A Priori Justification and Knowledge

First published Sun Dec 9, 2007; substantive revision Wed May 6, 2020

A priori justification is a type of epistemic justification that is, in some sense, independent of experience. Gettier examples have led most philosophers to think that having a justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge (see Section 4.4, below, and the examples there), but many still believe that it is necessary. In this entry, it will be assumed, for the most part, that even though justification is not sufficient for knowledge it is necessary and that a priori knowledge is knowledge based on a priori justification. So much of the discussion will focus on a priori justification.

There are a variety of views about whether a priori justification requires some sort of evidence or whether, instead, some propositions can be “default reasonable”, or that a person can be entitled to accept certain propositions independent of any evidence, perhaps because they are reasonable presuppositions of some area of inquiry. Philosophers who think that a priori justification requires evidence differ about the details. Some think that a priori evidence can be defeated (overridden or undercut) by other evidence, including evidence from sensory observations. There are a variety of views about whether a priori justification, and knowledge, must be only of propositions about what is possible or necessary, and if necessary, only of analytic propositions, that is, propositions that are in some sense “true in virtue of their meaning” (as in examples 1a–8a, below). Those who think that a priori justification requires evidence often think that the evidence is provided by rational intuitions or insights, but there is disagreement about the nature of those intuitions or insights, and critics deny that they really do constitute evidence.

The following list indicates the topics that will be presented and addressed.

1. Examples that illustrate the difference between a priori and a posteriori (empirical) justification

A priori justification is a certain kind of justification often contrasted with empirical, or a posteriori, justification. Roughly speaking, a priori justification provides reasons for thinking a proposition is true that comes from merely understanding, or thinking about, that proposition. In contrast, a posteriori justification requires more than merely understanding a proposition. Observations based on our senses, or introspection about our current mental state, are needed for us to be empirically, or a posteriori, justified in believing that some proposition is true. Examples below bring out the contrast. The first proposition in each group is a prime candidate for being a priori justified, if justified at all, while the other propositions are prime candidates for being a posteriori justified, if justified at all. Some of the propositions are false, but that does not mean that we could not be justified in believing them before we had evidence that they are false.

All bachelors are unmarried males.
All bachelors in the U.S. are taxed at a different rate from married men.
All vixens are female.
All vixens are cunning.
Green is a color.
Grass is green.
All Crimson things are red.
All recent volumes of Who’s Who are red. (Williamson 2013: 295)
A house is an abode for living.
A house undermined will fall. (Bealer 1992: 102; 1998: 207, 211)
All squares are rectangles.
No square-shaped object has a surface area greater than the total surface area of the United States.
If you know something, you believe it and it’s true.
I know that the earth is round.
A mountain is a raised surface of limited area, larger than a hill, usually with steep slopes and a peak.
There are mountains.
2 + 2 = 4.
2 quarts of any liquid added to 2 more quarts of any liquid = 4 quarts of liquid.
No object can be red and green all over at the same time.
There are ripe tomatoes that are now red all over but were green all over weeks earlier.
If A is taller than B, and B is taller than C, then A is taller than C.
Kevin Durant is taller than Lebron James, and Lebron James is taller than Steph Curry (famous basketball players).
Happiness is an intrinsic good.
Happiness is the result of doing what you like.
It is wrong to punish the innocent.
People who are unjustly punished often become angry and resentful.
Torturing children just for the fun of it is wrong.
Torture often produces unreliable testimony.
All rubies are red.
All rubies have chemical structure Al2O3.
Topaz is either blue, orange, yellow, or yellowish brown.
Water is H2O.

In each example, it is possible for someone to be justified in believing the first member in a way that is different from how it is possible for someone to be justified in believing the other members of the example. The way the first members can be justified is called a priori; the way the other members can be justified is called a posteriori (or empirically).

The first question to discuss is what sorts of propositions can be a priori justified and known.

2. What sorts of propositions can be a priori justified and known: all, and only, modal propositions?

Philosophers generally agree that we can be justified in believing 15bi and 15biii only empirically. Yet many believe that they are necessarily true. If they are necessarily true, that would mean that it’s false that we can be justified in believing necessary truths only a priori. But some philosophers think that 15bi and 15biii are not necessary truths and the relevant necessary truth that we can know a priori is that the essence of any type of matter is given by the basic elements of which it is composed. On this view, in the case of water and rubies, we discover empirically what those basic elements are and the propositions that state those discoveries are contingent. Philosophers who hold that 15bi and 15biii do express necessary truths usually think that there are descriptions that fix the reference of the terms, for example, for water, the description,

the stuff, whatever it is, that, in the actual world, has the properties of quenching thirst, putting out certain fires, falling from the clouds as rain, filling the lakes and rivers, etc.

While the meaning of “water” is given by this reference-fixing description, and can be known a priori, the essence of water must be discovered empirically. The meaning of natural kind terms does not give the essence of the kind directly in the way it does with “bachelor” and “vixen”.

One might think that 15a can be justified only empirically, but gemologists seem to think that it is conceptually necessary that rubies are red, that is, that the meaning of “ruby” requires that rubies be red. So given how gemologists use “ruby”, 15a is knowable a priori. The notion of a ruby seems to be a hybrid notion: its color is knowable a priori but its material essence as given in 15bi is knowable only empirically.

While it is widely believed that some necessary truths are capable of justification and can be known only empirically (e.g., “Water is H2O”), some contingent truths also seem justifiable, and knowable, a priori. Saul Kripke proposed that “the standard meter stick, S, in Paris is a meter long at \(t_0\)” is such an example (Kripke 1972: 274–275). “The length of S in the actual world at \(t_0\)” rigidly designates that length, that is, it refers to length L in every possible world. The reference of “one meter” is given by that reference-fixing description, so “one meter” rigidly designates L. However, “the length of S at \(t_0\)” does not rigidly designate any particular length since at \(t_0\) in other possible worlds S will be longer or shorter than L. So the proposition that “S is a meter long at \(t_0\)” is contingent because in other possible worlds that very same stick will be shorter or longer than it was in the actual world at that time. Still, we can know a priori, that is, independent of any empirical evidence, that “S is a meter long at \(t_0\)” is true in the actual world given that we know how the reference of “one meter” is fixed by a description that refers to the length of S in the actual world. If empirical evidence plays any role, it is only insofar as we need it to know that there really is a stick, S, that was designated as the meter at some particular time and place.

A second candidate for being a contingent proposition that is knowable a priori comes from John Turri. He claims that the proposition, “The most unlikely possible event is not presently occurring”, is contingent yet can be known simply in virtue of understanding its content, and hence is knowable a priori (2011: 337–338). “The most unlikely possible event” refers to an event that is maximally improbable. So we know a priori that no one could have sufficient reason to believe that an event that fits that description is now occurring. Still, it is possible that such an event is presently occurring. Thus we can know a priori that the contingent proposition that says that a maximally improbable event is now occurring is false, and that its denial is true.

A third candidate for being a contingent proposition that is knowable a priori is offered by Gareth Evans. He thinks that we can be a priori justified in believing, and know, propositions of the form, “If actually p, then p”, and particular instantiations of that form. Consider, “if any post is actually red, then it is red”. This proposition is contingent because the post could be red in the actual world but not red in some other possible world. So in some other possible world, \(w_2\), its antecedent can be true (because its antecedent is about the color of the post in the actual world, \(w_1\)) and it’s consequent false (because the post is not red in \(w_2\) and the consequent is about the color of the post in that world). A conditional that is necessarily true cannot have a true antecedent and a false consequent in any possible world. However, we can know independently of experience (that is, a priori) that if the post is actually red, then it’s red since it is true in the actual world (cf., Evans 1979: 83–85, for his discussion of this topic).

Another candidate for the contingent a priori is the proposition expressed by, “I am here now”. That sentence expresses a contingent proposition, since I do not have to exist, much less do I have to be where I actually am at the present time. Yet a person can know it is true wherever and whenever she utters it regardless of the experiences she is currently having or has had in the past, and so independently of experience.

Leaving aside now the question of whether there can be contingent propositions that are knowable a priori, there seems to be a difference within the class of necessarily true propositions that can be known, or justifiably believed, a priori. The propositions expressed by 10a–14a seem different from the propositions expressed by 1a–8a. Each of the latter propositions seem to be analytic, that is, in each case the sentence that expresses the proposition will express a logical truth if relevant terms and expressions in it are replaced by appropriate synonyms. So, for instance, “all vixens are female” will express a logical truth of the form if \(A \amp B\), then A if we substitute for “vixen”, “female fox”, for it will then say: if something is a female fox, it is a female. But no substitution of synonyms for terms or expressions in 10a–14a will yield a logical truth. The propositions expressed by 10a–14a are often said to be synthetic a priori propositions because they are not analytic (they are not true in virtue of their meaning, as it is sometimes put) but are a priori knowable and justifiable.

3. Is a priori justification fallible and defeasible?

A type of justification (say, via perception) is fallible if and only if it is possible to be justified in that way in holding a false belief. A type of justification is defeasible if and only if that justification could be overridden by further evidence that goes against the truth of the proposition or undercut by considerations that call into question whether there really is justification (say, poor lighting conditions that call into question whether vision provides evidence in those circumstances).

