First published Tue Apr 15, 2014; substantive revision Fri Aug 17, 2018

Blame is a reaction to something of negative normative significance about someone or their behavior. A paradigm case, perhaps, would be when one person wrongs another, and the latter responds with resentment and a verbal rebuke, but of course we also blame others for their attitudes and characters (see, e.g., Smith 2005). Thus blaming scenarios typically involve a wide range of inward and outward responses to a wrongful or bad action, attitude, or character (such responses include: beliefs, desires, expectations, emotions, sanctions, and so on). In theorizing about blame, then, philosophers have typically asked two questions:

  • Which precise reactions and interactions constitute blame?
  • Under what conditions is it appropriate to respond in these ways?

Many theorists approach these questions with a larger theoretical agenda in mind: for example, in an effort to understand the conditions of moral responsibility more generally and the nature of freedom (e.g., Wallace 1994), or in an effort to articulate the content of moral properties (e.g., Gibbard 1990). But the questions are interesting in their own right, especially since blame is such a common feature of moral experience. This entry will critically discuss the answers that have been offered in response to the above questions concerning blame, with the aim of shedding some light on blame’s nature, ethics, and significance. (A common but by no means universal assumption is that praise is the counterpart of blame; still, it is blame that is often taken to be the more significant phenomenon for moral philosophy.)

1. What is Blame?

To begin, note that almost all philosophical discussions of blame ignore (or mention only to set aside) the form of blame sometimes characterized as causal or explanatory responsibility (Kenner 1967; Hart 1968; Beardsley 1969). It is this notion of blame that is at stake when we say that Hurricane Hugo is to blame for the destruction of Charleston’s harbor, or that the cat is to blame for knocking over the vase. Theorists contrast this sense of “blame” with the sort of interpersonal blame that, for example, one gives up when one forgives. (As Pamela Hieronymi (2001) has pointed out, forgiveness in fact requires not giving up one’s judgment that the other person is explanatorily to blame.) But just what the relation is between causal blame and interpersonal blame is an important question that has not been well-explored. Nevertheless, in this entry the focus will be on the latter form of blame, which is a response to moral agents on the basis of their wrong, bad, or otherwise objectionable actions, attitudes, or characters.

Theories of blame could be organized in a number of different ways, depending on one’s purposes. Consider three of these possible ways. First, we could categorize theories of blame according to the content of blaming attitudes. On this way of dividing up things, the view put forth by Pamela Hieronymi (2004)—which holds that the force of blame is located in judgments of ill will—would be categorized with that of R. Jay Wallace (1994, 2011)—which holds that blame is an emotional response to ill will displayed in others’ actions. Alternatively, we could categorize theories of blame according to those psychological states or dispositions that are thought to constitute blame. This second way of dividing things up emphasizes an important difference between Hieronymi’s and Wallace’s theories: for Hieronymi, blame can be identified primarily with a judgment, but for Wallace, blame is primarily an emotion. A third way might instead focus on objects of blaming attitudes and behaviors. Is blame directed exclusively at actions? Or can it instead be directed at attitudes, including beliefs, as in the case of epistemic blame (see, e.g., Rettler 2018)? Here a theory that emphasizes the significance of emotions might opt for a more circumscribed account, since it’s not clear that indignation or other forms of blaming anger are really apt responses to, say, culpable epistemic failures. By contrast, a theory (like Hieronymi’s or Angela Smith’s (2005)) that has a more minimal conception of blame can more easily account for blame for attitudes.

Of course, any scheme for categorizing theories has its advantages and disadvantages, and by selecting one scheme over the other, one necessarily emphasizes certain aspects of blame while ignoring other aspects of blame that might be equally important. Nevertheless, the taxonomy to follow is consonant with much of the literature in classifying theories according to the activity or mental state that is thought to constitute blame. According to this way of carving things up, we get four categories: cognitive, emotional, conative, and functional accounts of blame.

1.1 Cognitive Theories of Blame

Cognitive theories of blame hold that blame is fundamentally a judgment or evaluation that we make about an agent in light of their actions, attitudes, or character. One of the earliest cognitive theories of blame is due to J. J. C. Smart (1961), who develops his analysis of blame indirectly, since he begins by distinguishing between praise and dispraise (rather than with the more natural distinction between praise and blame). According to Smart, to praise or dispraise an individual is simply to grade them as a member of a particular kind. And as Smart says, this sort of grading is no different than the sort of grading involved in judging one apple to be better than the others at the supermarket. Crucially, Smart notes that though you might dispraise a young philosopher for their poor writing in a letter of recommendation, you are not thereby blaming them for it. Thus for Smart, blame is distinct from dispraise. Unlike dispraise, blame involves more than merely grading someone’s actions or character (morally), since blame carries with it the implication that the person is responsible for their action or character. Blame, then, is a negative evaluative judgment that implies responsibility.

In a similar vein, Gary Watson (1996) has suggested that there is an evaluative form of blame connected with what he calls the “aretaic perspective”. To blame someone in this way is to judge that they have failed with respect to some standard of excellence (areté). It is also to insist that the agent is responsible for their action in the sense that the action is attributable to the agent—it represents their evaluative standpoint, their practical identity, what they “stand for” (Watson 1996). Like Smart, Watson recognizes that it is possible to make such a judgment dispassionately. Thus, on the grading and evaluative theories of blame developed by Smart and Watson, there is nothing about blame that requires a blamer to be emotionally exercised in any way. However, unlike Smart—who identifies blame with a form of grading that implies moral responsibility—Watson does not take aretaic blame to be a general analysis of blame. Rather, for Watson, aretaic blame is just one way among many that we blame others for their actions.

Even though many have resisted thinking of blame as a form of grading, a number of contemporary accounts of blame retain the core idea in Smart’s (and Watson’s) account that blame is a kind of evaluative judgment. But what sort of evaluative judgment will do? Many theorists have identified blame with judgments that essentially implicate how the blamed agent’s moral or practical self was involved in the production of action. This allows cognitive theories to explain the special force of blame. After all, as T.M. Scanlon puts it, “given that most people care about” their moral selves (and others’ opinions about their moral selves), judgments that implicate these aspects of a person are not “mere descriptions” (Scanlon 1986: 170). Michael Zimmerman (1988) and Ishtiyaque Haji (1998) make this point more vividly when they argue that to blame someone is to judge that in virtue of their attitudes, actions, or character, they have a stain on their moral self or a mark against their moral ledger. As Zimmerman puts it, when we blame someone, we judge

that there is a “discredit” or “debit” in his ledger … that his “moral standing” has been “diminished” (Zimmerman 1988: 38).

