The Concept of Emotion in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Tue Mar 1, 2011; substantive revision Mon Jul 19, 2021

In Indian literature, emotions are discussed in several different contexts (Bilimoria and Wenta 2015b; Torella 2015): first, within aesthetics (rasa). The word rasa can mean juice, sap, essence, condiment or even flavour and refers to the different sentiments invoked by a work of art, for example a piece of music. Secondly, emotions are discussed within the context of the bhakti (devotional) movement. Here particular emphasis is placed on cultivating the emotion of love for a supreme being, e.g., Śiva. Thirdly, they are discussed in various tantric traditions. These traditions form a counterbalance to the ascetic ideal of classical philosophical texts (fourth context in which emotions are discussed) in that they encourage “living out” emotions (and desires) without forming any attachment to them. This entry focuses on the emotions in this fourth context, namely classical Indian philosophical thinking, which includes Brāhmaṇical as well as Buddhist texts, among others. While there is no equivalent for the term “emotion” in Sanskrit, the concept nevertheless plays an important role in Indian philosophy. Terms used in Sanskrit texts include vedanā (feeling) and bhāva (feeling) as well as names of individual emotions, such as rāga (love, attraction), dveṣa (hatred, aversion), harṣa (joy), bhaya (fear) and śoka (sorrow). One of the reasons why emotions are philosophically interesting in India and the West is their relationship with the mental phenomenon of vijñāna or jñāna which is translated as “cognition”. The relationship between emotion and cognition is important for any account of reason and rationality. While the importance of the emotions for rational deliberation and decision-making has been acknowledged in recent discussions in the philosophy of mind, the history of Western philosophy contains many views, for example those of Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics, which emphasize the dangerous and destructive role of the emotions. At the heart of these views lies a division of our mental lives into cognitions and feelings. Cognitions are representational thoughts. They are often regarded as rational because they are capable of representing the external world and therefore they provide us with access to the external world, based on the best available evidence. So, according to this view of rationality, when I think that there is a book on the table, based on my available evidence, and there really is one, then my thought is rational. However, if I am hallucinating that there is a book on the table, my thought that there is a book might also be rational because the available evidence points towards this thought. In order to make sure that our thoughts represent reality correctly, we require an account of what counts as good evidence, which is one of the main foci of epistemology in Indian and Western philosophy. Nevertheless, cognitions derive their status as thoughts capable of rationality from the fact that they have objects which represent the external world. By contrast, feelings are some of the non-representational attitudes one can have towards the objects of the representations of our thoughts. For example, when a person thinks about her daughters, she has a cognition which represents her daughters. The objects of her thought are her daughters and her thought picks them out among various objects and subjects in the world. There are several ways in which these objects can be picked out: one can simply have the thought that one has two daughters or one’s thought can be “coloured” with love and affection. This “colouring” of thought is often regarded as an affect. Together with the thought, it accounts for an emotion. So, the emotion of love, for example, is the thought of the object of love plus an affect. The affect is non-representational and regarded as a “mere” feeling.

The reason why many philosophers regard the emotions as an obstacle to rational thought is the influence of the non-representational feeling. The fact that feelings do not seem to have objects means, according to some views, that they can interfere with rational thought. According to these views, rational thought, which is representational and therefore object-directed, is subject to disturbing interferences from the feelings. The feelings themselves, however, are non-rational because they arise due to some physical imbalance in the body, for example through an imbalance of the various “humours”. This imbalance can negatively influence rational thought. An example is the person who acts against her better judgment because she is in the grip of some feeling. This is of course also the basis for the term “passion” as something that we “suffer”, which was discussed by many philosophers in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, e.g., Descartes, Spinoza and Hume. Since rational thought is an ideal for many philosophers and the feelings can interfere with this ideal, the natural consequence seems to be to advocate for the extinction or at least the control of the feelings and, as a consequence, of the emotions. This is what many philosophers throughout the history of philosophy have done, most notably of course the Stoics. While they often recognize that the emotions contain a cognitive, and therefore potentially rational, element, they try to uncover this element by advocating its separation from the affect. Of course, if the affect were to be purged from the emotion, the resulting cognition would cease to be an emotion.

There is a parallel between this Western view and a prejudice that attaches to Indian philosophy. The prejudice is that Indian philosophy, because of its soteriological nature with its emphasis on the attainment of liberation, is about freeing the mind from feelings and emotions because they constitute an attachment to the world. While this is true of some schools of Indian philosophy, it is by no means a justified account of Indian philosophy as a whole. The different positions within Indian philosophy on this topic are more complex, as is the case with regard to Western philosophy. This article introduces some of the main positions regarding the emotions and their relation to cognitions in Indian philosophy. The sections of the article roughly correspond to the division into philosophical schools in classical Indian philosophy. Since arguably Buddhist philosophers have paid more attention to those phenomena that Western philosophers would classify as emotions than other Indian philosophers, the Buddhist account of the emotions will be discussed in more detail than the other accounts.

1. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account of the emotions

The discussion of this account will focus on the Nyāya-sūtras, Vātsyāyana’s Nyāya-bhāṣya, Uddyotakara’s Nyāya-vārttika and Jayanta Bhaṭṭa’s Nyāya-mañjarī. In addition, the Vaiśeṣika-sūtras together with Śaṅkara Miśra’s Vaiśeṣika-sūtra-upaskāra will be mentioned. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account of the emotions involves a strict division into cognition (jñāna) and mental phenomena that include a feeling aspect, such as love or attraction (rāga) and aversion (dveṣa). One of the main reasons for this is the acceptance of the existence of a permanent immaterial self (ātman) by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. According to their arguments, the ātman is a substance (dravya) which possesses several qualities (guṇas), such as cognition, desire, effort, aversion, pleasure and pain. This enumeration shows that there is no common Sanskrit term for the concept “emotion” in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika texts. One general term used is saṃvedana which translates as “feeling”, for example sukha-saṃvedana (feeling of pleasure).

The important aspect of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account is that the individual emotions, such as attachment and aversion are regarded as defects (doṣas) [NB 1.1.18] or impurities (upadhā) [VS and VSU 6.2.4]. These defects are the result of ignorance (mithyājñāna) and they give rise to actions that lead to the feeling of pleasure or pain. The reason why this is regarded as negative is that the feeling of pleasure and pain is responsible for our attachment to the world and, more importantly, for our attachment to the self and therefore presents an obstacle to liberation. For this reason, any emotion is deemed to have a negative influence on the individual. However, NV 1.1.22 mentions one exception, namely the desire for eternal pleasure and absence from pain which is final liberation. While, strictly speaking, a desire is not an emotion, it usually has the same negative effect because it results in attachment to the object of desire. The desire for eternal pleasure, however, is not detrimental to liberation; in fact it is a precondition for liberation.

The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers clearly distinguish between pleasure (sukha) and pain (duḥkha) on the one hand and the experience of pleasure (sukha-pratyaya) and pain (duḥkha-pratyaya) on the other hand. Pain and pleasure are qualities of the soul but they need to be cognized by the self in order to be experienced. This means that cognition has a special status among the qualities of self: no other quality can be experienced without cognition.

Another reason why cognition is an important quality is that it is not necessarily a defect whereas the other qualities are always defects. The defects fall into 3 groups: i) attraction (rāga), ii) aversion (dveṣa) and iii) illusion (moha) [NS 4.1.3]. Among the first group we find love, selfishness and greed. The second group includes anger, jealousy, envy, malice and resentment. The Third group encompasses error, suspicion, pride and negligence. These groupings show that, according to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account, there are no positive emotions. Even love, which is regarded as a positive emotion in many cultures, is ultimately a defect because all emotions lead to attachment and error.

The opposite of all three types of defect is described in NB 4.1.4 as knowledge of truth (tattvajñāna), right knowledge (samyaṅmati), truthful cognition (āryaprajñā) and right apprehension (sambodha). This shows that, according to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers, emotions are defects because they prevent our thinking from turning into right knowledge. This knowledge can thus only be had if we eliminate these defects and thereby our emotions.

According to NS 4.1.6, illusion is the worst defect because without it the others are not going to appear. This means that one has to be under an illusion already in order to think that the object of one’s attraction provides pleasure and the object of one’s aversion pain. In fact, NS and NB 4.1.58 state that ordinary pleasure should be regarded as pain:

The ordinary man, addicted to pleasure, regards pleasure as the highest end of man, and feels that there is nothing better than pleasure; and hence when pleasure has been attained, he feels happy and contented, feeling that all he had to attain had been attained; and under the influence of illusion, he becomes attached to the pleasure, as also to the things that bring about its accomplishment; becoming so attached, he makes an attempt to obtain the pleasure; and while he is trying for it, there come down on him several kinds of pain, in the form of birth, old age, disease, death, the contact of disagreeable things, separation from agreeable things, the non-fulfilment of desires and so forth; and yet all these several kinds of pain he regards as ‘pleasure.’ In fact pain is a necessary factor in pleasure; without suffering some pain no pleasure can be obtained; hence as leading to pleasure, this pain is regarded by the man as pleasure; and such a man, having his mind obsessed by this notion of ‘pleasure’, never escapes from metempsychosis, which consists of a running series of births and deaths. And it is as an antidote of this notion of pleasure that we have the teaching that all this should be looked upon as ‘pain.’ [NB 4.1.58, p. 1553]

This quote shows that ultimately the feeling of pleasure is an illusion and that our ordinary existence is necessarily beset with pain. This demonstrates the link between feeling and error, according to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. Both pleasure and pain are two factors that are responsible for our notion of “I” that prevents us from attaining final liberation. Therefore, the pursuit of pleasure is futile and ought to be abandoned in favour of final liberation.

For the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers, pleasure and pain are not forms of cognition because they have different causes than cognitions [VS and VSU 10.1.5–6]. This means that we can have a cognition without a feeling and we can also have a feeling without a cognition. In addition, they are experienced differently [NM, vol. 1, p. 118]. This separation between cognitions and feelings, together with the view that feelings are defects that disturb cognitions, means that feelings are regarded as purely negative. They lead to an attachment to the world which causes a sense of self and this sense of self provides an obstacle to liberation.