Just as we can be empirically justified in believing a false proposition (e.g., 9b: two quarts of water plus two quarts of carbon tetrachloride do not combine to yield four quarts of liquid), philosophers argue that we can also be a priori justified in believing a false proposition. Perhaps Kant was a priori justified in believing that every event has a cause. He thought that the proposition had that status. Yet many physicists believe that there are genuinely random events at the subatomic level, and reasonably believe it false that every event has a cause. You might initially be a priori justified in believing that no matter how happiness has been produced it is intrinsically good (12a), or that it is always wrong to punish an innocent person (13a). You might later think of counterexamples to such claims (e.g., by considering happiness produced through the suffering of others or punishing an innocent person to prevent some evil men from punishing him and many other innocent people). Then your initial a priori justification would be defeated. John Hawthorne notes how even paradigmatic instances of a priori justification, such as someone’s carefully working through a mathematical proof, can be undercut if the person gets empirical evidence that he is mad or that his proof is probably mistaken (based on evidence provided by expert testimony, a bad track record, or of distorting background conditions, etc.) (Hawthorne 2013: 2009). These examples seem to show that a priori justification is fallible and defeasible (i.e., it can be defeated by further a priori or empirical evidence).

Consider another example that makes this point. A sorites paradox involving heaps consists of the general claim that if you take one bean away from a heap of beans, you still have a heap, and a more specific claim that, say, any cone-shaped stack of a thousand beans is a heap. These two premises will lead you, bean by bean, to the conclusion that one, or even no beans, is a heap! It seems that we are a priori justified in believing both the general and the more specific claim are true, but at least one of them must not be true (perhaps the general claim is false, or even neither true nor false) because together they lead to an absurd conclusion. So this is another reason to think that a priori justification is fallible. (See Sosa 1998: 258–259, for an example about heaps.) George Bealer argues that philosophical paradoxes show that intuition is fallible (1998: 202). With a paradox, you are justified in believing each of a set of propositions taken separately, but at least one of them must be false because the set is inconsistent.

Why have some thought that a proposition that is a priori justified cannot be defeated by empirical evidence? Kant said that a priori knowledge is “knowledge that is absolutely independent of all experience” (Kant 1787 [1965: 43(B3)]). But it might be that the requirement that a priori knowledge be absolutely independent of all experience is too stringent. Enabling experiences may be required. It avoids this difficulty to hold instead that a priori knowledge and justification are independent of all experience beyond what is needed to grasp the relevant concepts involved in the relevant proposition (see, below, sec. 4.1). The fact that a priori knowledge is not independent of all experience does not show that it is empirically defeasible, but it does defeat the argument that it is not empirically defeasible because it is independent of all experience.

When it is just a matter of a priori justification, not knowledge, Philip Kitcher thinks that if there is such a thing as all things considered a priori justification, then “a person is entitled to ignore empirical information about the type of world she inhabits” (Kitcher 1983: 30; see, also, 24, 80–87). This view seems to rest on Kant’s idea but applied to justification, not just knowledge. If a priori justification is independent of all empirical experience, then no such experience can count either for or against a proposition that is justified a priori. Hilary Putnam thinks that if there is a priori justification, then there are “truths which it is always rational to believe” (Putnam 1983: 90). On Kitcher’s understanding of a priori justification, it is not defeasible by empirical information; on Putnam’s, it is not defeasible at all.

It’s hard to see how either view is defensible in light of the objections by Sosa, Bealer, and Hawthorne. Insofar as justification is relative to the evidence a person has, or should have, it seems possible for further evidence, either empirical or from intuition or rational insight, to override or undercut a person’s current evidence and thereby destroy that person’s current justification and knowledge. Nothing in the nature of a priori justification rules out that possibility. (See the discussion of Hartry Field, in Section 4.5 below, for more on why it is possible for empirical evidence in particular to defeat a priori justification.)

Up to this point, the discussion has focused on the sorts of propositions that can be justified, or known, a priori, and whether a priori justification is fallible and defeasible. But what does it mean to say that someone is a priori justified in believing propositions like those expressed by each of the first sentences in the fifteen examples above, that is, by 1a–15a? The discussion will now focus on that question.

Then I will turn to the three main views about the nature of a priori justification. One view is that a priori justification is not significantly different from empirical justification. A second view is that it rests on a distinct type of internal mental state often called rational intuition or rational insight and that those intuitions or insights can provide evidence for or against certain propositions. A third view is that a person can be a priori entitled to believe certain propositions independently of any evidence, or can be default reasonable in accepting a proposition independent of any evidence.

4. What is the nature of a priori justification?

4.1 A priori justification is justification that is independent of experience

A standard answer to the question about the difference between a priori and empirical justification is that a priori justification is independent of experience and empirical justification is not, and this seems to explain the contrasts present in the fifteen examples above. But various things have been meant by “experience”. On a narrow account, “experience” refers to sense experience, that is, to experiences that come from the use of our five senses: sight, touch, hearing, smell, and taste. However, this narrow account implies that justification based on introspection, proprioception (our kinesthetic sense of the position and movements of our body), memory, and testimony are kinds of a priori justification. And if we had different senses, like those of bats (echolocation) and duck-billed platypuses (electrolocation), experiences based on those senses would provide a priori, not empirical, justification on this account which takes a priori justification to be independent of experiences based on the senses we have.

Given these considerations, perhaps “experience” should be taken to mean “sense experience of any sort, introspection, proprioception, memory, and testimony”. This sounds like a hodgepodge of various sources of justification but perhaps what unites them is that, leaving aside memory and testimony, these sources provide us with information either about the physical world or our inner world, either the outer world through perception or the inner world of what we are feeling or thinking, or information about our bodies, through introspection and proprioception. Memory and testimony are not primary sources of justification; their primary epistemic function is to transmit either a priori or empirical justification. So the proposal should be seen as a way of distinguishing the primary sources of justification into two categories of justification: a priori and empirical.

As noted above (see, sec. 3) and below (secs. 4.4 and 4.5), “independent of experience” should not be taken to mean independent of all experience, but, as a first approximation, to mean “independent of all experience beyond what is needed to grasp the relevant concepts involved in the proposition”. It is sometimes said that a priori justification can depend on experience insofar as it enables the person to acquire the concepts needed to grasp the meaning of the proposition which is the object of justification, but experience cannot play an evidential role in that justification (Williamson 2013: 293). Later we will see that the notion of enabling experience might better be expanded to include experience needed to acquire certain intellectual skills such as those needed to construct certain proofs or create counterexamples (see, secs. 4.4 and 4.5, below).

Suppose there is a significant difference between a priori and empirical justification. This still does not tell us what the basis of a priori justification is. One view is that rational intuitions or insights are the bases of a priori justification; experiences, as construed above, the bases of empirical justification. Before discussing the nature of rational intuitions or insights, we should first distinguish between intuitions and intuitive judgments and consider what the content of intuitive judgments evoked in thought experiments is.

4.2 What is the content of intuitive judgments?

Anna-Sara Malmgren holds that intuitions are certain kinds of mental states some of which are candidates as justifiers of intuitive judgments that are made in response to philosophical thought experiments (2011: 267–268). What is the content of such intuitive judgments? Malmgren notes that there are several different ways to characterize intuitive judgments, but because they are all controversial, she characterizes them by reference to examples. For her, “an intuitive judgment is any judgment relevantly similar to certain paradigms or examples” (Malmgren 2011: 268). Her paradigm examples are of judgments that are evoked in Gettier cases where a person is in some sense lucky to have a true belief given his evidence, Twin Earth cases where a term or phrase does not refer to the same thing in different possible worlds, and the trolley case where a heavy man is pushed in front of a trolley to stop it from running over five people further down the tracks. Others offer as examples the judgment that it is morally permissible to unhook a violinist who has been connected to your kidneys without your consent, even if that will kill him (an example made famous by Judith Thomson in the abortion debate), the judgment that it is irrational for a man who grants that his life in the future will be happy, not a burden on others, virtuous, productive, with many friends and adventures, and will otherwise be worthwhile, to refuse to take a life-saving pill (Derek Parfit’s Early Death 2011: 270-71), and the judgment that it is irrational for a person now not to care about his suffering on any future Tuesday just because it’s a Tuesday (Parfit’s Future Tuesday Indifference 1984: 124).

Malmgren argues against Timothy Williamson’s view that the content of intuitive judgments involves counterfactual judgments. Williamson says that in typical Gettier cases we make two judgments: a judgment that such a case is possible and a counterfactual judgment that if the case had occurred, it would be a case of a justified true belief without knowledge. These two judgments entail that it is possible for a person to have a justified true belief without knowledge in a situation like that described in the Gettier example (Williamson 2004: 110). While Malmgren agrees that a possibility judgment is the content of the intuitive judgments in Gettier cases (2011: 281), she denies that it need be reached via the counterfactual judgment that Williamson proposes.

