First published Mon Apr 24, 2017

Memory plays important roles in many areas of philosophy. It is vital to our knowledge of the world in general and of the personal past in particular. It underwrites our identities as individuals and our ties to other people. Philosophical interest in memory thus dates back to antiquity and has remained prominent throughout the history of philosophy (Aho 2014; Bloch 2014; Burnham 1888; Herrmann & Chaffinn 1988; Nikulin 2015). More recently, memory has come to be recognized as a topic of major philosophical importance in its own right, with the emergence of the philosophy of memory as a distinct field of research (Bernecker & Michaelian 2017).

Much of the impetus for the emergence of the field was due to a trend, beginning in the late 1990s, towards increased interdisciplinarity among philosophers working on memory (Hoerl & McCormack 2001; Sutton 1998), a trend which reinvigorated and transformed older philosophical debates by bringing them into contact with empirical and theoretical developments in psychology and the sciences of memory more broadly. To cite just two examples among the many discussed below, empirical research on the constructive character of remembering has intensified philosophical debates over the viability of the influential causal theory of memory (Robins 2016b) and the associated concept of memory traces (De Brigard 2014b), while theoretical frameworks which situate remembering as a form of imaginative mental time travel have lent new urgency to longstanding debates over the relationship between memory and imagination (Debus 2014; Perrin & Michaelian 2017).

The interdisciplinary character of the field notwithstanding, the concerns of philosophers of memory remain distinct from those of memory researchers in other disciplines, and, while this entry discusses the latter where they are of direct philosophical relevance, its focus is squarely on the former. Given the roles played by memory in other areas, the philosophy of memory inevitably overlaps with many other fields of research. Three core areas of activity can nevertheless be discerned, with most researchers approaching memory from the perspectives of philosophy of mind, epistemology, or ethics. The bulk of this entry—sections 2–8—focuses on research on memory from the perspective of philosophy of mind, often referred to as the metaphysics of memory (Bernecker 2008). There is a separate entry on the epistemology of memory, so this area is discussed only briefly here, in section 9. Key issues in the ethics of memory are reviewed in section 10.

1. The Metaphysics of Memory: An Overview

More than any other area, the metaphysics of memory reflects the trend towards interdisciplinarity noted above, and work in this area sometimes shades into philosophy of psychology (Rowlands 2009) and philosophy of neuroscience (Bickle 2011). Relevant work in the philosophy of psychology is discussed here as appropriate; for more specialized work in the philosophy of neuroscience, see the entry on that topic. The central aim of mainstream research on the metaphysics of memory is to develop a theory of remembering: a general but informative account of what it is for someone to remember something. As we will see, however, there are multiple kinds of memory. It is unclear whether it is feasible to develop a theory of remembering that applies to all of these, and ultimately it may prove necessary to develop multiple theories of remembering, corresponding to the multiple kinds of memory. (Something similar may go for the epistemology of memory [Teroni 2014].)

The particular kind of memory on which most recent work has focused has gone by a number of names, but, adopting Tulving’s (1972, 1985a) psychological terminology, philosophers increasingly refer to it as “episodic” (e.g., Hoerl 2007; Dokic 2014; Hopkins 2014; Perrin & Rousset 2014; Soteriou 2008). The terminology may be new, but the focus is not (Brewer 1996). Episodic memory is, roughly, memory for the events of the personal past, and, starting at least with Aristotle (Sorabji 2006) and continuing with early modern philosophers including Locke (1998), Hume ([1739] 2011), and Reid ([1785] 2002), philosophers have singled episodic memory out for special attention on the ground that it provides the rememberer with a unique form of access to past events. For some, indeed, only episodic memory truly merits the name “memory” (Klein 2015; B. Russell 1921). Reflecting this focus, this entry will be concerned primarily with theories of episodic remembering: accounts of what it is for someone to remember an event from his personal past.

Due, perhaps, to their focus on episodic memory, philosophers have generally approached memory as a capacity exercised by single individuals. But recent work in a variety of disciplines has begun to challenge the individualistic approach, and the metaphysics of memory has come to include issues arising from the tradition of research on collective memory in the human and social sciences which traces back to Halbwachs ([1925] 1994; cf. Barash 2016; Michaelian & Sutton forthcoming) and which has recently given birth to the multidisciplinary field of memory studies (Roediger & Wertsch 2008; Segesten & Wüstenberg forthcoming). It has also come to include issues arising from the more recent tradition of research on external memory in cognitive science which views remembering through the lens of distributed (Hutchins 1995) or extended (Clark & Chalmers 1998) theories of cognition. While the entry is concerned primarily with individual memory, these more recent issues will be discussed as well.

2. Kinds of Memory

Before turning to theories of episodic remembering, it will be helpful to situate episodic memory with respect to other kinds of memory. In its broadest sense, “memory” refers to the varied outcomes of the diverse forms of learning of which humans and other agents are capable. Any modification of an agent’s behavioural tendencies as a result of its experience thus potentially counts as memory, making the category of memory very broad indeed. Despite the breadth of the category, however, there is an approximate consensus on a taxonomy of kinds of human memory.

2.1 The standard taxonomy

Philosophers generally distinguish among three main kinds of memory. In early treatments, Bergson ([1896] 1911) and Russell (1921), for example, distinguished between habit memory and recollective memory, while Broad (1925) and Furlong (1951) further distinguished between recollective memory and propositional memory (cf. Ayer (1956; D. Locke 1971)). These distinctions align reasonably well with those drawn by a taxonomy which, originating in psychology, has increasingly become standard in more recent philosophy.

2.1.1 Declarative memory

The taxonomy in question, developed in detail by Squire (2009), divides the overarching category of memory into declarative and nondeclarative memory. Declarative memory, in turn, is divided into episodic memory, corresponding roughly to recollective memory, and semantic memory, corresponding roughly to propositional memory. A first pass at distinguishing episodic from semantic memory can be made by observing that the former is concerned with the events of one’s personal past in particular (e.g., I remember speaking at a conference in Budapest), while the later is concerned with the world in general (I remember that Budapest is the capital of Hungary). It is crucial to note, however, that semantic memory is also sometimes concerned with past events. One can have memories that concern events that one did not oneself experience (I remember that my colleague spoke at a workshop in Rome, though I did not hear him speak); when one does, one remembers semantically, not episodically. Similarly, one can have memories that concern events that one did experience but that are of the same kind as memories for events that one did not experience (I remember that I visited the CN Tower when I was a child, but only because my parents later related the story to me); when one does, one likewise remembers semantically, not episodically. Thus the first-pass distinction between episodic and semantic memory does not get us very far. Drawing a more adequate distinction—providing a criterion of episodicity—is a core problem for the theories of episodic remembering discussed below.

2.1.2 Nondeclarative memory

Nondeclarative memory is usually defined in negative terms: a form of memory is declarative if it involves the encoding, storage, and retrieval of content that the subject can, at least in principle, bring to consciousness; it is nondeclarative if it does not (Squire 2009). Beyond this negative feature, the various kinds of nondeclarative memory may not have much in common with each other. For example, nondeclarative memory includes priming, which occurs when a subject’s response to a given stimulus is affected by his previous exposure to related stimuli (e.g., I recognize the word “Toronto” more quickly after seeing “CN Tower” than after seeing “Colosseum”). It also includes procedural memory, corresponding roughly to habit memory, the kind of memory at work when a subject manifests his ability to perform a skilled action (I remember how to ride a bicycle).

There is relatively little philosophical research on procedural memory, and this kind of memory will not be discussed in any detail here. This should not, however, be taken to imply that it is not of major philosophical interest. In epistemological terms, while declarative memory maps onto the category of knowledge that, procedural memory maps onto the category of knowledge how: one may know or remember how to do something without consciously entertaining any relevant content and without being able, even in principle, to consciously entertain any such content. Future research on procedural memory might therefore build on classic (Ryle [1949] 2009) and contemporary (Stanley 2011) work on the relationship between knowledge that and knowledge how.

Such research might also build on recent work on embodied (Myin & Zahidi 2015; Sutton 2007; Sutton & Williamson 2014) and enactive cognition (Hutto special-character:amp] Myin 2017; Loader 2013). While enactivist approaches will not be discussed any further here, it should be noted there is potential for convergence between these approaches and older Wittgensteinian approaches to memory. Wittgenstein (1980) suggested—in opposition to trace-based accounts—that remembering can, under certain circumstances, amount to doing or saying something, rather than retrieving stored content (Moyal-Sharrock 2009; O’Loughlin forthcoming). This resonates with the enactivist insistence on the centrality of action to cognition, but connectionist readings of Wittgenstein on memory (Stern 1991) have also been proposed, and it remains to be seen whether supplementing enactivist approaches with Wittgenstein will shed any additional light on the nature of remembering (Sutton 2015).

2.2 Alternative taxonomies

Squire’s taxonomy has been extremely influential, but alternative taxonomies have been proposed in both psychology and philosophy. In psychology, Atkinson and Shiffrin (1968) proposed a multi-store model in which kinds of memory are distinguished in terms of their temporal duration. Ultra short term memory refers to the persistence of modality-specific sensory information for periods of less than one second. Short term memory refers to the persistence of information for up to thirty seconds; short term memory, which receives information from ultra short term memory, is to some extent under conscious control but is characterized by a limited capacity. Long term memory refers to the storage of information over indefinitely long periods of time; long term memory receives information from short term memory and is characterized by an effectively unlimited capacity. Though this taxonomy does not distinguish among importantly different kinds of long term memory—in particular, it does not distinguish between episodic and semantic memory—it has been applied productively in psychological research. With rare exceptions (Werning & Cheng 2017), however, it has not informed philosophical discussions.

In philosophy, Bernecker (2010) has proposed a purely grammatical approach, arguing that the kinds of memory are given by the kinds of objects that the verb “to remember” can take. He thus distinguishes among memory for objects, memory for properties, memory for events, and memory for propositions or facts. While a grammatical approach will strike many in philosophy as natural, this particular taxonomy has so far not been taken up very widely. This may be due in part to the fact that, because the basis for the taxonomy is purely linguistic, it has difficulty distinguishing between episodic memory as such, which is arguably characterized by a particular phenomenology, and mere event memory, which lacks this phenomenology (Schechtman 2011). It may also be due in part to the fact that, because it cuts across the categories employed by the standard taxonomy, it is difficult to apply Bernecker’s taxonomy to studies that rely on the latter.

2.3 Other kinds of memory

Regardless of its merits, the standard taxonomy omits certain kinds of memory that are bound to figure in any full-fledged theory of remembering.

2.3.1 Working memory

Working memory, corresponding roughly to Atkinson and Shiffrin’s short term memory, refers to a capacity to actively manipulate a limited number of items in a conscious workspace (Baddeley 2007). There is some philosophical research on working memory (Block 2007; Carruthers 2015; Feest 2011), but the topic has so far been largely unexplored in mainstream philosophy of memory, and it will therefore not be discussed any further in this entry.

