Giambattista Vico

First published Wed Jun 11, 2003; substantive revision Thu Sep 15, 2022

Giovanni Battista Vico (1668–1744) spent most of his professional life as Professor of Rhetoric at the University of Naples. He was trained in jurisprudence, but read widely in Classics, philology, and philosophy, all of which informed his highly original views on history, historiography, and culture. His thought is most fully expressed in his mature work, the Scienza Nuova or The New Science. In his own time, Vico was relatively unknown, but from the nineteenth century onwards his views found a wider audience and today his influence is widespread in the humanities and social sciences.

1. Vico’s Life and Influence

Giovanni Battista Vico was born in Naples, Italy, June 23 1668, to a bookseller and daughter of a carriage maker. He received his formal education at local grammar schools, from various Jesuit tutors, and at the University of Naples from which he graduated in 1694 as Doctor of Civil and Canon Law. As he reports in his autobiography (Vita di Giambattista Vico), however, Vico considered himself as “teacher of himself,”[1] a habit he developed under the direction of his father, after a fall at the age of 7 caused a three year absence from school. Vico reports that “as a result of this mischance he grew up with a melancholy and irritable temperament such as belongs to men of ingenuity and depth” (Vita, 111). Vico left Naples in 1686 for Vatolla where, with occasional returns to his home city, he remained for the next nine years as tutor to the sons of Domenico Rocca. Vico returned to Naples in 1695 and four years later married Teresa Caterina Destito with whom he had eight children. Of his surviving children (three of them died), his younger son Gennaro was a favorite and went on to an academic career; his daughter Lusia achieved success as a singer and minor poet, and Ignazio is known to have been a source of disappointment to him. Of the others (Angela Teresa and Filippo) little is known. Vico was never rich, though he made a living, and the legend of his poverty derives from Villarosa’s embellishment of the autobiography. He did, however, suffer bouts of ill-health, and failed in his life-long ambition of succeeding to the chair of Jurisprudence at the University of Naples, having to settle instead for a lower and poorly paid professorship in Rhetoric. He retained this position until 1741 at which time he was succeeded by his son Gennaro. Vico died in Naples on January 22–23, 1744, aged 75.

In his own time Vico’s work was largely neglected and generally misunderstood-he describes himself living as a “stranger” and “quite unknown” in his native city (Vita, 134)-and it was not until the nineteenth century that his thought began to make a significant impression on the philosophical world. However, Vico’s thought never suffered from complete obscurity and its influence can be discerned in various traditions of European thought from the mid-eighteenth century onwards.[2] In Italy, Vico’s impact on aesthetic and literary criticism is evident in the writings of Francesco De Sanctis and Benedetto Croce, and in jurisprudence, economics, and political theory, his influence can be traced from Antonio Genovesi (one of Vico’s own pupils), Ferdinando Galiani, and Gaetano Filangieri. In Germany, Vico’s ideas were known to Johann-George Hamman and, via his disciple J.G. von Herder, to Johann Wolfgang von Goethe and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi. Vico’s ideas were sufficiently familiar to Friedrich August Wolf to inspire his article “G.B. Vico on Homer.” In France, Vico’s thought was likely known to Charles de Secondat, baron de Montesquieu, and Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and some have seen his influence in the writings of Denis Diderot, Etienne Bonnot, abbé de Condillac, and Joseph Marie, comte de Maistre. In Great Britain, although Vichian themes are intimated in the philosophical writings of the Empiricists and thinkers of the Scottish Enlightenment, there is no direct evidence that they knew of his writings. The earliest known disseminator of Vico’s views in the English-speaking world is Samuel Taylor Coleridge, who was responsible for much of the interest in Vico in the second half of the nineteenth century.