One need not endorse the idea of an actual moral ledger in order to hold a cognitive theory of blame. Pamela Hieronymi (2004), for example, articulates a cognitive account of blame, where the judgment in question is a judgment that the blamed agent has shown the blamer (or another) ill will. Since we care deeply about other people’s judgments about the quality of our wills, this judgment can also carry the distinctive force of blame.

Despite a number of supporters, there are many who are less sanguine about the prospects of a purely cognitive account of blame. One potential problem for cognitive accounts is that they risk conflating blaming with judging blameworthy (Kenner 1967; Coates and Tognazzini 2012). After all, it seems quite possible to judge, for example, that another has displayed ill will or that they have a mark against their moral ledger (and so, judge that they are blameworthy), without actually blaming that individual. The co-conspirator’s recognition of the wrongness of a partner’s criminal activity might, in fact, underlie admiration for the partner’s skillful execution of a heinous crime that most of us couldn’t stomach. The fact that the same judgment could elicit such different responses (repulsion and resentment in those of us who are committed to the values of morality and admiration in those who are not) suggests that the judgment alone cannot constitute blame. More recently, Hanna Pickard (2013) has argued that since it is possible to knowingly blame others inappropriately (i.e., to blame others even when we know that they are not really blameworthy for their actions), the judgment that another is blameworthy, or that they have shown ill will or disregard, is not necessary for blame. It looks, then, that judgments of the sort discussed above are neither necessary nor sufficient for blame.

A further problem for cognitive accounts is one suggested by Gary Watson (1987). According to Watson, attempts to identify or reduce blame exclusively to its cognitive components (recall that although Watson thinks that aretaic blame takes the form of judgments, it does not exhaust the phenomenon of blaming) make it seem

as though in blaming we were mainly moral clerks, recording moral faults … from a detached and austerely “objective” standpoint (1987 as reprinted in Watson 2004: 226–27).

Here Watson argues that blame issues from the perspective of a participant in human relationships, one in which we are not merely observing the moral order but are actively involved in a moral community. These sorts of considerations form the basis for emotional theories of blame.

1.2 Emotional Theories of Blame

Despite the fact that P. F. Strawson’s “Freedom and Resentment” (1962) contains little sustained discussion of blame as such, many take it to be the contemporary genesis of emotional theories of blame. According to Strawson, our status as morally responsible agents is grounded in the non-detached attitudes and emotions that are (in part) constitutive of ordinary interpersonal relationships. Regarding others as morally responsible agents, for Strawson, is not a matter of judgment but of emotional response. (Note that according to cognitivist theories of the emotions, emotional states are identified with a suite of judgments (Solomon 1993; Nussbaum 2001). Thus, if the cognitivist theory of emotions were correct, there would be no fundamental difference between cognitive and emotional theories of blame. However, cognitivist theories of the emotions are very controversial, and so we will set this important question aside.)

R. Jay Wallace (1994) has developed this idea into an account of “holding responsible” according to which we hold others morally responsible just in case we experience resentment, indignation, or (in the self-regarding case) guilt as a response to their actions, or judge that such a response would be appropriate. Thus, for Wallace, (a specific subset of) Strawson’s “reactive attitudes” are essentially implicated in the stance we take up when we hold others responsible. But though it is possible to take up the stance of “holding responsible” without being emotionally exercised, Wallace stresses (and reiterates this in Wallace 2011) that to actually blame an agent, one must be exercised emotionally.

Of course, Strawson and Wallace are hardly alone in endorsing emotional theories of blame. While these “Strawsonian” accounts of blame focus on the reactive attitudes (particularly resentment, indignation, and guilt), other emotional theories of blame are more inclusive. Susan Wolf (2011), David Shoemaker (2015, 2017), and Leonhard Menges (2017), for example, defend accounts of blame that emphasize anger (in the case of Shoemaker, it’s actually three distinct species of anger). Similarly, Macalester Bell (2013a, 2013b) argues for a “hostile attitudes” account of blame that includes the attitude of contempt as a blaming attitude. Consequently, what holds emotional theories of blame together is not widespread agreement over which emotions constitute blame. Rather, it is a shared commitment to thinking that to blame is to respond to others’ actions with a negative emotion.

Though it’s very plausible that we blame others by responding to their actions with anger, resentment, indignation, or even contempt, there are a number of objections to emotional theories of blame. George Sher (2006) argues that emotional responses are unnecessary for blame. For example, Sher argues that we can blame a loved one without feeling negative emotional reactions. So too, we can blame villains from whom we are temporally distant without any emotional response. The thought here is simply that it is possible to blame Nero for the burning of Rome, even though we do not feel any resentment or indignation towards Nero for his cruelty. In response, defenders of emotional theories might simply argue that despite appearances, without the emotions, one is simply not blaming Nero but instead merely judging blameworthy (see Wallace 1994, 2011). Alternatively, a defender of emotional theories could argue (plausibly, but by no means uncontroversially) that one can be in an emotional state even if one does not experience any felt affect.

A second objection to emotional theories of blame might be called the “force objection”. Pamela Hieronymi develops this objection by noting that

an affective accompaniment of a judgment would be a certain unpleasant emotional disturbance … but, the force of blame seems deeper, more serious or weightier (Hieronymi 2004: 121).

Thus, in Hieronymi’s view, the normative force of blame must be grounded in the cognitive elements of blaming emotions, since it is these elements that are responsive to and reflect our concern for morality. But if the force of blame is grounded in the cognitive elements of the emotion, then why wouldn’t a judgment with the same content constitute an instance of blame? It seems that while emotions might be concomitant with blame, it is the cognitive element—one that can be present even if the blamer is not emotionally exercised—and not the emotion itself that constitutes one’s blame. In response to this sort of objection, Wallace (2011) has argued that the reactive emotions are not superfluous add-ons to the judgment, but instead they serve to change the meaning of the judgment, imbuing the judgment with the sort of expressive significance that is characteristic of blame and that would otherwise be lacking from a mere judgment.

More recently, Miranda Fricker (2016) has argued that our blaming practices evince too much internal diversity to be so neatly identified with the narrow set of attitudes that emotion theorists focus on. Because blame in one context can vary so significantly from blame in another context—self-blame is different than direct second-personal blame, and each of these forms of blame is importantly different than third-party blame—there is very little that is present in all instances of blame. And surely no specific emotional experience will be present in all cases. In response to this, Leonhard Menges (2017) has claimed that there is actually less diversity in our blaming practices than Fricker supposes, and that to the degree there is any diversity in how we blame, it does nothing to undermine the rationale for emotional accounts of blame.