2.3.2 Prospective memory

Prospective memory refers to the ability to remember to perform a planned action, or to execute an intention. Failures in prospective memory are of considerable everyday significance and often cause some personal concern. Experimental and naturalistic work on prospective memory now flourishes in psychology (McDaniel & Einstein 2007), and there is considerable discussion about how it relates to other forms of memory and to other cognitive processes. Prospective memory has not yet been addressed much in philosophy, but this is likely to change given its relevance to understanding links between intention and action and to other forms of future-oriented thought.

2.3.3 Autobiographical memory

Autobiographical memory refers to one’s knowledge not only of specific past episodes but also of whole life periods, as well as the overall course of one’s life (Berntsen & Rubin 2012). There is a good deal of philosophical research on autobiographical memory, often drawing on accounts of narrativity. The relationship between autobiographical memory and other kinds of memory is described in different ways by different authors, but in most cases autobiographical memory is treated as a complex capacity that emerges through the interaction of more basic kinds of memory. It is thus unlikely to be a kind of memory on a par with those acknowledged by the standard taxonomy, which correspond to specific brain systems. Existing accounts of autobiographical memory are discussed in section 7 below.

2.4 Natural kinds in memory research

Psychologists have studied hundreds of different kinds of memory in addition to those described above. Many of these are defined in terms of specific laboratory tasks and are unlikely to qualify as natural kinds (Tulving 2007), kinds that carve nature—in this case, the mind—at its joints. But even if only the kinds acknowledged by the standard taxonomy are considered, it is not obvious whether any particular kind of memory, never mind memory as a whole, is a natural kind.

The obvious starting point here is the view that memory is indeed a natural kind. Michaelian (2011b) has, however, suggested that memory is not a natural kind, arguing that, because only declarative memory involves the encoding, storage, and retrieval of content, declarative and nondeclarative memory are sharply distinct from each other. This is consistent with the view that declarative memory is a natural kind, but Klein (2015) has rejected even the latter view, claiming that, because episodic memory necessarily involves a particular phenomenology, episodic memory and semantic memory are sharply distinct. In response, Michaelian (2015) has appealed to cases in which subjects appear to have intact episodic memory despite having impaired episodic phenomenology (Klein & Nichols 2012) to argue that the phenomenology in question is not, strictly speaking, a necessary feature of episodic memory. If this suggestion is right, then declarative memory may after all be natural kind. But even if declarative memory turns out not to be a natural kind, episodic memory might still be a natural kind. Cheng and Werning (2016), for example, have argued on the basis of their “sequence analysis” of remembering—a variant of the causal theory of memory introduced in section 4 below—that episodic memory is indeed a natural kind.

While there is some work on the question of the natural kindhood of episodic memory, the question of the natural kindhood of kinds of memory other than episodic memory remains almost entirely unexplored. Future work here might both draw on and contribute to resolving the debate between systems and process views of memory (Bechtel 2001; Foster & Jelicic 1999; Schacter & Tulving 1994). According to systems views, memory consists of multiple independent systems which interact in various ways. According to process views, in contrast, memory is a unitary capacity which is employed in different ways in response to different demands. The once-lively debate between partisans of systems views and partisans of process views has now largely died down. It has not, however, been clearly resolved in favour of either camp, and progress towards resolving it might be made by bringing the available evidence into contact with detailed theories of natural kinds.

3. Episodicity

As noted above, the kind of memory on which most recent work has focussed is episodic memory. Episodic memory is, roughly, memory for the events of the personal past, but not just any way of thinking about an event from the personal past amounts to episodically remembering it. On the one hand, it is possible, as noted above, for a subject to remember an event not only episodically but also semantically. Thus one core problem for a theory of episodic remembering is to distinguish between episodic memory and semantic memory, that is, to provide a criterion for the episodicity of episodic memory. The present section discusses attempts to solve this problem, which has received a great deal of attention in recent years. On the other hand, it is possible not only to remember an event but also to imagine it. Thus another core problem for a theory of episodic remembering is to distinguish between episodic memory and episodic imagination, that is, to provide a criterion for the mnemicity of episodic memory. Section 4 discusses attempts to solve this problem, which has historically received more attention.

3.1 First-order content

In Tulving’s early work (Tulving 1972), episodic memory was understood as what-where-when memory—in other words, as a system dedicated to storing and retrieving information about particular past events. Episodic memory was thus distinguished from semantic memory in terms of the kind of first-order content with which it is concerned. This first-order content-based approach to episodicity is appealingly straightforward, but it fails to acknowledge that semantic memory can also provide information about particular past events. It fails, moreover, to capture what has seemed to many to be the most distinctive feature of episodic memory, namely, its characteristic phenomenology.

In light of these problems, many researchers have abandoned first-order content-based approaches in favour of the second-order content-based and phenomenological approaches discussed below. Some researchers, however, particularly those interested in animal memory, continue to employ first-order content-based approaches. The second-order content-based approach, as we will see, imposes significant conceptual demands on rememberers, demands which animals are unlikely to meet. And the phenomenological approach is straightforwardly inapplicable to animal memory, since we lack access to animal phenomenology. The what-where-when criterion of episodicity, in contrast, is experimentally tractable, and research employing it has furnished important insights into the abilities of various nonhuman species to remember past events. Some researchers have found it expedient to introduce a concept of episodic-like memory meant to be free of any phenomenological connotations (Clayton & Dickinson 1998). The concept of episodic-like memory may provide a means of reconciling research on animal episodic memory with the influential Bischof-Köhler hypothesis (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007), according to which animals are “stuck in time”. The Bischof-Köhler hypothesis is itself controversial (Hoerl 2008), however, and the legitimacy of the concept of episodic-like memory remains a matter of contention (Droege 2012; Keven 2016; Malanowski 2016; J. Russell & Hanna 2012).

3.2 Second-order content

Second-order content-based approaches understand episodic memory as providing the rememberer with two types of information: first-order information about the remembered event itself (as in the first-order content-based approach) and second-order information about the relationship between the event and the subject’s current memory of it. These approaches thus distinguish episodic memory from semantic memory in terms of the self-reflexive character of its content. McCormack and Hoerl, for example, emphasize the rememberer’s grasp of his temporal relationship to the event (Hoerl 2001; McCormack & Hoerl 2001, 2008), while Fernández emphasizes the rememberer’s grasp of his causal relationship to the event (2006, 2008a,b).

The self-reflexivity criterion of episodicity is intuitively appealing, but it is not without potentially problematic implications. It implies, as noted above, that nonhuman animals (as well as young children) are incapable of remembering episodically, since only creatures with relatively sophisticated conceptual capacities—including the ability to represent past times as past and to represent the self as an enduring entity—are capable of entertaining the relevant second-order contents. It also implies that there is a major difference between the contents of retrieved memories and the contents of the corresponding original experiences, since it sees memories as including content—namely, their second-order, self-reflexive component—that is not included in experiences. Some have, however, seen the latter implication in a positive light, arguing that the fact that episodic memory generates new knowledge—by informing the subject not only of what happened in the past but also that he knows what happened because he experienced it—is in fact one of its defining features (Dokic 2014; Fernández 2015a).

3.3 Phenomenology

Phenomenological approaches, which have similar implications, have been popular in recent psychology, with Tulving, inter alia, abandoning the first-order approach in favour of an approach emphasizing the phenomenology of episodic remembering (Tulving 2002; cf. Dalla Barba 2002, 2016). Phenomenological approaches have likewise long been popular in philosophy. Hume ([1739] 2011), for example, argued that memory is accompanied by a feeling of strength and liveliness. Russell (1921) associated memory with a feeling of familiarity and a feeling of pastness. And Broad (1925) argued, more specifically, that the feeling of pastness is inferred from the feeling of familiarity. In the contemporary literature, Dokic (2014) has argued that episodic memory involves an episodic feeling of knowing.

The feeling of knowing, as usually understood, refers to the sense that one will be able to retrieve needed information from memory. The episodic feeling of knowing posited by Dokic, in contrast, refers to the sense that one’s retrieved memory of an event originates in one’s experience of the event. The concept of an episodic feeling of knowing is thus close to the concept of autonoetic consciousness first proposed by Tulving (1985b). Autonoesis refers to the consciousness of the self in subjective time—which can be roughly described as a feeling of mentally travelling through time to reexperience an event—that is characteristic of episodic remembering. Klein (2015) has made a forceful case for treating autonoeisis as a criterion of episodicity, and the idea that a sense of mentally travelling through time is the distinguishing mark of episodic memory fits well with our first-hand experience of the reexperiential character of remembering.

This idea does, however, raise a number of difficult issues. One such issue concerns the relationship of autonoetic consciousness to other forms of consciousness. Tulving contrasts autonoetic (self-knowing) consciousness with noetic (knowing) and anoetic (nonknowing) consciousness, where noetic consciousness refers to the consciousness of remembering that accompanies semantic memory and anoetic consciousness refers to a basic awareness of ongoing experience. The relationships among these forms of consciousness are complex (Vandekerckhove & Panksepp 2009) and have yet to be explored in detail by philosophers. Their relationships to the form of temporal consciousness at issue in awareness of the ongoing flow of time (Arstila & Lloyd 2014; McCormack 2015) likewise have yet to be explored. Another issue concerns the role of autonoesis in forms of mental time travel other than episodic memory. Episodic memory is increasingly understood as a form of past-oriented mental time travel on a par with future-oriented mental time travel, or episodic future thought (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007). While the standard view is that autonoesis is a necessary feature of both episodic memory and episodic future thought, some researchers have questioned the necessity of autonoesis for episodic future thought (De Brigard & Gessell 2016; Klein 2016a; Klein & Steindam 2016; Perrin 2016).

3.4 Functional perspectives on episodicity

Other researchers have argued that autonoesis is a contingent feature even of episodic memory. This would undermine its status as a criterion of episodicity, but, regardless of whether autonoesis is taken to be a necessary or only a contingent feature of episodic memory, it is not immediately obvious why we should be capable of autonoetic episodic memory—as opposed to mere what-where-when memory—at all. Indeed, accounting for any form of episodic memory in functional terms has proven to be a difficult challenge, and researchers have proposed a range of past-oriented, future-oriented or counterfactual, and metacognitive accounts.

Past-oriented accounts appeal to functional incompatibilities between episodic memory and procedural (Sherry & Schacter 1987) or semantic (Klein, Cosmides, Tooby, & Chance 2002) memory. The thought behind such accounts is that it is adaptively beneficial to have access to information about particular past events, as opposed to the recurrent features of events that are reflected in semantic or procedural memory; such information might, for example, enable us to reevaluate general impressions of others formed on the basis of their past behaviour (Klein et al. 2009). Past-oriented accounts are plausible as far as the function of what-where-when memory is concerned, but they do not identify a function that could be performed only when what-where-when information is accompanied by autonoetic consciousness. Future-oriented and counterfactual accounts appeal to the link between episodic memory and episodic future thought (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007; Tulving 2005) or episodic counterfactual thought (De Brigard 2014a). The thought behind such accounts is that it is adaptively beneficial to prepare for future events by directly anticipating them (in episodic future thought) or by considering alternative outcomes to past events (in episodic counterfactual thought); the ability to remember past events can then be explained as a byproduct of the ability to imagine future or counterfactual events. In line with these accounts, it has been suggested that future-oriented mental time travel may contribute to reducing delay discounting (Boyer 2008). It has also been suggested that the early human cognitive niche may have involved selection for a capacity for anticipatory planning (Osvath & Gärdenfors 2005), a suggestion that resonates with views that link mental time travel to other cognitive capacities, such as language, that appear to be unique to humans (Corballis 2011; Ferretti & Cosentino 2013; Suddendorf 2013).

