Epistemology of Geometry

First published Mon Oct 14, 2013; substantive revision Wed Jul 7, 2021

Geometrical knowledge typically concerns two kinds of things: theoretical or abstract knowledge contained in the definitions, axioms, theorems, and proofs in a system of geometry; and some knowledge of the external world, such as is expressed in terms of a system of physical geometry. The nature of the relation between the abstract geometry and its practical expression has also to be considered.

This essay considers various theories of geometry, their grounds for intelligibility, for validity, and for physical interpretability in the period largely before the advent of the theories of special and general relativity in the 20th century. It turns out that a complicated interplay between two basic properties of lines, being shortest and being straightest, is at work in many stages.

Before the 19th century only one geometry was studied in any depth or thought to be an accurate or correct description of physical space, and that was Euclidean geometry. The 19th century itself saw a profusion of new geometries, of which the most important were projective geometry and non-Euclidean or hyperbolic geometry. Projective geometry can be thought of as a deepening of the non-metrical and formal sides of Euclidean geometry; non-Euclidean geometry as a challenge to its metrical aspects and implications.

By the opening years of the 20th century a variety of Riemannian differential geometries had been proposed, which made rigorous sense of non-Euclidean geometry. There were also significant advances in the domain of abstract geometries, such as those proposed by David Hilbert. It follows that the terms ‘geometry’ and ‘physical space’ do not have simple meanings in the 19th century, and changing conceptions of these terms do not follow a simple pattern of refinement. Their inter-relations therefore also have a complicated history.

Geometry has been a school of systematic logical thinking, with Euclid’s work taken to be the paradigm of a well-founded science for millennia, but with a sudden change of views around 1900. It has also been a place of privilege for the elaboration of mathematical methods, from synthetic to analytic treatments, algebraic developments, the rise of structuralism, and more. Contemplating the development of geometry through the ages, one can see how it started as the study of figures (and their measurement) to become the study of space, and ended up being the study of spatial structures – from the most basic topology, to n-manifolds, to the geometries picked up by physicists.

At the same time, geometry has posed fundamental epistemological problems, and has been a decisive locus of philosophical debate. One may quickly mention: 1, the problem of certainty and apriority of geometric knowledge, linked to the question – one geometry, or many? 2, the problem of the role of intuition (was Kant right? is the axiom of parallels intuitively grounded?) 3, the problem of idealization, concerning the relation between perfect geometric figures and their real instantiations; 4, the shifting conceptions of the interrelation between mathematics and natural science.

1. Epistemological issues in Euclid’s geometry

A detailed examination of geometry as Euclid presented it reveals a number of problems. It is worth considering these in some detail because the epistemologically convincing status of Euclid’s Elements was uncontested by almost everyone until the later decades of the 19th century. Chief among these problems are a lack of clarity in the definitions of straight line and plane, and a confusion between shortest and straightest as a, or the, fundamental geometrical property. (See the many comments collected in Heath’s edition of Euclid’s Elements.) The implications for the parallel postulate will be treated separately, see the section on Non-Euclidean geometry.

The first four Books of Euclid’s Elements are about straight lines and circles, but it is well known that the concept of a straight line receives only a most unsatisfactory definition. A line is said to be “a breadthless length”, and a straight line to be a line “which lies evenly with the points on itself”. This may help convince readers that they share a common conception of the straight line, but it is no use if unexpected difficulties arise in the creation of a theory—as we shall see.

To those who decided to read the Elements carefully and see how the crucial terms are used, it became apparent that the account is both remarkably scrupulous in some ways and flawed in others. Straight lines arise almost always as finite segments that can be indefinitely extended, but, as many commentators noted, although Euclid stated that there is a segment joining any two points he did not explicitly say that this segment is unique. This is a flaw in the proof of the first congruence theorem (I.4) which says that if two triangles have two pairs of sides equal and the included angle is equal then the remaining sides of the triangles are equal.

Theorem I.4 is interesting in another way. Theorem I.2 carries a scrupulous, and by no means obvious, proof that a given line segment in a plane may be copied exactly with one of its end points at any prescribed point in the plane. Theorem I.4 properly requires a proof that an angle may likewise be copied exactly at an arbitrary point, but this Euclid cannot provide at this stage (one is given in I.23, which, however, builds on these earlier results). He therefore gave a bald claim that one triangle may be copied exactly in an arbitrary position, which makes one wonder why such care was expended on I.2. In fact, the whole concept of motion of figures was to become a prolonged topic of discussion in Arabic/Islamic times. (On deduction in Euclid, see Mueller 1981.)

A plausible reading of Elements Book I is that a straight line can be understood as having a direction, so that there is a straight line in every direction at every point and only one straight line at a given point in a given direction. The parallel postulate then says that lines which cross a given line in equal angles point in the same direction and do not meet. But this must be regarded as an interpretation, and one that requires quite some work to make precise.

Direction is, nonetheless, a more plausible candidate than distance; Euclid did not start with the idea that the straight line joining two distinct points is the shortest curve joining them. The relevant primitive concept in the Elements is that of equality of segments, such as all the radii of a given circle. Euclid stated as Common Notion 4 that if two segments can be made to coincide then they are equal, and (in the troublesome I.4) he used the converse, that if two segments are equal then they can be made to coincide. Segments are such that either one is smaller than the other or they are equal, and in I.20 Euclid showed that “in any triangle two sides taken together in any manner are greater than the remaining one.” This result has become known as the triangle inequality, and it goes a long way to proving that the line segment joining any two distinct points is the shortest curve through those points. Once the parallel postulate is introduced Euclid showed that opposite sides of a parallelogram are equal, and so the distance between a pair of parallel lines is a constant.

But there is another weakness in the Elements that is also worth noting, although it drew less attention, and this is the nature of the plane. The plane has another sub-standard definition, evidently modelled on that of the line: “a plane surface is a surface which lies evenly with the straight lines on itself” (and, unsurprisingly, “a surface is that which has length and breadth only”). After that, the word ‘plane’ is not mentioned in the first four Books, although they are solely concerned with plane geometry. When Euclid turned to solid geometry in Book IX, he began with three theorems to show successively that a straight line cannot lie partly in a plane and partly not, that if two straight lines cut one another they lie in a plane and every triangle lies in a plane, and that if two planes meet then they do so in a line. However, he can only be said to claim these results and make them plausible, because he cannot use his definition of a plane to prove any of them. They do, however, form the basis for the next theorems: there is a perpendicular to a plane at any point of the plane, and all the lines perpendicular to a given line at a given point are on a plane.

Once again, I.4 is problematic. Consider, for the purpose of a reduction ad absurdum, that one has two triangles, \(ABC\) and \(A'BC\) on the same side of their common base \(BC\), and such that \(BA = BA'\) and \(CA = CA'\). It is intended to show that therefore the vertices \(A\) and \(A'\) coincide, and for this one must, as Gauss observed (in unpublished remarks, see Gauss Werke 8, 193), use the fact that the triangles lie in the same plane. A good definition of a plane is required, one that allows this result to be proved.

1.1 The question of diagrammatic constructions

Euclid’s treatment of geometry has, through the ages, been celebrated as a perfect deductive presentation of a science, and certainly Euclid made great efforts to obtain a most careful logical chain of truths. Book I in particular is impressive (see Lambert 1786, Mueller 1981). Yet his proof-method gives a central role to diagrams, for which reason Euclid’s work came under severe criticism in the late nineteenth century. This is because, from the early eighteenth century, there was a gradual dominance of algebraic methods and a process of de-geometrization of mathematics, which evolved into the so-called “arithmetization” of mathematics. Diagrams were demoted to the role of mere auxiliaries in mathematical reasoning, and a careful logical presentation of axioms and proofs was implemented. One result of this movement would be Hilbert’s work, examined below.

It seems nevertheless true that the origins of geometric thinking have, in different cultures, always been associated with visuo-spatial reasoning, and in particular with figures and diagrams. This is a key reason for the celebrated beauty and appeal of geometry. Kant came close to capturing the spirit of Euclid’s style of work when he insisted that mathematical proof is based on the “construction of concepts” in intuition. The geometer works with carefully defined concepts, for which Euclid always shows how to construct instances (thus, e.g., proposition 1 shows how to construct an equilateral triangle given a line segment, and prop. 31 how to construct a parallel to a given line). But, as Kant emphasized in a famous passage of the Critique, logical analysis of the concepts could never provide the means of proof – an appeal to the construction (say, of a triangle) is required, offering a concrete instance either in empirical intuition (an external representation) or in pure intuition. Next, on the basis of the postulates, new elements are incorporated into the construction, which make it possible to interconnect concepts and obtain new results. So it is that one can prove diagrammatically, e.g., that the angles of a triangle add up to 180º (which, by the way, requires an appeal to the parallel postulate).

