First published Fri Jan 6, 2023

As an intellectual movement that exploded on the scene in mid-twentieth-century France, “existentialism” is often viewed as a historically situated event that emerged against the backdrop of the Second World War, the Nazi death camps, and the atomic bombings of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, all of which created the circumstances for what has been called “the existentialist moment” (Baert 2015), where an entire generation was forced to confront the human condition and the anxiety-provoking givens of death, freedom, and meaninglessness. Although the most popular voices of this movement were French, most notably Jean-Paul Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir, as well as compatriots such as Albert Camus, Gabriel Marcel, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, the conceptual groundwork of the movement was laid much earlier in the nineteenth century by pioneers like Søren Kierkegaard and Friedrich Nietzsche and twentieth-century German philosophers like Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, and Karl Jaspers as well as prominent Spanish intellectuals José Ortega y Gasset and Miguel de Unamuno. The core ideas have also been illuminated in key literary works. Beyond the plays, short stories, and novels by French luminaries like Sartre, Beauvoir, and Camus, there were Parisian writers such as Jean Genet and André Gide, the Russian novelists Leo Tolstoy and Fyodor Dostoevsky, the work of Norwegian authors such as Henrik Ibsen and Knut Hamsun, and the German-language iconoclasts Franz Kafka and Rainer Maria Rilke. The movement even found expression across the pond in the work of the “lost generation” of American writers like F. Scott Fitzgerald and Ernest Hemingway, mid-century “beat” authors like Jack Kerouac, Allen Ginsburg, and William S. Burroughs, and the self-proclaimed “American existentialist,” Norman Mailer (Cotkin 2003, 185).

What distinguishes existentialism from other movements in the intellectual history of the West is how it stretched far beyond the literary and academic worlds. Its ideas are captured in films by Ingmar Bergman, Michelangelo Antonioni, Jean-Luc Goddard, Akira Kurosawa, and Terrence Malick. Its moods are expressed in the paintings of Edvard Munch, Marcel Duchamp, Pablo Picasso, Paul Cézanne, and Edward Hopper and in the vitiated forms of the sculptor Alberto Giocometti. Its emphasis on freedom and the struggle for self-creation informed the radical and emancipatory politics of Martin Luther King Jr. and Malcolm X as well as the writings of Black intellectuals such as Ralph Ellison, Richard Wright, and W.E.B. Du Bois. Its engagement with the relationship between faith and freedom and the incomprehensibility of God shaped theological debates through the lectures and writings of Karl Barth, Paul Tillich, and Martin Buber, among others. And, with its penetrating analyses of anxiety and the importance of self-realization, the movement has had a profound impact in the development of humanistic and existential approaches to psychotherapy in the work of a wide range of theorists, including R.D. Laing, Rollo May, Viktor Frankl, and Irvin Yalom.

With this broad and diverse range of incarnations, it is difficult to explain what the term “existentialism” refers to. The word, first introduced by Marcel in 1943, is certainly not a reference to a coherent system or philosophical school.[1] Indeed, the major contributors are anything but systematic and have widely divergent views, and of these, only Sartre and Beauvoir explicitly self-identified as “existentialists.” In surveying its representative thinkers, one finds secular and religious existentialists, philosophers who embrace a conception of radical freedom and others who reject it. And there are those who regard our relations with others as largely mired in conflict and self-deception and others who recognize a deep capacity for self-less love and interdependence. Given these disparate threads and the fact that there is no unifying doctrine, one can nonetheless distill a set of overlapping ideas that bind the movement together.