Future-oriented and counterfactual accounts, like past-oriented accounts, are plausible as far as the function of what-where-when memory is concerned but do not identify a function that could be performed only when what-where-when information is accompanied by autonoetic consciousness. In contrast to these accounts, metacognitive accounts focus specifically on autonoesis, suggesting that this form of consciousness may play a metacognitive role. One possibility here is that autonoesis itself directly grounds a sense of subjective certainty that an apparently remembered event really happened, enabling the subject to act on remembered information rather than floundering in uncertainty (Klein 2014; Tulving 1985a). Another possibility is that autonoesis serves as one of several criteria exploited by metacognitive monitoring processes that enable the subject to tell whether he is remembering or imagining. A related possibility is that autonoesis enables the subject to take epistemic responsibility for his assertions about the past, thus ultimately playing a communicative role (Mahr & Csibra forthcoming). While these metacognitive accounts remain speculative, they at least begin to approach the function of autonoetic episodic memory.

4. Mnemicity

Assuming that a criterion of episodicity can be identified, it remains to identify a criterion of mnemicity—a criterion that distinguishes between remembering and imagining.

4.1 Remembering and imagining

The question of how to distinguish between remembering and imagining is importantly ambiguous. On the one hand, we sometimes remember but do so in a way that is in some sense inadequate; in such cases, we naturally say that we are “only imagining”. The question can thus be taken to concern the distinction between cases in which the subject remembers successfully and cases in which he remembers unsuccessfully. On the other hand, we sometimes think about the past in a way that does not amount to remembering at all; in such cases, too, we naturally say that we are “only imagining”. A criterion of mnemicity must therefore distinguish both between successful and unsuccessful remembering and and between remembering, whether successful or unsuccessful, and mere imagining.

4.1.1 Unsuccessful remembering

Distinguishing between successful and unsuccessful remembering requires identifying the difference between cases in which the memory process results in a genuine memory and cases in which it instead results a memory error such as confabulation (Hirstein 2009). The question of how to distinguish successful remembering from unsuccessful remembering resulting in memory errors is central to the theories of remembering discussed below, but philosophers have also begun to investigate memory errors in their own right. Some have considered the relationship between mnemonic confabulation and other forms of confabulation (Bortolotti & Cox 2009; Hirstein 2005). Others have asked whether confabulation and other memory errors might not, counterintuitively, have beneficial effects. Fernández (2015b), for example, has argued that even wholly confabulated memories may sometimes have adaptive benefits (but see Otgaar, Howe, Clark, Wang, & Merckelbach 2015), while Michaelian (2013) has argued that the misinformation effect, in which inaccurate information concerning an experienced event is incorporated into the subject’s memory of the event (Loftus 1996), can, under certain circumstances, have epistemic benefits (but see Shanton (2011)). And others have attempted to understand the relationships among memory errors of different types. Robins (2016a, a), for example, has explored the relationships among successful remembering, confabulating, and misremembering, characterizing remembering as involving both an accurate representation of an event and retention of information from experience of the event, confabulating as involving an inaccurate representation and no retention of information, and misremembering as involving an inaccurate representation and retention of information. Robins’ account is discussed in more detail below.

4.1.2 Mere imagining

Distinguishing between remembering and mere imagining requires identifying one or more memory markers, where a memory marker is a factor that discriminates between remembering, whether successful or unsuccessful, and mere imagining. The concept of a memory marker is itself importantly ambiguous. On the one hand, memory markers might be understood as factors that the rememberer himself can employ, from the first-person perspective, to discriminate between remembering and imagining. On the other hand, they might be understood as factors to which the theorist of memory can appeal, from a third-person perspective, to discriminate between remembering and imagining.

It is important to note that there is no guarantee of any correspondence between first-person and third-person memory markers. Many factors which might plausibly be held to shape the rememberer’s subjective judgements about whether he is remembering or merely imagining—such as the vividness of an apparent memory—are such that they do not track the objective boundary between memory and imagination. And many factors which might plausibly be held to track that boundary—such as the existence of a causal connection between an apparent memory of an event and the subject’s original experience of it—are such that they are inaccessible to the rememberer and therefore ineligible to serve as first-person markers. Criticisms of proposed memory markers that disregard the distinction between first-person and third-person markers may miss their target. Bernecker (2008), for example, objects to the source monitoring framework in psychology (Johnson (1997); see below), along with similar earlier approaches in philosophy (Smith 2013), on the ground that the markers identified by the framework discriminate between memory and imagination only imperfectly. If these approaches are understood as pertaining to third-person markers, then Bernecker’s criticism is telling. If, however, they are understood as pertaining to first-person markers, then it is not: since subjects’ judgements about whether they are remembering or imagining are sometimes mistaken, an account of first-person memory markers should not identify markers that discriminate perfectly between memory and imagination.

First-person memory markers play a vital role in enabling rememberers to cope with two problems posed by the interaction between memory and imagination. The source problem, arises because subjects remember not only information deriving from experience but also information deriving from a variety of other sources, including imagination. For example, one might imagine an event and later remember the imagined event. Hence, when one remembers, one is faced with the problem of determining whether the information that one remembers derives from experience or, rather, from another source. Subjects appear to cope with this problem by relying on a form of metamemory known as “source monitoring” (Johnson 1997), in which they employ a variety of content-based markers to determine whether or not they are remembering on the basis of experience. For example, memories deriving from experience tend to be more detailed and to include no information about the cognitive operations that produced them, whereas memories deriving from imagination tend to be less detailed and to include information about the cognitive operations that produced them.

The process problem, in contrast, arises because subjects engage not only in episodic remembering but also in episodic future thinking and episodic counterfactual thinking and because (as we will see) these forms of episodic imagining closely resemble remembering. For example, one might imagine a future event or a counterfactual event by drawing on information deriving from similar past events. Hence, when one engages in episodic thought, one is faced with the problem of determining whether one is remembering a past event or imagining a future or counterfactual event. Subjects may cope with this problem by relying on a form of metamemory which might be called “process monitoring”; whereas source monitoring relies primarily on content-based markers, process monitoring may rely additionally on phenomenological markers, such as the feelings of familiarity and pastness discussed above, and formal markers, such as the subject’s intention to remember or imagine (Hoerl 2014; Urmson 1967).

4.2 Theories of remembering

A full theory of remembering will thus include an account of first-person memory markers, but the theories of remembering described here are concerned primarily with third-person markers. These theories can be positioned with respect to two general—and arguably incompatible—conceptions of memory. The conceptions in question have been described in a number of different ways. Koriat and Goldsmith (1996), oppose storehouse conceptions to correspondence conceptions, while Robins (2016a) opposes archival conceptions to constructive conceptions. Borrowing some terminology from epistemology, the conceptions in question can also be described as preservationist and generationist. Preservationism takes remembering to be essentially a matter of encoding, storing, and retrieving information. In philosophy, preservationism is reflected in comparisons—beginning with Plato’s wax tablet metaphor—of memory to a variety of information storage technologies (Depper 2016; Draaisma 2000). In psychology, it is manifested in Ebbinghaus’s ([1885] 1913) foundational experimental work on memory for lists of nonsense syllables. Ebbinghaus’s legacy is carried on in a productive research tradition, but the accent in contemporary psychology is on generative conceptions of memory. Generationism takes remembering to be an active process in which the subject constructs a more or less adequate representation of the past. In psychology, generationism is manifested in Bartlett’s ([1932] 1995; Wagoner 2017) pioneering work on the ways in which memories are created and recreated by the remembering subject. In philosophy, many researchers continue to operate with a preservative conception of memory, but, beginning with a growing interest in false and recovered memories (S. Campbell 2003, 2014; Hacking 1995; Hamilton 1998), generationism has become increasingly influential.

Sufficiently moderate versions of preservationism and generationism may not be incompatible. In order to account for deviations from perfect storage, preservationists may acknowledge the active, constructive character of remembering. And, since stored information provides the raw materials out of which the subject constructs representations of the past, generationists need not deny that remembering involves storage of information. Less moderate versions of preservationism and generationism, however, may be incompatible. Some preservationists deny that genuine remembering is consistent with the inclusion in the retrieved memory representation of content that goes beyond the content that was included in the subject’s original experience of the event (e.g., Bernecker (2010)). Some generationists, meanwhile, grant that remembering involves the preservation of information originating in experience but deny that genuine remembering requires the inclusion in the retrieved memory representation of any content that was included in the subject’s original experience of the event (e.g., Michaelian 2016c). It is difficult to see how these more extreme preservationist and generationist conceptions might be reconciled with each other.

The preservationist conception is reflected in the empiricist theory, which was influential in the first half of the twentieth century and is thus the natural starting point for a review of theories of remembering. The most influential theories in the second half of the twentieth century were the epistemic theory and the causal theory, which likewise reflect the preservationist conception, with the causal theory gradually eclipsing the epistemic theory. In the early years of the twenty-first century, the causal theory has been challenged by new simulation theories, which adopt a thoroughly generationist conception of memory. The remainder of this section reviews each of these theories in turn.

4.2.1 The empiricist theory

Empiricists see both memory and imagination as drawing on preserved sense impressions. Identifying a marker for the distinction between memory and mere imagination is therefore central to the empiricist theory of remembering, and Hume ([1739] 2011) suggested two such markers. First, he suggested that memory and imagination may be distinguished by the latter’s higher degree of flexibility: memory respects the order and form of the subject’s original impressions, whereas imagination does not. This suggestion appears to be unworkable. Hume himself acknowledged that degree of flexibility cannot be employed as a first-person memory marker, since the subject has no means of comparing a current apparent memory to an earlier sense impression. And degree of flexibility fares no better as a third-person memory marker, unless a very extreme form of preservationism is assumed. Generationists, who conceive of remembering as an active, constructive process, are bound to reject a view of memory on which it is characterized by inflexibility. Moderate preservationists likewise acknowledge that remembering is often highly flexible; for example, they may acknowledge that one can remember the elements of an event in an order other than that in which one experienced them (Bernecker 2008).

Second, Hume suggested that memory and imagination may be distinguished by the former’s higher degree of vivacity. As Pears (1990) points out, Hume’s notion of vivacity is ambiguous. It sometimes seems to refer to a property of the representation produced by the apparent memory process; the idea here would be that representations produced by remembering are more detailed than representations produced by imagining. But it sometimes seems to refer to a property of the apparent memory process itself; the idea here would be that remembering imposes itself on the subject in a more spontaneous manner than does imagining. On either interpretation, vivacity may have merit as a first-person memory marker, but it is unworkable as a third-person marker. The representations produced by remembering may be more detailed on average than the representations produced by imagining, but only on average: imagination sometimes produces representations containing a great deal of detail, and memory sometimes produces representations containing very little detail. Similarly, the process of remembering may on average occur spontaneously more often than the process of imagining, but only on average: we sometimes remember deliberately, and we sometimes—as in the familiar phenomenon of mind-wandering (Dorsch 2015)—imagine spontaneously.