1.3 Conative Theories of Blame

Conative theories of blame emphasize motivational elements, like desires and intentions, as essential to blame. Two of the most developed extant theories of blame—those due to George Sher (2006) and T. M. Scanlon (2008, 2013)—fall in this category. And though we will focus on these two theories, other conative theories are possible.

1.3.1 Dispositions Around a Belief-Desire Pair

As mentioned above, George Sher (2006) is skeptical of emotional theories of blame. However, he is also skeptical about accounts of blame that are merely cognitive. There is more to blame than a mere judgment that an agent has acted wrongly, but one need not be emotionally exercised in order to blame. Sher prefers a happy medium between these two widely accepted alternatives.

According to Sher, what must be added to judgments of wrongness is a backwards-looking desire “that the person in question not have performed his past bad act” (2006: 112). But it’s not enough that the blamer simply wish that the bad action not have happened; the desire must be one that issues from the blamer’s general commitment to morality, since what we really want is that the wrongdoer not have “exercised his own decision-making capacities in a certain way”, and that “he have responded, or that he be disposed to respond, to what we consider a compelling moral reason” (2006: 105). On the resulting view, when the cognitive component of judging blameworthy is accompanied by this desire, which reflects our general commitment to morality, then we are blaming. (See also Arpaly 2006 and Arpaly & Schroeder 2014 for a similar view, according to which blame requires having a conative orientation “against the wrong or bad” (Arpaly & Schroeder 2014: 161).) Moreover, Sher argues that the belief-desire pair in question is itself the basis of those affective and behavioral dispositions that are commonly associated with blame. For example, a blamer’s disposition to feel hostile attitudes like anger towards the agent and to also reprimand, rebuke, and seek apology are to be explained by the presence of the belief-desire pair.

Despite the elegance of Sher’s view, it has generated a number of critical replies. Pamela Hieronymi (2008) objects to the link between the belief-desire pair and attendant affective and behavioral dispositions. To her mind, the link is too weak: though she accepts Sher’s claim that the belief-desire pair is essentially implicated in one’s general commitment to morality, she does not think he has adequately shown that the characteristic dispositions are implicated in the same way. After all, “surely our commitment to morality could be affirmed or clarified in ways that do not involve hostile behavior or reproach” (2008: 25). But if this is correct, then it looks like blame’s characteristic dispositions need not be present, even in those who are genuinely and sincerely committed to moral norms. As a result, Hieronymi concludes that Sher has failed to show that blame—which must involve such dispositions—is essentially tied to a more general commitment to morality.

A second objection to Sher’s view is due to Angela Smith (2008). Smith rejects Sher’s claim that a desire component is part of what constitutes an attitude as blame. To defend this, she invites us to consider an ordinary case of blame, say the blame we feel for a politician who leads us into a disastrous war. While we no doubt desire that the politician hadn’t led us into the war because we are generally committed to morality (and we therefore don’t enjoy the suffering of innocents), it is not clear how this desire is itself part of our blame. By Smith’s lights, the desire component of the belief-desire pair, like the attendant affective and behavioral dispositions, seems to be something that is above and beyond blame itself. In more recent work, Smith has also argued that in some cases, say in “the reactions of a mother whose son is blameworthy for [a] crime” (Smith 2013: 35), the relevant belief-desire pair might be present without blame. Other challenges to Sher’s theory include the worry that it is too “sanitized” because it compromises psychological realism by “stripping away [blame’s] unsavory features” (McGeer 2013: 166).

1.3.2 Attitude Adjustment in Response to Impairment

T. M. Scanlon (2008) has developed an influential account of blame that represents something of a shift from his earlier, more cognitive, account (see Scanlon 1986). In developing this new account, Scanlon’s initial motivation is similar to that of Sher, since Scanlon thinks that an adequate account of blame must fit somewhere between a mere judgment that another has acted in some objectionable way and a sanction (of which expressed reactive emotions are but one paradigm case). But unlike Sher, Scanlon does not think that we can avoid these (putatively) unattractive alternatives simply by supplementing the belief that another has acted wrongly or badly with a desire that they did not so act. Indeed, for Scanlon, the belief that another has acted wrongly is not part of blame at all. Instead, the cognitive component of blame is provided by a judgment that another has acted in a way that impairs meaningful interpersonal relations; this is a judgment of blameworthiness. (For Scanlon, blame is a response to the meaning of someone’s actions, rather than the permissibility of those actions. For more on this distinction, see the first three chapters of Scanlon 2008.) But this judgment itself is insufficient for blame (for reasons similar to those that Sher gives), so in addition to judging that the agent is blameworthy, blame requires you “to take your relationship with him or her to be modified in a way that [a judgment of blameworthiness] holds to be appropriate” (Scanlon 2008: 128–29). In other words, blaming someone involves not just the belief that they have acted in a way that impairs your relationship with them, but also, that you take yourself to have reasons to revise your intentions and attitudes towards them, and accordingly that you revise these intentions and attitudes on the basis of such reasons.

Like Sher, then, Scanlon has provided an initially plausible account of what it is to blame. But also like Sher, his account has been widely criticized. The most common line of criticism is best summed up by R. Jay Wallace’s (2011) slogan that Scanlon’s account “leaves the blame out of blame”. More precisely, Wallace argues that

blame has a quality of opprobrium that is not captured by the considerations about the normative significance of impaired relationships that are at the center of Scanlon’s approach (Wallace 2011: 349; see also Mason 2011).

Susan Wolf (2011) has also argued that in some cases, such as the case of a hot-headed but ultimately loving family, it seems that you can blame another without taking yourself to have impairments in your relationship or attendant reasons to revise your intentions or attitudes towards that person. The characteristic features of Scanlon’s interpretation of blame, then, seem to be unnecessary. More recently, Sher (2013) has argued that Scanlon’s emphasis on relationships is problematic. After all, many cases of wrongdoing involve strangers—e.g., in most car thefts, the victim does not know the criminal. Nevertheless, it still seems that it is possible to blame those with whom we have no standing relationship. So blame cannot essentially implicate interpersonal relationships. Scanlon, in response (2008, 2013), insists that all rational agents stand in the “moral relationship” to one another. However, whether this kind of relationship is sufficient to explain the blame of strangers is unclear. And indeed, as Sher points out, even if there is some relationship between a victim and the stranger who victimizes them, it’s not clear that this relationship plays any role at all in grounding the blame.

1.4 Functional Theories of Blame

Functional accounts of blame are analogous to functionalist theories of mental states or properties. Instead of identifying blame with any particular attitude (like a judgment or emotion) or combination of attitudes (like a belief-desire pair), functional accounts of blame identify blame by its functional role. This way of proceeding leaves open the particular attitude or combination of attitudes that constitute blame. In this way, functional accounts can be more flexible.