The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika view shows similarities with the received view of the emotions in Western philosophy with regard to the point that feelings are a disturbance of cognition. However, in many Western accounts cognition is regarded as an end in itself because it coincides with the ideal of rational thinking, whereas according to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers cognition is not an end in itself. Rather, it is supposed to lead to the conclusion that final liberation is the ultimate aim and final liberation means the end of cognition.

2. The Vedānta account of the emotions

In his commentary on the Brahma-sūtras, Śaṃkara makes the well-known argument that the self (ātman) exists because its existence is the only way to account for the idea of a subject of experience. This argument relies on the idea that the self has certain mental qualities, which are termed manas (mind), buddhi (intellect), vijñāna (cognition) or citta (consciousness), depending on what mental function is ascribed to them. Different mental functions are doubt, resolution, egoism or recollection [BSBh 2.4.6]. These mental functions, regardless of how they are referred to, have several qualities or modifications, including desire, imagination, doubt, faith, want of faith, memory, forgetfulness, shame, reflection and fear [BSBh 2.3.32] as well as love, aversion, pleasure and pain [BSBh 2.3.29]. This means that, according to Śaṃkara, the mind’s cognitive and emotional abilities are the qualities of our mental functioning which is different from the self.

At the heart of Śaṃkara’s teaching lies the notion that the true knowledge of the ātman is knowledge that is devoid of any of the above-mentioned qualities. In this respect one can find a similarity between the Nyāya school and Śaṃkara because for both of them cognitive and emotional qualities are due to false knowledge or ignorance of the true self. This means that the removal of ignorance results in a removal of emotions as well as cognitions. However, it is clear that the emotions present the main obstacle for the realization of the true self because desire and aversion lead to attachment and clinging which cause us to neglect the search for liberation that is crucial to Vedānta teaching. So, while Śaṃkara distinguishes between what Western philosophers would call cognitions and emotions, he does not present a purely cognitive state of mind without emotions as the ideal state of mind because such a state would be impossible. By definition, any purely cognitive state of mind presupposes the existence of a mind or intellect. For Śaṃkara, however, the problem is that a mind will always have certain qualities that would be called emotive in Western philosophy, such as desire, aversion, hatred, pleasure or pain. So, as long there are cognitions, there will also be emotions. Therefore, both must be eliminated in order for the self to attain liberation. On this point, Śaṃkara agrees with the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. While Śaṃkara distinguishes between emotions and cognitions, his distinction is not as pronounced as that of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. He regards both as qualities of the mind or intellect.

3. The Sāṃkhya-Yoga account of the emotions

Unlike the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika and Vedānta accounts of the emotions, the Sāṃkhya-Yoga account does not draw a fundamental distinction between feelings and cognitions. The reason for this is that the Sāṃkhya account rests on the division between puruṣa and prakṛti. The former is pure consciousness and does not contain any cognitions or feelings whereas prakṛti is primordial matter and has the three qualities (guṇas) sattva, rajas and tamas, which are aligned with different feelings: sattva with pleasure (sukha), rajas with pain (duḥkha) and tamas with confusion or illusion (moha). The terms sattva, rajas and tamas are difficult to translate but are sometimes rendered as “reflection”, “activity” and “inertia”. The important point about this dualist structure for the emotions is that, according to the Sāṃkhya account, both cognition and feeling belong to the realm of prakṛti which means that they are material. This stands in contrast to many dualist accounts in the history of Western philosophy, for example that of Descartes, according to which cognitions are immaterial whereas emotions or passions are material, thus making it easier to oppose the two. Larson and Bhattacharya (1987) summarize the difference between Western and Sāṃkhya dualism in the following way:

[A]ccording to Sāṃkhya philosophy, the experiences of intellect, egoity, and mind, and the “raw feels” such as frustration or satisfaction—or, in other words, what conventional dualists would consider to be “inherently private”—are simply subtle reflections of primordial materiality, a primordial materiality undergoing continuous transformation by means of its constituent unfolding as spontaneous activity, reflective discerning, and determinate formulation. Thus, the modern reductive materialists’ claim that “sensations are identical with certain brain processes” would have a peculiar counterpart in the Sāṃkhya claim that “awarenesses” [Sanskrit terms omitted] are identical with certain guṇa modalities. (Larson and Bhattacharya 1987, p. 76)

The relationship between puruṣa and prakṛti in Sāṃkhya philosophy is complex: puruṣa as pure consciousness is characterized by inaction (akartṛbhāva) and pure presence (sākṣitva). It does not stand in any relation with prakṛti, which comprises the material world, including mental processes. Nevertheless, puruṣa forms the foundation of prakṛti. This means that puruṣa provides the meaning for all material processes. Thus prakṛti exists for puruṣa and it is only because of this that the world is not simply a collection of meaningless physical processes. In addition, the intellect as part of prakṛti is supposed to realize that it is not consciousness and it is to become aware of pure consciousness as the way to liberation. This means that the intellect is supposed to understand the contentless pure consciousness but of course in order to do so it would have to become contentless itself, which seems impossible. Therefore, the intellect can only achieve this in an indirect way without cognition. Instead, we require meditative or yogic exercises to understand the difference between puruṣa and prakṛti.