Due to these and other problems—see Holland (1954) for a detailed discussion of the empiricist theory, versions of which he attributes to Russell (1921) and Broad (1925), in addition to Hume—the empiricist theory has few contemporary defenders. One exception is Byrne (2010), who endorses a neoempiricist theory which sees the content of memory and the content of imagination as degraded and transformed versions of the content of perception. The neoempiricist theory distinguishes between memory and imagination by claiming that memory necessarily preserves cognitive contact with the original event, whereas imagination may involve cognitive contact but does not preserve it. Both aspects of this claim are problematic. The claim that memory necessarily preserves cognitive contact may be undermined by the generative character of remembering, at least if an extreme form of generationism is assumed. And the claim that imagination does not preserve cognitive contact is difficult to reconcile with the fact that imagining draws on stored information. Like the classical empiricist theory, moreover, the neoempiricist theory fails to deal with both aspects of mnemicity, focusing exclusively on the distinction between remembering and mere imagining and saying little about the distinction between successful and unsuccessful remembering. It may therefore not have a significant advantage over the classical empiricist theory.

4.2.2 The epistemic theory

Epistemic theorists (e.g., Ayer 1956; Annis 1980; A. Holland 1974; D. Locke 1971; Munsat 1967; Naylor 1971; Ryle [1949] 2009; Zemach 1968) see remembering something as being a matter of having known it continuously since once first learned it.[1] The epistemic theory of remembering may capture important features of our ordinary use of the verb “to remember” (Moon 2013), and it has found a number of contemporary advocates (e.g., T. Williamson 2000; Adams 2011; Audi 2002), but it also faces a number of serious problems. One problem is that, because the epistemic theory is couched in terms of propositional knowledge, it applies to episodic remembering only if we take episodic representations to be propositional in character. Even if the theory is entertained as a theory of semantic remembering, moreover, it remains problematic. Semantic memory may correspond roughly to propositional memory, but this correspondence is only rough: on most accounts, semantic memory includes nonpropositional representations of various kinds. Thus the theory applies at best to a subset of semantic memories.

Another problem is that, since knowledge requires truth, justification, and belief, the epistemic theorist must claim that memory requires truth, justification, and belief, and each of these claims has been persuasively challenged. As we will see in section 6, there appear to be cases of memory without truth. There are likewise arguably cases of belief without justification (Audi 1995; Bernecker 2011). Lackey (2005), for example, describes a case in which, after initially forming a belief, the subject acquires defeaters which undermine his justification for it. And there are arguably cases of memory without belief. Martin and Deutscher (1966) illustrate one kind of nonbelieved memory by means of the hypothetical case of a painter who paints a scene that he takes to be imaginary but that turns out to correspond exactly to a scene that he witnessed as a child; intuitively, this is an instance of remembering without believing. Since the subject lacks the phenomenology characteristic of remembering, the epistemic theorist might in principle deny that this particular case is an instance of remembering. But, in the kind of nonbelieved memory studied by psychologists (Otgaar, Scoboria, & Mazzoni 2014), the subject fails to form a belief corresponding to his memory despite having the phenomenology characteristic of remembering; the existence of nonbelieved memories of this kind is well-established.

A further problem is that the theory appears either to collapse into the causal theory or to make remembering into something quite mysterious. As Deutscher (1989) points out, there would seem to be no plausible story about what it is to retain knowledge that does not appeal to the sort of causal connection posited by the causal theory. Thus, if the epistemic theorist explicates retention of knowledge in terms of causal connection, then his theory collapses into the causal theory, and, if the epistemic theorist refuses to explicate retention of knowledge in terms of causal connection, then his theory fails to provide any real insight into the nature of remembering.

4.2.3 The causal theory

Causal theorists see remembering as being characterized by the existence of an appropriate causal connection between an apparent memory and the subject’s original experience of the remembered event. The idea that a causal connection is essential to remembering was unpopular when Martin and Deutscher published their influential (1966) paper, but, despite early opposition (e.g., Squires 1969; Shope 1973; Zemach 1983), it has now largely eclipsed the epistemic theory. Bernecker—who cites von Leyden (1961), Goldman (1967), Shoemaker (1970), Anscombe (1981), and Armstrong (1987) as predecessors, in addition to Martin and Deutscher—has recently developed and defended it at length (Bernecker 2008, 2010). Not all contemporary philosophers of memory explicitly endorse the causal theory, and some suggest amendments or additions to it, but there are few who explicitly reject the theory (Debus 2017). The idea that remembering is characterized by an appropriate causal connection has thus taken on the status of philosophical common sense.

The core of the causal theory is the claim that an appropriate causal connection between the subject’s apparent memory and his original experience is both necessary and, along with relatively uncontroversial additional conditions, sufficient for remembering. There are two aspects to this claim. First, the claim that remembering requires a causal connection already classifies certain cases of apparent memory as merely apparent. For example, Martin and Deutscher describe a case in which a subject experiences an event, forgets it entirely, and later is coincidentally implanted with a “memory” exactly matching his original experience. The requirement of a causal connection rules this case out as a case of genuine memory. Second, the claim that remembering requires an appropriate causal connection classifies certain further cases of apparent memory as merely apparent. Martin and Deutscher describe a case in which a subject experiences an event, describes it to someone, forgets it entirely, is told about it by the person to whom he described it, forgets being told, and then seems to remember the event on the basis of what he was told. Here, there is a causal connection, but intuitively it is of the wrong sort to sustain remembering. Martin and Deutscher’s suggestion is that what is missing is a memory trace: simplifying somewhat, the idea is that the subject’s experience must give rise to a stored representation which exists continuously in the interval between experiencing and remembering and which contributes to the production of the retrieved representation. The requirement of an appropriate causal connection, where an appropriate causal connection is one that goes continuously via a memory trace in this manner, rules this case out as a case of genuine memory.

While the causal theory has been and continues to be enormously influential, both the necessity and the sufficiency of the appropriate causation condition have been questioned. Challenges to the sufficiency of the condition have been more popular. One such challenge appeals to the epistemic relevance of memory. Debus (2010) argues that genuine memories are necessarily epistemically relevant to the remembering subject, in the sense that he is disposed to take them into account when forming judgements about the past. In the most straightforward case, the subject remembers a given event and therefore forms a belief that the event occurred. In less straightforward cases, the subject may refrain from forming a belief that the event occurred but nonetheless be disposed to do so. Because it does not treat epistemic relevance as necessary for remembering, Debus argues, the causal theory is bound to classify certain cases as instances of genuine memory when in fact they are instances of merely apparent memory. For example, in the case of the painter described above, the painter disregards his apparent memory when forming judgements about the past, and therefore it should not be classified as a genuine memory; but the apparent memory is, we may assume, appropriately caused by the painter’s past experience, and therefore the causal theory is bound to classify it as a genuine memory. Given that epistemic relevance is necessary for genuine memory, this argument suggests that the appropriate causation condition must be supplemented with a condition explicitly requiring epistemic relevance. The view that epistemic relevance is necessary for genuine memory, however, may conflate mnemicity and episodicity: one natural take on the case of the painter is that the painter is remembering but, because he lacks autonoetic consciousness, not remembering episodically.

Another challenge appeals to the nature of memory traces. Traces are discussed in more detail below, but two main conceptions of traces are available in the literature, with some theorists understanding traces as local, individually stored entities with explicit content, while others understand them as distributed, superpositionally stored entities with implicit content. The local conception, adopted by Martin and Deutscher (1966), is more straightforward, but the distributed conception, inspired by connectionist approaches to memory (McClelland & Rumelhart 1986) and developed in detail by Sutton (1998), has gradually become the dominant view (Robins 2017). If the distributed conception is right, then individual experiences do not, strictly speaking, result in enduring individual traces but, instead, modify connection weights in networks of event features. Robins (2016b) has argued that, for this reason, a causal theory relying on distributed representations lacks any means of singling an individual event out as the one that is remembered. This would be an unfortunate implication, but the distributed conception may be able to avoid it. On standard distributed connectionist approaches (O’Brien 1991), transient activation patterns are discrete explicit representations, even though they are generated from information stored only holistically in connection weights: thus at retrieval, there can be a distinct representation of an individual remembered event.

Alternatively, the causal theorist might retreat to a local conception of traces, but doing so might not enable him to avoid this difficulty. Any causal theorist who acknowledges the constructive character of remembering must acknowledge that, when one remembers, while some of the content of the retrieved representation presumably originates in one’s experience of the remembered event, the remainder may originate in one’s experience of other events. This implies that one may satisfy the appropriate causation condition with respect not only to the remembered event but also with respect to the other events in question. Given that one does not remember the other events, satisfaction of the appropriate causation condition cannot be sufficient for remembering. Overall, it is unclear whether the appropriate causation condition is sufficient for remembering, regardless of whether a distributed conception or a local conception of traces is adopted.

If the appropriate causation condition merely fails to be sufficient for remembering, an adequate theory of remembering might in principle be produced by supplementing it with additional conditions, producing a variant of the classical causal theory. If the condition fails to be necessary, however, the causal theory will have to be rejected outright, and, while challenges to the sufficiency of the condition have been more popular, the necessity of the condition has also been challenged. Such challenges are motivated by a tension between the causal theory and the constructive character of remembering. The classical version of the causal theory treats the content of a retrieved memory representation as deriving entirely from the subject’s original experience of the remembered event. Causal theorists do not require that the content of a retrieved representation exactly match that of the corresponding experience. In particular, they do not require that the retrieved representation inherit all of the content of the experience. But most do require that the retrieved representation not incorporate content not included in the original experience. Research on constructive memory, however, demonstrates that the content of the retrieved representation routinely differs from that of the experience not only in that it does not include some information that the latter does include but also in that it does include some information that the latter does not include. For example, in cases of boundary extension, the subject sees part of a scene but remembers portions of it that were beyond his field of view (Hubbard, Hutchison, & Courtney 2010). In general, remembering is not a reproductive but a reconstructive process, in which components of previous experiences are extracted and recombined in a flexible manner, often resulting in representations that include content not included in the corresponding experiences (Schacter & Addis 2007).

The constructive character of remembering poses a problem for the sufficiency of the appropriate causation condition, as we have seen, but it also poses a problem for its necessity. In an attempt to render the causal theory compatible with the findings of constructive memory research, Michaelian (2011a) suggests modifying it so that it permits the content of the retrieved representation to go beyond that of the original experience, as long as two conditions are met: first, the content of the retrieved representation must not go “too far” beyond that of the experience; second, the memory system must function reliably when it generates the new content. The first of these conditions is problematically vague. Moreover, there appears to be no way of drawing a meaningful boundary between cases in which the content of the representation does not go too far beyond that of the experience and cases in which it does. In some cases, a majority of the content may derive from the experience. In some cases, only a minority of the content may derive from the experience. As long as part of the content was included in the experience, the causal theorist can in principle classify the representation as a genuine memory. In some cases, however, none of the content at all may derive from the experience. Once the fraction of the content that was included in the experience drops to zero, the causal theorist is bound to classify the representation as a merely apparent memory. Given the reconstructive character of remembering, however, such cases are bound to occur, and it is not clear why the mere preservation of some content, no matter how little, should make a qualitative difference between genuine and merely apparent memory.