The proof of prop. 1 has famously been objected for having a gap. Given a segment \(AB\), an equilateral triangle is constructed by drawing two circles with \(AB\) as radius, one centered on \(A\) and the other centered on \(B\). The objection is that Euclid has no continuity principle, hence the existence of point \(C\) (the intersection of both circles) is not warranted. But such an objection ignores the proper role of diagrammatic reasoning in Euclid. Manders (2008) has provided an insightful analysis of how information is obtained from text and diagram in the first books of the Elements, in careful distribution of roles, which led him to distinguish between exact information (from text only) and co-exact information (taken from the diagram). Notice that a diagram is not just a figure, but a reasoning tool, a semiotic element with rules of manipulation – and, according to Manders, careful (implicit) rules for the extraction of information. For further details on this topic, see the entry on diagrams, sections 4.2 and 4.3.

In this connection it is worth mentioning a famous fallacious proof that all triangles are isosceles, which Klein made well known. One can show that this pseudo-proof violates the rules of the game of Euclid, extracting exact information from the diagram, which is never allowed. On the other hand, one should notice that Euclid’s postulates are not so much axioms in the Hilbertian sense, as rules of construction that are applied in the elaboration and handling of diagrams. Most of Euclid's postulates establish that certain constructions can be performed, the drawing of a line or a circle, the meeting of two lines under certain conditions (this last is Euclid's own formulation of postulate 5 “of the parallels”). As for the central role of such rules of construction in Ancient geometry, it is interesting to remark that the Greeks said ‘diagramma’ to mean a mathematical proposition.

But geometric knowledge, which began close to visual thinking (Giaquinto 2007) and the practical manipulation of symbols, i.e., diagrams as concrete representations, gradually evolved to become a more abstract edifice. Already with Euclid, Archimedes and Apollonius there is an effort to give form to well-crafted concepts, which make precise, ideal, and general what was suggested by intuition; likewise, the way of handling diagrams is anything but naive (see e.g. prop. 10 in Book III, but also props. 7, 14 or 27 in Book I). And in due course, a critical stage was attained, when the assumptions of geometric knowledge were made explicit and subjected to scrutiny, looking for deeper foundations and for alternatives. At this stage, represented above all by the nineteenth century, the diagram had to be relegated in favor of more explicit, abstract, relational methods for the analysis of theoretical assumptions and developments.

1.2 Synthetic method vs. measurement

Let us say that a purely synthetic geometry is one that deals with primitive concepts such as straight lines and planes in something like the above fashion. That is, it takes the straightness of the straight line and the flatness of the plane as fundamental, and appeals to the incidence properties just described. It is resistant to the idea of taking distance as a fundamental concept, or to the idea of replacing statements in geometry by statements about numbers (say, as coordinates), although it is not hostile to coordinate geometry being erected upon it.

Let us also say for present purposes that a metrical geometry is one in which distance is a primitive concept, so line segments can be said to have the same length, congruent figures have corresponding sides equal in length, and geometrical transformations preserve lengths. We can also allow that similarities are allowed: these are transformations that produce scale copies of figures. (No theorem in Euclid’s Elements depends on the actual size of a figure: any theorem that applies to one figure applies to all its scale copies.)

Elementary geometry in the modern West moved in a confused way towards making distance the primary primitive concept, while often maintaining the Euclidean emphasis on straightness, thus frequently muddling the implications of the different concepts. A notable example of this being nonetheless productive was John Wallis’s argument in defence of the parallel postulate (given as a lecture in 1665 and published in Wallis 1693). It rested, as he realised, on the ability to make arbitrary scale copies of a triangle, and this seems to be the first time that the equivalence was recognised between these two systems:

  1. Euclid’s Elements with the parallel postulate
  2. Euclid’s Elements without that postulate but with the assumption that arbitrary similar figures exist added.

In the Encylopédie Méthodique (1784: vol. 2, 132), d’Alembert defined geometry as the science of the properties of extension, i.e., of bodies (and surfaces and lines) considered as merely extended and figured. Its principles are founded, in his view, on truths so evident that it is not possible to contest them. A line (in the sense of a curve) is one-dimensional, and the shortest line joining two points is the straight line. Parallel lines are lines that, however far they are extended, will never meet because they are everywhere equidistant. D'Alembert was not keen on axiomatic presentation of the material, and so it was also with many other eighteenth-century authors.

Adrien-Marie Legendre was a mathematician sympathetic to the didactic aims of the Elements but not to its original formulations. He wrote several different versions of his Éléments de géométrie (1794) with a view to restoring "Euclidean rigour" in the teaching of geometry, which in his view had been corroded by texts, such as one by Clairaut (1741), that relied on notions of self-evidence. They differ largely, as he had to admit, in their unsuccessful attempts to deduce the parallel postulate.

In all these editions Legendre took a firmly metrical point of view, taking as given algebra and the theory of proportions. His opening definition of the first edition proclaimed that “Geometry is a science that has as its object the measure of extent”. Extent, he explained, has three dimensions, length, breadth, and height; a line is a length without breadth, its extremities are called points and a point therefore has no extent. A straight line is the shortest path from one point to another; surfaces have length and breadth but no height or depth; and a plane is a surface in which if two arbitrary points are joined by a straight line this line lies entirely in the surface. Legendre then set out to prove even some truths that Euclid had preferred to assume, such as (Legendre’s first result): any two right angles are equal. The notion of congruence was central to his approach, and familiar congruence theorems follow in each edition until the parallel postulate could no longer be ignored. Once the existence of parallel lines was assured Legendre argued that they were equidistant.

In fact, Legendre’s attempts to restore rigour to the treatment of elementary geometry was no better than Euclid’s, and in some ways worse, not only because his attempts to prove the parallel postulate inevitably failed, but because he smuggled more into his account than he realised. But its chief significance for present purposes is that it exemplifies the attempt to ground elementary geometry on a concept of distance, or more precisely, on the idea that a straight line is the curve of shortest distance between any of its points. Distance itself is not defined.

Joseph Fourier, in a discussion with Monge, also took the concept of distance as fundamental, and began with three-dimensional space. He then employed equidistance to define successively the sphere, the plane (as the points equidistant from two given points) and the line (as the points equidistant from three given points). This did at least give him definitions of these previously troubling concepts (see Bonola 1912, 54).

To conclude: a reasonable view at the time would have been that metrical geometry needed to put its house in order, and it probably could not do so by grafting the concept of distance onto a structure modelled on Euclid’s Elements. This is an awkward position for traditional geometry to be in, and it may have opened people’s minds to the possibilities of alternatives. Certainly, two were to be produced. One, projective geometry, amplified and improved the synthetic side of geometry. The other, non-Euclidean geometry, was a new and challenging metrical geometry. But before we look at them, we turn to contemporary philosophical discussions of geometry.

2. Epistemological issues in applied geometry

It is a useful over-simplification to say that around 1800 the view was that there is one physical space, and that this space is described by the geometry in Euclid’s Elements, which is the only candidate for such a task. Disputes concerned the rigorous presentation of this geometry and the limits of its application to the physical world. The nature of the knowledge that geometry provided was also a matter of some discussion.

Traditionally, geometry had been regarded as a paradigm of truth, certainty, and justification. This can be found e.g. in many authors of the seventeenth century. Descartes was ready to criticize the Euclidian method for a certain stiffness, which made it difficult to find the solution of new problems, and he sought to alleviate it by combining algebra and geometry; yet, even so, he always emphasized the clarity and evidence of geometry and its demonstrations. According to Pascal, geometry was the perfect illustration of the methods of demonstrating truths, and of establishing a body of propositions in methodical order. Leibniz, Spinoza, and others, continued taking mathematics as a model for philosohical discourse.

Locke (see the entry on Locke) took from the Aristotelian tradition the idea that Euclidean geometry and rational theology are the exemplars of scientific knowledge, but sought to ground his philosophy in intuitive, demonstrative, and sensitive kinds of knowledge. Intuitive knowledge is what is grasped immediately; demonstrative knowledge avails itself of the intermediate steps of a proof, as in geometry. Both these forms of knowledge are certain. Sensitive knowledge is not certain: it is what we learn through our senses, it presents effects but not causes, it is at best partial and may be deceptive. Space can be thought of as composed of all (actual and possible) positions of objects; pure space is space with all solid bodies removed, and distance the primitive concept we use to discuss the separation between bodies.

Locke offered arguments against innatist interpretations of our knowledge of space and figures, emphasizing the primary role of experience (see the entry on Molyneux problem). Yet in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) Locke asserted that

…the idea of a right-lined triangle necessarily carries with it an equality of its angles to two right ones. Nor can we conceive this relation, this connexion of these two ideas, to be possibly mutable, or to depend on any arbitrary Power, which of choice made it thus, or could make it otherwise. (Essay IV.iii.29, pp. 559–560)

Sensitive knowledge of the corresponding objects, however, could never have this degree of certainty, and because our knowledge derives from our knowledge of objects it would seem that scientific knowledge of space is of a different kind from our knowledge of geometry. Thus, for Locke, Euclidean geometry provided one kind of knowledge, and experience and scientific experiment, another. Indeed, one might say that an epistemological gap remains to this day in philosophy in the form of a distinction between empirical and a priori knowledge that is still widely recognised.

In Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787) (see the entry Kant’s views on space and time) the situation is more complicated or sophisticated. Kant introduced the notion of a priori knowledge in contrast to a posteriori, and synthetic knowledge in contrast to analytical knowledge to allow for the existence of knowledge that did not rely on experience (and was thus a priori) but was not tautological in character (and therefore synthetic and not analytic). The contentious class of synthetic a priori statements includes the truths of Euclidean geometry; thus he ascribed certainty and necessity to Euclidean geometry. Kant associated geometric knowledge with the pure intution of space; to know that an isosceles triangle (i.e. with two equal sides) has two equal angles at the base, the mathematician must produce a particular construction that makes the truth of the claim demonstrable (see Critique, A 716, B 744).

Among the French philosophes, the dominant position in the 1740s was the Cartesian one, which, as exemplified by Clairaut’s Élémens de géométrie (1741) was perhaps unduly naïve in its insistence on clear and immediate ideas. The position of d’Alembert, in his articles in the Encylopédie Méthodique (1784), was more sophisticated. The objects of geometry are to be understood by abstracting from bodies every quality except that of being divisible and figured extents. Among these objects are lines, that lack breadth, and surfaces, that lack depth. Truths established about the objects of geometry are purely abstract and hypothetical, because there is no such thing, for example, as a perfect circle. The demonstrated properties can hold of actual circles only insofar as the actual object approaches the state of being a perfect circle,

They are, in some sense, a limit and, if one can put it this way, the asymptote of physical truths, the term for those objects that approach as closely as one wishes without ever arriving at it exactly. (see Encylopédie Méthodique II, 132)

However, if mathematical theorems do not exactly hold in nature, these theorems serve with more than sufficient precision in practice. To be demonstrated with complete rigour they must be considered as holding of bodies in a state of abstract perfection that they do not really have.

The curves studied in geometry are not perfectly straight nor perfectly curved, the surfaces are not perfectly flat nor perfectly curved, but the more nearly they are so, the more they approach the state of having those properties that one proves about lines exactly straight or curved, and of surfaces exactly flat or curved.

These reflexions, d’Alembert continued, will be enough to refute the sceptics, who complain that geometrical objects do not really exist, and others ignorant of mathematics who regard it as a useless game.

It would seem, therefore, that philosophers found no problems in Euclid’s Elements, but Hume, d’Alembert, and others of an empiricist persuasion qualified the applicability of the theorems on the grounds that the objects of geometry might have no corresponding objects in the world. Philosophers more open to the idea of a wide range of certain knowledge (as, for example, Kant) could grant geometrical theorems the status of a priori truths that cannot be other than they are.

2.1 Implications of mechanics

Physical space was the naïve, three-dimensional version of the space of Euclid’s Elements and of Cartesian coordinatised three-dimensional geometry, and this was how Newton had regarded it in his Principia Mathematica (1687). It was conceived of as a neutral arena, unaffected by matter or forces, but conditioning the movements of physical bodies under various kinds of forces. Chief among these was the force of gravity, which mathematicians in the Cartesian tradition regarded as a mysterious, even unacceptable, concept when it was introduced, but which by the start of the 19th century had been shown by Laplace to be capable of dealing well with all the known motions of the solar system. As a consequence, gravity had become a natural, primitive concept no longer in need of further explanation, and by 1800 it was reasonable of people who worked on the new theories of magnetism and electricity to consider them as forces and to model them, where appropriate, on Newtonian gravity.

Physical space, as described by Newton in his Principia, is to be studied by passing from observations of bodies in motion relative to one another and timed by an arbitrary clock to the corresponding true motion in absolute space and time. As Newton put it at the end of his first Scholium, the purpose of his treatise was to show

how to determine true motions from their causes, effects, and apparent differences, and, conversely, of how to determine from motions, whether true or apparent, their causes and effects.

There was clearly no doubt in Newton’s mind about the Euclidean nature of physical space, and indeed there seems to have been no doubts among astronomers in the 17th or 18th century that space was describable in the terms used in Euclid’s Elements. It is also likely that the growing recognition of the merits of Newton’s physics cemented a belief that space was three-dimensional, homogeneous, isotropic, and to be described as if it was an infinite coordinate grid, thus exemplifying the theorems—if not precisely the definitions—of the Elements.

The interaction between geometrical aspects of physical space, and mechanical behaviour of bodies, is clear in the statement of Newton's first law (see the entry on inertial frames):

Every body perseveres in its state of being at rest or of moving uniformly straight forward, except insofar as it is compelled to change its state by forces impressed.

There is also the result that a homogeneous spherical solid exerts the same gravitational effect on other bodies as would an equal mass concentrated at the centre of the body. That is to say, such bodies behave in a way that is provably, and not merely approximately, the same as point masses. In this way points and lines acquire physical significance in his theory of dynamics.

It was Laplace who gave the strongest argument for saying that physical space obeys Euclidean geometry. In his Exposition du système du monde of 1796 (see Book V, Ch. V, p. 472) he added an interesting note (quoted in Bonola 1912: 54) to say that

The attempts of geometers to prove Euclid’s Postulate on Parallels have been up till now futile. However, no one can doubt this postulate and the theorems which Euclid deduced from it. Thus the notion of space includes a special property, self-evident, without which the properties of parallels cannot be rigorously established. The idea of a bounded region, e.g., the circle, contains nothing which depends on its absolute magnitude. But if we imagine its radius to diminish, we are brought without fail to the diminution in the same ratio of its circumference and the sides of all the inscribed figures. This proportionality appears to me a more natural postulate than that of Euclid, and it is worthy of note that it is discovered afresh in the results of the theory of universal gravitation.

This is strikingly similar to the view of Wallis well over a century before, although Laplace did not mention Wallis and may not have known of his discussion on the parallel postulate.

Around 1800, therefore, it was generally true that problems with the truth claims of Euclidean geometry had been located among the problems about our knowledge of the external world. Confidence in philosophical and scientific circles in the validity of Euclidean geometry per se was very high.

3. Projective geometry

In the opinion of many in the 19th century, Euclidean geometry lost its fundamental status to a geometry that was regarded as more general: projective geometry. (For an introduction to geometry in the 19th century, see Gray 2011. Projective geometry is described in the entry, Nineteenth Century Geometry, see also the essays by various authors in Bioesmat-Martagon 2011.) Projective geometry has its own foundational problem, akin to that of distance in Euclidean geometry, which concerns the concept of cross-ratio, and we need to follow the moves to create projective geometry as an independent subject, to define cross-ratio in this setting, and to resolve the epistemological issues that are raised (an achievement associated with Klein’s Erlangen Programme). We shall also see that the growth of projective geometry creates the arena for Hilbert’s axiomatisation of geometry.

The origins of this geometric theory lay in the 17th century, with Desargues and Pascal, but plane projective geometry took a particular boost from Jean Victor Poncelet’s book of 1822 Traité des propriétés projectives des figures where he showed the power of projective methods under the provocative formulation of non-metrical geometry. The fundamental character of the new geometry resides in the way it can be thought of as capturing the simplest properties of the straight line—two distinct points define a unique line, two distinct lines meet in at most one point—while discarding the metrical concepts of distance and angle.

Poncelet’s claims for transformations of the plane that map lines to lines were rewritten by Chasles (1837) in a more rigorous way that highlighted the invariance of cross-ratio. Consider \(AB\) to represent the distance between the two points. The cross-ratio of four points \(A\), \(B\), \(C\), \(D\) on a line is defined to be \(AB{\cdot}CD \mathbin{/} AD{\cdot}CB\), and if the points are mapped to \(A'\), \(B'\), \(C'\), \(D'\) respectively by a projective transformation, then

\[ \frac{AB\cdot CD}{AD\cdot CB} = \frac{A'B'\cdot C'D'}{A'D'\cdot C'B'}. \]

However, this left the subject in the uncomfortable position of seeming to be more general than Euclidean geometry, because Euclidean, metrical, transformations are projective transformations but not conversely, while still seeming to rely on a metrical concept in the definition of its fundamental invariant.

This issue was tackled in the 1840s and 1850s by Georg Karl Christian von Staudt. His two books (1847, 1856–1860) attempted to give foundations for projective geometry that made it an autonomous subject, independent of Euclidean geometry. They were hard to read, and imperfect in a number of ways, but the task of creating a rigorous theory could be seen for the first time as a matter of completing a task already begun. Von Staudt argued that the transformations of plane projective geometry could map any triple of collinear points to any other, and any quadruple of points (no three of which were collinear) to any other, but not any quadruple of collinear points to any other. He then made a detailed study of collinear quadruples. He also made brief remarks about how Euclidean geometry could be obtained from projective geometry, and from these it could be seen that his theory of collinear quadruples reduced to the familiar theory of cross-ratio as soon as the concept of Euclidean distance was added to projective geometry. This insight was made clear and explicit by Felix Klein in a number of papers in the early 1870s. The first readable textbook on projective geometry, and the one that gave it its name, was Cremona’s Elementi di geometria projettiva of 1873, and after that the subject swiftly rose to become the fundamental classical geometry.

