist claims—but where to play this role, the transcendental claim only has to be a modest one, concerning what we must believe, not how things are (cf. Strawson 1985: 21–23; see also Grayling 1985 and Callanan 2011).

A third type of modest approach is offered by Stroud himself, where he claims that even a transcendental argument which shows what we must believe can have anti-sceptical value, in showing that these beliefs are indispensable and invulnerable, in the sense that we not only cannot abandon them, but also we cannot find them to be false in ourselves or others, because to so find them would be to give up believing anything at all. However, Stroud allows that this sort of status for the belief in question—for example, the belief that there are enduring particulars, or other minds—does not go as far as ruling out the possibility that belief of this sort are in fact not true (see Stroud 1994, 1999).

Finally, in Stern 2000, it is argued that modest transcendental arguments can be shown to be useful against scepticism, once we distinguish sufficiently carefully between the kinds of scepticism there are, and go for the right target or targets—where a less demanding form of scepticism may perhaps be defeated by a less ambitious transcendental claim. So, for example, if we take the target to be a sceptic who demands certainty, then a modest transcendental argument will not suffice. But if we take the sceptic to be one who demands merely justification that may nonetheless be fallible, and who claims we do not have even this because our beliefs are not properly supported by our generally accepted cognitive norms, then (it is claimed) a modest transcendental argument can indeed be useful. So, for example, the justificatory sceptic may claim that our belief in other minds seems to be grounded on nothing but the link between behaviour and mentality that we observe in our own case; but then, she can argue, it is based on little more than a poor argument from analogy, which we are not properly warranted in extending to others, as we are arguing from only a single instance (viz., ourselves), which is an inadequate inductive base on which to reason in this way. In response, however, it could be argued that unless others appeared to us as more than mere bodies, but instead as persons with minds, we could not acquire the capacity to apply mentalistic predicates to ourselves, and thus become self-conscious. This argument remains ‘modest’ because its transcendental claim extends only to how others must appear to us, and so is not ‘world-directed’ in the manner of more ambitious transcendental arguments; but even so, the idea is, it is still sufficient to show that our belief in these other minds is not merely based on a faulty inference in the way that the justificatory sceptic supposes, but rather on the nature of our experience—where as such, it can therefore be used to show that this belief is warranted, even if it could still be false.

Now, none of these approaches is unobjectionable, and it remains to be seen which, if any, is to be preferred. Concern about the Aristotelian approach can relate to whether it can show that belief in X is necessary for intelligible thought in general, or for thought by creatures like us—where if it only establishes the latter, the possibility of a sceptic raising intelligible doubts about it would seem to remain, while establishing the former seems extremely demanding if not impossible (cf. Körner 1967). Further, the worry might be raised in a Stroudian spirit, that all this approach shows is that doubts cannot be coherently expressed concerning X, but where that then seems to fall short of establishing that X is really the case. And finally, while it may perhaps seem right to say that there is something unintelligible or meaningless about questioning the principle of non-contradiction (although this can also be challenged: cf. Priest 1987), other sceptical doubts do not seem problematic to the same degree. (For further discussion points of this sort, see Illies 2003: 54–63.) Along similar lines, critics have also questioned Strawson’s naturalistic approach, as not fully answering the sceptical challenge: for even if a doubt here is ‘idle’, it does not follow that what is questioned is really true (cf. Valberg 1992: 168–96, Sen 1995). Likewise, when it comes to Stroud’s position, as he himself admits, the indispensability and invulnerability he speaks of ‘might not seem like much reassurance in the face of a general scepticism’ (Stroud 1999: 168), given that it not only does not rule out the possibility of falsity, but also seemingly gives no additional reasons for taking that possibility less seriously. Moreover, it has been suggested that Stroud’s position is unstable, as the claim that certain beliefs are invulnerable on the one hand, and the acceptance that they might be untrue on the other, seem to stand in tension with one another (see Brueckner 1996). The position proposed in Stern 2000 tries to get round these difficulties, but has also been accused of ducking important aspects of the sceptic’s challenge (see e.g., Sacks 1999 and 2000: 276–85; and for Sack’s own positive proposals, see Sacks 2005a, 2005b and 2006). Finally, for an attempt to adopt an approach that is neither ambitious or modest, but somewhere between the two, see McDowell 2006.

