Analytic Philosophy in Early Modern India

First published Tue Mar 10, 2009; substantive revision Sun Nov 5, 2023

Two older Indian philosophical traditions, the early Nyāya (grounded in Gautama Akṣapāda’s Nyāya-sūtra, c. 100 C.E., and dealing mainly with logic, epistemology, and the theory of debate) and the Vaiśeṣika (grounded in Kaṇāda’s Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, c. 100 B.C.E., dealing mainly with ontology), developed in parallel until, at some point in the 11th or 12th century, they merged to form a new school, called “Navya-Nyāya”, the new Nyāya or “new reason” school (Ganeri 2011). Despite its name, Navya-Nyāya incorporates and develops classical Vaiśeṣika metaphysics as well as classical Nyāya epistemology. The Navya-Nyāya authors also develop a precise technical language through the employment of which many traditional philosophical problems could be clarified and resolved. Navya-Nyāya techniques proved to be so versatile that they were employed, not just by philosophers, but also in poetics, linguistics, legal theory, and other domains of medieval Indian thought. The foundational text of this school was Gaṅgeśa’s brilliant and innovative Jewel of Reflection on the Truth (Tattvacintāmaṇi). The school continued to develop for about four centuries, reaching its heights with the works of Raghunātha, Jagadīśa and Gadādhara (Ganeri 2014). The sophisticated use this school made of its technical vocabulary made it increasingly inaccessible, and so, in the 17th and 18th centuries, several manuals or compendia were written to explain in simplified language the basic tenets of the school. I will describe the philosophical principles of Navya-Nyāya based on a synopsis of the most successful of these, Annambhaṭṭa’s The Manual of Reason (Tarkasaṃgraha; henceforth TS), together with its auto-commentary, the Dīpikā (henceforth TSD), This text was nicknamed Bāla-gādādharī, a sort of ‘Beginners Guide to Gadādhara’. As well as presenting the Vaiśeṣika theory of categories (a mixture of physical theory, metaphysics and philosophy of psychology), and the epistemological, methodological, and logical techniques of the new Nyāya system, The Manual of Reason interjects fascinating discussions on a wide variety of topics of philosophical interest, making the text an enjoyable and informative introduction to later Indian analytical philosophy (trans. G. Bhattacharya 1983; for discussion of the text, see also Athalye 1930, Atreya 1948, C. Bhattacharya 1966, Foucher 1949, Shastri 1961).

1. The Vaiśeṣika System of Categories

1.1 Methodology and Theory of Definition

Most Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika texts are structured in one of two ways. They either follow a traditional Vaiśeṣika pattern, in which the categories and their various sub-groups are discussed in order, or else they follow a pattern employed by the Buddhist logician Diṅnāga, and copied by Gaṅgeśa, in which each of the sources of knowledge is treated in turn. The Manual of Reason, however, adopts a style of analysis due to Vātsyāyana (the first commentator on the Nyāya-sūtra). Vātsyāyana stated that:

This [Nyāya] system will follow a three-fold procedure, viz. enumeration (uddeśa), definition (lakṣaṇa) and examination (parīkṣā). Of these, ‘enumeration’ means the act of referring to each object [to be analysed] by name; ‘definition’ means [citing] a characteristic of the named object which distinguishes it from all other objects; ‘examination’ means ascertaining, with the help of the pramāṇas, the appropriateness of the distinguishing characteristic for the object defined (Bhāṣya before NS 1.1.3).

The heart of this method lies in the use it makes of definitions, conceived of as differentiating marks of the thing defined. The Manual of Reason (TSD 3d) refines the idea: it defines a ‘definition’ of a class of things as any characteristic which is co-extensive with that class. A defining characteristic of the class ‘cow’ is the property ‘having dewlap’. Note that this does not tell us what the essence of the class is—it merely supplies us with a syndrome or trait by means of which we can identify the thing in question. The Naiyāyikas, we might say, have a ‘diagnostic’, rather than an ‘essentialist’, conception of definition. The purpose of the ‘examination’ now becomes clear: it is to see whether the alleged defining trait really is co-extensive with the class to be defined, or whether it is faulty, either by ‘over-covering’ (cf. ativyāpti; applying to things outside the definiendum) or by ‘under-covering’ (cf. avyāpti; not applying to everything within the definiendum), or both. A properly defining characteristic has to be, to use modern terms, both a necessary and a sufficient property of the thing to be defined. We see the pattern of enumeration, definition, and examination repeated again and again in Navya-Nyāya texts like The Manual of Reason.

1.2 What is the Vaiśeṣika System of Categories?

The Vaiśeṣika system of ‘categories’ (padārtha) is an attempt to classify in a systematic way all the different types of existent. Navya-Nyāya lists seven ‘categories’ of object: substance (dravya), quality (guṇa), motion or action (karma), universal (sāmānya), particularity or differentiator (viśeṣa), inherence (samavāya), and absence (abhāva). Of these, the first six comprise the classical list of categories, found even in the Vaiśeṣika-sūtra, while the seventh (absence) is a distinctive addition by the later school. Most of these types are themselves subject to sub-division: thus, there are nine types of substance, twenty four types of quality, etc.

One main question concerning this list of categories is whether we can discern any underlying structure or organising principle. This is related with another important question: just what is a category? The Manual of Reason answers this second question by giving the etymological analysis of the term ‘padārtha’ (category): ‘padārtha’ is the artha or meaning of a pada or word. The claim is that the Vaiśeṣika categories are in some way the metaphysical correlates of linguistic structures. One way to make this claim more precise would be to note the existence of striking similarities between the Vaiśeṣika system and Sanskrit grammar (cf. esp. Faddegon 1918). Another way is to observe a distinctive pattern of argument employed, in which the hypothesis that a certain type of substance, quality, etc. exists is supported on the ground that it explains some feature of our linguistic practice (for example, the argument that space exists as it explains our use of directional terms.)

An alternative approach would be to seek some purely apriori rationale behind the list. Athalye (1930: 75) offers one such:

A notion is either positive or negative, and so the external object of a notion might be ‘existent’ (bhāva) or ‘non-existent’ (abhāva). ‘Existent’ things again are of two kinds, properties and a common substratum in which they reside. The latter is ‘substance’ (dravya). Of the properties, again, some reside in many objects conjointly, others in individual things singly. The first is ‘universal’ (sāmānya), while the latter class is again divisible into properties that are stationary and those that are evanescent, i.e. ‘quality’ (guṇa) and ‘motion’ (karma). The remaining two categories, ‘inherence’ (samavāya) and ‘particularity’ (viśeṣa) are assumed to explain the special theories of the Vaiśeṣikas.

This reconstruction of the Vaiśeṣika system is not quite satisfactory, for it relies on an unexplained and perhaps question-begging distinction between stationary and evanescent properties, and leaves two of the categories completely unaccounted for. Another reconstruction (also deficient) is offered by Potter (1977). When we look at The Manual of Reason’s own definitions of the individual categories, it seems to be following this approach. The Manual of Reason’s definitions are as follows:

that which possesses the universal substance-hood;
that which possesses qualities (TSD 3)
that which possesses universals, and isn’t a substance or motion;
that which possesses the universal quality-hood (TSD 4)
that which causes conjunctions (between substances);
that which possesses the universal motion-hood (TSD 5)
that which is eternal, unitary, and inherent in many things (TS 82)
that which exists in eternal substances and functions as their differentiator (TS 83)
that thing which is eternal and a relation (TS 84)
[No general definition given]

There are certain problems with this series of definitions, read as an apriori reconstruction of the categories. In particular, the definitions of ‘substance’ and ‘quality’ seem to be jointly circular, unless we take as already given universals such as substance-hood, which make the definitions somewhat vacuous. I will give another reconstruction, one which roughly follows the great Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika author Udayana (cf. Tachikawa 1981).

1.3 The Underlying Structure of the List

First divide things up into the existents and the non-existents, the latter corresponding to the category ‘absence’. Now take inherence to be a primitive, fundamental relation. Given such a relation, the following three-fold division is exhaustive:

  1. things which do not inhere in others, but are inhered in,
  2. things which both inhere in others, and are themselves inhered in,
  3. things which inhere in others, but are not inhered in by anything.

We want group (a) to correspond to the category ‘substance’. Unfortunately, the Vaiśeṣikas claim that wholes are distinct from, and inhere in, their parts. The only substances which do not inhere in anything are the atomic substances (which for the Vaiśeṣikas correspond with the eternal substances). Group (c) corresponds to the category ‘universal’, for universals are said to inhere in things (substances, qualities and motions) but do not have anything inhering in them. Group (b) comprises, the non-atomic substances, the qualities and the motions. Let us now divide this group into two: those which are inhered in only by universals, and those which are inhered in by other things as well. The former corresponds to the categories ‘quality’ and ‘motion’, for substances are inhered in, not only by universals, but also by qualities, motions, as well as by other substances. Finally, we must find a way to sub-divide the former group into qualities and motions. More traditional Naiyāyikas preserve the distinction by saying that motions, but not qualities, cause the substances in which they inhere to come into contact with (or break away from) each other. This, however, appeals to the idea of ‘contact’, which cannot itself be defined in terms of our primitive relation inherence. Some radical Naiyāyikas (especially Bhāsaravajña) claim that motions are just a kind of quality, as their properties are so similar. The only remaining category is ‘differentium’ (viśeṣa), whose members reside in and individuate the eternal substances i.e. the atoms. The point, perhaps, is that all other things are individuated by the universals and wholes that inhere in them, but two atoms of the same substance are in all respects identical. But if objects are individuated by means of what inheres in them, then there must be something inhering in each atom which distinguishes it from the others—a ‘differentium’ (see §10.2).

This is a rough sketch, omitting many technicalities, of how the Vaiśeṣika philosophers tried to build their system of categories on logical principles (for an example of such technicalities, see TSD 3(c). The Manual of Reason points out that a substance cannot be defined as the substratum of qualities, because of the Vaiśeṣika doctrine that substances do not possess any qualities at the moment when they are created.)

2. Physical Substance

2.1 The Five Primary Physical Substances

Vaiśeṣika distinguishes, among nine acknowledged types of substance, a sub-class of five—earth, water, fire, air and ākāśa—to which it gives the name “bhūta” (‘physical substance’). A bhūta is defined as a substance which possesses a specific sensible quality—odour, taste, colour, touch and sound.

It was, perhaps, originally thought that the five physical substances and the five sensible qualities are directly correlated, each quality residing in one and only one substance, odour just in earth, taste just in water etc. (such a view is reported by Vātsyāyana under NS 3.1.65–6). This may give some insight into the origins of the ‘five physical substances’ theory, but it was realised very early on that it is extremely implausible to maintain that earth, for example, is invisible, or else that its colour is always due to intermixture with fire (Bhaduri 1947: 133). The set of correlations between physical substances and sensible qualities is more complex in the Vaiśeṣika-sūtras and later texts, and is indicated in the following chart:

odour taste colour touch sound
earth x x x x
water x x x
fire x x
air x
ākāśa x

The orthodox Vaiśeṣika view is that each physical substance is characterised by the possession of a particular type of sensible quality and the absence of certain others. Thus, earth is the substance endowed with odour, water with taste but not odour, fire with colour but not taste or odour, etc. A drawback of such definitions is that we cannot infer, from the detection of a sensible quality, which type of substance is present. Later Vaiśeṣika therefore looks for a diagnostic set of definitions, one which seeks to find, for each substance, a particular sensible quality whose presence is indicative of that substance. The Manual of Reason (TS 10–14):

Earth is (specifically) endowed with odour
Water is (specifically) endowed with cold touch
Fire is (specifically) endowed with hot touch
Air is (specifically) endowed with touch without colour
ākāśa is (specifically) endowed with sound.

Thus, although earth, water, and fire are all tactile, only water allegedly has cold touch. It seems that it could find no positive distinguishing trait for air, and thus reverted to the older style of definition.

It is perhaps surprising to find a ‘five elements’ theory defended still in the seventeenth century. Some modern writers have tried to represent these substances as metaphors for different ‘states’ of matter—solid (earth), liquid (water), gas (air), and temperature (fire). This is, however, improbable, for it is nowhere said that a particular substance can turn from earth to water to air. Perhaps it is a mistake to see the theory as belonging to physics at all; instead, bearing in mind the way the substances are defined in terms of their sensible qualities, we might see it as an exercise in the logical analysis of the data presented by the various sense modalities to construct a (metaphysical) theory of the world. Such a theory would, for example, explain the fact that there are correlations between what we see and what we touch by positing that there must be types of things which can be both seen and touched. Likewise, the occurrence of tactile sensations with no correlated visual sensations leads us to postulate the existence of substances which can be felt but not seen (air), and so on for the other substances. It is, after all, the existence of such correlations between different sense modalities which grounds an objective conception of the world (phenomena accessible only by one sense are more likely to be thought of as subjective in origin).

2.2 Vaiśeṣika Atomism

The Manual of Reason (TS 10–14) repeats the conventional Vaiśeṣika theory that the first four substances (earth, water, air, fire) are each of two types, atomic and composite. An atom (paramāṇu) is indestructible (anitya), indivisible (i.e. non-composite), and has a special kind of dimension, called “small” (aṇu). The Vaiśeṣikas’ standard argument for atomism is as follows. It is an empirically established truth that whatever is perceived is composite. Thus even the smallest perceptible thing, namely, a fleck of dust in a sun-beam, has parts, which are therefore invisible. The Vaiśeṣikas call the smallest perceptible thing a “triad” (tryaṇuka) and claim that it has three parts, each of which is called a “dyad” (dyaṇuka). Does each of these parts itself have parts? Yes—for it is another empirically established truth that the parts of a visible thing themselves have parts (e.g. a piece of cloth, whose parts, the threads, are themselves composite). The Vaiśeṣikas say that a dyad has two parts, each of which is an atom.

This argument establishes that there are objects too small to be seen, but it does not demonstrate that some of them are non-composite. Why cannot the process of sub-division be continued ad infinitum? The Manual of Reason’s intriguing answer is that if such were the case then Mount Meru and a mustard seed would have the same size, as each would have the same (infinite) number of constituent parts! An implicit premise here (articulated by other Vaiśeṣikas) is that the size of a whole is a function of the size, number and spatial arrangement of its parts.

The argument seems to be question-begging, for the implicit premise is only true if atomism is already accepted. A non-atomist will say that the size of an object is determined, not by its constituents, but by the spatial boundaries of the ‘stuff’ it is made of.