Malmgren thinks that descriptions of cases in thought experiments are incomplete, and that certain ways of completing them are deviant because they involve interpretations of the cases that misunderstand what is intended (2011: 274–275). In the famous Nogot/Havit Gettier case, the issue is whether Smith knows that someone in his office owns a Ford. Smith sees Nogot driving around in a Ford and, say, believes that Nogot has shown him current ownership papers to a Ford. But Nogot actually drives a rental car, does not own a Ford, and has shown Smith ownership papers to a Ford he used to own. It would be a deviant understanding of the example to assume also that Smith has good independent evidence that Havit, who also works in his office, owns a Ford. Of course, in that case Smith would know that someone in his office owns a Ford. Malmgren thinks that the interpretation that assumes that Smith is hallucinating and has a poor memory of what papers he has seen is also deviant. In that case, Smith would not be justified in believing that Nogot, and so someone in his office, owns a Ford.

The intuitive judgment in the case is: it is possible that a person in a situation like that described in the example has a justified true belief without knowledge. Williamson thinks that this judgment is based on the counterfactual: if the case had occurred, it would be a case of justified true belief without knowledge. But in the deviant cases, it would not be a case of justified true belief without knowledge, either because it would be a case of knowledge (the extra reasons case where Smith has evidence that Havit owns a Ford) or not a case of justified belief (where Smith is hallucinating, has a poor memory, etc.). However, those deviant cases could occur in the possible world that is most similar to the actual world, sometimes called the “nearest possible world” by philosophers. Because of this, as counterfactuals are usually understood by philosophers, what Williamson takes to be the relevant counterfactual would be false. In the nearest possible world where the standard description of the case holds, the consequent of the counterfactual would be false. So the case would offer no support for the intuitive modal judgment: it is possible that a person has a justified true belief without knowledge. It seems clear to Malmgren that the case does support that possibility judgment regardless of whether nearby worlds are deviant (making the consequent of the relevant counterfactual false) or not (Malmgren 2011: 278–279). So Williamson must be mistaken in thinking that some counterfactual judgment must be the basis of the modal intuitive judgment: it is possible to have a justified true belief without knowledge in a case like the one described in the example.

4.3 There is no significant difference between a priori and a posteriori justification and knowledge

One way to answer the question about the nature of a priori justification and knowledge is to adopt a bottom up approach. Start with contrasting examples like the fifteen above and construct a theory that explains the difference. Timothy Williamson objects to this approach on the grounds that it may result “in a distinction of no special significance like a taxonomy of plants and animals based on color” or the classification of plants into bushes and non-bushes (2013: 291 and 309). Ultimately, that is what he argues: the difference between a priori and a posteriori knowledge is insignificant.

Williamson imagines that through perceptual experiences and relevant feedback a person has acquired the ability to reliably judge distances in terms of inches, and separately, by the same means, to judge them in terms of centimeters. But she has not yet realized that there is a relationship between distance in inches and distance in centimeters. Then one day she uses her perceptual capacity to judge distances in inches and centimeters “offline” by forming side-by-side visual images of marks nine inches apart and nineteen centimeters apart and sees that D is true: If two marks had been nine inches apart, they would have been at least nineteen centimeters apart. She has never measured how far apart the front and back legs of an ant are, but in a similar way she uses her imagination and sees that A is true: If two marks had been nine inches apart, they would have been further apart than the front and back legs of an ant.

In both cases, experience is the basis of a capacity to make judgments in imagination and what goes on in imagination is what provides the justification for those judgments.

Williamson’s argument against the significance of the distinction between a priori and a posteriori justification rests on comparing how D and A (and other similar pairs of propositions like 4a and 4b in the examples above) are justified. He contends that they are both justified by relevant manipulations in imagination. But on traditional accounts of justification, D would be a paradigm case of some proposition that can only be a priori justified and A a paradigm case of some proposition that can only be a posteriori justified. Williamson seems happy to concede that there is some sort of difference (2013: 294–295, 296–297) between these two types of justification but to deny that it is a significant difference given the way that each type relies on manipulations in imagination. He might grant that the difference is like the difference between seeing something through a microscope or telescope as opposed to seeing something with the naked eye. There is a difference, but it is not a significant difference since these three types of seeing all rely on visual perceptions.

Defenders of a significant distinction between a priori and a posteriori justification could grant that there is no significant difference insofar as imagination plays the role in justification that Williamson proposes. And sometimes it does play that role in a priori justification as Elijah Chudnoff illustrates with many examples involving geometric propositions and accompanying figures (2011a: 636–38; 2013a: 370–372). However, there are other ways to justify propositions a priori. Some seemingly a priori propositions can be justified by reflection. One example that Chudnoff often appeals to involves the proposition: if \(a\lt 1\), then \(2 -2a \gt 0\). To justify that proposition, you might first let \(a = 1\) and see that \(2 - 2a = 0\). You might then reflect that when “a” is a number less than one but greater than or equal to zero, \((2 - 2a)\) is greater than zero. Finally, you might reflect that if “a” is a negative number, \((-2a)\) will be a positive number, so \((2 - 2a)\) will be a number larger than 2, and so greater than zero. So by reflection on a few relevant cases, we can come to see a priori that if \(a\lt 1\), then \((2 - 2a) \gt 0\). This way is much different than the way we might come via imagination to see A = If two marks had been nine inches apart, they would have been further apart than the front and back legs of an ant.

In the case of proposition D, we might learn that one inch equals 2.54 centimeters, do the math and see that nine inches equals 22.86 centimeters, and thereby see that nine inches is greater than nineteen centimeters. There are other ways to be a priori justified in believing some proposition is true than by what Williamson calls the method of simulation. And those ways of justifying a proposition a priori are significantly different from a posteriori ways of justifying a proposition.

In a recent essay (2020b), Boghossian defends three different ways (none of which involve the method of simulation) by which we might be a priori justified in believing a proposition: two ways in which our understanding might be the source of a priori justification, and a third way that appeals to rational intuitions that do not have a distinctive phenomenology and, according to Boghossian, are not the product of our understanding concepts.

In many essays and a book, Elijah Chudnoff argues that intuitions have what he calls a “presentational phenomenology” that parallels that of perception. For him, intuitions are intellectual perceptions that sometimes reveal abstract reality in the way that sensory perceptions sometimes reveal concrete reality. So on his view, a priori justification is similar to, but significantly different from, a posteriori justification. For Chudnoff, intuitions can be evoked through imagination, reflection, and even reasoning from premises to a conclusion, but it is their nature, not their source, that is the basis of their ability to provide justification. His argument parallels an argument that says perceptions justify because they are the mental states they are, not because of their source. That is why they can provide justification in a demon world or the Matrix, even though their source is a demon or super computers and not real objects.

Like Boghossian and Chudnoff, and unlike Williamson, Albert Casullo thinks that there is a significant difference between a priori and a posteriori justification based on the difference between support by nonexperiential and experiential evidence. He also thinks that there is something like justification (namely, positive epistemic status) that does not rest on evidence at all (2012c: 318–326). For Casullo and others, positive epistemic status can stem from what you are entitled to accept given certain ends or projects. This sort of view will be discussed in Section 4.5 below.

4.4 Rational intuitions or insights as the bases of a priori justification

Suppose a priori justification rests on output (evidence) from some nonexperiential source. What sort of evidence could that be? A standard answer is that intuition, or rational insight, is the basis of a priori justification. And what are intuitions, or rational insights?

As we’ve seen, Malmgren distinguishes between intuitions and intuitive judgments, where an intuition is a distinctive type of mental state that can justify a judgment (2011: 267–268). But not everyone means the same thing by “intuition”. In Thinking, Fast and Slow, Daniel Kahneman argues that intuitions often lead us to accept false beliefs. He offers Herbert Simon’s definition of an intuition, “Intuition is nothing more and nothing less than recognition [of some cue stored in memory]” (2011: 11, 237). But Kahneman is thinking of fast, automatic, immediate judgments when he writes of intuitions and intuitive judgments based on them. He often thinks of them as issuing from “gut feelings”, as in his example of “the chief investment officer of a large financial firm” who decided to invest tens of millions of dollars in Ford Stock after recently attending an auto show where Ford vehicles were on display (2011: 12). And he describes an intuitive answer as “the first one that comes to mind” (2011: 6). Elijah Chudnoff has a different conception of intuitions because he thinks that “there are hard-won intuitions which take deliberate effort to have” and other intuitions that require an expert to guide a person before she can have them (Chudnoff 2020).

Philosophers do not mean what Kahneman means when they refer to the intuitions people typically have when considering Gettier cases and the other paradigmatic cases listed above. While intuitions are non-inferential, some can appear only after much reflection and effort (see, again, Chudnoff 2020). Nor are they what George Bealer means by a “physical intuition”, such as the one that founds the intuitive judgment that a house undermined will fall (Bealer 1992: 102; 1998: 207, 211). They are some sort of intellectual seeming (Bealer) or rational insight (BonJour). For Bealer and BonJour, taken in the broadest sense, intuitions are non-inferential in that they are not the conclusion of some piece of reasoning. For Chudnoff, intuitions can be produced by reasoning though their justificatory force does not come from that reasoning. The reasoning just leads you to a proposition that seems true in itself. Like sensations, intuitions must be occurrent, and so are unlike beliefs, which need not be. You can have a belief that P while not considering P, but you cannot have an intuition that P while not considering P.

