Peter Frederick Strawson

First published Wed Sep 16, 2009; substantive revision Thu May 4, 2023

Peter Frederick Strawson (1919–2006) was an important and influential philosopher of the late twentieth century. His writings range over philosophical logic, the philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology and the history of philosophy. Across these debates, Strawson aimed to identify the most fundamental concepts involved in our ordinary ways of thinking. He took these to include such core concepts as those of body, person, space and time, and causation. Strawson aimed to show both that sceptical challenges to our use of such concepts are spurious and unwarranted and also that our entitlement to use these concepts does not depend on their being reduced to some supposedly more naturalistically acceptable basis, such as experience as conceived of by the empiricists, or the concepts involved in fundamental science. According to Strawson, the proper task of metaphysics is to describe these indispensable notions and their interconnections. His work was influential in moving Oxford philosophy away from the anti-metaphysical work of A.J. Ayer and J.L. Austin towards a re-engagement with many traditional philosophical questions. Strawson’s work continues to command attention.

1. Life

Peter Frederick Strawson was born, in London, on November 23, 1919. He studied Philosophy, Politics and Economics (PPE) at St. John’s College, Oxford, between 1937 and 1940. His philosophy tutors were J.D. Mabbott, an eminent political philosopher, later to become Master of the college, and H. P. Grice, whom Strawson himself described as ‘one of the cleverest and most ingenious thinkers of our time’. (This quotation comes from Strawson’s ‘Intellectual Autobiography’ contained in Hahn 1998. Strawson’s account there of his life and thought contains much that is of philosophical interest, and it also reveals much about him as a person.) Strawson was then called up for military service and belongs to that generation of British philosophers, including Ayer, Hampshire, Hare, Hart and Wollheim, who saw service in the Second World War. His first post after the war was at Bangor, in Wales. After winning the prestigious John Locke Prize in Oxford (a prize awarded on the basis of a written examination to philosophy graduates in Oxford), he received an appointment at University College, Oxford, which made him a Fellow in 1948. Two years later, in 1950, with the publication of ‘On Referring’ in Mind and his debate with Austin about truth, he achieved international fame.

His subsequent life as a philosopher was spent mostly in positions at Oxford, first as a Fellow at University College, and then, after 1968, as Gilbert Ryle’s successor as Wayneflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy, at Magdalen College. Writing extensively, in both books and articles, about the philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology and the history of philosophy, he succeeded in redirecting Oxford philosophy away from the limitations which had to some extent been accepted under the influence of Austin, towards a re-engagement with some traditional abstract philosophical issues. From the early 1950s onwards he established a pre-eminence within Oxford philosophy, both through his publications and also through his quite exceptional critical abilities. Part of the way that Strawson’s approach to philosophy contrasted with Austin’s is that Strawson was committed to the value of publication, of books and articles, whereas Austin seemed content to develop his views and promulgate them in lectures and talks. His achievements were recognised by election in 1960 to the British Academy, by the reception of a knighthood in 1977 and by many other honours. In 1998 he became the twenty-sixth philosopher to have a volume devoted to him in the famous Library of Living Philosophers series, adding another British name to the list of recipients of this honour, previous ones being Whitehead, Russell, Moore, Broad and Ayer. He was probably the most famous and most discussed British philosopher within the academic world of philosophy from the 1950s until the late 1980s. His status is evidenced by the fact that his writings attracted the attention of, and were discussed by, the world’s leading philosophers, including, Russell, Sellars, Putnam, Quine, Davidson, and Kripke.

Strawson was married and had four children. He was a highly cultured man, with a passion for literature, especially poetry, large amounts of which he could recite and which he also wrote. In conversation, manners and appearance, the overwhelming impression was of elegance and effortless intelligence.

Strawson retired in 1987, but remained philosophically active until his death in Oxford on February 13, 2006.

2. Reference

Strawson published ‘On Referring’ in 1950. (Like Frege, Russell and, later, Kripke and Evans, Strawson made his name by writing about reference.) He subsequently modified and developed his views on reference, but the central claim of ‘On Referring’ is something he always defended. Strawson’s title contains, of course, an allusion to Russell’s famous article ‘On Denoting’, the central idea of which Strawson is criticising. Strawson’s conception of the debate is that Russell offered his theory of descriptions as a complete account of the role of definite descriptions in English (such expressions as ‘the queen of England’), whereas the truth is that the role of the word ‘the’ when embedded in definite descriptions cannot be captured in a single account. There are uses which do not fit Russell’s theory because the phenomenon is simply more complex than Russell allowed. It is not, therefore, that Strawson is offering his own complete theory; it is, rather, that he is picking out uses for which, according to him, Russell’s theory fails, and characterising them. Russell’s theory had achieved the status of orthodoxy at the time that Strawson launched his attack on it. That this is the way to understand Strawson’s contribution to the debate has the important consequence that it is no objection to his approach to point to uses of ‘the’ about which, arguably, Russell (or something close to Russell’s view) might be correct. Such points do not touch Strawson’s central claim. This undermines a number of responses to Strawson. Strawson’s paper initiated a debate about definite descriptions that has run ever since its publication, and in which his views have remained central.

Russell claimed that a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ says; ‘There is one and only one F and it is G.’ The difference from ‘An F is G’ is that the latter merely claims that there is a (G) F, whereas the use of the definite article imports the extra claim of uniqueness. Both are alike in making an existential claim about Fs, namely, there is an F, and hence, according to Russell, at least part of the role of ‘the’ is to be (or to introduce) what is called an existential quantifier. This, in a crude presentation, is Russell’s Theory of Definite Descriptions. Against this Strawson argued, first, that it is unsupported. He claimed that Russell’s main support for his theory is that a sentence such as ‘The king of France is bald’ remains meaningful even though there is no king of France. Its having meaning cannot, therefore, depend on there being a referent for the apparent subject expression. According to Strawson, Russell infers from that to the conclusion that the semantic role of the apparent subject expression in such sentences (i.e. ‘the F’) cannot be to refer to or designate an object, and must, rather, function as a quantifier. Against this, Strawson suggested that the meaningfulness of ‘The F is G’ should be thought of as, roughly, there being rules as to what a use of the sentence in different circumstances will amount to. If the circumstances are right, then it can be used in a referring way; if not, then the use might not succeed in being an act of reference. Strawson’s distinction between a sentence’s having a meaning and the speech act performed by its use on an occasion is clearly sound and important. One question that was debated is whether all of Russell’s reasons for his theory are disarmed by the introduction of this distinction.

However, against the Russellian theory itself Strawson made the important point that the theory implies that a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ must count as false when used in circumstances where there is no F. (These cases are often described as ones involving ‘reference failure’). It must do so because, according to the theory, part of the role of ‘The F’ (at least in such declarative sentences) is to say that there is an F. Contrary to this, Strawson claims that we would not always regard a saying of ‘The F is G’ as false in such circumstances. We would not react by saying ‘That is false’ but would rather say something like ‘What do you mean?’ or ‘You must be under a misapprehension’. He suggests that in such circumstances the use amounts neither to saying something true nor to saying something false. It exhibits what came to be called a ‘truth-value gap’. In subsequent discussion it became clear that it is difficult to determine what we should say about the truth value of sentences involving referential failure. Strawson’s main objection to Russell’s account is, though, that it is simply obvious that sometimes we use ‘The F’ to refer to or pick out an object, and we do not then use it to say that there is an F.