In spite of the fact that cognition and emotion are both material, emotions have a negative connotation in Sāṃkhya philosophy. In this regard the account is similar to that of many Western philosophers. However, in Western philosophy the idea is to have cognition free from emotion. By contrast, the Sāṃkhya philosophers do not think of cognition as a desirable end in itself. Rather, their idea is that ultimate liberation lies in the recognition of puruṣa by prakṛti. This means that our everyday experience of ourselves as conscious intellects with cognitions and emotions is an obstacle on the way to realizing what pure contentless consciousness is. In fact, Sāṃkhya philosophers argue that our experience of ourselves as conscious beings is a mistake that needs to be rectified in order to achieve liberation. This realization is extremely difficult to achieve and therefore Sāṃkhya proposes first of all to clear the mind of the passions [SSu 2.15] by separating them from cognition and then to free the mind from cognition in order to comprehend contentless consciousness. So emotions or passions are regarded as negative but they are not contrasted with cognitions because cognitions themselves are supposed to be overcome in order to understand puruṣa.

In the Yogasūtras, Patañjali provides a method for understanding the difference between puruṣa and prakṛti via a series of exercises that aim at stripping away all of the disturbing influences from the mind, including what Western philosophers would classify as emotions. In fact, Patañjali argues that the mind is affected by afflictions (kleśas) that keep it from becoming clear about the difference between puruṣa and prakṛti. In YS 2.3, Patañjali lists the afflictions:

Ignorance (avidyā), egoism (asmitā), attachment (rāga), aversion (dveṣa) and adherence [to mundane existence] (abhiniveśa) are afflictions. [YS 2.3]

These afflictions need to be removed in order to achieve liberation. Unlike in many Western accounts of the emotions, the removal of the afflictions is not supposed to lead to a form of rational thinking that is divorced from any emotion. Rather, rational thinking itself needs to be overcome, in order to achieve true liberation by separating puruṣa from prakṛti.

The main reason why emotions such as attachment and aversion are regarded as afflictions is that they lead to a desire to change our circumstances and therefore to an attachment to the world. This attachment, however, is precisely what is to be given up in order to achieve liberation. So, Patañjali and his commentators argue that emotions lead to desire and therefore have to be given up as one of the root causes of ignorance that causes attachment to the world. Only then can the mind discriminate between puruṣa and prakṛti.

One interesting parallel between Western accounts of the emotions and Patañjali is the use of the “colouring” (uparāga) or “coloured” (uparaktam) metaphor with regard to the mind [e.g., in YS 4.23]. Patañjali claims that the mind is “coloured” by all of the objects it knows, including cognitions and emotions. This means that in order to understand the difference between itself and pure consciousness (puruṣa), it has to free itself from these colourings and become pure. Only then can it recognize that it is different from the puruṣa which cannot be known in itself because it cannot become an object of the mind. Vyāsa, in his commentary on YS 4.23, explains that the mind itself is an object that appears as a conscious subject which is why many philosophers mistake it for the subject. However, once the mind becomes empty of all objects the difference between the mind and puruṣa reveals itself. Vyāsa makes the argument that a mind which is empty of all objects can still know itself and thus it would have to become an object in the mind, i.e., itself. In other words, cognition would have to be cognized by itself. This, however, is impossible, according to him. Instead, puruṣa shows itself as that which makes cognition possible. In this sense, puruṣa can be compared to Husserl’s idea of the “transcendental ego”. So, puruṣa can only reveal itself indirectly by emptying the mind of all cognitions, including emotions. This means that emotions are regarded as an obstacle to liberation but at the same time, they share this designation with other cognitions of the world.

The Sāṃkhya-Yoga account of the emotions thus shows some similarities with the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika account in that both regard the emotions as the first obstacle to liberation. Both accounts differ from many Western views in that they regard emotion-free thinking not as an end in itself but as the next obstacle to be removed. For the Sāṃkhya-Yoga philosophers there is a distinction between veridical and non-veridical cognition (vijñāna). The latter is classified as ignorance (avidyā), which, together with certain emotions, forms the afflictions (kleśas). The Yoga-sūtras [YS 2.4] emphasize that ignorance is the most fundamental affliction that is the root of all other afflictions. In his commentary on YS 2.3, Vyāsa states that “the afflictions are the five forms of unreal cognition.” So, as Sinha points out:

All afflictions (kleśa) are due to false knowledge (avidyā) and can be destroyed by right knowledge. The Yoga, like Spinoza, regards emotions as intellectual disorders which can be cured by true knowledge. [Footnote omitted] (Sinha 1985, p. 97)

We therefore see similarities between a cognitive account of the emotions and the Sāṃkhya-Yoga account because both claim that emotions have mental objects but at the same time there is a difference in how emotions can relate to knowledge, with the Sāṃkhya-Yoga philosophers claiming that knowledge and emotions are incompatible.