The second condition is likewise problematic. James (forthcoming) argues that the introduction of a reliability condition tacitly turns the causal theory into a causal-epistemic theory. The thought here is that the only apparent motivation for imposing the condition is the intuition that memory is a source of knowledge. This is unpersuasive, as there is a clear difference, independent of any epistemological considerations, between reliable and unreliable memory processes. Confabulation, in particular, may be characterized by its unreliability (Hirstein 2005). James also argues, however, that, once a suitable epistemic condition—such as the reliability condition—is added to the causal theory, the causal condition itself becomes redundant. The thought here is that, if the reliability condition is satisfied, then it should not matter whether the causal condition is also satisfied. This is more persuasive, especially in conjunction with the claim that there is no way of drawing a meaningful boundary between cases in which the content does not go too far beyond that of the experience and cases in which it does. Overall, then, the modified version of the causal theory appears to be an unstable halfway-point between the classical causal theory and a theory which rejects the causal condition outright, replacing it with a reliability condition. The simulation theory can, at least in some versions, be understood as such a theory.

4.2.4 The simulation theory

The idea that remembering the past is linked to imagining the future may go back as far as Augustine (Manning, Cassel, & Cassel 2013), but it has until recently played little role in the philosophy of memory. It has, however, come to play an important role in the psychology of memory, as psychologists have moved away from a conception of episodic memory as what-where-when memory and towards a conception of episodic remembering as a form of constructive mental time travel. Reinforced by impressive brain imaging evidence and extensive research on representational and phenomenological overlap between remembering the past and imagining the future (Klein 2013; Schacter et al. 2012; Szpunar 2010), this new conception emphasizes the similarities between episodic memory, episodic future thought (in which the subject imagines possible future events), and, increasingly, processes such as episodic counterfactual thought (in which the subject imagines alternatives to past events). Taking the new conception to its logical conclusion, many have suggested that, rather than distinct capacities for episodic memory and episodic imagination, humans in fact have a single general capacity for mental time travel (Suddendorf & Corballis 2007). In psychology, this new conception has led to theoretical frameworks such as the constructive episodic simulation approach (Schacter, Addis, & Buckner 2008) and the scene construction approach (Mullally & Maguire 2014), both of which emphasize the simulational character of remembering. In philosophy, it has led to simulation theories of remembering (Shanton & Goldman 2010), which see remembering as a process of imagining past events, a process in which a causal connection to the remembered event is at best incidental.

Building on work on episodic future thought, Michaelian (2016c) treats episodic memory and episodic future thought as processes carried out by a common episodic construction system. Both processes draw on stored information originating in experience of past events—that is, on memory traces—in order to construct representations of events. Episodic future thought obviously cannot draw on traces originating in experience of represented events, simply because the relevant events have not yet occurred. Similarly, episodic memory does not necessarily draw on traces originating in experience of represented events: in some cases, it may do so, but the episodic construction system, because it is supports both episodic memory and episodic future thought, is not designed in such a manner that it always does so. Michaelian’s version of the simulation theory, then, implies that an appropriate causal connection is not a prerequisite for remembering. Building work on episodic counterfactual thought, De Brigard (2014a) treats episodic memory as one function of a system devoted to the construction of possible past events—not only events that actually occurred but also events that might have occurred but did not. De Brigard’s version of the simulation theory, too, would seem to imply that episodic memory may in some cases draw on traces originating in experience of represented events but that it does not always do so.

If the simulation theory is right, both of the aspects of mnemicity identified above may require rethinking. Regarding the first aspect, Robins (2016a) has argued that, whereas the causal theory can appeal to the existence of an appropriate causal connection in order to distinguish among successful remembering, confabulating, and misremembering, the simulation theory may not be able to accommodate these distinctions, since it views both successful and unsuccessful remembering as resulting from the same imaginative process. The simulation theory can, however, appeal to the reliability of the imaginative process in question, characterizing successful remembering as involving reliable imagination resulting in an accurate representation of the event, confabulation as involving unreliable imagination resulting in an inaccurate representation, and misremembering as involving reliable imagination resulting in an inaccurate representation (Michaelian 2016b). This approach to memory errors has the advantage of making room for veridical confabulation, which can be characterized as involving unreliable imagination resulting in an accurate representation,

Regarding the second aspect of mnemicity, the simulation theory implies that the difference between memory and imagination is much less dramatic than the traditional view takes it to be. Hopkins (forthcoming) has described memory as imagination controlled by the past. If the simulation theory is right, memory is indeed imagination, but it need not be controlled by the past. One may merely imagine a past event by imagining a counterfactual past event. But if one imagines an actual past event, and if one’s imagination is reliable, then one is simply remembering it. There is, if the simulation theory is right, no difference in kind between cases in which one reliably imagines an actual past event at least in part on the basis of one’s experience of the event and cases in which one reliably imagines an actual past event on another basis; in cases of both sorts, as long as one’s representation of the event is accurate, one has a genuine memory of the event.

Philosophers committed to the traditional view of the difference between memory and imagination are likely to object not only to this implication of the simulation theory but also to the idea of mental time travel itself. Research on mental time travel, as we have seen, suggests that there is no qualitative difference between episodic memory and episodic future thought. Adopting Perrin’s (2016) terminology, continuists argue explicitly that any difference between them is merely quantitative, while discontinuists grant that there are quantitative similarities between episodic memory and episodic future thought but maintain that there are a variety of qualitative differences between them. Discontinuism is the traditional view. Debus (2014), for example, has drawn on relationalist accounts of the objects of episodic memory (J. Campbell 2001; Debus 2008; see section 5 below) to argue that, when one remembers a past event, the remembered event itself may, due to one’s previous causal contact with it, constitute part of the content of one’s mental state, whereas, when one imagines a future event, the imagined event cannot constitute part of the content of one’s mental state, because one has had no causal contact with it. Perrin (2016), meanwhile, has argued that, when one imagines a future event, one effectively stipulates the identity of the subject whose experience one is imagining, so that episodic future thought is immune to error through misidentification, whereas, when one remembers a past event, the identity of the subject is determined by one’s causal relationship to one’s past experience, so that episodic memory is not immune to error through misidentification. Others have argued that episodic memory is itself immune to error through misidentification (Hamilton 2009, 2013), but a more serious problem for these discontinuist arguments is that they presuppose the causal theory of memory: since the causal theory itself presupposes that there is a qualitative difference between remembering and imagining, the arguments appear to beg the question against the continuist view of mental time travel (Michaelian 2016a).

In addition to challenging the traditional view that there is a qualitative metaphysical difference between memory and imagination, the simulation theory challenges the view that there is a qualitative epistemological difference between them. Philosophers have tended to be dismiss the possibility of episodic knowledge of future events, that is, of knowledge produced by imagining the future, as opposed to the sort of semantic knowledge produced by prediction (Kneale 1971; Swinburne 1966). The simulation theory, however, suggests that our episodic knowledge of future events may be on a par with our episodic knowledge of past events. This view is surprising, but it chimes with recent work on imagination as a source of knowledge (Balcerak Jackson forthcoming; Kind forthcoming).

5. Representation

Despite the disagreements among partisans of the theories of remembering discussed in section 4, they are, for the most part, in agreement on the point that remembering involves representations of past events. The role of representations in remembering, however, raises a number of difficult questions of its own. One such question concerns the implications of mental content externalism for memory content in particular.[2] Externalism, which has become the dominant view of the nature of mental content, holds that the content of a subject’s mental representations depends not only on his own internal states but also on his relationships to things in his external environment. For example, what one thinks when one thinks the thought that one would express by saying “water is wet” is determined in part by the chemical composition of the substance that fills the lakes and rivers and falls from the sky in the environment in which one learned to use the word “water”, namely, H2O; had one learned to use the word “water” in an environment in which something other than H2O fills the lakes and rivers and falls from the sky, then one’s thought would have been that that other substance is wet, not that H2O is wet (Putnam 1975). This much is common ground among externalists. But a subject might move from one environment to another, and externalists disagree about the contents of memories formed before such moves and retrieved after them. Pastist externalists (e.g., Boghossian 1989; Burge 1998) maintain that the past environment alone is relevant. Presentist externalists (e.g., Ludlow 1995; Tye 1998) maintain that the past and the present environments are both relevant. And futurist externalists (e.g., Stoneham 2003; Jackman 2005) maintain that the past, the present, and any future environments are all relevant. Since the arguments for and against these views have had little contact with mainstream philosophy of memory, they will not be reviewed here; for further discussion, see Bernecker (2010).

Two further questions concerning the role of representations in remembering have been at the heart of mainstream philosophy of memory. These questions are sometimes run together, but they raise distinct issues. The first, concerning retrieved representations, is the question of the nature of the objects of memory. The second, concerning stored representations, is the question of the existence and role of memory traces.

5.1 The objects of memory

The direct objects of memory are those to which the subject is related, in the first instance, when he remembers.[3] Historically, there have been two main competing views on the nature of the objects of memory: direct realism and indirect (or representative) realism.

5.1.1 Direct realism

Direct realism (defended by Reid ([1764] 1997) and, more recently, by Laird (1920)) claims that, when one remembers, one is in the first instance related to past events themselves; it is thus perhaps the most intuitively appealing view of the nature of the objects of memory. The primary motivations for direct realism about the objects of memory parallel the motivations for direct realism about the objects of perception. One motivation is the thought that positing representations that stand as intermediaries between the remembering subject and the remembered object may have sceptical implications for our ability to know the past. Another motivation is the thought that remembering is phenomenologically direct, that is, that, in remembering, we attend to past events, not to internal representations of past events. The work on metamemory discussed in section 4 suggests that remembering may in fact often be phenomenologically indirect rather than phenomenologically direct. But there are more serious problems for direct realism, and it is these that provide the primary motivation for indirect realism.

5.1.2 Indirect realism

Indirect realism (defended by J. Locke ([1689] 1998), Hume ([1739] 2011), and, more recently, B. Russell (1921)) claims that, when one remembers, one is in the first instance related to internal representations of past events. Here, again, the dialectic parallels that of the debate between direct and indirect realists about the objects of perception. In the domain of perception, the argument from hallucination takes the possibility of the occurrence of hallucinations indistinguishable from successful perceptions to suggest that hallucination and successful perception have something in common, namely, an internal representation of a scene, and that it is to this that the subject is related in the first instance in both cases. In the domain of memory, the argument from memory hallucination—or, as it would more aptly be called, the argument from confabulation—appeals to the possibility of the occurrence of confabulations indistinguishable from successful memories to suggest that confabulation and successful memory have in common an internal representation of a past event and that it is to this that the subject is related in the first instance in both cases. Denying that representations are the direct objects of the relevant mental states, moreover, leads to disjunctivism, according to which perception or memory, on the one hand, and hallucination or confabulation, on the other hand, are states of fundamentally different kinds. Some have been prepared to defend disjunctivism about memory (Debus 2008), but the cognitive processes at work in memory and confabulation are highly similar, making disjunctive an unattractive option from any broadly naturalistic standpoint.

