First published Wed Dec 2, 2020

Democratic societies are often characterized by extensive pluralism of religions, cultures, ethnicities, and worldviews, on the basis of which citizens make claims against their state. Democratic states are additionally characterized by a commitment to treat all citizens equally, and so they require fair and just ways to wade through and respond to these claims. This entry considers cultural claims in particular.

Cultural claims are ubiquitous in political and legal spaces. Not only do individuals and groups both make cultural claims against the state, often for legal or political accommodations, but the state often explains its choices in terms of protecting particular aspects of its culture. This entry will first examine the ways in which “culture” is defined by political and moral philosophers: culture-as-encompassing group, culture-as-social-formation, culture-as-narrative/dialogue, and culture-as-identity. Over the course of this discussion, the “essentialist” challenge will be introduced: an essentialist account of culture is one that treats certain key characteristics of that culture as defining it and correspondingly all of its members must share certain key traits in order to be treated as members (for more, see Phillips 2010). In particular, the entry goes on to note that early conceptions of culture-as-encompassing groups are criticized for being essentialist, and later conceptions are attempts to reformulate culture in ways that avoid the essentialist challenge.

Following an articulation of these main ways of understanding culture, the entry turns to an assessment of distinct (though occasionally overlapping) types of cultural claims that are pressed against the state by minority groups: exemption claims, assistance claims, self-determination claims, recognition claims, preservation claims (and claims against coerced cultural loss), defensive claims in legal settings, and exclusive use claims (claims against cultural appropriation). There are both justifications for, and objections to, these claims, and they often hinge on how “culture” is understood. In many cases, the disputes about the justifiability of these claims hinge on competing understandings of what culture is, and especially, how valuable it is to those who are members, as will be shown below. Finally, the entry will close with an assessment of cases where a majority community makes cultural claims to justify actions, mainly in the context of controlling immigration and, in some cases, refusing entry to potential migrants all together, as well as the cultural demands it makes of those who are admitted, and the range of justifications and objections offered in these cases. This section considers the content of the majority culture, to which newcomers are asked to adhere, as well as how forcibly they can be “asked” to do so.

1. Defining Culture

Defining the term “culture” is very challenging: it has been described as both a “notoriously overbroad concept” (Song 2009: 177) and a “notoriously ambiguous concept” (Eisenberg 2009: 7). It is deployed in multiple ways: as the entry will go on to consider in more length, the term “culture” can refer to the set of norms, practices and values that characterize minority and majority groups, for example by noting that the Hasidic Jewish communities in New York practice a unique “culture”, or by describing Italian or Senegalese culture. But it is also used in other ways, for example, to refer to “bro” culture or “hipster” culture, or the culture of British football fans. Moreover, any one person can be a member of multiple cultures—someone (like this writer!) can be a member of the Canadian culture, the Ottawan culture, the Jewish culture, and the academic culture at the same time. Contextual considerations will explain why the norms, practices, and values that define each of these cultures become relevant at a particular moment. Moreover, only some of these cultures have political and legal relevance; only those that do are the focus of this entry.

In the political and legal spheres, there is widespread disagreement about what culture is, and the next section is focused on elaborating these distinct views of culture. There is however considerable agreement that whatever it is, it matters to people and the meaning and value it provides to the lives of individuals are among the most important reasons, if not the most important ones, to defend and protect it in legal and political spaces. This value is why it is important to attempt to discover what culture is and correspondingly why, and which aspects of it in particular, should or should not be protected in the public sphere. Notice that the observation that cultures are valuable to people, and indeed that they bring value to the lives of individuals, is not the same as saying that individual cultural practices are all good. Any defensible account of culture must take seriously the importance of culture in general without defending all of its instantiations. There are four main ways in which culture has been interpreted: as an encompassing group, as social formation, in dialogic terms, and in identity terms.

1.1 Culture-as-encompassing-group

One way to think about culture is as a kind of all-encompassing whole, which shapes all or most dimensions of our lives. It is perhaps Will Kymlicka’s formulation of a “societal culture” that is most responsible for generating serious reflection on the nature of culture understood in this way. A societal culture

provides its members with meaningful ways of life across the full range of human activities, including social, educational, religious, recreational and economic life, encompassing both public and private spheres. (Kymlicka 1996: 76)

Kymlicka explains that a vibrant societal culture provides a “context for choice”, i.e., it provides the resources that individuals rely on to make sense of their world and the choices it offers. On this account, nation-states are well-described as having a societal culture, as are Indigenous groups and sub-state national minority groups (for example, the Catalans or the Tibetans); immigrant groups which sustain a range of cultural practices and norms even as they integrate into a larger “societal culture” are not.

Kymlicka is not alone in offering an encompassing account of culture. Michael Walzer too offers such an account, proposing that we understand political communities as “communities of character”, in which members are bound by a “world of common meanings” (Walzer 1983: 28). Avishai Margalit and Joseph Raz also describe so-called “encompassing” groups, in which their members

find in them a culture which shapes to a large degree their tastes and opportunities, and which provides an anchor for their self-identification and the safety of effortless secure belonging. (Margalit & Raz 1990: 448)

Avishai Margalit and Moshe Halbertal say of an encompassing group that its culture “covers various important aspects of life”, and in so saying, they offer as an example the Ultra-Orthodox Jewish culture:

it defines people’s activities (such as Torah study in Ultra-Orthodox culture), determines occupation (such as circumciser), and defines important relationships (such as marriage). It affects everything people do: cooking, architectural style, common language, literary and artistic traditions, music, customs, dress, festivals, ceremonies…the culture influences its members’ taste, the types of options they have and the meaning of these options, and the characteristics they consider significant in their evaluation of themselves and others. (Margalit & Halbertal 1994: 498)

Whereas Kymlicka emphasizes the freedom that is offered by a robust societal culture, Margalit and Halbertal speak of its role in securing members’ “personality identity” (Margalit & Halbertal 1994: 502) and Walzer of its importance in shaping a “collective consciousness”. Although these scholars justify the protection of a robust culture for many reasons, they agree that what culture does, fundamentally, is offer a background value system that helps members select among options and interpret their value, including for example with respect to certain forms of employment, or education, or family structure and child-rearing. Walzer captures the way in which culture informs how even the most basic of things are understood:

a single necessary good, and one that is always necessary—food, for example—carries different meanings in different places. Bread is the staff of life, the body of Christ, the symbol of the Sabbath, the means of hospitality, and so on. (Walzer 1983: 8)

Much is illuminated by these accounts of culture, including especially why depleted societal cultures may be less able to provide the context for choice that Kymlicka emphasizes, or why one’s “personality identity” may thereby be threatened: if a cultural group’s educational, political, or economic systems are weakened, their capacity to support members to make sense of the world, and choose among options, is likewise weakened. Moreover, this account illustrates the wrong of undermining the cultures of others: if a culture is undermined, the choices available to its members are thereby reduced. We can see this with respect to Indigenous culture in many states: where states have actively attempted to erase Indigenous culture, the result has been severe social dislocation and alienation among Indigenous peoples whose context for choice has been substantially weakened.