Strawson’s attitude is well presented in a later important paper where he says:

The distinction between identifying reference and uniquely existential assertion is something quite undeniable. The sense in which the existence of something answering to a definite description used for the purpose of identifying reference, and its distinguishability by an audience from anything else, is presupposed and not asserted in an utterance containing such an expression, so used, stands absolutely firm, whether or not one opts for the view that radical failure of the presupposition would deprive the statement of a truth-value. It remains a decisive objection to the theory of Descriptions … that … it amounts to a denial of these undeniable distinctions. (Strawson 1964, 85)

This passage reveals four important aspects of Strawson’s approach to definite descriptions.

The first is that his fundamental objection to Russell is that it is simply obvious to him as a sensitive and self-reflective user of language that the use of the word ‘the’ does not conform to the theory. Whatever puzzles there may be about language and reference their solution cannot require us to deny such obvious facts. It is a recurring theme in, or perhaps a recurring part of the method of, Strawson’s philosophical discussion of language that some aspects of language are more or less obvious to us. Second, the contrast that strikes Strawson as especially obvious is that between saying that there is (one and only one) F and employing, in certain contexts, the definite description ‘The F’. If, standing in front of our familiar car, I say to my family, ‘The car will not start’, I am hardly telling them that we have, or there is, a certain car. Why should I engage in a communicative act of that sort? It is the importance of this contrast that impressed Strawson, as opposed to the problem often now raised against Russell’s theory, that the uniqueness commitment seems equally problematic. Strawson notes the issue about uniqueness but attends most to the assertion of existence problem. This reading of the nature of Strawson’s main objection to Russell implies that a crucial question is whether it is indeed an implication of Russell’s analysis that the person employing the description ‘The F’ (in normal discourse) says that there is one (and only one) F. If that is not an implication of Russell’s analysis then Strawson’s main objection lapses. It might also be asked whether any analysis of descriptions in terms of quantifiers, even if developed in a more sophisticated way, must have such a problematic implication.

Third, one central concept in Strawson’s developed description of the role of such an expression as ‘The F’ is that it can be a device for what he calls identifying reference. Roughly, Strawson’s idea is that the definite description is sometimes chosen to enable the audience to fix on or pick out as the subject matter of the claim an item of which they already know. In this role it cannot be that ‘the F’ tells them of the existence of such an F, since its role rests on the prior existence of such knowledge. Strawson provides a detailed analysis of this function in the first chapter of Individuals, as well as in the article from which the above quotation comes. Finally, a notion that Strawson introduced in his own description of the nature of definite descriptions and which surfaces in the quotation is that of presupposition. Strawson said that the use of a definite description standardly presupposes the existence of an object fitting the description even though it does not say, nor therefore entail, that there is such an object. This concept met with resistance amongst philosophers but has had a colossal influence on linguists, who have tended to see it as a useful concept in the description of language (see Huang 2007, ch. 7). This encourages us to ask whether it is more likely that linguists or philosophers have the better insight into language.

3. Truth

The other very important debate that Strawson was involved in the early 1950s was that with Austin about truth. Viewed in terms of the politics of Oxford philosophy at that time, the debate perhaps represents a power struggle between Austin, the hitherto acknowledged leader, and Strawson, the younger challenger. Philosophically, Strawson took exception to Austin’s attempt (in Austin 1950) to formulate a reconstructed version of the correspondence theory of truth. Austin’s account of truth is complex, but, roughly, he held that in saying that a statement is true one is saying that the state of affairs which a particular kind of linguistic convention, which he called the referential conventions, ensure are picked out by the use of the original sentence in the given circumstances, satisfy the conditions which another sort of convention — called the descriptive conventions — target the rest of the sentence onto. Austin’s idea can be illustrated with an example. The sentence ‘The television is broken’ is governed by certain referential conventions which target it onto some state of affairs in the world involving a particular television set; there are also certain descriptive conventions built into the sentence linking it to a type of state of affairs (the containing-a-broken-television type); the former state of affairs conforms to, or falls under, the descriptively correlated type. Strawson’s criticism principally alleges that Austin has no clear conception of what the supposed referential conventions link sentences with. Is it objects — say, the television? If so, then that is not a state of affairs, and certainly not a fact.

Strawson also argues that facts and states of affairs should not be regarded as things in the world. He suggests that we employ such nouns as ‘fact’ and ‘state of affairs’ as non-referential devices for expressing claims. Thus, I can say ‘It is a fact that P’ instead of simply saying ‘P’, but the former remark in no way introduces an entity beyond anything introduced in the second claim. (This might be labelled a redundancy theory of facts.) Having queried the ontology of Austin’s account, Strawson, somewhat surprisingly seems prepared to allow that the conditions that Austin’s account incorporates are, in effect, correlated with the truth of the sentence in question, but, he says, the fulfilment of these conditions is not what we are claiming to obtain when we say that it is true. It is simply obvious that remarks about truth are not remarks about linguistic conventions. This criticism seems to have a similar status to the central criticism of Russell. Strawson’s point against Austin is that it is simply obvious that the theory cannot be correct because it is obvious to us as language users that when we speak of truth we are not talking about such things as referential (and descriptive) linguistic conventions. Finally, Strawson pointed out that Austin’s account could only apply to a limited range of statements. If I say ‘There are no unicorns’ what are the referential targets of my remark?

Strawson’s criticisms were taken by most people to have fatally wounded Austin’s theory. The subsequent discussion occasioned by their debate primarily concerned some issues about the degree to which Strawson’s criticisms as a whole were fair to Austin, and also whether the approach to truth that Strawson himself favoured was adequate. Strawson’s account, rather than Austin’s, became the focus of debate. Strawson himself returned to the former question in later articles, arguing persuasively that even on the most charitable interpretation Austin’s idea of two sorts of conventions cannot be made sense of. Strawson himself favoured a view which took as the central insight about truth (one deriving from F. P. Ramsey) that to say that P is true is equivalent to saying that P. Strawson’s own main contribution to working out this idea was to stress the linguistic acts that the word ‘true’ enables us to perform. This left him free to point out that even if Ramsey’s equivalence is the fundamental core of the notion of truth, it would not follow that the expression ‘true’ is a redundant expression. The presence in our language of the term ‘true’ might be of great—indeed, indispensable—utility.