According to one functional account of blame, the function of blame is protest. In other words, what we’re doing when we blame others is protesting their actions or character. But this, of course, means that any number of attitudes or combination of attitudes could be present in blame. Pamela Hieronymi (2001), Matthew Talbert (2012), and Victoria McGeer (2013) argue that reactive attitudes like resentment (and the expressions of these attitudes) serve as powerful forms of protest. Angela Smith (2013), on the other hand, argues that when we modify our attitudes and intentions as Scanlon envisions, but do so as a form of protest, then we are actually blaming. In other words, for Smith, it’s not enough that we modify our attitudes and intentions; the modification in question must serve a particular function, namely that of protest, to count as an instance of blame. And in order to count as a protest, it need not involve any particular emotional state. (See Franklin (2013) and Houston (1992) for more on the way in which blame allows us to stand up for our values.)

There are at least two sources of concern for those theories that take protest to be the function of blame. First, it’s not clear that protest is independent of blame, such that one could specify what it is to protest without appealing to blaming attitudes. But if this is so, it’s not clear that appealing to the notion of protest will help us clarify the nature of blame. Second, protest seems paradigmatically expressed. Indeed, it’s hard to make sense of unexpressed protest. Do workers protest unfair labor conditions simply through their beliefs or attitudes? Or must they make such beliefs and attitudes known? And if it is the latter, then it’s not clear that protest could be the function of blame. After all, not all blame is expressed. These objections are not decisive, of course, but they do suggest that there is more work to be done in defense of protest views to help us better understand what the nature of protest is, such that appeals to protest can provide a non-circular account of blame.

Of course, there might be other functions of blame: to express or communicate condemnation or disapproval, for example. Michael McKenna (2012, 2013) has argued for such an account. In fact, he has claimed that blame is conversational, and thus functions to continue a conversation started by the blamee’s wrongful action. In particular, McKenna claims that the reactive attitudes and their expressions serve this function. Antony Duff has proposed a similar understanding of the aim of blame, according to which it is

an attempt to communicate to the wrong-doer a moral understanding of his wrong-doing; to bring him to recognize his guilt and repent what he has done (Duff 1986: 70).

Along these lines Coleen Macnamara (2011, 2015) has also argued that our practices of holding others morally responsible more generally (a set of practices that includes blame) are communicative in their function. In a similar vein, Christopher Bennett (2013) claims that blame functions symbolically to express our disapproval. Like Smith, he develops this account by supplementing Scanlon’s theory of blame, but it seems that one could adapt Bennett’s expressive apparatus even outside of a Scanlonian framework, since the distinctive aspect of it is that it expresses something important about our stance towards the blamee’s actions. Most recently, Miranda Fricker (2016) claims that communicative blame, which identifies and communicates faults, is the paradigmatic case of blame.

Because of their relative newness to the scene, there is not much criticism of these views. However, one potential problem with these views is that many (perhaps most) instances of blame are not expressed or communicated. In what sense are those instances of blame communicative? And if they are not, how can blame be essentially communicative in its nature? Gary Watson suggests that resentment is “incipiently communicative” and says that “in some elusive sense, resentment is ‘meant to be expressed’” (Watson 2011: 328). (That sense remains elusive, but see McKenna (2012) and Macnamara (2015) for more discussion.)

2. When is Blame Appropriate?

Blame is easily abused and misused, so a complete understanding of the phenomenon will require looking not just at what blame is but also when it’s appropriate. (We use ‘appropriate’ as a broad normative term to cover all sorts of evaluations, such as whether any particular instance of blame is fitting, warranted, permissible, required, effective, and so on.) As Miranda Fricker puts it: “Like most things in life, our practice of blame is susceptible to the vices of being done from the wrong sort of motive, in the wrong degree, in the wrong way, or with the wrong sort of object” (Fricker 2016: 168). This list provides a nice initial taxonomy of ways that blame can go awry: an ethics of blame will need to take into consideration (a) facts about the blamer, (b) facts about the blaming interaction itself, and (c) facts about the person being blamed. (We’re lumping “in the wrong degree” together with “in the wrong way”, since disproportionality will be one way in which the blaming interaction can be problematic.) Keep in mind, too, that how you answer the question of what blame is will influence these ethical questions, since the propriety conditions of a judgment are plausibly distinct from the propriety conditions of a rebuke. Because we are not here endorsing a particular theory of blame, our characterization of the norms in question will operate at a level of abstraction that floats free of substantive commitments concerning the nature of blame. (It’s also worth noting that the conditions on appropriate blame outlined below may perhaps be legitimately ignored if the stakes are high enough and the likely consequences of blame so valuable. In other words, there may be cases where it is appropriate to blame for the ‘wrong’ sort of reason. We set these cases aside for the purposes of our discussion.)

2.1 Facts about the Person Being Blamed

Begin by considering potentially relevant facts about the person who is being blamed. A natural answer to the question of when blame is appropriate is to say that blame is only appropriate when the person blamed is in fact blameworthy. This may sound at first like an unhelpful tautology—after all, what could it mean to be worthy of blame if not simply that you can be appropriately blamed?—but the emphasis on worthiness is meant to draw attention to the fact that it’s only appropriate to blame a person when they have earned it or when they deserve it. That is, only when certain facts about the person being blamed are in place. Which facts? What does one have to do to earn blame?

2.1.1 Moral Agency

As we noted in section 1 above, being to blame (i.e., causally responsible; see Beardsley 1969 and Kenner 1967) is not sufficient for being blameworthy because often, the best or most salient causal explanation doesn’t even involve a moral agent at all. Earthquakes and mosquitoes can be to blame for various negative outcomes, but neither can be blameworthy because neither can, as Gary Watson puts it, “act effectively and competently in moral matters” (2013a: 3322). Only certain creatures are even candidates for blame in the first place, and though it is a matter of some controversy which precise capacities are required, the list certainly includes the capacities for reflection, deliberation, decision-making, and self-determination. But earthquakes and mosquitoes are the easy cases; the harder cases are children and psychopaths, individuals who haven’t (or haven’t yet) developed an understanding of or an appreciation for moral norms. These individuals, it seems, can still act in morally significant ways—indeed, in ways we would naturally describe as cruel and even evil—but whether they can earn moral blame (as opposed merely to giving us good reason to protect ourselves from them) is a vexed question (see Watson 2011 and Shoemaker 2015 for insightful discussion). But regardless of how one answers that question, it is widely accepted that potentially blameworthy agents must be capable of reflecting upon, reasoning about, and executing a decision about how to behave. If someone lacks these capacities, they are exempted from blame.