However, multiple objections have been launched at this way of understanding culture, most of which are variants on what is termed the “essentialist” objection; notice, though, that the views described above are not believed by their holders to be essentialist. The essentialist objection targets what it sees as an assumption that members of a culture will hold the same set of practices, norms, and values to be important, and in the same measure. But, say critics, this assumption does not hold: in any actual culture, members will be differently committed to its defining practices and norms, and indeed, there will necessarily be disagreement around which of its practices and norms are defining in the first place. The essentialist objection says, roughly, that treating culture as encompassing wrongly does one of the following things: 1) it proclaims that certain features of a culture are at its core and therefore immutable, on pain of dissolving the culture (Eisenberg 2009: 120), and correspondingly that cultures are necessarily bounded and determinate rather than contested and fluid (Moore 2019; Patten 2014: 38); 2) having identified these features as at a culture’s core, it excludes those who believe themselves to be members but do not  conform to, display, or respect these features (Parvin 2008: 318–19); and, 3) it ignores the reality that most people in a liberal society “draw their identity from a multiplicity of roles and communities and memberships at any one time” (Parvin 2008: 321), which can variously have social salience, depending on the context, both independently of, and sometimes in conjunction with, cultural identities (Moore 2019). In summary, a too-encompassing account of what culture is for its members runs the risk of treating the boundaries of a culture as if they are determinate, unshifting, and as though its members display no variance (and perhaps cannot display variance) in their commitment to the culture as a whole and its defining practices.

The alternative accounts of culture that are considered below are all, at least in part, intended to respond to the essentialist challenge; their objective is, in other words, to generate a plausible account of what culture is, and correspondingly what it means to be a member of a particular cultural group, that can be deployed to make sense of legal and political controversies, and ideally adjudicate among them, without succumbing to the essentialist challenge. A caveat: the views of culture treated below should be understood as “ideal types”, characterized so as to understand its key features, how it is differentiated from other views, and why it does not fall victim (in its own estimation) to the essentialist challenge.

1.2 Culture-as-social-formation

One attempt to reconceive culture in a way that responds to the essentialist challenge, but which retains a view of culture as largely encompassing, proposes that cultures are defined by their members’ shared experience of social formation (Patten 2014: 39). On this “social lineage” account of culture, what makes a culture is that its members are subject to a “set of formative conditions that are distinct from the formative conditions that are imposed on others” (Patten 2014: 51). The experience of being subjected to common institutions, understood broadly to include shared educational spaces, languages, media, as well as shared historical traditions and stories, overlapping familial structures, and so on, shapes a sense among cultural group members that they share a distinct way of seeing the world, and that certain assumptions that they possess are shared by, or at least understood by, others. This view emphasizes a culture’s historical trajectory, but does not require that its defining norms, values and practices are unchanging over time. On the contrary,

internal variation is possible because subjection to a common set of formative influences does not imply that people will end up with a homogeneous set of beliefs or values. (Patten 2014: 52)

As a result, cultures are sites in which members can contest and deliberate their meaning with enough shared assumptions about the way the world works that they can recognize each other as engaged in the same project.

Patten writes of the institutions to which cultural group members are subject that they are at least to some degree “isolated from the institutions and practices that work to socialize outsiders” (Patten 2014: 52), and thus serve to distinguish one culture from another. On this view, significant emphasis is placed on who is controlling the levers of the institutions that shape members’ formation: that is, it matters that members are in control of the institutions to which they, themselves, are subject, so that they can plausibly shape their own social experience, and the experience of younger members, in fundamental ways. Where the control over this social formation is denied, a culture’s members are thereby harmed; when it is coercively denied, there is very likely an injustice demanding remedy.

By focusing on the shared experience of subjection to common cultural institutions, this account avoids the accusation that what defines a culture is the stability of its basic norms and values over time: culture is not, on this view, a static entity. Instead, what matters is that cultural group members believe themselves to be members of a cultural group, and that this belief’s foundation is in the experience of common cultural institutions, rather than in the specific practices that are central to the group. These central practices can change fundamentally, without the cultural group itself dissolving. However, this view is subject to criticism by scholars who worry that those who control the levers of formation do not represent the views of all members (Phillips 2018), that instead they are using their relative positions of power to create and enforce cultural norms and practices that do not command (or would not command, without coercion) widespread agreement.

1.3 Culture-as-dialogue

The latter objection—that a so-called culture is the product of some but not all of its members leads some scholars to rearticulate culture in terms of the ways in which it is constructed via dialogue among members and their engagement with each other. The purpose of emphasizing that a culture’s members are the source of its main practices, values and norms, is to emphasize that a culture is not “given” to its members from above, as a fixed and unalterable entity. Rather, members of a culture are, in a fundamental way, its authors. Here is James Tully explaining this: cultures are

continuously contested, imagined and reimagined, transformed and negotiated, both by their members and through their interactions with others. (Tully 1995: 11)

Seyla Benhabib similarly emphasizes the narrative aspect of cultures, noting that insiders

experience their traditions, stories, rituals and symbols, tools, and material living conditions through shared, albeit contested and contestable, narrative accounts. (Benhabib 2002: 5)

That there is contestation among members, and that its main elements are under constant negotiation, does not render a culture any less meaningful for its members. What may seem confusing is the idea that a contestable and constantly shifting culture warrants protection; perhaps protection means artificially halting the natural changes that a culture would undergo, by protecting elements of it at a moment in time. But defenders of this view demand protection in the form of ensuring that the forums in which culture is negotiated, shared and transmitted, are sustained in robust and inclusive ways, and without unwanted interference by forces external to the culture. As with the culture-as-formation account, the emphasis is on the capacity of group members to shape the norms and practices that are central, rather than with the norms and practices themselves.

How does this view respond to the worry about asymmetrical power distribution within a cultural group? Focusing on the ways in which a culture’s central characteristics are determined via negotiation among members is an attempt to be attentive to the power structures that shape whose voice is heard during these negotiations, in minority and majority cultures (Dhamoon 2006). In many, and indeed perhaps in most, cultures, historically the dominant voices have been male, and one impact of that has generally been a gendered view of the how best to organize cultural life, that has reduced the rights of women (and other minorities) in myriad ways, often to their disadvantage as well as against their will. For some, the oppression of less powerful members by those who hold the levers of power generates at least partial skepticism about the value of protecting or accommodating culture in liberal, democratic states, especially in cases where it may seem that “multiculturalism is bad for women” (Okin 1999). On this view, cultural practices that undermine the rights of women (and other minorities) should not be tolerated in liberal democratic states.

The recognition that many cultural practices are disadvantageous to women (and other minorities) does not propel all political theorists to adopt a skeptical attitude towards them in all cases. For some, it is an opportunity to see that cultures can be valued even by those who are putatively oppressed, even as they work from the inside to influence the direction of their culture, towards less oppressive norms and practices. For example, although often sidelined from their centres of power, many women value their cultures in ways that press them not to exit, but rather to engage in processes of reforming inegalitarian practices and norms, from within (Deveaux 2007). This way of thinking about culture and its contents celebrates, and encourages, moves to “democratize” the mechanisms by which a cultural group’s main norms, values and practices are adopted, and defends public cultures that are genuinely open to multiple voices (Lenard 2012).