4. The Buddhist account of the emotions

While there are many nuances in the accounts of the emotions among Buddhist writers, there are also certain key ideas that are common to all of them. This section, tries to bring out these key ideas by analyzing some of the writings of the Buddhist philosophers Dharmakīrti, Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla.

4.1 Buddhist cognition

As with other Indian accounts of the emotions, the Buddhist conception of emotion appears in the context of the discussion about the role of cognition (vijñāna). Buddhist philosophers argue against the existence of a self (ātman). At the same time, they acknowledge the existence of a non-physical momentary consciousness or chain of cognitions (santāna vijñāna) which carries over from former births into the present and future rebirths. Thus, Buddhists try to find a middle ground between a permanent non-physical self and the materialism of the Lokāyata school (materialist school of philosophy) which argues that the self is purely the result of bodily processes. According to the materialists, the self comes into existence with the body and ceases to exist when the body ceases to exist.

In the Pramāṇa-siddhi-chapter of the Pramāṇa-vārttika, Dharmakīrti argues that past lives exist. We can know this because of the authority of the Buddha and we have reason to accept his authority because of his infinite compassion. This compassion can only be the result of practice over many life times [PV 36]. The Lokāyata philosophers argue that cognitions require the support of a body and therefore cease to exist when the body ceases to exist. Dharmakīrti objects to this by arguing that mental cognitions do not derive from any physical support [PV 49]. Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla state that the relationship between the support and what is supported can be analyzed either as a causal relationship or as the relationship between an object and its capacity [TS and TSP 1858–1859]. In this respect they do not deviate from Dharmakīrti who rejects this position of the Lokāyata philosophers by arguing that the body could be neither the cause of cognition nor could it have the capacity of cognition. Franco explains Dharmakīrti’s argument in the following way:

If the body were one lasting and changeless entity from birth to death, it could not produce cognitions gradually, and thus all the cognitions one has throughout one’s life would be produced at once. If the body were the material cause of the cognition, the cognition would last as long as the body, and thus there could be no dead body (v. 51). If the breaths are considered the cause of cognition, the same inadmissible consequence applies: Because the body is the material cause of the breaths, the breaths would last as long as the body and the cognition as long as the breaths (v. 53). All these inadmissible consequences do not apply if one admits that cognition is the cause of cognition. (Franco 1997, pp. 134–135)

Of course, there is no reason why the Lokāyata philosophers should say that the body is changeless. It might precisely be the changes that appear in the body, for example in the brain, which are responsible for cognition. Dharmakīrti argues that if cognition required the support of the body, there is no reason why it should not arise everywhere where there exists a body or matter [PV 37–38]. The obvious objection to this argument is that not any form of matter supports cognition. It has to be a particular kind of matter, ordered in a particular way, as is the case in human beings and many animals.

According to Buddhist “psychology”, love and hatred are two of the afflictions (kleśas) that befall human beings and that need to be removed in order to attain liberation. There are a number of sections in the Yogācāra-bhūmi, possibly written by either Asaṅga or Maitreya, that discuss these kleśas. The text provides several lists, most of which include love (rāga) and hatred or enmity (pratigha). Other kleśas are: satkāya-dṛṣṭi (false view with regard to the satkāya (five skandhas)), attachment to extreme views, attachment to unwholesome views, attachment to practices and observances, pride, ignorance and doubt. These kleśas could be associated with one or more of the five possible feelings: pleasant feeling (sukha), unpleasant feeling (duḥkha), neutral feeling (upekṣā), happy mood (sau-manasya) or unhappy mood (daur-manasya). A translation of the psychological categories of the Yogācāra-bhūmi into the categories of Western philosophy of mind would render the following distinctions: a kleśa is a mental phenomenon that consists of a representation of an object plus a certain feeling, sensation or affect. For example, in the case of love, the Yogācāra-bhūmi states that we have the object of love plus either a pleasant sensation or a happy mood or indifference (neutral feeling). It is interesting to note that the mental phenomenon of love can be connected with indifference. In general, this suggests that a sensation is comparable to a psychological attitude and that we always have to have one attitude or another towards a mental object. This means that our thinking is never without a feeling, even if it is a “neutral” feeling. It is unclear, however, in what way we could experience the emotion of love with the sensation of indifference. It seems that love always requires a positive feeling. The Yogācāra-bhūmi allows for a mental phenomenon to count as the experience of love, as long as it does not involve a “negative”, i.e., unhappy or unpleasant, feeling.

In addition, the text acknowledges that a representation can be about a real object or an imagined object. In the latter case, the question arises in what way we can distinguish between an object and its representation. This suggests that at least some Buddhist traditions distinguish between a cognition, the object of a cognition and the feeling accompanying a cognition. Śāntarakṣita mentions kleśas in TS 1955 and it is obvious that he operates within the context of this psychological distinction which becomes clear in his discussion of love (rāga) and hatred (dveṣa).