Vico’s ideas reached a wider audience with a German translation of The New Science by W.E. Weber which appeared in 1822, and, more significantly, through a French version by Jules Michelet in 1824, which was reissued in 1835. Michelet’s translation was widely read and was responsible for a new appreciation of Vico’s work in France. Subsequently, Vico’s views impacted the work of Wilhelm Dilthey, Karl Marx, R.G. Collingwood, and James Joyce, who used The New Science to structure Finnegans Wake. Twentieth century scholarship has established illuminating comparisons with the tradition of Hegelian idealism, and taken up the relationship between Vico’s thought and that of philosophers in the western tradition and beyond, including Plato, Aristotle, Ibn Khaldun, Thomas Hobbes, Benedict de Spinoza, David Hume, Immanuel Kant, and Friedrich Nietzsche. Comparisons and connections have also been drawn between Vichean themes and the work of various modern and contemporary thinkers, inter alia W.B. Yeats, Friedrich Froebel, Max Horkheimer, Walter Benjamin, Martin Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Jürgen Habermas, Paul Ricoeur, Jean-Francois Lyotard, and Alisdair MacIntyre. As a review of recent and current literature demonstrates, an appreciation of Vico’s thought has spread far beyond philosophy, and his ideas have been taken up by scholars within a range of contemporary disciplines, including anthropology, cultural theory, education, hermeneutics, history, literary criticism, psychology, and sociology. Thus despite obscure beginnings, Vico is now widely regarded as a highly original thinker who anticipated central currents in later philosophy and the human sciences.

2. Vico’s Early Works

Vico’s earliest publications were in poetry rather than philosophy-the Lucretian poem “Affetti di un disperato” (“The Feelings of One in Despair”) (composed in 1692) and “Canzone in morte di Antonio Carafa” (“Ode on the Death of Antonio Carafa”) both published in 1693. After his appointment to Professor of Rhetoric in 1699, Vico began to address philosophical themes in the first of six Orazioni Inaugurali (Inaugural Orations). In 1707 Vico gave a seventh oration-intended as an augmentation of the philosophy of Bacon that he subsequently revised and published in 1709 under the title De nostri temporis studiorum ratione (On the Study Methods of Our Time). Two years later his projected but uncompleted statement on metaphysics appeared, De antiquissima Italorum sapientia ex linguae latinae originibus eruenda libri tres (On the Most Ancient Wisdom of the Italians Unearthed from the Origins of the Latin Language). The years that followed saw the publication of various works, including two replies to critical reviews of De antiquissima (1711 and 1712), a work of royal historiography-De rebus gestis Antonii Caraphaei libri quattuor (The Life of Antonio Caraffa) (1716)-Il diritto universale (Universal Right) (1720–22), and in 1725 and 1731 the two parts of his autobiography which together compose the Vita di Giambattista Vico scritta da se medesimo (Life of Giambattista Vico Written by Himself). Over the course of his professional career, Vico also composed and delivered lectures on rhetoric to students preparing to enter into the study of jurisprudence. These survive as student transcriptions or copies of the original lectures, and are collected under the title Institutiones Oratoriae (1711–1741) (translated as The Art of Rhetoric) in which Vico’s develops his views on rhetoric or eloquence, “the faculty of speaking appropriate to the purpose of persuading” through which the orator aims to “bend the spirit by his speech.”[3]

Although these early writings are increasingly studied as significant works in their right, they have generally been regarded as important for tracing the development of various themes and ideas which Vico came to refine and express fully in his major and influential work, The New Science. In De nostri temporis studiorum ratione, for example, Vico takes up the theme of modernity and raises the question of “which study method is finer or better, ours or the Ancients?” and illustrates “by examples the advantages and drawbacks of the respective methods.”[4] Vico observes that the Moderns are equipped with the “instruments” of “philosophical ‘critique’” and “analytic geometry” (especially in the form of Cartesian logic) (DN, 7–9), and that these open realms of natural scientific inquiry (chemistry, pharmacology, astronomy, geographical exploration, and mechanics) and artistic production (realism in poetry, oratory, and sculpture) which were unknown and unavailable to the Ancients (DN, 11–12). Although these bring significant benefits, Vico argues, modern education suffers unnecessarily from ignoring the ars topica (art of topics) which encourage the use of imagination and memory in organizing speech into eloquent persuasion. The result, Vico argues, is an undue attention to the “geometrical method” modeled on the discipline of physics (DN, 21ff.), and an emphasis on abstract philosophical criticism over poetry. This undermines the importance of exposition, persuasion, and pleasure in learning; it “benumbs...[the] imagination and stupefies...[the] memory” (DN, 42), both of which are central to learning, complex reasoning, and the discovery of truth. Combining the methods of both Ancients and Moderns, Vico argues that education should aim ideally at cultivating the “total life of the body politic” (DN, 36): students “should be taught the totality of the sciences and arts, and their intellectual powers should be developed to the full” so that they “would become exact in science, clever in practical matters, fluent in eloquence, imaginative in understanding poetry or painting, and strong in memorizing what they have learned in their legal studies” (DN, 19).