G. J. Warnock (in Warnock 1964) thought he discerned a problem in Strawson’s account because the theory might not allow that in saying that a certain remark is true a speaker is saying something about that remark, which Warnock thought a desirable element in an account of truth. Rather, Warnock felt that according to Strawson the speaker is simply saying the same as the original remark. In his response Strawson pointed out that it is possible to incorporate reference to the statement in the analysis he gave of truth ascriptions. Thus, the claim ‘John’s statement that P is true’ can be treated as equivalent to (say) ‘P, as John’s statement said’. This is ingenious, but it leaves one aspect of Strawson’s view unexplained, and it may have been this aspect that Warnock was trying to home in on. Strawson stressed that it is statements that are truth bearers. If, however, truth should not be thought of as a property of anything, then what is the point of carefully identifying the things that are its bearers? (On some of these issues, see Searle 1998.)

4. Logical Theory

Strawson published his first book An Introduction to Logical Theory in 1952. In it he attempts to explain the nature, and the scope and limits, of formal logic. The eminence he had already achieved was reflected in the fact that it received a review by Quine in Mind. Strawson’s aim, generated in part by his reflections on the correct treatment of definite descriptions, is to say what formal logic is by explaining and elucidating its central concepts, among them the notion of entailment. Strawson favours explaining ‘P entails Q’ as ‘‘P and not Q’ is self-contradictory’, and explains or elucidates the notion of self-contradiction in terms of sentences saying nothing; in effect, they give and then take back simultaneously. Strawson then looks at the notion of form and of proof systems. He applies his ideas to traditional syllogistic logic as well as to modern propositional and predicate logic. It can be wondered how far his elucidation of the central notions is adequate, and it can also be wondered whether he attends to all the notions that need explanation in relation to formal logic (e.g., consistency and completeness). The main part of his book does not seem to have had a large influence on philosophers or logicians. However, three elements in his discussion had and continue to have considerable influence. First, he gave a fuller explanation of the notion of presupposition than he had previously provided. Second, Strawson asked how far the meaning of ordinary language connectives, such as ‘and’, ‘or’ and ‘if … then…’, can be equated with those of the truth functional connectives, such as ‘&’, ‘∨’, and ‘→’, that logicians employ. Strawson argued that there are significant differences. His conclusion is that these ordinary expressions do not have what might be called a precise logic. The question that Strawson asked has continued to be central in the philosophy of language and has not been resolved. Grice took an opposite view to Strawson and part of the point of Grice’s account of implication, as opposed to meaning or saying, was to generate an explanation for the data that Strawson appealed to in arguing for a semantic difference between ordinary language and formal logic, without having to postulate a semantic difference. Strawson himself later criticised Grice’s theory, at least in relation to conditionals. Third, he proposed an approach to the problem of induction. We shall describe that later when looking at Strawson’s contribution to epistemology.

5. Individuals

In 1959 Strawson published his second book Individuals. It is ambitious, abstract, wide ranging and original, and it has continued to be read and discussed, especially the first half. Strawson coined the terms ‘descriptive metaphysics’ to capture his task and opposed that to what he called ‘revisionary metaphysics’. By using ‘metaphysics’ Strawson was primarily emphasising the abstractness and generality of his questions. A consequence of this generality, Strawson suggests, is that the methods needed for settling them are different in kind from those employed in debating less abstract conceptual or philosophical questions. One such method, employed in chapter 2, when exploring the sound world, involves imagining creatures with quite different experiences from our own, and trying to determine their capacities for thinking about objects. By calling it ‘descriptive’ Strawson means, in part, that he is not recommending revisions or additions to how we think. But the term also signals Strawson’s conviction that there is a shared and universal conceptual scheme which we human beings have, and know that we have, and for which no justification in terms of more fundamental concepts or claims can be given. He writes:

[T]here is a massive central core of human thinking which has no history—or none recorded in histories of human thought; there are categories and concepts which, in their most fundamental character, change not at all. Obviously these are not the specialities of the most refined thinking. They are the commonplaces of the least refined thinking; and yet are the indispensable core of the conceptual equipment of the most sophisticated human beings. (Strawson 1959, 10)

The claim that there are a shared set of concepts which are at the indispensable core of human thinking is a recognisably Kantian thesis. (We say more about Strawson’s relation to Kant below.) Descriptive metaphysics aims to describe and analyse this universal conceptual scheme. In particular, Strawson aims to focus on one part of that total structure, namely our ability to direct our thoughts, and speech, onto items in the world. It is possible therefore to see Individuals as, in part, a development of Strawson’s interest in reference.

Individuals is very much a book of two halves. In the first four chapters Strawson’s focus is on our ability to refer to and think about items in our environment, including ourselves. In the second part, again of four chapters, the aim is to elucidate the distinction between subject expressions and predicate expressions. This latter task belongs more to philosophical logic or the philosophy of language than to metaphysics, but the link is, according to Strawson, that the central cases of subject expressions are those picking out the entities to which we basically refer, the character of which it has been the task of the first half to determine. Since, in fact, the book’s colossal and immediate impact was due primarily to the brilliance and originality of its first three chapters, we shall describe them in somewhat more detail than the rest of the book. The truth is that reading the argument developed in those chapters generates a continuous intellectual excitement, which the later chapters do not quite match. It is also true that issues to do with the subject-predicate distinction appeal to fewer people than do the issues focused on in the early part.

Chapter 1 focuses on the question of whether there is a category of entities which we can think about without depending on thought about entities of other categories. The focus initially is not so much on thought as on linguistically referring to something when in conversation with an audience, and Strawson clarifies the relevant idea of talking about an item by invoking the notion of identifying reference which emerged in his theory of reference. Strawson proposes the following model of latching onto an identifying reference. One case is where the referent is picked out as a currently perceived item – say, this page. In such a case the audience succeeds when they pick out the same item in their own field of experience. The other is where it is picked out as falling under a description. Strawson’s idea is that ultimately such descriptions need to relate the item in some way to currently perceived items – say, as the author of this page – for otherwise the possibility of reduplication would prevent us from picking out a unique item. (Such a two–fold structure of thought was also accepted by Russell, but arguments in the theory of perception persuaded him that the perceived scene was private rather than, as Strawson holds, public.)

How should we think of these descriptive relations? Strawson claims in chapter 1 that these descriptive relations are fundamentally spatio-temporal. That is, my ability to think of James I rests on thinking of him as the person ascending the throne in 1603, the present time being 2018. Ultimately I fix on him via his place in a spatio-temporal framework which is centred on my currently perceived environment. Strawson further points out that since we need to update this relational framework over time as we move around, we need to be able to re-identify objects and places encountered at different times. Strawson draws an epistemological conclusion from this. Since our ability to maintain a grasp on the spatio-temporal framework depends on acceptance of such identifications it is incoherent to be sceptical about the procedures we rely on to confirm them while still thinking in terms of the spatio-temporal framework itself. With these conclusions in place, Strawson returns to his fundamental question as to whether there is a basic category of items of reference. Some forms of reference seem parasitic on other forms of reference: reference to theoretical entities is dependent on reference to material particulars; reference to experiences, such as Mary’s pain in her leg, are dependent on references to their subjects. Strawson’s assumption seems to be that putting these two categories to one side leaves us with two candidates for the basic items of reference: material bodies (in a broad sense) and occurrences. Occurrences, however, cannot be basic since they too are standardly picked out dependently – e.g., the fire in that house – and, moreover, according to Strawson, they do not form a structured framework allowing the spatio-temporal framework to be grounded. Thus Strawson’s conclusion: bodies (in a fairly inclusive sense) are referentially basic.