4.2 Śāntarakṣita on love and hatred

Śāntarakṣita argues that love and hatred exist due to habit and repetition which is ascertained by confirming and disconfirming concomitance. This means that they are learned through experience. For example, love is learned by a person being confronted with objects to which this feeling is attributed and thus reinforced the more of these objects a person encounters. However, we can observe the existence of love and hatred in babies who have not had the repeated experience of these objects in this life. Śāntarakṣita claims that the existence of love and hatred cannot be due to the first encounter with the object of love or hatred because it would be possible, as indeed happens according to him, to encounter this object without the respective feelings of love or hatred or to encounter it with another feeling, such as disgust. As an example, Śāntarakṣita mentions the attraction a man might feel towards a woman. He claims that men are attracted to women if they also attribute “goodness” and “devotedness” to them, even though a particular woman might not possess these qualities. So the qualities that make, for example, a woman “lovable” do not have to exist in the woman and therefore, according to Śāntarakṣita, the woman cannot be said to be the cause of the feeling of love in the man. Love, then is not an object of the senses (viṣaya). Therefore, the reason why these feelings exist is through force of habit in previous lives. We have learned over time that women are “lovable”. This argument is meant to demonstrate that love and hatred could not exist if the materialists were right and mental life was simply the result of bodily processes.

Kamalaśīla explains this argument in his commentary on TS 1948–1953 in a rather straightforward way and adds a very helpful example:

For the following reason also, the feelings of Love, etc. cannot be due to presence of the excitants:–Because, if the feelings appeared exactly in accordance with the excitants, they would proceed from the excitant exactly in the same manner as the Cognition of Blue and other things (which always proceeds in accordance with these things);–the feelings however do not proceed in this way; on the contrary, the said feelings appear in regard to the Woman and other things, in men who attribute to the woman the form of their own lasting pleasure, etc. which have not been experienced at all; and yet the objects (woman, etc.) are not actually possessed of the said form of goodness, etc.;–and when a thing is devoid of a certain form, it cannot be the excitant or basis of the Cognition of that form; otherwise it would lead to absurdity. (TSP: 931)

In this passage, Kamalaśīla draws a distinction between the cognition of blue and the feeling of love. His point is that the cognition of blue is a perception and therefore requires an object whereas a feeling of love does not. There is no basis for love in the way that there is a basis for our perception of blue. So, Śāntarakṣita’s argument, as explained by Kamalaśīla, consists of two parts: a) love, hatred etc. are learned through experience and reinforced by repetition and b) love, hatred etc. are not perceptions.

In TS 1958, Śāntarakṣita provides a similar example of male animals that become “perturbed” by the touch of female animals even though they do not know anything about any “doings” (vṛttānta) or sexual intercourse, yet. His argument is that this feeling must be due to experiences in previous lives. He does not account for the possibility of instinctual behaviour. If Śāntarakṣita allowed for the existence of instinctual behaviour then his observation of babies and animals might have let him to believe that love and hatred are mental phenomena that are not learned through experience.

Śāntarakṣita clearly believes that there is something fundamental about the feelings of love and hatred. They are so fundamental that even babies feel them. At the same time, they require experience. So the question is how was the first feeling of love (or hatred) acquired? There might have been a time when humans did not have the feeling of love and they only acquired it at some point in their lives through experience and subsequent repetition of the experience. This sounds like a strange idea precisely because love and hatred are so fundamental to our unenlightened lives that the existence of a time when they did not exist seems impossible. Yet, Śāntarakṣita’s view implies either that there must have been such a time or that there is an infinite chain of these feelings stretching backwards. In TS 1872, Śāntarakṣita makes it clear that he believes in the latter option:

As regards the “other world”, there is no such “other world”, apart from the “chain of causes and effects, in the form of cognition and the rest”. What is spoken of as “the other world” or “this world”, that is only by way of a certain limit placed upon the said “chain” which is beginningless and endless. (TS 1872)

So, Śāntarakṣita might argue that love and hatred are just as much part of a “chain of cognitions” that is without beginning and end as all other cognitions. The reason why he postulates the existence of this eternal “chain of cognitions” is the argument that no cognition could be caused by anything other than a previous cognition and hence there cannot be a first cognition for anything we call a particular being. If there was a first cognition for a particular being then, according to Śāntarakṣita (TS 1878–1885), there would be five options: i) the first cognition does not have a cause; ii) it is produced by an eternal cause; iii) it is eternal and unchanging; iv) it is caused by another substance; and v) it is caused by a cognition “from another chain”.

Śāntarakṣita rejects the first option because he argues that according to this idea the foetus would somehow receive the first cognition without any cause. This means that the cognition would be eternal, rather than momentary. Śāntarakṣita rejects the second option because if the cognition is produced by an eternal non-material cause then it should itself be eternal. The argument is that if something which exists eternally can bring about a cognition then there is no point in time at which this cause could have brought about the effect. So the effect is eternal in the same way as the cause. But an eternal effect cannot exist because something which is eternal does not have a cause. The third option that the cognition is eternal runs counter to our experience which tells us that cognitions are momentary. Śāntarakṣita also dismisses the Lokāyata position that cognitions are produced by physical substances because the Lokāyata philosophers argue that material substances are eternal. So, Śāntarakṣita makes a similar argument to the rejection of option two. An eternal cause has to have an eternal effect but cognitions are not eternal. Option five is rejected in TS 1893–1896 where Śāntarakṣita argues that the first cognition of one chain cannot be solely caused by a cognition from another chain because in that case we would expect the knowledge of parents to carry over into their babies.