This defense of humanistic education is expanded in the Orations, directed “to the flower and stock of well-born young manhood,”[5] where Vico makes a case for modern humanistic education and focuses on a certain kind of “practical wisdom” or prudentia which the human mind, with the appropriate discipline and diligence, is able to attain. This theme is continued in De Antiquissima, where Vico traces the consequences of his insight that language can be treated as a source of historical knowledge. Many words of the Latin language, Vico observes, appear to be “derived from some inward learning rather than from the vernacular usage of the people.”[6] Treated as a repository of the past, Latin might be investigated as a way of “seek[ing] out the ancient wisdom of the Italians from the very wisdom of their words.”(DA, 40).

In the course of pursuing this task, Vico also develops two central themes of his mature philosophy: the outlines of a philosophical system in contrast to the then dominant philosophy of Descartes already criticized in De nostri temporis studiorum ratione, and his statement of the principle that verum et factum convertuntur, that “the true and the made are...convertible,” or that “the true is precisely what is made” (verum esse ipsum factum). Vico emphasizes that science should be conceived as the “genus or mode by which a thing is made” so that human science in general is a matter of dissecting the “anatomy of nature’s works” (DA, 48), albeit through the “vice” of human beings that they are limited to “abstraction” as opposed to the power of “construction” which is found in God alone (DA, 50–52). Given that “the norm of the truth is to have made it” (DA, 52), Vico reasons, Descartes’ famous first principle that clear and distinct ideas are the source of truth must be rejected: “For the mind does not make itself as it gets to know itself,” Vico observes, “and since it does not make itself, it does not know the genus or mode by which it makes itself” (DA, 52). Thus the truths of morality, natural science, and mathematics do not require “metaphysical justification” as the Cartesians held, but demand an analysis of the causes-the “activity”-through which things are made (DA, 64).

Vico’s Vita di Giambattista Vico is of particular interest, not only as a source of insight into the influences on his intellectual development, but as one of the earliest and most sophisticated examples of philosophical autobiography. Vico composed the work in response (and indeed the only response) to a proposal published by Count Gian Artico di Porcía to Italian scholars to write their biographies for the edification of students. Referring to himself in the third person, Vico records the course of his life and the influence of various thinkers which led him to develop the concepts central to his mature work. Vico reports on the importance of reading Plato, Aristotle, the Hellenics, Scotus, Suarez, and the Classical poets, and traces his growing interest in jurisprudence and the Latin language (Vita, 116ff. passim). Vico describes how he came to “meditate a principle of the natural law, which should be apt for the explanation of the origins of Roman law and every other gentile civil law in respect of history” (Vita, 119) and how he discovered that “an ideal eternal law...should be observed in a universal city after the idea or design of providence” (Vita, 122). According to Vico’s own account, his studies culminated in a distinction between ideas and languages. The first, he says, “discovers new historical principles of geography and chronology, the two ideas of history, and thence the principles of universal history lacking hitherto” (Vita, 167), while the latter “discovers new principles of poetry, both of song and verse, and shows that both it and they sprang up by the same natural necessity in all the first nations” (Vita, 168). Taken together, these form the central doctrine of The New Science, namely, that there is a “philosophy and philology of the human race” which produces “an ideal eternal history based on the idea of...providence...[and] traversed in time by all the particular histories of the nations, each with its rise, development, acme, decline and fall” (Vita, 169).

3. The New Science

Many themes of these early works-language, wisdom, history, truth, causality, philology, rhetoric, philosophy, poetry, and the relative strengths and weaknesses of ancient and modern learning-are incorporated into and receive their fullest treatment in Vico’s major work, The New Science, first published in 1725 (an edition subsequently known as the Scienza Nuova Prima or First New Science) and again in a second and largely rewritten version five years later. Vico published a third edition in 1744, which was later edited by Fausto Nicolini and appeared in 1928. Nicoloni is responsible for updating Vico’s punctuation and breaking the work up into its current structure of chapters, sections, and numbered paragraphs (1112 in all), not originally supplied by Vico himself, which have been reproduced in many though not all subsequent editions. Nicolini referred to his edition as the Scienza Nuova seconda-Second New Science (or simply The New Science), under which title the definitive version is known today.

The text consists of an overview (“Idea of the Work”) couched as an explication of a frontispiece depicting a female figure (Metaphysics), standing on a globe of the Earth and contemplating a luminous triangle containing the eye of God, or Providence. Below stands a statue of Homer representing the origins of human society in “poetic wisdom.” This is followed by five Books and a Conclusion, the first of which (“Establishment of Principles”) establishes the method upon which Vico constructs a history of civil society from its earliest beginnings in the state of nature (stato di natura) to its contemporary manifestation in seventeenth century Europe.