2.3 The Metaphysics of Number (saṃkhyā)

The Navya-Nyāya account of number has been likened in content and sophistication to that of Frege, and is indeed fascinating. The Manual of Reason says only that numbers are qualities (guṇa-s), that they are the ground for numerical judgements, and that they range from 1 to a very high number called parārdha (1014. Note here again discomfort with the idea of infinity). The view that numbers are qualities is in fact associated with old Vaiśeṣika, and turned out to be irreconcilable with the structure of the Vaiśeṣika ontological system. We may speak of there being three horses in the field, but also of there being 24 qualities in the Vaiśeṣika system. Yet a quality cannot by definition reside in another quality—hence numbers cannot be qualities. This problem led the Navya-Naiyāyikas to develop a new account of numbers, based on a new type of relation called the paryāpti or ‘completing’ relation.

Here is a summary of their theory. Consider the following pair of sentences:

  1. The table has wooden legs
  2. The table has four legs.

The similarity between (1) and (2) suggests that we think of number-words as akin to other adjectives, i.e. as attributing some property to the object/s they qualify. The Nyāya say that, in (1), the property of being wooden resides in the legs of the table by the relation of inherence. Can we analyse (2) the same way, as stating that a universal property four-hood inheres in the legs? The new Nyāya (esp. Raghunātha and Jagadīśa) answer in the negative. For note that (1) entails

  1. Each leg is wooden.

However, (2) does not entail,

  1. Each leg is four.

The solution offered is to postulate a new relation, ‘completion’, which relates the property fourhood to the four legs jointly, but not to each leg individually. Raghunātha remarks that “the ‘completion’ relation, whose existence is indicated by constructions such as ‘This is one pot’ and ‘These are two’, is a special kind of self-linking relation.” His commentator Jagadīśa adds:

It might be thought that the ‘completion’ relation is nothing but inherence…So Raghunātha states that ‘completion’ is a another relation….In a sentence like “These are two pots”, ‘completion’ relates the property two-hood by delimiting it as a property which resides in both pots. Otherwise, it would follow that there is no difference between saying “These are two” and “Each one possesses two-hood”.

The proposal is that number properties are related jointly to objects by the many-one relation ‘completion’. I think we can simplify this proposal a little without losing its essential structure. Rather than saying, in a sentence like “Mars is a planet”, that the property planethood resides in Mars by the inherence relation, we would now say that the predicate “…is a planet” is true of Mars, so to speak building the inherence relation (or copula) into the predicate. In an entirely analogous way, we can build the completion relation into the number-predicate, which then becomes, if the number is n, an n-place relation. Thus the sentence “Venus and Mars are two” asserts of Venus and Mars that they stand in a certain 2-place relation, the relation which is the number 2. The Nyāya idea, then, is that number-adjectives are n-place relational predicates, and that numbers are n-place relations holding jointly between n distinct objects. It in no way follows from the statement that the relation 2 holds between Venus and Mars, that it holds just with Venus, any more than it follows from the statement that X is to the left of Y, that X is to the left, full stop. On the Nyāya proposal, then, it looks as though the troublesome inference is blocked because its conclusion is not even well-formed, since the phrase “Venus is two”, like the phrase “X is to the left”, is an incomplete or unsaturated expression.

The Nyāya, we have seen, distinguish two relations, the inherence and completion relations. Their motive is, as we might now say, to account for the distinction between collective and distributive properties. For the recognition that the inference from “These are two pots” to “Each pot is two” is invalid is just the recognition that the predicate two does not distribute over plural subjects. The Nyāya idea is to analyse collective predicates like ‘…are two’, not as one-place predicates of aggregates or sets, but as n-place relational predicates, true of n objects jointly. But since such relational predicates still take objects as subjects, this indeed shows that recognising the distinction between distributive and collective predicates does not force us to abandon the adjectival view. The Nyāya, indeed, have a term for collective properties: they call them vyāsajya-vṛtti-dharma or ‘properties which occur jointly’.

3. Space, Time and Motion

3.1 Space (dik)

The Manual of Reason’s remarks on the nature of space and time are sketchy in the extreme. We must supplement them with details from other Vaiśeṣika and Nyāya authors. Even then, the theories of space and time found in Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika texts have been studied very little, and we can only form a rough and inadequate picture at the present time. The Manual of Reason’s observations concerning the notion of space are as follows:

  1. Space is a substance (TS3)
  2. Space is the ‘ground’ for statements such as “this is east of that” etc. (TS 16)
  3. Space is unique, ubiquitous, and eternal (TS16).
  4. Space is an instrumental cause of every effect (TSD16).
  5. ‘Nearness’ (aparatva) and ‘farness’ (paratva) are spatial qualities of objects.

Space is conceived of as that substance in virtue of which statements attributing distance and direction, such as “A is to the east of B” (or “A is near to B”, “A is nearer to B than to C”, etc.) are objectively true or false. Space is thus an explanatory postulate: it is argued that we must postulate the existence of a new (spatial) substance to explain the fact that objects stand in spatial relations with one another. The problem is to make sense of this claim. Bhaduri (1947: 216–7) does so as follows (I paraphrase his account):

Imagine a sequence of objects A, B, C, D, …, F, each in contact with the next, arranged in a line. Now A is to the left of B, and B is to the left of C, and since “being to the left of” is a transitive relation, A is to the left of C, etc. But, although A is in contact with B, and B is in contact with C, it is not true that A is in contact with C—contact is atransitive. Thus contact cannot be what spatially relates objects. What then? “According the Vaiśeṣika, it is space which brings [A and C] into relation. Both are in conjunction with space and thus with each other through its mediation. Space is that which turns the relation of conjunction into a transitive relation” (Bhaduri).

This explanation has a problem. It assumes that between any two bodies there is a chain of touching material objects. But, given this assumption, we do not need to postulate a new substance with which everything is in contact, in order to create a transitive relation from contact. For we can define “being to the left of” thus: x is to the left of y iff there are distinct objects p, q, r,…t such that x is in contact with p, p is in contact with q, …, t is in contact with y.

Potter (1977: 92) refines the argument. We say that A is nearer to D than to F because there are more intervening objects between A and F than there are between A and D. Suppose however that between D and F there is no chain of material objects. How is it that we can still say “A is nearer to D than to F”? Potter answers: “In order to provide the material to explain this comparative judgement we must postulate an intervening series of entities, and these must be spatial”. Note that this explains, not the transitivity of directional relations like “to the left of”, but rather the magnitude of distance relations like “near to”. “Near to” is not a transitive relation. It accepts the basic premise that the distance between two objects is measured in terms of the number of intervening entities, and postulates a series of “spatial entities” when there are no material ones present.

This explanation also has a problem, for space is supposed to be a single entity. Perhaps it should say that the two objects are in contact with a ‘segment’ of space, and spatial segments have magnitude.

Perhaps the best way to construe the argument is as offering an explanation of spatial separation without having to postulate a series of mediating bodies. Thus, if A is nearer to D than F, and there is nothing either between A and D or between A and F, the best explanation is that D is in contact with a nearer part of space than F.

The Manual of Reason says that space is ‘ubiquitous’ (vibhu), which it defines as ‘being in contact with every sample of earth, air, fire, water (and ‘mind’) (TS14). This raises the question: is space infinite in dimension, or the same size as the cosmos? If space is defined in terms of the relations between physical objects, then it would seem to have the same size as the cosmos. There are however Vaiśeṣika arguments that it is infinite. The Vaiśeṣikas say that most bodies are either ‘long’ (dīrgha) or ‘short’ (hrasva) in dimension (TS25, Bhaduri 1947: 118), but that a body’s having ‘long’ or ‘short’ dimension is unintelligible unless it has bounding, perimeter parts. Space, however, has no parts and hence no boundary. Some Vaiśeṣikas conclude that space has no finite dimension (i.e. is infinite); others that it has a special dimension called ‘paramadīrgha’ or ‘maximal length’.

3.2 Time (kāla)

The Manual of Reason says of time that it is the ground for statements about the past, present and future, that it is unique, eternal and ubiquitous, and that it is the container of everything and a instrumental cause of every effect (TS15+D). The conception of time mirrors that of space: it is that in virtue of which statements of the form “A is earlier than B” are objectively true of false. Time is said to differ from space, and thus not be identical with it, in the following respect: whereas what is spatially near or far varies from person to person, what is temporally near or far is the same for all persons (cf. Bhaduri 1947, Mohanty 1992). But why should we restrict our attention only to presently existing persons?

In the Nyāya-sūtra, Gautama mentions an argument against the possibility of present time remarkably similar to (and perhaps even derived from) Nāgārjuna’s arguments against motion. NS 2.1.39 (paraphrased): There is no such thing as the present time, because, when an object is falling to the ground, each point on its descent belongs either to the already-traversed sector or to the yet-to-be-traversed sector. There is therefore, no point on the trajectory to which the present time can be attributed. The present time is an imaginary point of demarcation between the past and the future. Gautama replies (NS 2.1.40–42) to this by saying (i) that the concepts of ‘past’ and ‘future’ are relative to that of the ‘present’, and not to each other, and (ii) that the denial of the present has an absurd consequence, that nothing can be known perceptually, as perception functions in the present. The point of (i), perhaps, is that even if the present is just a boundary, it is not thereby imaginary.

3.3 Vaiśeṣika Dynamical Theory: The Nature and Causes of Motion

Beginning with Praśastapāda (6th century C.E.), the early Vaiśeṣika authors took a rational and scientific interest in the behaviour of projectiles and other moving bodies. Their theory bears comparison with Philoponus’ “impetus” theory, which was responsible for a paradigm shift in Western scientific thought. The Manual’s account substantially agrees with that already found in Praśastapāda, which is partially traceable to the Vaiseṣika-sūtra itself. The content of the relevant stanzas can be summarized as follows:

Motion is the non-inherent cause of conjunction and disjunction. It is of five types, four volitional (throwing upwards, throwing downwards, contraction, expansion) and the fifth comprising all non-volitional motion (including falling, rotating, flowing, etc.) (TS 5, 81).

Weight (gurutva) is the non-inherent cause of the initial falling motion of a body (TS 30).

Fluidity (dravatya) is the non-inherent cause of (initial?) flowing (TS 31).

‘Impetus’ (vega) is a dispositional property (saṃskāra), as is ‘elasticity’ (sthitisthāpaka) (TS 80). ‘Impetus’ is the non-inherent cause of the second and subsequent falling motions of a body (TS 30). Elasticity is that which restores something to its original state after it has been distorted.

Here is a brief summary of the theory. A moving body possesses, at each moment in time, a particular ‘motion’, which is to be thought of as a momentary, quality-like property of the body. Motions are defined to be the cause of conjunctions or disjunctions. A conjunction with a (stationary) body is brought about by displacement in space. We are thus to think of the motion of a body as being either identical with, or else the cause of, its displacement in space between two moments in time. A motion cannot be caused by another motion (as that would lead to perpetual motion). A body is set in motion by its possession of a quality like ‘weight’ or ‘fluidity’. It persists in motion by having a dispositional property, ‘impetus’ or ‘elasticity’, which is the continuous cause of subsequent motions. It is brought to rest by coming into contact with other objects.

The role of ‘impetus’ in this account is particularly interesting. It is illustrated with reference to two examples: (i) a fruit falling from a tree; (ii) a javelin thrown obliquely upwards.

  1. At time t0 the fruit is stationary at place s0. Its weight is counterbalanced by its contact with its stalk. At t1, its stalk breaks and its weight causes it to move to point s1. At this time too there is produced in the fruit a dispositional ‘impetus’. At t2, the impetus in the fruit causes a second motion, from s1 to s2, and so on for all subsequent times. Note that the ‘weight’ of the fruit is the cause of its initial motion, but then ceases to be operative. The cause of all subsequent motion is the ‘impetus’ impressed into the fruit by the initial motion. It is this idea, that the subsequent motion of the fruit is the result, not of an external force, but of the internally impressed vega, which licenses us to describe the Vaiśeṣika account as an impetus theory.
  2. When the javelin is thrown, the initial volitional push imparts into the javelin an initial motion and an impetus. The upwards impetus counteracts the javelin’s weight and causes its upwards motion. When this impetus is exhausted by contact with the air, the javelin’s weight imparts a downwards impetus and the javelin falls. The horizontal motion of the javelin is caused by its having a horizontal impetus which again decreases as a result of contact with the air. The amount of impetus initially acquired by the javelin is proportional to the applied volitional push. Once again, its is the javelin’s having impetus, rather than the action of some external force, which accounts for its continued motion through the air.

The Vaiśeṣikas extend this model to explain certain other kinds of motion. (1) The initial cause of the flowing of water is alleged to result from a force called ‘fluidity’ (rather than the weight of the water). The subsequent flowing is the result of the water’s acquired impetus. (2) Interestingly, the impetus of a body moving in a straight line was thought to be ontologically of the same type as the elasticity of a bent stick—a fact which reveals that impetus was thought of as a kind of internal force, not as inertia. (3) The Vaiśeṣikas mention various other kinds of motion: the movement of an iron needle towards a magnet, the upward motion of flames, the movement of air, and the initial motion of the atoms at the beginning of creation. Given the above model, there must be some ‘force’ which initially gives rise to each of these motions, yet none of the ‘forces’ so far isolated (weight/gravity, fluidity, elasticity) will do. The Vaiśeṣikas therefore speak of a new force, ‘adṛṣṭa’ (the ‘unseen’ force), alleged to account for such motions.

4. Selves: Human and Divine

The eighth of the nine Vaiśeṣika types of substance is ‘self’ (ātman), defined as the substratum of mental states such as believing, knowing, etc. (The ninth is ‘mind’ (manas), a distinct element in the ontology of the mental.) Selves are divided into two types—human (jīva) and divine (paramātman; īśvara). The Manual of Reason supplies arguments (all traceable back to earlier authors) for the existence of both types of self.

4.1 A Causal Argument for God’s Existence

A properly formulated Nyāya argument has three components: thesis, reason (hetu) and example (dṛṣṭānta). The thesis, again, has two components: the ‘locus’ (pakṣa) or place of the inference, and a property (sādhya) whose presence in the locus is to be inferred. Thus every Nyāya argument exhibits the same pattern: p has S, because it has H; e.g., d. (For example: “The mountain ( = p) has fire (= S), because it has smoke ( = H); e.g. the kitchen ( = d)”. See further §8). A sound argument must fulfil at least three criteria: (i) the reason property must be uncontroversially present in the locus; (ii) the reason property and the inferred property must be appropriately related, roughly such that wherever the reason is present, so is the inferred property; (iii) the example must be an uncontroversial place where both the reason property and the inferred property are present.