Its basic concepts were the points, lines, and planes of a space that was \(\mathbb{R}^3\) enriched with what was often called a plane at infinity, so that any two coplanar lines meet. Prior to axiomatisations of the theory at the end of the 19th century, point, line, and plane were basic concepts with an intuitive interpretation that allowed for a ready passage between projective and Euclidean geometry. The allowed transformations of the geometry map points to points, lines to lines, and planes to planes and preserve cross-ratio. They act transitively on the space, so no point, line, or plane is special, and therefore lines that are parallel in any finite part of the space may be mapped to intersecting lines and vice versa.

In its synthetic form the successes of projective geometry were largely confined to the simplification it brought to the study of conics—all non-degenerate conics (the circle, ellipse, parabola, and hyperbola) are projectively equivalent. In its algebraic form projective geometry proved itself almost essential in the study of plane algebraic curves of any degree, and, extended to projective spaces of higher dimensions, to the study of algebraic surfaces. All this contributed to the central importance attributed to a non-metrical geometry based on little more than the concept of the straight line and on the incidence properties of lines and planes.

Projective geometry also possessed one startling feature, called duality, which stimulated epistemological reflections on its possible source. In plane projective geometry it is possible to exchange the terms ‘point’ and ‘line’, ‘coincident’ and ‘concurrent’ and in this way obtain from a valid statement a new one. As a result all definitions, theorems, and proofs in projective geometry have a dual character. The dual of the statement of Desargues’ theorem and its proof, for example, is the converse of the theorem and its proof. In three dimensions, the terms ‘point’ and ‘plane’ can be exchanged in the same way, leaving ‘lines’ unchanged. This raises intriguing epistemological issues: duality was regarded by Cremona as a law of logic; also, it is easy to conceive of the plane as made up of points, but impossible to regard it intuitively as made up of lines. To make matters worse, space is three-dimensional when regarded as made up of points, but four-dimensional when made up of lines.

3.1 Coordinate transformations; Kleinian geometry

Klein’s Erlangen Programme and what has become known as the Kleinian view of geometry is described in the entry, Nineteenth Century Geometry. It has come to stand as the principal source of the view that geometry can be defined as a group acting on a space, and a geometrical property is any property invariant under all the transformations of the appropriate group.

Klein advocated this view in a pamphlet published when he became a Professor at the University of Erlangen in 1872 and other publications in journals in the 1870s in order to re-unify geometry. He presented a way of showing that metrical geometries, such as Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometry, and other geometries, such as inversive geometry and birational geometry, can be regarded as special cases of projective geometry (as can affine geometry, which he did not know about in 1872).

The fundamental geometry was real projective geometry, say in two dimensions. In this geometry the space is real projective space, and the group is the group of all projective transformations. Such a transformation maps points to points, lines to lines, curves of degree \(n\) to curves of degree \(n\), and, importantly, the cross-ratio of four collinear points is left unaltered by any projective transformation. In the Kleinian viewpoint, this establishes that points, lines, curves of degree \(n\), and the cross-ratio of four collinear points are properties of the geometry.

Projective geometry incorporated the other geometries in a variety of ways. Klein indicated that one may seek to add to the list of configurations, in which case the group that keeps them invariant will generally be smaller than the principal group, or one may seek to enlarge the group, in which case the class of invariant configurations will generally shrink. Klein succeeded in showing that non-Euclidean geometry arises as a sub-geometry by confining attention to the interior of a conic in projective space and to the subgroup that maps the interior of that conic to itself (see Klein 1871, 1873).

The epistemological character of Klein’s Erlangen Programme becomes clearer when one looks at how it resolved the well-known nagging doubt about the definition of cross-ratio in projective geometry. Klein’s answer proceeded by analogy with lengths in Euclidean or non-Euclidean geometry. In those geometries, the corresponding group preserves straight lines, and any point can be mapped to any other point, but there is no transformation in the group that can map a line segment onto a proper sub-segment of itself. Any arbitrary but fixed line segment (determined by two points) can therefore be taken as unit of length and used to measure line segments, by constructing arbitrary multiples and sub-multiples of it and arranging them as one would a ruler. Now to measure the length of a segment \(AB\), one simply lays the point \(A\) at one end of the ruler and sees where the point \(B\) falls on the ruler.

Klein’s insight, following von Staudt, was that an exactly similar argument involving quadruples of collinear points can be used to define cross-ratio in projective geometry. The projective group preserves straight lines, and any ordered triple of collinear points can be mapped to any ordered triple of collinear points, and the map that sends a given ordered triple of distinct points to another ordered triple of distinct points is unique, but there is no transformation in the group that can map a quadruple of four collinear points onto an arbitrary such quadruple. Any arbitrary but fixed collinear quadruple can therefore be taken as unit of ‘size’, and a complicated but not difficult argument allows one to produce arbitrary multiples and sub-multiples of it that can be used to measure cross-ratios, by arranging as one would a ruler. Rather than give the details, it is better to give this suggestive illustration of why this can be done. Let the cross-ratio of the four collinear points \(P\), \(Q\), \(R\), \(S\) be measured by mapping the points onto the points \(A\), \(B\), \(C\), \(D\) on the real line, where \(A\) is at the origin, \(C\) at \(\infty\), and \(D\) at 1, so it is the position of \(B\) that determines the cross-ratio. This is uniquely determined, and if the length of \(AB\) is \(x\), we find that \(AB{.}CD \mathbin{/} AD{.}CB = x\).

In the language of the time, length is a two-point invariant of the Euclidean or non-Euclidean group, and cross-ratio is a four-point invariant of the projective group.

3.2 Hilbert and others on axiomatic projective geometry

Problems with some technical issues in projective geometry, and the rising standards of rigour at the end of the 19th century provoked attempts to axiomatise the subject. The task was taken up by Moritz Pasch, and most energetically by Italian geometers Pieri, Peano, and others in the second half of the 19th century, and they succeeded in giving a rigorous account of real and complex projective geometry in two and three dimensions (see Marchisotto and Smith 2007). But they managed at the same time to reduce the subject to a rigorous training for geometry teachers, and did not appreciate the avenues for research that they had opened. It was left to David Hilbert to revitalise the axiomatic approach to geometry (see Hallett and Majer 2004).

Hilbert had been introduced to a number of controversies about elementary projective geometry that concerned what results in what settings implied what other results. The most notable concerned Desargues’s theorem (see Arana and Mancosu 2012). In 3-dimensional projective geometry, Desargues’s theorem is a consequence of the incidence axioms alone, but it is a theorem about points and lines in a projective plane (and so in 2-dimensional geometry) yet no-one had been able to derive it from the incidence axioms of 2-dimensional projective geometry. It had come to be suspected that it might not be deducible from those axioms alone, and Giuseppe Peano was able to show that indeed it could not be deduced without some extra assumptions. Independently, Hilbert also gave an example of a geometry meeting all the incidence axioms of 2-dimensional projective geometry but in which Desargues’s theorem was false. It was replaced by the simpler example found by the American mathematician and astronomer F.R. Moulton in all later editions of Hilbert’s Grundlagen der Geometrie (1899).

In the axiomatic geometries that Hilbert put forward, the fundamental objects (points, lines, planes) are not defined. Instead, Hilbert specified the network of relations that links them, which determines how they can be used and what can be said about them. He presented five families of axioms, sorted according to the concepts they codified. He then created a variety of geometries obeying a variety of axioms systems, and established the consistency of them by giving them coordinates over suitable rings and fields—often his geometries admit many interpretations or models. Here Hilbert took advantage of his expertise in the novel theories of number fields and rings. This gave these geometries all the consistency of arithmetic, and increased Hilbert’s interest in attempts to ground arithmetic in some form of set theory and logic.

Hilbert’s approach thrived because he had come to realise that there was a mathematics of axioms, a study of different but inter-related axiom schemes and their implications, and of the axioms and their possible interpretations (models). He employed this new method to solve questions about independence and consistency, hoping to find also new insights into simplicity, the solubility of mathematical problems, and decidability. Poincaré, in his review (1902) of Hilbert’s book, accepted the new geometries as valid, but regretted that they were, as he put it, incomplete, because they lacked a psychological component. By this he meant that they could not be accommodated in his explanation of how we develop our knowledge of the geometry of physical space on the basis of experience (see section 6.2 below).

4. Non-Euclidean geometry

Investigations of the parallel postulate began in Greek times, continued in the Islamic world, and were undertaken in the early modern West. But, for reasons which are still unclear, after around 1800 it became easier for people to imagine that Euclid’s Elements might not be the only possible system of metrical geometry. Among the factors that can help explain how the unthinkable became thinkable even outside the community of mathematicians was the accumulation of theorems based on assumptions other than the parallel postulate. It would seem that the production of novel, consistent consequences of such a radical assumption, and the failure to find a contradiction, inclined some people to contemplate that there might indeed be a whole geometry different from Euclid’s. It may also be relevant that this process coincided with the full assimilation of imaginary numbers (and the rise of complex function theory); indeed, Lobachevskii called his theory "Imaginary geometry".