When it is a matter of perception, in the Mueller-Lyer figure the line with the arrowheads pointing inward appears longer than the one with them pointing outward even if you know it is not really longer. To some people at least, in the Monty Hall example it seems that there is a 50-50 chance that the grand prize is behind either of the two doors that are left unopened after Monty has opened one of them, even though they know that the probability it is behind the door the contestant did not choose is 2/3 (see Russell 2010: 464, for the Monty Hall example). So intuitions are a type of appearing; physical and philosophical intuitions have this in common. George Bealer characterizes a rational intuition as an intellectual seeming that some proposition is necessarily, or possibly, true (Bealer 1998: 207–208). He contrasts this with the physical intuition that a house undermined will fall which is not about what is necessarily or possibly true. Also, philosophical intuitions are based solely on understanding the proposition which is their object while physical intuitions are based on understanding something about the physical world. Bealer contrasts intuitions with “judgments, guesses, and hunches” (1998: 210–211), common sense, belief, and even an inclination to believe (1998: 208–209). And, of course, they are not just “gut feelings”, which are not based solely on understanding some proposition,

Laurence BonJour thinks that a rational insight is an immediate, non-inferential grasp, apprehension, or “seeing” that some proposition is necessarily true (BonJour 1998: 106). He goes on to argue that a proposition’s appearing to be necessarily true is the foundation of a priori justification, because he wants to allow that such justification can be fallible and defeasible. So for BonJour it is apparent rational insights that are the evidence on which a priori justification rests, not rational insights themselves (1998: 112–113, 1998: §§4.5, 4.6). After publishing In Defense of Pure Reason (1998), and in response to comments by Paul Boghossian (2001), BonJour wrote that these appearances are not propositional, that is, they are not appearances that something is the case (BonJour 2001a: 677–678). In this respect, they are unlike beliefs and more like perceptual sensations.

John Hawthorne questions whether apparent rational insights or rational intuitions as understood by BonJour and Bealer, respectively, provide evidence for the beliefs which are based on them. He assumes that these intellectual seemings manifest themselves to inner consciousness “by a special kind of phenomenology” (Hawthorne 2013: 215). He then wonders whether any of the following would provide evidence: a seeming without the relevant phenomenology he calls Glow, a seeming with a Glow of which the person is unaware (if this is even possible), a seeming with a known Glow which is unreliable. He seems to think that good answers to these questions would require abandoning the “internalist mandate” that drives these views that “allow only that which is ‘accessible’ from the inside to count as relevant to justification” (Hawthorne 2013: 216). As we’ve seen, Chudnoff thinks that intuitions have a distinctive phenomenology that provides reason to believe that the propositions which are their objects are true (2011b, esp. secs. 6 & 7); others think that they need not have a distinctive phenomenology (Sosa 2013; Boghossian 2020b). One might maintain that at least in certain circumstance, being in the mental state with the relevant phenomenology necessarily gives you prima facie reason to believe the proposition consideration of which caused that intuition, that is, gives you a reason to believe that proposition even though that reason might be undermined or overridden by further considerations.

Further, Bealer may have an answer for those who think that reliability is a necessary condition of justification because he argues that intellectual seemings are necessarily reliable when had in certain conditions. He calls his view modal reliabilism (1998: 215–217), which holds that a certain kind of concept possession (namely, full understanding of the concept) in ideal conditions guarantees the sort of reliability that some think evidence requires. On this view, it does not matter what, if any, phenomenology is associated with the relevant intellectual seemings (cf. Sosa 2013). What matters is whether the person fully understands the relevant concepts involved. That could even be the basis for justification of intuitive mathematical judgments that are not accompanied by any intuitions with Glow (a possibility mentioned by Hawthorne above (2013: 217)). So a defender of views like Bonjour’s and Bealer’s can answer Hawthorne’s questions by arguing that the relevant intuitions or insights are reliable whether they are accompanied by Glows, unknown Glows, or no Glows at all.

Those who hold that intuitions can justify because they are based on the understanding think, for instance, that our understanding the concept knowledge is the source of our intuition that a correct lucky guess is not knowledge. Hawthorne’s criticisms of basing a priori justification on the understanding (as Boghossian 2020b proposes) is that there seem to be instances of a priori justification that require skill in “sophisticated proof techniques that are quite obviously not preconditions of anything in the domain” (Hawthorne 2013: 213). For instance, sophisticated proof techniques were required to prove Fermat’s Last Theorem even though it is easy to understand what the theorem says, namely, that the equation \(x^n + y^n = z^n\) has no solutions when n is a positive integer greater than two. A possible response to this objection is to expand the notion of enabling experiences to include those needed to acquire intellectual skills which are needed to employ intellectual seemings in reasoning (see, secs. 4.1 above and 4.5 below) and are different from perceptual skills. But possessing those techniques without also understanding the connections between the premises would not yield justification. It is possible to hold that the important difference between a priori and a posteriori justification is that once the concepts and the relevant techniques are acquired, nothing more is needed for a priori justification (that is the sense in which a priori justification is independent of experience), but further experience is needed for a posteriori justification. Further, Hawthorne’s criticism seems not to affect whether intellectual intuitions that are evoked by thought experiments (as in standard Gettier cases) can provide evidence since no special techniques are required there.

While Hawthorne questions whether intuitions provide any evidence for or against philosophical theories, Brian Weatherson grants that they do but questions how much evidential weight they have. Gettier examples are taken by many to be a conclusive refutation of the view that having a justified true belief is sufficient for knowledge, but not by Weatherson. He says,

In short, the true theory of knowledge is the one that does best at (a) accounting for as many as possible of our intuitions about knowledge while (b) remaining systematic. (2003: 7)

He thinks that it may be best to accept the JTB theory of knowledge even in the face of Gettier examples if no other systematic theory of knowledge is available. Systematic theories should not have too many unacceptable (that is, counterintuitive) theoretical consequences, should involve the analysis of a theoretically significant concept in theoretically significant terms, and should be simple (2003: 8–9). Weatherson says that,

While a theory can be reformist, it can’t be revolutionary. A theory that disagreed with virtually all intuitions about possible cases is, for that reason, false.

Stopped Clock is a case in which a person correctly believes that the time is, say, 1:00 p.m. on the basis of looking at a clock that reads 1:00 o’clock, and which he is justified in thinking is working properly. However, the clock stopped working exactly twenty-four hours earlier. Still, that person has a justified true belief that it is 1:00 p.m. Sheep is a case where a jokester farmer breeds poodles to look like sheep, and grooms them so they are indistinguishable from real sheep. He puts them in his field for tourists to see, and his real sheep are in that field but out of sight behind some large boulders where he feeds them. Jones drives by and forms the justified true belief that there are sheep in the field. It seems that the intuitions that knowledge is absent, but JTB present, in Stopped Clock and Sheep are enough to make it reasonable to reject the JTB theory of knowledge. A few really strong intuitions seem enough by themselves to make it reasonable to reject a theory. Contra Weatherson, reasonable rejection does not require that the theory disagree with virtually all intuitions. Theoretical virtues are not enough to overcome such intuitive shortcomings even if there is not a competing virtuous theoretical analysis available.

A promising account of a priori justification in terms of a nonexperiential source of evidence is one that sees intellectual intuition, rational insight, or apparent rational insight, as providing the relevant a priori evidence with its source being reason. This rational capacity is not some special faculty of intuition analogous, say, to sight, which is a source of empirical evidence. One function of reason involves “seeing” how evidence supports a conclusion, and in deductive reasoning, “seeing” how conclusions follow from premises. This same ability is exercised when reason “sees” that some proposition is true, or necessarily true, simply in virtue of the person’s understanding the proposition. However, this intellectual “seeing” need not have distinctive conscious qualities, qualia, associated with it, unlike perceptual seeing, which does. Apparent rational insights need not be accompanied by appearances, if “appearances” necessarily involve qualia. The metaphor of “seeing” logical connections or that certain propositions are true should not mislead us into thinking that there is a special, quasi-perceptual faculty along with sight, touch, hearing, etc. It is plausible to hold that reason can “grasp” and “see” without there being any analogue to having certain touch or visual sensations. (In several essays, Chudnoff disagrees: 2011a, 2011b.)

4.5 A priori justification does not require any nonexperiential source of evidence

Recently some philosophers have thought that a person can be justified in believing, or accepting, a proposition without having any evidence to support it, and so even if there is no nonexperiential source of evidence for that belief or acceptance. As we have seen, Timothy Williamson has argued that certain acquired skills can be used to provide justification for believing a proposition for which the person does not have evidence, namely, the skill of bringing ideas together in imagination. His proposal is that in the case of the inches/centimeters proposition it is this skill at making comparisons of length in imagination, and then observing the results, not a person’s perceptual evidence, that justifies him in believing that proposition.

Even if true, it seems that we can distinguish empirically based from understanding based employment of a skill. Manipulating in imagination two circles of unequal radii can bring a person to understand that they cannot intersect in more than two points. Creating an image of a line nine inches long next to an image of a typical ant can bring a person to believe that the distance between the front and back legs of a typical ant is less than nine inches, but not that it must be. Science fiction films sometimes depict giant ants that could have been actual. Further, skills at judging, say, that in Sheep you do not know that there are sheep in the field is based on your understanding the concept “knowledge”. But your skill in judging that sheep have wool requires more to qualify as knowledge than understanding that proposition: you need to know what sheep in fact are like. A detective’s skill at deducing via disjunctive syllogism that Jones is the murderer is similar to a geometer’s deducing that a quadrilateral has four interior angles or that the Pythagorean Theorem is true, but the nature of the premises can make all the difference between whether the reasoning is a posteriori or a priori. So even if the exercise of relevant skills can provide justification apart from evidence, how the skill is used, and in particular on what subject matter, seems to be a basis for distinguishing a priori from a posteriori (empirical) justification.