With this in mind, let us consider The Manual of Reason’s argument for the existence of God:

A dyad of earth etc. has a maker, because it is an effect; e.g. a pot (TSD 17b).

Here, the locus of the inference is a dyad, the smallest composite entity. The reason is “being an effect” (kāryatva), and the inferred property is “having a maker” (kartṛ-janyatva). The Manual of Reason carefully defines what it means by a ‘maker’: a thing which is non-inferentially aware of the inherent or material cause of the thing to be made, has a desire to make it, and acts accordingly. In this sense, the potter, but not the potter’s wheel or the clay or any other causally relevant feature, is the maker of the pot, for it is the potter who sees the clay (= material cause of the pot), desires to make a pot, and acts accordingly by using the wheel and stick.

Comments: (1) Why does The Manual of Reason take dyads to be the locus of the inference? This is, in fact, a clever move. Obviously, we cannot take God to be the locus (e.g. God exists, because…), for then the first criterion on a sound inference will not be met—the reason property, whatever it is, cannot be uncontroversially present in a locus whose very existence is controversial. We can’t take the locus to be “everything in the world”, for many such things are not effects (e.g. atoms, space) and so The Manual of Reason’s desired reason will again not be unequivocally present in the locus. Hence, we must pick some particular thing. We had better not choose a human artefact, for the inference, even if sound, would then establish nothing about God. From the class of non-artefacts, the choice of dyads is a good one here, for (a) they are the most basic things made out of the atoms, and hence out of which everything else is made, and (b) if The Manual of Reason can show that these have a maker, then it follows that the maker is aware of everything (from the definition of a maker and (a) above). Thus, God’s omniscience will be a corollary of the proof of his existence.

(2) The argument takes the picture of causation used in the “potter-pot” example and extends it to cover all natural phenomena. God’s function is to make things out of the given and uncreated ingredients (the atoms, cf. the clay), which are the products’ material cause. Matilal accordingly describes the Nyāya as having a “potter model” of God, in contrast with a “spider model”, in which God spins the world out of his own essence, or a “magician” model, in which the world is an illusion conjured up by God. The argument, however, rests upon an anthropomorphic and agentive view of causation. The Buddhist Dharmakīrti ridiculed the argument by likening the pot to an anti-hill (another thing made of clay): should we say that this admittedly complex and intricate construction is the product of intelligent agents? And even if we do, why should not the world, like an ant-hill be a product of collective agency, rather than produced by a single agent?

(3) The argument might be thought of as an argument based on induction, induction from the class of artefacts to the class of natural products. What licenses the induction from things seen to have a maker to things not so seen? Dharmakīrti (cf. Vattanky 1984: 56–8) says that we are licensed to infer that an object has a maker only if we have seen other objects of the same type being made. Thus, we can infer that the Pyramids had a maker, not because we can see that maker, but because the Pyramids belong to a type (buildings) other instances of which we have seen made. The Naiyāyika makes a bolder inductive claim, that two object belong to the same ‘type’, in this sense, if they are both effects.

4.2 An Argument for the Existence of the Human Self

Vaiśeṣika defines the human self as the substratum of such psychological qualities as believing, etc., as well as of happiness and other emotions, which God does not have. There is an implicit appeal, here too, to the “potter” model of causation: just as, in the sentence “The potter makes the pot”, the property “….making the pot” resides in the potter, so too in “I believe that p”, the property “….believes that p” resides in me. Given that the self is defined as that substance, whichever it is, in which a person’s psychological qualities reside, the question is whether we can identify this substance as a physical one, for example, the person’s body or their senses, or whether we must postulate some new type of substance. Vaiśeṣika’s argument for the existence of the self as a new substance is by elimination of two rival candidates.

(1) The substratum of beliefs, etc. is the person’s body. The Manual of Reason makes the case for this as follows: If I say, “I am cold”, “I am running”, it is my body to which the predicate applies. Therefore, when I say “I believe that p”, the subject likewise is my body. The Manual’s reply is that if this were true, then

there would be the difficulty that with the destruction of a hand, a foot, etc., there will be the destruction of the body and it will follow that there will also be the destruction of the self.

Clearly, I can lose part of my body without ceasing to believe and know things. But losing part of my body does not entail losing my body, as a whole. So this argument fails. A better argument is found in the Nyāya-sūtra: the very phrase “my body” shows that I am not identical with my body. But this doesn’t work either, for I can also say “my soul”! There is no clear argument against physicalism here.

(2) The substratum of beliefs etc. is the person’s sense-faculties [recall that every physical substance was divided into three: pertaining to body, sense-faculty, and (inanimate) object]. This rather strange claim might be taken to include the view of the Buddhists, that a person is reducible to a stream of momentary mental events, including sense-data etc. The Manual of Reason’s argument against such a view (a repetition of an argument already found in the Nyāya-sutra) is a strong one:

Were this the case, there would be no re-identifying awareness (anusandhāna), e.g. “I who saw that pot am now touching it”, for there cannot be any recognition by one of what is apprehended by another.

The idea here is that the possibility of recognitive experience presupposes the existence of a unitary enduring self. There are really two arguments compressed here. One is this: I cannot remember an object unless I have seen it earlier—I cannot remember what you have seen (cf. Locke’s account of personal identity in terms of a continuity of memory experiences). The other argument is more intricate. The Abhidharma Buddhist claims that a person is just an aggregate of experiences, some visual, some tactile, etc. The problem raised for such an account by the Naiyāyika is that it is possible to make trans-modality judgements, in which the deliverances of one sense-faculty are compared with another. Suppose that V(o1) is a visual experience of an object o1, and T(o2) is a tactile experience of an object o2. It is possible to judge “o1 = o2”, but this judgement does not belong to the sphere of any one sense-faculty. Hence, it must be located in some other substance. The self is here conceived of as that which collates, organises and compares the deliverances of the individual senses. See Ganeri 2012, chapters 11, 15, 16 for an expanded discussion.

This is a convenient place at which to introduce the last of the nine substances, the ‘mind’ (manas). It is defined by The Manual of Reason (TS18) as a sixth sense-faculty, one by which a person ‘perceives’ their inner mental objects (beliefs, pleasure sensations etc.) In other words, it is a faculty of introspection. Naturally, we need an argument why this faculty cannot be identified as belonging to the self, and the usual Nyāya claim is that the self is the agent of cognising, while the mind is an instrument for cognising, just as we must distinguish between the axe-man, who is the agent chopping the tree, and the axe, which is the instrument for chopping. The Nyāya also claim that the mind has another function, which is to ‘switch’ between the different sense-faculties, it being assumed that, while we are being subjected to sense-impressions from different faculties simultaneously, we only attend to one at a time.

The Manual of Reason (TS 79) says that eight of the Vaiśeṣika qualities reside only in the self, and in no other substance. They are cognition, memory, pleasure or happiness (sukha), pain or unhappiness (duḥkha), desire (icchā), aversion (dveṣa), merit (dharma) and demerit (adharma) (TS 73–78). The first two we will discuss later (§§ 5.2–3). As regards happiness and unhappiness, Matilal (1986: 301), summarizes the Vaiśeṣika view when he says that “the essential characteristic of pleasure or happiness consists in its being experienced as favourable to us or being in accord with us, i.e. with our body or mind or our very existential situation (anukūla)”, which makes it distinct from knowing or perceiving or apprehending something, and that it is an “inner disposition on account of which the external world becomes agreeable or desirable”. Desire is the state of craving for something. Merit is that which is produces by meritorious action (karma). See further Ganeri 2012, chapters 13, 14.

5. Philosophical Psychology

5.1 Overview of Philosophical Psychology

Study of the nature, content and causes of cognition (buddhi, jñāna, upalabdhi) lies at the very centre of the Nyāya philosophical method. In epistemology, the question asked is: how do we distinguish between true and false cognitions, and under what conditions does a true cognition arise? In logical theory, the issue is: when does one cognition ‘follow’ from another, in some suitably articulated sense. In philosophy of language, the assumption is that sentence structure mirrors cognitive structure, and hence that an inquiry into sentence meaning proceeds via an analysis of the cognitions sentences ‘express’. The importance of this topic is reflected by The Manual of Reason, for although ‘cognition’ is technically just one of twenty-four types of quality in the Vaiśeṣika schema, its analysis accounts for nearly half of the book (TS 34–74).

The term ‘cognition’ is used by the Naiyāyikas to refer to any intentional (sa-viṣayaka; object-directed) mental state, including states of perceiving, inferring, doubting, guessing, remembering, etc., but excluding desiring, hoping, suffering, etc. (cf. Matilal 1968: 7–8). Because we say that the subject has such states, they are thought to be ‘qualities’ (in the technical Vaiśeṣika sense) of the soul. The Manual of Reason states that a cognition is the “ground for all linguistic practice” (TS 34), reflecting the Nyāya conception of language as primarily an instrument for transmitting true thoughts from speaker to hearer.

From the point of view of epistemology, the most important division, within the class of cognitions, is between those which are true and the rest. However, the standard Nyāya classification of the species of cognition, repeated by The Manual of Reason, begins with another division, between memory cognitions (smṛti) and the remainder (anubhava; nonrecollective cognition). The full classification is as follows:

not true
false (viparyaya; 4 types)
doubt (saṃśaya)
‘not true’

Nyāya epistemology is in effect a theory of the true nonrecollective cognitions, and their division into four types on the basis of the different accredited epistemic means (pramāṇa-s) by which they are produced. (What about accidentally true cognitions, e.g. the result of a lucky guess? There are well-discussed problems with incorporating them into the above schema). It is clear that, no matter how generally reliable are our epistemic methods, it will always be possible for misfires to issue occasionally in false cognitions (e.g. perceptual illusions, beliefs resulting from a reporting error, etc.). The Manual of Reason’s example (TS 72) is of the false pseudo-perceptual judgement “This is a piece of silver” on seeing an oyster-shell. I will discuss the epistemology of perception, inference and testimony in §§ 7, 8 and 9 respectively. Here, I will examine in more detail three types of cognition which, though very important within the Nyāya framework, are subsidiary to its epistemology. They are: memory, ‘doubt’ and tarka. (Where do dreams fit in the schema? TS 70 states that they belong in the category of ‘false’ cognitions. This, however, is odd, since they are not the product of any of the four pramāṇas misfiring. Neither are they memories or states of doubt. According to Praśastapāda, dreams are the result of the free movement of the ‘mind’ when it is not connected with the external sense-faculties, influenced by adṛṣṭa, ‘unseen’ forces.)

5.2 Memory

Memory is considered in the western tradition to be an important means by which an individual can justify her beliefs about the past. It is striking then to note that the Nyāya at the outset separate memory states from knowledge-yielding beliefs and deny to them the status of knowledge-hood. The Manual of Reason has the following to say about memory:

A memory state is one which results solely from a ‘mental disposition’ (bhāvanā) (TS 35).

A ‘mental disposition’ is a quality of the soul which is caused by a nonrecollective cognition and causes a memory cognition (TS 80).

Memories are either ‘true’ or ‘false’, as the originating cognition is true or false (TS 74).

The general theory is that an initial cognition, e.g. a perceptual experience of an object, generates a dispositional mental state, which has the capacity, when certain other causal factors are present, to trigger an active memory of that object. (The whole process might be likened to that of someone who, having learned to swim, has a dispositional capacity to swim, which they exercise on certain occasions.) The resultant memory state has the same content as the originating perceptual experience, and can be said derivatively to be ‘true’ or ‘false’, depending on whether the original perception was veridical or not. Memory, on this account is represented as an entirely infallible faculty: there is no mention of the possibility of what is called “false memory”, i.e. having memories without any originating experience, or of “faulty memory”, in which the content of the memory does not exactly match that of the originating experience.

Given this account, in which memory is seen merely as reproducing a past knowing experience, there is perhaps a sense in which the memory does not itself count as knowledge, any more than an exact reproduction of a Picasso counts as a Picasso. The Naiyāyikas state that memories lack ‘independence’. The idea, perhaps, is this. In general we establish the veracity of an experience by examining the way in which it was caused (my perception of the table is veridical, because my eyesight is good, the lighting is adequate, etc.). In the case of a memory, however, we must go via the originating experience. Memory is conceived of as a mere surrogate for the original experience, and its veracity is ‘dependent’ on that of the original. We might think, however, that memory in fact does more than merely reproduce the original experience. It may represent the experienced event as happening in the past, and thus have a different content.

5.3 Doubt (saṃśaya)

The concept of doubt has an important theoretical role in Nyāya, for a state of doubt is claimed to be a necessary precondition for any philosophical enquiry. Doubt is one of the sixteen topics listed under Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.1, which determine the content of the entire text. In particular, a doubt is the first step in a properly formulated inference: is there a fire on the mountain?—Yes, because there is smoke there. The Manual of Reason gives a very precise definition of a doubt (TS 71): a cognition of two incompatible qualifiers in the same qualificand, for example the cognition “Is this (dimly perceived or distant object) a person or a tree-stump?” Schematically, then, a doubt is a cognition whose content is of the form “x is F or not-F?”.

Two points are worth noting. (i) Although doubts are classified as non-true (apramā) cognitions, they are not false. A false cognition is one whose content is “x is F” when in fact x is not F. (ii) Doubts are distinguished from other cognitions by virtue of having a special type of content, rather than by being propositional attitudes of a special kind. The Nyāya do not here say that we can take one of a series of attitudes towards the same proposition, believing, disbelieving, doubting, etc. Yet if the only thing which distinguishes a doubt is its having a content of the form specified in TS 71, then what differentiates the doubt that x is F from the belief that x is both F and not-F? Vardhamāna replies by drawing a distinction between actually having a contradictory belief and merely believing that one has a contradictory belief. The former is supposedly impossible, the supposedly contradictory belief that x is both F and not-F is really a belief that I have a belief whose qualificand is x and whose qualifiers are F and not-F. Since there are no genuine contradictory beliefs, there are no beliefs with the same content as doubts.

5.4 Tarka “Suppositional Thinking”

The term ‘tarka’ is often used loosely in the sense of hypothetical or reductio-ad-absurdum reasoning, but The Manual of Reason gives it a much more precise and technical sense:

Tarka is the ‘ascription’ (āropa) of the ‘pervader’ (vyāpaka) by the ascription of the ‘pervaded’ (vyāpya). For example, ‘if there is no fire, then there is no smoke’(TS 73).