  • Nihilism: The emergence of existentialism as an intellectual movement was influenced by the rise of nihilism in late nineteenth century Europe as the pre-modern religious worldview was replaced with one that was increasingly secular and scientific. This historical transition resulted in the loss of a transcendent moral framework and contributed to the rise of modernity’s signature experiences: anxiety, alienation, boredom, and meaninglessness.
  • Engagement vs. Detachment: Against a philosophical tradition that privileges the standpoint of theoretical detachment and objectivity, existentialism generally begins in medias res, amidst our own situated, first-person experience. The human condition is revealed through an examination of the ways we concretely engage with the world in our everyday lives and struggle to make sense of and give meaning to our existence.
  • Existence Precedes Essence: Existentialists forward a novel conception of the self not as a substance or thing with some pre-given nature (or “essence”) but as a situated activity or way of being whereby we are always in the process of making or creating who we are as our life unfolds. This means our essence is not given in advance; we are contingently thrown into existence and are burdened with the task of creating ourselves through our choices and actions.
  • Freedom: Existentialists agree that what distinguishes our existence from that of other beings is that we are self-conscious and exist for ourselves, which means we are free and responsible for who we are and what we do. This does not mean we are wholly undetermined but, rather, that we are always beyond or more than ourselves because of our capacity to interpret and give meaning to whatever limits or determines us.
  • Authenticity: Existentialists are critical of our ingrained tendency to conform to the norms and expectations of the public world because it prevents us from being authentic or true to ourselves. An authentic life is one that is willing to break with tradition and social convention and courageously affirm the freedom and contingency of our condition. It is generally understood to refer to a life lived with a sense of urgency and commitment based on the meaning-giving projects that matter to each of us as individuals.
  • Ethics: Although they reject the idea of moral absolutes and universalizing judgments about right conduct, existentialism should not be dismissed for promoting moral nihilism. For the existentialist, a moral or praiseworthy life is possible. It is one where we acknowledge and own up to our freedom, take full responsibility for our choices, and act in such a way as to help others realize their freedom.

These ideas serve to structure the entry.

1. Nihilism and the Crisis of Modernity

We can find early glimpses of what might be called the “existential attitude” (Solomon 2005) in the Stoic and Epicurean philosophies of antiquity, in the struggle with sin and desire in St. Augustine’s Confessions, in the intimate reflections on death and the meaning of life in Michel de Montaigne’s Essays, and in the confrontation with the “dreadful silence” of the cosmos in Blaise Pascal’s Pensées. But it was not until the nineteenth century that the ideas began to coalesce into a bona fide intellectual movement. By this time, an increasingly secular and scientific worldview was emerging and the traditional religious framework that gave pre-modern life a sense of moral orientation and cohesion was beginning to collapse. Without a north star of moral absolutes to guide us, the modern subject was left abandoned and lost, “wandering,” as Nietzsche writes, “as if through an endless nothing” (1887 [1974], §125). But it wasn’t just the rise of modern science and its cold mechanistic view of the world as a value-less aggregate of objects in causal interaction that contributed to the anxiety and forlornness of the modern age. The rise of Protestantism also played a role. With its rejection of hierarchical Church authority, this new form of Christianity emphasized subjective inwardness and created a unique social configuration grounded in principles of individualism, freedom, and self-reliance. The result was the loss of a sense of community and belongingness rooted in the close-knit social bonds of traditional society. And the Protestant shift intensified the Christian attitude of contemptus mundi (“contempt for the world”), contributing to feelings of loneliness and creating a perception of public life as a domain that was fundamentally inauthentic and corrupt (Aho 2020; Guignon 2004; Taylor 1989).

Along with these historical developments, social transformations associated with the Industrial Revolution and the formation of the modern state were emerging. With newly mechanized working conditions and bureaucratic forms of administration, an increasingly impersonal and alienating social order was established. When Ortega y Gasset introduces his notion of “the mass man,” he captures the automation and lifeless conformism of the machine age, where everybody “feels just like everybody else and is nevertheless not concerned about it” (1930 [1993, 15]). In their conceptions of “the public” (Kierkegaard), “the herd” (Nietzsche), and “the They” (Heidegger), existentialists offer powerful critiques of the leveled down and routinized ways of being that characterize mass society. And the novels and short stories of Dostoevsky, Camus, and Kafka capture the bourgeois emptiness and boredom of the managerial class and the paranoia and distrust that emerges when life is regulated and controlled by faceless bureaucrats.

These social transformations created the conditions for nihilism, where modern humanity suddenly found itself adrift and confused, unsure of which path to take or where to look for a stable and enduring sense of truth and meaning. The condition of nihilism involves the shocking recognition that there is no overarching reason, order, or purpose to our existence, that it is all fundamentally meaningless and absurd. Of all the existentialists, Nietzsche was the most influential and prophetic in diagnosing and conceptualizing the crisis. With the death of God and the loss of moral absolutes, we are exposed to existence “in its most terrible form … without meaning or aim” (Nietzsche 1887 [1974], §55). And it is against this anomic background that the question of existence, of what it means to be, becomes so urgent. But it is a question that requires taking a radically different standpoint than the one privileged by the philosophical tradition.