2.1.2 Freedom and Responsibility

In addition to having the general capacity for practical reasoning, however, it is often thought that an individual is appropriately blamed only if they had (and, on the occasion, exercised) free will. The excuse “I couldn’t help it” or “I was forced to do it” is often sufficient to render blame inappropriate, so it’s a natural thought that someone can only be blamed for those things that they could have helped, or weren’t forced into—in other words, for those things that they chose of their own free will. (But note that this is primarily a condition applied to actions for which one is thought to be blameworthy. Taking seriously the possibility that we can be blameworthy for our attitudes as well might naturally lead one to downplay the importance of free will, or reconceive what it involves. See, for example, Smith 2005.) Typically, free will is thought of as a sort of control: as the ability to control (by selecting) which of two possible futures obtains, for example, or as the ability to control (by guiding) one’s actions in light of one’s considered judgments about what one ought to do. (See van Inwagen 1983; Fischer 1994; Nelkin 2011; Franklin 2018.) The question of whether control of the right sort is compatible with determinism has proven to be a difficult one to answer; hence it’s a difficult question whether blame would ever be appropriate in a deterministic world. There are less sweeping threats to freedom, however. We are all vulnerable to coercion, manipulation, situational pressures, and varying degrees of temptation or compulsion, and the extent to which these factors rob us of our freedom is the extent to which we may not be deserving of blame.

If you add the capacity for practical reasoning to the right sort of capacities for control (which will likely include not just volitional capacities but cognitive capacities, too), you end up with a morally responsible agent—that is to say, an individual who has the capacities that render them a sensible target of blame (see Fischer & Ravizza 1998; Vargas 2013). If, in performing a morally reprehensible action, they exercise those capacities, then they are morally responsible for that action—that is to say, they are a sensible target of blame for that action (they are neither exempted nor excused from our blaming practices).

There are further subtleties here, but they are inessential to the main point, which is simply that most theorists think that it is only appropriate to blame someone if they have certain capacities for control, practical reasoning, moral understanding, etc., and exercised them on the occasion in question. (One of the subtleties is that even if an agent satisfies all the relevant control conditions, they may still fail to be responsible if they fail to meet an independent epistemic condition. Non-culpable ignorance (perhaps even culpable ignorance) of the consequences of one’s actions seems to excuse bad behavior as much as lack of control. See Ginet 2000, Mele 2011, and Robichaud & Wieland 2017.) Likewise, most theorists think that if someone has and exercises these capacities, then they are blameworthy—that is, they have earned blame. But just because someone has earned blame doesn’t mean that blame is necessarily the right response. To see why, let’s turn now to facts about the blaming interaction itself.

2.2 Facts about the Blaming Interaction

Even if someone is blameworthy, not just any blaming interaction is called for. If we think of blame as a “move” made through moral space, or as a contribution to a moral conversation (see McKenna 2012), then one dimension of normative questions will concern the moves or messages that are called for. We might think of these as procedural norms (Coates and Tognazzini 2012).

2.2.1 Proportionality

Analogous to the common thought that the punishment must fit the crime, it is plausible to suppose that the blame must, in some sense, fit the transgression. Perhaps it’s legitimate to be annoyed at your friend for forgetting your birthday one year, but you shouldn’t (at least in the absence of some special context) vow never to speak to them again as a result of that one lapse. What will count as a proportional blaming response to a transgression will no doubt vary with different relationships and different transgressions, but there will likely always be some responses that take the transgression too seriously, and some that don’t take it seriously enough.

What counts as a proportional blaming response won’t depend just on the nature of the transgression, though; it will likely also depend on the way the wrongdoer has responded to their own transgression. As Angela Smith puts it:

If someone has an objectionable attitude toward me, for example, but is already reproaching herself for it and making efforts to change, then I may judge that I have no reason to adopt or express any blaming attitudes toward her at all. Her own self-reproach shows me that she already recognizes that I have moral standing and deserve better treatment, and therefore I may no longer see her attitude as posing a challenge to me or my status. In cases of this sort, the faulty attitude is still attributable to the agent and she is open to legitimate moral criticism for it; but the agent is already responding appropriately to this fact and therefore there may be no grounds for further criticism on the part of others (Smith 2007: 482).

Relatedly, in the case of third-party blame—where your blame is directed at someone who has wronged someone else—there are procedural questions concerning how the intensity of your blame matches up with the intensity of the blame from the person who was wronged. If I suspect that your failure to blame someone who has wronged you stems from a lack of self-respect or a lack of feeling empowered, then perhaps I can appropriately be more outraged than you are. But in other cases it seems as though I need to temper my blame in light of how you yourself view the wrong that has been done to you. For example, what if you have forgiven the wrongdoer? Does that by itself render third-party blame out of order? Maura Priest (2016) suggests that we distinguish between “Spectator Blame” and “Associate Blame” to help deal with this issue. While forgiveness might render blaming on behalf of the victim inappropriate, there is still a more detached form of blame that could be appropriately maintained.

2.2.2 Epistemic Considerations

Imaginary philosophical examples are always told by an omniscient narrator, but of course real-life cases of blame are never like that, and we have to rely on our fallible judgments about the obscure motivations of other human beings. Sometimes we are confident that someone has done wrong; other times we let our anger hamper our imagination and our generosity in searching for possible excuses for apparent wrongdoing. Having too quick a temper is itself something for which one can be open to criticism, and what makes a temper count as too quick is often that it outstrips the evidence for wrongdoing. The realm of interpersonal blame is not perfectly analogous to the realm of legal responsibility, of course, so “beyond a reasonable doubt” may be too demanding a requirement, but nevertheless there is some epistemic standard that must be met before blame is appropriate, even if the potential target of blame is in fact blameworthy (this point is developed in more detail by D. Justin Coates (2016)).

Gideon Rosen has also appealed to epistemic considerations on blame, except he uses them to argue for a general sort of skepticism about moral responsibility:

What must you think in order to judge that Bill, for example, is responsible for lying to his wife? You must think that at the time of action, either he knew that he had decisive reason not to lie, or if he did not know this, that his ignorance was the upshot of some prior bad action done in full knowledge of every pertinent fact or norm. You must think, in other words, that his bad action either is, or derives from, an episode of genuine, full-strength akrasia.

I suggest that given the opacity of the mind—of other minds and even of one’s own mind—it is almost always unreasonable to place significant confidence in such a judgment (Rosen 2004: 308).