The terms in this definition require explanation. The technical sense of ‘ascription’ (āropa) is ‘counterfactual or suppositional cognition’ (āhāryāropa), defined as a cognition whose qualifier is an property the opposite of which is known to reside in the qualificand. In other words, it is a counterfactual assumption. ‘Pervader’ and ‘pervaded’ are notions taken from the Nyāya theory of inference. When we say that wherever there is smoke, there is fire, this can be re-expressed as that fire pervades smoke, i.e. that the property of being a smoke-possessing-thing has a narrower extension than the property of being a fire-possessing-thing. So here, fire is the pervader and smoke is the pervaded. Thus, tarka consists in a cognition of smoke’s absence given the counterfactual assumption that fire is absent. It is the cognition of a conditional “if p then q”, or “were p to be true then q would be true”, assuming that ‘p’ is false.

One main function of tarka is said to be the elimination of doubt. Suppose one has the doubt “Is x F?”. One might then judge “if x is not F then x is not G”, and if one also knows that x is G, it will follow that x is F. The Naiyāyikas recognise this function but deny nevertheless that tarka is a source of knowledge (pramāṇa). Their reason, it seems, is that there is a distinction between citing positive empirical evidence for a thesis and merely eliminating the contrary possibility by a priori methods. This is reflected, perhaps, in the fact that no example is cited in arguments based on tarka to buttress the inference. The Manual of Reason, it seems, goes even further and denies that the counterfactual conditional is a true cognition, which implies, since they are not false either, that counterfactual conditionals do not have a truth-value.

Udayana claims that tarka is of five types, namely ‘self-dependence’ (ātmāśraya), ‘mutual dependence’ (anyonyāśraya), ‘circle’ (cakraka), ‘infinite regress’ (anavasthā), and ‘having an undesirable consequence’ or reductio-ad-absurdum (aniṣṭāprasaṅga). These are basically self-explanatory – the fifth, ‘prasaṅga’ is the one used to great effect by Nāgārjuna and other Mādhyamika Buddhists. Other authors give slightly different lists (see S. Bagchi 1953 for details).

6. Causation and the Causal Theory of Knowledge

6.1 Overview of Causation

The study of causation is an important part of Indian philosophical thought. One reason for this is the early interest in cosmological speculation: “We should remember that philosophic activity in India arose out of the cosmogonic speculations of the Vedas and the Upaniṣads. The all-important business of philosophy was to attempt to discover some simple, unitary cause for the origin of this complex universe” (Matilal 1985: 287). Another reason is that Indian linguistics (especially the Pāṇinian system of ‘kārakas’ or relations between verb and noun, which greatly influenced Nyāya, Mīmāṃsā and Buddhist thinkers) is based on an underlying causal model, in which the verb in a sentence designates an event, for the production of which each such object as is designated by a noun has a particular causal role. This same model informed and influenced Indian epistemology, and led to the development of the theory of ‘pramāṇas’, the causal means or processes leading to an epistemically accredited awareness-event (pramā). In the Nyāya tradition, four such pramāṇas are recognised: perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna), ‘analogical identification’ or ‘comparison’ (upamāna) and testimony (śabda). The accounts given of each of these employ an extremely causalistic idiom, typical questions being ‘what causes a perceptual experience?’, ‘what are the distinguishing causal factors of true and false perceptual experiences?’, ‘under what conditions does knowledge of the premises of an argument cause knowledge of the conclusion?’, etc.

The choice of examples undoubtedly influences one’s causal theory. The Naiyāyikas almost invariably illustrate their discussions with one of the following three examples: (i) The potter-pot example. The effect is the finished pot. Some of its causes are the pot-halves (which the potter joins to form the pot), the potter, his wheel and stick, the contact between each of the pot-halves, and between them and the stick, etc. (ii) The thread-cloth example. Here the effect is the piece of cloth. Among its causes are the threads from which it is woven, the weaver, the shuttle, the loom, various contacts, etc. (iii) The axe-tree example. The effect, i.e. the felling of the tree, is caused by the axe, its contact with the tree, the axeman, etc. Some of the questions we would like to ask here are these. Can all instances of causation be fitted into the general pattern illustrated by these examples (e.g. is there always an ‘agent’)? Do the Naiyāyikas have an adequate account of causation even for these examples (i.e. can they distinguish between those factors which are, and those factors which are not, causes of the effect)? Can both objects and events be causes? Are causal relations singular or based on repeatable regularities? Attempts to answer such questions as these led to increasingly sophisticated accounts of causation as the Nyāya school evolved.

6.2 The Three Types of Cause

The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas traditionally held that, within the total collection (sāmagrī) of causal factors leading to an event, there are three distinguishable types of cause, namely ‘substrate’ or ‘inherence’ causes (samavayi-kāraṇa), ‘non-substrate’ or ‘non-inherence’ causes (a-samavayi-kāraṇa), and ‘instrumental’ causes (nimitta-kāraṇa). This classification is repeated by The Manual of Reason (TS 43). A substrate cause is a substance in which the effect inheres. The substrate cause of a pot would be the pot-halves; of a cloth, the threads. This is because the Nyāya say that a whole inheres in its parts, and, so, if the effect (e.g. the pot) is a whole, its substrate causes are the parts in which it inheres. If the effect is an object’s coming to have a new property (e.g. the tree’s being felled), the substrate cause is the object (the tree). Note that, in spite of a certain similarity, the notion of a substrate cause is not the same as Aristotle’s “material” cause, for (i) the parts of an object are not necessarily identical with the material from which it is composed, and (ii) even an immaterial substance can be a substrate cause, for example the soul, which is the substrate cause of epistemic events.

All other causal factors are either ‘non-substrate’ causes or ‘instrumental’ causes. A non-substrate cause is one which inheres in the substrate cause. Thus, though not being the substrate, it is closely connected with it. The conjunction of threads is said to be a non-substrate cause of a piece of cloth. Another example is often cited. The non-substrate cause of the colour of a piece of cloth is the colour of the threads (which colour inheres in the threads, in which inheres the effect, the colour of the cloth). Any other causal factor is called an instrumental cause, for example, the weaver’s shuttle or the weaver herself. Why did the Naiyāyikas distinguish between non-substrate causes and the remainder? Perhaps it was an attempt to differentiate between those causes which must continue to exist for the effect to exist, and those which need not. If the threads were to lose their colour, then the cloth would lose its, and if the threads were to become disjoint, the cloth would cease to exist altogether. If, however, the weaver dies, having already woven the cloth, or if the shuttle is subsequently destroyed, it will not affect the continued existence of the effect.

It does not follow from these definitions that anything which inheres in the substrate is a non-substrate cause, or that anything which does not is an instrumental cause. In other words, we still need to define “being a cause”. First, however, two more types of causal factor are distinguished by the Nyāya. These are the ‘special’ instrumental cause (karaṇa) and the ‘operating condition’ (vyāpāra) We often speak of the cause of an effect, and in doing so pick out one factor from the total collection of causal factors as being particularly salient or important in bringing about the effect. Intuitively, the idea is that, even if we have the substrate cause (the pot-halves), the non-substrate cause (the contact between the halves), and even some of the instrumental causes (the potter, etc.), we will not get the effect (the pot) unless the potter acts or ‘operates’ to bring it about. In a sense, then, it is the potter’s actually using his stick which is the cause of the pot. The Naiyāyikas try to capture this idea by saying that one of the instrumental causes is the ‘special’ (asādhāraṇa) cause of the effect, and they call it the ‘karaṇa’. This notion is particularly important to the Nyāya epistemology (see below). What constitutes the ‘special’ nature of this cause? The Navya-nyāya (cf. TS 54) answer is as follows. They introduce first the notion of an ‘operative condition’ (vyāpāra), defined as that cause which immediately precedes the effect. For example, the operative condition for a pot is the conjunction of the pot-halves; for the felling of a tree, it is the final contact between axe and tree before the tree falls. The ‘special’ cause is defined as that factor which ‘brings about’ this operative condition. In other words, it is the factor whose operation directly brings about the effect. In the examples, it would be the axe or the potter’s stick. These objects are, for the Nyāya, the true instruments by means of which the effect is produced.

6.3 What is a Cause?

The Naiyāyikas build up in this way a model of causation, in which different causal factors have different types of causal role. The model reflects (or is reflected in) the Indian grammatical analysis of causal statements, such as “The potter throws a pot with her stick”, “The lumberjack fells a tree with her axe”, in which one distinguishes, apart from the verb designating the event, an agent (kartṛ), object (karman), instrument (karaṇa), and so on. We do not yet know, however, how to distinguish between causes and non-causes. The Manual of Reason (TS 41) provides the Navya-Nyāya answer. Given two entities, c and e,

c is a causal factor for e iff
  1. c exists before e,
  2. c exists ‘regularly’ (niyata) with e, and
  3. c is ‘relevant’ (ananyathāsiddha) to e.

The first clause is to prevent self-causation. The import of the second condition is that entities similar to c must always exist with entities similar to e. There must be an invariable or constant conjunction between c-type entities and e-type entities. This rules out objects which just happen to be there, such as, to give the Naiyāyikas’ example, a donkey happening to wander past the pottery just as the potter goes to work. This feature of the account, the insistence that a causal relation instantiates a regularity, resembles a Humean account of causation. The Naiyāyika, however, recognised the possibility of ‘accidental’, non-causal regularities, such as day always preceding night, or (the example given by The Manual of Reason), the colour of the thread always preceding the cloth. Although the occurrence of a cloth is invariably preceded, not just by threads, but by the presence of thread-colour as well, we would not want to say that thread-colour is a cause of cloth. The third clause is their attempt to eliminate such accidental regularities. The same clause is supposed to stop the cause of a cause (e.g. the potter’s parents) from being a cause. Its meaning, however, is not quite clear. Literally, it states that a cause must be ‘not established otherwise’. Kalidas Bhattacharya says that “an invariable antecedent is irrelevant if knowledge of it is not required for any anticipative knowledge of the origination of the effect” (see Potter 1977: 67). Matilal says that an antecedent is irrelevant if “it is possible to find a reasonable explanation of its appearance” (1985: 290). The Manual of Reason states that an antecedent is irrelevant if its antecedence is only established along with some other entity. We know that thread-colour precedes cloth only because we know that it occurs with the thread (which we know to precede cloth); hence the thread-colour is irrelevant in this sense. This highlights an asymmetry between the two regularities, the threadcolour-cloth regularity and the thread-cloth regularity. For while we can establish the latter directly by observing correlations between thread and cloth, we establish the former by observing the correlation between threadcolour and thread. Thus the former supposedly depends on the latter but not vice versa. It is not clear, however, that the dependence does not run the other way too. In any case, in using this criterion to block transitivity, the Naiyāyikas seem to seeking a definition not of causality per se (which most regard as a transitive relation), but rather an epistemic notion of ‘causal explanation’ or ‘causal salience’.

6.4 Causation and Knowledge

Cognitions that are not memories are classified under two headings: true and false. If we can find factors invariably preceding true cognitions, then we will have the beginnings of a causal theory of knowledge. We will be able to say that a cognition is a knowledge-episode iff it is (i) true and (ii) preceded by a causal factor which invariably precedes true cognitions (i.e. its truth will not be an accident). The Nyāya (TS 39) claim to find four, and only four, invariable correlations: perception, inference, comparison, and testimony. To each they apply the model of causation outlined above. In particular, they isolate, in each case, a ‘special’ instrumental cause (karaṇa), to which they give the name ‘pramāṇa’. In the case of perception, for example, it is the senses. Note that an invariable correlation between two entities, in the sense defined above, does not entail that whenever the first is present, so is the second—the potter is invariably connected with a pot, but only causes a pot when he is actually ‘operating’. Similarly, a pramāṇa, e.g. the eyes, only causes a true cognition when it is actually operating. In other words, the pramāṇa is a necessary but not a sufficient cause for true cognitions. To get a sufficient cause, the Nyāya (TSD 69 iii) says:

The causal condition that is ‘special’ to true cognition is called a ‘guṇa’ [an epistemic excellence]; the causal condition that is ‘special’ to false cognition is called ‘doṣa’ [an epistemic defect]. In the perceptual case, the guṇa [of a true cognition ‘x is F’] is the sensory connection with an object [x] possessing a property [F], etc.

This is, in effect, the operative condition for true perceptual cognitions. Thus, the occurrence of all the usual factors (substrate causes, non-substrate causes, general instrumental causes, etc.) together with an epistemic excellence (guṇa) is a necessary and sufficient causal condition for the occurrence of a true cognition (see also Philips and Tatacharya 2003).

7. Perception, Concepts and Sense-Object Relations

Noticing something coiled up in the corner of the room, I perceive it to be a piece of rope. Looking out of the window, I see that the sky is blue and see also, perhaps, the blueness of the sky. I see too that the air is cold, and that there is nobody on the street. What do all these experiences have in common, in virtue of which they are all acts of perception? The Manual of Reason (TS 46) gives the classical Nyāya answer:

Principle 1: In each case of perceptual experience, the experience has as its special instrumental cause a ‘connection’ (sannikarṣa) between the object perceived and the perceiver’s sense-faculty.

All seeings are the product of a sensory connection (of a type to be specified) with the thing seen. This basic idea must be embellished in two ways before it is can serve as a proper a theory of perception: (i) some account must be given of the fact that, in all the cases cited above, the content of perception is semantically structured (e.g. that the thing in the corner is a piece of rope), for otherwise perceptual experiences would not be capable of being true, and hence fail to qualify as knowledge-episodes; (ii) an account must be given of the type of ‘connection’ involved here. Only then can we evaluate the merits of the Nyāya theory.

7.1 ‘Qualificative Perception’ and the Role of Concepts

A structured perception, of an object a as having a certain property f (e.g. seeing the thing in the corner as being a piece of rope), is called by the Naiyāyikas ‘qualificative’ (savikalpaka = saprakāraka), for it a perception of an object, the ‘qualificand’ (viśeṣya) as having a certain feature or ‘qualifier’ (prakāra; viseṣaṇa) (cf. TS 47). It is alleged by the Naiyāyikas that any piece of perceptual knowledge must be of this form, and further that most cases in which we claim just to be seeing an object (e.g. “I see the car”) are really cases of seeing something as a car. In a ‘qualificative’ perception, it is the qualificand which is in sensory connection with the perceiver. How then does the qualifier enter the picture? The Nyāya claim that:

Principle 2: In every case of perception, the qualifier is a previously perceived entity (substance, quality, motion or universal) which is recalled by the perceiver and ‘superimposed’ upon the qualificand.

The intuitive idea is that the qualifying feature is a concept, empirically acquired by the perceiver, and now used to categorise the object perceived. To see that the passing animal is a horse, one must first possess the concept horse, by means of previous acquaintance with the type. (Use of the term ‘concept’ here does not imply that the features are in any sense subjective—for the Nyāya they are objective entities or constructions out of objective entities). The Nyāya thus use their theory of memory (initial experience causing dispositional trace causing memory event) as a theory of concept-possession.

