Group Rights

First published Mon Sep 22, 2008; substantive revision Sat Aug 20, 2022

A group right is a right held by a group as a group rather than by its members severally. The “group” in “group right” describes the nature of the right-holder; it does not describe the mere fact that the right is confined to the members of a group rather than possessed by all members of a society or by humanity at large. Much of the controversy that surrounds group rights focuses on whether groups can hold rights and, if they can, on the conditions a group must satisfy if it is to be a right-holder. Some proponents of group rights conceive right-holding groups as moral entities in their own right, so that the group has a being and status analogous to those of an individual person. Others give groups no such independent standing, but conceive group rights as rights shared in and held jointly by the group’s members. Some opponents of group rights challenge the very proposition that groups can bear rights. Others do not, but worry about the threats that group rights might pose for individuals and their rights. They are met by counter-claims that individual and group rights, suitably formulated, can be complementary rather than conflicting and that some group rights might also be human rights.

1. Identifying group rights

A group right is a right possessed by a group qua group rather than by its members severally. It contrasts with a right held by an individual person as an individual. An example of a commonly asserted group right is the right of a nation or a people to be self-determining. If there is such a right, it is a right possessed and exercised by a nation or a people as a group. It will not be reducible to the individually-held rights to individual self-determination of those who belong to the relevant nation or people. Other rights that have often been asserted as group rights include the right of a cultural group that its culture should be respected and perhaps protected; the right of a linguistic group that its language should be usable and provided for in the public domain; and the right of a religious group that it should be free to engage in collective expressions of its faith. Groups rights are also claimed for organized groups such as commercial corporations, churches, political parties, universities and charitable associations. In each of these cases, the right is a right held by the group qua group, and duties generated by the right will be duties owed to the group.

Group rights should not be confused with rights that people possess in virtue of being group members. People normally possess rights as members of universities or sports clubs or businesses or trade unions or churches or states but, in the ordinary run of cases, these are individual rights. For example, the right of a member of a university to use its library, or the right of a citizen to vote in elections, is the right of an individual person. An infringement of that right would infringe the right of the individual right-holder, rather than a group right of the relevant university or state. In fact, most rights held by individuals are associated with group identities or group memberships of some sort. If we are willing to extend rights to non-human animals, even human rights will be rights unique to a particular group; yet most human rights are conceived as individual rights and, on some views, can only be individual rights.

A group right should not therefore be identified with a “group-differentiated” right. That term has been coined by Will Kymlicka (1995) to describe a right that is accorded to a particular group but not to the larger society within which the group exists. For example, a society might accord special rights, such as special territorial rights or rights of self-government, to an indigenous minority in recognition of the special status that that minority should enjoy within the larger society, or out of concern for the vulnerability of its traditional form of life. These would be “group-differentiated rights”. That term is now sometimes abbreviated to “group right”, which is unfortunate since a group-differentiated right may or may not be a group right properly so-called. If, for example, the group-differentiated right is the right of a group to be self-governing, it will also be a group right. But if it is, for example, a right unique to the members of an indigenous minority to fish in certain waters and if that right is vested in, and is exercisable by, the several individuals who make up the minority, it will be a group-differentiated individual right. (Kymlicka 1995, 45–48; Jones 2010.)

2. Moral and legal group rights

Group rights can be legal or moral or both. If a legal system accords rights to a group, or recognises it as an entity possessing rights, it will simply be the case, for that legal system, the group has rights. Those legal rights might then spawn moral rights. A law may create a wrong that would not otherwise be a wrong but, if the legal system is generally just and if the law serves a useful purpose, its breach may be considered a moral, as well as a legal, wrong. For example, you may have no right to a particular good in the absence of a law giving you legal title to it but, once you have legal title, my theft of that good can wrong you morally as well as legally. Similarly, once a group has been accorded legal rights, we might think that, in at least some cases, violations of its legal rights wrong it morally as well as legally. A group may therefore be credited with legally-dependent moral rights.

If group rights could only ever be creatures of law, however, we could not protest that a legal system failed to recognise or respect a group’s right. Proponents of group rights, like proponents of individual rights, have been keen to use the language of rights in arguing about the form that legal, political and social arrangements should take. That implies a conception of group rights that is moral in foundation and that might be used to determine what legal rights groups should have. It is as moral rights that group rights are most controversial. Individual rights are subject to innumerable disputes, but few deny that individuals, as persons or in other capacities, are capable of possessing rights. By contrast, many reject the very idea that groups can possess moral rights and even those who embrace that idea frequently disagree over the sorts of group that can possess them.

3. Groups as right-holders

No-one ascribes rights promiscuously to every kind of group, so what makes a group the kind of group that might bear rights? For many theorists an essential condition is the integrity it manifests: a group must surmount a threshold of unity and identity as a group if it is to be capable of bearing rights.

Thus Peter French (1984, 5–18) distinguishes between “aggregate collectivities” and “conglomerate collectivities”. An aggregate collectivity is a mere collection of individuals such as a crowd or the people standing at a bus stop or a statistical category such as middle-income earners. If we were to ascribe either moral responsibility or moral rights to an aggregate, those would be reducible, without remainder, to the responsibilities and rights of the several individuals who made up the aggregate. A conglomerate collectivity, by contrast, has a unified being since it is formally constituted as an organization with an internal structure, rules, offices and decision-procedures. (For a similar, but not identical, distinction between aggregates and organizations, see Copp 1984.) French’s examples of conglomerates include the Democratic Party, the US Congress, the US army, the Red Cross, university faculties and business corporations. Organizations of this sort have identities that are not exhausted by those of the persons in them; one person’s leaving and another’s joining does not yield a new organization. Thus, “what is predicable of a conglomerate is not necessarily predicable of all of those or any of those individuals associated with it” (1984, 13), including the rights and responsibilities we might ascribe to the conglomerate. French does not deny that the individuals in a conglomerate, such as a business corporation, will have rights and responsibilities relating to its activities; he denies only that the rights and responsibilities of the conglomerate can be distributed without remainder amongst those individuals. Thus, if the Gulf Oil Corporation buys or sells property, or joins a cartel, or is found causally responsible for environmental pollution and held morally responsible for cleaning it up, the Corporation as agent and as patient is not reducible to the individuals who are currently associated with it.

Dwight Newman (2011, 4) distinguishes in a similar fashion between “sets” and “collectivities”. A set, like French’s aggregate, becomes a different set each time its membership changes. A collectivity, by contrast, remains identifiable as the same collectivity even though its membership changes. For both French and Newman, a group’s having an identity that survives changes in its membership is essential to its being the kind of group that might bear rights. (See also Graham 2002, 68–9; List and Pettit 2011, 31–32; Van Dyke 1977.)

The phenomenon of a group’s having an identity and existence that is separate from its members is most readily apparent in the case of formally organised groups. So, for example, we can think of a football club or a university department or a trade union as remaining the same football club, university department or trade union, even though the individuals who constitute its members change over time. When you or I join or leave a formally constituted organisation, there is something independent of ourselves that we join or leave. Thus, if we ascribe rights to a formally constituted group, the right-bearing group will be something other than the set of individuals who happen to belong to it at any moment.

Formal organization may not be deemed essential to a group’s having an irreducible and enduring identity. Nations, for example, are often conceived as entities whose identities run across successive generations of nationals. A nation’s historic entitlement to a particular territory would typically be conceived as the entitlement of a single enduring entity rather than a right inherited and bequeathed by successive generations of nationals so that, historically, no temporally continuous entity has possessed rights over the territory. People are given to thinking of nations in this unitary and enduring fashion even in cases, such as the Kurds, where a nation has not been instantiated in a state, or the Poles, where the nation has been deprived of political independence for lengthy periods of its history. Whether we conceive a group as having an identity and being that supersedes that of its members turns not just on what we find in the world, but also on how we see it.

For some proponents of group rights, we should look for the integrity essential for right-bearing neither in the group’s internal organization nor in its objective characteristics but in its subjectivity. What matters is that the individuals who make up the group feel themselves strongly bound together as members of a group with which they identify. Marlies Galenkamp holds that a right-holding group must possess a strong form of intra-group solidarity and be the kind of group that communitarians describe as a constitutive community (1993, 81–100, 111–2, 131; see also Segesvary 1995). Michael McDonald (1991) argues that it is a shared understanding amongst individuals that they are normatively bound to each other that makes them a group for moral purposes. That shared understanding may be related to and promoted by shared objective characteristics, such as a common history, language, system of belief or social condition, but it is still the subjectivity of the group rather than those objective features that is crucial to its being a right-bearing group. Larry May (1987) and Paul Sheehy (2006, 151–173) also find the source of a group’s moral status in the interrelatedness of its members, but argue those interrelationships are significant for the common interests and needs to which they give rise.