This narrative or dialogic account of culture thus responds well to the essentialist challenge, by denying that the defining features of a culture must be static and equally valuable to all members of a cultural group. But, it must respond to another challenge, namely, the individuation challenge (Moore 2019). If an account of culture is going to be robust enough to define the entities that should be entitled to additional political and legal consideration in various ways, including with respect to additional rights protections or exemptions from certain legal and political requirements, it must also be able to identify with some specificity the boundaries of a particular, discrete, culture and who legitimately counts as a member for the purposes of respecting the political and legal claims made as a result. But this can be a challenge to accomplish.

To see why, consider Benhabib’s account of the ways in which cultures are observed from the outside, and the way they are experienced from the inside. The observer is largely responsible, she says, for imposing “unity and coherence on cultures”, whereas from the inside, its participants

experience their traditions, stories, rituals and symbols, tools, and material living conditions through shared, albeit contested and contestable, narrative accounts. (Benhabib 2002: 5)

One effect of understanding the culture in this way is that while many of its members will hold deeply to the central values and take deep satisfaction in participating in the central cultural traditions, many others will dip in and out of its central practices, and pick and choose among its central values and norms. So, just who counts as a member is blurry, and this blurriness may appear to be a problem when membership is said to confer rights and privileges that are not available to non-members. There is an inevitable tension between the need to individuate cultures for political reasons and the boundaries of cultures which are inevitably poorly demarcated. Only context will enable us to resolve the political questions that will thereby emerge.

1.4 Culture-as-identity (or identity rather than culture)

To answer the challenge of how to identify a culture, and its members, one proposal focuses on the subjective component associated with belonging to a cultural group. Take this example, described by Margaret Moore: although there is deep division in Northern Ireland between Catholics and Protestants, the differences are neither religious (the conflict is not about distinctive interpretations of a religious text, and religious figures are not targeted for violence), nor cultural, since surveys of cultural values of both communities reveal considerable overlap among the values that competing communities hold (Moore 1999: 35). She says, rather, a focus on shared identities among rival groups makes more sense of the conflict.  A largely or partly identity-focused view highlights that one key dimension of culture is the way in which it shapes the identity of cultural group members. As well, such a view highlights that culture is a thing to which many people will have important connections, but which will be defining for them in multiple and distinct ways. An identity-focused view has clear merits: for example, it can explain why individuals remain nominally attached to a culture, even though its centrally defining features shift historically over time, and even if they do not engage with some of its more traditional aspects.

Additionally, an identity-focused view can accommodate identities that are not obviously culturally based, for example, including LGBTQ+ identities (Eisenberg 2009: 20; for a discussion of cultural/identity claims in an LGBTQ+ context, see Ghosh 2018: chapter 4). Indeed, an identity-focused view aims to circumvent the difficulty of identifying what specific material is legitimately cultural material. As noted above, scholars of minority cultures frequently note that there is a wide variety of claims made by a wide variety of groups, and these groups are defined by an assortment of distinct characteristics, including race, ethnicity, religion and sexuality. Say its defenders, a focus on identity rather than culture may be preferable because

the term identity covers more ground in the sense that it can refer to religious, linguistic, gendered, Indigenous and other dimensions of self-understanding. (Eisenberg 2009: 2)

2. Minority Cultural Rights Claims

The four views of culture described above inform the cultural claims that both individuals and groups make against the state. The specific threats that individuals and groups face, and which demand a kind of protection, are distinct, as are the responses that states may have in response to the claims made by individuals and groups (Eisenberg 2009: 20–21). In some cases, claims are made for accommodations for all members of a group qua group; in others, claims are made with respect to particular individuals; and there may well be connection among these. For example, a group may demand language protection policies, or an individual may claim a right to speak her mother tongue in legal proceedings. These rights are related to each other, and may be in some cases derived from one another: one reason an individual has a right to speak her mother tongue in legal proceedings may be because the state has recognized her language as an official language either of the state, or of a sub-state jurisdiction, for example. As a matter of accommodation, it will be important in what follows to notice when claims are made for accommodations that apply to individuals and when they are accommodations that apply to groups; although some philosophers are keen to assess whether cultural rights are best understood as individual or group rights (Casals 2006), the analysis below proceeds by assuming that they can be both (following Levy 2000: 125).

Notice as well that the term “accommodation” is a kind of catch-all to include the wide range of claims an individual or group can make against a state on the basis of culture. Political philosophers have attempted to distinguish among these claims in myriad ways, in order to make sense of them. Many such rights are claimed by immigrant groups (typically) to a state, who require certain accommodations from the state in order to better integrate into that state. In the larger debate around the value of multiculturalism, there is considerable discussion about which sorts of accommodations encourage the integration of, especially, culturally distinct newcomers, and which sorts permit or even encourage their separation from the larger society (e.g., Sniderman & Hagendoorn 2007). Some scholars worry, as well, that a focus on how best to accommodate cultural minority groups travels with ignoring (perhaps wilfully) more important questions of redistribution to those who are less well off (Barry 2001; Fraser 1995). In general, however, multicultural theorists agree that accommodation rights are most defensible when they support the integration of minorities in general, and newcomers in particular, as well as when they are aimed at remedying persistent inequalities between majority and minority groups.

It is worth noting that not everyone readily agrees that “culture” should be treated as a source of distinct legal and political claims, however. For example, Sarah Song points out that so-called “multicultural” claims are often in fact claims to accommodate a wide range of groups, including racial, religious and ethnic groups. Many political theorists of cultural rights appear to believe that there are distinct and recognizable cultural groups, making distinctive cultural claims, whereas in their example-giving they rely on a “wide range of examples involving religion, language, ethnicity, nationality, and race” (Song 2009: 177). Rarely is “culture” alone the basis for a claim against a state. Rather, says Song, so-called cultural claims are in fact often demands for other well-understood and defensible democratic goods. Most such demands are for religious accommodations, well-defended by standard liberal defenses of freedom of conscience; others are demands for reparations for past and ongoing wrong, in the form of affirmative action; others yet are demands for democratic inclusion, often rooted in a morally problematic history of deliberate exclusion. Once the reasons for these “cultural” demands are revealed clearly, we will often find democratically defensible reasons to respect and accommodate them, without needing to resort to relying on culture as a distinct entity, giving rise to a distinct set of rights-claims. The result is that the controversy associated with properly defining cultures and identifying their members can be avoided in many instances. However, this analysis can make it difficult to treat cases where something called “culture” interacts with, or supplements, religious, ethnic, and racial claims.