Principle 2 has a number of consequences:

  1. If every case of seeing an object a as f is preceded by a prior perception of f, and if that prior perception were itself of f as qualified by some qualifier g, we would get an infinite regress. The Nyāya (cf. TS 47) therefore state that, in addition to qualificative perceptions, there are also ‘non-qualificative’ (nirvikalpaka = niṣprakāraka) perceptual experiences. In such experiences, on sees both the object and its qualifier, but not as being qualified by the qualifier.
  2. To illustrate the general theory, suppose I perceive for the first time a vase having a particular shade of blue which I have never before seen. The theory states that, prior to seeing the vase as being qualified by that shade, I first see the vase, together with (but not qualified by) the shade, and then, recalling that shade, impose it upon the vase.
  3. Perceptual illusions, hallucinations, etc., are all explained as cases in which a wrong feature is recalled from memory (or the concept bank). Suppose I misperceive the coiled object in the corner as being a snake. The account given by the Nyāya is that I recall and superimpose the feature snakehood, on the basis presumably of its close similarity with the true feature ropehood. Similarly, if I hallucinate a dagger, the account entails that I am superimposing the memory of some previously encountered dagger upon the region of space in front of me (there must be some qualificand, by Principle 1). This is called the ‘mislocation’ (anyathākhyāti) theory of perceptual error. Note that, if all error is a product of qualifier-mislocation, then no error is possible with respect to the qualificand with which one is in sensory connection. Note too that the Nyāya make no appeal to ‘images’, ‘ideas’ or any other subjective content to explain illusion—it is an externalist account of error. This shows that the so-called argument from illusion, from the phenomenal indistinguishability of veridical and non-veridical perceptual experiences to their having a shared subjective content, is false. It is not clear, however, that one can always find a suitable qualificand (is a region of space really perceived in a hallucination?) or a suitable qualifier (e.g. when one sees a stick as bent, because partially submerged in water, where does the feature ‘being bent thus’ come from?—the Nyāya actually claim that it is an objective feature causally produced by the act of perceiving!)
  4. This theory allows the Nyāya to say that locutions like “I see (visually) that the air is cold” or “I see that the mango is sweet”, in which the qualifier, though perceptible is not a visible property, are genuine cases of perception. They classify them as a type of ‘extra-ordinary’ perception, called jñāna-lakṣaṇā-pratyāsatti. (The other types of extra-ordinary perception sometimes admitted are ‘sāmānyalakṣaṇa’, in which all the bearers of a property are perceived by perceiving the property, and yogic perception.)
  5. The Nyāya state that experience amounts to a knowledge-episode when and only when it is true, i.e. when the qualifier actually qualifies the qualificand. The Manual of Reason (TS 69 iii) says that the guṇa or special causal factor for perceptual knowledge when the qualifier imposed by the perceiver onto the sensorily connected qualificand is actually present in the qualificand. There may, however, be scope for Gettier-style counter-examples to this definition.

7.2 Types of Sense-Object Relation

The Manual of Reason (TS 48) reports the standard Nyāya view, which is due to Uddyotakara, that there are exactly six types of sense-object relation which ground perceptual experiences:

  1. Contact or conjunction (saṃyoga). Ordinary perceptions, e.g. of a pot. If by ‘contact’ we understand some sort of causal relation, then the Nyāya can be said to have a causal theory of perception. However, they may mean that the eye is in contact with the object in some more literal sense.
  2. Inherence-in-the-conjoined (saṃyukta-samavāya). We noted above that, in ‘non-qualificative’ perception, one sees the object and its feature together. The relation between the feature and the perceiver is an indirect one—the feature inheres in the object, with which the perceiver is in contact.
  3. Inherence-in-the-inherent-in-the-conjoined (saṃyukta-samaveta-samavāya). If the feature in (2) is a quality (guṇa), e.g. a particular shade of blue, then inhering in it is a universal, blueness, which can itself apparently be perceived.
  4. Inherence (samavāya). The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣikas have a rather strange doctrine, that each sense-faculty is made out of the type of substance with which it is particularly associated. The auditory faculty is thus made out of ākāśa, and, as sounds inhere in ākāśa, the relation between the hearer and the sound is inherence.
  5. Inherence-in-the-inherent (samaveta-samavāya). By this indirect relation, the hearer is related to properties such as sound-hood inhering in sound.
  6. Qualifier-qualificand relation (viśeṣaṇa-viśeṣya-bhāva). This is an important one. The Nyāya believe that absences are ‘real’ objects, e.g. the absence of an elephant in the room now, and that they can be perceived. Absences are said to qualify their substrata, and are perceived indirectly, by the perceiver seeing the substratum. The Buddhist Dharmakīrti argued that this is really an inference from non-apprehension (anupalabdhi-hetu) running thus: “I perceive the walls of the room; if there were an elephant, I would not see it, and my perceptual faculties are working normally; therefore, there is no elephant”.

7.3 Gaṅgeśa’s Criticisms and New Definition

Gaṅgeśa criticises Principle 1 on three grounds: (a) it entails that every awareness is perceptual since every awareness is produced by the instrumentality of the ‘inner’ sense faculty or manas; (b) it fails to include divine perception, which involves no sensory connection; and (c) there is no one type of sensory connection, nor anything obviously in common to the ad hoc list of six types. Gaṅgeśa therefore offers a new definition:

Principle 3: A perceptual experience is a cognition which has no other non-mnemonic cognition as its ‘special’ instrumental cause (karaṇa).

Two objections to this definition are countered. Objection 1: Since every qualificative cognition is produced by a prior awareness of the qualifier, the definition under-extends. Reply: No. The awareness of the qualifier is merely an auxiliary causal factor, the ‘special’ instrumental cause is a sense-object contact. Objection 2: Since recognition, which is a type of perception, does have the prior awareness of the qualifier as its ‘special’ instrumental cause, the definition under-extends. Reply: No. The ‘special’ causal factor is the memory of the qualifier triggered by the dispositional trace produced by the prior awareness, not the prior awareness itself.

Gaṅgeśa’s definition has the virtue of capturing the sense in which perceptual experience is more ‘immediate’ than other types of experience, and is also applicable both to human and to divine perception. Restricted to human perception, it turns into the previous definition (Gaṅgeśa says that the ‘inner’ sense should not be regarded as perceptual after all).

8. Logical Theory and Gaṅgeśa’s Analysis of Inferential Warrant (vyāpti)

8.1 Overview of Logical Theory

Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi is divided into four parts, one for each of the four knowledge-sources or pramāṇas recognised by the Nyāya school. The post-Gaṅgeśa scholars focused more and more exclusively on the second part, concerning inference, and wrote increasingly detailed commentaries on a comparatively small portion of the book, namely the part where Gaṅgeśa examines the relation between inferential sign and property-to-be-inferred, which is called the vyāpti, ‘pervasion’ or ‘inference-warranting’ relation (Ingalls 1951, Goekoop 1977, Wada 2007). Even today, in a traditional Indian education, study of these sub-commentaries on various subsections of the vyāpti section of Gaṅgeśa forms an essential part of the curriculum.

The general structure of a properly formulated Nyāya inference has three components: thesis, reason (hetu) and example (dṛṣṭānta). The thesis, again, has two components: the ‘locus’ (pakṣa) or place of the inference, and a property (sādhya) whose presence in the locus is to be inferred. Thus every Nyāya argument exhibits the same pattern: p has S, because it has H; e.g. d. For example, “The mountain ( = p) has fire (= S), because it has smoke ( = H); e.g. the kitchen ( = d)”. A sound argument must fulfil at least three criteria: (i) the reason property must be uncontroversially present in the locus; (ii) the reason property and the inferred property must be appropriately related, roughly such that wherever the reason is present, so is the inferred property; (iii) the example must be an uncontroversial place where both the reason property and the inferred property are present.

Certain topics concerning this account are addressed in The Manual of Reason and other Navya-Nyāya texts. Among them are: the conditions under which inference can take place, and the conditions under which the result is a knowledge-episode (TS 49, 54); the correct account of the inference-warranting relation, between the inferential sign and the property-to-be-inferred, called the ‘pervasion’ or ‘vyāpti’ relation (TS 50); the distinction between inference and demonstration (svārtha- and parārtha- inference) (TS 52, 53); the three-fold classification of inference types, those which are ‘universally positive’ (kevalānvayin), those which are ‘universally negative’ (kevala-vyatirekin), and those which are combined positive and negative (anvaya-vyatirekin) (TS 55); the types of inferential fallacy (hetvābhāsa) (TS 57–64).

I will discuss mainly the definition of the ‘pervasion’ relation. First, however, a brief note on how the causal model of knowledge is applied to inference. The ‘special’ instrumental cause (karaṇa) of an inferential cognition is said to be the inferrer’s knowledge of the relevant pervasion relation. The ‘operative condition’ (vyāpāra) is said to be an awareness that the locus of inference (p) possesses such an inferential sign (h) as is pervaded by the property inferred (s). This is, in effect, an awareness which combines the two premises of the argument together immediately prior to the conclusion being derived, and is called the ‘parāmarśa’ or ‘consideration’. The ‘guṇa’ or ‘causal factor responsible for the truth’ of the inferential cognition is the condition that this ‘consideration’ be true, i.e. that the locus does in fact possess such a sign as is pervaded by the inferred property. Another auxiliary causal factor is that the inferrer must either not yet already know the conclusion or else must have a particular desire to infer (i.e. given, knowledge of the premises, the inference would normally take place mechanically, but if the conclusion is already known e.g. perceptually, then the inferrer has to have a special wish to re-establish it inferentially). This condition is known as ‘pakṣaṭā’, and should not to be confused with ‘pakṣadharmatā’, which is the name of condition (i) above.

8.2 Definitions of the Pervasion (vyāpti) Relation

Vyāpti or pervasion, is that relation between the inferential sign (hetu) and the inferred property (sādhya), which legitimises the inference. It would typically be expressed by a sentence such as “wherever there is smoke there is fire”, or “whatever exists is transitory”. Knowledge of this relation, according to the Nyāya, is the instrumental cause in the inferential process—it is that relation knowledge of which, when combined with observation of the inferential sign, will permit us to make a sound or knowledge-yielding inference. Gaṅgeśa therefore attaches great importance to the precise definition of this relation. He notes as many as twenty-one definitions all of which he rejects for some reason or other, and then he goes on to give seven further formulations, each of which he considers acceptable. Of the definitions he rejects, the first five came to be known as the ‘vyāpti-pañcaka’, and inspired a huge literature both among the Sanskrit commentators and their modern interpreters. These definitions are traceable to the earlier Buddhist and Nyāya literature. Two more rejected definitions, known as the ‘Lion and Tiger’ definitions, are apparently due to Gaṅgeśa’s Navya-Nyāya predecessors (Wada 2007, ch. 5). The definition Gaṅgeśa finally accepts is called his ‘siddhānta-lakṣaṇa’.

8.3 The ‘No Counter-Example’ Definition

The five definitions which make up Gaṅgeśa’s ‘vyāpti-pañcaka’ are all varieties of what we might dub the ‘no counter-example’ definition of the pervasion relation. This states that the inferred property S pervades the reason property H just in case there is no place/entity where H is located but S is absent. Formally:

Pervades (S, H) iff ¬(∃x)(Hx & Sx).

where S′ is used to denote the complement of S. This definition is traceable both to the early Nyāya notion of a ‘deviating’ pseudo-reason (i.e. one which occurs somewhere where the inferable property S is absent), and to Diṅnāga’s ‘triple-condition’ theory of the inferential sign, his third condition being that H must not be located in any “disagreeing case” (cf. ‘vipakṣa’), i.e. a place where S is absent. In either case, the intuition is that a relation expressed by “where there is smoke there is fire” obtains just in case there is no place where fire is absent but smoke is present, i.e. no counter-example. The first definition which Gaṅgeśa considers is of just this form. It is that S pervades H iff H has “non-occurrence in the loci of absence of S” (sādhyābhāvavad-avṛttitvam), i.e. V1.

Why is this plausible-seeming interpretation of the notion of pervasion rejected in Navya-Nyāya? There are two reasons:

The Problem of Partially Locatable Properties. The first problem with the ‘no counter-example’ definition depends on the Navya-nyāya notion of partial location (avyāpya-vṛtti). A property is said to occur wholly or completely in an object if it occurs in every part of that object. For example, the property of being golden occurs completely in a piece of (pure) gold; the object is ‘saturated’ (abhivyāpya) by the property, just as sesame oil saturates a sesame seed. Some properties, however, occur in some parts of the object but not others—these are called “partially locatable”. For example, the property of being molten occurs at the centre of the Earth but not at the periphery. Note that the same property can be wholly located in some loci and partially located in others—e.g. redness occurs wholly in a ruby but partially in a red snooker ball. The distinction concerns two modes of property-possession, not two types of property. An important point is that, if a property is partially located in an object, then so is its negation. The Naiyāyikas’ standard example of a partially locatable property, viz. “…is in contact with a monkey” (kapi-samyoga), illustrates the point. If the monkey is sitting on a branch of a tree, then the following statements may be true:

  1. The tree is in-contact-with-the-monkey at time t, and
  2. The tree is not-in-contact-with-the-monkey at time t,

(2) being true because there are parts of the tree with which the monkey is not in contact. Nyāya avoids the threatened violation of the law of non-contradiction by relativising the notion of occurrence. (1) is thus analysed as “the occurrence, of the property being-in-contact-with-the-monkey in the tree, is delimited by (avacchinna) the branch”. Since a different delimitor appears in (2), there is no inconsistency between the two statements.

The main effect of admitting partially located properties into the system is that it is no longer the case that a property, P, and its complement, P′, are disjoint: they may now intersect. If the inferred property is partially located, then the class of “agreeing cases” (sapakṣas - places where the inferred property is present) and the class of “disagreeing cases” (vipakṣas—places where the inferred property is absent) overlap rather than being distinct classes. To put it another way, a property P should be thought of as having both a “presence range” (P+) and an “absence range” (P−), and the two may overlap. Consider now the standard inference “The mountain has fire, because it has smoke”. Suppose we find a place where smoke is present, and fire is both absent and also present, e.g. the kitchen. Does this show the inference to be faulty? According to definition V1, it does, because the kitchen will be a counter-example, a place where smoke is present and fire absent. But this is wrong: since fire is also present there, it is not a real counter-example to the rule “where there is smoke there is fire”. The upshot is that we must examine the “presence ranges” of the reason property and inferred properties, not their “absence ranges”. A real counter-example to rule is a case which is in the presence-range of the reason property but not in the presence range of the inferred property.