A significant measure of unity and identity might then be essential for a group’s being the kind of group that can bear rights but, if it is, that condition would seem necessary rather than sufficient. Those who question the very idea of group rights do not deny that groups come in different forms or that some exhibit a high degree of unity or that groups can be very important in people’s lives. They deny only that we have reason to ascribe groups, however unified and however significant, the moral properties they must possess if they are to be independent right-holders. So where do proponents of group rights find those properties?

Philosophical analyses of rights have been dominated by two rival theories. One is the choice or will theory according to which to have a right is to possess a choice (e.g. Hart 1982; Steiner 1998). On that theory, rights can be possessed only by beings capable of choice. If we take the case of claim-rights (rights that impose corresponding duties upon others), those rights should be ascribed only to beings capable of exercising control over the performance of the corresponding duties. We can possess rights only if we are capable of exercising them.

The other theory is the interest or benefit theory for which the crucial feature of a right lies in its providing for the right-holder’s interest or benefit (e.g. Kramer 1998; Lyons 1969). If we take the case of claim-rights again, those rights can be ascribed to the beings at whose interests the corresponding duties are directed, irrespective of whether the right-bearer is able to control the performance of those duties. Of course, not every interest will generate a right and interest theorists usually therefore propose more discriminating versions of the theory. David Lyons (1969, 176), for example, provides that someone has a claim-right only if they are the “direct, intended beneficiary” of another’s duty. In another much-used formulation, Joseph Raz (1986, 166) holds that X has a right “if and only if X can have rights, and, other things being equal, an aspect of X’s well-being (his interest) is a sufficient reason for holding some other person(s) to be under a duty”.

In conformity with these rival theories, some accounts of group rights emphasize a group’s capacity for choice or, as it is more commonly described, its capacity for “agency” as the crucial test of its capacity to possess rights, while others focus upon the group’s capacity to possess interests as a group.

A capacity for agency is central to the ascription of rights to groups in the accounts of Peter French (1984, 1995) and Christian List and Philip Pettit (2011). French argues that we have reason to ascribe some groups the moral agency and moral personality that we ordinarily ascribe to human individuals. If a group is to be a moral agent, it must be capable of intentional action as a group; it must be able to have purposes, plans, goals and interests that motivate its conduct. It must also be capable of making rational decisions about its intentions and of responding to events and ethical criticism by adjusting its intentions and behaviour as those bear upon others (1995, 10-12). Conglomerate groups, such as business corporations, which possess internal decision structures and expressly formulated policies, can meet those conditions. That suffices to make them both moral group agents and “full-fledged moral persons” equipped with moral responsibilities and moral rights. They are properly accorded “whatever privileges, rights and duties as are, in the normal course of affairs, accorded to all members of the moral community” (1984, 32).

For List and Pettit (2011) a group can be an agent if it has representational states, so that it can form beliefs, and motivational states so that it can possess desires. It must also be capable of processing and acting on its beliefs and desires and of attaining a minimal level of rationality, particularly consistency, in the way its attitudes connect with one another and with its environment. Organized groups, such as states, churches, commercial corporations and voluntary associations, can, they argue, satisfy those conditions and so be agents. The attitudes formed by such groups supervene on those of their individual members but are not reducible to those of their members. A group can therefore possess agency as a group.

The specific case that List and Pettit make for group agency is epistemological rather than ontological and cannot be reproduced here. Agency alone, however, does not make the case for group rights. A robot could be an agent but it would not bear rights since it would not possess the sort of agency required for personhood. List and Pettit adopt a “performative” conception of personhood, according to which being a person turns on what an entity can do rather than the stuff of which it is made. To be a person is to be “an agent who can perform effectively in the space of obligations” (173). It is to be capable of participating in a system of conventions, such as a system of law, in which the participator contracts and honours obligations to others and derives entitlements from the obligations of others. Group agents possess that normative capability and so should be accounted persons. As persons, they can and should be held morally responsible for their actions and be credited with rights, albeit fewer rights than we should ascribe to natural human persons (on which, see section 7 below).

Making group agency a necessary condition for group right-holding significantly limits the range of groups that might possess rights. Adina Preda (2012), for example, an adherent of the choice theory, holds that only organized groups equipped with collective decision-procedures can possess rights since only they are capable of intentional action as groups. Groups that lack those structures, such as ethnic or linguistic groups, may have members who possess individual rights relating to their group characteristics, but the groups of which they are members will not possess rights as groups.

Those who subscribe to the interest theory of rights can view the range of groups that might possess rights much more generously. Thus Keith Graham points out (2002, 89–93) that a group does not have to be a moral agent to be a moral patient or to be treated more or less justly or to flourish more or less well. Similarly for May (1987), McDonald (1991) and Sheehy (2006) the critical consideration is that a group can have interests as a group that are more than the aggregated interests of its individual members. That renders groups capable of being harmed or of being treated unjustly as groups and therefore suitable candidates for rights.

The most developed and sophisticated interest-based account of group rights has come from Dwight Newman. For Newman (2011, Part I) groups that constitute right-bearing “collectivities” can range from corporations and churches to cultural groups and hockey teams. A collectivity is distinguished by the central values to which it is committed and by a structure which defines its membership and marks it off from other groups. Its members are essential to its existence, but the collectivity is no mere aggregation of its members. Rather, it supervenes on its members. It supervenes on their existence but also on their relationships with one another and their beliefs about those relationships. Supervenience does not imply reducibility; neither the existence of the collectivity, nor its actions or intentions, can be reduced to those of its individual members. For Newman a collectivity has moral status as a collectivity. It can therefore bear moral rights and moral responsibilities as a collectivity. It can also have interests, which are other than the aggregated interests of its members; those interests will lie in whatever makes the collectivity’s life go better as a collectivity. In conformity with Raz’s conception of rights, a group’s interests will generate rights whenever they are of sufficient importance to justify the ascription of duties to others.

Miodrag Jovanović (2012) provides another interest-based account of group rights but of a rather different sort. Current international and domestic systems of law ascribe rights to groups, such as rights of self-determination and rights designed to protect their cultures. Jovanović seeks to explicate those rights by uncovering the “normative moral standpoint” implicit in them. That standpoint, which he himself endorses, is, he argues, “value-collectivism”: “the view that collective entities can have inherent value, which is independent of its contribution to the well-being of individual members” (2012, 6). In other words, we should understand the legal rights attributed to a group as grounded in the irreducibly collective value of the group, a value that is not reducible to the value of the group for the several individuals who constitute its members. Jovanović does not ascribe those rights to every sort of group recognised in law. In particular, he does not ascribe them to juristic persons, such as business corporations and trade unions. Rather, he ascribes them only to groups that possess a pre-legal existence and identity, such as national, ethnic, linguistic and religious groups. It is the irreducibly collective interests of those groups that, on his account, legal group rights should aim to protect and promote.

4. Group rights: corporate and collective

The various approaches to group rights described in the previous section share a common feature. Each supposes that ascribing a right to a group entails conceiving the group as moral entity in its own right: the group must possess a moral standing that is not reducible to the standing of its members. That is why arguments about group rights frequently assume the same character as arguments about the ascription of rights to foetuses or the dead or future generations or non-human animals. In each case, the central issue is whether we should allow that the relevant entity has the moral standing necessary for it to bear rights.

If, for groups, we answer that question affirmatively, we shall conceive group rights analogously with individual rights. A group right, like an individual right, will be a right held by a single unitary entity. The right of a group will be “its” right rather than “their” right. Indeed, we might think of a group right as the right of a “group-individual”. Groups might bear duties in the same fashion. A group, as a single integral entity, can possess duties just as it can possess rights, and those duties may derive from group rights. For example, each nation’s right of self-determination is most obviously directed at other nations who, as nations, have corresponding duties to respect one another’s rights. (It remains logically possible, of course, that duties stemming from group rights will fall upon individual persons, just as it is possible that the rights of individual persons will generate duties for groups. On the relatively neglected subject of group duties, see Collins, 2019.)