Another view that rejects the idea that a justified belief must be founded on evidence says that all of our beliefs are prima facie justified so all of them are what one might call “default reasonable”, that is, justified barring reasons to reject them (this is what Gilbert Harman (2001) calls “general foundationalism”). On some accounts of a priori justification, namely those that hold that a priori justification is justification independent of empirical evidence, general foundationalism would imply that all of a person’s beliefs are prima facie (or weakly) a priori justified since that justification would stem merely from the fact that the person believes them, not from any empirical evidence that supports them. On this view, and contrary to initial appearances, there is really no difference in the way the propositions at the start of this essay are prima facie justified since they are all weakly a priori justified if you accept them. The general foundationalist view might add that, if some are all things considered less justified than others, it is because of the relationships between them. Coherence considerations account for all things considered justification and are what upset initially equal prima facie justification. Further, this view has the implication that you could be prima facie justified in believing extremely bizarre propositions, say, beliefs about what happens on the planet Gliese 581d, a planet scientists have judged may be “friendly to life” (Russell 2012: 100), even though you have no empirical or testimonial evidence to support your beliefs about this alien planet. You may, but need not, also believe that the Gliesians are in touch with you (but not others) via telepathy because you are “the chosen one”. Insofar as you have no defeating evidence, you could even be all things considered justified in believing all those things about the Glieseans, despite having no evidence to support your beliefs. But it seems that a coherent set of beliefs about Gliese 581d would not provide a priori justification of all of them even if it provided some sort of justification for them. That would be drawing the boundaries of the a priori too broadly.

Hartry Field also holds that belief in certain propositions can be “default reasonable”, that is, justified but not on the basis of evidence. He seems to think that if a belief’s being “default reasonable” were sufficient for its being a priori justified, too many beliefs would count as being a priori justified. That’s because he thinks, for example, that “People usually tell the truth” is default reasonable but not a priori justified. So he adds the requirement that an a priori justified belief cannot be empirically defeasible (Field 2000: 119–120; cited in Casullo 2012c: 318–320). But we have seen above that paradigm cases of a priori justification can be defeated by empirical considerations (see above, sec. 3). So by adding the requirement of no empirical defeat, Field’s view will imply that there are no a priori justifiable propositions. On the other hand, if he drops that requirement, he faces the same problem as Harman in drawing the boundaries of a priori justification too broadly.

A final view of a priori justification according to which it does not rest on nonexperiential evidence holds that we are entitled to accept certain propositions on no evidence and that entitlement on no grounds or evidence is what a priori justification amounts to. To be entitled to accept, or trust, some presupposition is for it to be rational to accept or trust it, though this is supposed to be different from being justified in believing it. Crispin Wright proposes that the laws of logic and the presupposition that we are not now in the midst of a coherent and continuing dream, not now brains-in-a vat, etc., are rational presuppositions, some of which are standard presuppositions of science. That’s because certain “cognitive projects” (i) could not be pursued without presupposing those things, (ii) there is no evidence to think that those presuppositions are false (even if also none to think them true), and (iii) nothing will be lost, and something may be gained, by accepting these presuppositions (see Jenkins 2007). The gains and losses must not be pragmatic gains and losses such as gains and losses in happiness, prestige, accomplishments, wealth and the like. Otherwise all that would follow is that it is practically rational to accept the presuppositions. The gains and losses must be epistemic, that is, having to do with truth, or probable truth, or with evidence because Wright wants the rational acceptance of such presuppositions to be an answer to the skeptic about knowledge and epistemic justification.

Carrie Jenkins has questioned whether the project-relative rationality of a presupposition that Wright proposes is enough to make it rational to accept that presupposition (Jenkins 2007). For instance, when conducting certain inquiries, it might be rational relative to some project or kind of inquiry to accept that the world is a pretty orderly place, yet not epistemically rational to accept the presupposition itself. Maybe we should suspend judgment about that until we go look at the world.

We might think of these presuppositions as heuristics, rules that if followed usually aid us in the pursuit of truth but in certain contexts can be rationally doubted. Perhaps they do not necessarily determine what it is rational to believe or accept. In moral philosophy, anti-utilitarians often claim that there are many moral rules that prohibit lying, cheating, stealing, torturing, etc, and that these rules sometimes require people not to maximize utility. Act utilitarians often respond by saying that these are useful guides to doing what has the best consequences, but they are not definitive of what makes actions right or wrong. Wright’s presuppositions seem to be analogous to what act utilitarians see as heuristics or secondary rules.

In summary, it seems that accounts of a priori justification that do not hold that it rests on evidence provided by a nonexperiential source are in danger of counting certain beliefs or acceptances as a priori justified that, intuitively, do not seem to be. They are in danger of drawing the circle of a priori justification too broadly (Harman), to include propositions that are “default reasonable” (Field), or are presuppositions of science (Wright) that may be justified but do not seem to be a priori justified. The attempt by Field to narrow that circle seems to rest on a doubtful assumption, namely, that a priori justification cannot be defeated by empirical evidence.

If one thinks that some sort of justification can derive from what is default reasonable or through relevant entitlements, one might adopt Casullo’s view that there are different types of knowledge or justification, broadly construed: a priori which rests on nonexperiential evidence; a posteriori which rests on empirical evidence; and a third type of justification that does not rest on any evidence (Casullo 2012c: 324–326). This section has raised some problems for this third conception of justification.

We turn next to considerations that seem to count for the view that intellectual intuitions are evidence for the propositions that are their objects.

5. Should we think that rational intuitions provide evidence for the propositions that are their objects?

The answer to this question requires first answering another question: what are intuitions? As noted above, Bealer distinguishes between physical intuitions, such as the intuition that a house undermined will fall (1998: 207, 211, 213; 1992: 102, 104), and rational intuitions. Here are several of Bealer’s examples of rational intuitions from (1998): if P, then not not P (207); if P or Q, then it is not the case that both not P and not Q (210); that Gettier situations are possible (207: 211–12); that phenomenal colors are incompatible (211); that if spatial region x is a part of spatial region y and spatial region y is part of spatial region z, then spatial region x is part of spatial region z (212). At one point Bealer says that the difference between a physical and a rational intuition is that a rational intuition “presents itself as necessary”, but he immediately goes on to say that he does not know exactly how to analyze this notion. A proposal he offers is the following: if x (rationally) intuits P, then it seems to x that P and also that necessarily P. But later he says that in Gettier cases there are rational intuitions about the situation described being possible (1998: 206, 207, 211–12), and he explicitly says, “Without possibility intuitions, philosophy would be fatally flawed” (1998: 212; my italics). It seems that what Bealer holds is that a rational intuition that P is one where it either seems that P and also necessarily that P, OR it seems that it is possible that P. As we have seen, Malmgren argued that in Gettier cases the relevant intuition is that it is possible that a person in the relevant circumstances have a justified true belief but lack knowledge. Bealer’s remark about an intuition’s presenting itself as necessary was only meant as a way of contrasting the physical intuition that a house undermined will fall with some other rational intuitions. For Bealer, rational intuitions involve modal seemings, either about what is necessary or possible.

Bealer offers a complicated multi-stage argument for why intuitions, so understood, provide evidence. Part of his argument involves distinguishing basic from derivative sources of evidence. Some contingent sources of evidence provide justification but only because some basic source justifies their use. Perhaps perception is a basic source of evidence and testimony derivative. But what makes a source of evidence basic? For Bealer, a source of evidence is basic if and only if its deliverances have an appropriate kind of modal tie to the truth (1998: 218). His view is that a source has the appropriate modal tie if and only if, necessarily, its deliverances would be true for the most part, that is, would be reliable, when that source is employed by someone in cognitive conditions of suitable high quality (for short, in ideal conditions) (1998: 219). In short, the appropriate modal tie to the truth is the source’s being necessarily reliable when the person using it is in ideal cognitive circumstances. This account of a basic source of evidence explains why guessing is not a basic source of evidence for a person who happens to be a reliable guesser: guessing in that special world would be reliable but not in all other possible worlds. But is rational intuition a basic source of evidence on this account?

Bealer argues that rational intuitions depend on concept possession and if one fully understands a concept, they will be necessarily reliable in ideal cognitive conditions in applying that concept. A person can misunderstand a concept such as arthritis and apply it to pains in the thigh, or incompletely understand it by not knowing whether it applies to a certain case or not. For example, someone might not understand the concept of a contract well enough to know whether it applies to any oral agreements (1998: 221). But full understanding of concepts is incompatible with any misunderstanding or incomplete understanding.