Strawson next asks, in chapter 2, whether it is possible that there should be a conceptual scheme that acknowledges the existence of objective particulars but in which material bodies are not the basic particulars. Since, according to the initial argument, referential thought rests on a spatio-temporal framework only if it rests on thought about bodies, this question becomes: can there be thought about objective entities which doesn’t involve thinking of them in spatial terms? To investigate this question, Strawson considers whether the notion of an objective particular would be comprehensible to a creature with only auditory experience, the assumption being that auditory experience on its own is non-spatial and thus that a creature in such a situation wouldn’t have access to spatial ways of thinking. What objective notions would be available to such a creature? Strawson imaginatively enters into the sound world to see how far ideas analogous to those that space makes available can be found. The best option relies on relating individual sounds to a continuous ‘master sound’ which, as it were, defines something analogous to space. Strawson himself appears to think this might work. His view thus seems to be that although spatio-temporal thinking rests on bodies, objective thinking cannot be shown to require spatio-temporal thinking per se, but even in cases where there can be objective thought without spatio-temporal thinking, there must be something in in the subject’s way of thinking which performs a role analogous to the role that thought about space performs for us. Strawson’s argument was influentially discussed by Gareth Evans in ‘Things Without the Mind’ (1980), a commentary on chapter 2 of Individuals; further commentary can be found in Snowdon 2006 and Cassam 2005.

In the next chapter, entitled ‘Persons’, Strawson leaves behind speculation about concepts based on attenuated experiences, and focuses on our rich thought about ourselves. His argument involves a comparison between three conceptions of such thought. The first is what he calls the no-ownership view. This is the view that we do not really refer to ourselves when we use the first-person pronoun, even though we seem to. There is nothing that owns or has the experiences to which to refer. Strawson’s response is to argue that once this view is developed, genuine self-reference emerges as involved in the theory’s explanation of the illusion of ownership of experiences. One question for this response is whether it is a decisive objection to the no-ownership theory that an incoherence emerges in its standard explanation as to why we tend to believe that our experiences are owned. Why must the no-ownership view supply such an explanation? The second conception is that deriving from Descartes, according to which, the item that ‘I’ picks out is something distinct from the physical body. Strawson argues that this conception is incompatible with the principle that one can ascribe experiences to oneself only if one is prepared to ascribe them to others. This is because a subject can meet this requirement only if they are able to pick out other subjects, and, Strawson holds, one cannot pick out non-spatial subjects. Strawson concludes that when we self-refer we refer to an entity which has two sides or aspects, the physical and the mental, and not to a thing which possesses only the mental sort of feature, something else having the physical features. In effect, Strawson is representing ordinary thought as having the structure of what others have called a dual-aspect theory. Persons are things with two aspects – bodily and mental. He famously describes this as the idea that the concept of a person is a primitive concept. Second, since we can self-ascribe we must be able to other-ascribe, and that means that our methods for doing so must be adequate. As Strawson puts it, the criteria we employ for psychological ascription to others must be ‘logically adequate’. There cannot, therefore, be a genuine problem of other minds. Again, as in the first chapter, Strawson derives a significant epistemological consequence from his conceptual investigations. This famous chapter has exercised a fascination on philosophers thinking about ourselves and has been, perhaps, as much discussed as any piece of philosophical argument that Strawson wrote. (For interesting discussion of this chapter see Ayer 1963, Martin 1969, and Snowdon 2009.)

Finally, Strawson takes Leibniz as an opponent of some of his major theses and considers whether Leibniz might be able to avoid his conclusions. He argues, displaying considerable ingenuity in suggesting different interpretations of Leibniz, that Leibniz does not escape the problems.

Individuals then shifts focus to the subject-predicate distinction. Strawson’s initial aim is, in effect, to show that a novel theory is required. There are two reasons. First, we lack a proper explanation as to why absolutely anything can be the reference of a subject expression but only universals can be what predicates express. Second, he classifies the different accounts on offer and argues that they are either open to objection, or open to the demand for further explanation. The contrast between subjects and predicates that Strawson himself proposes for the central cases is that understanding a subject expression depends on the possession of empirical information, whereas the understanding of predicates does not. For example, to understand the name ‘James I’ I need to know something like; there was a king who ascended the throne in 1603. But to understand the predicate ‘… is triangular’, there is no empirical information about the world that I need to grasp. There need not be, or have been, any triangles at all. I have, rather, to grasp the principle of classification linked to the term. Strawson’s proposal is ingenious, but faces a number of questions. First, is it clear that all predicates express principles of classification the grasp of which involves no empirical knowledge? Consider such natural kind involving predicates as ‘is gold’ or ‘is a dog’. Second, is it obvious that understanding subject expressions requires accepting the empirical claims, as opposed to merely knowing what the assumptions are? Third, what entitles Strawson to attach a priority within his account to empirical claims? Why is non-empirical discourse, such as mathematics, to be regarded as secondary? Strawson then attempts to explain some other elucidations of the subject-predicate distinction as deriving from his own suggestion, and to develop a more general criterion on the basis of his own account having captured the core cases. In the next chapter Strawson asks the very interesting and novel question whether, just as the employment of (the core type of) subject expressions presupposes empirical information, there is a type of proposition the truth of which is presupposed by subject-predicate propositions in general. He picks out what he calls feature-placing sentences, such as ‘It is raining’. Such a sentence does not designate an object and describe it, rather the sentence affirms the presence of a feature. Strawson argues that where there are true subject-predicate propositions there must also be true feature-placing sentences. That is his answer to the question.

Individuals is far richer in argument than we have been able to convey. It occasioned, more or less immediately, considerable debate, and has continued to do so ever since. The epistemological conclusions that Strawson advanced, both about bodies and about other minds, were closely scrutinized. The overall arguments of the chapter on persons and the chapter on bodies were closely analysed. The contrast between descriptive and revisionary metaphysics, although briefly presented by Strawson, entered into the folk taxonomy of philosophy. As well as occasioning disagreement, Strawson’s book stimulated, over time, a series of books all of which could be described as essays in descriptive metaphysics with a similar focus to, though not with identical conclusions to, Individuals. These include Gareth Evans’ The Varieties of Reference, John Campbell’s Past, Space and Self, and David Wiggins, Sameness and Substance. (For a good general critical discussion of Individuals see Williams 1961.)

6. The Bounds of Sense

In 1966, seven years after the publication of Individuals Strawson published his third book, The Bounds of Sense, subtitled An essay on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason.

Strawson’s introduction to Kant arose out of the historical peculiarities of Oxford’s degree in Philosophy, Politics and Economics. At that time, the degree was structured such that there were two special subjects which those who wished to specialise in philosophy were obliged to take: Logic and Kant, the latter to be studied through the Critique of Pure Reason and the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Strawson found ‘a depth, a range, a boldness, and a power unlike anything I had previously encountered’ (Strawson 2003, 8).