This might be described as the “traditional” conception of group rights, in that it describes the way in which group rights have been most commonly understood. In recent years, however, some proponents of group rights have conceptualised them quite differently. They have understood a group right as a right that is the shared or jointly held right of a set of individuals. In this conception, a group right is still properly so-called because the individuals who make up the right-holding group possess a right together that none of them possesses separately. The right is not a mere aggregation of rights held individually by the members of the group. But, a group right conceived in this way does not entail giving a moral status to the group qua group that is separate from that of its members severally. Rather, the moral standing that underwrites the group right is the moral standing of the several individuals who jointly hold the right. The group right is therefore conceived as “their” right rather than “its” right (Jones 1999a).

The distinction between these two conceptions has frequently passed unnoticed and there is no agreed vocabulary that marks it. The term corporate will be used here to describe the traditional conception, since that conception presents a right-holding group as a unitary entity. The term collective will be used to describe the conception of a group right as a shared or joint right, since it conceives a right-holding group as a “collection” of individuals, albeit a collection that is bound together in a way that enables them to hold their right collectively. (Note that, contrary to this usage, many proponents of the “corporate” conception of group rights use the term “collective” to describe those rights; e.g. Galenkamp 1993, Jovanović 2012, McDonald 1991, Newman 2011.)

Joseph Raz has provided the most influential statement of the collective conception. According to Raz, if a right is to be a collective right, it must satisfy three conditions:

First, it exists because an aspect of the interest of human beings justifies holding some person(s) to be subject to a duty. Second, the interests in question are the interests of individuals as members of a group in a public good and the right is a right to that public good because it serves their interest as members of that group. Thirdly, the interest of no single member of that group in that public good is sufficient by itself to justify holding another person to be subject to a duty. (1986, 208)

Raz’s conception of a collective right is tied to his interest theory of rights according to which, as we have seen, X has a right if X has an interest that suffices to ground another’s duty (1986, 166). Thus, a group of individuals has a collective right if their shared interest is sufficient to ground a duty in others, and if the interest of any single member of the group is insufficient by itself to ground that duty. When these conditions are satisfied, the group of individuals possess a right together that none of them possesses separately. In fact, Raz argues that the interests that ground a right are not necessarily limited to the interests of the right-holder; they can also include interests that others have in the right-holder’s having the right (1986, 245–63; 1994, 44–59; 1995). For example, the right of journalists not to disclose their sources is grounded not only in their own interests but also in the public’s interest in their having that right. That consideration can also apply to collective rights. The rights of a group in respect of its culture, for example, might be grounded not only in the interests of the group’s members in their culture but also in the interests of “outsiders” in the continued existence of the group’s culture.

Some other theorists whose approach to group rights is consistent with what is described here as the “collective” conception are Nathan Brett (1991), Allen Buchanan (1993, 1994), Leslie Green (1991), Vinit Haksar (1998), Lesley Jacobs (1991) and Seumas Miller (2001, 2010). (See also Margalit and Raz 1990.) The collective conception need not be tied to an interest theory of rights. Miller, for example, gives an account of the collective conception that owes nothing to that theory (2001, 210–33). But the ascendancy of the interest theory of rights in recent years has meant that those who have adopted the collective conception have frequently followed Raz in combining it with the interest theory. (For criticism of the collective theory so conceived, see Griffin 2008, 261–265; Preda 2013.) Moreover, that theory does provide a ready-made account of what it is that individuals share—interests—that makes them a right-holding group. The way that interests can accumulate across individuals also helps to explain how it is that a group of individuals can have a right, as a group, that none of them possesses singly. For Raz, the number of individuals in a group can affect both whether the group has a right and how weighty its right is (1986, 187, 209). Others are less comfortable with that “aggregative” feature of Raz’s conception; yet the relevance of numbers is often hard to dismiss. Consider, for example, the claim of a linguistic minority that its language should be usable, and provided for, in the public domain. Given the public costs of meeting that claim, it would seem implausible to hold that we should take no account of the size of a linguistic minority (of which there may be several) in deciding whether the claim amounts to a right.

The fact that, on the collective conception, the individual members of a group hold their right jointly does not entail that the right must be grounded in an interest that an individual could have as an independent individual. Some goods take a necessarily collective form, so that they cannot be made available to an individual in isolation from others; for example, the good constituted by a group’s culture or its communal form of life. Yet it still makes perfect sense to hold that a group right to those goods is morally grounded in the interests of the several individuals who make up the relevant group and that the right is held jointly by those individuals. Thus, even though the collective conception gives no moral standing to a group independently of its members, it can still account for groups’ having rights to goods that are necessarily non-individual in form.

At the same time, there is nothing in the logic of the collective conception that limits the possible objects of group rights to non-individualizable goods. Nor, if we adopt the interest theory, need the right-holding group be a group in virtue of anything other than the shared interest that grounds their right. The second condition that Raz stipulates for a collective right suggests that individuals must be members of a group before they can go on to have interests of a sort that might ground a collective right. Miller, too, makes membership of a social group a defining condition of a joint right’s being a collective right (2001, 211). But it is not clear why we should hold that a set of individuals can have a collective right only if they constitute a group in virtue of something other than their shared interest.

Consider the following example. A city is characterised by very heavy traffic that poses a danger to its pedestrians. The city’s pedestrians have an interest in there being a network of walkways so that they can move around the city in safety. Each pedestrian, as an individual, has an interest in those walkways, but the interest of just one pedestrian is insufficient to create a duty for the city authorities to construct the walkways. However, the shared interest of all pedestrians may well suffice to ground that duty, in which case pedestrians will have a collective right that the authorities should construct and maintain the walkways. The point of this example is not to insist that, in these circumstances, pedestrians would indeed have that right. Rather it is to show that (a) a group might have a right to a good that is intelligible as a good for an independent individual, and (b) a right-holding group need be a group only in virtue of the shared interest that grounds their right. The group need not be institutionalised as a group, nor need it be distinguished by a common ascriptive feature. (In the example given, the fact that the right-sharing individuals are identifiable as “pedestrians” contributes nothing to their having a collective right independently of their interest in being able to walk around the city safely, .)

The collective conception can, then, make sense of group rights both to goods that would be intelligible as goods for independent individuals and to goods that are intelligible only as goods enjoyed collectively with others. It is often supposed that, if a good takes a necessarily collective form (e.g. the collective good of possessing a common culture), the interest in that good can be understood only as the irreducible interest of a group. That is associated with the supposition that, if the shared interest generates a group right, the right-holding group must also be understood as an irreducible moral entity. Both suppositions are mistaken. Even in the case of a shared or collective interest, the interests that do the moral work in generating a right are entirely intelligible as the interests of the several individuals who make up the group and whose good is at stake. Similarly, the moral standing necessary for the individuals, as a group, to have a right to the shared good can be the standing of the several individuals who compose the group. Thus, vindicating group rights need not entail showing that the right-holding group has either interests or a standing that is not reducible to those of its members.

At the same time, there is a limit to the range of cases the collective conception can encompass. As was mentioned earlier, there can be cases in which the interest of a group logically precedes that of its members and in which the members have interests simply because, qua members, they share in the interest of the group. For example, a football club may have the stated aim of being as successful as possible in playing against rival clubs. The club will then have an interest in whatever will promote that aim, including fielding the strongest team possible in each game. I, as a member of the club, will share in its interests. So, for example, if it is in the club’s interest to drop me from its team because I am not playing well enough, that will also be in my interest qua member. That interest qua member may conflict with a personal interest that I have in remaining a team player, but arguably that does not disturb my interest qua member. If we understand the interest that grounds a group’s right as an interest that the group has independently of its members, and if we understand the members’ interests as mere derivatives of that group interest, we must understand both the interest and the right of the group according to the corporate model. The group right cannot be understood adequately as a product of the aggregated interests of the individuals who populate the group (Newman 2011, 57–82).

For the same reason, the collective conception cannot easily make sense of a group right as a right possessed by a group whose identity is unaffected by changes in its membership. As Newman points out (2011, 59–60), if we conceive a group right as a right held jointly by those who compose the group, each change in the group’s membership must entail a change in the identity of the right-holding group. On the other hand, that may not be an objection. Groups, such as cultural, linguistic, ethnic and religious groups, are often shifting amorphous entities and we may have to get used to the idea that right-holding groups can be groups that have constantly changing compositions. Practically, that may be of little consequence for group rights provided that there is a reasonable continuity of interest amongst the group’s members, so that the content of the right is not disturbed by every change in membership.