Take the case of the choice, made by referendum, to ban minarets on mosques in Switzerland. The defensibility of the ban has been the subject of deliberation among political philosophers, and one key point of contention has been whether and to what extent minarets are religiously required by Islam. Many interpreters propose that, since minarets are not obligatory according to Islamic religious requirements, the choice to ban them is regrettable (because of what it says about the public place of Islam in Switzerland), but it does not violate the religious freedom of practising Muslims in Switzerland, and as a result is permissible (Miller 2016). In making this claim, however, what is ignored is the cultural significance of minarets. Without a recognition of the distinct place of culture in certain claims, a full understanding of the minaret case cannot be reached. The same challenge can be seen in deliberations around whether Muslim women should be permitted to wear face coverings in public spaces. Some commentators suggest that, because (according to some interpretations) Islamic texts do not appear to require face coverings, women can be denied the right to engage in this practice, without violating their religious freedom. In making this argument, its defenders notice that the choice to cover faces is in effect a (mere) cultural interpretation of Islamic requirements, as evidenced by the fact that only some communities of practising Muslims engage in the practice. For some scholars, it is essential to separate religious from cultural claims—liberal democratic states take religious claims very seriously as matters of conscience, and have a long history of zealously protecting religious freedom. So, having determined that a claim is not one of religious freedom, such scholars believe they can comfortably deny the request for permission to cover faces in public spaces. However, ignoring the cultural dimensions of the claim—or treating them as though they are obviously of less significance than the underlying religious claim—fails to treat the case properly. In particular, it fails to take seriously that religious obligations necessarily have cultural interpretations, that a full recognition of religious freedom entails recognizing their cultural interpretations, and that specifically cultural legal and political accommodation (of a religious commitment) will thereby be called for.

In what follows, distinct types of cultural claims, made against a state’s major institutions, will be examined. These claims are, as will be seen, sometimes made by individuals and sometimes by groups. Where relevant, the analysis will highlight whether the concept of culture that is being deployed is culture-as-encompassing group, culture-as-social-formation, culture-as-narrative, or culture-as-identity. The analysis will not always be neat. In some cases, there will be multiple defenses of a cultural right, which rely on distinct understandings of culture.

2.1 Exemption rights

Perhaps the most familiar type of cultural claim made against the state is in the form of request for exemptions from rules and regulations that typically apply to all citizens. Exemption rights respond to the fact that, in liberal democracies, laws and practices are meant—genuinely—to treat all citizens equally, but that there are some which inadvertently impose disadvantage on certain minorities. The worry to be resolved is that minority citizens are unintentionally or accidentally burdened by the normal application of certain laws (Levy 2000: 130), in ways that treat them unfairly, which can be resolved by exemptions from certain laws and normal practices (Quong 2006; Gutmann 2003). The extension of exemption rights then is understood as a

a recognition of that difference, as an attempt not to unduly burden the minority culture or religion en route to the laws’ legitimate goals. (Levy 2000: 130)

For example, some Sikhs request exemption from laws that require wearing motorcycle or construction-site helmets. Although Sikhism is a religion, Sikhs describe the requirement that they wear a turban not quite as a religious requirement, but rather as a symbol of their faith and commitment to Sikh values, as well as an expression of their identity (Sikh Faith FAQs in Other Internet Resources). Without exemption from these laws, Sikhs would be excluded from taking advantage of opportunities that are meant to be available to all citizens on an equal basis. The same is true of Indigenous communities, who have requested exemptions from generally applicable laws that limit hunting and fishing, explaining that such limits undermine their traditional way of life, or make it hard (or impossible) for them to sustain themselves (Levy 2000: 128). Before Sunday-closing laws were abandoned in Canada and the United States, religious minorities were occasionally granted exemptions from them. In these cases, as described above and without legally provided exemptions, people (usually minorities) must choose between participating in opportunities that should be available to all citizens on an equal basis or to respect their (cultural) understanding of what their religion requires of them.

The request for exemption can be lightly distinguished from the request for rule modification. As indicated, exemption requests are, as they sound, requests that individuals be exempted from certain requirements that are meant to apply to all citizens equally; modification requests ask for changes in existing, majority, practices to accommodate certain other, minority, practices. Sikhs sometimes request exemption from laws that would, otherwise, require them to remove their turban as above; in other cases, they request uniform modifications, so that turbans are treated as one among several available head coverings for those carrying out a specific role. The same is true of uniform modification requests made by Muslim women who cover their faces or heads, and Jewish men who wear yarmulkes, where uniforms have traditionally required an uncovered head or face, or where they have required particular head coverings (as in the Sikh case, they may also be presented as requests for exemptions). Similarly, when observant Muslims request short breaks in their work day to pray at specific times of day, or when Jewish and Muslim students ask for changes in the provision of foods (to accommodate kosher and halal obligations) in school cafeterias, the request is for modification rather than exemption.

In most cases, the early failure of a legitimate law to modify or exempt new practices is unintentional. That is, the laws or practices in place were not adopted intentionally with the purpose of excluding, but were rather adopted under the assumption that they treat the existing population fairly. But widespread immigration has diversified many populations in substantial ways. Immigrants often travel with practices and norms that are, when they arrive, unfamiliar to the states they are joining, and as a result states are asked to modify certain laws, and exempt newcomers from certain others. There may be cases where there are legitimate public reasons to persist in applying certain laws in spite of the disadvantage they generate for newcomers. As well, there are cases where states persist in demanding obedience to laws and practices that clearly disadvantage newcomers attempting to integrate, but where there are no good mitigating factors to justify persisting in the imposing of disadvantage (as when the Danish town of Randers passed a law requiring that pork be served “on an equal footing with other foods” in school cafeterias). In these latter cases, the exclusionary impact of the laws is no longer inadvertent, and they are generally condemnable for perpetuating unnecessary and unjustified exclusion from political, economic and social spaces.

It is not always the case that individuals or groups claiming cultural rights to exemption and modification are immigrants, but that is often the case. Indigenous communities ask for exemptions, as do certain orthodox religious communities. These cases will be discussed below in the section focused on cultural preservation.

2.2 Assistance rights

Demands for assistance call on the state to preserve the conditions under which various elements of a culture can persist and even thrive, especially minority languages, or to promote and protect cultural associations in various ways, including by offering financial support to artists from within these cultural groups, or by providing resources to permit the production and distribution of ethnic-language media. The justification for assistance rights is the same as for exemption and modification requests: it is to prevent persistent unfairness in access to rights or goods that are meant to be available for all citizens on an equal basis. In the case of assistance rights, cultural minority groups argue that the majority group has access to these goods already, for example to a robust language or media space, and so they request state resources to secure these goods for cultural minorities as well. Here, whereas the justification overlaps with the one offered to defend exemption and modification rights—to generate fairness—the understanding of culture that underpins the demand for these rights is distinct. Typically, exemption and modification claims treat culture-as-identity or dialogue, whereas in the case of assistance claims, the background understanding of culture is often culture-as-social-formation or culture-as-encompassing group; the culture is treated as a whole that requires assistance to protect each of its central parts, in order to do the job of shaping members well.

2.3 Self-determination rights

Self-determination rights are those that confer substantial control to sub-state jurisdictions over a particular territory and in particular the right to run the major institutions on that territory. A self-determining community is one that, because of control over major institutions in a territory, is capable of making and enforcing decisions, without interference by outsiders, in multiple policy spaces (I. M. Young 2004). The justification for self-determination rights is sometimes based on reparation or corrective justice, for example where past state actions have undermined the capacity for a particular cultural group to be self-determining in the first place (Song 2009: 184). In other cases, the demand for self-determination is justified with respect to the importance of protecting the autonomy of a culturally distinct sub-state jurisdiction, that is, its capacity to run its own affairs in ways that are consonant with its particular cultural preferences. The right to self-determination typically relies on an understanding of culture-as-encompassing group, or culture-as-social-formation, suggesting that without significant control over the major institutions that govern the lives of citizens, the relevant group will not be able to be self-determining.