In the work, Vico consciously develops his notion of scienza (science or knowledge) in opposition to the then dominant philosophy of Descartes with its emphasis on clear and distinct ideas, the most simple elements of thought from which all knowledge, the Cartesians held, could be derived a priori by way of deductive rules. As Vico had already argued, one consequence and drawback of this hypothetico-deductive method is that it renders phenomena which cannot be expressed logically or mathematically as illusions of one sort or another. This applies not only most obviously to the data of sense and psychological experience, but also to the non-quantifiable evidence that makes up the human sciences. Drawing on the verum factum principle first described in De Antiquissima, Vico argues against Cartesian philosophy that full knowledge of any thing involves discovering how it came to be what it is as a product of human action and the “principal property” of human beings, viz., “of being social” (“Idea of the Work,” §2, p.3).[7] The reduction of all facts to the ostensibly paradigmatic form of mathematical knowledge is a form of “conceit,” Vico maintains, which arises from the fact that “man makes himself the measure of all things” (Element I, §120, p.60) and that “whenever men can form no idea of distant and unknown things, they judge them by what is familiar and at hand” (Element II, §122, p.60). Recognizing this limitation, Vico argues, is at once to grasp that phenomena can only be known via their origins, or per caussas (through causes). For “Doctrines must take their beginning from that of the matters of which they treat” (Element CVI, §314, p.92), he says, and it is one “great labor of...Science to recover...[the] grounds of truth-truth which, with the passage of years and the changes in language and customs, has come down to us enveloped in falsehood” (Element XVI, §150, pp.64–5). Unveiling this falsehood leads to “wisdom,” which is “nothing but the science of making such use of things as their nature dictates” (Element CXIV, §326, p.94). Given that verum ipsum factum-“the true is the made,” or something is true because it is made-scienzia both sets knowledge per caussas as its task and as the method for attaining it; or, expressed in other terms, the content of scienza is identical with the development of that scienza itself.

The challenge, however, is to develop this science in such a way as to understand the facts of the human world without either reducing them to mere contingency or explaining their order by way of speculative principles of the sort generated by traditional metaphysics. They must be rendered intelligible, that is, without reducing them, as did the Cartesians, to the status of ephemera. Vico satisfies this demand by distinguishing at the outset of The New Science between il vero and il certo, “the true” and “the certain.” The former is the object of knowledge (scienza) since it is universal and eternal, whereas the latter, related as it is to human consciousness (coscienza), is particular and individuated. This produces two pairs of terms-il vero/scienza and il certo/coscienza-which constitute, in turn, the explananda of philosophy and philology (“history” broadly conceived), respectively. As Vico says, “philosophy contemplates reason, whence comes knowledge of the true; philology observes that of which human choice is author, whence comes consciousness of the certain” (Element X, §138, p.63). These two disciplines combine in a method or “new critical art” (nuova’arte critica) where philosophy aims at articulating the universal forms of intelligibility common to all experience, while philology adumbrates the empirical phenomena of the world which arise from human choice: the languages, customs, and actions of people which make up civil society. Understood as mutually exclusive disciplines-a tendency evident, according to Vico, in the history of philosophy up to his time-philosophy and philology appear as empty and abstract (as in the rational certainty of Cartesian metaphysics) and merely empirical and contingent, respectively. Once combined, however, they form a doctrine which yields a full knowledge of facts where “knowledge” in the Vichean sense means to have grasped both the necessity of human affairs (manifest in the causal connections between otherwise random events) and the contingency of the events which form the content of the causal chains. Philosophy yields the universally true and philology the individually certain.

The text of The New Science then constitutes Vico’s attempt to develop a method which itself comes to be in the course of applying it to human experience, and this takes the form of a history of civil society and its development through the progress of war and peace, law, social order, commerce, and government. “Thus our Science,” Vico says near the beginning of the work, “comes to be at once a history of the ideas, the customs, the deeds of mankind. From these three we shall derive the principles of the history of human nature, which we shall show to be the principles of universal history, which principles it seems hitherto to have lacked” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §368, p.112). Accomplishing this task involves tracing human society back to its origins in order to reveal a common human nature and a genetic, universal pattern through which all nations run. Vico sees this common nature reflected in language, conceived as a store-house of customs, in which the wisdom of successive ages accumulates and is presupposed in the form of a sensus communis or “mental dictionary” by subsequent generations. Vico defines this common sense as “judgment without reflection, shared by an entire class, an entire people, and entire nation, or the entire human race” (Element XII, §145, pp.63–4). It is also available to the philosopher who, by deciphering and thus recovering its content, can discover an “ideal eternal history traversed in time by the histories of all nations” (Proposition XLII, §114, p.57).