Finally, note three things about the distinction between corporate and collective rights. First, the limits of the collective conception identified above stem from its unwillingness to conceive a group separately from its members. They do not stem from an inability of the collective conception to make sense of necessarily shared or collective interests—interests that individuals can have only along with others. Secondly, we can most readily conceive a group separately from its members when it is formally constituted as an institution, as in the case of a football club or a university. But once we separate a group from its members in that way, we run into the issue of whether we should really ascribe the right to an institution or an organisation rather than to a group (Sheehy 2006, 159–167, 175–195). Presumably it is for that reason that people do not normally describe the rights of Congress or Parliament or the Supreme Court as “group rights”. Thirdly, it is logically possible to interpret some group rights as corporate and others as collective, so that we are not obliged to commit ourselves exclusively to just one of these conceptions.

5. Group rights and collective goods

The distinction between corporate and collective rights concerns the way in which we might conceive the subject of a group right. But the issue of whether there is reason to ascribe rights to groups is sometimes approached through their possible objects—through what group rights might be rights to. If there are goods that have a necessarily group character and if there are rights to those goods, it would seem that those must be group rights. So are there such goods?

The obvious place to start is with the economist’s idea of public goods. We might reasonably suppose with Raz (1986, 208) that a right can be a group right only if it is a right to a good that is public to the members of the right-holding group. For the relevant group, the good must be non-excludable (it must be available to all members of the group) and non-rival (its consumption by one member of the group must not diminish its possible consumption by other members). However, as Denise Réaume has pointed out (1988, 8–9), some goods that are deliverable only as public goods can reasonably be considered objects of individual rights. Clean air is a standard example of a public good, but we can reasonably hold that individuals have rights to clean air as individuals. An industrialist who seriously pollutes a community’s atmosphere might be held to violate the right to breathe unpolluted air of each individual in the affected community rather than a collective or corporate right of the community as a group.

Réaume’s own proposal (1988, 1994), which has attracted much attention amongst commentators on group rights, is that we should understand group rights as rights to “participatory goods”. A participatory good is a public good of a particular type. It is a good whose enjoyment by an individual depends upon its also being enjoyed by others. Consider the case of clean air again. Although this is typically a good that is public to a group, each individual breathes in and out as an individual and enjoys the good of clean air as an individual. The goodness of clean air for me does not depend upon its also being good for you, even though it is good for you. Now consider goods such as friendship, a team game, and a convivial party (Réaume 1988, 12–13; Waldron 1993, 355–6). Those are necessarily social goods. I cannot enjoy genuine friendship as an entirely individual good; I can play a team game only if others do too; and I can take pleasure in conviviality only as a shared experience. So some goods are necessarily “participatory” in nature. These goods have also been described as “communal” (Waldron 1993, 339–69), “shared” (Green 1988 207–9; Raz 1995, 35–6), and “common” (Marmor 2001). Charles Taylor’s notion of “irreducibly social goods” has been deployed to similar effect: if those goods are the objects of rights, their irreducibly social character implies that they must be the objects of group rights (Taylor 1995, 127–145; Sheehy 2006, 159–167, 175–195).

Participatory goods are goods that must be both produced and enjoyed publicly, and goods that are simultaneously produced and enjoyed by those who participate in them. While participatory goods combine production with consumption, it is the necessarily public character of their enjoyment that really distinguishes them from other public goods. It is because they can be enjoyed only as shared goods that, Réaume argues, only groups can have rights to them. Her claim is not that every participatory good must be the object of a right; rather it is that, if there is a right to a participatory good, that must be a group right. The relevant right here is neither the liberty-right to participate in the good nor the claim-right to be unprevented by others from participating in the good, both of which will normally be individual rights. Rather it is a right to the participatory good itself (e.g. the right not merely to participate in an orchestra but the right of the orchestra to play as an orchestra, the right not merely to participate in a culture but the right that the culture shall be maintained and protected).

Some goods that can yield rights, and that are, Réaume argues, participatory in at least some of their aspects, are living in a cultured society, sharing a common language, and being a member of a religious community. If groups have rights to these participatory goods, do others have duties to provide them with those goods? If, for example, a group has a right to its culture as a participatory good, that might imply that it is entitled to constrain the freedom of its dissident members in ways that ensure the continuance of its culture. If a linguistic minority has a right to its language as a participatory good, that might imply that it is entitled to coerce reluctant others to use its language in order to sustain and promote the language as a participatory good. However, those are not the sort of rights that Réaume proposes since they would be unacceptably onerous for those who bore the duty (1988, 16–17; 1994, 133–4; see also Marmor 2001). Moreover, some participatory goods can be the goods they are only if people participate in them willingly.

The group rights that Réaume suggests might relate to participatory goods are rights against “outsiders” rather than “insiders”. And they would be rights not to outsiders’ participation in the good, but to their non-prevention of, and their non-interference with, the group’s participatory good and perhaps also rights to measures and resources that will facilitate the group’s continued enjoyment of its participatory good. A linguistic minority may, for instance, have a right that the majority society should establish, maintain and respect arrangements that will secure the minority’s ability to continue using its language. Similarly, an indigenous minority may have a right that the majority society should institute arrangements that will protect its traditional form of life, which form of life is, for the minority’s members, a participatory good. But these externally directed rights would remain rights grounded in the group’s interest in its participatory good and that, for Réaume, means they must be group rights.

There is an obvious gap in Réaume’s attempt to identify group rights as rights to participatory goods (1994, 123–4). If only groups can have rights to participatory goods, it does not follow that groups can have rights only to participatory goods. They may also have rights to non-participatory goods, such as safe walkways or community health safeguards or coastal defences. Even the claim that rights to participatory goods must be group rights has not escaped challenge. James Morauta (2002) argues that, conceptually, a participatory good could be the object of an individual right. An individual might, for example, have a right to require others to participate with him in speaking his language and those others may be duty-bound to comply if he so insists. That may be a morally unappealing state of affairs but nothing in the logic of rights or participatory goods rules it out (provided that the very nature of the good at issue does not require voluntary participation). The lacuna that Morauta identifies indicates that the proposition that only groups can have rights to participatory goods relies upon more than just the “structural features” of those goods. It relies also upon a moral assumption about the relative standing of the individuals who have interests in, or who lay claim to, a participatory good.

Suppose, for example, that one person in a nation had, uniquely, a right that that nation should be self-determining. His fellow-nationals should then be part of a self-determining unit, not because they are entitled to be, but because he is entitled that they should be. He therefore has a right over their lives that they themselves do not. Normally, we would regard that sort of inequality in moral standing as entirely unacceptable; but it is because we take that moral unacceptability for granted that we are predisposed to accept that rights to participatory goods—or, indeed, rights to public goods as public goods—must be group rights. Of course, people of equal standing can be unequally interested in a good but, in any sizeable group, it is most unlikely that one individual’s interest in a good that is public to the group will be so special and so disproportionate that that individual will have, uniquely, a right to the good as a good for the group as a whole (Jones 2014, 2018).

6. Scepticism about group rights

Criticism of group rights can take a case-by-case form. The critic might argue that close inspection of particular rights commonly claimed as group rights reveals either that they are not rights at all or that they dissolve into individual rights (e.g. Griffin 2008, 256–276; Lagerspetz 1998). However, much criticism is directed at the very idea of group rights. That criticism is generally of two sorts: either it is sceptical of the claim that groups can hold rights or it is fearful of the implications or consequences of ascribing rights to groups.

Sceptics often object to the ontology of groups they take to be implicit in the idea of group rights. To suppose that groups, like individual persons, can hold rights is to suppose that groups can have a being and an integrity that match those of individual persons. But groups are collections of individuals and to make them out to be supra-human entities that are somehow more than, or other than, the sum of their parts is mistaken: “only individuals can make decisions, can literally have values, literally engage in reasoning and deliberation” (Narveson 1991, 334). Those who make and administer the law may have good reason to create and to operate with fictions, such as the legal fiction of corporate personality. But moral rights and duties can attach only to real persons; “fictitious entities have no rights” (Graff 1994, 194). Groups do not exist separately from their members and, when we ascribe rights to groups as such, we ignore that simple truth. (Narveson 1991, 331–5; Wellman 1995, 157–77; cf Vincent 1989).