2. Engagement vs. Detachment

From Plato onward, Western philosophy has generally prioritized a methodology grounded in a perspective of rational detachment and objectivity to arrive at truths that are immutable and timeless. By practicing what Merleau-Ponty disparagingly calls, “high-altitude thinking” (1964 [1968], 73), the philosopher adopts a perspective that is detached and impersonal, a “God’s eye view” or “view from nowhere” uncorrupted by the contingencies of our emotions, our embodiment, or the prejudices of our time and place. In this way the philosopher can grasp the “reality” behind the flux of “appearances,” the essential and timeless nature of things “under the perspective of eternity” (sub specie aeternitatis). Existentialism offers a thoroughgoing rejection of this view, arguing that we cannot look down on the human condition from a detached, third-person perspective because we are already thrown into the self-interpreting event or activity of existing, an activity that is always embodied, felt, and historically situated. Existence, then, is generally grasped not just through dispassionate theorizing but through a careful analysis of first-person experience, of the concrete, flesh and blood particulars of everyday life and the feelings, relationships, and commitments that make us who we are. It is a philosophy that begins from the standpoint of the engagé, of the individual who is engaged in life and who confronts the givens of existence.

2.1 Subjective Truth

The existentialist critique of theoretical detachment was pioneered by Kierkegaard whose scorn was directed primarily at G.W. F. Hegel, a philosopher who adopted the “perspective of eternity” to build a metaphysical system that would provide complete knowledge of reality. By taking a disengaged and panoptic view, Kierkegaard argues Hegel’s system invariably covers over the deeply personal project of being human and the specific needs and concerns of the existing individual. In his words, “it makes the subject accidental, and thereby transforms existence into something indifferent, something vanishing” (1846 [1941, 173]). In response, Kierkegaard reverses the traditional orientation that privileges objectivity by claiming that, when it comes to the question of existence, one’s own subjective truth is “the highest truth attainable” (1846 [1941, 182]). This means the abstract truths of philosophical detachment are always subordinate to the concrete truths of the existing individual. “The real subject,” writes Kierkegaard, “is not the cognitive subject … the real subject is the ethically existing subject” (1846 [1941, 281]). And subjective truth cannot be reasoned about or explained logically; it emerges out of the situated commitments, affects, and needs of the individual. For this reason, it does not disclose timeless and objective truths; it discloses “a truth which is true for me” (1835 [1959, 44]). For Kierkegaard, to live this truth invariably results in feelings of anxiety and confusion because it is objectively uncertain; it has no rational justification, and no one else can understand or relate to it. It is an ineffable truth that is felt rather than known. In this sense, the existing individual “discovers something that thought cannot think” (Kierkegaard 1844 [1936, 29]). But prioritizing the contingent and unrationalizable truths of existence does not mean Kierkegaard is forwarding a position of “irrationalism.” He is claiming, rather, that the standpoint of rational detachment cannot help us access the self-defining commitments and projects that matter to the existing individual. Truths of flesh and blood cannot be reduced to systematic explanation because such truths do not provide us with objective knowledge. Rather, they lay bare the passionate and urgent sense of how we should live our lives. They tell the individual: “what I am to do, not what I am to know” (Kierkegaard, 1835 [1959, 44]).

2.2 Perspectivism

Nietzsche echoes Kierkegaard’s misgivings about methodological detachment and philosophical systems but he does so by forwarding a pragmatic and perspectival account of truth. He argues that philosophers don’t discover objective truths by means of detached reasoning because truth claims are always shaped by and embedded in specific sociohistorical contexts. Truths, for Nietzsche, are best understood as social constructs; they are created or invented by a historical people, and they endure only so long as they are socially useful. On Nietzsche’s account, truths are passed down historically for generations to the point where they are uncritically accepted as “facts.” But from the standpoint of perspectivism, “facts are precisely what there is not, [there are] only interpretations. [The world] has no meaning behind it, but countless meanings” (Nietzsche 1901 [1968], §481). Nietzsche’s genealogy is one that shows how the history of Western philosophy is largely a history of forgetting how truths are invented. “It is only by means of forgetfulness,” he writes, “that man can ever reach the point of fancying himself to possess a ‘truth’” (Nietzsche 1889a [1990a], §93). This means human beings are already bound up in socially constructed perspectives that they cannot disengage or detach from. To exist, then, is to live in one’s “own perspectival forms, and only in them. We cannot see around our own corner” (Nietzsche 1887 [1974], §374). There is no aperspectival “reality.” The epistemological distinction between “appearance” and “reality” is a pseudo-problem that is always parasitic on the perspectival forms that we inhabit.