Bealer says, “Our intuitions are what seem to be so concerning the applicability of concepts to cases presented to pure thought” (1998: 231). And what seems to be so is modal, something’s being possible or necessary. For instance, if a person who fully understands the concept knowledge is presented a Gettier case, the relevant intuition for Bealer will be that it seems possible for the person in the Gettier scenario to have a justified true belief but lack knowledge. If a person who fully understands “spatial part” is asked whether it’s true that if x is a part of y, and y a part of z, then x is a part of z, the relevant intuition for Bealer will be that it seems necessarily true.

Bealer further maintains that we are not now in the relevant ideal conditions. However, he does say that,

if we limit ourselves to suitably elementary propositions, then relative to them we approximate ideal cognitive conditions,

and that

the deliverances of our basic sources would provide in an approximate way the kind of pathway to the truth they would have generally in ideal conditions. (1998: 219)

He is saying that even in our current non-ideal cognitive condition the deliverances of our basic sources, which include rational intuitions, can be somewhat reliable even if not as reliable as they would be in ideal conditions. He also thinks that for many of us the class of elementary propositions “would not be inconsiderable” (1998: 219). Bealer is probably thinking of the many readily accessible conceptual connections such as those in 1a–15a given near the beginning of this entry.

Casullo recommends a different approach to defending rationalism. He thinks rationalists should start from common ground and that they should “enlist empirical support for the existence of a priori knowledge” (2012a: 248–249). This may be because he thinks that nonexperiential mental states are the basis of a priori justification and “nonexperiential mental state” is a natural kind term. This seems plausible because Casullo thinks that “experience” is a natural kind term (see, below, sec. 6.4). He may think that the reference of all natural kind terms must be discovered empirically and so think that what he takes as the basis of a priori justification must be discovered empirically. Suppose the nonexperiential mental states that Casullo thinks are the bases of a priori justification are what other philosophers call “intuitions”. If a priori knowledge rests partly on a priori justification, and that rests on “intuitions”, that could explain why Casullo recommends empirical inquiry as a means to discover what intuitions are like as a first step in explaining how they can provide a priori justification.

Bealer seems to disagree with Casullo about the nature of intuitions. He has written that empirical investigation into people’s “intuitions” is irrelevant because they do not investigate intuitions in the relevant sense, that is, intuitions understood as responses to fully understanding propositions (1998: 202). Casullo seems to understand intuitions differently, as a certain kind of mental state whose nature must be discovered empirically. Insofar as a defense of rationalism involves a defense of the epistemic role of intuitions, it is not surprising that Bealer and Casullo suggest different ways of defending rationalism given that they have different views about the nature of intuitions.

6. Should we doubt the evidential force of intellectual intuitions?

6.1 What exactly is an intellectual seeming or rational intuition?

We have seen that Bealer thinks that a rational intuition is a modal seeming: either a seeming to be true and necessarily true, or a seeming to be possible. In other places Russell (2017: 232) defines an a priori intuition as the psychological state people are in when some proposition seems true to them solely on the basis of their understanding that proposition. This definition of an a priori intuition allows us to distinguish between what Bealer called a physical intuition that a house undermined will fall, because it does not seem true to us solely on the basis of understanding what it says, and the intuition that if P, then not not P, or that if someone knows P, then she believes P and P is true. Unlike on Bealer’s account of rational intuitions, this account of intuition does not require that the propositions that are the objects of intuitions be modal. It provides a way of distinguishing a priori justifiable necessary propositions such as Necessarily, all bachelors are unmarried males from empirically justifiable necessary propositions such as Necessarily, water is H2O since an intuition that the former proposition is true can be based solely on a person’s understanding it but an intuition that the latter is true must be based partly on understanding how things are in the external world. This account of intuition also allows that what are called synthetic a priori proposition (like 10a–14a) can be the objects of a priori intuitions since they can seem true to a person solely on the basis of her understanding them.

Several philosophers appeal to the understanding in their accounts of a priori justification: Bealer in all his many essays; BonJour 1998; Jackson 2000; Peacocke 2000; Sosa 2013; Boghossian 2020b. But the view also has its critics. Though Paul Boghossian thinks that some a priori justification stems from that source, he thinks that a priori intuitions about substantive normative propositions can provide justification but they do not rest on our understanding those propositions (2020b). Consider the proposition that It is always wrong to torture children just for the fun of it. His argument is that if such intuitions were based on understanding the concept “wrong”, then it would not make sense to ask whether that sort of act merits disapproval or should be punished, assuming for the sake of argument that the correct account of the non-substantive meaning of “wrong” is in terms of what merits disapproval or should be punished. But he thinks that this question always makes sense. So it follows that a priori normative intuitions of this sort are not based on understanding the relevant normative concepts. Boghossian seems to think that this argument generalizes to apply to all a priori intuitions whose objects are synthetic propositions, not just to intuitions about substantive normative propositions.

A possible response to Boghossian is that full or deep understanding of normative concepts like “wrong” requires understanding that certain paradigm cases are wrong, though a more superficial understanding which can be captured by non-substantive account of wrong does not. An analogy with causation might help. A superficial understanding of why opium causes sleep is that it has dormative powers. But a deeper, more detailed understanding would involve understanding how the chemicals in opium affect the neurons in the brain and how those in turn cause sleep. Problems will remain with the “lack of deep understanding” reply to Boghossian’s argument: how does one explain the fact that professional moral philosophers sometimes have different intuitions about substantive claims about what is wrong? One would expect them to have equally deep understanding of the relevant normative concepts and so to have the same a priori intuitions on the understanding-based account of intuitions that Boghossian argues against. But sometimes they do not, as Boghossian notes (2020b). At the same time, he offers an explanation of why the intuitions of philosophers diverge: the theories they hold can affect the intuitions they have.

6.2 Experimental philosophy

A new branch of philosophy called experimental philosophy (X-phi for short) has studied the intuitive judgments of people (often students) when presented with well-known examples in epistemology and ethics. They ask these people (often from different ethnic, cultural, economic, and educational backgrounds) whether someone in a hypothetical scenario knows, or only believes, that some proposition is true, say, in Sheep whether the person knows, or only believes, that there are sheep in the field. In ethics they may present the subjects with a case and ask them if it is wrong, or not wrong, to do what is described. In a case often called Transplant, five innocent people are desperately in need of certain vital organs, and the only way to save them is to cut up some innocent person and distribute his organs to the five (transplant surgery has been perfected and our potential donor is a perfect match to all five). Experimental philosophers will ask their subjects whether it is wrong, or not wrong, to cut up the one to save the five, and then record their intuitive judgments. In another case often called Trolley, a runaway trolley is on track A and headed for five innocent people who are trapped on that track. All person S can do to keep the trolley from running over the five is to turn the trolley down track B where one innocent person is trapped. If S does nothing, five will die; if he throws the switch via a remote device, the one on track B will be killed. Or what if someone pushed a heavy person in front of the trolley to stop it from running over the five? Experimental philosophers ask whether it would be wrong, or not wrong, for S to throw the switch or push the man. They record the data, which they take to be intuitive judgments on the cases, and note differences in the responses, say, between different ethnic or economic groups.

Some of the initial studies that seemed to show that there are differences along ethnic, cultural, and economic lines in response to examples have not been replicated (see Turri 2018; Wykstra 2018 for an overview of the work in X-Phi.). Other studies have been criticized because of their experimental design. Apart from these experimental flaws, claims about disagreements in intuition have been criticized as epistemically irrelevant because the so-called “intuitions” of subjects are not what philosophers have in mind when they refer to a priori or rational intuitions (Bealer 1998: 202, 213). If what philosophers mean by “intuitions” requires that they stem from full understanding of concepts in ideal cognitive circumstances, then the “intuitions” that experimental subjects have do not qualify, for they lack full understanding and the cognitive circumstances they are in probably do not qualify as ideal.

One might think that from an epistemic standpoint, the “intuitions” that philosophers have when considering “suitably elementary propositions” are what should be studied because, as Bealer said, “if we limit ourselves to suitably elementary propositions, then relative to them we approximate ideal cognitive conditions”, and philosophers come nearer to having a full understanding of the relevant concepts. Studies of that sort are being done (see Schwitzgebel & Cushman 2012, 2015). Some results suggest that philosophers’ intuitions, like those of non-philosophers, are affected by how an example is described (called “framing effects”) and by the order in which the examples are presented (“ordering effects”). This suggests that the intuitions of philosophers are no more reliable than those of non-philosophers. But perhaps the experimental situation is not ideal and that ideal conditions are the ordinary settings in which philosophers do their work. (See, Kahneman’s description (2011: 234–235) of the approach taken by Gary Klein and his followers who criticize artificial experiments and recommend studying “real people doing things that matter” (Kahneman 2011: 235).

6.3 Can intuitions be checked for accuracy?

A different sort of objection to intuitions as a source of a priori evidence assumes that a source of justification must be capable of being calibrated to determine whether it is accurate (Cummins 1998: 116–118). What we see through a telescope justifies us in believing that the moon has mountains because we have done things like looking through telescopes at distant mountains on earth and then gone to them and discovered that the telescopes presented an accurate picture of the mountains. But what, the objection goes, can intuitions be checked against? Other intuitions? But that is like checking a crystal ball against itself.

BonJour has argued that many errors involving apparent rational insights (intuitions) can be corrected internally by further reflection, or by appealing to coherence (BonJour 1998: 116–119). Others have replied that neither perception nor memory (Goldman 2007: 5) can be checked either, except against themselves, but that does not prevent these sources from providing justification in certain circumstances.