Doubts about the integrity of groups are sometimes sociological rather than ontological. Generally, we might suppose that the groups to which we ascribe rights have a unity and identity that is independent of, and that provides the foundation for, our ascription of rights to them. A group, such as an ethnic or cultural group, has a certain “natural” existence and we recognise it as having rights because of the kind of existent it is. In reality, however, pre-institutionalised groups are shifting and changing entities and lack clear boundaries. In addition, any section of humanity that we might fasten upon as a group is likely to be part of a larger sociological entity, and to have within it smaller entities, that might also claim to be “groups”. So there can be a significant element of arbitrariness about the segments of humanity that we identify as “groups”. We may suppose that, in ascribing rights to a group, we merely acknowledge the entitlements of a pre-existing entity, but, in reality, it may be the ascription of rights itself that identifies, creates and fixes a segment of humanity as a “group”. (Flanagan 1985; Kukathas 1992, 110–15; Mitnick 2006; Offe 1998, 125–31; Waldron 2002. Cf. Mello 2004; Sharp 1999.)

Groups may be found improper subjects of rights because they lack properties, other than genuine integrity, that are deemed essential for right-holding. As we have seen, proponents of the interest theory of rights are able to view group rights more generously than those who adhere to the choice theory, although the supposition that groups can have interests has not gone unchallenged (Wall 2003, 273). Choice theorists can extend rights to organised groups that possess decision-procedures (Preda 2012; Sumner 1987, 209–211), but some argue that even those groups are incapable of the agency required for right-holding (Wellman 1995, 157–65; Wall 2000, 2003, 270–6; cf. Nickel 1997). Again, if sentience is a necessary condition of right-holding, that may disqualify groups as right-holders: “groups are composed of sentient individuals, but they do not themselves feel anything” (Rainbolt 2006, 208. See also Kymlicka 1989, 241–2; Ellis 2005, 206–7. For a contrary view, see Graham 2002, 89–104).

More simply, sceptics often suppose that crediting groups with rights entails ascribing groups irreducible moral standing as groups, a standing that the sceptics reject. They do not deny the reality of groups or their significance for human life but insist that, insofar as these give rise to rights, those rights can be adequately conceived as rights held individually by the members of groups. Indeed, that must be so, since only individual humans can possess moral standing and only they therefore can possess moral rights. Michael Hartney (1991), for example, asserts “value-individualism”, the view that “only lives of individual human beings have ultimate value”; collective entities derive whatever value they have from their contribution to the lives of individual human beings (297). Value-individualism, Hartney argues, precludes the possibility of moral group rights (see also Ellis 2005; Kukathis 1991; Narveson 1991).

For the most part, scepticism about group rights presupposes a corporate conception of those rights. It challenges claims that a group might have a being, status or value that is not reducible to that of its members. But, since the collective conception makes none of those claims, it is largely untouched by that scepticism. It is not, however, exempt from other sorts of objection.

7. Fears of the implications or consequences of group rights

Worries about the moral implications or consequences of ascribing rights to groups relate not only to whether we should accept that groups have rights but also to how generously we should ascribe rights to them. The common thread running through these worries is the threat that group rights might pose to individuals and their rights. Sometimes the concern is for those inside, and sometimes for those outside, the right-holding group.

One concern is that, if we give moral standing to groups as such, we shall lose sight of individuals within the group (Vincent 1989, 714). If a group can have standing as a group independently of its individual members, those individuals will have no standing on any matter on which the relevant standing lies with the group. On those matters, the separate wills of individuals cannot count. They will not be overridden; they will simply pass unrecognised.

Another fear concerns the power that a group may wield over its own members (e.g. Macdonald 1989; Offe 1998, 131–5; Waldron 1993, 363–6). When we allow that a group has rights, those may be rights that enable it to regiment the lives of its members. Thus, once again, group rights may function to the detriment of those who fall within the group. In one respect, that seems an unnecessarily invidious way of representing the relationship between groups and their members. There is nothing unusual about a group’s organising itself so that it can make decisions collectively, either directly or through appointees, that bind its members severally. That describes the normal state of affairs for tennis clubs, anglers’ associations, political parties, churches and any number of quite unremarkable groups. The right of a group collectively to make decisions that bind its members severally is a simple description of democracy.

So why has there been so much angst about allowing that groups can have rights over their members? The answer is that, in recent decades, group rights have been discussed primarily in relation to groups that have involuntary memberships: groups that are distinguished by their race, ethnicity, culture, or language. People do not choose to be members of these “ascriptive” groups, nor can they easily leave them as they might leave a club or association. If they find the group’s authority oppressive or its way of life intolerable, they cannot simply opt out, since their membership of the group is treated by others—insiders or outsiders or both—as a natural “given” to which normal rights of entry and exit do not apply. That is why Will Kymlicka, for example, a liberal deeply sympathetic to the claims of cultural groups and indigenous peoples, is reluctant to allow that the rights of groups can be directed inwardly as restrictions upon the group’s own members, rather than outwardly as protections against the external world (Kymlicka 1995, 34-48; cf. Marmor 2001).

Concerns about the potential for oppression implicit in group rights sometimes have an empirical dimension. Demands for group rights are often looked upon most favourably when they are made by indigenous peoples, cultural minorities and religious groups whose way of life is threatened by external influences. But frequently, it is alleged, the real effect of conceding rights to these sorts of group is to reinforce the power of conservative elites whose wishes and interests clash with those of others in the group. Typically, an elite will want to use its power to maintain the traditions and integrity of the group and will be unwilling to tolerate dissent, deviance and demands for reform. It will also seek to maintain the position of those within the group who have traditionally been subordinate. This issue is often described as the problem of “minorities within minorities” (Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005; Green 1994), but it can also be a problem of majorities (e.g. women) within minorities. In short, while according rights to a group may enhance the position of some of its members, it may seriously diminish the freedom and well-being of others (Cohen et al. 1999; Deveaux 2000; Dick 2011; Kukathas 1992, 113-15; Okin 2002; Shachar 2001; Tamir 1999, 158-64, 173-4). We should also bear in mind, however, that withholding power from a sub-state group for that reason involves the assumption that the group’s members will be better served by the state’s authority than by the authority of their group, an assumption that some would question (e.g. Holder 2012).

A closely related fear concerns the potential of group rights to rival and override the rights of individuals (e.g. Buchanan 1994; Caste 1992; Graff 1994; Isaac 1992; Macdonald 1989, 126–7; Tamir 1999, 161; Tesón 1998, 132–137). One of the strongest motivations for ascribing rights to individual persons is to provide them with safeguards. Individuals as individuals are vulnerable to those who wield power in all of its many forms and to the might of numbers. When we give rights to individuals, we provide them with moral shields that protect them from the excesses of power, including excesses of collective power. But, if we ascribe rights to groups, we may discover that their rights override the rights of individuals, so that rights lose their potency as safeguards for individuals. When the rights of a mighty group come up against those of a mere individual, Goliath rather than David may more frequently emerge as the victor.

That concern is shared by List and Pettit (2011, 170–85). While they hold that group agents as group persons should possess rights, they also subscribe to value (or “normative”) individualism, the view that something is good only if it is good for individual human beings or non-human sentient beings (182). On their view, value-individualism provides reason not to abandon group rights (as Hartney, 1991, alleges) but to curtail the scope of those rights. Group persons should have only rights that will redound to the benefit of individual persons, be they members or non-members of the group. Given the well-known dangers posed by asymmetries of power between groups and individuals, we should accord groups a more limited set of rights than we accord individuals, though we have no reason similarly to curtail the responsibilities we assign groups. (For other views on value-individualism and the curtailing of group rights, see Hindriks 2014; Pasternak 2017; Rafanelli 2017; Smith 2018).