The right to self-determination is typically attributed to states, so its meaning in the context of minority communities operating at the sub-state level is not always clear. Among sub-state jurisdictions, the right is often claimed by Indigenous groups as well as sub-state national groups, like the Basques and the Scottish, whose “societal culture” is manifestly distinct from the majority’s societal culture. The demand for self-determination is a demand to make choices about how children are educated, what language is spoken by the relevant political authorities, and how the public space should be organized. The right claimed has at least three manifestations: 1) the right, at a minimum, to “maintain a comprehensive way of life within the larger society without interference”; 2) the right to recognition by the majority for its way of life, and 3) the right to active backing by the majority to affirmatively support the relevant way of life so that “the culture can flourish” (Margalit & Halbertal 1994: 498). These three interpretations make distinct demands on the state, running from simple non-interference to active participation in sustaining the conditions for self-determination. As a result, the larger state is sometimes tasked with assessing the extent to which it wants to direct its resources to supporting a particular request for self-determination, focused on whether associated claims to cultural preservation are warranted. These will be considered below.

2.4 Recognition rights

The demand for formal recognition in legal and political documents often travels with the demand for self-determination, and is grounded in a desire to have the majority mark its commitment to the full and equal respect of a cultural minority group (Mcbride 2009). In the Canadian case, the Québécois have long fought for recognition as a nation, with a “distinct society”. Attempts to recognize Québec’s status in the Canadian constitution have repeatedly failed, though a motion that read “That this House recognize that the Québécois form a nation within a united Canada” was approved (with considerable controversy, however) by the House of Commons in 2006. The demand for recognition in this case is a demand for respect as an equal, national, founding partner of the Canadian state.

In the case of Indigenous communities as well, the right to self-determination often includes not only the demand to exercise authority over specific jurisdictions, but also for recognition. They seek recognition, for example, as original inhabitants of a particular state, or as nations in their own right, or as having been the victims of various crimes at the hands of colonizers, including the violation of early treaties between them, as well as demands for state support in sustaining and, in many cases, rebuilding communities that were actively devastated by colonizing/settler governments. In Canada, and other colonizing states, for example, it has become common to read land acknowledgement statements in advance of events (including as part of the “announcements” read at the beginning of a school day), recognizing that events and proceedings are taking place on unceded Indigenous land. Similarly, Australian Indigenous communities have long argued for official recognition in the Australian constitution. From the perspective of Australian Indigenous communities, the hope, and indeed the expectation, is that official recognition will give rise to additional rights and benefits, for example to greater voice and political access to members of the minority. The hope for additional rights and benefits is present in some, but not all, cases of recognition claims (for example, it largely was not present in the case of Québec).

Recognition comes in other forms beyond acknowledgement in legal and political documents, that are intended to confirm respect for minority groups. In some states, the languages of minority groups can be officially recognized as national languages. For example, the Romansh language in Switzerland is officially recognized as a national language, even though its speakers make up less than 1% of the country’s total population. By contrast, Turkish laws that banned the speaking of Kurdish in public spaces were an attempt to deny recognition to a national minority (lifted finally in 1991). As with demands for official recognition in binding constitutional documents, these sorts of recognition demonstrate respect for minority communities as well as a commitment to treating them as full and equal members of the larger state.

2.5 Cultural preservation rights

Cultural preservation rights are those that groups claim as key to sustaining a cultural group as a cultural group. This right is sometimes described as a right to the “survival of a culturally-specific people” (Gutmann 2003: 75). In some cases, the justification is based on the claim that certain forms of exposure to and engagement with the wider community will result in the erosion of a culture that is valued by its members. In others, the justification is historical, as in where orthodox religious groups, fleeing religious persecution in Europe, agreed to settle new land in Canada and the United States in exchange for religious freedom. In others, the central justification is that cultural diversity is valuable and worth preserving, in and of itself (Parekh 2000). (In some cases, cultural preservation rights are claimed as recompense for past wrong; this claim is considered separately, below.) Demands for cultural preservation are most controversial where they are made by illiberal groups, as will be detailed shortly.

It is worth dwelling here for a moment to notice that there are two ways to interpret cultural preservation: it could mean the preservation of a group as a distinct cultural entity or it could mean the preservation of certain practices and values that are believed, at a moment in time, to be central to the culture. Rights to cultural preservation come in multiple formats, including demands for exemption, parental autonomy, respect for internal conflict resolution mechanisms (in family law, mainly), and control over membership. These rights are justified with respect to preserving culture, and typically rely on an understanding of culture-as-encompassing groups or culture-as-social-formation, just as does the more general right to self-determination with which they often travel.

Many minority illiberal groups ask only for rights of forbearance against the state in which they live (Spinner-Halev 2000). In response, a state may permit an illiberal cultural group to be “left alone”, on the idea that so long as it can persist without state support of any kind, it may do so. A state may be asked to do more, however, to preserve the culture.

For example, a state may be asked to exempt community members from certain requirements that are typically demanded of all citizens, including mandatory schooling and child labour laws. Consider this example: many orthodox Amish communities live a life that is largely segregated from the wider community. They live a religiously structured way of life which dictates whom members marry, how they raise children, how they produce an economy that permits their way of life to continue. In most cases, they demand neither recognition nor additional financial support in order to protect their communities’ way of life. They had previously demanded only non-interference, for the most part. But, in the 1970s, some American Amish communities demanded, and were granted, the right to withdraw their children from mandatory education at the age of 14, arguing that where their children were required to remain in school until the age of 16, they were more likely to exit the community. This high rate of exit would, they argued, result in the failure of the Amish way of life to persist over time (Burtt 1994). The right of exemption the Amish claimed was, in this case, derivative of the larger demand for cultural self-preservation; without the exemption, they said, the culture itself might fade away.

A state may also be asked to respect certain domains of legal authority, perhaps most frequently in the domain of family law. Minority communities often regulate the conditions of marriage, and custody of children, as well as divorce, and request the legal authority to do so. Respecting the legal authority of minority communities to exercise jurisdiction in family law is the kind of request that often troubles critics of cultural minority rights, since it may entrench disadvantages to women, for example in divorce settlements or custody agreements (Shachar 2001; Bakht 2007). In general, then, states that acknowledge the legal authority of minority communities in the space of family law also demand that those who are participating in these adjudication proceedings do so willingly; majority states therefore often retain permission for themselves to interefere in these proceedings, in support of those who may be inadequately protected. The state must attempt a balance here, between offering its support to the most vulnerable members of a minority group (for example to ensure that their constitutional rights are protected) and interference of a kind that is inattentive to the rightful claims of minority groups to persist over time, in part by exercising its authority in key spaces.