Whatever their respective strengths and weaknesses, one thing these modest strategies have suggested is that some of the central features of transcendental arguments outlined above do not fit arguments of this less ambitious sort. Thus, these arguments are not world-directed, but are self-, experience-, or belief-directed. Secondly, they do not expect the transcendental arguments to refute the sceptic on their own (as it were), but in conjunction with broader epistemological or anti-sceptical considerations (such as naturalism, or perceptual and other epistemic norms). Thirdly, by offering an approach that is more modest, they raise the question of how much adequate responses to scepticism are entitled to assume and what kinds of reassurance they are meant to provide (cf. Hookway 1999; Cassam 2007: 51–84; Wang 2012). And in all these ways, they have raised exegetical issues about how Kant’s place in the canon discussed above might be understood differently, concerning his attitude to scepticism and whether in the end his intentions are best interpreted in ‘modest’ or more ambitious terms (cf. Callanan 2006; Bardon 2006; Stapelford 2008).

5. Connections to Modal Metaphysics and Epistemology

In listing key features of transcendental arguments in section 2, it was indicated that metaphysical necessity might be the right kind of modality for transcendental arguments, and this brings the discussion to the realm of modal metaphysics. To begin with, if one is sceptical about modality anyway (Quine 1953), then using modality to understand transcendental arguments is a non-starter. However, if one is comfortable with modality in general, it is then a natural way to analyse transcendental arguments. After all, transcendental arguments can be seen as offering certain kind of philosophical explanation—‘transcendental explanation’, as it is sometimes called—and given this, metaphysical explanations of various sorts are natural candidates. More specifically, with our schema above, we should say that X transcendentally explains the possibility of Y, or more succinctly, X possibilitates Y, and this relation should be understood with metaphysical modalities. This picture is not universally shared: some hold that in answering transcendental how-possible questions, identifying the necessary conditions for the targets is explanatorily idle (Cassam 2007).

Modal metaphysics is itself a difficult area that involves all kinds of sophisticated theories, such as realism, ersatzism, fictionalism, to name just a few (see entry on varieties of modality). Fortunately, to analyse transcendental arguments with metaphysical modality, there is no need to commit to any theory of the nature of metaphysical necessity. In effect, what is more relevant is modal epistemology; more specifically, how one manages to know whether a given modal claim is true or not. To see how this is so, let’s use this toy example:

Kantian categories are necessary conditions for the possibility of objective cognition.

We will use “Kantian categories” as a placeholder for any candidates for being the relevant conditions. To analyse this with metaphysical necessity, this statement can be paraphrased as follows:

It is metaphysically necessary that if there is objective cognition, then Kantian categories are in place.

Now, how do we know, or at least try to figure out, the truth or falsity of such a statement? This is where modal epistemology enters the scene. As with many other areas in philosophy, the territory is often divided into rationalism and empiricism, though admittedly such division can also miss the subtleties among different views. In any case, one major view within the rationalist tradition is the conceivability approach (Yablo 1993; Chalmers 1996, 2010). According to such an approach, knowledge of the above statement about metaphysical necessity is based on knowledge of the following:

It is inconceivable that there is objective cognition without there being categories in place.

The rationale for this move is that according to such an approach, conceivability is a guide to metaphysical possibility, while inconceivability is a guide to metaphysical impossibility. Given this, if it is metaphysically necessary that if A then B, then it is not metaphysically possible that there is A without B. Now it is natural to expect that the difficulties with the conceivability approach will thereby translate into this rendering of transcendental arguments, in roughly this way: this rendering assumes that inconceivability entails metaphysical impossibility, but such entailment does not hold, because inconceivability might just reflect human’s lack of imagination, and therefore transcendental arguments are in trouble (Mizrahi 2017). When Mizrahi makes this claim, he uses Kant’s Refutation of Idealism as the prime example, but he intends this point to be applied to other transcendental arguments too.