Strawson lacks sympathy with Kant’s description of his task as the explanation of the possibility of synthetic a priori judgements. His approach to the first Critique is instead captured by his characteristically elegant title which contains a three-fold pun. First, it is an echo of a title that Kant considered for the Critique. Second and third, it plays on the ambiguity of the word ‘sense’ which can denote both sense-experience and sense-meaning. According to Strawson, Kant sets a lower limit on sense, arguing that ‘a certain minimal structure is essential to any conception of experience which we can make truly intelligible to ourselves’ (1966, 11). And he sets an upper limit on sense, holding ‘that the attempt to extend beyond the limits of experience the use of structural concepts, or of any other concepts, leads only to claims empty of meaning’. Finally, he does all of this from ‘a point outside [the bounds of sense], a point which, if they are rightly drawn, cannot exist’ (1966, 12). This point outside the bounds of sense is Kant’s metaphysics of transcendental idealism and the ‘imaginary subject of transcendental psychology’ (1966, 32). Strawson’s analytic project is to extract what is valuable of the first two strands from the supposed incoherence of the last.

With regards to the lower limit of sense and the constructive part of the first Critique, Strawson examines Kant’s argument that our experience must be of recognisably independent objective items, which are spatial and temporal, and which must satisfy some strong principles of permanence and causation. Strawson argues, with both care and brilliance, that Kant’s arguments are defective in various ways, but that somewhat weaker, yet nonetheless important, conclusions along similar lines can be defended. The most fecund and brilliant part of Strawson’s argument, and the part which has correspondingly attracted the most attention, is Strawson’s take on Kant’s Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, in which Strawson argues that ‘for a series of diverse experiences to belong to a single consciousness it is necessary that they should be so connected as to constitute a temporally extended experience of a unified objective world’ (1966, 97). That is, the experience of a self-conscious creature must involve, and be recognised as involving, perception of objects. Strawson’s reconstruction of the argument relies on the idea that the experiences of a self-conscious creature must provide room for the thought of experience itself. But one can apply that notion only in the context of the application of categories of things which are not experiences. However, such categories can be available to a subject only if its experiences provide it with the grounds for applying them, which involves the idea that its experiences relate it to non-experiences, that is to say, independent things. This argument is discussed in Rorty 1970, Harrison 1970, and Gomes 2016.

With regards to the upper limit to sense and the destructive part of the first Critique, Strawson examines Kant’s arguments in the Dialectic, and develops further requirements on our conception of experience analogous to those Kant advances. The discussion of the Paralogisms is particularly important for Strawson, containing, as he sees it, a deep insight about the failures of Cartesian dualism. Kant doesn’t combine, according to Strawson, this recognition of the failures of dualism with a correspondingly accurate account of ourselves, but this failure is to be explained by Kant’s transcendental idealism, and once shorn of this theory, Kant’s view is able to be supplemented with a plausible and realistic account of ourselves.

Finally, Strawson considers Kant’s transcendental idealism, and though he is ultimately unsympathetic, he explores its interpretation with great care and considers why Kant might have adopted it. One issue which he presses is whether there is a coherent way to fit ourselves as objects into a framework of transcendental idealism, given Kant’s seeming view that real objects, things in themselves, are unknowable and beyond our experience. The rejection of transcendental idealism requires Strawson to scrutinize Kant’s arguments for it, and he very carefully and sympathetically analyses and rejects Kant’s arguments about space and time, and geometry, and also the argument, presented in the Antinomies, that transcendental realism generates contradictions. Strawson further abandons much of Kant’s talk of mechanisms of synthesis in the generation of proper experience. Much of Strawson’s discussion here relies on his particular interpretation of transcendental idealism, which has been heavily criticised, for instance in Matthews 1969.

The Bounds of Sense had an immediate impact and continues to be extremely influential. Its interpretation of Kant quickly became a target of discussion in Kant scholarship, and Strawson returned to some issues of Kant interpretation in four essays which are collected in Strawson 1997. But it also, as Putnam remarks, ‘opened the way to a reception of Kant’s philosophy by analytic philosophers’ (Putnam 1998 in Hahn 1998, 273). One particular focus has been on Strawson’s use of a style of argument which he took Kant himself to have developed. These arguments have come to be called ‘transcendental arguments’. In Individuals and The Bounds of Sense they take the form of uncovering dependencies in our ways of thinking of the world. These dependencies can be taken to have anti-sceptical implications if claims about which the sceptic is sceptical can be shown to be required for the judgements which the sceptic makes, or ones which are involved in the sceptic’s own understanding of their view. In the years following its publication this anti-sceptical response was closely investigated, a large literature on it was generated, including notably a number of powerful contributions by the American philosopher Barry Stroud. (See Stroud 1968 and 2000.) One problem is that it is extraordinarily difficult to show that there are the conceptual dependencies which such transcendental arguments rely on. Interestingly, Strawson himself soon devised a different response to scepticism, but it is also true that the anti-sceptical approach that Strawson developed here remains appealing to a range of epistemologists, and this debate continues. Some discussion of the prospects for such arguments can be found in Stern 1999 and Gomes 2017a.

Some issues that have been raised about The Bounds of Sense are the following: (1) Does Strawson himself provide a satisfactory identification of a good question that Kant’s Critique can be regarded as trying to answer? At about the same time that Strawson published his book on Kant, Jonathan Bennett, in his book Kant’s Analytic suggested that Kant’s claims have to be regarded as unobviously analytic if they are to be correct. Is Strawson’s conception better than this? (2) Is Strawson’s interpretation of Kant – especially his account of transcendental idealism – correct? (3) Does Strawson’s version of Kant’s Transcendental Deduction of the Categories fare any better than Kant’s own? (4) Is Strawson right to think that there are insights in Kant’s project that can be separated from his transcendental idealism? And (5) does Strawson defend the anti-sceptical transcendental arguments cogently? Strawson’s relation to Kant is discussed in Glock 2003, Gomes 2017b, and the papers collected in a special issue of the European Journal of Philosophy (2016) marking the 50th anniversary of The Bounds of Sense.

7. Later Books

Strawson published three more books (other than collections of essays) in English (plus another in French which overlaps with one of those in English). In 1974 Subject and Predicate in Logic and Grammar appeared. Strawson himself described this book as ‘probably the most ambitious and certainly the one that has received the least attention’ (Strawson 2004, ix). He is right about the second point but not, we suspect, about the first. It is an ambitious book, but can hardly be ranked above either Individuals or The Bounds of Sense in that respect! In the first part of it Strawson presents a revised version of his account of the normal subject-predicate distinction, and also presents a partial theory of one particular case of subject expressions, namely proper names. In this he was responding to the emergence of direct referential accounts of the kind that Kripke had made popular. The discussion of the subject-predicate distinction is clearer and more direct than the one achieved in Individuals. What Strawson particularly brings out is that in ordinary language predicates have a complex role, involving the indication of universals, the expression of exemplification, plus expression also of temporal aspects. This functional complexity explains the correctness of certain other accounts of the distinction. No consensus about the assessment of Strawson’s proposal has emerged, the reason being that there has still been no very general interest in the subject-predicate distinction. In the second part, Strawson develops an approach to the understanding of grammar in which he attempts to relate grammar, in the sense of syntax, to much more basic functional specifications of the elements of a language, such that it becomes possible to see actual grammars as different ways to achieve these functional roles. Again, no consensus has emerged about this highly original way to think about grammar.