Nietzsche goes on to suggest there is a psychological motivation in our shared belief in objective truth. It shelters us from the terrifying contingency and mutability of existence. Nietzsche understands that human beings are vulnerable and frightened creatures, and the belief in truth—even though it is an illusion—has social and pragmatic utility by providing a measure of coherence and reliability. We need these truths for psychological protection, to help us cope with an otherwise chaotic and precarious existence. “Truth,” therefore, “is that sort of error without which a certain species of life could not live” (Nietzsche 1901 [1968], §493).

2.3 Being-in-the-World

In Being and Time, Heidegger will expand on this critique of detachment and objectivity by developing his own phenomenological analysis of existence or “being-in-the-world” (In-der-Welt-sein). Following the core maxim of phenomenology introduced by his teacher Husserl, Heidegger’s philosophy attempts to return “to the things themselves,” to not explain but describe how things are given, reveal themselves, and make sense to us in our average everyday lives. Employing the word “Dasein,” a colloquial German term that refers to the kind of “existence” or “being” unique to humans, Heidegger makes it clear he is not interested in a systematic explanation of what we are, as if existence referred to the objective presence of a substance—e.g., a rational animal, an ego cogito, or an ensouled body. As a phenomenologist, he is concerned with how we are. In his version of phenomenology, Dasein is viewed not as a substance with what-like characteristics but as a self-interpreting, meaning-giving activity. Dasein refers to “the subject’s way of being” (Heidegger 1927 [1982, 123]), someone who is always already involved and engaged with the equipment, institutions, and practices of a shared world and that embodies a tacit understanding of how to be in that world.

Heidegger’s conception of being-in-the-world articulates three related ideas that will become central to twentieth-century existentialism and phenomenology. First, it offers a thoroughgoing rejection of the Cartesian view of the self or “I” as a discrete mental container of “inner” thoughts and beliefs that is somehow separate and distinct from “outer” objects in the world. There is no inner-outer dualism because the self is not a disembodied mind or consciousness. It is the activity of existing, a relational activity that is structurally bound up in the world. Thus, “self and world belong together in the single entity, the Dasein” (Heidegger 1927 [1982, 297]). Second, Heidegger compels us to rethink what we mean by “world.” From a phenomenological perspective, the world is not a geometrical space nor is it the sum of objects. It is the relational setting of our lives, the shared context of meaning that we are already involved in. And our involvement in the world allows objects to count and matter to us in particular ways. Third, Heidegger suggests that being-in-the-world is a meaning-giving activity. When we engage with and handle objects in the world, we give them meaning; we encounter them as meaningful. What appears to us in the immediacy of lived experience is always shaped by the public meanings we grow into. The fact that our existence is “fraught with meaning” suggests that experience has an intentional structure; it is always directed towards objects; it is about or of something (Heidegger 1919 [2002, 60]). The experience of hearing, for example, is not a representation of bare sense data because sounds are invariably colored by the context of meaning we are thrown into. We hear some-thing: we hear “the thunder of the heavens, the rustling of the woods, the rumbling of the motors, the noises of the city” (Heidegger 1950 [1971, 65], emphasis added). Meaning, on this view, is not generated by detached cognitive associations. It emerges against the background of our functional involvement in the world, in the way we are situated and engaged in a shared network of equipment, roles, institutions, and projects. And this engagement reveals a kind of pre-reflective competence or practical “know how” (können) that can never be made theoretically explicit.

2.4 Embodiment

We see, then, that in their critique of third-person detachment existentialists forward the idea that we are already “caught up in the world” (Merleau-Ponty 1945 [1962, 5]). And an essential aspect of being caught up in this way is the experience of one’s own embodiment and the crucial role that bodily orientation, affectivity, perception, and motility play in our everyday being-in-the-world. In this way, philosophers such as Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, Beauvoir, and Marcel challenge the traditional interpretation of the body. Against the standard “Cartesian account,” the body is not regarded as a discrete, causally determined object, extended in space, and set apart from the disinterested gaze of the cognizing mind. The body is not something I have. It is a site of affectivity and meaning. It is who I am. And I cannot obtain objective knowledge of my body because I am already living through it; it is the experiential medium of my existence. “The body,” as Sartre puts it, “is lived and not known.” (1943 [1956, 427])[2]