Group rights conceived collectively may seem less threatening to individuals than group rights conceived corporately. Because, on the corporate conception, a group has moral standing independently of its members, its standing, will and interest can rival and override those of its individual members. A collective right by contrast, because it is held jointly by the individuals who make up the collectivity and is grounded in their standing and interests, presents no similar danger. But fear of collective rights may still be provoked by the way in which those rights derive from the aggregation of individual interests. As we have already seen, on Raz’s conception of collective rights, numbers count. Numbers affect both whether groups have rights and how weighty their rights are (1986, 187, 209). Others are loath to accept that rights can derive from, or be affected by, that sort of aggregation (Réaume 1988, 2003; Tamir 1999, 166–71). In contemporary philosophy, rights-thinking is commonly opposed to maximizing consequentialism, of which utilitarianism is the prime example. Ascribing rights to individuals is a way of acknowledging their separateness as persons and of safeguarding them from the aggregative excesses of utilitarianism. But if the aggregation of interests can yield collective rights, a morality of rights may begin to assume the character of, and to present the same dangers as, the very sort of utilitarian thinking that many rights-theorists intend it to preclude, especially for those outside the right-holding group.

8. Group rights and individual rights: co-existence and complementarity?

A number of things might be said in response to these worries. First, very much depends upon the content that we give group rights. It is possible to invest individual rights with a content that would make them unsavoury, but that would not discredit the very idea of individual rights; similarly, the possibility that we might find some group rights objectionable is no reason to dismiss group rights altogether. Secondly, it would seem strangely arbitrary, given the moral significance that we give to rights, to insist that the objects of rights can be only goods that individuals can enjoy as independent individuals and never goods they can enjoy only in association with others. Some theorists of rights seem to think just that. But we cannot take for granted that no good, whose shared nature was such that it could be the possible object only of a group right, could ever have the significance that would justify its actually being the object of a right.

Thirdly, there is no reason why individual rights and group rights should not both figure in our moral thinking. Indeed, they commonly do. For example, it would be entirely commonplace to hold that a people, as a political unit, has a collective right to be self-determining but only within the limits set by individuals’ human rights. Group rights do not have to clash with individual rights and a complete moral theory would articulate individual rights and group rights so that they formed a coherent set (cf. Buchanan 1994; De Feyter and Pavlakos 2008; Holder and Corntassel 2002; Jones 2018). It may prove impossible to anticipate and avoid every conflict amongst rights, but, even if it does, we need not suppose that conflicts will arise more commonly between group rights and individual rights than amongst individual rights themselves (McDonald 1998; Waldron 1993, 203-24).

There is also a well-established tradition of political thought, associated particularly with Alexis de Tocqueville and the English Pluralists, which sees the existence of groups as essential to the dispersion of power and maintenance of liberty within a society. According to that tradition, groups do not glower threateningly at individuals. Rather, the rights of groups help to counter and hold in check a potentially overmighty state. (Stapleton 1995; Lustgarten 1983. See also Frohnen 2005 and Gedicks 1989.)

Group rights and individual rights can, then, co-exist more or less peacefully, but it is also possible for them to enjoy a more positive and mutually supportive relationship. Raz has pointed out that individual rights frequently presuppose the existence of general social goods and individual rights themselves frequently promote social goods (1986, 193–216, 245–263; 1995). Indeed, individual rights may sometimes be rights only because they promote social goods. Raz does not claim that those social goods are generally the objects of group rights, but he does expose the error of supposing that an antagonism towards collective considerations is somehow built into the very idea or purpose of individual rights. The interests that group rights and individual rights seek to protect will frequently be the same interests.

Indeed, it may sometimes be an individual right that makes the case for a group right. We might argue, for example, that some of the goods to which individuals have rights depend for their realisation upon the health of the communities and cultures to which those individuals belong, so that there is a case for individuals sharing in group rights because those rights serve their individual rights or their individual freedom (Jacobs 1991; Kymlicka 1989, 1995; Wellman 1999). Or we might argue that individuals have equal rights to the conditions of self-development, that individual self-development requires common or joint activity, and that that makes the case for group rights to the conditions necessary for that common or joint activity (Gould 2001). Or, again, we might hold that amongst the range of options required for individual autonomy are joint options, options to pursue ends that require co-ordinated activity with other members of one’s group; that too may justify group rights, such as the right of a group to control its own affairs (Wall 2007). The claim here might be either that a group right is conducive to, or, more strongly, that it is essential for, the realisation of an individual right.

Newman too argues that some individual rights presuppose group rights (2011, 76-82). His general analysis of the relationship between individual and group rights is both nuanced and qualified (2011, Part II). As we have seen, he conceives right-holding groups as having rights grounded in their interests as groups, interests that are not reducible to the interests of their members taken severally. Even so, he insists that group rights must be consistent with the “humanistic principle”, which holds that what matters ultimately is the well-being of individual human persons. In that respect, he is, like List and Pettit (2011), a value-individualist and not, like Jovanović (2012), a value-collectivist. A group right cannot ultimately be in competition with the well-being of the group’s members. He formulates that requirement as “the service principle”: if the claims a group makes upon its members are to be legitimate, those claims must serve the interests of the group’s members. He pairs that with a “mutuality principle”: a right-holding group cannot act without regard for the well-being of outsiders, be they individuals or other groups. The service principle does not, however, translate into the familiar claim that individual rights must invariably displace group rights. People have interests both as individuals and as group members and sometimes their interests as members may matter more than their interests as individuals. Newman therefore cautions against supposing that compliance with his humanistic principle means that group rights must always take second place to individual rights.

9. Group rights and human rights

In seeking to reconcile group rights and individual rights, should we take a further step and deem some group rights to be human rights? Some international human rights documents already suggest that we should. The preambles to the UN’s Covenants on Civil and Political Rights (1966) and on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966) characterise the rights each Covenant recognises as human rights. The first articles of both Covenants ascribe to all “peoples” the right of self-determination, the right freely to dispose of their natural wealth and resources, and the right not to be deprived of their means of subsistence. These are manifestly group rights but for the Covenants they would also seem to be human rights. The UN instrument that recognises collective human rights most expressly and abundantly is its Declaration of the Rights of Indigenous Peoples, 2007. The rights the Declaration announces include, for example, the rights of indigenous peoples “to maintain and strengthen their distinct political, legal, economic, social and cultural institutions” (art.5), their right that their cultures shall not be destroyed (art.8), and their right not to be forcibly removed from their lands and territories (art.10).

The mere existence of these international instruments does not, of course, establish that the ascription of human rights to groups is either conceptually coherent or morally defensible and, for the most part, drafters of UN human rights documents have studiously avoided any suggestion that human rights might be other than individually held. For many commentators, human rights are necessarily and only the rights of human individuals; groups may possess rights but they will not be human rights (e.g. Donnelly 2013, 45–54; Graff 1994; Griffin 2008, 256–76; Jovanović 2012, 166–195; Miller 2002; Nickel 2007, 163–167; Nordenfelt 1987; Waldron 1993, 339–69). Others insist that some goods that are fundamental to human well-being are collective in nature and an adequate theory of human rights would accommodate that reality and recognise group as well as individual human rights (e.g. Beitz 2009, 181–186; Casals 2006; Crawford 1988; Felice 1996; Freeman 1995; Holder 2006; Jones 1999b, 2013; Kymlicka 2001, 69–90; Malik 1996; Mende 2018; Thompson 2015).

Where we stand on this issue may turn on what we understand a human right to be. The orthodoxy among moral and political philosophers has been that human rights are moral rights which individuals possess in virtue of their humanity. If we opt instead for a purely legal conception of human rights (e.g. Buchanan 2013; Macklem 2015), the question of whether group rights might be human rights may be settled by legal fiat: if law declares a group right to be a human right, a human right it will be. Similarly, if we adopt a “political” conception of human rights, according to which a right is “human” not because it is grounded in our humanity but in virtue of the role it plays, or should play, in international political practice (e.g. Beitz 2009; Rawls 1999; Raz 2010), group rights will figure among human rights if they are reckoned suitable for that role. But, if we stick with the traditional moral conception of human rights and take the adjective “human” seriously (e.g. Griffin 2008; Tasioulas 2007; Wellman 2011), the possibility of group human rights remains controversial. Human beings are individual beings so that, if human rights are rights we hold as human beings, they would seem to be of necessity individual rights. Moreover, the misgivings many people entertain about the potential of group rights to rival and threaten individual rights are likely to be all the greater if the rights we ascribe to groups are human rights which might match and override the human rights of individuals.