Rosen’s skepticism here relies on arguments presented earlier in his article for the conclusion that the epistemic requirements on moral responsibility are quite stringent (in order for ignorance to be culpable, it must eventually trace back to clear-eyed akratic action; see also Levy 2011), but for our purposes the important point is simply that “the opacity of mind”, as Rosen puts it, can make it hard to tell when someone is genuinely blameworthy, and thus can render unjustified the judgment of wrongdoing on which appropriate blame rests. Of course, one need not accept Rosen’s skeptical conclusion to agree that blamers must not jump to conclusions about wrongdoing.

2.3 Facts about the Blamer

Even if some agent is blameworthy, and even if no procedural norm would be violated, it’s not the case (or, at least, not always the case) that everyone can blame. As Roger Wertheimer points out,

some matters—like other folks’ intimate intrafamilial relations—may be none of your business, not your affair, no (proper) concern of yours, so, whatever your evidence and emotions, it is not your place to bear ill will (Wertheimer 1998: 499).

G. A. Cohen echoes the sentiment from a different perspective:

[Moral] admonition may be sound, and in place, but some may be poorly placed to offer it. When a person replies to a critic by saying: “Where do you get off criticizing me for that?”, she is not denying (or, of course, affirming) the inherent soundness of the critic’s criticism. She is denying her critic’s right to make that criticism, in a posture of judgment (Cohen 2006: 118).

The general idea here is that there may be facts about the person who is expressing blame that make their blame inappropriate. It’s not their place, they aren’t well positioned, they don’t have the authority, and so on. Marilyn Friedman (2013: 272) puts the point nicely by saying that not everyone is blamerworthy. To continue with the legal analogy from above: whereas the blaming interaction raises questions of procedure, we might think of facts about the blamer as giving rise to questions about jurisdiction. Granted that the wrongdoer is blameworthy and that the blaming procedures would be in order, who exactly can enact those procedures?

2.3.1 Standing

There has recently been an explosion of work on the so-called standing to blame, which is often taken to be the primary fact about the blamer that is relevant to whether an instance of blame is appropriate. Hypocritical blame is usually treated as a paradigm example, and the most basic thought is simply that there seems to be something inappropriate about blame issued by a blamer who is guilty of the same transgression to which they are reacting. The standard way of talking about what’s going wrong in this sort of case is to use the label ‘standing’: the hypocritical blamer lacks the standing to blame. But before we look closer at the notion of standing in general, and hypocrisy in particular, it’s worth making a brief note about terminology.

Not everyone who writes about standing uses the term in the same way. As best we can tell, there are three distinct usages of the term, and this has resulted in theorists sometimes talking past each other. Everyone seems to agree that ‘standing’ is a label to be applied to some fact about the blamer that enables appropriate blame (or, more modestly, that ‘lack of standing’ is a label to be applied to some fact about the blamer that renders blame inappropriate). But from that common foundation, usage diverges.

For some, ‘standing’ is a term that indicates any condition about the blamer that is relevant to appropriate blame. In this broad sense, the notion of standing serves as a way to mark a contrast with facts about the blamed person, such as whether the blamed person is blameworthy. To invoke Friedman’s terminology again: the notion of standing is sometimes applied broadly to anything that pertains to whether a blamer is blamerworthy. But other theorists use the term in a narrower way.

For others, standing is more specifically tied to whatever it is that makes hypocritical blame inappropriate. We said above that hypocritical blame is often treated as a paradigm case of standingless blame, so it makes sense that some theorists would see the case of the hypocrite as what provides content to the notion of standing. Other instances of standingless blame would then be other scenarios that are relevantly similar to whatever is happening in the case of the hypocrite. This way of understanding standing leaves open the possibility that there may be some facts about the blamer that are independent of standing but which render blame inappropriate.

Finally, there are those who associate the notion of standing with a particular objection that the blamed person can apparently sometimes raise. In particular, in response to hypocritical or meddlesome blame (to take two common examples), it seems like the person being blamed can sometimes appropriately dismiss the blame (or, perhaps better, silence the blamer) with the retort: “Who are you to blame me for that?”. In this sort of exchange, the thought goes, the person being blamed is challenging the standing of the blamer. For those who take this view of the notion of standing, the only facts about the blamer that count as the standing facts are those whose absence would underwrite the legitimacy of this “who are you?” response.

It’s clear that all three of these questions—(1) what blamer-based facts are relevant to the propriety of blame and why, (2) what goes wrong in cases of hypocritical blame, and (3) what blamer-based facts are relevant to the legitimacy of the “who are you?” charge—are worth asking, and will likely have overlapping answers. But there’s a serious risk of misunderstanding if we don’t distinguish among these questions. Since hypocrisy plays such a central role in recent scholarship on these questions, we’ll begin there.

2.3.2 Hypocrisy

At least sometimes, we blame others with the aim of getting them to see the error of their ways and change their behavior in the future. One sure way to fail at this is to be guilty of the very same (or a relevantly similar) transgression as the one you are condemning. The hypocritical blamer is perhaps the paradigm example of someone whose blame somehow goes awry. For one thing, it’s unlikely that hypocritical blame will be effective (see Dworkin 2000; Roadevin 2018), but the problem seems to go deeper than that. (Another way to put it: hypocritical blame would still be problematic even if it were effective.) In line with the distinctions we made at the end of the last section, let’s separate two questions here: first, what’s wrong with hypocritical blame, and second, what is the nature of the “who are you” rebuttal of hypocritical blame.

So, first: what precisely is the problem with hypocritical blame? (See Szabados and Soifer 2004 for a book length treatment of the ethics of hypocrisy in general.) The answer to this question will likely depend on the nature of blame. R. Jay Wallace, for example, who advocates a Strawsonian account of blame, explains the problem with hypocrisy by an appeal to the underlying commitments of the reactive attitudes. For Wallace (2010: 326), “blame carries with it a kind of practical commitment to critical self-scrutiny”, a commitment that the hypocritical blamer fails to live up to. Given that “we all have an interest in being protected from the kind of social disapproval and opprobrium that are involved in blame”, the hypocritical blamer—as long as they aren’t also blaming themselves, in which case they might not count as hypocritical—treats their own interest in avoiding blame as more important than the interest of the target of their blame. As Wallace puts it (2010: 328): “This offends against a presumption in favor of the equal standing of persons that I take to be fundamental to moral thought”. Thus, for Wallace, the problem with hypocritical blame is that it is morally wrong (and thus inappropriate even if the target is blameworthy). Kyle Fritz and Daniel Miller (2018) also think that hypocritical blaming is morally objectionable because it involves an unfair “differential blaming disposition”, which “contravenes the equality of persons” (2018: 123). They argue that their account, unlike Wallace’s, can account not only for what’s objectionable about hypocritical moral address, but also for why even unexpressed hypocritical blame is morally problematic.