By building on the analysis of the lived body (corps propre, corps vécu, corps vivant, Leib), existentialists reveal how our moods, perceptions, and experiences are already bound up in worldly meanings, how we internalize these meanings, and how this act of internalization shapes the way we live, how we handle the tools of daily life, maneuver through lived space, relate to others, and interpret and perform our identities. In her pathbreaking work The Second Sex, Beauvoir illuminates this point by showing how a woman tends to internalize the dominant androcentric worldview, resulting in a representation of herself as subordinate, weak, and inferior. She is the “second sex” not because she is born with a particular biological body, but because she inhabits, enacts, and embodies the oppressive meanings and practices unique to her patriarchal situation. As Beauvoir famously puts it, the woman “is not born, but rather becomes a woman.” This is because “the body is not a thing; it is a situation… subject to taboos [and] laws… It is a reference to certain values from which [she] evaluates [herself]” (1949 [1952, 34, 36]).

The existentialist’s distinction between the object-body and the lived-body has made it possible for contemporary philosophers and social theorists to engage the lived experience of those who have been historically marginalized by the western tradition. By rejecting the standpoint of theoretical detachment and focusing on the structures of embodiment and being-in-the-world, influential thinkers such as Franz Fanon (1952 [1967]), Iris Marion Young (1984 [2000]), and Judith Butler (1990), among others, have explored different ways in which we enact and embody forms of oppression and how this can shape our self-image and inhibit the experience of movement, spatial orientation, and other forms of bodily comportment. These investigations help to broaden and pluralize our understanding of the human condition by shedding light on a diverse range of embodied perspectives, from ethnicity and race, sex and gender, and age and physical ability. And insofar as these analyses help capture what is distinct about the meaning-giving activity of humans, they illuminate what is arguably the unifying principle of existentialism: “existence precedes essence.”

3. Existence Precedes Essence

This principle was initially introduced early on in Heidegger’s Being and Time when he writes, “The ‘essence’ of Dasein lies in its existence” (1927 [1962, 42]).[3] Sartre will later repackage this line with the pithy adage, “existence precedes essence” (1946 [2001, 292]). What this statement suggests is that there is no pre-given or essential nature that determines us, which means that we are always other than ourselves, that we don’t fully coincide with who we are. We exist for ourselves as self-making or self-defining beings, and we are always in the process of making or defining ourselves through the situated choices we make as our lives unfold. This is, according to Sartre, “the first principle of existentialism,” and it “means, first, that man exists, turns up, appears on the scene, and, only afterwards, defines himself” (1946 [2001, 292–3]). The point here is that there can be no complete or definitive account of being human because there is nothing that grounds or secures our existence. Existence is fundamentally unsettled and incomplete because we are always projecting forward into possibilities, “hurling ourselves toward a future” as we imagine and re-imagine who we will be. Existence, then, is not a static thing; it is a dynamic process of self-making.

Acknowledging existence as a self-making process does not mean the existentialist is denying that there are determinate aspects or “facts” about our situation that limit and constrain us. This is our givenness (or “facticity”), and it includes aspects of our being such as our embodiment and spatiality, our creaturely appetites and desires, and the socio-historical context we find ourselves in. But what distinguishes us as humans is that we have the capacity to rise above or “transcend” these facts in the way we relate to, interpret, and make sense of them. If I am compelled by a strong desire for sex, alcohol, or cigarettes, for instance, I do not out of necessity have to act on these desires. I have the freedom to question them and give them meaning, and the meanings I attribute to them shape my choices and the direction my life will take going forward.

This means, unlike other organisms, we are self-conscious beings who can surpass our facticity by calling it into question, interpreting it in different ways, and making decisions about how to deal with it in the future. This is what Kierkegaard means when he describes existence as “a relation that relates to itself” (1849 [1989, 43]). Existence is a reflexive or relational tension between “facticity” and “transcendence,” where we are constrained by our facticity but simultaneously endowed with the freedom to exceed or transcend it. The human being is, as Ortega y Gasset writes, “a kind of ontological centaur, half immersed in nature, half transcending it” (1941, 111). We are not wholly determined by our nature because our nature is always a question or an issue for us. We have the capacity to reflect on and care about it. And the way we care about our nature informs how we create ourselves. Sartre will go so far as to say that human existence is fundamentally “indefinable” and that “there is no human nature” because there is no aspect of our facticity that can fully describe us. Our facticity reveals itself to us only through the self-defining meanings and values that we give to it. “If man […] is indefinable, it is because at first he is nothing. Only afterward will he be something, and he himself will have made what he will be” (1946 [2001, 293]). This idea that facticity can always be nullified or negated by our choices reveals the key to understanding the existentialist conception of freedom.