The main count on the other side of the argument is that many goods that matter to human beings are collective in nature and many that are already well-established objects of individual human rights have collective dimensions. Consider, for example, collective acts of worship or other shared expressions of religious faith, or provision for a minority’s language in public documentation and public signage. If these collective goods are objects of human rights, those rights would seem to be of necessity group rights. UN documents sometimes seek to avoid that conclusion by distinguishing between the possession and the exercise of human rights. Individuals may exercise some human rights “in community with others” rather than individually but the rights they exercise together will still be rights they possess individually. But that distinction can be difficult to maintain (Jones 2018, 2020). If, for example, a population engages in an act of collective self-determination, that act is not intelligible as the simultaneous exercise of so many individually-held rights of individual self-determination; the act is a collective act with a collective outcome and the right to perform it can only be a group right. Similarly, a right to perform an integrated act of worship as an integrated act makes sense only as a group right. Individuals may possess individual rights to participate in the collective act but the right to stage the act of worship as a collective act will be a group right. If, with the Vienna Declaration (1993, Part II, para. 22), we deem the human right to freedom of religion to include the right of religious communities that their sacred sites shall not be desecrated, that too would seem inescapably to be a group right.

The distinction between the corporate and collective conceptions of group rights is of first importance here. A group right corporately conceived is a right held by the group as a corporate entity possessing moral standing as that entity. It is a right borne by an entity other than a human being and is therefore not plausibly a human right. A group right collectively conceived is a right held by individuals, but a right held by those individuals jointly rather than individually. So understood, a group right is readily intelligible as a human right. Of course, not all collective rights will be human rights, just as not all individual rights are human rights. But a right need not fall outside the domain of human rights just because the individuals who hold it do so collectively rather than individually.

What then of fears that ascribing human rights to groups will be to the detriment of individuals and their human rights? If we ascribe human rights to groups understood as corporate entities, those fears are easily understood since potentially we pit the rights of two different entities, groups and individuals, against one another. But, if we ascribe human rights to groups understood as collectivities, we do nothing of the kind since the individuals who hold human rights collectively will be the same individuals as those who hold human rights individually. The task of the human rights theorist will then be to structure the entire set of human rights so that, for all who hold them, they constitute a morally optimal and compossible set.