A change in attitudes can be noticed already by the late 18th century. In 1759 d’Alembert called the problem of parallel lines “le scandale des éléments de géométrie.” In 1763, the dissertation of G. S. Klügel examined a large number of attempts to prove the parallel postulate, concluding that they were all faulty: the result can be proven on the basis of axioms "that are not clearer or more secure than Euclid’s," and thus Euclid was indeed right to include among the axioms "a proposition that cannot be demonstrated in correct form." Klügel's discussion called special attention to Saccheri’s work (1733) as the most detailed treatment in Modern times, and stimulated Lambert to do his own detailed work on the topic (1786). Later on, in 1816, Gauss restated in print that the constantly increasing number of attempts to prove the postulate do not fill the gap, and that one should honestly and openly admit that "in essence we have not come farther than Euclid 2000 years ago."

Perhaps the signal example of this shift is the Law Professor F. K. Schweikart, who in 1818 sent Gauss via Gerling, a colleague and former student of his at the University of Marburg, an account of a geometry quite different from Euclid’s. Schweikart’s geometry was accepted by Gauss, who replied that all the properties of the new geometry could be derived once a value was given for a constant that appeared in Schweikart’s account. But on what grounds Gauss had accepted it, is less clear. As the years went by he came to be entirely confident that there was a new, two-dimensional geometry different from Euclidean plane geometry. This geometry could be described by formulae that he, following Lambert, would have seen were akin to those of spherical geometry. But he did not describe a three-dimensional geometry of this kind, leaving open the possibility that the two-dimensional geometry was some kind of formal, meaningless oddity. On the other hand, in correspondence with Bessel he made it clear that he could not ascribe to Euclidean geometry the certainty he gave to arithmetic, which was a priori. Both he and Bessel kept open the possibility that astronomical regions of space might fail to be Euclidean.

Credit for the first fully mathematical descriptions of space in terms other than Euclid’s must go to János Bolyai in Hungary and Nicolai Ivanovich Lobachevskii in Russia independently. Bolyai in his “Appendix scientiam spatii absolute veram exhibens” (1832) and Lobachevskii in his Neue Anfangsgründe der Geometrie (1835) and again in his Geometrische Untersuchungen (1840) replaced the parallel postulate with the assumption that given a line L and a point not on that line, there are many lines through the point that lie in the plane defined by L and the given point, but that do not meet the line L. Of these, as they then showed, one line in each direction is asymptotic to L, and these asymptotic lines divide the family of all the other lines in the given plane and through the given point into two families: those that meet L, and those that do not. Much work then followed, famously similar in each case, in particular to show that in the three-dimensional space described by their assumptions there is a surface upon which Euclidean geometry holds, and to deduce the existence of trigonometrical formulae describing triangles in the plane. These formulae resemble the corresponding formulae for triangles on the sphere.

All this convinced both Bolyai and Lobachevskii that the new geometry could be a description of physical space and it would henceforth be an empirical task to decide whether Euclidean geometry or non-Euclidean geometry was true. Lobachevskii even attempted to determine the matter by astronomical observations, but there were significant methodological difficulties and his results were utterly inconclusive.

It is, of course, true, that no amount of consistent deductions in the new geometry rules out the possibility that a contradiction does exist, but the intriguing relationship of the new geometry to spherical geometry, and the existence of trigonometric formulae for triangles strongly suggested that the new geometry was at least consistent. Those who did accept it, and they were very few before the 1860s, nonetheless may well have welcomed a better account than the one Bolyai and Lobachevskii provided. Even so, many geometers were to find the formulae convincing ‘proofs’ of the validity of the new geometry even after the reformulations of Riemann and Beltrami (for example, Enriques in his major essay (1907) on the principles of geometry).

It is not just that there are formulae, but that they hint at an alternative formulation of geometry, one in which the geometry described in Euclid’s Elements might prove to be but a special case. If there could be another way to define geometry, one that would lead to these formulae in various cases, the way would be open to rethink all of the questions about geometry that critical examination had opened. The person best placed to do this in the 1830s and 1840s was Gauss: he knew very well what Bolyai and Lobachevskii had done, and his differential geometry gave him the means to proceed, but, curiously, he did not do so. In the early 1840s he wrote some notes that show he could connect the new two-dimensional geometry with geometry on a surface of constant negative curvature, but he did nothing with this observation.

On the other hand, the mere existence of formulae would not suffice to make them geometrical in character. This need to give them a geometrical grounding was recognised by Lobachevskii in his earliest publications, but being in Russian they were not read outside Russia (nor were they appreciated by Russian mathematicians). He dropped his considerations of this kind in his pamphlet of 1840, upon which much of his reputation depends to this day, but brought them back in his last presentation, the Pangéométrie (1856), which, however, did no better than the earlier versions.

Lobachevskii argued firstly that geometry was a science of bodies in space, and that space is three-dimensional. The most primitive concept was that of contact, and its opposite, a cut separating two bodies. Two bodies not in contact are separated and a suitable third body in contact with both of them measures the distance between them -- a concept that was otherwise undefined. With it, however, he could define a sphere with its centre at a given point as the collection of all points equidistant from that given point. He then showed how to define a plane capturing the intuition that a plane is the collection of points in space that lie the same distance from two given points. In his terms, given two points, a plane is the set of points common to two spheres of equal radius, one centred on one of the points and the other on the other. A line can be defined similarly using circles on the same plane.

With the intuition that distance is the primitive concept comes a greater appreciation of motion, or at least the results of being able to move objects around without altering them. One can imagine transporting a rigid body around, say a cube with sides of unit length, and using one of its sides to mark out lengths. We shall see later that the possibilities inherent in this process occasioned a chicken-and-egg debate between Bertrand Russell and Henri Poincaré at the end of the 19th century.

The new geometry posed a radical challenge to Euclidean geometry, because it denied traditional geometry its best claim to certainty, to wit, that it was the only logical system for discussing geometry at all. It also exploited the tension known to experts between the concepts of straightest and shortest. But in other ways it was conventional. It offered no new definitions of familiar concepts such as straightness or distance, it agreed with Euclidean geometry over angles, it merely offered a different behaviour of parallel lines based on a difference in the distant behaviour of straight lines. Its proponents did not offer a sceptical conclusion. Bolyai and Lobachevskii did not say: “See, there are two logical but incompatible geometries, so we can never know what is true.” Instead, they held out the hope that experiments and observations would decide. The epistemological price people would have to pay if astronomical observations had come down in favour of the new geometry would, in a sense, have been slight: it would have been necessary to say that straight lines have an unexpected property after all, but one only detectable at very long distances. To be sure, many of the theorems of geometry would then have to be reworked, and their familiar Euclidean counterparts would appear only as very good approximations. But that is broadly comparable to the situation Newtonian mechanics found itself in after the advent of special relativity.

5. Riemannian geometry

The much more significant change came with the arrival of Bernhard Riemann’s great extension of Gaussian differential geometry. Precisely, he found a way to define geometries starting from very general concepts, and gradually leading (through more and more narrow hypotheses) to the known metric geometries. At the risk of sounding anachronistic, it can be argued that Riemann’s “conceptual” style of work is a form of proto-structuralism. What he does is this: first, he introduces the general structure of n-dimensional manifold, to then define a metric in the manifold (with the means of differential geometry, line element and Gaussian curvature). With all this in place, Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometries emerge as particular cases of 3-dimensional manifolds, concrete forms of the general structure. And the “hypothesis” that singles out these geometries, within the general framework of Riemannian manifolds, is the physical assumption that rigid bodies can move freely without deformation.

Some of the epistemological issues are already raised with Gauss’s work (1828), so we turn to it first. Euler had shown long before that, at each point P in a (smooth) surface, there are two so-called principal curvatures, the maximum and the minimum curvature of lines passing through P. These curvatures, \(\kappa_{1}\) and \(\kappa_{2}\), occur in plane sections perpendicular to each other and allow us to study the shape of the entire neighborhood of P. Now, Gauss’s deep idea (which remarkably he found while working on geodesy, i.e., surveying and mapmaking) was that some properties of curved surfaces can be studied without regard for the ambient space. And one of these key properties is the product \(\kappa_{1}\kappa_{2}\), called the Gaussian curvature of the surface (at a point). Thus, employing methods of differential analysis, he elaborated what is called an intrinsic geometry of surfaces.