5.1.3 Compromise and hybrid views

Direct realism nevertheless retains its intuitive appeal, and some have therefore advocated a compromise between it and indirect realism. Bernecker (2008), for example, argues for the compatibility of the causal theory of memory—most versions of which treat memory as involving representations—and direct realism about the objects of memory on the ground that remembering a past event may require having a suitable representation of the event without requiring that one be aware of the representation. A compromise view of this sort may provide a response to the argument from confabulation, since it acknowledges a role for representations in both successful memory and confabulation. But it does not by itself provide a response to a distinct problem, the cotemporality problem. The cotemporality problem arises because, while direct realism claims that the direct object of a present memory is a past event, there is no obvious sense in which a subject now might be directly related to a past event. Bernecker (2008) argues that the cotemporality problem can be avoided if we assume that past events continue to exist even after they have occurred. This may, however, be a high metaphysical price to pay simply in order to respect direct realist intuitions.

Even if concerns about the metaphysical price of Bernecker’s view are set aside, there remain concerns about whether the view achieves a genuine compromise between direct and indirect realism. Since the view acknowledges that representations play an indispensable role in remembering, it remains, at bottom, representationalist in character. The recent philosophy of perception literature, however, suggests the possibility of a view of the objects of memory which incorporates elements of both representationalism and relationalism. In that literature, the focus is on the character of perceptual experience, with relationalists arguing that what determines a subject’s perceptual experience is an external scene, while representationalists argue that what determines it is an internal representation. This focus on perceptual experience opens up the possibility of hybrid views, according to which perceptual experience is partly determined by external scenes and partly determined by internal representations (e.g., Schellenberg 2014). At present, the prospects for hybrid views of memory remain unexplored.

5.2 Memory traces

In addition to retrieved representations, most theories see remembering as involving stored traces. Both the existence and the precise role of traces have, however, been matters of controversy.

5.2.1 The existence of traces

Opposition to including references to traces in a philosophical theory of remembering often stems from particular conceptions of the nature of philosophical, as opposed to scientific, theories. Thus some have argued that philosophical theories of remembering should not posit traces on the ground that philosophical theories are or should be concerned with the nature of remembering as such, or perhaps with the concept of memory, whereas traces pertain to the mechanisms that, as a matter of contingent fact, underwrite the process of remembering (D. Locke 1971). One response to this argument maintains that the nature of remembering cannot be understood without understanding the mechanisms that underwrite the process of remembering (Sutton 1998). Another response maintains, more strongly, that traces may be part of the very concept of remembering (De Brigard 2014b; C.B. Martin & Deutscher 1966).

Others have argued that philosophical theories of remembering should not posit memory traces on the ground that philosophical theories ought not to dictate to scientific theories and that traces belong to the province of the latter (Zemach 1983). One response to this argument advocates a retreat to a purely logical conception of memory traces, devoid of any empirical detail (Heil 1978; D.A. Rosen 1975). Another response advocates the development of a conception of traces based on current scientific theories of remembering (Sutton 1998). This response, in turn, motivates the distributed conception of traces introduced in section 4. As we have seen, the distributed conception is not without its disadvantages; in particular, it may have troubling implications for the causal theory. But it has advantages as well; in particular, it may ground a response to Wittgensteinian (1980; see also Malcolm [1963] 1975) antirepresentationalist arguments, which often presuppose a local conception of traces (Sutton 2015).

5.2.2 The role of traces

Assuming that the existence of traces is granted, a full account of remembering will have to describe the relationship between traces, the representations produced by retrieval, and the representations involved in perceptual experience.

De Brigard (2014b) reviews several positions that have historically been defended regarding the relationship between traces and perceptual representations. Semidirect representationalism holds that perception is indirect and that traces are the same as the representations involved in perception. Indirect representationalism holds that perception is indirect and that traces are distinct from the representations involved in perception. As De Brigard emphasizes, what ultimately matters here is relationships among contents rather than vehicles. He thus distinguishes between content invariantism, which holds that the content of the trace is the same as that of the perceptual representation, and content variantism, which holds that the content of the trace may differ from that of the perceptual representation. In practice, since the invariantist/variantist distinction cuts across the semidirect/indirect distinction, which concerns relationships among vehicles rather than contents, semidirect and indirect representationalism can often be grouped together. Direct representationalism holds that perception is direct and that traces are created after perception occurs. Extending De Brigard’s nomenclature, direct relationalism would hold that perception is direct and that remembering does not involve traces.

De Brigard’s approach does not explicitly take the relationship between traces and retrieved representations into account, and taking this relationship into account expands the range of possible positions. As before, perception might be held either to be direct or to be indirect. If perception is direct, storage might be held either not to involve traces or to involve traces. If storage does not involve traces, retrieval might be held to be either direct or indirect. The former possibility corresponds to a straightforward version of direct relationalism. The latter possibility, on which neither perception nor storage involves representations but on which retrieval does involve representations, would be difficult to motivate, as it is difficult to see from where the content of retrieved representations might come if it is not supplied by memory traces. If storage does involve traces, retrieval might, again, be held to be either direct or indirect. The former possibility, on which neither perception nor retrieval involves representations but on which storage does involve representations, would be difficult to motivate, as it is difficult to see what role traces might play given that they do not contribute to retrieval. The latter possibility is the natural way of understanding direct representationalism.

If perception is indirect, storage might be held either not to involve traces or to involve traces. If storage does not involve traces, retrieval might be held to be either direct or indirect. The former possibility, on which perception involves representations but neither storage nor retrieval involves representations, would be difficult to motivate, as the considerations that motivate relationalism about memory likewise motivate relationalism about perception. The latter possibility, on which perception and retrieval involve representations but storage does not, corresponds roughly to a view advocated by Vosgerau (2010); on this view, storage may in a sense involve traces, but stored traces, due to their inactive character, cannot be said to have content. If storage does involve traces, retrieval might be held to be either direct or indirect. The former possibility, on which perception and storage involve representations but retrieval does not, would be difficult to motivate, as, again, the considerations that motivate relationalism about memory likewise motivate relationalism about perception. The latter possibility is the natural way of understanding both semidirect representationalism and indirect representationalism.

Taking the relationship between traces and retrieved representations into account also complicates the distinction between content invariantism and content variantism. De Brigard applies the distinction to the relationship between the contents of perceptual representations and the contents of traces. It may also be applied to the relationship between the contents of traces and the contents of retrieved representations. But what ultimately matters here is the relationship between the contents of perceptual representations and the contents of retrieved representations. One is a content invariantist with respect to this relationship if one holds that the content of the retrieved representation is the same as the content of the perceptual representation, and one is a content variantist if one holds that the content of the retrieved representation may differ from the content of the perceptual representation. Any view on which both perception and retrieval involve representations—including semidirect representationalism, indirect representationalism, and something like Vosgerau’s view—may be combined with either content invariantism or content variantism.

Philosophers have often treated remembering as a basically preservative process, but this should not be taken to suggest that content invariantism is the standard view in philosophy. While there have been attempts to identify purely preservative forms of memory (Dokic 2001), most philosophical theories of remembering allow for two kinds of variance between the content of retrieved representations and the content of perceptual representations. First, all theories allow for the subtraction of content through forgetting. Second, many theories allow for the addition of self-reflexive, second-order content of the sort described in section 3. Thus content variantism is in fact the standard view. Note, however, that the standard form of content variantism permits the addition of second-order content concerning the subject’s relationship to the remembered event but forbids the addition of first-order content concerning the event itself. Most theories of remembering thus remain preservationist in spirit. Another possible form of content variantism permits the addition of both second-order content and first-order content. Generationist theories of remembering entail this more radical form of content variantism.

6. Accuracy

Generationist forms of content variantism raise the question of accuracy in memory in an especially vivid way: if the content of the retrieved representation can differ from that of the trace, which can in turn differ from that of the perceptual representation—or if, as the simulation theory claims, there need be no trace linking the retrieved representation and the perceptual representation—there would seem to be no guarantee that memory provides us with accurate representations of past events. Generationist forms of content variantism do not, however, guarantee inaccuracy, and preservationist forms of content variantism do not guarantee accuracy, for the accuracy of memory has two distinct dimensions.

6.1 Truth and authenticity

Adopting Bernecker’s (2010) terminology, authenticity refers to the correspondence between the memory representation and the subject’s experience of the past event, while truth refers to the correspondence between the memory representation and the past event itself. Crucially, neither sort of accuracy entails the other. A retrieved representation may be authentic, but, if the subject misperceived the relevant event, it may nevertheless not be true. A retrieved representation may be true, but, if the subject misperceived the relevant event, or if he accurately perceived an aspect of it other than what is given to him by the retrieved representation, it may nevertheless not be authentic.

Thus, while preservative forms of content variantism imply that genuine memories are always authentic, such memories are not always true. Authenticity implies truth only where the subject’s original experience itself was accurate with respect to the experienced event. Cases of misperception, again, illustrate the possibility of authenticity without truth. Preservationists who wish to hold that genuine memories are always true must therefore impose this as an additional requirement, above and beyond what is required by the core of their theory. By the same token, while generative forms of content variantism allow that genuine memories are sometimes inauthentic, such memories are not always false. Inauthenticity implies falsity only where the subject’s original experience was both accurate and complete. Cases of boundary extension (discussed above) or field-observer perspective switching (Debus 2007b; McCarroll 2017; Sutton 2010b) illustrate the possibility of inauthenticity without falsity. In cases of perspective switching, the subject perceives an event from one perspective (field perspective) but remembers it from another, perhaps even seeing himself in the scene (observer perspective); while many or most observer memories are inauthentic (since they fail to correspond to the subject’s original experience), they are not necessarily false (since they may correspond to what an observer would have seen). For these reasons, generationists do not hold that genuine memories are always authentic. But those who wish to hold that genuine memories are always true can impose this as an additional requirement

6.2 Factivity

To impose this additional requirement is to claim that memory is factive, in the sense that genuine memories are necessarily true, that is, that apparent memories that are not true are merely apparent. In philosophy, the view that memory is factive has been common. The standard arguments for the factivity of memory are linguistic, appealing to the apparent incoherence of asserting both that one remembers an event and that the event did not occur (Bernecker 2017; cf. Moore’s paradox). Assessing these arguments is beyond the scope of this entry, but note that they are controversial even among those who give linguistic arguments a great deal of weight (De Brigard 2017; Hazlett 2010). Among naturalists, who often give linguistic arguments less weight, they are more controversial still. From a naturalistic point of view, the goal of a theory of remembering ought to be to describe the process of remembering itself, regardless of whether we are intuitively inclined to classify its results as genuine or merely apparent memories. If the same process may be responsible both for producing true memories and for producing false memories, then an adequate theory of remembering will not require that genuine memories are always true—in the terms introduced in section 2, the relevant natural kind may include both true and false memories, regardless of whether our ordinary linguistic practice permits us to group them together.