  • Beitz, Charles, 2009, The Idea of Human Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brett, Nathan, 1991, “Language Laws and Collective Rights”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 347–360.
  • Buchanan, Allen, 1993, “The Role of Collective Rights in the Theory of Indigenous People’s Rights”, Transnational Law and Contemporary Problems, 3 (1): 89–108.
  • –––, 1994, “Liberalism and Group Rights”, in In Harm’s Way: Essays in Honor of Joel Feinberg, Jules L Coleman and Allen Buchanan (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–15.
  • –––, 2013, The Heart of Human Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Casals, Neus Torbisco, 2006, Group Rights as Human Rights: a Liberal Approach to Multiculturalism, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Caste, Nicholas J., 1992, “Corporations and Rights”, Journal of Value Inquiry, 26 (2): 199–209.
  • Collins, Stephanie, 2019, Group Duties: Their Existence and Their Implications for Individuals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cohen, Joshua, Martha Nussbaum, and Matthew Howards (eds.), 1999, Is Multiculturalism Bad for Women?, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Copp, David, 1984, “What Collectives are: Agency, Individualism and Legal Theory”, Dialogue, 23: 249–270.
  • Crawford, James, 1988, “The Rights of Peoples: Some Conclusions”, in The Rights of Peoples, James Crawford (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 159–175.
  • De Feyter, Koen, and George Pavlakos (eds.), 2008, The Tension Between Group Rights and Human Rights: A Multidisciplinary Approach, Oxford: Hart Publishing.
  • Devaux, Monique, 2000, “Conflicting Equalities? Cultural Group Rights and Sex Equality”, Political Studies, 48 (3): 522–539.
  • Dick, Caroline, 2012, The Perils of Identity: Group Rights and the Politics of Intragroup Difference, Vancouver: University of British Columbia Press.
  • Donnelly, Jack, 2013, Universal Rights in Theory and Practice, 3rd edn, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Eisenberg, Avigail, & Jeff Spinner–Halev (eds.), 2005, Minorities within Minorities, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ellis, Anthony, 2005, “Minority Rights and the Preservation of Languages”, Philosophy, 80 (312): 199–217.
  • Felice, William F., 1996, Taking Suffering Seriously: The Importance of Collective Human Rights, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Flanagan, Thomas, 1985, “The Manufacture of Minorities”, in Minorities and the Canadian State, Neil Nevitte and Allan Kornberg (eds.), Oakville: Mosaic Press, pp. 107–124.
  • Freeman, Michael, 1995, “Are there Collective Human Rights?”, Political Studies, 43 (1): 25–40.
  • French, Peter A, 1984, Collective and Corporate Responsibility, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1995, Corporate Ethics, Fort Worth: Harcourt Brace.
  • Frohnen, B.P., 2005, “The One and the Many: Individual Rights, Corporate Rights and the Diversity of Groups”, West Virginia Law Review, 107 (3): 789–846.
  • Galenkamp, Marlies, 1993, Individualism and Collectivism: the Concept of Collective Rights, Rotterdam: Rotterdamse Filosofische Studies.
  • Gedicks, Frederick Mark, 1989, “Towards a Constitutional Jurisprudence of Religious Group Rights”, Wisconsin Law Review, 99 (1): 99–169.
  • Gould, Carol C., 2001, “Group Rights and Social Ontology”, in Groups and Group Rights, Christine Sistare, Larry May, and Leslie Francis (eds.), Lawrence: University of Kansas Press, pp. 43–57.
  • Graff, James A., 1994, “Human Rights, Peoples, and the Right to Self-Determination”, in Group Rights, Judith Baker (ed.), Toronto: Toronto University Press, pp. 186–214.
  • Graham, Keith, 2002, Practical Reasoning in a Social World, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Green, Leslie, 1988, The Authority of the State, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1991, “Two Views of Collective Rights”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 315–327.
  • –––, 1994, “Internal Minorities and their Rights”, in Group Rights, Judith Baker (ed.), Toronto: Toronto University Press, pp. 100–117.
  • Griffin, James, 2008, On Human Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Haksar, Vinit, 1998, “Collective Rights and the Value of Groups”, Inquiry, 41 (1): 21–43.
  • Hart, H. L. A., 1982, “Legal Rights”, in his Essays on Bentham, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 162–193.
  • Hartney, Michael, 1991, “Some Confusions Concerning Collective Rights”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 292–314.
  • Hindriks, Frank, 2014, “How Autonomous are Collective Agents? Corporate Rights and Normative Individualism”, Erkenntnis, 79 (59): 1565–85.
  • Holder, Cindy, 2006, “Self-Determination as a Human Right”, Human Rights Review, 7 (4): 5–18.
  • –––, 2012, “Devolving Power to Sub-State Groups: Some Worries about the Worries”, The Monist, 95 (1): 86–102.
  • Holder, C.L., and J.J. Corntassel, 2002, “Indigenous Peoples and Multicultural Citizenship: Bridging Collective and Individual Rights”, Human Rights Quarterly, 24 (1): 126–151.
  • Isaac, Thomas, 1992, “Individual versus Collective rights: Aboriginal People and the Significance of Thomas v Norris”, Manitoba Law Journal, 21 (3): 618–630.
  • Jacobs, Lesley A., 1991, “Bridging the Gap between Individual and Collective Rights with the Idea of Integrity”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 375–386.
  • Jones, Peter, 1999a, “Group Rights and Group Oppression”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 7 (4): 353–377.
  • –––, 1999b, “Human Rights, Group Rights, and People’s Rights”, Human Rights Quarterly, 21 (1): 80–107.
  • –––, 2010, “Cultures, Group Rights and Group-Differentiated Rights”, in Multiculturalism and Moral Conflict, Maria Dimova-Cookson and Peter Stirk (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 38–57.
  • –––, 2013, “Groups and Human Rights”, in Human Rights: the Hard Questions, Cindy Holder and David Reidy (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 100–114.
  • –––, 2014, “Collective Rights, Public Goods and Participatory Goods”, in How Groups Matter, Magali Bessone, Gideon Calder and Frederico Zuolo (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 52–72.
  • –––, 2018, “Human Rights and Collective Self-Determination”, in Human Rights: Moral or Political?, Adam Etinson (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2020, “Collective and Group-Specific: Can the Rights of Ethno-Cultural Minorities be Human Rights?”, in his Essays on Culture, Religion and Rights, London: Rowman & Littlefield, 53–81.
  • Jovanović, Miodrag A., 2012, Collective Rights: A Legal Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kramer, Matthew H, 1998, “Rights Without Trimmings”, in A Debate over Rights, Matthew H. Kramer, N. E. Simmonds, and Hillel Steiner (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 7–111.
  • Kukathas, Chandran, 1992, “Are there any Cultural Rights?”, Political Theory, 20 (1): 105–139.
  • Kymlicka, Will, 1989, Liberalism, Community and Culture, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1995, Multicultural Citizenship, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2001, Politics in the Vernacular: Nationalism, Multiculturalism, and Citizenship, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lagerspetz, Erik, 1998, “On Language Rights”, Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 1 (2): 181–199.
  • List, Christian, and Philip Pettit, 2011, Group Agency: The Possibility, Design and Status of Corporate Agents, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lustgarten, L. S., 1983, “Liberty in a Culturally Plural Society”, in Of Liberty, A Phillips Griffiths (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 91–108.
  • Lyons, David, 1969, “Rights, Claimants, and Beneficiaries”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 6 (3): 173–85.
  • Macdonald, Ian, 1989, “Group Rights”, Philosophical Papers, 18 (2): 117–136.
  • Macklem, Patrick, 2015, The Sovereignty of Human Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Malik, Maleiha, 1996, “Communal Goods as Human Rights”, in Understanding Human Rights, Conor Gearty and Adam Tomkins (eds.), London: Mansell, pp. 138–169.
  • Margalit, Avishai, and Joseph Raz, 1990, “National Self-Determination”, Journal of Philosophy, 87 (9): 439–461.
  • Marmor, Andrei, 2001, “Do We have a Right to Common Goods?”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 14 (2): 213–225.
  • May, Larry, 1987, The Morality of Groups: Collective Responsibility, Group-Based Harm, and Corporate Rights, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • McDonald, Leighton, 1998, “Can Collective and Individual Rights Coexist?”, Melbourne University Law Review, 22 (2): 310–336.
  • McDonald, Michael, 1991, “Should Communities have Rights? Reflections on Liberal Individualism”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 217–237.
  • Mello, Brian, 2004, “Recasting the Right to Self-Determination: Group Rights and Political Participation”, Social Theory and Practice, 30 (2): 193-213.
  • Mende, Janne, 2018, A Human Right to Culture and Identity? The Ambivalence of Group Rights, London: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Miller, David, 2002, “Group Rights, Human Rights and Citizenship”, European Journal of Philosophy, 10 (2): 178–195.
  • Miller, Seumas, 2001, Social Action: A Teleological Account, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2010, The Moral Foundations of Social Institutions: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mitnick, Eric J., 2006, Rights, Groups, and Self-Invention: Group-Differentiated Rights in Liberal Theory, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Morauta, James, 2002, “Rights and Participatory Goods”, Oxford Journal of Legal Studies, 22 (1): 91-113.
  • Narveson, Jan, 1991, “Collective Rights?”, Canadian Journal of Law and Jurisprudence, 4 (2): 329–345.
  • Newman, Dwight, 2011, Community and Collective Rights: A Theoretical Framework for Rights held by Groups, Oxford: Hart Publishing.
  • Nickel, James, 1997, “Group Agency and Group Rights”, in Ethnicity and Group Rights: Nomos XXXIX, Ian Shapiro and Will Kymlicka (eds.), New York: New York University Press, 235–256.
  • –––, 2007, Making Sense of Human Rights, second edition, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Nordenfelt, Johan, 1987, “Human Rights—What They Are, and What They Are Not”, Nordic Journal of International Law, 56 (1): 1–8.
  • Offe, Claus, 1998, “‘Homogeneity’ and Constitutional Democracy: Coping with Identity Conflicts through Group Rights”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 6 (2): 113–141.
  • Okin, Susan Moller, 2002, “Mistresses of their Own Destiny: Group Rights, Gender and the Realistic Rights of Exit”, Ethics, 112 (2): 205–230.
  • Pasternak, Avia, 2017, “From Corporate Moral Agency to Corporate Moral Rights”, Law and Ethics of Human Rights, 11 (1): 135–159.
  • Preda, Adina, 2012, “Group Rights and Group Agency”, Journal of Moral Philosophy, 9 (2): 229–254.
  • –––, 2013, “Group Rights and Shared Interests”, Political Studies, 61 (2): 250–266.
  • Rainbolt, George, 2006, The Concept of Rights, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Rafanelli, Lucia M, 2017, “A Defense of Individualism in the Age of Corporate Rights”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 25 (3): 281–302.
  • Rawls, John, 1999, The Law of Peoples, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Raz, Joseph, 1986, The Morality of Freedom, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1994, Ethics in the Public Domain, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1995, “Rights and Politics”, Indiana Law Journal, 71: 27–44.
  • –––, 2010, “Human Rights without Foundations”, in The Philosophy of International Law, Samantha Besson and John Tasioulas (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 321–338.
  • Réaume, Denise, 1988, “Individuals, Groups, and Rights to Public Goods”, University of Toronto Law Review, 38 (1): 1–27.
  • –––, 1994, “The Group Right to Linguistic Security: Whose Right, What Duties?”, in Group Rights, Judith Baker (ed.), Toronto: Toronto University Press, pp. 118–141.
  • Segesvary, V., 1995, “Group Rights: the Definition of Group Rights in the Contemporary Legal Debate based on Socio-Cultural Analysis”, International Journal on Group Rights, 3 (2): 89–107.
  • Shachar, Ayelet, 2001, Multicultural Jurisdictions: Cultural Differences and Women’s Rights, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sharp, Alan, 1999, “What if Value and Rights Lie Foundationally in Groups? The Maori Case”, Critical Review of International, Social and Political Philosophy, 2 (2): 1–28.
  • Sheehy, Paul, 2006, The Reality of Social Groups, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Smith, Leonie, 2018, “The Curious Case of Ronald McDonald’s Claim to Rights: An Ontological Account of Differences in Group and Individual Person Rights”, Journal of Social Ontology, 4 (1): 1–28.
  • Stapleton, Julia (ed.), 1995, Group Rights, Bristol: Thoemmes Press.
  • Steiner, Hillel, 1998, “Working Rights”, in A Debate over Rights, Matthew H. Kramer, N. E. Simmonds, and Hillel Steiner (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 233–301.
  • Sumner, L. W., 1987, The Moral Foundation of Rights, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Tamir, Yael, 1999, “Against Collective Rights”, in Multicultural Questions, Steven Lukes and Christian Joppke (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 158–180.
  • Tasioulas, John, 2007, “The Moral Reality of Human Rights”, in Freedom from Poverty as a Human Right, Thomas Pogge (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 75–102.
  • Taylor, Charles, 1995, “Irreducibly Social Goods”, in his Philosophical Arguments, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 127–145.
  • Tesón, Fernando R., 1998, A Philosophy of International Law, Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Thompson, Janna, 2015, “Can Groups have Human Rights?”, Ethical Perspectives, 22 (2): 291–313.
  • Van Dyke, Vernon, 1977, “The Individual, the State, and Ethnic Communities in Political Theory”, World Politics, 29 (3): 341–369.
  • Vincent, Andrew, 1989, “Can Groups be Persons?”, Review of Metaphysics, 42 (44): 687–715.
  • Waldron, Jeremy, 1993, Liberal Rights, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002, “Taking Group Rights Carefully”, in Litigating Rights: Perspectives from Domestic and International Law, G. Huscroft and P. Rishworth (eds.), Oxford: Hart, pp. 203–220.
  • Wall, Edmund, 2000, “The Problem of Group Agency”, Philosophical Forum, 31 (2): 187–197.
  • –––, 2003, “Problems with the Group Rights Thesis”, American Philosophy Quarterly, 40 (4): 269–285.
  • Wall, Steven, 2007, “Collective Rights and Individual Autonomy”, Ethics, 117 (2): 234–264.
  • Wellman, Carl, 1995, Real Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, The Moral Dimensions of Human Rights, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wellman, Christopher Heath, 1999, “Liberalism, Communitarianism, and Group Rights”, Law and Philosophy, 18 (1): 13–40.

Copyright © 2022 by
Peter Jones <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free