4. Freedom

Recognizing that there is no pre-given essence that determines existence, the existentialist makes it clear that it is up to the individual to make his, her, or their own identity through choices and actions. Sartre explains that the coward, for instance, is not the way he is because of an unstable childhood or a particular genetic makeup. The coward “makes himself a coward” by means of his decisions (1946 [2001, 301]). In this way, the existentialist generally affirms the view that the human being has free will, is able to make decisions, and can be held responsible for their actions.[4] But, as we will see, this does not mean that we can do whatever we want. It means, rather, that existence is structured by our capacity to give meaning to our situation based on the actions and choices we make as our lives unfold. Insofar as we exist, we are envisioning a certain kind of life, assigning a value to our identity, and making ourselves into the kind of person we are.

When we become aware of our freedom as an inescapable given of the human condition, the awareness is often accompanied by anxiety because we realize that we alone are responsible for our choices and the projects we undertake. There is no moral absolute, divine will, or natural law that can provide guidance or justify our actions. We are, in this sense, condemned to be free because “there are no excuses behind us nor justifications before us” (Sartre 1946 [2001, 296]).

4.1 The Anxiety of Choice

In the canon of existentialist literature, no writer captures this idea better than Dostoevsky in his Notes from the Underground. The nameless “underground man” rebels against an increasingly scientized, rational, and mechanistic picture of human behavior promoted by Russian social reformers in the 1860s, where everything a person does was thought to be determined by causal laws. For the underground man, this view reduces the human being to a mechanical cog or “a piano key” (1864 [2009, 18]), and it undermines the one value that gives existence its meaning and dignity, that is, the capacity to choose and create our own lives.[5] To affirm his freedom, the underground man responds to this situation through self-immolating acts of revolt, doing the opposite of whatever the determinations of rationality, social convention, or the laws of nature demand. When he has a toothache, he refuses to see the doctor; when he is at a party with former school mates, he behaves in outrageous and humiliating ways; when the prostitute Liza reaches out to him in tenderness, he lashes out at her in rage. In this sense, the underground man is an anti-hero. He recognizes that freedom is the highest value, the “most advantageous advantage” (1864 [2009, 17]) for human beings, but at the same time he realizes there is no way of knowing what might come of our choices; they may, as they do for the underground man, result in our own self-destruction. As Dostoevsky writes: “What man wants is simply independent choice, whatever that independence may cost and wherever it may lead. And the choice, of course, the devil only knows what choice” (1864 [2009, 20]).

This account of freedom suggests that my being (or identity) is always penetrated by the possibility of its own negation because I can always question myself and assign new meanings to and interpretations of who I am in the future. My self-interpretation is always insecure or unstable. I may interpret myself as a philosophy professor today, but I am also not a professor insofar as I can freely choose to reject this identity and resign from my job tomorrow. In this sense, I am no-thing, a “being-possible.” As Sartre puts it: “human existence is constituted as a being which is what it is not and which is not what it is” (1943 [1956, 107]). For the existentialist, anxiety discloses this predicament to me, revealing that I’ve been abandoned to a realm of possibilities, where I face a dizzying array of options, and I alone am answerable to whatever options I choose. Understood this way, anxiety is not directed at some external object or event in the world. If I am an incarnation of freedom, it is directed at me; I am the source of it.

4.2 Mediated Freedom

In Being and Nothingness, Sartre forwards an account of “radical” or “absolute” freedom, an unconditioned “freedom-in-consciousness” where we make or create ourselves ex nihilo, through the sheer “upsurge” of choice alone. But in the wake of Marxist criticism in the 1940s and 1950s, his views changed; he realized that this early account was far too abstract, interiorized, and influenced by Cartesian assumptions.[6] It failed to engage the social, historical, and material conditions that invariably limit and constrain our freedom. He came to recognize that our choices and actions are always mediated by the world, by the sociohistorical situation we’ve been thrown into. He sees that the idea of radical, unconditioned freedom “is nonsense. The truth is that existence ‘is-in-society’ as it ‘is-in-the-world’” (Sartre 1952 [1963, 590]). Freedom must be understood as “freedom-in-situation.” It is true that we are free to create ourselves, but it is also true that we are already created by our situation. “Man,” is best understood as “a totally conditioned social being who does not render back completely what his conditioning has given him” (Sartre 1972 [2008, 35]).