Gauss worked with coordinate systems within the surface itself, and considered the distance between points on the surface S along lines contained entirely in S. Now, some surfaces \(S_1\), \(S_2\) can be obtained from each other by bending (without stretching); expressed more formally, there is an isometric map from \(S_1\) to \(S_2\), which means that the points on \(S_1\) are assigned points in \(S_2\) so that distances within the surface \(S_1\) are the same as the distances of the corresponding points in \(S_2\). (For instance, a plane can be so bent to form of cylinder; you may use a piece of paper to convince yourself.) And Gauss made the remarkable discovery that the Gaussian curvature of a surface is an intrinsic property that remains invariant under isometric mappings. He was so happy about this result that he called it theorema eggregium, his ‘outstanding theorem’: if two surfaces \(S_1\), \(S_2\) are isometric, then corresponding points have the same Gaussian curvature.

The fact that the Gaussian curvature of a surface at a point is intrinsic means that it is entirely determined by measurements in the surface and does not involve any question of a third dimension or the ambient space embedding the surface. The property of Gaussian curvature does not depend on how the surface is located in space, but only on intrinsic properties of its metrics. That is to say, important properties of curved surfaces remain invariant even if one bends the surface isometrically (without breaking, stretching, or folding it up). One such thing that remains invariant is the geodesics on the surface, i.e., the lines of shortest distance (lying entirely on the surface). In the case of a cylinder, the geodesics are the vertical lines, horizontal lines (circles), and helices around it —and these lines all come from straight lines on the plane that is ‘rolled up’ to form the cylinder.

Given a metric, a differential formula for the distance ds between neighboring points (which is everywhere the same), the curvature can be found. If, for example, the formula for distance is that for a map of the sphere on the plane, the curvature will be found to be the reciprocal of the square of the radius of the sphere \(1/R^2\). A plane has the same Gaussian curvature as a cylinder, or also as something close to a cone (that one may form from a cylinder, without breaking, stretching, or folding); they are locally isometric; although curved, the cylinder has zero curvature in Gauss’s technical sense, just as does the plane, which is why printing from a rotating drum is possible. Gauss investigated when one surface can be mapped onto another in such a way that distances are not altered, showing that a necessary condition for this to happen is that the curvatures at corresponding points are the same. And this also implies that the same figures can be constructed on all of these surfaces; the minimal lines or curves of shortest length between two points (geodesics) on one surface correspond to those on the others, so that angles, areas, etc. will be the same. Gauss had found a deeper way to look into the geometry of a surface, and this gave birth to modern differential geometry.

It was not immediately appreciated that Gauss’s approach allowed mathematicians to define surfaces as regions of the plane with a particular metric that are not to be obtained from surfaces in Euclidean 3-dimensional space. If one defines a surface as the image of a map from a piece of \(\mathbb{R}^2\) to \(\mathbb{R}^3\), then of course it is in \(\mathbb{R}^3\). But if one defines a surface as a region of \(\mathbb{R}^2\) with a particular metric, then there may be no surface in \(\mathbb{R}^3\) to which it corresponds. The first person to appreciate this seems to have been Riemann, who also extended this idea to any number of dimensions.

5.1 Riemann's generalisation

Riemann’s ideas were both profound and naïve, and for that reason they proved difficult to make precise, but we can content ourselves with being naïve initially. He supposed he was given a space (he called it a ‘manifold’) in which one can at any point impose a coordinate system at least on all points near to an arbitrary initial point, and if \(n\) numbers are needed to specify the location of a point he said that the space is \(n\)-dimensional. We can think of this process as providing a map of at least that part of the space near the initial point onto \(\mathbb{R}^n\). Riemann was very aware of the difference between local and global determinations, and this became one of the keys to his new ideas: the same local conditions are compatible with numerous different global configurations.

He then supposed there was a means of saying what the distance was infinitesimally, by generalising the formula for \(ds\) from 2 to \(n\) variables. (He even allowed that entirely different formulae be used, but we shall not describe that part of his theory, which lay fallow for many years). Next, he generalized the intrinsic property of curvature to higher dimensions; essentially, the \(n\)-dimensional object has lots of 2-dimensional surfaces to which the Gaussian theory applies, so a notion of curvature of a \(n\)-dimensional object at a point can be derived from a consideration of the 2-dimensional surfaces that pass through the point.

There are properties of the space that are independent of the coordinate system. If two different coordinate systems give out different coordinates, but in such a way that the distance between the points is preserved, then either system gives us the same geometry, and we find that the two agree on the curvatures at each point, on distances, and so forth. Yet the framework of differential geometry proposed by Riemann is very flexible and general. He found that it allowed not only for alternatives to Euclidean geometry, but even for geometries where the generalized curvature does change from point to point. Initially this was scarcely taken up, and most authors focused on geometries of constant curvature. As Riemann explained, his framework allowed for geometries of negative curvature (this is the Lobachevskii-Bolyai case), of positive curvature (a new kind, often called elliptic geometry, or ‘Riemannian’ in a narrow sense), and also of zero curvature (Euclidean).

Because the formula for \(ds\) was written down subject to only a few restrictions, there is no reason to believe that a Riemannian geometry is defined with respect to an antecedent Euclidean geometry. There is no claim that an \(n\)-dimensional Riemannian geometry is to be obtained by a map from an \(n\)-dimensional subset of some Euclidean \(m\)-dimensional space. This means that geometry can be done without reference to any Euclidean geometry. Euclidean geometry is no longer epistemologically prior to any study of other geometries. The reign of Euclid was—theoretically—over.

Given a concept of distance on a manifold it is possible to talk about geodesics—a geodesic being a curve of shortest length between two points. Existence and uniqueness questions can be raised, and often answered. A significant advance was made independently by Tullio Levi-Civita in 1917 and Hermann Weyl in 1918, inspired by Einstein’s theory of general relativity, when they showed how to define parallelism on a curved manifold (on Levi-Civita’s contribution, see Bottazzini 1999 and on Weyl’s contribution see Scholz 2001). Roughly speaking, in Weyl’s presentation (1918), two vectors at different points are parallel if they belong to a family of vectors along a curve that do not vary along the curve. This became referred to as a way of establishing a connection between different points, and the theory was called the theory of connections on manifolds. One can ask if a family of tangent vectors to a curve is composed of vectors parallel to the tangent vector at the starting point: if so, the curve is a natural candidate to be considered the straightest curve between its end points, because the tangent vector never accelerates along the curve. In modern differential geometry, geodesics are defined via connections.

5.2 Riemann and Beltrami and rigorous non-Euclidean geometry

Riemann’s “Über die Hypothesen …” (given as a lecture in 1854, published posthumously in 1868) and Beltrami’s “Saggio di interpretazione” (1868) gave different but equivalent accounts of 2-dimensional non-Euclidean geometry. Beltrami employed differential geometry to justify the hyperbolic geometry of Lobachevskii-Bolyai. By studying the pseudosphere and how it can be mapped onto the plane (in such a way that its geodesics went to straight lines), Beltrami realized that the unit disk can be viewed as an ‘infinite plane’. It had been impossible to find a surface in \(\mathbb{R}^3\) that behaved like the hyperbolic plane (the closest, but partial, being the pseudosphere); now it was possible to realize non-Euclidean geometry as the geometry of the interior of a disk with a novel metric. The disk is the whole ‘plane’, its circumference a line at infinity, line segments in the disk are ‘lines’, and one can define a distance function \(d(P,Q)\) that makes sense and validates Lobachevskii’s results. From the logical point of view, this was an enormous step forward, as the consistency of non-Euclidean geometry was now proven.

Riemann’s account, which was stated in \(n\) dimensions, agrees with the one that Poincaré was to use in many short publications in 1880 and 1881 but only describe explicitly in his major paper (Poincaré 1882). In this so-called conformal model, the plane is again a disk, geodesics are arcs of circles perpendicular to the boundary of the disk and angles are true (Euclidean). The Riemann and Beltrami disks swiftly persuaded mathematicians that the non-Euclidean geometry of Bolyai and Lobachevskii did, after all, make rigorous mathematical sense. Poincaré’s contribution a decade later was to make non-Euclidean geometry the natural geometry for certain topics elsewhere in mathematics, chiefly the developing and important subject of Riemann surfaces.

The importance of a rigorous account of any part of mathematics should not be ignored, but the acceptance of non-Euclidean and Riemannian geometries went beyond the presentation of a consistent formalism. It marks the acceptance of the abstract view that geometry is whatever can be described in the Riemannian formalism: one has a very general framework, allowing for a dizzying number of concrete specifications. Thus the door was opened to the view that there are many geometries, each of which must be consistent, and none of which need to refer to Euclidean space, however intuitive this may be. (A parallel development with similar outcome happened in the context of projective geometry with Klein's work.) The number of dimensions of the ‘space’ under discussion, and the precise metric can be modified at will (in due course, the topological character of that ‘space’ would be treated similarly). There is a 2-dimensional geometry of such-and-such a kind because a suitable metric can be found; because there is, as it were, a map of it, not because a surface has been found in \(\mathbb{R}^3\) with the right properties. Indeed, it was later shown (Hilbert 1901) that there is no surface in \(\mathbb{R}^3\) corresponding precisely to non-Euclidean 2-dimensional space.