However, note that defenders of transcendental arguments have at least two ways to respond to such a challenge. First, to understand the transcendental conditionals (i.e., claims asserting that the possibility of Y requires or presupposes X) as (in)conceivability claims is not mandatory. Second, even if we understand the conditionals this way, there is a weaker version of the conceivability approach which holds that (in)conceivability is only a guide to (im)possibility, which is obviously much more defensible than the stronger version that involves entailment. To be sure, some might find this version too weak to secure the distinctiveness of certain arguments being ‘transcendental.’ If one goes down the first route, one can opt for other approaches in modal epistemology. For example, another camp of rationalism in this area is the essentialist approach (Fine 1995; Lowe 2011, 2012, 2013). According to such an approach, knowledge of the above statement about metaphysical necessity is based on knowledge of the following:

It is part of the essence of objective cognition that if there is objective cognition, then categories are in place.

Now again, this rendering inherits all the problems with such approaches, which will not be covered here (see the entry on the epistemology of modality). One can then reject rationalism in this area and opt for an entirely different camp, for example the counterfactual approach (Williamson, 2005, 2007, 2016). According to such an approach, knowledge of the above statement about metaphysical necessity is based on knowledge of the following:

If there were objective cognition without there being categories in place, then there would be a contradiction.


Objective cognition without categories counterfactually implies a contradiction.

This approach invokes certain notion of ‘imaginative simulation’ to model the inference, and it is sometimes said that such an exercise is neither a priori nor a posteriori, but ‘armchair’ (Williamson 2013). Whether this threefold distinction is reasonable is controversial, as it is generally thought that armchair inferences are a priori inferences. Now, note that the same dialectic recurs: this rendering inherits all the problems with such approach, and one might therefore wish to opt for a different analysis (for more on connecting transcendental arguments and counterfactuals, see Kannisto 2020).

The point of the above discussion is not to present all the approaches in modal epistemology; for example, there are other approaches such as the one that invokes analogical inferences (Roca-Royes 2017). There are also approaches that might combine several ideas, for example Husserl’s ‘imaginative variation’ that combines conceivability and essence (1931/2012). The key message here is that if transcendental conditionals can be thought to embody claims about metaphysical modalities, then both considerations from modal metaphysics and modal epistemology—especially the latter—will influence what we should say about such conditionals. Another potential direction is to see whether metaphysical grounding can be an explanation of transcendental conditionals (see the entry on metaphysical grounding). Although it can be tempting and potentially enlightening to connect these contemporary approaches to the historical tradition, no claim about a direct historical connection is made here: it should not be assumed—without textual analyses anyway—that any above approach captures what Kant, Fichte, and other historical figures had in mind when they invoked such arguments.

6. Transcendental Arguments in Ethics

As we have seen, then, when it comes to transcendental arguments in epistemology, most of the effort in recent years has been concentrated at the meta-level, concerning what transcendental arguments are and what they can be expected to achieve: when it comes to examples of transcendental arguments themselves, very few new ones have actually been proposed (for exceptions, see Lockie 2018, Cheng 2022). However, the picture is different in ethics, where attempts to produce such arguments are still being made, so that while epistemology perhaps remains their natural home, the use of transcendental arguments in ethics is of undoubted significance (see for example Brune, Stern and Werner (eds.) 2017). Moreover, as with such arguments in epistemology, when it comes to transcendental claims in ethics, Kant may again be taken as an important inspiration, especially Kant 1785.