The result of this, in Vico’s view, is to appreciate history as at once “ideal”-since it is never perfectly actualized-and “eternal,” because it reflects the presence of a divine order or Providence guiding the development of human institutions. Nations need not develop at the same pace-less developed ones can and do coexist with those in a more advanced phase-but they all pass through the same distinct stages (corsi): the ages of gods, heroes, and men. Nations “develop in conformity to this division,” Vico says, “by a constant and uninterrupted order of causes and effects present in every nation” (“The Course the Nations Run,” §915, p.335). Each stage, and thus the history of any nation, is characterized by the manifestation of natural law peculiar to it, and the distinct languages (signs, metaphors, and words), governments (divine, aristocratic commonwealths, and popular commonwealths and monarchies), as well as systems of jurisprudence (mystic theology, heroic jurisprudence, and the natural equity of free commonwealths) that define them.

In addition to specifying the distinct stages through which social, civil, and political order develops, Vico draws on his earlier writings to trace the origin of nations back to two distinct features of human nature: the ages of gods and heroes result from memory and creative acts of “imagination” (fantasia), while the age of men stems from the faculty of “reflection” (riflessione). Vico thus claims to have discovered two kinds of wisdom-“poetic” and “philosophical”-corresponding to the dual nature of human beings (sense and intellect), represented in the creations of theological poets and philosophers, respectively (“Poetic Wisdom,” §779, p.297). Institutions arise first from the immediacy of sense-experience, pure feeling, curiosity, wonder, fear, superstition, and the child-like capacity of human beings to imitate and anthropomorphize the world around them. Since “in the world’s childhood men were by nature sublime poets” (Element XXXVII, §187, p.71), Vico reasons, nations must be “poetic in their beginnings” (Element XLIV, §200, p.73), so that their origin and course can be discovered by recreating or remembering the “poetic” or “metaphysical truth” which underlies them (Element XLVII, §205, p.74). This is manifest primarily in fable, myth, the structure of early languages, and the formations of polytheistic religion. The belief systems of early societies are thus characterized by “poetic metaphysics” which “seeks its proofs not in the external world but within the modifications of the mind of him who meditates it” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §374, p.116), and “poetic logic,” through which the creations of this metaphysics are signified. Metaphysics of this sort is “not rational and abstract like that of learned men now,” Vico emphasizes, “but felt and imagined [by men] without power of ratiocination...This metaphysics was their poetry, a faculty born with them...born of their ignorance of causes, for ignorance, the mother of wonder, made everything wonderful to men who were ignorant of everything” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §375, p.116). Incapable of forming “intelligible class concepts of things”-a feature of human mind realized only in the age of men-people “had a natural need to create poetic characters; that is, imaginative class concepts or universals, to which, as to certain models or ideal portraits, to reduce all the particular species which resembled them” (Element XLIX, §209, p.74).

From this genus of poetic metaphysics, Vico then extrapolates the various species of wisdom born of it. “Poetic morals” have their source in piety and shame (“Poetic Wisdom,” §502, p.170), he argues, while “poetic economy” arises from the feral equality of human beings and the family relationships into which they were forced by need (“Poetic Wisdom,” §523, p.180). Similarly, “poetic cosmography” grows from the seeing “the world as composed of gods of the sky, of the underworld...and gods intermediate between earth and sky” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §710, p.269), “poetic astronomy” from raising the gods “to the planets and [assigning] the heroes to the constellations” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §728, p.277), “poetic chronology” out of the cycles of harvest and the seasons (“Poetic Wisdom,” §732, p.279), and “poetic geography” from naming the natural world through “the semblances of things known or near at hand” (“Poetic Wisdom,” §741, p.285). As the faculty of reason develops and grows, however, the power of imagination from which the earliest forms of human society grew weakens and gives way finally to the power of reflection; the cognitive powers of human beings gain ascendance over their creative capacity, and reason replaces poetry as the primary way of understanding the world. This defines the age of men which makes philosophy, Vico reasons, a relatively recent development in history, appearing as it did “some two thousand years after the gentile nations were founded” (Element CV, §313, p.92).