Riemann was clear that the epistemological implications of this way of doing geometry were immense. His lecture was a happy combination of mathematics, philosophy and physics (Ferreirós 2006). Mathematicians should no longer need to abstract some fundamental intuitions from what they believe about physical space, such as the nature and properties of straight lines or circles, and seek to build a true geometry on the basis of some axiomatic expression of those intuitions. Rather, the direction of thought should go in the opposite direction: mathematicians were free to consider infinitely many geometries. Riemann speculated about the validity of the hypotheses of geometry "in the infinitely small" being possibly bound up with the physical forces. Scientists could now freely investigate which geometry is best for the mathematical explanation of empirical facts. He envisioned the abandonment of the Newtonian conception of phenomena, "by making in this conception the successive changes required by facts which it cannot explain." His purely conceptual (mathematical) research would be useful "in preventing this work from being hampered by too narrow views, and progress in knowledge of the interdependence of things from being checked by traditional prejudices." In this connection, it was soon shown that it is possible to do theoretical mechanics in the setting of non-Euclidean geometry.

6. The intelligibility of the new geometries

The epistemological significance of projective geometry rests on its implications for the nature and rigour of classical geometry. The epistemological significance of non-Euclidean geometry rests more on the possibility that it could be true in whatever way that Euclidean geometry could be true. We therefore turn to 19th century examinations of the intelligibility of geometry.

But first a word of warning. The logical fact that non-Euclidean geometry turned out to be consistent (relative to Euclidean geometry, or to real analysis) does not per se establish the invalidity of the Kantian viewpoint. Kant's views are compatible with the existence of logical alternatives to Euclidean geometry; after all, he was arguing about space as an intuition, not about mere conceptual possibilities; he was not a Leibnizian, and denied that geometry is analytic. If anything, a Kantian would expect that the alternative geometries are only an intellectual possibility, and that we cannot visualize them intuitively. A sophisticated elaboration of such a standpoint was Frege's in his famous correspondence with Hilbert (see the entry on the Frege-Hilbert controversy). But it's true that most of the relevant authors chose a different line of thought and abandoned the Kantian position.

6.1 Herbart’s philosophy and Riemann

Johann Friedrich Herbart became Kant’s successor in Königsberg in 1808, where he remained until going to Göttingen in 1833, but he was no orthodox Kantian. His major work, the two-volume Psychologie als Wissenschaft neu gegrundet auf Erfahrung, Metaphysik, und Mathematik of 1824–1825, sought to establish psychology as a science, based on experience and metaphysics. Using some rather fanciful mathematics he endeavoured to show how memory works and how repeated stimuli of certain kinds cause the mind to learn to perceive, for example, lines, parallel lines, intersecting lines, and surfaces. There are no innate ideas, in Herbart’s opinion; visual space is constructed from experience, most significantly by means of the conceptual act of inferring continuity in spatial processes. And concepts are generated by clusters of memories, upon which logic then operates independently of their origins. This was Herbart’s way of avoiding grounding logic in psychology.

Herbart’s ideas influenced Riemann (see Scholz 1982). Riemann regarded natural science as the attempt to understand nature by the use of precise concepts, which are to be modified in the light of new experiences. He expected the most successful concepts to be quite abstract, and agreed with Herbart that they are not a priori in the Kantian fashion. It was their origin in observation or experiment that gave these concepts their significance for science, but Riemann allowed for a constant process of corroboration and revision. In notes he wrote for himself (see Riemann Werke 1990: 539) Riemann said that he agreed with Herbart in matters of psychology and epistemology, but not ontology or with his ideas about the construction of the concepts of space, time, and motion. The disagreement masks a deeper sympathy. Herbart had advocated a three-dimensional real world of causally connected but discrete 'monads' (with windows, to use Leibniz's phrase), which the mind treats via the concept of a continuum, which it supplies, thereby turning its discrete experiences into spectra of possibilities. Riemann saw no reason to restrict attention to three dimensions, and moved the continuous spectra of possibilities into the very general geometrical concepts he was creating.

This diminished the role of experience that Herbart had emphasised. Riemann was making conscious what Herbart had said occurred naturally: if intellectual reflection generates concepts with which we frame the world, in reaction to our experiences, then, said Riemann, let mathematics generate more precise and flexible concepts with which to conduct science. At the end of his lecture he explored possibilities for the application of the new geometries, especially at an atomic level, and he argued that his task had been to expand the range of theoretical options, eliminating prejudices.

6.2 Helmholtz and Poincaré

Riemann’s ideas in turn influenced Hermann von Helmholtz, who published several influential essays on how our knowledge of geometry is possible. In his “On the factual [thatsächlichen] foundations of geometry” (1866) he endeavoured to show how only a limited number of Riemannian geometries can be constructed in which there is a concept of rigid body motion. He argued that it is our experience of rigid bodies that teaches us what space is like, and in particular what distance is. He further claimed that a 2-dimensional space that admits rigid body motions would either be the Euclidean plane or the sphere. Beltrami wrote to him to point out that he had overlooked the possibility of non-Euclidean geometry, and Helmholtz not only agreed, but wrote a further essay (1868) in which he explained how it would be possible for us to have knowledge of this geometry at an intuitive level (thus giving the lie to followers of Kant). Many Kantians refused to be convinced, but one person that these ideas (and Riemann's) very likely influenced was Henri Poincaré (see Gray 2012).

As soon as Poincaré began to write his popular philosophical essays about geometry, he made it clear that his chief concern was with how we could rely on any geometry at all. Mathematical advances were the basis for his reflections, but the key question was about the epistemological status of the hypotheses on which geometry is founded. And here he could not agree with Kant, nor Helmholtz, nor with Riemann. He was well aware of the great range of Riemannian geometries, and of the conclusion of Helmholtz’s speculations, by then made rigorous in the work of Sophus Lie, that a very limited number of geometries admitted rigid body motions. His concern in his “On the foundations of geometry” (1898) was with epistemology.

Poincaré argued that the mind quickly realises that it can compensate for certain kinds of motions that it sees. If a glass comes towards you, you can walk backwards in such a way that the glass seems unaltered. You can do the same if it tilts or rotates. We come to master a store of these compensating motions, and we realise that we can follow one with another and the result will be a third compensating motion. On this basis we come to distinguish displacements (both our bodily displacements and displacements of objects) from other kinds of change, i.e., alterations for which we cannot generate compensating motions, such as the motion of the wine in the glass as it swirls around, or a change in its colour. Most importantly, the displacements form a mathematical structure called a group. In this way the mind comes to form the concept of a rigid body motion, and we elaborate a clear conceptual understanding of space on the basis of the group of motions.

Poincaré then considered what group the group of compensating motions could be, and found that, as Lie had proved in his study of the Riemann-Helmholtz problem of space, there was a strictly limited collection of such groups. Chief among them were the groups that come from Euclidean and non-Euclidean geometry, and as abstract groups they are different. But which one was correct?

Poincaré’s controversial view was that one could never know, or better, than none was simply "true". Human beings, through evolution and through our experience as infants, pick the Euclidean group and so we say that space is Euclidean. Our bodies are quite rigid, our motions are rigid motions, and this is decisive. Another species, drawing on different experiences, could pick the non-Euclidean group and so say that space was non-Euclidean. If we met such a species, there would be no experiment that would decide the issue.

Of course, one can make experiments using large triangles and measuring the angles, as Lobachevskii, Riemann and others had suggested. To maximize dimensions, assume that the sides of the triangle are made by rays of light. Now, suppose that within the limits of experimental error the result of the experiment is that the angle sum of the triangle is less that \(\pi\), a result consistent with non-Euclidean geometry but inconsistent with Euclidean geometry. The only conclusion one can draw, said Poincaré, is that either light rays travel along straight lines and space is non-Euclidean, or that space is Euclidean and light rays travel along curves.

We can summarise his argument this way. Our knowledge of the geometry of the external world is founded on our basic physical experiences, which lead to our mental ability to deal with a group of rigid body motions. There is a very limited store of these groups, but no experiment can decide between them. All we can do is make a choice, and we shall choose the simplest one. As it happens, that was the Euclidean group, because, said Poincaré, we had found that one of its properties not shared with the non-Euclidean group (corresponding to the parallel postulate), was particularly simple. But the human species had, as it were, made a choice, and that choice was now innate in the human mind. Because of the way knowledge is acquired and the fact that there is more than one appropriate group, one can never know whether space is Euclidean or non-Euclidean, only that we construct it as Euclidean.

This twist on the Kantian doctrine of the unknowability of the Ding an sich (the thing in itself) and our confinement to the world of appearances, was congenial to Poincaré as a working physicist. Even though he agreed with Riemann to a large extent, Riemann had hoped that empirical matters would guide the choice of geometry, while Poincaré could not agree. The viewpoint just explained is Poincaré’s philosophy of geometrical conventionalism. But there is an important distinction to make. Notice that this is not like the conventionality of words, but rather like social or legal conventions (where some basic facts have to be taken into account, see De Paz 2018). The situation is far from total arbitrariness, since physical experience plays a decisive role and restricts the choice; but there is no absolute determination either, in the end a choice has to be made, and simplicity has the final word.