In psychology, the view that memory is factive has been much less common. This is not very surprising, given that much psychological research on remembering focuses on unsuccessful remembering: understanding how unsuccessful remembering occurs provides important insights into the mechanisms responsible for successful remembering, just as understanding how perceptual illusions and hallucinations occur provides important insights into the mechanisms response for successful perception. What is more surprising is that psychologists have sometimes gone too far in the opposite direction, assuming that, because remembering is constructive, it is bound to be false (Ost & Costall 2002). This is in effect to treat memory as counterfactive. The distinction between authenticity and truth enables us to see that constructive, generative remembering need not be characterized by falsity. The generative character of remembering does, however, point to the need for a more sophisticated criterion of truth (S. Campbell 2014). While the fact that remembering is generative does not imply that memories are bound to be outright false, it does suggest that they are frequently false in some respects. This, in turn, suggests that remembering need not be fully accurate in order to be fully adequate, thus pointing towards a need for a criterion that acknowledges that truth in memory comes in degrees.

7. The Self

The question of truth in memory derives much of its importance from the role played by memory in relation to the self. It is something of a cliché to observe that memory makes us who we are, but memory is indeed intimately linked to the self.

7.1 Personal identity

Locke ([1689] 1998)—who was perhaps anticipated in this by Spinoza (Lin 2005)—discussed the idea that what makes a person at a given time count as the same person as a person at an earlier time is that he remembers the earlier person’s experiences. This memory theory of personal identity has been much discussed since Locke (Mathews, Bok, & Rabins 2009), and there are well-known substantive and methodological problems for it. The primary substantive problem is that the memory criterion for personal identity appears to be uninformative, because one can by definition remember only one’s own experiences, not those of anyone else—if memory thus presupposes personal identity, it is unenlightening to say that personal identity presupposes memory. There have been attempts to meet this objection by introducing the notion of quasi-memory, which is meant to be like the notion of memory without the implication of personal identity (Buford 2009; Parfit 1984; Roache 2006; Shoemaker 1970). While the notion of quasi-memory may enable us to disentangle memory from personal identity, it remains to be seen whether it is empirically defensible (Northoff 2000).

The primary methodological problem is that arguments for and against the memory criterion tend to rely on thought experiments involving memory swapping and other such cases. Moving away from these far-out cases, some philosophers have preferred to consider the implications of real memory disorders. Craver (2012; cf. Craver, Kwan, Steindam, & Rosenbaum 2014), for example, has argued on the basis of cases of episodic amnesia such as that of the well known patient KC (Rosenbaum et al. 2005) that memory is not a presupposition of selfhood. Others have preferred to build on cognitive psychological theories of autobiographical memory. Schechtman (1994, 2011), for example, has argued that memory does not and need not provide simple connections between discrete past and present moments of consciousness, maintaining that what matters, as far as the sense of personal identity is concerned, is the way in which autobiographical memory summarizes, constructs, interprets, and condenses distinct moments from the personal past to produce a coherent overall narrative (cf. Goldie 2012). Approaches such as Schechtman’s appear to involve a change of subject, from personal identity as such to the subject’s sense of personal identity. This shift is explicit in Klein and Nichols’ (2012) examination of the role of autonoesis in underwriting the sense of personal identity—the sense that one now is the same person as someone at an earlier time. Roache (2016) has questioned Klein and Nichols’ interpretation of the clinical case on which their argument depends, and the debate over the relationship between autonoesis and the sense of personal identity is ongoing (Fernández forthcoming; Klein 2016b).

7.2 Autobiographical memory

Such approaches also appear to involve a second change of subject, from episodic memory to autobiographical memory. The extent to which this actually constitutes a change of subject is debatable, for the relationship between episodic and autobiographical memory is itself a matter of debate. Some philosophers have held that all episodic memories are autobiographical (Hoerl 1999). In developmental psychology, however, episodic memory, understood as a capacity to remember particular events, is often treated as emerging before autobiographical memory, which requires a capacity to organize individual events into coherent narratives. Thus, autobiographical memory is usually understood as including more than episodic memory. Conway and Pleydell-Pearce’s (2000; cf. Conway 2005) influential view, for example, sees autobiographical memory as emerging from what they refer to as the self-memory system, including an autobiographical knowledge base containing information about specific events, general events, and broader life periods. Accounts of personal semantic memory go further, describing a form of memory for one’s past that is distinct from both episodic and semantic memory (Renoult, Davidson, Palombo, Moscovitch, & Levine 2012). Views emphasizing narrativity are also influential (Hutto 2017); rather than seeing autobiographical memory in terms of stored information, Brockmeier (2015), for example, sees autobiographical remembering as a process in which autobiographical memories themselves emerge through the subject’s active construction of a life narrative. Interestingly, Cosentino (2011) has argued that the linguistic capacity at work in the construction of life narratives itself depends on the capacity for mental time travel, including episodic memory.

7.2.1 Rilkean memory

There is thus a need for work devoted to clarifying the concept of autobiographical memory. In addition to clarifying the relationship between autobiographical memory and episodic memory, such work might also take more exotic forms of autobiographical memory into account. Rowlands (2015, 2016), for example, has recently introduced the concept of Rilkean memory. Rilkean memory, as Rowlands defines it, is a type of autobiographical memory that is neither episodic nor semantic. Episodic and semantic memories have content, but Rowlands maintains that these are sometimes transformed into something else which, while lacking content, is nevertheless recognizable as a form of autobiographical memory. These Rilkean memories can be either embodied or affective. Embodied Rilkean memories manifest themselves in the form of bodily and behavioural dispositions, such as when a runner adopts a certain posture due to past injuries. Affective Rilkean memories manifest themselves when one has certain feelings or moods in response to certain stimuli due to certain past experiences, without being able to bring any information about those experiences to mind.

7.2.2 Memory and emotion

Though Rilkean memory clearly bears some relationship to recognized forms of memory, it is, as Rowlands himself acknowledges, not entirely clear whether it ultimately merits the name “memory”. The concept of Rilkean memory does, however, foreground the role of affect, including emotion, in autobiographical remembering. The relationship between memory and emotion is complex and multifaceted (see de Sousa 2017), but two issues in particular stand out. First, we routinely experience emotions when we remember. These emotions may be understood as themselves being memories, namely, memories of past emotions, or they may be understood as being present emotions directed at past events. Debus (2007a) argues for the latter possibility, but, even if she is right, we do presumably sometimes have memories of past emotions. This, in turn, raises the question of whether remembered emotions are themselves emotions, as well as the question of how we are to understand present emotions directed at remembered past emotions.

Second, certain emotions, such as nostalgia, are necessarily past-directed. Such intrinsically past-directed emotions raise interesting questions. Howard (2012), for example, argues that nostalgia can arise in connection with memories that are known to the rememberer to be nonveridical. This implies that a version of the paradox of fiction—the challenge of explaining how an audience can feel something in relation to an event they know to be fictional—arises for memory. It also raises the question of whether nostalgia felt in connection with memories that are known to the rememberer to be nonveridical is necessarily inappropriate or whether it can under some circumstances be appropriate.

8. Beyond Individual Memory

While most research on the metaphysics of memory has assumed that remembering is something done by individuals on their own, this assumption has recently been challenged, as researchers have drawn on accounts of cognition as distributed or extended to interrogate the role of external memory and on ideas from the burgeoning interdisciplinary field of memory studies to investigate the possibility of more or less robustly collective forms of memory.

8.1 External memory

A distinction is sometimes drawn between distributed and extended accounts of cognition, with the former referring to a line of research in cognitive science that focuses on cognition in complex sociotechnical systems consisting of multiple human and technological components (Hutchins 1995) and the latter to a current in philosophy of mind that focuses on cognition in systems centred on human subjects augmented by technological or sometimes social resources (Clark & Chalmers 1998). Accounts of both sorts are committed to the rejection of traditional “intracranialist” views of cognition and their replacement with the “extracranialist” view that cognition sometimes exceeds the bounds of the individual brain, and the difference between them may thus be merely one of emphasis, as distributed cognition theorists emphasize remembering in sociotechnical systems, while extended cognition theorists emphasize remembering in technologically-augmented individuals. Thus Hutchins (1995) considers how a cockpit—or rather the system consisting of the pilots of an airliner plus various instruments—remembers its speeds, while Clark and Chalmers focus on the case of Otto, a (hypothetical) Alzheimer’s patient who relies on a notebook to supplement his unreliable memory. While both accounts are in agreement on the point that external resources may count as memory stores only in the context of larger systems, both confront us with the role of various forms of external memory in human remembering.

8.1.1 The concept of external memory

One question about external memory concerns the concept of external memory itself. Clark and Chalmers’ argument appeals to apparent functional analogies between Otto’s notebook and internal memory in non-memory-impaired individuals, suggesting that, in virtue of these analogies, appropriate external resources may, when certain conditions are met, qualify as literal external memory stores. Opposition to their argument has thus been driven by a variety of apparent functional disanalogies between internal and external memory (Adams & Aizawa 2008; Rupert 2009). External memory, which tends to be designed to provide highly stable storage, does not, for example, duplicate the constructive character of internal memory. One response to these disanalogies is to retreat to a more moderate alternative to extended cognition, such as embedded (Rupert 2009), scaffolded (Arango-Muñoz 2013; Sterelny 2010), or situated (Sutton 2009) cognition, on which external resources may play a vital role in remembering without themselves literally taking part in the memory process. Another response is to move away from parity-based arguments for extended cognition of the sort offered by Clark and Chalmers to the complementarity-based arguments advanced by Clark in subsequent work (e.g., Clark 2003). While the former appeal to functional analogies between internal and external memory, the latter appeal to functional disanalogies, suggesting that external memory comes to play a role in remembering precisely because it does not mimic internal memory (Sutton 2010a). Given the constructive character of internal memory, for example, stable forms of external memory may make a distinct and valuable contribution to remembering.

8.1.2 Cognitive consequences of new forms of external memory

Another question concerns the cognitive consequences of our growing reliance on novel forms of external memory. Regardless of whether external memory literally takes part in the memory process, our reliance on such forms of external memory, particularly when they are internet-connected, may have important cognitive consequences (Smart 2012). Some have worried that these are purely negative, with external memory diminishing internal memory in one way or another (e.g., Carr 2010), but whether this in fact occurs is an empirical question. There is some research suggesting that, when we know that information will be available online, we tend to remember how to find that information, rather than remembering the information itself (Sparrow, Liu, & Wegner 2011). The consequences of our use of web-connected forms of external memory have, however, only begun to be studied, and it may be instructive here to recall that Plato already voiced the worry that an older external memory technology, namely, writing itself, would have a negative impact on our ability to remember, a worry that most today would dismiss without a second thought.

8.2 Collective memory

In addition to the growing literature on the ways in which technological resources contribute to remembering, there is a large and dynamic literature on the ways in which groups remember together. Or rather there are two distinct literatures here, one concerning small-scale groups, the other concerning large-scale groups. The former has been investigated primarily in psychology, exemplified by studies of remembering in married couples (Harris, Barnier, Sutton, & Keil 2014) or in mother-child dyads (Reese, Haden, & Fivush 1993). The latter has been investigated primarily in the social sciences and history, where, in what has been termed a “memory boom” (Blight 2009), an enormous amount of work on how nations and similar entities remember their pasts has appeared in recent years. One question of philosophical interest in this general area is the relationship between memory in small-scale groups and memory in large-scale groups. There is increasing interaction between the two literatures (Bietti & Sutton 2015; Fagin, Yamashiro, & Hirst 2013; Roediger & Abel 2015), and it may turn out that similar processes of remembering unfold in both small-scale and large-scale groups. But small-scale and large-scale collective memory, as we will see, do appear to raise somewhat different issues, and it may turn out not to be a contingent matter that they have for the most part been studied in different disciplines.