Gaṅgeśa’s second definition is designed to solve this problem: H’s “non-occurrence in the loci of absence of S which are different from locus of S”. In other words, a locus of absence of S which is also not a locus of S should not be a locus of H:

Pervades (S, H) iff ¬(∃x)(Hx & Sx & ¬Sx).

The effect of the new clause is precisely to rule out the problem of partially locatable properties, by specifying more restrictively what constitutes a counter-example.

The Problem of Universally Positive Inference. There are, claim the Nyāya, patterns of legitimate inference in which the property inferred has as its extension the entire domain. Such inference are called ‘kevalānvayin’ or ‘universally positive’ (cf. TS 55). The stock Nyāya example is the inference “This is nameable, because it is knowable”, nameability being regarded as a property of everything. Another example would be “This exists because it is produced”. If such an inference is sound, then its reason property and inferred property must exemplify the pervasion relation. According to the above definition, to say that nameability pervades knowability is to say that any locus of the property absence-of-nameability is not a locus of knowability. The problem is that, since nameability is a universal property, absence-of-nameability is an uninstantiated (aprasiddha) property, and the Nyāya claim that such properties are ontologically suspect. To put it another way, the statement “any locus of the property absence-of-nameability is not a locus of knowability” includes a non-referring expression, “locus-of-absence-of-nameability” or “unnameable thing”, and hence is not truth-evaluable. The problem does not arise for all uninstantiated properties, for some, e.g. being a sky-lotus, or being a square circle, can be shown to be constructs made out of simpler instantiated properties. Thus, the statement “The square circle is circular” can be taken not as containing a non-referring expression, but as meaning “The circle is square and circular”. However, ‘unnameable (thing)’ is not decomposable into two distinct properties this way.

None of the interpretations of the ‘no counter-example’ definition considered by Gaṅgeśa can solve the problem of universally positive inferences, and Gaṅgeśa accordingly rejects them all. His own definition uses a trick to get round the problem.

8.4 Gaṅgeśa’s Definition: the ‘siddhānta-lakṣaṇa

The Manual of Reason reproduces with slight simplification Gaṅgeśa’s new definition. It says that S and H are related by the pervasion relation just in case there is collocation of H with S and S is not a property the absence of which is collocated with H (hetusamānādhikaraṇātyantābhāvāpratiyogi-sādhyasāmānādhikaraṇyam vyāptiḥ; TS 50). Almost the same formulation is found in other Navya-Nyāya texts, such as the Siddhānta-muktāvali. This definition is supposed to be applicable even if the inferred property S is ‘universally positive’. The idea, roughly, is that if S pervades H then no property whose absence is collocated with H can be identical to S. If we can find an instance of a locus of smoke which is also a locus of the absence of some property, coldness say, then coldness cannot be identical with fieriness. That is:

Pervades (S, H) only if (∃x)(Hx & Px) → (PS).

(There is an implicit quantification over P here). What this says is that there is no place where H is collocated with the absence of S, but it does so without actually using the potentially non-referring phrase “absence of S”, and it thereby avoids the problem of universally positive properties. However, although this condition is necessary for pervasion, it is not sufficient, for it is consistent with H (or S) being uninstantiated. So Gaṅgeśa insists too that H and S must be collocated:

Pervades (S, H) iff
x (Hx & Px) → (PS), and
x (Hx & Sx).

Gaṅgeśa’s trick implicitly trades on the theorem “AB ≡ ¬ (A & ¬ B)”. Thus clause (i) is virtually equivalent to V1. This shows too that we do not yet have a definition which can deal with the partially locatable properties, for which we need something more like V2. Hence Gaṅgeśa’s final definition is:

Pervades (S, H) iff
x (Hx & Px & ¬Px) → (PS), and
x (Hx & Sx).

This definition of pervasion is able to handle both universally positive properties and partially located properties appearing as inferred property.

One may wonder why it is that, since a pervasion relation is of the form “all Hs are S”, the Naiyāyikas did not simply use the notion of universal quantification in their definitions. The answer, perhaps, is that they were in fact trying to define this notion, and to do so only in terms of certain other notions which they took to be primitive, especially the notion of co-location and absence. If this is correct, however, then we must show how to reconstruct the definition without its implicit quantification over a property P (cf. Goekoop 1967).

9. Meaning, Understanding and Testimony

9.1 The Language Processing Mechanism

Just as perception and inference are described, in the pramāṇa system, as knowledge-yielding faculties, so too is language. This leads the Nyāya to formulate a description of the mechanism by which a competent language-user is able to decode noise-utterances and derive language-based knowledge. The description The Manual of Reason gives of this ‘language processing mechanism’ is as follows (TS 67, 68). The input to the process is the hearer’s auditory perception of a spoken utterance qua uninterpreted noise, and this is identified as the ‘special’ instrument cause (karaṇa). For example, hearing the noise-string

“The” “cat” “is” “on” “the” “mat”.

The ‘operative condition’ (vyāpāra) is the hearer’s (tacit) knowledge of the meaning (śakti-jñāna) of each of the words in the utterance. This is what marks off a person who understands the language in question from one who does not (but who may, nevertheless hear the words spoken, without having the capacity to interpret them). For example, knowledge that

“the cat” means the cat,
“the mat” means the mat, and
“is on” means the substratum-superstratum relation.

The output of the process, i.e. the effect of the combined causal factors, is the hearer’s forming a belief, for example belief that

The cat is on the mat.

Just as, in the case of perception, a number of auxiliary causal factors, such as there being adequate lighting, the perceiver’s sense-faculty being in good condition, the perceiver paying attention, etc., so here too. Nyāya isolates four such factors for special attention, namely: spatio-temporal ‘contiguity’ (sannidhi) of the uttered words; the speaker’s intention (tātparya); ‘syntactic expectancy’ (ākāṅkṣā); and ‘semantic fitness’ (yogyatā) (cf. TS 67). The first is self-explanatory: if the words in the utterance are uttered one at a time over a long period of time, or mixed in with the words of a distinct utterance, it will be impossible form a proper auditory perception of the utterance. The second, ‘speaker’s intention’ is appealed to when the sentence contains an ambiguous word—disambiguation proceeds via consideration of the speaker’s intended meaning. The Manual of Reason defines ‘syntactic expectancy’ as ‘the inability of one word to produce, without another word, an awareness of the relation between them’, and it cites, as an example of an utterance which fails to possess such expectancy, the sentence “horse man elephant”. Clearly the idea is at least that the utterance must be grammatically correct. More than that, there is a suggestion that it is in virtue of the syntactical rules that the unarticulated semantic relations between the words are expressed. What makes it the case that someone who understands the utterance “the cat is on the mat” grasps a united proposition, and not just a list of items [the cat, the on-relation, the mat]? The idea here, perhaps, is that (knowledge of) the syntactical rules generates an awareness of the connecting relations between each of these items.

‘Semantic fitness’ (yogyatā) is an intriguing concept. The Manual of Reason defines it as ‘the absence of incompatibility among what is signified by the words’, and illustrates its definition by contrasting the sentence “He sprinkles the field with water” with “He sprinkles the field with fire”. The idea is that the activity of sprinkling is ‘compatible with’ (i.e. can only be done with) a liquid like water, and not with a substance like fire. It would be like saying “Cathood is on the mat” or perhaps Chomsky’s “Colourless green ideas sleep furiously”. Such sentences, though grammatically correct, do not make sense. This causal factor, then, is that an utterance is intelligible only if the proposition expressed is ontologically possible, by the light of a preconceived ontological system, such as the Vaiśeṣika system of categories. Some Naiyāyikas, however, impose a more demanding requirement, that to be ‘semantically fit’ the utterance must be true, i.e. that ‘fit’ = ‘true’, not merely ‘possible’, and consequently that an utterance is intelligible only if it is true! In effect, they identify ‘semantic fitness’ with the ‘guṇa’ or ‘causal factor leading to truth’, in the language-processing mechanism. We will return to this dispute a little later.

9.2 Semantic Power and the Reduction of Semantic Properties

The Manual of Reason’s definition of a word is celebrated and often quoted. It says (TS 66) that a word is that which has semantic power (śaktaṃ padam). A sentence (vākya) is defined as a collection of words. So The Manual of Reason’s definition fits with the modern one, according to which a word is a semantically significant sentential constituent. Semantic power is that knowledge of which enables the competent hearer to interpret the word, and this, for the Naiyāyikas, consists in the word’s standing for an object. Thus, someone who understands the word “cat” knows something of the form <“cat” means cat>, where “means” is a relation between words and objects of some type. The Manual of Reason raises three questions about this relation: (i) Is it a new and irreducible type or relation, not reducible, that is, to any of the relations already admitted (TSD 66a)? (ii) What is the relatum, i.e. with what type of entity are words semantically related (TSD 66b, k)? (iii) How do we learn the meaning of a word (TSD 66c, d).

(i) The Mīmāṃsakas and Grammarians were ‘essentialists’ about meaning, arguing that the Sanskrit language is a natural entity, independent of human convention or usage, whose words possess intrinsic semantic powers to signify objects, just as fire has the intrinsic capacity to burn. The Naiyāyikas traditionally opposed this view, arguing instead that language is a product of convention, and that it is possible to account for a word’s semantic power in terms of stipulations governing its use. The claim is that we can define (and hence analyse) the meaning-relation thus:

x means y iff there is a decree/stipulation (saṅketa) of the form “Let utterances of x generate cognitions of y”.

Now a stipulation or decree is claimed to consist in the decree-maker’s having a certain mental state, viz. a ‘desire’ or ‘will’ (icchā) of the form specified. Thus, the meaning relation is analysed in terms of mental states and their contents, and not as a new type of relation. Who is the decree-maker? The Manual of Reason states that it is God, but most later Naiyāyikas drew a distinction between words which have belonged ‘endlessly’ in the language (introduced by God) and words introduced by an explicit human stipulation (e.g. the technical terms in Pāṇini’s grammar).

(ii) What is the meaning-relatum of a word like “cow”, a generic nominal expression? Here again The Manual of Reason contrasts the Nyāya view with that of the Mīmāṃsakas. One sub-school of Mīmāṃsakas (the Bhātta) claim that the meaning of “cow” is the universal cowhood, since sentences like “(The) cow is an animal”, or injunctive laws like “Never kick a cow”, say something about the entire class of cows, not about any one individual. Thus:

“cow” means cowhood.

In reply to the obvious objection, that in many other sentences, such as “The cow is in the garden”, a particular cow is referred to, these Mīmāṃsakas appeal to the idea that a sentence can carry an ‘implication’ (ākṣepa) other than its literal meaning. Thus the sentence “The cow is in the garden” may mean literally that cowhood is collocated with occurrence-in-the-garden (i.e. that there exists a cow in the garden), but carries the implication that a certain particular cow is in the garden. The principle here is that a prior awareness of the qualifier (viśeṣaṇa) leads to an implicated awareness of the thing qualified (viśeṣya) (TSD 66b). The Nyāya reply to this argument proceeds by way of rejecting the principle cited, for, they say, awareness of a qualifier or universal is possible only via an awareness of the thing qualified.

The Manual of Reason states the modern Nyāya view: the meaning of an utterance of the word “cow” is a particular individual as qualified by cowhood (jāti-viśiṣṭa-vyakti):

“cow” means a-cow-as-qualified-by-cowhood.

The idea is this. Anyone who understands an utterance of the sentence “(The) cow is in the garden” does so by (a) identifying a certain object as the referent of the word “cow”, and (b) grasps that that individual is qualified by the property occurrence-in-the-garden. However, one can only identify an object by distinguishing it from others, and this involves the use of a distinguishing feature. So the individual is grasped in awareness as distinguished/qualified by the feature cowhood. Since the meaning of a word is, by definition, its contribution to the final belief generated by hearing the utterance containing the word, the meaning of “cow” is an individual as qualified by cowhood. Note that, on such a theory, token utterances of “cow” vary with respect to the individual to which they refer, but every token utterance nevertheless shares a common semantic property, viz. “ …—qualified-by-cowhood”. The Naiyāyikas in this way draw a distinction between type- and token- meaning (or, as some say, between meaning and reference).

The other Mīmāṃaka sub-school (Prābhākara) claim that, in order to explain the fact that, on hearing a sentence, we grasp a unified proposition and not just a list of entities, the meaning-relatum of a word like “cow” is ‘an object connected with another’ (itarānvita). The meaning-relatum is a cow along with a ‘hook’ to link it with other meaning-relata. More precisely, the meaning of the word would be something like

“cow” means a cow-individual, which is ……

So the sentence “The cow is in the garden” does not just mean the list <cow, being in the garden>, as it would if each word simply designated an object, but rather the connected proposition <cow-which-is in-the-garden>. The idea, in effect, is that all meaning-relata, are, in Frege’s terminology, ‘unsaturated’. To this ingenious suggestion, The Manual of Reason replies (TSD 66k) that it is superfluous, for “since it is possible for the relation [between meaning-relata] to be apprehended as what is signified by the sentence [as a whole], it is not necessary to postulate a semantic power with reference to the relation”. In other words, The Manual of Reason claims that general (presumably syntactic) features of the sentence are enough to connect the meaning-relata, without needing to claim that those meaning-relata themselves do the connecting.

(iii) The Naiyāyikas offer the following account (TSD 66c) of language acquisition. The child makes a series of observations concerning the linguistic behaviour of adults. She hears adult A utter a certain noise “Bring the cow” say, and sees adult B perform a certain action, bringing of the cow. Again, she hears A utter the noise “Bring the horse”, and sees B bring the horse, and hears “Feed the cow” and sees the cow being fed. Then, by a twin inductive process, of (a) “agreement in presence” (anvaya) and “agreement in absence” (vyatireka)—i.e. noticing the correlation between A making or not making an utterance and B performing or not performing an action, and (b) ‘collection’ (āvāpa) and ‘rejection (udvāpa)—i.e. noticing the regularities between utterances of “cow” and events concerning the cow, utterances of “bring” and bringing events, etc., the child understands that the word “cow” is linked with objects belonging the class of cows, etc.

This is an empiricist account of language learning reminiscent of the account attributed by Wittgenstein to Augustine, and severely criticised by him. Apart from the superhuman inferential powers attributed to the child, the problem highlighted by Wittgenstein is that no amount of observation can show, for example, that the relevant correlation is between “cow” and cow-individuals, and not between “cow” and B’s cow-directed-actions, the universal cowhood, heifers rather than cows, etc. (cf. TSD 66d).