In reply to this sort of response, critics of intuition-based views of a priori justification have said that at least different types of perception can be checked against each other, say, vision against touch (Weatherson 2003: 4). The critics of intuition add that while we can distinguish circumstances where, say, vision is unreliable from circumstance where it is not, nothing similar can be done when it is a matter of intuitions. For instance, we can distinguish conditions where the lighting conditions, or the person’s eyesight, are bad from ones where they are not. We can know whether we are in a desert where optical illusions occur and whether we are not. At least sometimes we can tell whether we are hallucinating or not.

First, the thought that a potential source of justification must be capable of being calibrated if it is to provide justification seems false. The people inside Plato’s cave who can only see shadows cast on the wall in front of them can be justified in believing that those shadows have a certain shape based on what they see and the reports of others. A priori intuitions involve a kind of intellectual “seeing”, and they can be checked against other people’s reports of their intuitions. That one type of perception can be checked against another (say, sight against touch) does not seem to count for much epistemically. Perhaps a ouija board can be checked against a crystal ball, but without some further explanation, neither agreement, nor disagreement, between them would have significant epistemic implications. Perhaps intellectual or rational intuitions produced under certain circumstances should be discounted, viz., those produced by people who are angry, depressed, drunk, tired, etc., or who are not impartial, have something at stake in the outcome, or have not reflected carefully on the relevant concept. But that does not mean that all of them should be discounted. Calibration may not be necessary for justification. And in some circumstances it seems insufficient, as when there is good reason to think that agreement is accidental or the result of causes irrelevant from an epistemic standpoint.

6.4 Naturalized epistemology

There are other objections to the reliance on intuitions in philosophy that do not call into question their reliability. They call into question their relevance. Casullo (2003) proposes to treat “experience” as a natural kind term, and Hilary Kornblith and Philip Kitcher propose to treat epistemic terms such as “knowledge” and “justification” in that way too. Kornblith thinks that intuitions can help direct us to the appropriate objects, or phenomena, of investigation but not much more. For instance, we have an intuition that knowledge is not a type of furniture so we should not start our empirical investigation into the essential nature of knowledge by looking at furniture (Kornblith 1998, 2005, 2006). If we think of normative terms such as “wrong” as natural kind terms, and so as analogous to a natural kind term like “water”, there would be some reference-fixing description associated with “wrong” as there is for “water”. For “water” that description is something like: the stuff, whatever it is, that in the actual world has the properties of quenching thirst, putting out certain fires, falling from the clouds as rain, filling the lakes and rivers, etc., on the planet on which we live. Empirical investigation is then needed to discover what this reference-fixing description in fact refers to. On Kornblith’s view, there is little room for rational intuitions to play in discovering the essential nature of knowledge or normative kinds. They do not play a role in determining the content of any relevant reference-fixing description and, at most, tell us where not to look to find what does fulfill a given description.

It would be a mistake to take “cube” to be a natural kind term understood through some reference-fixing description such as: a three-dimensional solid that looks such-and-such a way when looked at from various angles and that feels so-and-so when turned around in your hands; is able to fit snugly through square holes cut out of a board, etc. “Cube” is not a natural kind term and we understand what a cube is through understanding its definition, namely, a three-dimensional solid with six faces all of which are squares.

Rational intuitions seem relevant to testing proposed definitions of “cube”, but not proposed reference-fixing descriptions of “water”. If someone thought that the correct definition of “cube” is: a three-dimensional solid with six faces all of which are parallelograms with equal sides, we could show it is not a correct definition of “cube” by imagining a “squished” cube that satisfies that definition but, intuitively, is not a cube. None of the properties mentioned in the reference-fixing description for water are either necessary, or taken singly or together, sufficient conditions of a liquid’s being water. So it does not seem that rational intuitions could play much of a role in determining what the essential nature of knowledge is if “knowledge” were a natural kind term whose reference is fixed by some description. People would have to empirically discover the nature of knowledge with the aid of its reference-fixing description, just as they had to empirically discover the nature of water. The same thing would seem to apply to normative terms like “right” or “what there is most reason to do (or believe)” if they were natural kind terms.

On the basis of thinking about these examples involving “water” and “cube”, a person might think that whether rational intuitions have a small or a large role in discovering the essential nature of normative concepts, and other concepts of interest to philosophers, depends on whether those concepts are like the concept of water or instead like that of cube. But Peter Railton’s view that normative terms are natural kind terms allows for a large role for rational intuitions in determining their reference-fixing descriptions.

Railton calls a reference-fixing description a “job description”. He is interested in normative concepts like right and what there is most reason to do, and describes in general terms what a job description might include. Railton says that there may not be much to say about “the concept of a reason full stop”. Perhaps all we can say in that regard is that a reason is a consideration that counts in favor of something: an action, a desire, an emotion, a belief, etc. But Railton thinks that the concept most reason to do has

a distinctive, all-important role in your conceptual scheme—it expresses “stops the buck” in deliberating and deciding what we ought to do, what ultimately matters.

He goes on to add that the relevant “job description” includes reference to paradigm cases. For example, it is assumed that agony gives everyone some reason to avoid performing actions that produce it, that vengeance is not itself a reason to do something, and that acrophobia sometimes is not a sufficient reason to avoid doing something that will save your life (Railton 2017a: 51).

In another essay on Parfit’s On What Matters, Vol III, Railton says that the job description of rightness is

necessarily connected to the guidance of deliberation,…,has analytic connections to ought claims about action and motivation,…,has certain paradigm cases, etc.

He thinks that the job description of minimizing suffering is completely different (Railton 2017b: 118–119). Nevertheless, Railton thinks that the two concepts might refer to the same thing in the way that water and H2O refer to the same thing despite being different concepts. That will be true if the acts that have the naturalistic property of minimizing suffering uniquely (or best) fulfill the job description associated with the normative concept rightness.

Rational intuitions might play a role in Railton’s view that normative terms are natural kind terms by supplying the paradigm cases that are elements of the job descriptions associated with normative concepts. He says that it is “inconceivable” that there not be reason to stop prolonged agony that is being inflicted on someone just for amusement (2017a: 56). On Railton’s view, to determine what the natures of right, reason, most reason, etc., are you need to consider more than just what rational intuitions might reveal. They can help determine what paradigm cases should be included in the relevant “job description”, but that description includes more than just paradigm cases. On Railton’s view, insofar as “old style” analytic philosophy only considered the data supplied by rational intuitions, it mistakenly left important data aside. This is true of attempts to analyze normative concepts but also true of attempts to analyze other concepts that have been of interest to philosophers, for example, knowledge, causality, personal identity, justice, being morally responsible, acting freely, etc.

Railton’s view is that normative concepts are hybrid concepts, somewhat like the concept of ruby as a red gemstone with such-and-such chemical structure (see example 15) or of an ice cube. “Ice” is a natural kind term, or at least its definition as “frozen water” is partly given by the natural kind term, “water”. But, as we have seen, “cube” is not a natural kind terms. So “ice cube” is partly a natural kind term and partly not.

6.5 Pragmatism

Another approach that discounts the role of intuitions in philosophy, especially in epistemology, is pragmatic. The idea is to first determine what epistemic goals we want principles to serve, and then to discover empirically which epistemic principles, if adhered to, will best serve those goals (Weinberg 2006). For instance, your goal might be to have lots of true beliefs or, alternatively, to have few false ones. Or your goal might be to have beliefs that make you happy. Probably the best set of rules to follow to obtain lots of true beliefs will be different from, and more lenient than, the best set of rules to follow to avoid having false beliefs. Probably those sets of rules will be different from the set of rules you should adopt if you are interested in having beliefs that make you happy. It’s reasonable to think that intuitions will have to be appealed to in determining what makes a goal an epistemic goal rather than some other sort of goal, and what precisely that epistemic goal is. Lehrer (1986: 6–7) holds that the epistemic goal is not to maximize true beliefs or minimize false ones. For him, it is the following: for any proposition, P, that a person is considering, believe P if and only if it is true. Intuition must be relied on to determine what the epistemic goal is. Intuitively, Pascal’s Wager is about whether belief in God pays, not about whether there is good evidence to believe that God exists or does not exist. The goal of the argument is not epistemic but pragmatic in a narrow sense, namely, to believe what will make your life, including your afterlife, go best for you. Intuitively, the goal of having beliefs that will make your life go well is not an epistemic goal. Epistemic goals have to do with truth, fitting your beliefs to the evidence, having evidentially justified beliefs, etc.

The pragmatic approach that sketched here seems doomed at the outset: it cannot avoid appealing to intuitions in order to determine what the correct epistemic goal is. And if it is appropriate to appeal to intuitions to determine the correct epistemic goal, why not also other epistemic intuitions to determine what knowledge, justification, etc., are?