In 1985 Strawson published Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties. The book grew out of Strawson’s Woodbridge Lectures at Columbia University in 1983. It is, in a sense, a book of philosophy about philosophy. In each chapter Strawson focuses on a philosophical dispute in which there is a strong tendency to deny the reality or existence of an aspect which common sense affirms. The term ‘skepticism’ in the title stands for this general sceptical tendency. The first chapter concerns knowledge itself, denied by the philosophical sceptic. The later chapters consider the denial of certain aspects of ordinary human thought and experience, such as the reality of colour by scientifically inspired philosophers, and the reality of thought and experience by a certain sort of materialist. The thread linking these chapters is the sceptical thought that these aspects of our ordinary human experience are to be found wanting on account of their not being reducible to a more scientifically acceptable, physicalist base. In each case, Strawson’s aim is to deny the denial, and to explain, as one might say, how philosophers can have their cake and eat it. Against the sceptic about knowledge, Strawson stresses that the claims that they deny are presuppositions of all human thought and enquiry; against the reductive naturalist he goes further, not only stressing the inescapability of the ordinary human standpoint but also allowing it its own validity from its own particular standpoint.

The book is about philosophy in another sense, since it employs and illuminates some ideas from earlier philosophers, especially Hume and Wittgenstein, and reveals Strawson’s very deep understanding of them. The book marks, also, a further development in Strawson’s engagement with epistemological scepticism. Strawson expresses agreement with some of his earlier critics (in particular Stroud) that transcendental arguments are problematic as anti-sceptical devices, and suggests instead that scepticism can be set aside because no-one is persuaded by sceptical arguments. Philosophical sceptical doubts are not serious doubts, and so are not to be taken seriously. This further twist in Strawson’s epistemology has, again, inspired considerable debate, and no consensus has yet emerged. In particular, it remains to be determined how strongly we should take Strawson’s suggestions that certain claims are presuppositions on human thought and enquiry. One worry which remains is that Strawson’s point that no one is remotely inclined to accept the sceptic’s claim establishes at most that we regard such arguments as having the status of defending a paradoxical conclusion; it does not, in itself, explain why the conclusion is incorrect. However, as well as being an original contribution to epistemology, the book presents an approach to ontology which deserves to be called Oxonian, because it has been popular in Oxford. The idea is that there is no good reason not to be realists about most aspects of the world, including colour, mentality, meaning, and perhaps value, but that this does not require the defence of a reduction to some features of a supposedly more fundamental realm. This is a relaxed realism that does not set its face against the claims of natural science, but rather refuses to take them as calling into question the legitimacy of our ordinary ways of thinking about the world. This form of Oxford realism was influential on a generation of British philosophers, many of whom were Strawson’s students.

Finally, in 1992, Strawson published Analysis and Metaphysics: an Introduction to Philosophy. Strawson had given introductory lectures once he became a professor, and the lectures became this book. It is, again, a book about philosophy, contrasting different conceptions of the subject, and defending Strawson’s own conception of the nature and value of analysis. Of importance here is Strawson’s distinction between reductive and connective analysis. Strawson’s attitude is that the aim of analysis is to reveal conceptual links and connexions, thereby illuminating some features of our concepts, but that there is no favoured basic level of thought to which it is the goal of philosophical analysis to reduce everything else. Echoing the name for his conception of ontology, one might call that a conception of relaxed analysis. Strawson in fact repeatedly wrote about the nature of philosophy, and the views in this book are his final conclusions. It is also a book in which he practises what he preaches in relation to certain chosen areas, including, for example, the topics of causation and explanation, experience, meaning, and freedom. Whether it is a good introductory book or not, it is certainly a deep and interesting treatment of its topics for the non-beginner! Strawson himself prepares the reader by remarking brilliantly that the book ‘though introductory … is not elementary. There is no such thing as elementary philosophy. There is no shallow end to the philosophical pool’ (Strawson 1992, vii).

8. “Freedom and Resentment”

Strawson always joked that he would turn to moral philosophy only when his powers were waning. He wrote very little on the topic, commenting later on his ‘Freedom and Resentment’ and ‘Social Morality and Individual Ideal’, that ‘[b]etween them, these two papers effectively embody all I have thought or have to say in a philosophical area which, important as I recognize it to be, I have never found as intellectually gripping as those to which I have given more attention’ (Strawson 1998, 11). Nevertheless, ‘Freedom and Resentment’ (Strawson 1962) is perhaps now Strawson’s most famous and widely discussed paper.

Strawson’s aim in this paper is to dissolve the so-called problem of determinism and responsibility. He does this by drawing a contrast between two different perspectives we can take on the world: the ‘participant’ and ‘objective’ standpoints. These perspectives involve different explanations of other people’s actions. From the objective point of view, we see people as elements of the natural world, causally manipulated and manipulable in various ways. From the participant point of view, we see others as appropriate objects of ‘reactive attitudes’, attitudes such as gratitude, anger, sympathy and resentment, which presuppose the responsibility of other people. These two perspectives are opposed to one another, but both are legitimate.

Strawson’s paper notes two broad ways in which we can withdraw from the participant perspective. The first involves cases in which the agent remains someone to whom reactive attitudes are appropriate but where something about the circumstances means that the attitude is not appropriate in this particular case. Perhaps you stood on my foot because you were pushed. In this case, you have a good excuse for your behaviour and resentment is no longer appropriate. The second involves cases in which the agent has more or less permanent incapacities which remove them from the domain of reactive attitudes in general. Perhaps the person who stood on my foot is a child or in the grip of some psychopathological illness. In these cases, we cease to treat the agent as a fitting object of reactive attitudes, even if only temporarily.

Strawson takes these observations about the reactive attitudes to bear on the reconciliation of determinism and responsibility because of the inescapability of the reactive attitudes. They are a central part of what it is to be human. The truth of determinism cannot, then, force us to give up the participant standpoint, because the reactive attitudes are too deeply embedded in our humanity. Between determinism and responsibility there can be no conflict.