Since history itself, in Vico’s view, is the manifestation of Providence in the world, the transition from one stage to the next and the steady ascendance of reason over imagination represent a gradual progress of civilization, a qualitative improvement from simpler to more complex forms of social organization. Vico characterizes this movement as a “necessity of nature” (“Idea of the Work,” §34, p.21) which means that, with the passage of time, human beings and societies tend increasingly towards realizing their full potential. From rude beginnings undirected passion is transformed into virtue, the bestial state of early society is subordinated to the rule of law, and philosophy replaces sentiments of religion. “Out of ferocity, avarice, and ambition, the three vices which run throughout the human race,” Vico says, “legislation creates the military, merchant, and governing classes, and thus the strength, riches, and wisdom of commonwealths. Out of these three great vices, which could certainly destroy all mankind on the face of the earth, it makes civil happiness” (Element VII, §132, p.62). In addition, the transition from poetic to rational consciousness enables reflective individuals-the philosopher, that is, in the shape of Vico-to recover the body of universal history from the particularity of apparently random events. This is a fact attested to by the form and content of The New Science itself.

Although from a general point of view history reveals a progress of civilization through actualizing the potential of human nature, Vico also emphasizes the cyclical feature of historical development. Society progresses towards perfection, but without reaching it (thus history is “ideal”), interrupted as it is by a break or return (ricorso) to a relatively more primitive condition. Out of this reversal, history begins its course anew, albeit from the irreversibly higher point to which it has already attained. Vico observes that in the latter part of the age of men (manifest in the institutions and customs of medieval feudalism) the “barbarism” which marks the first stages of civil society returns as a “civil disease” to corrupt the body politic from within. This development is marked by the decline of popular commonwealths into bureaucratic monarchies, and, by the force of unrestrained passions, the return of corrupt manners which had characterized the earlier societies of gods and heroes. Out of this “second barbarism,” however, either through the appearance of wise legislators, the rise of the fittest, or a the last vestiges of civilization, society returns to the “primitive simplicity of the first world of peoples,” and individuals are again “religious, truthful, and faithful” (“Conclusion of the Work,” §1104–1106, pp.423–4). From this begins a new corso which Vico saw manifest in his own time as the “second age of men” characterized by the “true” Christian religion and the monarchical government of seventeenth century Europe.

In addition to his account of the origins and history of civil society developed in The New Science, Vico also advances a highly original thesis about the origin and character of Homeric poetry, which he refers to as “The Discovery of the New Homer.” Vico observes that the “vulgar feelings and vulgar customs provide the poets with their proper materials” (“Discovery of the True Homer,” §781, p.301), and, given that in the age of heroes these customs constituted a “savage” and “unreasonable” state of human nature, the poetry of Homer cannot be the esoteric wisdom or creative act of a single individual, as scholars have assumed, but represents the imaginative universals of the Greek people themselves. Homeric poetry thus contains the “models or ideal portraits” which form the mental dictionary of the Ancients, and explains the place Vico assigns to Homer in the frontispiece where his statue represents the origins of human society in poetic wisdom. Vico thus applies his doctrine of the imaginative universal to the case of Homer and concludes that though it “marks a famous epoch in history it never in the world took place.” The historical Homer was “quite simply a man of the people” (“Discovery of the True Homer, §806, p.308) and quite distinct from the ostensible author of the Odyssey and Iliad who was actually a ”purely ideal poet who never existed in the world of nature...but was an idea or a heroic character of Grecian men insofar as they told their histories in song“ (”Discovery of the True Homer, §873, p.323).