8.2.1 Memory in small-scale groups

The central question concerning memory in small-scale groups is perhaps whether such groups manifest emergent, robustly collective forms of memory. A range of views on this question are available (Barnier, Sutton, Harris, & Wilson 2008; Wilson 2005), but the conservative view is certainly that, while remembering may be affected by the social context in which it occurs, it is itself always a strictly individual-level process. The conservative view is the natural starting point, but there is a surprisingly good case to be made for the radical view that remembering is sometimes a group-level process. A promising place to look for robustly collective forms of memory is in transactive memory systems (Wegner 1987): stable, ongoing groups characterized by a division of responsibility for remembering and a shared metacognitive awareness of that division (Kirchhoff 2016; Theiner, Allen, & Goldstone 2010; Tollefsen, Dale, & Paxton 2013). Drawing on Wimsatt’s (1986) notion of emergence, for example, Theiner (2013) has provided a rigorous argument for the view that transactive memory systems manifest a form of emergent memory, in the sense that the group has a memory capacity of its own, over and above those of its individual members. Drawing on a somewhat different theoretical framework, Huebner (2013, 2016) has developed a complementary approach. Thus, while the question remains open, the conservative view may no longer be the obvious starting point.

8.2.2 Memory in large-scale groups

The central question concerning memory in large-scale groups is whether such groups are capable of remembering in anything like the sense in which individuals are capable of remembering. Applying concepts developed in the domain of individual memory to the domain of small-scale collective memory may already be problematic; applying them to the domain of large-scale collective memory may be more problematic still. Anastasio et al. (2012), for example, have argued that the concept of consolidation (referring to the process through which unstable, short-term memory representations are transformed into stable, long-term memory representations) applies both at the level of individuals and at the level of societies, but this argument may overlook the disanalogies between internal and external memory noted above. Similarly, Tanesini (forthcoming) has argued that the concept of amnesia (referring to the inability of an agent to retrieve memories that would normally be retrievable) applies both at the level of individuals and at the level of societies, but there is little evidence that patterns of remembering and forgetting at the social level correspond particularly closely to patterns at the individual level. Along the same general lines, Szpunar and Szpunar (2016; cf. Merck, Topcu, & Hirst (2016)) have argued that the concept of episodic future thought (introduced above) applies both at the level of individuals and at the level of societies, but it is unclear whether societies are able to imagine their futures in ways analogous to those in which individuals imagine their futures.

General concepts and theories developed in other areas of social ontology have the potential to shed further light on collective memory. For example, the literature on collective intentionality (Tollefsen 2006), may clarify the activity of joint reminiscing, which might be understood as a form of joint attention to the past (Hoerl & McCormack 2005; Seemann forthcoming). By providing a novel test case, collective memory also has the potential to shed light on general concepts and theories in social ontology. For example, Smith (2014) has pointed out that, whereas many social objects (institutions, contracts, and the like) are continuants, in the sense that they endure over time, the speech acts which, on many accounts, ground their existence, are events and hence exist only at a given moment in time. It is unclear how events might ground the existence of continuants, and one potential solution to this problem is to ground the existence of social objects not in speech acts but rather in forms of external memory, which are themselves continuants (Ferraris [2010] 2013, 2015).

9. The Epistemology of Memory

In addition to their implications for the metaphysics of memory, external and collective memory may have novel implications for epistemology (Carter & Kallestrup 2016; Clark 2015; Michaelian & Arango-Muñoz forthcoming). Most research on the epistemology of memory, however, reflects the traditional concerns of individual epistemology, including the viability with respect to memory knowledge of broad families of epistemological theories, such as internalism and externalism (Madison 2017), and of particular theories within those families, such as foundationalism (Senor 1993), coherentism (Olsson & Shogenji 2004), and reliabilism and virtue epistemology (Shanton 2011), as well as the relevance to memory of issues such as scepticism (Baldwin 2001; Moon 2017) and epistemic circularity (Alston 1986). Other research on the epistemology of memory tackles concerns specific to memory. As Frise (2015, Other Internet Resources) points out, there are unresolved debates over the problem of forgotten evidence (Harman 1986), the problem of forgotten defeat (A.I. Goldman 1999), and the problem of stored beliefs (Moon 2012). There are also ongoing debates over the alleged analogy between testimony and memory (Barnett 2015; Dummett 1994) and the question whether memory is a generative or a merely preservative source of knowledge (Frise forthcoming; Lackey 2005; Matthen 2010; Salvaggio forthcoming). Issues in the epistemology of memory, of course, interact with issues in the metaphysics of memory, but, as there is a separate entry on the epistemology of memory, these interactions will not be explored here in any detail.

10. The Ethics of Memory

The ethics of memory is a relatively new area, but research in this area already concerns a number of distinct questions.

10.1 Memory and moral responsibility

The research on remembering as mental time travel introduced above emphasizes the relationship between episodic memory and its future-oriented counterpart, episodic future thought, and there are potential links between mental time travel and moral responsibility. Levy (2014; cf. Vierra 2016), for example, has argued that deficits in episodic memory and episodic future thought in psychopathy (Kennett & Matthews 2009; McIlwain 2010) imply that psychopaths cannot genuinely intend to harm others and that they therefore may not have full moral responsibility for their actions. Craver et al. (2016), however, argue that subjects with deficits in episodic memory and episodic future thought make moral judgements similar to those made by normal subjects, suggesting that more work needs to be done to establish a definitive link between mental time travel and moral responsibility.

10.2 The duty to remember

Some researchers have argued that we may have a moral duty to remember. Margalit (2002), for example, argues that we have a duty to remember the victims of radical evil. Such an obligation—which, as Blustein (2008) points out, might hold either at the individual or the collective level—would be consistent with the spirit behind truth and reconciliation commissions and similar institutions (Neumann & Thompson 2015). But the existence of a duty to remember is controversial, with some maintaining that there is no general duty to remember the past and even that there may in some cases be a duty to forget (Rieff 2016).

10.3 The right to be forgotten

Our increasing reliance on novel forms of external memory, may have surprising ethical ramifications. The default for human memory is to forget, and most of the information that we encounter never makes its way into long-term memory. The default for computer memory, in contrast, is to remember, and researchers are beginning to explore the ethical implications of moving from a state of affairs in which forgetting is the norm, in the sense that one’s words and deeds would in general leave few permanent traces, to one in which remembering is the norm, in the sense that many of our words and deeds leave behind more or less permanent digital traces (Mayer-Schönberger 2009). When remembering is the norm, people may, in particular, be deprived of any opportunity for a fresh start after engaging in inappropriate behaviours, leading some to argue for a right to be forgotten (Ghezzi, Pereira, & Vesnic-Alujevic 2014; J. Rosen 2012). From a legal and technological point of view, such a right is likely to be difficult to implement. From a moral point of view, a right to be forgotten may imply a duty to forget, and it is unclear whether we can plausibly be held to have such a duty (Matheson 2013).

10.4 The ethics of external memory

Novel external memory technologies may ultimately reshape the norms governing individual remembering (Burkell 2016; O’Hara 2013), but even in the short term there are pressing ethical questions related to the impact of external memory technologies on cognition and the self. Regarding cognition, some have, as noted in section 8, voiced unease about the cognitive impact of increasingly prevalent use of such technologies (Carr 2010). Others, however, are more optimistic (Bell & Gemmell 2009), and assessing the empirical evidence for optimistic and pessimistic claims about the cognitive impact of external memory technologies is no easy matter (Heersmink 2016; Loh & Kanai 2016). Regarding the self, Heersmink (2015, forthcoming) has argued that an extended mind perspective implies that there are strict ethical constraints against interfering with individuals’ external memories (cf. N. Levy 2007). Clowes (2013, 2015), however, has raised the possibility that the fact that internet-connected forms of external memory are often strongly influenced by agents other than the individuals to whom they belong means that they do not count as parts of the relevant individuals’ minds.

10.5 The ethics of memory modification and enhancement

With the emergence of new techniques for altering the functioning of memory systems—for example, retrieval of a stored memory results in a period of reconsolidation during which the retrieved memory is labile and susceptible to modification, potentially allowing interventions to alter traumatic memories (Spiers & Bendor 2014)—ethical questions concerning various forms of memory modification have become more pressing (Erler 2011; Hui & Fisher 2015; N. Levy 2012; Liao & Wasserman 2007). Liao and Sandberg (2008) identify a number of questions raised by memory modification technologies; in light of the close relationship between memory and the self noted above, it is no surprise that many of these concern the effects of memory modification on the self. Modifying someone’s memories may, for example, limit his self-knowledge by depriving him of opportunities to learn about his own actions or erode his sense of agency by depriving him of the possibility of viewing himself as an agent with respect to events in which he was involved. Nevertheless, Liao and Sandberg argue that, in certain cases, the benefits of memory modification may outweigh its costs, so that there need be no general ethical barrier to the use of emerging memory modification technologies. Much of the debate so far has focussed on the suppression of traumatic or otherwise undesirable memories, but parallel questions are raised by the use of novel methods for the enhancement of memory abilities by pharmaceutical and other means (Bostrom & Sandberg 2009). Critics of the memory enhancement debate, however, have argued that the evidence for the efficacy of the relevant methods is mixed (Zohny 2015) or that the debate often overlooks important differences among kinds of memory (Fox, Fitz, & Reiner forthcoming).


Further reading in philosophy: Bernecker & Michaelian (2017) is the most comprehensive, up-to-date survey of the philosophy of memory available, covering all major contemporary issues in the area, as well as the history of philosophy of memory and memory in nonwestern philosophical traditions. Nikulin (2015) provides advanced surveys of the historical background, and see Herrmann & Chaffin (1988) for key historical texts. Grau (2009) and Kania (2009) introduce issues in the philosophy of memory through discussion of popular films.

Further reading in other disciplines: In psychology, Draaisma (2000) and Danziger (2008) provide broad historical overviews of our thinking about memory; they are complemented by Winter (2012), which focuses on more recent history. Roediger, Dudai, & Fitzpatrick (2007) is a comprehensive but accessible guide to issues in the contemporary psychology of memory; Tulving & Craik (2000) and Dudai (2002) are older but still useful guides. For popular introductions to the psychology of memory, see Schacter (1996), Schacter (2001), and Seamon (2015). In the broader field of memory studies, Tota & Hagen (2016) and Kattago (2015) provide comprehensive introductions, and Rossington & Whitehead (2007) and Olick, Vinitzky-Seroussi, & Levy (2011) collect key texts on collective memory. See also Radstone & Schwarz (2010), Boyer & Wertsch (2009), Nalbantian, Matthews, & McClelland (2011), and Groes (2016) for wide-ranging interdisciplinary discussions.

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