The second part (b) of Śāntarakṣita’s argument, that love and hatred are different from perception, is intriguing in that he claims that there cannot be an external cause for love and hatred because whatever we might want to postulate as this external object can elicit different feelings in different people. The object of one person’s love might be the object of another person’s aversion. For this reason, love and hatred cannot be acquired in this life, like perceptions. So the love and hatred that exist in a baby or young animal must be carried over from another life. This argument assumes that there could not be non-perceptual cognition that can arise without previous experience and therefore faces the same challenges as the claim that all feelings have to be learned through repeated experience. But it goes beyond this discussion in that it raises the question of what the object of love and hatred is. Kamalaśīla uses the term vaśa (desire, love) rather than rāga in his commentary on TS 1948–1953 which suggests that he does not clearly distinguish between desire and love. If it is true that rāga is a kleśa then it is plausible that there is no distinction between love and craving. So he could be making the obvious point that we can desire something without a basis in the external world, i.e., what I desire might not exist, or that I might desire something for the wrong reasons. Love, hatred and desire all require the existence of an object. However, unlike a perceptual object, the objects of love and desire can be “merely” mental. I can love the idea of equality or I can desire something which does not exist. This “non-existence” can be two-fold: i) I can desire something which cannot exist either logically or physically, for example, I can desire that I had wings; ii) if I desire something to be the case, then what I desire does not exist, yet. For example, if I desire an ice-cream then the state of affairs in which I have an ice-cream does not exist, yet. In contrast with love and desire, perception, at least on a realist account, requires its object to exist in the external world.

4.3 Cognitions, emotions and kleśas

While the argument about the difference between perception and love does not show that love requires previous experience, it raises, (at least) two interesting questions about the Buddhist account of the emotions: i) why does Śāntarakṣita draw a distinction between perception and feeling on the basis of the non-existence of external objects in the case of love, hatred and desire? ii) why does he make a specific argument about love and hatred when he has already argued in previous verses of the Lokāyata-parīkṣā that all cognitions require other cognitions as their causes?

In what follows, these questions are addressed briefly in reverse order. The second question raises the general problem of the translatability of the concept of feeling or emotion into Sanskrit. As mentioned in the introduction, there is no general term in Sanskrit for emotion and Śāntarakṣita uses the expression “love and hatred etc.” (rāga-dveṣa + ādi). In the translation, Jha has taken the “etc.” as referring to other feelings, assuming that Śāntarakṣita was operating with a psychological category such as “feeling”. However, there is no single word in the text which would translate as feeling every time it appears in the translation. In fact, it is clear that Śāntarakṣita does not mean “feelings” in the sense of non-representational attitudes towards objects because love and hatred have objects according to him, albeit mental objects. Since Śāntarakṣita remains within the context of Buddhist psychology and clearly refers to Dharmakīrti, it is plausible that he means “other kleśas” instead of “other feelings” because love and hatred are kleśas and have objects.

In this context, it is also important to discuss the translation of the term vijñāna as “cognition”. Both terms refer to a mental phenomenon that provides knowledge. This means that they refer to a state of affairs that pertains in the world. Both terms presuppose an external or mental object they are directed towards. One important difference between these two terms, which shows the difficulty with translating vijñāna as cognition, is that, according to Śāntarakṣita, a vijñāna always has an object but it does not have to have conceptual content. In this sense, even a sensation or feeling, such as the sensation of pleasure, is a vijñāna because it has an object but lacks conceptual content, according to Śāntarakṣita. The sensation has an object because it provides knowledge about mental states and therefore has to have an object of knowledge. However, this object is not conceptual. So, according to Śāntarakṣita, a vijñāna includes affective mental states, such as feelings, sensations and emotions and therefore kleśas. The Western term “cognition”, by contrast, excludes affective mental states.

The whole of the Lokāyata-parīkṣā of the Tattva-saṃgraha is one argument for the existence of an infinite chain of vijñānas that is independent of its physical manifestation. For Śāntarakṣita, “love, hatred and the rest” are examples of vijñānas. These vijñānas are also kleśas but not all vijñānas are kleśas. Love and hatred are especially useful for his argument because they are fundamental to our experience and emphasize the continuity of the “chain of vijñānas”.