Another common form of cultural preservation rights are exclusion rights, that is, the right of a cultural group to refuse to admit others to territory or membership, because of a worry that more generous terms of admission threatens to undermine it by, in effect, diluting it. Just as states have the putative right to control their borders (discussed below in section 3), and who can claim membership rights even after admission, so do some sub-state jurisdictions claim this double right of exclusion, citing the importance of cultural preservation. Indigenous communities have sometimes claimed the right to exclude non-Indigenous individuals from settling on their territories or the right to exclude others (for example non-Indigenous spouses of Indigenous persons) from certain membership benefits, including the right to vote (or otherwise have a say) for those who will govern. State courts have been asked to adjudicate the rightful authority of Indigenous communities to make these determinations (see Song 2005).

The cultural preservation rights described above pose a difficult challenge, connected to the critiques of treating culture as an encompassing group: any claim for cultural preservation, say some critics, translates in effect into problematic claims of control over members, which, moreover, are typically most restrictive for women and LGBTQ+ members of a cultural group. This is a challenge posed most forcefully where rights of cultural preservation are demanded by so-called illiberal groups like the Amish, and where they are (in the eyes of critics) imposed on children against their will. Illiberal groups are those which deny certain key liberal values, like autonomy and equality; in many cases, these communities are supported by educational systems that discourage autonomous choice-making, by avoiding the teaching of skills and capacities that typically enable it, and by enforcing hierarchical rules that elevate some members over others in ways that egalitarians find uncomfortable. The worry is that the community wants not only to preserve itself as a distinct cultural group, but also that it wants to protect a kind of cultural homogeneity that leaves no room for contestation or dissent over its central values and practices. These latter hierarchical rules often render women vulnerable to more powerful men, who may demand various forms of sexual subservience to them, who relegate them to the home to care for children, and who impose rigid codes of behaviour on them, for which harsh penalties are meted out in cases of violation. These kinds of so-called “cultural practices” are, for some critics, such that they render any form of state support in protecting minority cultural groups largely indefensible (Okin 1999). 

A worry that runs through objections to these many cultural preservation rights is that women may not be willing participants in these cultures, and therefore that respecting cultural preservation rights consigns women to lives they would not choose, do not want, and cannot escape. But for many it is a mistake to assume that women members are such only under duress, since many will deeply value the community itself and respect the norms and values that it seeks to protect, even if they reject certain among them. In these cases, and where political theorists consider them, there is an attempt to move from treating culture in encompassing terms towards treating it in dialogic and narrative terms. Cultures, even oppressive (to liberals) minority cultures, are subject to change, and perhaps the best source of change is deeply committed members who willingly endorse key values but reject others, including those that do not respect the equal rights of women. Monique Deveaux’s account of female adult participants in customary marriages in South Africa, who accept some elements of their culture, but who aim to gain a voice at the table to shift others, treats culture in dialogic terms (Deveaux 2007). Here, the key motivating thought is that cultures can and do shift over time, in response to how its members engage in it, and what matters is not the change itself, but who or what is its source. On this view, the objective of cultural preservation rights is not to preserve culture per se, a challenge that would prove impossible in any case, but rather the right to protect the ability of group members to shape their culture and to protect it against unwelcome sources of change.

Others argue that so long as women, and any others subject to rigid cultural demands, possess a right (or the capacity) to exit the community, their choice to remain should be treated as such (Kukathas 1992). For those who hold this view, efforts to render the right to exit genuinely exercisable are tremendously important (Kukathas 2012; Holzleithner 2012). In so doing, a state must make a choice about the resources it provides to those members who may desire to exit, but who do not have the means to establish themselves in the larger society. In some orthodox religious communities, property is owned in common and individual members do not have any personal property or resources; as a result, exiters have nothing on which to rely while they establish their new lives. In others, members are poorly educated, and unfamiliar with life outside of their own communities, and so exit without the capacity to sustain themselves in the larger society.  So, receiving states can offer support to exiters in various ways, for example by providing shelters to exiting women (and men), in which education is provided so that they may eventually attain self-sufficiency as a member of mainstream society. The choice to support exiters may seem to undermine a culture’s capacity for self-preservation. But supporting exiters is not well-understood as denying cultural preservation rights; rather, the choice to do so stems from a state’s commitment to protecting the rights of all of its members, including the most vulnerable, as best as it can do.

2.6 Rights against cultural loss

The right to cultural preservation described above should be distinguished from the slightly different right against coerced cultural loss, which focuses on preservation in cases where the potential loss is the result of coercion by outside forces against which a cultural group is relatively powerless. Of course, cultural change is inevitable in some form, as highlighted above, and especially if one holds a culture-as-dialogue view, cultures are in fact never static. Rather, practices, norms, and values that are defining of a culture at one time may cease to be centrally defining of that culture, for a whole range of reasons including economic, environmental, and political. So, in fact, some amount of cultural loss is inevitable, and moreover, it is not always to be regretted. Sometimes, it is a normal response to external factors that are beyond a culture’s control, and sometimes it is welcome because the changes result in the better protection of human rights or more inclusive cultural traditions and practices. A cultural group may choose to shift their central modes of production in response to changing environmental factors, for example. So, as Samuel Scheffler has argued, the strong preservationist view of culture—that cultures should be insulated from all forms of change—must be rejected (Scheffler 2007).

Yet, especially minority cultures may sometimes have a reasonable claim that they are not able to protect themselves against unwanted cultural change, or that they are not able to control the pace of change. They may thereby be entitled to forms of state support, to help them create the conditions under which they can resist unwanted cultural change.  When linguistic minorities request state support to persist in educating children in a minority language, for example, sometimes the justification is in the name of protecting against the erosion of the language in the face of pressure to adopt or become fluent in the majority language.

In other cases, majorities are actively focused on undermining minority cultures, often over years and even decades. Colonial states have pursued genocidal policies against Indigenous communities for example, with the expressed purpose of undermining their capacity to survive as distinct peoples. In assessing cases of cultural loss, then, a key factor is whether the shift is forced upon minority groups, not necessarily by changing environmental or economic conditions, but by agents who intend to undermine the culture, by actively disvaluing it and thereby acting so as to undermine the conditions for its robust continuity. External, malicious, factors that engender cultural change that would not otherwise be expected, make the change not only regrettable, but generate a case for reparations, for example with respect to Indigenous communities, where there is “evidence of a history of dispossession, discrimination, or subordination” (Phillips 2018: 97).

2.7 Cultural defense rights

In legal environments, wrong-doers sometimes deploy a cultural defense, explaining that minority cultural norms and values, which are in tension with those of the majority, are causally relevant in explaining why they committed a wrong. A cultural defense has, thereby, sometimes been treated as a relevant mitigating factor in assigning punishment. The right to offer a cultural defense is typically justified with respect to the importance of recognizing that minorities do not always operate according to the same values and norms that are represented in the majority’s legal system, and that these differences are entitled to some consideration in legal spaces. Earlier court decisions accepted explanations that, for example, men who murdered their unfaithful partners were moved to do so by a combination of shame and rage associated with cultural norms. For example, men who claimed that “gang rape” (known culturally as marriage by capture) was mandated by Hmong culture as a way to secure a wife, in which women were not only complicit but in fact willing partners, are no longer understood to have a defense in legal suits accusing them of rape (Song 2005). However, the power of “cultural” explanations in mainstream legal spaces has decreased over time, as states have come to see how many of these defenses are in fact cover for patriarchal, misogynist attitudes that persist, both in some minority communities and in the wider community.