He advocated conventionalism in other areas of science too, arguing that what we call the laws of nature (Newton’s laws, e.g., the principle of inertia) are neither empirical matters open to revision nor absolute truths but are well established results that have been elevated to the role of axioms in present scientific theories. They could be challenged, but only if a whole scientific theory was being challenged, not idly when some awkward observations were made. Faced with a satellite that did not seem to be obeying Newton’s laws one should, said Poincaré, consider some as-yet unnoticed force at work and not seek to re-write Newton. But a new theory can be proposed, based on different assumptions that rewrite a law of nature, because these laws are not eternal truths—we could never know such things. And if a new law were to be proposed, simplicity and not only empirical fit will be taken into account as one chooses between the new and the old.

The crucial distinction here is that scientific conventionalism operates at a high level. The choices are made consciously and intellectually, the debate is only open to people with a considerable amount of specialised education. On the other hand, the choice of Euclidean geometry operates in the mind before it is capable of any kind of formal instruction; without some geometric framework, the unfortunate subject would be incapable of any knowledge of the external world.

6.3 Poincaré versus Russell

Poincaré’s views brought him into collision with Bertrand Russell in the 1890s when he was emerging from his brief Hegelian phase and entering his Kantian phase. Russell was trying to establish the Kantian a priori by arguing that there is one fundamental geometry, which is projective geometry, and we have synthetic a priori knowledge of it (see Griffin 1991 on Russell and Nabonnand 2000 on the controversy).

There can be little doubt that Poincaré, with his much greater command of mathematics, won much of the debate, as Russell, with his characteristic willingness to admit his errors, was willing to concede. But a significant difference of approach between them was never to be resolved. Poincaré’s analysis began with rigid bodies and their motions, from which a concept of distance is created. Russell argued on the contrary, that whatever we may discover the concept of distance to be, we know before we begin that the distance from London to Paris is more than a metre. This Poincaré denied in his “Des fondements de la géométrie: à propos d’un livre de M. Russell” (1899).

In Poincaré’s view, we only know the distance from one point to another on the basis of experience with rigid bodies, and this knowledge has become innate in us. In Russell’s view, distance is to be regarded as a fundamental intuition, and if some contemplated that the distance from London to Paris could be less than a metre, we would know we could not be talking about distance. But Poincaré insisted that talk of what we know should always be dependent on how we know it; without that, the claims were not knowledge claims at all.

A mathematical illustration may illuminate the disagreement. For Poincaré, talk about what we might call ordinary geometry, the sense of space that we have prior to advanced instruction, is really about the ability we have to measure things. We can carry a rigid body around, and use it as a ruler. It is because we can do that that we can speak of the distance between places. If you want to make the set-up more abstract, there must be a space and a group that acts on the space and moves points in the space around. If this group has the property that however a region of that space is moved around it is never mapped onto a proper subset of itself then one can construct rigid bodies and talk about distance.

For Russell, one is free to take a space and assign a ‘distance’ to each pair of points (subject to some simple conditions which we omit). Relative to this sense of distance, one can say if, as a region is moved around, points in it remain the same distance apart or not. We have done this for our sense of distance on the surface of the Earth, and we can do this whether or not we also have some rigid body motions. In mathematical terms, Russell would be happy with what is called a metric space. The point is not that one could impose a metric on the surface of the Earth in which a particular pair of points, say in Cambridge, were a metre apart and London and Paris were only half a metre apart—one could—but that one can talk about distance without presupposing the action of a group. Some metric spaces admit the action of groups that preserve distance, others do not, but distance can be defined without talking about a group. Poincaré was never confronted with exactly this argument—metric spaces are an invention of the 20th century—but we know what he would have said. He would have said that it was valid mathematics but entirely formal and could not be considered as genuine knowledge because it lacked a psychophysical dimension. We know this because it was his criticism of the axiomatic geometries constructed by Hilbert (see below).

Poincaré’s arguments also met with objections from the Italian mathematician Federigo Enriques. Poincaré had argued that one way to see the validity of the geometrical conventionalist argument was to consider a disc in which everything was made of the same material, which expanded as it heated, and in which the temperature was a particular function of the distance of the centre of the disc. This function, which Poincaré specified, ensured that the metric in the disc, as measured by rods made of the same material as the disc, was that of non-Euclidean geometry. Creatures living in the disc would report that their space was non-Euclidean; we would reply that their space was Euclidean but subject to the distorting effect of a temperature field. Plainly each side can maintain their position free of self-contradiction.

Enriques argued, in his book Problemi della Scienza (1906), that this was unreasonable. The creatures would be right to ascribe a geometry to their space (and, indeed, non-Euclidean geometry) because the distorting force is beyond their control. Their geodesics are built in to the space, and it would be unreasonable of them to ascribe the paths of geodesics to the operation of a ‘force’ because that ‘force’ was not something they could even in principle manipulate. Heat, the gravitational effect of massive objects, all these distorting influences are things that can be allowed for, because they can be changed. If, in the experiment above, it were to be claimed that space is Euclidean but our candidates for straight lines are deformed it should be possible to vary the degree of deformation. One might conduct the experiment further away from any massive objects, in emptier regions of space. If different experiments gave even slightly different results one would, in accordance with Poincaré’s own criteria for changing scientific conventions, look for something in the circumstances that was responsible for the deviation of the light rays from straightness. But if no experiment were to show any difference, Enriques argued that it would be rational to conclude that light rays travelled on geodesics and the geometry of space was non-Euclidean.

It is worth noticing that the growing sophistication of ideas about how theoretical geometry relates to practical experience, and about the nature of the knowledge that geometry supplies, belong to a family of changes across all of mathematics by 1900. An autonomous discipline of mathematics emerged that placed an increasing emphasis on formal aspects of the subject and offered a complicated and often distant relationship with the world of experience. This modernist turn in mathematics is discussed in various places (see Gray 2008 and the literature cited there).

7. Concluding remarks

This essay has examined the main branches in the development of geometry until the early years of the 20th century under the headings of theoretical or abstract knowledge, empirical and other analyses of the intelligibility of such knowledge, and the deductive character of that knowledge.

The status of the straight line in elementary Euclidean geometry as both the shortest curve joining any two of its points and as the curve that points always in the same direction was disentangled. One line of enquiry led to geometries that emphasised straightness as the fundamental property (typically, projective geometry) and the other to geometries that emphasised the shortest aspect. The former approach was seen from the start as a non-metrical one, and became the favoured arena for formal, even axiomatic investigations of geometry as a deductive enterprise. The price was having less and less to say about physical space (as Poincaré observed). The concept of geometry was radically enlarged, but in ways that were not intended to be accounts of physical space or experiential space.

The metrical account led to a progressive elucidation of a significant obscurity in Euclid’s Elements: the parallel postulate. For much of the 19th century, non-Euclidean geometries (like Lobachevskii's) were the only alternative to Euclid’s that was proposed as an intelligible geometry, even though it was generally agreed that only the most delicate experiments could hope to decide the matter. Poincaré’s contested view was that no experiment could so decide, and this raised important issues about the way abstract terms are to be interpreted and the role of hypotheses in scientific theory.

Beyond the eye-catching and thought-provoking idea of a physical geometry alternative to Euclid’s system, which had stood for two thousand years, there was the panoply of metrical geometries hinted at in work on differential geometry by Gauss and above all by Riemann. Here it finally proved possible to explain the relationship between straightest and shortest in a suitably general setting. It also became possible to discuss geometry as a body of ideas that grew out of naive ideas of length, angle, shape, and size, and to do so in a sophisticated and rigorous way. What had been regarded as inescapable axiomatic truths, necessary truths, now became hypothetical assumptions that could be modified in many ways; the old notion of an axiom yielded gradually to the modern one. It was also possible to contemplate all kinds of theoretical structures as ‘spaces’, whether or not they were presented axiomatically or intended as distillations of intelligible experience. In this way, it became possible to apply geometrical ideas in novel settings and in novel ways. Geometrisation has been ubiquitous in maths and science ever since.

After 1900, it was clear that Euclidean geometry had lost its pre-eminent position. This ancient system lost its certainty, and there were better formal, axiomatic systems, such as those proposed by Hilbert and some mathematicians in the school around Peano. There were rich systems that were more fundamental, in the sense of using fewer properties of the figures of traditional geometry such as the straight line (the many versions of projective geometry). And there was a profusion of metrical geometries with more natural starting points and deeper theories.

As a result, ideas about how theoretical geometry of whatever kind relates to the space around us had become much more sophisticated. From the standpoint of pure mathematics, the situation was one of pluralism. The truth of geometry was no longer to be taken for granted, notoriously the Kantian viewpoint was generally abandoned. Choosing a physical geometry had become, in some measure, an empirical question —if we assume Poincaré was not right. Philosophical ideas about the intelligibility of geometry had also deepened. Perhaps also from the standpoint of general science one ought to consider a pluralistic outlook.


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