‘Freedom and Resentment’ has spawned an extensive literature. It introduced the notion of reactive attitudes to debates about free will and responsibility and one set of questions raised by the paper concerns the nature of these attitudes. Strawson characterises them initially as those belonging to involvement or participation with others in interpersonal human relationships and he takes them to target the good will of others as manifested in their behaviour. Others have broaded the notion, instead emphasising their connection to holding someone to some expectation or demand (see Wallace 1994). Another set of questions concerns the relation between the reactive attitudes and moral responsibility. Gary Watson, in a paper first published in 1987, reads Strawson as holding that the reactive attitudes are constitutive of moral responsibility and raises a challenge for such a view in explaining our attitudes towards cases of extreme evil (Watson 2004). Others have queried whether Strawson intends the reactive attitudes to have such explanatory priority (Alvarez 2021)

A final set of questions concerns the inescapability of the participant stance and its role in the overall structure of Strawson’s argument. Some have emphasised the connections with Strawson’s reading of Hume and Wittgenstein as set out in Skepticism and Naturalism; see, for example, Russell 1992. Others such as Allais 2014 have emphasised the connections with Kant, not least the suggestive affinity with Kant’s attempt to dissolve the problem of free will in the Critique of Pure Reason. More recently, Hieronymi 2020 provides a book-length defence of a ‘social naturalist’ reading of Strawson’s paper and De Mesel 2022 traces the connection between ‘Freedom and Resentment’ and Strawson’s later (and underappreciated) writings on the same themes.

Strawson’s paper and many of its important responses are collected together in McKenna and Russell 2008. A set of papers published to mark its 50th anniversary are collected in Shoemaker and Tognazzini 2014.

9. Some Themes in Strawson’s Writings

Strawson contributed ideas to debates about a wide range of topics, only some of which can be described here. We have selected five areas to describe.

9.1 Perception

Strawson made a major contribution to the theory of perception. His conception is articulated to some extent in The Bounds of Sense, but also in a series of articles, of which the most famous is ‘Perception and Its Objects’ (1979). He suggests that the concept of perception should be analysed as a causal concept. His version of the causal theory differs in two main respects from that of Grice, who also famously defended a similar analysis. First, Strawson’s argument for view turns on the idea that perception is essentially a method of acquiring knowledge; he suggests that this requires that the concept of perception is a causal concept. Second, Strawson claims that Grice’s attempt to spell out the right causal chain by picking it out via examples is circular, and he instead invokes notions of match and range. Strawson’s version attracted considerable attention. More important is Strawson’s claim that there is no way to describe perceptual experience in terms which are not physical-object concept involving. That this can be done, he thinks, is the crucial mistake of the traditional empiricist model, as represented, for example, in the thought of A. J. Ayer. According to Strawson we are not reading in or interpreting our experiences when we respond to them by making objective judgements; we are simply endorsing their content. Strawson therefore holds that it is myth to suppose that we can locate a level of claim on the basis of which we can defend the validity of our application of physical object concepts. Rather, our experience is ‘saturated’ by those concepts themselves. In a more recent terminology, Strawson holds that perception involves the occurrence in us of experiences having objective representational content, and that there can be hallucinations with a similar content but which are not properly perceptual because the complex causal requirements for being perceptual are not met. Strawson’s claims about perception are discussed in Snowdon 1998.

9.2 Language

Strawson’s contribution to the philosophy of language is also far more extensive and important than so far indicated. He developed his views in relation to the leading ideas of others about language. One conception that he opposed is that of Quine. Writing with Grice, he argued that Quine’s criticisms of the idea of analyticity rest on a commitment to a kind of reduction that itself is simply a dogma. Moreover, repeatedly over the next twenty years he argued that Quine’s sceptical approach to meaning and related notions is both unfounded and also wrong in that it deprives us of notions that we cannot do without in the study of logic and language. Strawson also engaged with Davidson’s account of meaning, mainly in his inaugural lecture ‘Meaning and Truth’ (1969), but also elsewhere. Strawson suggests that truth is itself a notion secondary to saying (and communication) and cannot play the role in an account of meaning that Davidson proposed. His other reaction to the Davidsonian programme, which accepted a notion of logical form for natural language sentences specified in the complex formulae of predicate logic, was to deny that there is a requirement to map ordinary language onto artificial logical structures. This attitude placed Strawson in opposition to a movement of thought that swept through Oxford’s younger philosophers during his time as a professor. And what Strawson never quite achieved was an alternative explanation to Davidson’s of what a theory of meaning should be. His attitude to truth, and his slogan that ordinary language has no precise logic, implied that centring an analysis of meaning on truth conditions and a search for logical forms in natural language expressible in the predicate calculus was misguided. But he did not give a positive account of how we do understand linguistic utterances.

Strawson also made important contributions to the assessment of Austin’s theory of speech acts and Grice’s own model of meaning. Finally, he responded to the anti-realist approach developed by Dummett, which also gained its adherents, in ‘Scruton and Wright on Anti-Realism’ (1976), a brief but brilliant critique which argued that there are no obvious reasons to adopt the anti-realist account of truth, and moreover that it is hard to make that account consistent with what appear to be obvious facts about the knowability (or unknowability) of our psychological lives and the past.

9.3 History of Philosophy

Another theme that needs stressing is Strawson’s engagement with the history of philosophy. His work on Kant in The Bounds of Sense and in other articles is perhaps the most straightforward example of this engagement, but it is not the only instance. In Individuals and elsewhere he wrote about Descartes, especially his account of the self. Leibniz is the hero, or perhaps anti-hero, of chapter 4 of Individuals. Hume and Wittgenstein are the central characters in Skepticism and Naturalism, and he wrote about Spinoza, especially his theory of freedom. From the last century, he wrote about Wittgenstein, in a famous review of the Philosophical Investigations, published in Mind (reprinted in Strawson 2011), and also G.E. Moore. These writings reveal both a deep knowledge and a deep understanding of these thinkers, never unsympathetic and always able to see the wood as well as the trees. Strawson had a sense of the age of philosophical problems, and of the insights from the great dead philosophers that need preserving and renewing.

9.4 Scepticism and knowledge

We have set out, to some extent, the development of Strawson’s epistemological views, but have not described his earliest proposal in relation to the problem of induction. In An Introduction to Logical Theory he pioneered what came to be called the ‘analytical solution’, according to which there cannot be any question as to the rationality of the employment of induction, since by being rational we mean, amongst other things, using induction. The question whether induction is rational resembles, according to this approach, the question whether the law is legal. Since ‘being legal’ means ‘being in accordance with the law’, there can be no question about the legality of the law. This remains a discussed approach. In Individuals he talked of the satisfaction of certain conditions as being criterial for the ascription of some disputed claims, and justified that by transcendental arguments. The Bounds of Sense can be regarded as an extended anti-sceptical transcendental argument. Finally, in Skepticism and Naturalism he attempts to oppose the sceptic by appealing to the inescapability of the claims opposed by the sceptic. The unity amongst all these proposals is that the response to scepticism is never the production of a proof or demonstration based on a level of thought external or prior to the discourse in question. Each solution aims to turn aside scepticism in some other way. Strawson’s ingenuity in devising such responses is very impressive and he is the source of at least three major anti-sceptical approaches.

10. Conclusion

Strawson did not seek to make disciples, nor did he write too much by way of defence of his views against critics (except, as it were, when he had to). However, he produced a continuous flow of original and profound, and elegantly expressed, philosophy dealing with a very broad range of topics. He thereby exerted a considerable influence on philosophy, both during his lifetime and, indeed, since his death.