“Cultural” defenses of crime often amount to treating culture as though it were a homogeneous whole, and as though perpetrators of crime rather than its victims have a lock on its interpretation. But “respect for culture cannot mean deference to whatever the established authorities of culture deem right” (Gutmann 2003: 46). Additionally, a generic imperative to “respect culture” in legal spaces can ignore the differences among types of cultural expectations, which can range from permissible acts, to encouraged acts and required acts, only some of which may justifiably be treated as legally relevant (Vitikainen 2015: 162). As well, it can permit and encourage the representation of minority (especially non-western) cultures as stereotypes, and “mobilizes culture in ways that encourage absurdly large generalizations about people from particular cultural groups” (Phillips 2007: 81 & 99). The danger represented by an uncritical acceptance of the cultural defense is in a treatment of culture as so encompassing that it treats its members as incapable of autonomous decision-making. But, say critics of the cultural defense, this is a mistake—along with many other factors, culture can be part of an explanation for engaging in wrong-doing, but should “never be mistaken for the whole truth” (Phillips 2007: 98).

2.8 Exclusive cultural use rights (or rights against cultural appropriation)

A final cultural right that is claimed by some is the right to control cultural artifacts or expressions, or the use of cultural content in general (Matthes 2016). This is the right that is at issue in recent controversies focused on cultural appropriation, defined as the use, by a non-member, of “something of cultural value, usually a symbol or a practice, to others” (Lenard & Balint 2020). Familiar examples of actions that have been accused of engaging in cultural appropriation include the wearing of dreadlocks by whites; the donning of Indigenous clothing as Halloween costumes; the use of turbans in high fashion; the teaching of yoga by instructors who do not have South Asian backgrounds. In all of these cases, a non-member is accused of “appropriating” a particular cultural practice or symbol that is not their own. On this view, cultures have exclusive rights to use their cultural “products” as they see fit, often because that practice is understood to be central to their identity. This perspective is controversial, and often mocked, by those who observe that history just is the mingling and sharing of cultural practices and symbols, including in the spaces of cuisine, the arts, dress and spiritual practices; their mocking treats the rights claim as relying on an understanding of culture that is unchanging and immutable over time, which is historically inaccurate and, furthermore, undesirable. Correspondingly, key cultural artifacts are best understood as belonging to “humanity”: “it isn’t peoples who experience and value art: it’s men and women” (Appiah 2009).

The right claimed—to full or exclusive use of defining cultural practices or symbols—is perhaps not best enforced by the state, though states can and do engage in practices that are attentive to the harms allegedly caused by cultural appropriation. For example, centralized support for the arts, in the form of grants to produce artistic endeavours, can be sensitive to who is asking for support to produce what, and can direct funding towards artists from a particular tradition who aim to produce culturally specific products, and correspondingly refuse (unless very good reason is offered) to support endeavours by cultural outsiders to produce “insider” art (Rowell 1995; J. O. Young 2008). The right claimed is relatively stronger where a particular cultural community is the victim of a power imbalance, where the cultural community has expressly requested that a particular practice or symbol be “left alone” by a majority community, and where members of the majority community are profiting on the basis of its use of the particular symbol or practice (Lenard & Balint 2020). As in other cases, the right claimed by a cultural group is strongest where there are persistent inequalities between the minority claimant and the majority group.

3. Majority Cultural Rights Claims

Section 2 considered the cultural rights claims that are, usually, made by minority groups. Majority groups make cultural claims as well, in particular with respect to excluding others from their territory as well as with respect to what can be demanded of those who are admitted.

3.1 Cultural continuity and exclusion rights

One domain in which majority communities claim a cultural right is in the space of immigration. For some, the right of states to shape their culture can legitimately serve as a reason to exclude others, in general and sometimes specific others. This view is often attributed to Michael Walzer, who argues that the right of a state to control its borders is intimately connected to its capacity to

defend the liberty and welfare, the politics and culture of a group of people committed to one another and to their common life. (Walzer 1983: 39, emphasis added)

The right of a state to control its culture is therefore an essential one to protect its “collective consciousness”, as noted in Section 1.

This claim has encountered pushback from many scholars, for multiple reasons. One reason is that the claim that a state may exclude would-be migrants for cultural reasons has too often been, in fact, an attempt to enact discriminatory legislation aimed at excluding migrants whose beliefs and practices are said to be incompatible with, or even undermining of, the values and norms that define the majority’s culture. Exclusion based on so-called cultural reasons has often been a claim that a state prefers to remain culturally, religiously, ethnically, and racially homogeneous. Historically, states engaged explicitly in such discriminatory practices, which have now been repudiated, including for example variants of Asian Exclusion Acts which were in operation in North America in the early 1900s.

The same accusation is also merited in several recent cases, such as the implementation of the so-called Muslim Ban in the United States, or with respect to proposals during the height of the crisis in Syria (2015) in some countries to prioritize Christian over Muslim refugees (Song 2018). Among political theorists of immigration, there is however widespread repudiation of discriminatory immigration policies, both explicitly and implicitly, even among those who defend the general right of states to exclude would-be migrants and refugees, for many reasons including to preserve culture (Miller 2005).

A second source of pushback stems from a more general skepticism that a majority’s culture, even if genuinely valuable to its members, should be treated as sufficiently so to warrant excluding migrants, especially necessitous ones (the language of necessity is borrowed from Song 2018). Even if it is conceded that culture is valuable to a majority, many scholars believe that its protection cannot warrant excluding those in severe need of safety or subsistence.

Yet, say those who defend the view that culture can, at least in some cases, serve to exclude migrants, there is a case to be made for treating the state as possessing the right to cultural continuity (Miller 2005). This claimed right looks very much like the right to cultural preservation (or against cultural loss) described above, and it highlights not so much the sentimental dimensions of a majority’s attachment to its culture, but rather its pragmatic interpretation. On this view, any particular state is defined by a “shared public culture” which, because shared, underpins the trust that democratic states rely on to pursue political and social objectives in common. No particular value that makes up a shared public culture is valuable in and of itself. Rather, it is the combination of a set of values, norms, and practices, that produces “our” culture that is valuable, and in its presence, trust is higher; as a result, so is the willingness to cooperate to support policies that require some sacrifice, including for example, commitment to redistributive social policies that are especially to the benefit of those who are least well-off (e.g., see the essays in Gustavsson & Miller 2019). So, according to those who defend these views, a state that seeks to exert control over admission citing “cultural” reasons is neither racist nor discriminatory, but rather is seeking controlled admission (rather than closed borders) so that newcomers can, over a sufficient time period, come to adopt enough of the set of defining values, norms, and practices, to be able to warrant and extend the trust that underpins the policies that instantiate these objectively valued goods.