T. M. Scanlon, on the other hand, takes blame to be an adjustment of attitudes in response to an impaired relationship, so the problem with hypocritical blame is that it distorts the facts. The adjustment of attitudes and expectations that constitutes blame purports to be a response to some way in which the blamed person has impaired their relationship with the blamer. But, as Scanlon says (2008: 177), “there is something false in [the hypocritical blamer’s] suggesting that it is [the blamee’s] unwillingness to act in ways that indicate untrustworthiness that impairs [their] moral relationship,” since the past attitudes and actions of the hypocritical blamer already impaired the relevant relationship. Thus, for Scanlon, we might say that the problem with hypocritical blame is that it is unfitting (or untrue to the facts).

Even if hypocritical blame is unfitting and/or unfair, it’s not obvious how that would help us to make sense of the “who are you” charge that motivates so much recent work on standing. When I challenge your credentials to cast blame by accusing you of hypocrisy, I’m not simply trying to tell you that you are doing something morally wrong, nor that you are making false assumptions. Although those would presumably count as reasons to cease blaming, the “who are you” charge is more pointed than the claim that the blamer has a reason to stop. Instead, it seems like I am trying to silence your blame in some way. (It’s this further thought that drives Macalester Bell’s (2013a) skepticism about the idea of standing.) Our second question, then, is how exactly to make sense of the “who are you” charge when applied to a hypocritical blamer.

There are two general proposals for making sense of the way in which hypocrisy seems to make a blamer lose their moral voice, so to speak. We saw above that Fritz & Miller largely agree with Wallace that hypocritical blaming is unfair because the hypocrite harbors a “differential blaming disposition”. But they go a step further by suggesting that the normative upshot of the unfairness of hypocritical blame is that the blamer “forfeits the right to blame others” for violations of the norm with respect to which the hypocrisy arises (Fritz & Miller 2018: 125). This thought fits quite naturally with some ways in which the “who are you” charge tends to be formulated. When I ask the rhetorical question, “Who are you to blame me?”, perhaps what I’m trying to say is that although others may have the right to blame me for this transgression, you do not have such a right. Your hypocrisy has taken it from you. However, even this might be too strong. Perhaps your hypocrisy doesn’t mean you’ve forfeited your right to blame, but only that you have a distinctive pro tanto reason to refrain from blaming. Since blame–even hypocritical blame–can sometimes be morally imperative, this reason won’t always be decisive. But its existence might suffice to explain the sense that the hypocrite is in some sense overstepping her bounds in many instances.

Of course, you might worry about supposing that there is such a thing as a general right or entitlement to blame in the first place. Matt King (forthcoming) argues on these grounds in favor of skepticism about the notion of standing. According to King, there is nothing distinctive about the “who are you” charge, and he offers an account of what goes wrong with hypocritical blame by appealing not to the idea of standing but instead to the idea that the hypocrite is violating norms of priority (or perhaps norms of involvement) that specify where our critical focus ought to be. The hypocrite’s focus is in the wrong place, and this provides the hypocrite with a weighty moral reason not to blame.

The second proposal, recently developed by Ori Herstein, for making sense of the “who are you” charge doesn’t appeal to a general right to blame, but instead begins from the insight that blaming is, in part, an attempt to give reasons to the person being blamed—reasons to stop what they are doing, to apologize, to acknowledge wrongdoing. Even without being blamed, a wrongdoer would presumably have these reasons, but what blame does is add another type of reason to the mix—specifically, a directive reason. This richer account of the blaming transaction opens up a new way of understanding the “who are you” charge. In Herstein’s view, although a hypocritical blamer does still issue a valid directive through their blame, that directive can nevertheless be permissibly ignored “without substantive deliberation on [its] merits” (Herstein 2017: 3110).

2.3.3 Other Blamer-Based Worries

Although hypocrisy is the most frequently discussed blamer-based fact that would render blame problematic, there are certainly others worth exploring. Here we’ll briefly discuss four: complicity, meddling, moral luck, and claimant injustice.

To charge someone with blaming hypocritically is to allege that they are blaming (or, at least, pretending to blame) in response to transgressions similar to those (or perhaps type-identical to those) that they have committed in the past. A somewhat related charge, but worth distinguishing, is the claim that the blamer is somehow objectionably involved in the very act that they are, at this very moment, condemning. This is to charge the blamer with complicity, and such a charge might take many forms. G. A. Cohen (2006: 126) gives a nice sample: “you ordered me to do it, you asked me to do it, you forced me to do it, you left me with no reasonable alternative, you gave me the means to do it”. The superior officer who orders a subordinate to do something morally reprehensible is not in a position to blame the subordinate for carrying out the order, even if civilians are. And this is not necessarily because the superior officer has done similar things in the past, but instead because they are too closely involved in the very act they are purporting to condemn.

The issue of complicity has recently been discussed in connection with whether the state has the standing to blame certain criminals. Gary Watson (2015) and Gustavo A. Beade (forthcoming) each raise worries about the fact that criminality is correlated with certain social disadvantages that the state itself may be responsible for. If complicity in wrongdoing undermines the standing to blame, and if the state is—as seems plausible—at least partly responsible for the social conditions that partly explain criminal behavior, then it suddenly becomes unclear that the state is in a position to punish certain law-breakers. (Watson also considers the more worrisome conclusion that certain disadvantaged criminals aren’t even bound by the laws in the first place, due to the structural disadvantages in which the state is complicit.)

Although it is helpful for some purposes to distinguish hypocrisy from complicity, it may be that at a more fundamental level they are problematic for the same reason. This is the view that Patrick Todd (2012, forthcoming) advocates. According to Todd, the reason we can raise the “who are you” charge against both hypocrites and those who are complicit in our wrongdoing is that in both cases, the blamer’s own behavior demonstrates a lack of commitment to the relevant moral norm.

Even if a blamer isn’t a hypocrite and isn’t involved in the action they are condemning, their blame can nevertheless be inappropriate if the wrong in question is just none of their business. Linda Radzik gives a nice description of our common moral attitudes toward these situations:

For example, a group of co-workers will often insist that the romantic infidelity of one of their members is none of their business (and then feel a bit ashamed when they continue to gossip about it). Neighbors and teachers hesitate to interfere with a parent’s treatment of her child although they judge the treatment to be wrongful, unless the wrong reaches a certain level of severity. Even within close relationships, we are sometimes uncertain whether we should express our negative moral judgment of a friend’s behavior. True, the hesitancy to sanction in these cases is sometimes based on laziness, self-interest, cowardice or uncertainty about the moral judgments at issue, none of which contradict the claim that we have the standing to sanction. But, at other times, our hesitancy seems to be based on the sense that it would be wrong to sanction. We say, “It isn’t my place to interfere even though I can see what she is doing is wrong”. We do not feel entitled to sanction every wrongdoer for every wrong (Radzik 2011: 582).