9.3 Testimony

The Manual of Reason says that statements are either Vedic or secular. It adds that (hearing a) Vedic statement is a pramāṇa, a means of knowing that which is stated, because Vedic statements are originally uttered by God. (The Mīmāṃsakas dispute this. Not believing in God, they say instead that a Vedic statement is a means of knowing precisely because it has no personal origin, and error in testimony is always a result of human error in the source!) Hearing a secular statement is a means of knowing only if the speaker is an ‘authoritative person’ (āpta). An authoritative person is defined as one who speaks the truth (yathārthavaktā). There is an ambiguity here: is an authoritative person one who is speaking the truth with respect to the particular utterance in question, or one who is generally truthful? Another question here is: must the testifiee know that the testifier is an authority in this sense or not?

To confuse matters further, The Manual of Reason says that the ‘guṇa’, causal factor responsible for the truth of the testifiee’s belief, is ‘yathārtha-yogyatā-jñāna’, which can mean either (i) veridical cognition of semantic fitness, or (ii) cognition of veridical semantic fitness. In either case, the ‘guṇa’ has nothing to do with the speaker’s credentials, it seems. Option (ii), however, must be wrong, for it cannot be a condition upon testimony that the hearer already knows that what was said is true. Option (i), however, would not guarantee that the final hearer’s belief is true, unless by ‘fitness’ The Manual of Reason now intends a rather stronger notion, according to which the meaning-relata ‘fit’ together iff they are in fact connected, i.e. if the utterance expresses a truth. This is, indeed, how some other Naiyāyikas understand the notion of yogyatā, but does not accord with The Manual of Reason’s own definition.

I propose the following resolution. The language processing mechanism was described above as one which issues in the testifiee believing that which the testifier says. The truth of the testifiee’s belief will therefore depend upon whether or not the testifier is speaking truly, and so this should be called the ‘guṇa’ here. However, we do not always believe what we hear, especially if we have reasons to suppose that the speaker is not likely to be speaking the truth. It is possible, then, that the output of the language processing mechanism is not simply belief in what was said, but rather belief simply that it has been said. There are, roughly, two sorts of case when this can happen: (1) if the testifiee judges that the testifier is deceitful or unreliable or simply uninformed about the topic, and (2) if the testifiee knows on independent grounds that what the testifier is saying is false (which is consistent with the testifier believing it and testifying sincerely), perhaps on a priori grounds concerning the plausibility of the assertion. With a little interpretative licence, we might think that these two conditions correspond to the two conditions imposed by The Manual of Reason on testimony: that the testifier must be an ‘authority’ (āpta), and that the sentence must be ‘semantically fit’ (yogya).

10. The Vaiśeṣika Concepts of Universal, Inherence, and Basic Differentium

10.1 Universals

The Manual of Reason reports the standard Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika definition of a universal (sāmānya, jāti):

A universal is something which is (i) eternal, (ii) unitary, and (iii) located in a plurality of things (substances, qualities or motions). (TS 82)

Universals are thus conceived of as unstructured, objective properties which necessarily reside in individuals. The postulation of such entities in the Vaiśeṣika schema has explanatory force, accounting for the distinction between ‘natural’ and ‘conventional’ classifications. Intuitively, this is the distinction between groupings such as the class of cows or horses, which reflect natural divisions (“cut nature at the joints”), and those such as the class of Cabinet Ministers or the class of endangered species, which reflect anthropocentric concerns. The Naiyāyikas mark this distinction by calling natural properties “universals” (jāti) and anthropocentric properties “imposed” or “nominal” properties (upādhi). Correlatively, a semantic distinction is drawn between “natural kind terms” (naimittikī), i.e. terms the basis for whose application is a universal, and “imposed kind terms”, terms whose basis for application is an anthropocentric property. Udayana tried to make this distinction more precise by giving a list of criteria for a property to count as natural. Examination of his list (which are called the “jāti-bādhakas”—impediments distinguishing natural properties) will reveal something further about the nature of the natural properties according to Nyāya.

The six impediments are (1) ‘non-plurality’—a genuine universal must be plurally instantiated; (2) ‘equipollence’ (tulyatva)—two co-extensive properties cannot both be genuine universals; (3) ‘cross-connection’ (saṃkara)—two genuine universals must not partially overlap; (4) ‘regress’—a property like universality cannot itself be a universal, on pain of infinite regress (universality-hood, etc. etc.); (5) a property like differentia-hood cannot be a genuine universal, for by definition the basic differentia share no common universal property; (6) a property like inherence-hood cannot be a universal, since it does not inhere in its loci. Of these six, the last three are there basically to maintain the internal consistency of the Vaiśeṣika system, and the first is a straightforward consequence of the definition of a universal. It debars a singly-instanced properties such as space-hood from the status of genuine natural kind, perhaps motivated by the thought that the very nature of a universal consists in its grounding judgements of the form “x is of the same kind as y”, which presuppose that there are at least two entities.

The second and third criteria are the most important, and can be stated more formally as follows. If P and Q are distinct properties, then (equipollence, tulyatva):

[P] = [Q] → either P or Q (or both) is not a universal,

where ‘[P]’ denotes the extension of P. The contraposed form is:

P and Q are universals → [P] ≠ [Q].

Note that this does not entail that universal properties are extensionally individuated or equivalent to classes, as some have maintained. It shows only that corresponding to each class, there is at most one universal. Although, within the domain of universals, a universal is uniquely determined by its extension, the distinction between a universal and a co-extensive imposed property (e.g. pothood and conch-shell-like-neck-hood) is an intensional distinction.

As for the third impediment (sāṃkarya), if P and Q are distinct properties, then

[P] partially overlaps [Q] → either P or Q (or both) is not a universal.

The contraposed form is:

P and Q are universals → [P] ⊂ [Q] or [P] ⊃ [Q] or [P] ∩ [Q] = ∅.

(The inclusion is strict because of the ‘equipollence’ constraint.) In other words, genuine universals are arranged in a hierarchy: given two universals, either they are related as genus and species, all instances of one being instances of the other, or else they are completely disjoint, having no instance in common (e.g. cowhood-animalhood, cowhood-treehood). The Nyāya say that, if one universal is thus subsumed by another, the former is ‘lower’ (apara) and the latter is ‘higher’ (para) (cf. TS 6). The ‘highest’ universal of all is ‘existentness’ (sattā), into whose extension falls every substance, quality and motion. The demand that universals be organised hierarchically shows that the Nyāya took as their paradigm the biological species, which tend to exhibit this structure. Bearing in mind that the term for “universal”, i.e. “jāti” is also the word for caste, Matilal (1971: 76) speculates that

[O]ne might discover in the Nyāya doctrine of generic property a remote influence of the socio-religious ideas of the Brahmins. Translated into biological terms, the … principle of ‘non-overlapping’ becomes a principle which opposes cross-breeding. There is thus some evidence that the Nyāya bias for real generic properties was partly influenced by the Brahmanical concept of an ideal social order where intermixture of classes is not to be permitted.

Some Naiyāyikas, especially Bhāsarvajña and Raghunātha, reject the ‘cross-connection’ impediment, pointing out the problems encountered trying to apply it to non-biological natural kinds (e.g. redness and greenness overlap, as do pothood and goldhood). Raghunātha suggests that consistent application of this principle would eliminate virtually all universals from the ontology. Udayana’s criterion of a property to be ‘natural’ is thus not a necessary one, and neither is it sufficient: none of his impediments shows why the pair ‘blue-green’ is more natural than Goodman’s pair ‘grue-bleen’ (where x is grue iff x is green and examined before time t, and is blue otherwise, and vice versa for bleen.)

The idea that universals are, in some sense, ‘located’ in particulars generated two distinctive objections to the theory. Diṅnāga trades on the spatial metaphor to argue that the Nyāya conception of universals is incoherent. For, if a universal is ‘unitary’, it can be located in at most one place, and thus not ‘plurally instanced’. If, conversely, if is located simultaneously at many places, that can only be because it has parts, each located at a different place, and hence is not ‘unitary’. This argument plays on the ambiguity of the notion of ‘being located’, and pretends that a universal like cowhood is located in individual cows in just the same sense that a cow is located in a field. Nevertheless, it forces the Nyāya to be more careful in its account of the universal-particular relation. As The Manual of Reason notes (TS 84), a universal is said to reside in its instances by the relation of ‘inherence’ (samavāya), defined as an “inseparability” (ayutasiddhi) relation. Of two entities, x and y,

x is inseparable from y iff x cannot exist unless y exists.

The idea is that a cow cannot exist unless the universal cowhood exists, and that it is in this sense that cowhood is located in the cow. (The same relation is claimed to occur between non-repeatable ‘qualities’ (guṇa) and substances, a whole and its parts, and the basic differentia and the atoms.) Spatial location, on the other hand, involves a quite different relation, namely contact (saṃyoga). In this way, the term ‘location’ is disambiguated.

The other problem is the classic one: what happens to a universal if all its instances are destroyed? Can universals exist without being instantiated? The definition of the inherence relation permits this, for the requirement is that cows cannot exist without cowhood, not vice versa. We might say that the cow’s existence supervenes on that of the universal cowhood. However, it is not so clear that we can say in the same way that the parts (of a car, say) cannot exist unless the whole (car) exists.

10.2 The Basic Differentia (viśeṣa)

The Vaiśeṣika traditionally and uniquely accept into their ontology a category of item called ‘basic differentia’ (viśeṣa), from which, some claim, they derive their name. The Manual of Reason defines these items as follows (TS 83): “those entities which reside in the eternal substances [i.e. the atoms] and function as their differentiators are called viśeṣa”. The idea is that, just as a cow and a horse are distinct entities, as they have distinct properties, so too even two atoms of the same substance, e.g. earth, must differ with respect to at least one property. Each atom, therefore, possesses a ‘differentium’ unique to itself, which serves to distinguish it from any other atom of the same type. The assumption, then, is that any two non-identical items are distinguished by virtue of possessing distinct properties. This is the contraposed version of Leibniz’ Law that Indiscernibles are Identical, that (∀P)(PxPy) → (x = y), where “P” ranges over properties. The principle faces triviality unless certain constraints are placed on the range of properties quantified over. For example, if the property “… = y” is permitted, the principle states vacuously that identicals are identical. The Vaiśeṣikas implicitly restrict the principle to intrinsic, non-relational properties of the objects concerned, ruling out, for example, ‘being at a certain spatial or temporal location’ as being a property capable of discriminating two otherwise identical objects. Thus, the claim seems to be that no two objects, including atoms, can be intrinsically identical. This is how Leibniz himself appears to have understood his Law, saying that “It is always necessary that beside the difference of time and place there be internal principles of distinction….thus although time and place serve in distinguishing things, we do not easily distinguish them by themselves,” and that “There is no such thing as two individuals indiscernible from each other. Two drops of water, or milk, viewed with a microscope, will appear distinguishable from each other”.

The principle is, admittedly, as strong one. Wittgenstein (Tractatus 5.5302) points out that it entails the logical impossibility of a universe containing two identical spheres; Wiggins notes that it implies the logical impossibility of even a single sphere (or any other symmetrical object), since it entails the identity of the two hemispheres (and so on until one reaches a geometrical point). More to the point, as the Vaiśeṣikas implicitly realised, it implies the logical impossibility of more than one atom of a given substance (having a certain velocity, spin, etc.). Rather than reject the principle, however, they instead introduced new intrinsic properties, the basic differentia, thereby avoiding the unpalatable consequence.

11. The Ontology of Nonexistence (abhāva) and the Semantics of Negative Statements

11.1 Motivations

The later Naiyāyikas develop a remarkable theory of nonexistence. According to them, the absence of an object or feature at a particular spatial or temporal location is a state of affairs just as objective as the presence of the object or feature there. To Kanāḍa’s original list of six categories (padārtha) or types of existent, they therefore add a seventh, ‘absence’ (abhāva). This ontological doctrine is underpinned by (i) phenomenological and (ii) semantic considerations.

(i) The phenomenological point was that a negative awareness, say that a certain person is not in the room, is a kind of awareness phenomenally distinct from any awareness about what is in the room. Cognition of what is not has an autonomous phenomenology (this idea is notably articulated by Sartre). The principle appealed to is thus:

Experiences of nonexistence are phenomenally distinct from, and irreducible to, experiences of existents.

The idea emerges in the Nyāya epistemology with their claim that absence is perceived, and that this perception is a sui generis type of perceptual experience, not reducible to a combination of ordinary perception and inference (cf. the sixth type of sensory connection in Uddyotakara’s list).

(ii) The semantic point is that the Nyāya espouse a version of the correspondence theory of truth, according to which true sentences correspond to facts. It is alleged that true negative sentences (e.g. “The pot is not on the ground”) correspond to ‘negative facts’. Facts, however, are all, for the Nyāya, of the same basic relational form, ‘bRa’ (they are said to have a qualificand-relation-qualifier structure; i.e. they are complexes of existing entities). This restriction on what constitutes a fact is expressible via the following semantical principle:

Sentences correspond to facts constructed out of simple or complex entities (i.e. entities like ‘a’, ‘absence of a’, ‘a-&-b’, ‘a-or-b’).

The principle entails that one cannot use the truth-functional connectives to construct facts, except where they are equivalent to term-logical connectives. (For example, the sentence “Rama and Sita are righteous” is equivalent to “Rama is righteous and Sita is righteous”, but the term-connective in “Rama and Sita are married” is not similarly eliminable in favour of the truth-functional conjunction “Rama is married and Sita is married”.) The point is that a sentence like “The pot is not on the ground” cannot correspond to a fact of the form ‘¬bRa’ (as there are no such facts according to P2), but must rather correspond to a fact of the form ‘bRā’. Hence the introduction into one’s ontology of negative entities.

11.2 Temporally and Spatially Located Absence

The Manual of Reason (TS 85–88) reports the usual Nyāya view that there are four types of absence: prior nonexistence (prāgabhāva); posterior nonexistence or ‘destruction’ (dhvaṃsa); ‘constant’ or ‘absolute’ absence (atyantābhāva); and difference (anyonyābhāva). Of these, the first two refer to possible temporal states of a transient object. Suppose we represent the temporal duration of a person A by the following line (assuming that he lived between 1650 and 1750):

t1 1650 t2 1750 t3  

At any time t1 prior to 1650, A does not yet exist, and at any time t3 later than 1750, A no longer exists. In accordance with the above principles, Nyāya reformulates these negative existential claims as positive existential statements about negative entities, namely, the ‘prior absence of A’, ‘<A’ say, and the ‘posterior absence of A’, ‘A>’ say. Thus, the first reads:

<A exists at t1,

or, since, in the Nyāya idiom, objects are said to be located in time as well as in space,

  1. <A is located at t1.