Vico’s Principal Writings and English Translations

  • Opera di G.B. Vico, 8 volumes in 11, edited by Fausto Nicolini, Bari: Laterza, 1911–41.
  • Le Orazioni Inaugurali (1699–1707), On Humanstic Education (Six Inaugural Orations, 1699–1707), translated by Giorgio A. Pinton and Arthur Shippee, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1993.
  • De Nostri temporis studiorum ratione (1709), On the Study Methods of our Time, translated by Elio Gianturco, with, as an addendum, The Acadamies and the Relation between Philosophy and Eloquence [1737], translated by Donald Phillip Verene, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • De antiquissima Italorum sapientia ex linguae latinae originibus eruenda libri tres (1710), On the Most Ancient Wisdom of the Italians Unearthed from the Origins of the Latin Language, including The Disputation with “The Giornale de’ Letterati d’Italia” [1711], translated by L.M. Palmer, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • On the Most Ancient Wisdom of the Italians. Drawn out for the Origins of the Latin Language [1711], translated by Jason Taylor, New Haven: Yale University Press, 2010.
  • Institutiones Oratoriae (1711–1741), The Art of Rhetoric, translated and edited by Giorgio A. Pinton and Arthur W. Shippee, Amsterdam and Atlanta: Editions Rodopi B.V., 1984.
  • Il diritto universale (1720–22), Universal Right, translated by Giorgio Pinton and Margaret Diehl, Amsterdam and Atlanta: Editions Rodopi B.V., 2000; A Translation from Latin into English of Giambattista Vico’s Il dritto Universale/Universal Law, translated by John D. Schaeffer, Lewiston, NY: Mellen Press, 2011. Volume 1: Synopsis of Universal Law (trans. Donald P. Verene) and Book 1: On the One Principle and One End of Universal Law. Volume 2: Book 2: On the Constancy of the Jurisprudent, and Dissertations.
  • Scienza nuova (1725), The First New Science, edited and translated by Leon Pompa, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • Vita di Giambattista Vico scritta da se medesimo (1725–31), The Autobiography of Giambattista Vico with the Continuation by Villarosa [1818], translated by Max Harold Fisch and Thomas Goddard Bergin, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1944, revised 1963.
  • Scienza nuova seconda (1730/1744), The New Science of Giambattista Vico, revised translation of the third edition by Thomas Goddard Bergin and Max Harold Fisch, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1948; Cornell Paperbacks, 1976.
  • De mente heroica (1732), On The Heroic Mind: An Oration, translated by Elizabeth Sewell and Anthony C. Sirignano, in Vico and Contemporary Thought, ed. Giorgo Tagliacozza, Michael Monney, and Donald Phillip Verene, Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1979.

Secondary Literature


  • Berlin, Sir Isaiah, 1976, Vico and Herder: Two Studies in the History of Ideas, London: The Hogarth Press.
  • –––, 2000, Three Critics of the Enlightenment: Vico, Hammann, Herder, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Black, David, 1997, Vico and Moral Perception, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Brennan, Timothy, 2014, Borrowed Light: Vico, Hegel, and the Colonies, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Burke, Peter, 1985, Vico, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Camponigri, A. Robert, 1953, Time and Idea: The Theory of History in Giambattista Vico, Chicago: Regnery.
  • Danesi, Marcel, 1993, Vico, Metaphor, and the Origin of Language, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • DuBois, Nancy, 2001, Vico and Plato, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Goetsch, Jr., James Robert, 1995, Vico’s Axioms: The Geometry of the Human World, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Grassi, Ernesto, 1990, Vico and Humanism: Essays on Vico, Heidegger, and Rhetoric, New York: Peter Lang.
  • Mazzotta, Guiseppe, 1999, The New Map of the World: The Poetic Philosophy of Giambattista Vico, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Mali, Joseph, 2002, The Rehabilitation of Myth: Vico’s ‘New Science.’, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Marshall, David L., 2010, Vico and the Transformation of Rhetoric in Early Modern Europe, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Miner, Robert C., 2002, Vico: Genealogist of Modernity, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Mooney, Michael, 1985, Vico in the Tradition of Rhetoric, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Naddeo, Barbara Anne, 2011, Vico and Naples: The Urban Origins of Modern Social Theory, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Pompa, Leon, 1990, Vico: A Study of the New Science, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Schaeffer, John D., 1990, Sensus Communis: Vico, Rhetoric, and the Limits of Relativism, Durham: Duke University Press.
  • Stone, Harold Samuel, 1997, Vico’s Cultural History: The Production and Transmission of Ideas in Naples, 1685–1750 (Brill’s Studies in Intellectual History, Volume 73), Leiden: Brill Academic Publishers.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip, 1981, Vico’s Science of Imagination, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1991, The New Art of Biography: An Essay on the “Life of Giambattista Vico Written by Himself”, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Philosophy and the Return to Self Knowledge, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2015, Vico’s ‘New Science’: A Philosophical Commentary, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2021, The Rhetorical Sense of Philosophy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Journal Articles