And the thought, of course, is that we do not feel entitled to sanction every wrongdoer for every wrong because we aren’t so entitled. Radzik describes three situations in which only a limited group of individuals could appropriately blame: (1) cases where agents wrong themselves, (2) cases where the wrong is “committed within special relationships, such as romantic partnerships, familial bonds, and friendships” (2011: 593), and (3) cases where third-party blame “would interfere with the victim’s ability to find vindication in the aftermath of wrongdoing” (2011: 597).

It’s a good question exactly why appropriate blame would be restricted only to certain individuals in these sorts of case. Perhaps there are norms of privacy at play (Smith 2007; Nagel 1998), or perhaps there’s an illuminating analogy to be made here with the notion of standing in the law (Sabini and Silver 1982, though see also Bell 2013a and King forthcoming), or perhaps if we see blame as a response which presupposes that the person blamed is in some way accountable to the members of their moral community, then we can distinguish between several (overlapping) moral communities, only some of which any one person belongs to, and thus only some of which underwrite one’s ability to blame appropriately (Duff 2010: 126). If we adopt Scanlon’s recent account of blame (2008), then perhaps we can say that some wrongs are none of our business because they don’t impair any of our relationships, and hence don’t render appropriate any blame-constituting modifications in those relationships. (The so-called "Business Condition" on appropriate blame—that blame is inappropriate if the wrong is none of your business—is another place where it is helpful to distinguish the question of why meddlesome blame is problematic from the question of the precise nature of the "who are you" charge that might be raised by the person being blamed.)

Moral luck (in all its forms) provides another perspective from which to see how blame might be inappropriate. Consider Gary Watson’s (1987) influential discussion of Robert Harris, who is at once an unequivocally cruel murderer and also, in a real sense, a victim of his tragic formative circumstances. It’s a legitimate question, given his history, whether Harris is even the sort of creature who is a sensible target of blame - that is, whether Harris is even a morally responsible agent in the first place - but even if we grant that he is, there’s another potential obstacle to blame at work here. Watson expresses it like this:

The fact that Harris’s cruelty is an intelligible response to his circumstances gives a foothold not only for sympathy, but for the thought that if I had been subjected to such circumstances, I might well have become as vile. What is unsettling is the thought that one’s moral self is such a fragile thing. One tends to think of one’s moral sensibilities as going deeper than that (though it is not clear what this means). This thought induces not only an ontological shudder, but a sense of equality with the other: I too am a potential sinner (Watson 1987, as reprinted in Watson 2004: 245).

The obstacle to blame that Watson is describing here is not the thought that Harris might not be blameworthy (though he might not be), but rather the thought expressed well by the phrase “There but for the grace of God go I”. It’s a humbling perspective to take on one’s agency, one that may “taint one’s own view of one’s moral self as an achievement” (2004: 246), and make one feel that “indignation on one’s part would be self-righteous and indulgent” (2004: 254). For want of a better term, we might say that this is a worry about subjunctive hypocrisy, since it certainly has a similar flavor to the hypocrisy worry discussed above. The thought is something like this: “If I were as bad as him, I’d have no standing to blame him. But the difference between us is simply a matter of luck, and surely my good moral luck can’t serve as the basis for my moral standing to blame. So I lack the standing to blame even though I’ve never done the terrible things in question.”

It’s worth mentioning one final fact about the blamer that can complicate a blaming interaction, though this one fits less well into the framework we’ve been exploring because it’s not something that makes blame inappropriate so much as it is something that makes blame unheard. We have in mind an idea introduced by Vanessa Carbonell (forthcoming), which she dubs “claimant injustice”. According to Carbonell, claimant injustice “…occurs when social prejudices or structural inequalities undermine a moral agent’s ability to engage in felicitous moral address—to make moral claims, to call out wrongdoing, to judge or condemn others for their action, to hold responsible, to seek redress, to blame or punish, to participate in any of the social practices associated with the participant and vicarious reactive attitudes” (forthcoming: 16). The idea here is that the very power to engage in moral address is something that requires a social context where the blamer is recognized as (and believes themselves to be) a valid source of moral claims, but this context can be absent for members of marginalized groups, thus rendering them unable to hold members of dominant groups responsible. Thus it may be that yet another fact about the blamer—the fact that they are marginalized—can render blame infelicitous. (See Hornsby 1995 for related discussion.) Again, it’s not that their blame is dismissed so much as simply not heard as moral address in the first place.

2.4 Varieties of Blame

Because the nature of blame is controversial, we have tended in this section simply to use the word “blame”, but it’s important to remember that one’s views about the ethics of blame will very much depend on what one takes blame to be. For instance, although hypocritical moral address (to use Wallace’s term) seems clearly to underwrite the legitimacy of a "who are you" charge, it is less clear whether merely harboring a hypocritical blaming judgment is likewise inappropriate, or inappropriate in quite the same way. In general, the difference between expressed and unexpressed blame is an important distinction to keep in mind when theorizing about the ways in which blame can go wrong (see Fritz and Miller 2018; Todd forthcoming).

Moreover, blame seems to be just one among many ways that we respond to wrongdoing, and it’s still an open question just how blame relates to activities like holding responsible, demanding answers, punishing, and so on. (For some attempted taxonomies, see Macnamara 2011; Shoemaker 2011; Smith 2012; Tognazzini 2015.) So, answers to the above questions about the ethics of blame will not automatically double as answers to analogous questions about the ethics of these other ways of interacting.


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  • Tognazzini, N. A. 2015. “The Strains of Involvement,” in Clarke, McKenna, and Smith (eds.), The Nature of Moral Responsibility, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 19–44.
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Other Internet Resources

  • “Praise and Blame”, entry by Garrath Williams in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Blame, an episode of the NPR show Radiolab.


Our sincere thanks to John Martin Fischer, Coleen Macnamara, Angela Smith, and Gary Watson for all of their help thinking about moral responsibility and blame over the past several years, and to the American Council of Learned Societies and The College of William & Mary for financial assistance during the research for this entry. Thanks also to Dee Payton and Patrick Todd for helpful discussions about the issue of standing.

Copyright © 2018 by
Neal Tognazzini <>
D. Justin Coates <>

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