In fact, in view of what was said previously regarding the problems of transcendental arguments, it is perhaps not really surprising that ethicists have had fewer qualms in producing them. For, as we saw, the difficulty when it comes to external world scepticism, other minds scepticism, and the like, is in finding an argument that will successfully cross Stroud’s ‘bridge of necessity’, and establish a conclusion concerning how things are, rather than how things must appear or how we must believe them to be, and so reach a conclusion that will satisfy the realist about such matters. However, in ethics, it is much more acceptable to reject realism, and to adopt a more anti-realist position of some sort at the outset (cf. Rähme 2017); as a result, the most that will be called for is a modest transcendental argument which is not world-directed, as many ethicists do not want to treat moral values and norms as part of the ‘world’ anyway, and so see no victory for the sceptic in failing to establish any more ambitious conclusion, where this may still be a worry in the epistemological cases.

While until recently there was only a limited discussion of transcendental arguments in ethics within the ‘analytic’ tradition of Anglo-American philosophy (see e.g., Phillips-Griffiths 1957–8; Watt 1975; Harrison 1976; Cooper 1976; Finnis 1977 argues for the value of truth), they have played a significant role in the social philosophy of thinkers such as Karl-Otto Apel and Jürgen Habermas (for a broader discussion of transcendental arguments concerning intersubjectivity in the ‘continental’ tradition more generally, see Chase & Reynolds 2011: 89–114 and Russell & Reynolds 2011). Apel has argued that an ethical perspective is required as a condition for a commitment to truth, inquiry and successful communication. Habermas denies this, where instead he thinks that we are committed to communication and discourse by the pragmatic implications of speech oriented towards reaching understanding of each other, which for us, as speaking beings, is unavoidable. Both may be said to be inspired by C. S. Peirce’s insistence on the relation between truth and consensus, where the search for consensus is said to require as a necessary condition that we have certain ethical attitudes to others, such as equal respect and tolerance for their views and commitments. In this way the suggestion is also made in the practical case, it is easier for transcendental arguments to take a so-called ‘retorsive’ rather than a deductive form, aiming to more modestly show that to make inquiries in this context we simply must not question certain things to make inquiries in this context (See Apel 1976b vol II/1980 and 1976a; Habermas 1983. For further discussion see Benhabib and Dallmayr (eds.) 1995; Illies 2003: 64–92 and Kuhlmann 2017. A comparable form of transcendental argument is attributed to Emmanuel Levinas in Perpich 2008: 124–149; For a critical discussion of the value of this approach see Stern 2016).

Moreover, transcendental claims have been given a more prominent role within recent Anglo-American ethical theory, largely through the work of Alan Gewirth and Christine Korsgaard. These arguments start not from claims about truth and communication, but from claims about our nature as human agents, and what we must then presuppose about the moral status of ourselves and others. As in epistemology, the promise of such arguments in ethics has generated much interest and attention. For illustration, we will discuss a transcendental argument in ethics proposed by Korsgaard. (For Gewirth, see Gewirth 1981; Beyleveld 1991; and Illies 2003: 93–128.)

Korsgaard’s use of a transcendental argument in fact forms only part of a wider response to sceptical worries about the demands of morality (‘the normative question’), and is deployed merely to convince the sceptic that her own humanity has value, from which a further argument concerning the publicity of reasons is used to show that she must also then value the humanity of others. The transcendental argument that Korsgaard proposes is modelled on a position which she finds in Kant and which she outlines as follows:

[Kant] started from the fact that when we make a choice we must regard its object as good. His point is the one I have been making—that being human we must endorse our impulses before we can act on them. He asked what it is that makes these objects good, and, rejecting one form of realism, he decided that the goodness was not in the objects themselves. Were it not for our desires and inclinations—and for the various physiological, psychological, and social conditions which gave rise to those desires and inclinations—we would not find their objects good. Kant saw that we take things to be important because they are important to us—and he concluded that we must therefore take ourselves to be important. In this way, the value of humanity itself is implicit in every human choice. If complete normative scepticism is to be avoided—if there is such a thing as a reason for action—then humanity, as the source of all reasons and values, must be valued for its own sake. (Korsgaard 1996: 122)

This argument can be laid out as follows:

To rationally choose to do X, you must regard doing X as good.
You cannot regard doing X as good in itself, but can only regard doing X as good because it satisfies your needs, desires, inclinations, etc.
You cannot regard your desiring or needing to do X as making it good unless you regard yourself as valuable.
Therefore, you must regard yourself as valuable, if you are to make any rational choice.