  • Barfield, Raymond, 2011, “Vico’s New Science,” Chapter 6 in Barfield, The Ancient Quarrel Between Philosophy and Poetry, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bayer, Thora Ilin, 2008, “Vico’s Pedagagy (1699–1707),” New Vico Studies, 27: 39–56.
  • Bayer, Thora Ilin, 2000, “The Future of Vico Studies: Vico at the Millennium,” New Vico Studies, 18: 71–76.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, 1985, “On Vico,” Philosophical Quarterly, 35: 281–289.
  • Costelloe, Timothy M., 1999, “The State of Nature in Vico’s New Science,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 16 (2): 320–339.
  • Dmitriev, Alexander, 2016, “Mikhail Lifshits and the Soviet Image of Giambattista Vico,” Studies in East European Thought, 68: 271–282.
  • Israel, Jonathan I., 2001, “The Radical Impact in Italy: Giambattista Vico (1668–1744),” in Israel, Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity 1650–1750, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Levine, Joseph, 1991, “Giambattista Vico and the Quarrel between the Ancients and the Moderns,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 52 (1): 55–79.
  • Lim, Donghyun L., 2018, “Vico and the Disregation of Historical salutis,” History of European Ideas, 44 (1): 1–13.
  • Mali, Joseph, 1995, “On Giambattista Vico,” History of European Ideas, 21 (2): 287–290.
  • Marshall, David L., 2011, “The Current State of Vico Scholarship,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 72: 141–60.
  • Miner, Robert C., 1998, “Verum-factum and Practical Wisdom in the Early Writings of Giambattista Vico,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 59 (1): 53–73.
  • Pierlott, Matthew, 2000, “Vico’s Principle of Authority and the Ideal Eternal History: Transcendence of Human Limitation,” Dialogue, 42 (2–3): 46–52.
  • Samuelson, Scott, 1999, “Joyce’s Finnegans Wake and Vico’s Mental Dictionary,” New Vico Studies, 17: 53–66.
  • Trompf, G.W., 1994, “Vico’s Universe: ‘La Provvedenza’ and ‘la Poesia’ in the New Science of Giambattista Vico,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 2 (1): 55–86.
  • Perez, Zaragin, 1984, “Vico’s Theory of Knowledge,” Philosophical Quarterly, 34: 15–30.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip, 2009, “The Poetic Metaphysics of Jove,” The Review of Metaphysics, 63: 307–28.

Edited Collections and Bibliographies of Work on Vico

  • Crease, Robert, 1978, Vico in English: A Bibliography of Writings by and about Giambattista Vico 1668–1744, Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Croce, Benedetto, 1947–48, Bibliografia vichiana. Revised and enlarged by Fausto Nicolini. 2 volumes, Naples: Ricciardi.
  • Donzelli, Maria, 1973, Contributo alla bibliografia vichiani 1948–1970, Naples: Guida.
  • Gianturco, Elio, 1968, A Selective Bibliography of Vico Scholarship 1948–1968 (Supplement to Forum Italicum), Florence: Grafica Toscana.
  • Tagliacozzo, Giorgo, 1981, Vico: Past and Present, Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Tagliacozzo, Giorgo and Donald Phillip Verene, 1976, Giambattista Vico’s Science of Humanity, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press. [Includes “Critical Writings on Vico in English,” by Molly Black Verene, pp.457–80, which expands the bibliography in Giambattista Vico: An International Symposium.]
  • Tagliacozzo, Giorgo, and Donald Phillip Verene and Venessa Rumble, 1986, A Bibliography of Vico in English, 1884–1984, Bowling Green, Ohio: Bowling Green State University Press.
  • Tagliacozzo, Giorgo and Hayden V. White, 1969, Giambattista Vico: An International Symposium, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press. [Includes “Bibliography” by Tagliacozza, pp. 615–19.]
  • Tagliacozzo, Giorgo, Michael Monney, and Donald Phillip Verene, 1979, Vico and Contemporary Thought, Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Tateo, Luca, with a foreword by Jaan Valsiner, 2017, Giambattista Vico and the New Psychological Science, London: Routledge.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip, 1987, Vico and Joyce, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Verene, Donald Phillip and Thora Ilin Bayer, 2009, Keys to the New Science; Translations, Commentaries, and Essays, Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press.
  • Verene, Molly Black, 1976, “Critical Writings on Vico in English: A Supplement,” Social Research, 43: 904–14.
  • –––, 1994, Vico: A Bibliography of Works in English from 1884–1994, Charlottesville: Philosophy Documentation Center.

Other Internet Resources

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