7. Even if intuitions can justify, can they yield knowledge of the external world?

Suppose, for the sake of argument, we grant that intuitions properly understood and had under ideal conditions by people with a deep understanding of the relevant concepts can justify certain propositions. But can they yield knowledge about the external world? Carrie Jenkins has argued that they can insofar as the concepts that play a role in a priori justification have been shaped by experience. She thinks that for knowledge (not justification) our concepts must be grounded. By this she means that they must accurately and non-accidentally represent the world. So the concept table can be grounded for a person in a world where there are tables but not for a brain-in-a-vat (BIV) (Jenkins 2008a: 128–29). For a concept to be justified for Jenkins is for it to be “respectable” for us to rely on it (by which, I believe, she means that we would be epistemically blameless in relying on it) as “a relevantly accurate guide to the world” (Jenkins 2008a: 129). So a BIV can have a justified, though not a grounded concept, about things existing in the external world.

Jenkins thinks that our concepts are grounded. Her argument for thinking this is that our basic concepts are useful, and in that respect they are sort of like maps. If they did not fit the world (weren’t grounded) even though they are founded on sensory input, their usefulness would be a miracle. They would be like a map that fits the world that was based on a dream. Since we should not believe in miracles, those concepts must fit the world. The best explanation of the usefulness of our concepts is that they accurately represent features of the world that produce our sensory inputs that allow us to navigate successfully in the world. She thinks that this No-Miracles Argument shows that it is reasonable to think that our concepts (or groups of concepts) mirror the world’s structure (Jenkins 2008a: 139). If we have justified concepts, ones we have reason to think fit the world, we can examine them to see what they involve and then have a priori justification for believing that certain propositions that involve them are true of the world. So, on her view, we (but not BIVs) could know a priori, merely on the basis of examining our concepts, that all vixens are female and that there are (or at least were) vixens, and that all bachelors are unmarried and that there are (or at least were) bachelors. If we have grounded concepts, we (but not BIVs) can have a priori knowledge that all of these propositions are true. Yet gaining this sort of knowledge about our external environment a priori seems impossible.

Further, it is not obvious that all a priori knowledge rests on grounded concepts. Normative or mathematical concepts might map the normative and mathematical domains but not the external world. We can know a priori that it is wrong to torture children just for the fun of it and that two is the only even prime regardless of what the external world is like. Perhaps we can also know a priori that some general normative principles are true, such as the principle of inference to the best explanation (IBE). Roughly, this principle says that we are justified in believing some hypothesis if it is the best explanation of what we observe. For instance, it says that we are justified in believing that someone recently walked along the beach because that best explains our observation of footprints in the sand. But we could not be justified in accepting IBE because it is useful and the best explanation of its usefulness is that it fits the way the world is. That would be a circular argument for accepting IBE. Lastly, it seems possible for even a BIV to know certain conditional propositions, for instance, to know that that IF something is a vixen, it is a female fox and IF someone is bachelor, he is an unmarried male.

Jenkins allows that some concepts can be grounded, even if they are not directly grounded, provided they are constituted by grounded concepts, but it is hard to see how the concepts spiritual and immaterial could be so constituted. Still, it seems that we can know a priori that if there are angels, there are spiritual beings and if there are immaterial beings, they do not occupy space.

It is one thing to hold that a priori knowledge requires enabling empirical experience to acquire the concepts that are the basis of that sort of knowledge, and quite another thing to hold that those concepts must be grounded in such experience. The latter rules out some seemingly obvious kinds of a priori knowledge (viz., some mathematical and normative knowledge, and knowledge of certain conditional propositions which seem merely to be about the relationship of concepts), and so seems too strong. It also seems to allow in a priori knowledge of the existence of, say, foxes and bachelors, and so seems too weak.

8. What is a priori knowledge?

It is widely, though not universally, held that knowledge is partly analyzable in terms of justified true belief. But, as we’ve seen, Gettier examples show that having a justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge. We need some anti-luck condition in addition to JTB to rule out cases where there is a JTB but not knowledge because, in some sense, the person in the Gettier situation is lucky to have a true belief given the way his evidence is related to the truth of his belief.

The Lottery Paradox suggests that even more than JTB and an anti-luck condition are required for knowledge. The chances that you hold the winning ticket in a one million ticket lottery is one in a million, and that you hold a losing ticket, 999,999 in a million. Suppose you know what the probability of your holding a losing ticket is and that you in fact have a losing ticket. Then you seem to have a justified belief that your ticket is a loser (because you know that’s very likely true), and it is true that it is a loser. Assume, also, that you are not in a Gettier situation. Still, you do not seem to know that your ticket is a losing one. It seems that you need further confirmation from a trustworthy source to know your ticket has lost.

If knowledge in general is justified true belief plus some condition to handle Gettier cases and another to handle the Lottery Paradox, then on the account of knowledge that requires you to have a justified true belief, a priori knowledge will be a priori justified true belief plus some conditions to deal with Gettier and Lottery Paradox cases. Specific versions of this view of a priori knowledge will depend on specific versions of a priori justification.

But there are rival accounts of knowledge that reject the view that knowledge is partly analyzable in terms of justification. One such view is called knowledge reliabilism; the other, the “knowledge first” view. Knowledge reliabilism is the view that a person knows P if and only if she has a reliably produced true belief, and a priori knowledge reliabilism would say a similar thing about a priori knowledge. Perhaps just having reliable intuitions would be enough to have a priori knowledge regardless of whether they provided justification or not.

There are well-known examples that count against the idea that reliably produced true belief is sufficient for knowledge. Let Truenorth be a person who has true beliefs about what direction is north, south, etc., even when blindfolded. He has a kind of internal compass like the ones found in migratory birds. But assume that Truenorth has no reason to think that his beliefs about compass directions are accurate; he has never received confirmation of their accuracy, neither from the testimony of others nor by checking things out himself. Nevertheless, he is confident that his beliefs about what direction is north, etc., are correct. Assume, also, that he has no reason to think that others in his society have, nor that they lack, his directional ability. In general, assume that there are no undefeated defeaters of Truenorth’s beliefs about what direction is north, etc. Intuitively, it seems that if he believes that some direction he points to is north, he is not justified in believing, nor does he know, that it is north, even if what he believes regarding compass directions is always true.

If this is a problem for reliabilists about empirical knowledge, it may also be a problem for reliabilists when it comes to a priori knowledge. Mere reliability does not seem sufficient for knowledge. What seems missing in the case of Truenorth is any reason for him to think that his beliefs about compass directions are reliable. Perhaps what is missing on reliabilist accounts of a priori knowledge is similar, namely, that the subject lacks any reason to think that her a priori intuitions are reliable even if they are.

Brian Weatherson offers an example involving a person he calls “Tamati”, a young mathematician who has a sudden strong conviction that there is no largest prime upon noticing that as primes get larger the gap between them also gets larger (2019: 125–26). Tamati believes that there is no largest prime on the basis of his strong conviction, and Weatherson explains how Tamati’s strong convictions about mathematical propositions are reliable. But, intuitively, Tamati is not justified in believing, nor does he know, that there is no largest prime without a proof that it’s true. So reliability is not sufficient for justification or knowledge even in the realm of the a priori.

Views that see knowledge as resting on justification, whether empirical or a priori, might be said to make justification first. A “knowledge first” view sees justification as derivative at best. It equates one’s total evidence with one’s total knowledge (Williamson 2014: 8; see, also, 4). If justification is a function of evidence, knowledge implies justification, but according to Williamson justification is not part of what knowledge is. He holds that knowledge is not analyzable even partly in terms of justification.

There seem to be clear counterexamples to the knowledge first view. Suppose you are driving out in the country and first pass by one of many fields where sheep are grazing, and then a little later pass by the field with the poodles that look just like sheep. In the first cases, you knew there were sheep in the field, but in the last case you did not. Still, weren’t you just as justified, didn’t you have the same sort of evidence, in the last case as in the first ones? No, says Williamson, a defender of the knowledge first view. You are just as epistemically blameless in the last case as in the earlier ones because, for all you know, you are looking at real sheep. You have a legitimate excuse for believing that you are looking at sheep, but you don’t have evidence, nor are you justified in believing, that you are looking at sheep when you are looking at poodles (Williamson 2014: 4–5).

Williamson’s criticism of any justified true belief account of knowledge would rest on the fact that no one has yet been able to solve the Gettier problem (2014: 1–2), nor give a good account of what it is for beliefs to be justified because they fit the evidence. According to him, the attempt to analyze knowledge is in a shambles, and the knowledge first approach promises to shed light on the nature of indiscriminability, norms of assertion, and epistemic logic (2014: 6–7). So it promises to be fruitful while the old approach of analyzing knowledge has left behind a path strewn with failures. This, says Williamson, is a good reason to change horses. But Williamson’s view seems to have its own liabilities. On the knowledge-first approach that he develops, you don’t have any evidence that there are sheep in the field when you are looking at the poodles, and human footprints in the sand are not evidence that someone recently walked there if they were made by a monkey wearing rubber feet. The new horse bucks.


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Other Internet Resources


I am indebted to my colleagues, Eric Hiddleston and Michael McKinsey, for their comments on my 2007 entry, and to my friends, Mylan Engel and Matthias Steup, for their extensive comments on the 2014 entry. I am also indebted to an anonymous referee who made many comments, suggestions, and corrections on an earlier draft of the 2014 entry and two referees for this entry who did the same. The input from all these people has improved this, and the previous entries, considerably.

Copyright © 2020 by
Bruce Russell <Bruce.Russell@wayne.edu>

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