Consider this example. To rationally choose to eat this piece of chocolate cake, I must think that eating the cake is good in some way. How can I regard it as good? It seems implausible to say that eating the cake is good in itself, of intrinsic value. It also seems implausible to say that it is good just because it satisfies a desire as such: for even if I was bulimic it might do that, but still not be regarded as good. A third suggestion, then, is that it can be seen as good because it is good for me, as satisfying a genuine need or desire of mine. But if I think this is what makes eating the piece of cake good, I must value myself, as otherwise I could not hold that satisfying me is sufficient to make something good enough for it to be rational for me to choose to do it; so I must regard myself as valuable. Put conversely: suppose that you thought that you and your life were utterly worthless, pointless, meaningless—that in your eyes, you were valueless. And suppose that you are faced with a piece of cake: on what basis would you choose it eat it? It seems unlikely that there is something intrinsically good about eating it, or that you should do so just because you find yourself with a desire to do so, even while finding your existence valueless. It seems that the only reason to do so would be if you thought eating the cake brought you some genuine benefit—but if you thought your life was worthless, how could you see this as a reason either? Why is bringing benefit to something that in your eyes is so utterly without value a reasonable thing to do?

There are some dangers in this argument, however. One, which Korsgaard considers, is that it might lead to ‘self-conceit’ (Korsgaard 1998: 54. Cf. also Korsgaard 1996: 249–50): that is, I might conclude from this that I am supremely valuable, simply as myself, which could obviously then get in the way of my ethical treatment of others. But, this worry might be lessened by the thought that while the argument gets me to see that I must find something valuable about me, it need not be anything about me in particular, and perhaps could instead be something about me that is more general—such as my humanity or personhood. However, while Korsgaard says that reflection will indeed lead us in this more general direction, we will need to see how. A second, perhaps related, worry is that this argument has a troubling parallel in the case of Satan, where Satan goes through (1) to (4) above, and concludes that he must regard his devilish nature as valuable. If this argument somehow entitles us to regard our own humanity or personhood as valuable, why doesn’t it entitle Satan to think the same about his nature? This is not the same as self-conceit, because he is not valuing himself as Satan just qua Satan; he is valuing his nature, just as we are valuing ours. Nor does devilishness seem any less central to his nature than humanity is to ours. So it is hard to see how the Satanic parallel can be avoided by the argument as it stands.

Nonetheless, it is possible that something can be built on the central idea of the argument, which seems to be this: As long as we think we can act for reasons based on the value of things, but at the same time reject any realism about that value applying to things independently of us, then we must be treated as the source of value and in a way that makes rational choice possible. We can therefore see Korsgaard’s second argument as attempting something along these lines, using her notion of practical identity to perhaps avoid the two problems we have identified with the Kantian argument.

Here, then, is an outline of Korsgaard’s second argument:

To rationally choose to do X, you must take it that doing X is the rational thing to do.
Since there is no reason in itself to do X, you can take it that X is the rational thing to do only if you regard your practical identity as making X the rational thing to do.
You cannot regard your practical identity as making doing X the rational thing to do unless you can see some value in that practical identity.
You cannot see any value in any particular practical identity as such, but can regard it as valuable only because of the contribution it makes to giving you reasons and values by which to live.
You cannot see having a practical identity as valuable in this way unless you think your having a life containing reasons and values is important.
You cannot regard it as important that your life contain reasons and values unless you regard your leading a rationally structured life as valuable.
You cannot regard your leading a rationally structured life as valuable unless you value yourself qua rational agent.
Therefore, you must value yourself qua rational agent, if you are to make any rational choice.

The first step is now familiar: To act is to do or choose something for a reason that may be conscious or uncomscious. The second step is based on Korsgaard’s idea that we have reasons to act because of our practical identities (such as one’s identity as a father, or lecturer, or Englishman), not because acts have reasons attached to them in themselves. Once again, realists might demur, claiming that some actions are rational things to do, because some things have value as such: so, perhaps knowledge is valuable in itself, thereby making it rational to seek it. But let us leave such worries aside and assume with Korsgaard that nothing is objectively rational for us to do.