3.2 Cultural continuity and integration enforcement rights

States that defend the right of cultural continuity at the level of admission to a state typically also deploy the right to adopt and enforce “integration” policies that encourage newcomers to adopt majority norms and values, arguing that the faster such adoption happens, the more rapid admission itself can be. Integration policies ask newcomers to adopt the norms and practices of the majority community, whereas accommodation policies ask the majority to accommodate practices that are distinct from those that define the majority’s culture. On this conventional multicultural view, the process by which migrants are admitted to the territory, and then to membership, is a “two-way” street, requiring that both newcomers and the host state adapt in response to each other (Kymlicka 1998).

Is the demand that newcomers integrate culturally reasonable? Is it reasonable, that is, to ask immigrants to adopt the norms, values, and practices that are central to the culture they have joined (l will leave aside the question of economic and political integration, here)? Notice that in the political and sociological literature in immigration incorporation, integration (culturally) is typically distinguished from assimilation, where the former focuses on welcoming newcomers with the distinct sets of norms and values that travel with them (and so accommodating them where possible), and the latter demands that immigrants adopt as fully as possible the set of norms and values that are central to the host society (Brubaker 2001; see also Modood 2007). In the political theory literature on multiculturalism, however, it is widely accepted that a demand for full assimilation is normatively problematic (it requires too much of immigrants, to abandon their histories and identities, as part of joining a new community), but that some form of encouragement to integrate is permissible.

Whether the integration demands are permissible depends on at least two connected things, however: first, on the content of the shared public culture and, second, on the accessibility of the venues in which the content of this public culture is deliberated. The space in which a culture is deliberated is amorphous as well as expansive. The source of key norms, practices, and values is multi-fold: some are historical, some are deliberately adopted through political processes, some are accidentally adopted in response to contingent circumstances. The demand that newcomers integrate, in the sense of adopt the norms and practices of the majority culture to at least a reasonable extent is more defensible in cases where access to spaces in which they are deliberated is public and therefore open to many voices. The precise meaning of “accessibility” to spaces that are not clearly defined, and entry to which is not monitored or policed in any formal way, is challenging to pin down. But the key point is that to the extent that cultures welcome and take seriously new voices—in public media, in political spaces, and so on—they can be described as publicly accessible. So, there is a connection between the legitimacy of demanding adherence to majority culture norms and practices, as part of the process of integration, and the genuine access that newcomers have to the spaces in which they are deliberated.

In considering the second question, with respect to the content of a majority’s shared public culture, I borrow from the literature in the political theory of nationalism (though I do not believe that the language of nationalism itself is essential to appreciate its relevance to the discussion here). A culture can be defined by features that are more or less inclusive. Where cultures are defined by characteristics that are typically used to describe ethnic nations, including shared history, religion, ethnicity/race, newcomers are less easily able to join them and be recognized as full members. Where cultures are defined by characteristics that are typically used, on the other hand, to describe civic nations, including shared commitment to political institutions and, usually, a commitment to liberal democratic principles, then they are more welcoming for newcomers. In the language adopted earlier in this entry, cultures that are defined by exclusive features are more likely to treat culture as encompassing, whereas cultures that adopt inclusive features, and emphasize accessibility to the forums in which its content is deliberated, treat culture in dialogic or identity terms. This need not be the case, though, since those who treat culture in dialogic terms may nevertheless believe that key elements of history or religion are central to it (though they are open to deliberation about the appropriateness of these elements as central) and similarly identities can be formulated on the basis of exclusionary features.

Another way to define inclusivity focuses attention on the extent to which a culture’s main norms, practices, and values can be adopted by newcomers without their giving up something they value (Lenard 2019). Key here is to define the permissible contours of an inclusive culture that, at the same time, can serve to distinguish it from others in ways that resolve what philosophers have called the “particularity” problem. If cultures are defined only by commitment to liberal democratic principles and the institutions that instantiate them, then a person will necessarily be committed to any state that is so defined. But this conclusion does not make sense of the reality that many citizens are attached to their state’s interpretation of these values—fundamental, abstract, liberal democratic principles are adopted, respected, and instantiated, in other words, in a culturally specific way. It is important, then, to delineate the boundary of permissible cultural content, which can include recognition of key historical moments, or political conversations, or cultural icons. No state can demand of newcomers that their emotional commitment be to their new state; but it can reasonably impart information about learnable key cultural markers, encourage newcomers to adopt the associated practices and norms, and hope that over time their emotional identification shifts to the host state, at least partially (Carens 2005). Under the condition that the public cultural content of a host state is reasonably accessible, and that the forums in which it is deliberated are likewise reasonably accessible, then the host state can permissibly encourage the integration of newcomers. This right is perhaps best understood as derivative of the right to cultural continuity that states claim in relation to immigration, which can permissibly be claimed if and only if the accessibility conditions described above are met.

Not all scholars agree on this point, of course, and some reject entirely the suggestion that newcomers can be asked to make accommodations to the culture of the state that they have joined. Those who adopt variants on this view treat the majority’s culture as nearly always homogeneous and oppressive in ways that are disrespectful of newcomers, and treat the demand for integration along at least some dimensions as “cleaned up” variations on the discriminatory and racist immigration policies of the past (Abizadeh 2002). This is a real worry. When the Netherlands demanded that potential migrants from majority Muslim countries watch a video and pass a test merely to gain entry to its territory—a video that showed gay men kissing and a topless woman—it was widely excoriated for its discriminatory intent, rather than (as was claimed) an attempt to ensure that migrants could adopt the liberal values that supposedly characterized the country’s culture. More generally, the mechanisms of encouraging the learning and adoption of the majority culture’s values, in addition to its actual content as delineated above, as well as the consequences for failure to do so, must be scrutinized for their reasonableness. This assessment is a tricky business, certainly, made trickier because in many (if not most) immigration situations, the potential newcomer is in a situation of vulnerability in relation to the host state: their interest in gaining entry is very strong and so in many cases, they will accept heavy-handed attempts to coerce their integration without complaint.

4. Conclusion

Both minority groups (many of which are immigrant groups) and majority groups claim that “culture” is important and deserving of accommodation in multiple ways. This entry began with an examination of the multiple ways in which culture has been understood, to unpack the ways in which it is deployed when specific cultural rights are claimed. It is important to notice that these cultural claims, on both sides, are often made in relation to each other: a minority group demands a particular cultural right and the majority responds by claiming a different cultural right. In many cases, the choice to respect or ignore claimed cultural rights is framed in terms of the impact that doing so will have on the culture of the majority, for example, by stating that a particular practice for which accommodation is requested is incompatible with the majority culture in general, or sometimes more specifically with a particular practice or norm that is believed to be particularly important. The latter claim was made, for example, in France, during “l’affaire du foulard”—the right to cover one’s head as a manifestation of Islamic (or Jewish) religious commitment was denied for the way in which it compromised the French’s commitment to laicity (Laborde 2008; Benhabib 2004).

This entry has attempted to offer the resources that are essential to adjudicating these conflicts, in ways that take seriously both those who demand cultural rights and those who resist respecting them. Hopefully, future political theory can make use of this taxonomy to identify satisfactory conclusions to these conflicts when they arise.


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Other Internet Resources


I would like to thank Matthias Hoesch, Margaret Moore, and Stéfanie Morris for comments on an earlier draft of this entry.

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Patti Tamara Lenard <>

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