Primary Literature

A. Books by Strawson

  • 1952, Introduction to Logical Theory, London: Methuen.
  • 1959, Individuals, London: Methuen.
  • 1966, The Bounds of Sense, London: Methuen.
  • 1971, Logico-Linguistic Papers, London: Methuen.
  • 1974a, Freedom and Resentment and Other Essays, London: Methuen.
  • 1974b, Subject and Predicate in Logic and Grammar, London: Methuen, reprinted in 2004 by the Ashgate Press.
  • 1985a , Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, London: Methuen, and New York: Columbia University Press.
  • 1985b, Analyse et Metaphysique, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • 1992, Analysis and Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1997, Entity and Identity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 2011, Philosophical Writings, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

B. Selected Articles by Strawson

  • 1950a, “On Referring”, Mind, 59: 320–344; reprinted in Strawson 1971.
  • 1950b, “Truth”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, reprinted in Strawson 1971.
  • 1956, (with P. Grice), “In Defense of a Dogma”, Philosophical Review, 50: 141–158.
  • 1962, “Freedom and Resentment”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 48: 1–25; reprinted in Strawson 1974a.
  • 1964, “Identifying Reference and Truth-Values”, Theoria, 30(2): 96–118; page references to the reprint in Strawson 1971.
  • 1969, “Meaning and Truth”, reprinted in Strawson 1971
  • 1976, “Scruton and Wright on Anti-Realism”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 77: 15–21.
  • 1979, “Perception and its Objects”, in Perception and Identity: Essays Presented to A. J. Ayer, G. F. Macdonald (ed.) London: Macmillan.

Secondary Literature

  • Allais, L., 2014, “Freedom and Forgiveness” in Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility, Volume 2: ‘Freedom and Resentment’ at 50, D. Shoemaker and N. Tognazzini (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Alvarez, M., 2021, “P. F. Strawson, Moral Theories and ‘The Problem of Blame’: ‘Freedom and Resentment’ Revisited”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 95(1): 183–203,
  • Austin, J. L., 1950, “Truth” reprinted in J. L. Austin, Philosophical Papers, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1961.
  • Ayer, A. J., 1963, “The Concept of a Person” in The Concept of a Person and other essays, London: Macmillan.
  • Bennett, J., 1966, Kant’s Analytic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brown, C., 2006, Peter Strawson, Stocksfield: Acumen.
  • Campbell, J., 1994, Past, Space and Self, London: MIT Press.
  • Cassam, Q., 1997, Self and World, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2005, “Space and Objective Experience” in Thought, Reference and Experience: Themes from the Philosophy of Gareth Evans, J. Bermúdez (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • European Journal of Philosophy, Volume 24 (2016) – a set of papers marking the 50th anniversary of The Bounds of Sense.
  • De Mensel, B., 2022,  “Taking the Straight Path. P.F. Strawson’s Later Work on Freedom and Responsibility”, PhilosophersImprint, 22(0) doi: 10.3998/phimp.782.
  • Evans, G., 1980, “Things without the Mind”, in Van Straaten 1980.
  • –––, 1982, The Varieties of Reference, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Glock, H. (ed.), 2003, Strawson and Kant, Oxford: Clarendon Press
  • Gomes, A., 2016, “Unity, Objectivity, and the Passivity of Experience”, European Journal of Philosophy, 24: 946–969.
  • –––, 2017a, “Perception and Reflection”, Philosophical Perspectives, 31: 131–152.
  • –––, 2017b, “Kant, the Philosophy of Mind, and Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy”, in A. Gomes & A. Stephenson (eds.), Kant and the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hacker, P. M., 2002, “Strawson’s Concept of a Person”, in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 102(1): 21–40.
  • Hahn, L. E. (ed.), 1998, The Philosophy of P. F. Strawson, Chicago and Lasalle, Illinois: Open Court
  • Harrison, R., 1970, “Strawson on outer objects”, Philosophical Quarterly, 20: 213–221.
  • Hieronymi, P., 2020, Freedom, Resentment, and the Metaphysics of Morals, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Huang, Y., 2007, Pragmatics, Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • Martin, C. B., 1969, “People” in Contemporary Philosophy in Australia (eds.) Brown R. & Rollins C. D., London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Matthews, H., 1969, “Strawson on Transcendental Idealism”, Philosophical Quarterly, 19: 204–220.
  • Philosophia, Volume 10 (1981) – a special issue dedicated to the philosophy of P. F. Strawson.
  • McKenna, M., & Russell, P. (eds.), 2008, Free Will and Reactive Attitudes: Perspectives on P.F. StrawsonsFreedom and resentment”, Farnham: Ashgate.
  • Putnam, H., 1998, “Strawson and Scepticism” in Hahn 1998, pp. 273–287.
  • Rorty, R., 1970, “Strawson’s Objectivity Argument”, Review of Metaphysics, 24: 207–244.
  • Russell, B., 1905, “On Denoting”, reprinted in Logic and Knowledge, R. C. Marsh (ed.), London: Allen and Unwin.
  • Russell, P., 1992, “Strawson’s Way of Naturalizing Responsibility”, Ethics, 102: 287–302.
  • Searle, J., 1998, “Truth: A reconsideration of Strawson’s Views” in Hahn 1998, pp. 385–401.
  • Sen, P. K., & Verma R. R. (eds.), 1995, The Philosophy of P. F. Strawson, New Dehli: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.
  • Shoemaker, D., & Tognazzini, N. (eds.), 2015, Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility (Volume 2: ‘Freedom and Resentment’ at 50), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Snowdon, P.F., 1998, “Strawson on the Concept of Perception” in Hahn 1998, pp. 293–310.
  • –––, 2006, “P.F. Strawson: Individuals”, in Central Works of Philosophy (Volume 5: The Twentieth Century: Quine and After), J. Shand (ed.), London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2009, “‘Persons’ and Persons”, Organon F, 4: 449–476.
  • Stern, R. (ed.), 1999, Transcendental Arguments: Problems and Prospects, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stroud, B., 1968, “Transcendental Arguments”, Journal of Philosophy, 65(9): 241–256; reprinted in Stroud 2000.
  • –––, 2000, “The Synthetic A Priori in Strawson’s Kantianism” in B. Stroud, Understanding Human Knowledge: Philosophical Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press; reprinted in Glock 2003.
  • –––, 2000 Understanding Human Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Van Straaten, Z. (ed.), 1980, Philosophical Subjects; Essays Presented to P. F. Strawson, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wallace, R., 1994, Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Warnock, G. J., 1964, “A Problem about Truth” in G. Pitcher (ed.), Truth, Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
  • Watson, G., 2004, “Responsibility and the Limits of Evil: Variations on a Strawsonian Theme”, in G. Watson, Agency and Answerability, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiggins, D., 1980, Sameness and Substance, London: Basil Blackwell.
  • Williams, B., 1961, “Mr. Strawson on Individuals”, Philosophy, 36(138): 309–332; reprinted in B. Williams, Problems of the Self, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.


The SEP editors would like to thank Jasper Pirasteh for sending us a list of editorial suggestions for improving the language and punctuation in this entry.

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