The third step asks how a practical identity can make something into a reason for an agent: how can the fact that I am a father make it rational for me to buy my daughter this toy? The thought here is that it can only do so if you see value in that identity. Korsgaard stresses this when she writes:

The conception of one’s identity in question here is not a theoretical one, a view about what as a matter of inescapable scientific fact you are. It is better understood as a description under which you value yourself, a description under which you find your life to be worth living and your actions to be worth undertaking. (Korsgaard 1996: 101)

So, being a father, whether contingently or essentially, gives one no reason to be a caring or devoted father of a sort that would have good reason to buy a daughter a gift; rather, valuing one’s fatherhood does this.

But (moving on to step (4)), how can I see my particular practical identity as valuable? Korsgaard’s position here is that I cannot see any value in any particular practical identity as such: for, to do so would mean being committed to realism, to thinking that being a father, an Englishman, a university lecturer or whatever matters as such; or (in a way that is in the end equally realist), it matters because of the intrinsically valuable things it leads you to do. But, Korsgaard takes such realist positions to be problematic, and so thinks this will not do as an answer.

So suppose we allow that no particular practical identity can be seen to have value in itself; Korsgaard then offers as the only remaining explanation of its value to the agent that has that identity, that such identities have the general capacity of enabling the agent to live a life containing reasons: because I have whatever particular practical identities I do (father, Englishman, university lecturer…), I can then find things to be valuable and act rationally accordingly, in a way that gives me unity as a subject.

But then (step (5)), to think that this makes having some sort of particular practical identity important, you must think that it matters that your life have the sort of rational structure that having such identities provides; but (step (6)), to see that as mattering, you must see value in your leading a rationally structured life. And then, finally, to see value in your leading such a life, you must see your rational nature as valuable, which is to value your humanity.

Does this Korsgaardian argument avoid the pitfalls of the Kantian one discussed earlier? It seems to avoid the problem of self-conceit, because it does seem that what you end up valuing is not yourself simply as such, but yourself qua rational agent. And as presented here, it avoids the problem of the Satanic parallel, because all it shows is that Satan must value his rational nature, not his devilishness.

For both these problems to be avoided, however, it is important to run the argument as outlined above, not as it is sometimes presented by Korsgaard, which is via the notion of need (cf. Korsgaard 1996: 121 and 125). This would follow the same premises as before for (1)–(5), and then go as follows:

You cannot regard it as important that your life contain reasons and values unless you take your need to lead this sort of life as important.
You cannot take this need to be important unless you take yourself to be valuable.
Therefore, you must value yourself, if you are to make any rational choice.

The difficulty with (6*)–(8*), we think, is that (8*) does not stipulate what it is about yourself that you are required to value, so that this could be my sheer particularity (self-conceit), or if I am not in fact human, my non-human nature (Satan). This is because (6*) just identifies a need, and says that this need could not be important unless the agent who has the need were seen to be valuable somehow—whereas the previous argument narrows value down to rational agency, and so rules out both self-conceit and devilishness.

We have therefore reconstructed that part of Korsgaard’s strategy who offers an argument to the effect that you must value your humanity, as a transcendental argument: it is transcendental as it claims that valuing humanity is a necessary condition of being an agent which makes rational choice. It turns out that if it is to be made plausible in this way, a lot depends on accepting Korsgaard’s arguments against realism; but then, as we have seen, many have always suspected that some commitment to anti-realism is required to make a transcendental argument convincing. A further worry when it comes to external world scepticism, as we discussed above (§3), is that this commitment can appear to make the argument redundant, because anti-realism appears sufficient as a response to scepticism on its own. However, in this ethical case, this worry is perhaps less of a concern, because a sceptic could endorse an anti-realist position in metaethics, without accepting that they or others have value as a matter of their normative ethics, so that there is still work left for the transcendental argument to do. To this extent, therefore, it is not surprising that Korsgaard’s claims have given further impetus to the debate concerning what transcendental arguments are, and what they can contribute. (For further discussion of Korsgaard’s position as an interpretation of Kant, see Wood 1999: 125–32 and Timmermann 2006; and for further discussion, see Skorupski 1998, Skidmore 2002, Enoch 2006, Stern 2011, Stern and Watts 2019).