According to Śāntarakṣita, vijñānas can include feelings and emotions whereas in Western psychology and philosophy cognitions are distinct from emotions and feelings. This means that the role of vijñānas in Śāntarakṣita’s system is different from the role of cognitions in Western psychology and philosophy. As I mentioned above, in the history of Western philosophy the distinction between feeling and cognition has often been used as the demarcation between feeling and rational thought with the ideal of affectless thought. For Śāntarakṣita and other Buddhist philosophers the ideal is not necessarily that of affectless thought. Instead, their ideal is that of an existence free from afflictions (kleśas). So, they try to extinguish one kind of mental phenomenon but their distinction is different from the distinction between feeling and thought. For them, all mental phenomena that provide an obstacle to liberation should be eliminated. This includes what Western psychologists would call emotions or feelings. However, it also includes many affectless cognitions. This means that the Western psychological category “emotions” does not feature prominently in Śāntarakṣita’s account of the mind. In fact, it is not clear that he would even recognize such a category. According to Buddhist psychology, some kleśas straddle the Western divide between feeling and thought. They involve both feeling and thought and they are a mental phenomenon, called a vijñāna. Whereas for many philosophers in the history of Western philosophy, the ideal has been to purge feeling from thought, in order to attain a standard of rationality, the ideal for Śāntarakṣita and other Buddhist philosophers is to free our mental life from those vijñānas which are kleśas. The reason is not to attain some standard of rationality because, for Buddhists, most vijñānas are suspect in that they involve an attachment to the present life and therefore pose an obstacle to liberation.

One question that arises in this context is “why does Śāntarakṣita single out love and hatred, instead of discussing kleśas in general?”. One answer might be that they are fundamental to our human experience and therefore lend themselves to Śāntarakṣita’s argument that cognitions in general do not come into existence with the body.

In Western discussions of this topic, feelings are very often associated with some physical change, such as a quicker heartbeat or a change in the chemical make up of the brain. For this reason, emotions are very often regarded as providing some link between the mental and the physical. Śāntarakṣita mentions this link between feeling and physical changes in TS 1960. He claims that phlegm (balāsa) and other bodily changes are not responsible for love, hatred or perturbations through sexual arousal because there is no observed concomitance between them. While this claim might be true with regard to phlegm, it is obviously false with regard to other physical changes, especially changes in the brain. However, it would be wrong to completely dismiss Śāntarakṣita’s argument simply because he turned out to be wrong about this empirical claim. After all, the argument raises important questions about the status of mental phenomena, such as love and hatred. This becomes clear when we think about the other question mentioned earlier: why does Śāntarakṣita distinguish between perceptions on the one hand and love and hatred on the other hand based on the existence or non-existence of external objects? While Śāntarakṣita often adopts an idealist position compatible with the Yogācāra standpoint in the Tattva-saṃgraha, he seems to switch to a realist position in this case which is compatible with a Sautāntrika standpoint. The best explanation for this switch is that Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla are arguing against Lokāyata philosophers (materialists), who do not share the Yogācāra outlook on reality. This means that Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla try to find common ground with these philosophers and therefore share their assumptions about the mind-independent existence of an external world. Śāntarakṣita’s and Kamalaśīla’s argument then is that even with this assumption in place, it does not follow that all cognitions are dependent on or even identical with the body. According to them, the Lokāyata philosophers would have to draw a distinction between perceptions on the one hand and love and hatred on the other hand, and while they might be able to account for perceptions they are not able to account for love and hatred.

4.4 Buddhist emotions

From the preceding arguments by the Buddhist philosophers Dharmakīrti, Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla it becomes clear that Buddhist philosophers do not operate with the psychological category “emotion”; at least not in the way that other Indian (and Western) philosophers do. For example, Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla do not consider love and hatred to be irrational because they involve non-cognitive feelings that do not represent an external reality. Kamalaśīla in particular makes it clear that for him love and hatred do not require a relationship to objects in the external world. He argues that not having an external object is a salient feature of love and hatred. In Western philosophy of mind we often use the presence or absence of an object of love in order to distinguish between rational and irrational love. Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, however, do not use this distinction in order to argue that love and hatred should be eliminated. As Buddhists, their concern lies with the afflictions that prevent the mind from becoming liberated and whatever mental state is an affliction ought to be eliminated. Emotions then are vijñānas and as such they always have an object. This position stands in contrast to philosophical traditions, be they Indian or Western, in which feelings and emotions are often distinguished from cognitions because they lack an object.

5. Conclusion

A number of themes emerge from this overview: 1) The Western categories of “cognition” and “emotion” do not have equivalents in classical Indian philosophy. This is interesting because it suggests that these concepts are not psychological categories but perhaps social categories. While there has been some anthropological work done by, for example, Catherine Lutz on the differences in the categorization of specific emotions across cultures, there is the possibility that the category as a whole might not translate into all cultures (see Danziger 1997). 2) One common theme in classical Indian philosophy is that the phenomena that would be labelled as “emotions” in Western philosophy are to be eradicated because they prevent liberation. 3) None of the Indian philosophical schools aim at “emotion-free” cognitions as an end in itself. In fact, those states that would be labelled “cognitions” in Western philosophy are also to be eradicated because they also prevent liberation. 4) Indian schools differ over the inclusion of feeling states under the concept of vijñāna (cognition). Some schools distinguish between feeling states and vijñāna whereas others, most notably Buddhists, do not. This last point suggests that there is an interesting comparison to be made between Buddhist accounts and cognitive accounts of the emotions. However, any comparison must be sensitive to the difficulties in translating the concepts involved.


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