  1. A> is located at t3.

What happens at times such as t2? These are times at which A exists or is present (is located). Note, furthermore, that, at t2, there is a posterior absence of <A (for the prior absence of A is destroyed when A comes into existence), which we designate by ‘(<A)>’. There is also a prior absence of A> (for the posterior absence of A does not yet exist), i.e. ‘<(A>)’. The Manual of Reason (TSD 89E) records the older Naiyāyikas’ claim that these double absences must be identical with the original entity, on pain of an infinite regress. Thus:

(<A)> = <(A>) = A.

Later Naiyāyikas apparently disputed this natural identity (which corresponds to the Law of Double Negation in classical logic), on the ground that double negative constructions contain the concept of negation, and hence are logically more complex.

A third type of absence, called ‘constant’ or ‘absolute’ absence (atyantābhāva) is illustrated by constructions of the form “The pot is not on the ground”. The Manual of Reason states (TS 87) that what distinguishes this type of absence is that it is located in the three times—past, present and future. This seems odd, as it might be that the pot is on the ground at some times but not others. Perhaps the point is that the locus of the absence here is a spatial entity rather than a temporal one. For example, the construction “Heat is not in ice” illustrates this kind of absence. Perhaps, furthermore, the force of this negation is that the pot is never located on the ground—hence we cannot speak of the prior or posterior absence of the pot (for these concepts are defined in terms of times when the pot is present). (E.g. Udayana’s definition of a substance as that which does not have a constant absence of qualities.)

The fourth type of absence, ‘difference’ (anyonyābhāva), is illustrated by the sentence “The pot is not (the) cloth”. This is to be read as a non-identity statement.

The Naiyāyikas thus say that every negative sentence is the negation of a sentence of the form “aRb”, and they distinguish between cases where the relation R is the identity relation and cases where it is a relation other than identity. The object a is called the locus of the absence, and the object b is called the ‘counterpositive’ or ‘negatum’ (pratiyogin) of the absence, i.e. it is the object whose presence in the locus is being denied. This highlights the fact that absences are thought of as a kind of property or ‘locatable’, rather than as a kind of ‘location’ (at least when the relation is not identity). For example, the absence of A is located in many places at once. It is not said that there is a distinct absence-of-A at each and every place where A is absent. We can now see how the Nyāya parse negative sentences without using a sentential negation. Take the sentence “The pot is not blue”. The first-order paraphrase of this would be: It is not the case that the pot is blue (¬Fa). The Nyāya strategy is first to say that every property, such as blueness, has both an extension F (places where it is located) and a counter-extension F′ (places where its absence is located), and then to paraphrase the sentence as: The pot has absence-of-blue. Note that a partially locatable property is one for which the extension and counter-extension overlap—it is possible for a feature to be collocated with its absence.

11.3 The Logic of Negation

The Manual of Reason (TS 89) makes some very interesting observations about the logical properties of absence or negation.

Reference versus description. It is claimed that there is a distinction between a qualified absence (viśiṣṭābhāva) and a mere absence (kevalābhāva). Consider the following pair of sentences:

  1. Annambhaṭṭa is not in the room, and
  2. The author of The Manual of Reason is not in the room.

The idea is that in (3) the ‘mere’ absence of Annambhaṭṭa is located in the room, whereas in (4) a qualified absence (of Annambhaṭṭa as qualified by authorhood) is located in the room. Do (3) and (4) really have distinct logical forms? Perhaps we find here a realisation that nominal expressions such as “The author of The Manual of Reason” have two distinct logical functions, namely those of referring to an individual and describing an individual via his properties. (4) can thus be read either as asserting the same as (3), that Annambhaṭṭa is not in the room, or as saying that the author of The Manual of Reason, whoever it or she is, is not in the room, i.e. that the properties “being the author of The Manual of Reason” and “being in the room” are not collocated. If that is the sense in which (4) involves a qualified absence, then (3) and (4) do have different logical forms.

Universal Quantification. The Manual of Reason draws another very important distinction, between a specific absence (viśeṣābhāva) and a generic absence (sāmānyābhāva). These are illustrated by the following sentences:

  1. (This) pot is not in the room, and
  2. (Any) pot is not in the room

(N.B. they would be expressed by the same sentence in Sanskrit; hence the brackets). To say that there is a specific absence of pot in the room is to say that some particular pot is not in the room, but to say that generic absence of pot in the room is to say that any pot is not in the room (i.e. no pot is in the room). The distinction is thus linked to the formulation of universally quantified constructions. Indeed, in Nyāya logical theory, generic absences are used to formulate the pervasion (vyāpti) relation: “where there is smoke there is fire” is contraposed to give “where there is no fire there is no smoke”, and this is expressed by saying that there is a generic absence of smoke in places where there is a generic absence of fire (cf. Ingalls 1951: 54–5). It is clear that (5) and (6) do have distinct logical forms. In the Nyāya technical language, the distinction is made out by saying that the property which delimits the counterpositiveness of the absence (i.e. the pratiyogitāvacchedaka) is this-pot-hood in (5), but pothood in (6).

Logical Connectives and De Morgan’s Laws. The Manual of Reason touches on the meaning of conjunctive and disjunctive absence, i.e. absence of (both A and B) (ubhayābhāva) and absence of (either A or B) (anyatarābhāva). It observes that an awareness that two pots are absent is consistent with an awareness that one pot is present (and the other absent). In fact, as Ingalls shows (1951: 63–67) the Nyāya recognised the validity of two general equations:

absence of (both A and B) = (absence of A) or (absence of B), and

absence of (either A or B) = (absence of A) and (absence of B).

These are recognisably versions of De Morgan’s Laws, that ¬(A & B) ≡ ¬A ∨ ¬B, and that ¬ (AB) ≡ ¬A & ¬B. As an example of the second of these laws, consider Mathuranātha’s remark (1951: 66) that a ‘heap’ of (specific) absences (abhāva-kūṭa) is equivalent to a generic absence. A place which is the locus of generic absence of fire is a place at which every particular fire is absent, and conversely, if every specific fire is absent, then fire is generically absent. Thus the ‘heap’ (conjunction) of specific absences of fire, is equivalent to the absence of any fire at all (the disjunction of specific fires).


Navya-Nyāya Texts in English Translation

  • The Manual of Reason (Annambhaṭṭa). Tarkasaṃgrahadīpikā on Tarkasaṃgraha, edited and translated by G. Bhattacharya. Calcutta: Progressive Publishers (1983).
  • Tattvacintāmaṇi (Gaṅgeśa). Epistemology Of Perception: Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi, Jewel Of Reflection On The Truth (About Epistemology): The Perception Chapter (Pratyakṣa-khaṇḍa), Transliterated Text, Translation, And Philosophical Commentary. By Stephen H. Phillips and N.S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. Treasury of the Indic Sciences. New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies, 2004.
  • Padārthatattvanirūpaṇa (Raghunātha). The Padārthatattvanirūpaṇam of Raghunātha śiromaṇi, trans. Karl Potter. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard-Yenching Institute (1957).
  • Nyāyasiddāntamañjarī (Janakīnātha Cūḍāmaṇi). Perception and Inference in the Nyāyasiddāntamañjarī, text, translation and notes, by Tuvia Gelblum. University of London PhD Thesis (1960–61).
  • Bhāṣāpariccheda (Viśvanātha). Bhāṣāparicceda with Siddhānta-muktāvalī, trans. Swami Madhavananda. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama (1996).
  • Tarka-kaumudī (Laugākṣi Bhāskara). The Moonlight of Logic: Studies in Laugākṣi Bhāskara’s Tarka-kaumudī, trans. Plamen Gradinarov. Delhi: Ajanta Books (1991).
  • Śaktivāda (Gadādhara). Gadādhara’s śaktivāda: Theory of the Expressive Power of Words, trans. V. P. Bhatta. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers (1994).

General Works

  • Anrò, Alberto, 2022, “Nyāya Formalized: Exercises of Application”, Philosophy East and West, 72 (1): 1–34.
  • Athalye, Y. V., 1930, Tarka-saṃgraha of Annambhaṭṭa, with the authors own Dīpikā and Govardhana’s Nyāya-bodhini, edited with critical and explanatory notes, 2nd Edition: Bombay Sanskrit Series, No. LV.
  • Atreya, B. L., 1948, The Elements of Indian Logic, with the text and translation of Tarkasaṃgraha, 3rd Edition: Bombay: Nalanda Publications.
  • Bagchi, S., 1953, Inductive Reasoning: A Study of tarka and its Role in Indian Logic, Calcutta: Calcutta Oriental Press Ltd.
  • Bhaduri, S., 1947, Studies in Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika Metaphysics, Poona: Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute.
  • Baslev, A. N., 1983, A Study of Time in Indian Philosophy, Wiesbaden: O. Harrassowitz.
  • Bhattacharya, C., 1966, The Elements of Indian Logic and Epistemology, Calcutta, Modern Book Agency.
  • Bhattacharyya, S., 1987, “Some Aspects of the Navya-Nyāya Theory of Pervasion”, in his Doubt, Belief and Knowledge.
  • –––, 2004, Development of Nyāya Philosophy and its Social Context, PHISPC Volume III Part 3, New Delhi: Centre for Studies in Civilizations.
  • Bhattacharyya, S. and K. H. Potter, 1994, “Navya-Nyāya from Gaṅgeśa to Raghunātha”, Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies (Vol. VI), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers.
  • Burton, Jim, 2020, “Diagrams for Navya-Nyāya”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 48 (2): 229–254.
  • Dash, Subash Chandra, 2013, A Navya-Nyāya discussion on the meaning of the negative particle nañ: a study of the Nañvādakārikā of Udayana, Toshihiro Wada (ed.), Nagoya: Nagoya University Association of Indian and Buddhist Studies.
  • David, Hugo & Duquette, Jonathan, 2021, “Epistemology, Logic and Metaphysics in Pre-Modern India: New Avenues for the Study of Navya-Nyāya”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 49 (2): 145–151.
  • Doctor, Payal, 2015, “Quotations, References, and the Re-use of Texts in the Early Nyāya Tradition”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 43 (2–3): 109–135.
  • Dravid, R. R., 1972, The Problem of Universals in Indian Philosophy, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers.
  • Faddegon, B., 1918, The Vaiceṣika System, described with the help of the oldest texts, Amsterdam: J. Muller.
  • Foucher, A., 1949, Le Compendium des Topiques D’ Annambhaṭṭa, Paris: A. Maisonneuve.
  • Ganeri, J., 2012, The Self: Naturalism, Consciousness and the First-Person Stance, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, The Lost Age of Reason: Philosophy in Early Modern India 1450–1700, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • Goekoop, G., 1977, The Logic of Invariable Concomitance in the Tattvacintāmaṇi, Dordrecht: Reidel; originally published 1967.
  • Guhe, Eberhard, 2022, “Maheśa Chandra’s Exposition of the Navya-Nyāya Concept of ‘Cognition’ (jñāna) from the Perspective of Inquisitive Logic”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 50 (5): 835–864.
  • Mullatti, L.C., 1977, The Navya-Nyāya Theory of Inference, Dharwad: Karnatak University.
  • Halbfass, W., 1992, On Being and What There Is: Classical Vaiśeṣika and the history of Indian Ontology, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Ingalls, D., 1951, Materials for the Study of Navya-nyāya Logic, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Mandal, K. K., 1968, A Comparative Study of the Concepts of Space and Time in Indian Thought, Varanasi: Chowkhamba Sanskrit Series Office.
  • Matilal, B. K., 1968, The Navya-nyāya Doctrine of Negation: The semantics and Ontology of Negative Statements in Navya-nyāya Philosophy, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1977, Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz.
  • –––, 1985, Logic, Language and Reality, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • –––, 1986, Perception: An Essay on Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • –––, 1991, The Word and the World: India’s Contribution to the Study of Language, Delhi: Oxford University Press.
  • Mishra, U., 1987, The Conception of Matter according to Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika, 2nd edition, Delhi: Gian Publishing House.
  • Mohanty, J. N., 1966, “Nyāya Theory of Doubt”, in his Essays on Indian Philosophy (1993). New Delhi ; Oxford: Oxford University Press, 44–61.
  • –––, 1992, Reason and Tradition in Indian Thought, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Phillips, S., 1995, Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of New Logic, London: Open Court.
  • –––, 2011, Epistemology in Classical India: The Knowledge Sources of the Nyaya School, London: Routledge.
  • Potter, K. H., 1977, “The Tradition of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika up to Gaṅgeśa”, Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies (Vol. II), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers.
  • Raja, K., 1966, Indian Theories of Meaning, Madras: Adyar Library and Research Centre.
  • Schayer, S., 1938, Contributions to the Problem of Time in Indian Philosophy, Kraków: Nakładem Polskiej Akademii Umiejętności.
  • Seal, B., 1915, The Positive Sciences of the Ancient Hindus, London: Longmans, Green.
  • Sen, P. K. (ed.), 2006, Philosophical Concepts Relevant to Sciences in Indian Tradition, PHISPC Volume III Part 4, New Delhi: Centre for Studies in Civilizations.
  • Sen, S. N., 1966, “The Impetus Theory of the Vaiśeṣika”, Indian Journal for the History of Science, 1, 34–45.
  • Shastri, S. K., 1961, A Primer of Indian Logic according to Annambhaṭṭa’s Tarkasaṃgraha, Madras: Kuppuswami Sastri Research Institute.
  • Siderits, M., 1991, Indian Philosophy of Language, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Staal, F., 1988, “Means of Formalisation in Indian and Western Logic”, in his Universal: Studies in Indian Logic and Linguistics (1988). Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 81–87.
  • Subbarayappa, B. V., 1968, “An Estimate of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra in the History of Science”, Indian Journal for the History of Science, 2: 24–34.
  • Tachikawa, M., 1981, The Structure of the World in Udayana’s Realism, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Thakur, A., 2003, Origin and Development of the Vaiśeṣika System, PHISPC Volume II Part 4, New Delhi: Centre for Studies in Civilizations.
  • Vattanky, J., 1984, Gaṅgeśa’s Philosophy of God, Madras: Adyar Library and Research Centre.
  • Wada, T., 2007, The Analytical Method of Navya-Nyāya, Groningen: Egbert Forsten.
  • Wada, Toshihiro, 2020, Navya-Nyāya philosophy of language. New Delhi: DK Printworld.

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