7. Transcendental Arguments in Philosophy of Psychology and Perception

In addition to ethics, transcendental arguments are also widely use in other areas of philosophy. There are certain prominent examples in philosophy of psychology and perception. For the former, one idea is that the possibility of intentional action requires or presupposes the subject’s sensation-based bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy 1980, 1989, 1995; Bermúdez 1995). This general idea has been cashed out in different ways. One such instance begins with the fact that we do perceive and act upon the world, and proceeds with the inference that the possibility of guiding actions via our perceptions of the world requires or presupposes spatial awareness of our bodily positions. Although here the starting point concerns perception in general, it is standard to think of these inferences from some examples of vision: our visual experiences of worldly objects enable us to act upon those objects only if the subjects are capable of mapping the information that they give about the spatial relations between our bodies and the objects in question. Another instance begins with the fact that we do experiences ourselves as performing bodily-directed intentional actions. This can be motivated by considering simple examples such as scratching one’s head. To do this, it is not enough to locate the spot on one’s head where one wishes to scratch. It is also needed to be able to locate that spot relative to the rest of one’s body. That is, the possibility of the above experiences requires or presupposes certain kind of representational awareness of one’s body. Some might even go further to hold that one needs to be aware of that spot as part of one’s body. Why is this so? The idea is that one normally scratches the spot with one’s hand, and in moving the hand to the location of the spot, it seems necessary to holistically represent one’s body, otherwise one would not be able to direct one’s hand to the spot smoothly.

One distinctive feature of these arguments is that they seem to make empirical claims about the world, so the status of such arguments can become a matter of dispute. It is often thought that transcendental arguments, or at least the conditionals involved, have to be a priori (Bermúdez 1995; Schwenkler 2012), but if they can be tested through cases in real life, specifically clinical cases from neuropsychology, it is then become unclear whether such conditionals are indeed a priori. Ian Waterman’s case might be the most discussed one in this context. He unfortunately lost all functions on the large myelinated sensory fibers below the neck, and as a result he almost had no sensation below the neck (Cole 1991). At the beginning of such a condition, he could barely move without falling on the ground, but after appropriate training, he became able to retrieve some capacities for walking and other actions through the help of sight. Now why is this relevant? Recall that the first transcendental conditional introduced in this section has it that the possibility of guiding actions via our perceptions of the world requires or presupposes spatial awareness of our bodily positions. After training, Waterman could guide his actions via his visual experiences of the environment, but this does not seem to require or presuppose the relevant kind of spatial awareness of our bodily positions. If so, then the conditional is falsified. As for the second transcendental conditional above, it states that the possibility of experiencing ourselves as performing body-directed intentional actions requires or presupposes certain kind of representational awareness of one’s body. Now the partly recovered Waterman could experience himself as performing body-directed intentional actions, but this does not seem to require or presuppose the relevant kind of representational awareness of one’s body, since he is now relying on his sight, not his body image or schema. In this way, cases from neuropsychology might bear on transcendental conditionals.

But doesn’t this make the relevant conditionals a posteriori? After all, they can be falsified by empirical facts in the actual world. For those who insist that such conditionals are a priori, they might argue that since those conditionals are a priori necessary truths, they are true of all possible worlds, including the actual world; no wonder empirical cases in the actual world can be relevant. This involves very complicated issues: true logical and mathematical statements are supposed to be true of all possible worlds, including the actual world, but they cannot be refuted by empirical cases in the actual world. This links back to considerations about modal metaphysics (see §5 above), and about philosophy of language and epistemology too. Note that this issue is connected to another important issue concerning naturalisation (Bermúdez 1995): to bring transcendental conditionals to bear on actual cases is supposed to be a virtue, because it fits the current Zeitgeist, but given the empirical bearings, how can such conditionals be a priori? It is not clear that the literature has engaged with this issue sufficiently. In a way, a priori statements bear on the empirical world: e.g., ‘any sister is a sibling’ bears on all sisters; however, this a priori statement cannot be refuted by empirical investigations of these individuals in the empirical world.

Philosophy of perception is another area that is filled with transcendental arguments, even though the users sometimes do not label them as such. For example, consider the view that the possibility of intentionality requires or presupposes that perceptual experiences have representational contents (McDowell 2008, against Travis, 2004, 2018; the ‘content view’ as it is sometimes called). The sub-arguments for such conditionals can be very complicated. It might rely on the idea that rational relations must be between contentful episodes, otherwise one might commit the notorious ‘myth of the given’ (Sellars 1956). Such pictures can demand an even stronger conditional, that the possibility of intentionality requires or presupposes that perceptual experiences’ representational contents are all conceptual (McDowell 1996). Relatedly, it is also proposed that the possibility of intentionality requires or presupposes the ‘disjunctive conception of perceptual evidence’ (McDowell 1982, 1995, 2008). If the force of transcendental arguments is in doubt, then many arguments in philosophy of perception would be problematic. (For more on McDowell, see Cheng 2021b). To be sure, there can always be disagreements about whether these arguments are transcendental at all. To settle this, one needs to check whether these arguments fit the six characteristics listed in section 2. However, one difficulty is that it is unclear whether we should take them as individually necessary and jointly sufficient. Another difficulty is that other practitioners would presumably disagree with some of the characteristics listed above. Here we regard the above examples as transcendental arguments primarily because they fit the schema offered at the beginning of this entry, but the relations between these arguments and the characteristics listed in section 2 are of course complicated and controversial.

In addition to the above examples, there are some notable recent developments in this area. One prominent theory in this area is naïve realism, the view that the phenomenal characters of perceptual experiences are partially constituted by their objects (Campbell 2002; Martin 2006). As such, it is not obviously transcendental in any sense. However, there is a recent twist that builds the transcendental element into the theory: according to this new version, naïve realism is an integral part of the transcendental project of explaining how it is possible that perceptual experiences have the distinctive characters that they do. That is, naïve realism is not only the best explanation of the relevant phenomenal characters; it is the only viable explanation for why certain perceptual experiences have the kind of phenomenal characters they do (Allen 2017, 2020). Another recent example concerns the relation between perceptual experiences and imaginative reflection on the phenomenal characters of such experiences (Gomes 2017): more specifically, imaginative reflection ‘draws on the knowledge we possess of the phenomenal character of our perceptual experience and exploits various of our imaginative and reflective capacities to provide us with support for modal claims about whether certain non-actual types of perceptual experience could support various forms of thought’ (p. 140). In this context, it is crucial to emphasise that transcendental arguments can at best reveal properties that perceptual experiences must have, or must lack, given the modal force of such arguments. For example, one might think that visual experiences must have a field-like structure, as visual objects need to be placed within an overarching space. This specific claim, to be sure, has proven to be highly contested (Campbell 2007; Schwenkler 2012; French 2018; Cheng 2019).

8. Concluding Remarks

We have looked in some depth at the role of transcendental arguments that have been given in philosophy, not only in refuting the epistemological sceptic, but also in ethics, philosophy of psychology, and philosophy of perception. As we have seen, such arguments clearly face challenges, both in their details but also at a more general level, concerning how much they can ever hope to achieve. However, while these challenges are certainly significant, it would be wrong to exaggerate them: for, as we have also seen, the range of potential uses for such arguments is wide, while it seems that their intriguing power, as well as their alluring promise, will mean that philosophers will continue to be drawn to them. As a result, therefore, it seems unlikely that those engaged in the subject will ever cease to feel that ‘tenderness for transcendental arguments’ (Strawson 1985: 21) instilled in them by Kant and others.


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