Sartre’s Marxist inspired conception of situated or mediated freedom is one that had already been forwarded and developed by Beauvoir in her major treatises The Second Sex and The Coming of Age and in her novels such as The Blood of Others (1945 [1970]) and The Mandarins (1954 [1991]). The view is also developed by her compatriot Merleau-Ponty. In Phenomenology of Perception, for example, Merleau-Ponty makes it clear that the options we choose to act on do not emerge out of nothing. They are already embedded in a sociohistorical situation “before any personal decision has been made.” (1945 [1962, 449]) The ways in which we create or make ourselves, then, are always circumscribed by the meanings of our situation. We are simultaneously self-making and already made. “We exist in both ways at once,” writes Merleau-Ponty. “We choose the world, and the world chooses us.” (1945 [1962, 453–454]). As we will see in section 6.3, the recognition of the extent to which freedom is mediated by the material conditions of our situation opened existentialism to a broader engagement with the social sphere and the structures of oppression and violence that shape our experience and self-understanding.

5. Authenticity

Existentialism is well known for its critique of mass society and our tendency to conform to the levelled-down norms and expectations of the public. Rather than living our own lives, we tend to get pulled along by the crowd, doing what “they” do. As Heidegger writes, “We take pleasure and enjoy ourselves as they take pleasure. We read, see, and judge about literature and art as they see and judge … we find ‘shocking’ what they find shocking. The ‘they’… prescribes the kind of being of everydayness” (1927 [1962, 126–7]). Living this way can be comforting, creating the illusion that we are living well because we are doing what everyone else does. But for the existentialist, this conformist way of being is a manifestation of inauthenticity or self-deception because it shows how we are unwilling or unable to face up to the freedom and contingency of our condition; it reveals the extent to which we are afraid of being an individual, of being true to ourselves, and of making our own life-defining choices.

In The Sickness unto Death, Kierkegaard describes inauthenticity in terms of fleeing from ourselves, of “not wanting to be oneself, [of] wanting to be rid of oneself” (1849 [1989, 43]). Insofar as we let others decide our lives for us, we live a life that is bereft of passion, a life of “bloodless indolence,” where we are unwilling or unable to “make a real commitment.” (Kierkegaard 1846 [1946, 266–67]). Similarly, Heidegger will refer to this condition as a form of estrangement that “alienates Dasein from itself,” where we exist as a “they-self” (Man-selbst) that drifts along in lockstep with others. (1927 [1962, 254–55]) And this self-estrangement is numbing or “tranquilizing” (beruhigend) because it covers over the anxiety of own freedom and finitude.

Sartre and Beauvoir refer to inauthenticity in terms of “bad faith” (mauvaise foi), where we either deny or over-identify with one of the two aspects of human existence, either facticity or transcendence. I am in bad faith, for example, when I over-identify with my factical situation and deny my freedom to act on and transform this situation. I am also in bad faith when I over-identify with freedom and deny my past conduct and the fact that my choices are limited and constrained by my situation. Sartre and Beauvoir recognize that the self is never wholly free or wholly determined; it is structurally unstable, it is a “double- property … that is at once a facticity and a transcendence” (Sartre 1943 [1956, 98]). When we cling to one or the other of these poles, we are denying this “double-property,” and this is a denial of the fundamental ambiguity and instability at the core of the human condition.

5.1 The Power of Moods

For the existentialists, the possibility of breaking free from engrained patterns of self-deception is generally not something that is accomplished by means of detached reflection. It emerges in the wake of powerful emotional experiences or moods. When the existentialist refers to feelings of “nausea” (Sartre), “absurdity” (Camus), “anxiety” (Kierkegaard), “guilt” (Heidegger), or “mystery” (Marcel) they are describing uncanny affects that have the power to shake us out of our complacency, where the secure and familiar world breaks apart and collapses, and we are forced to confront the question of existence. Jaspers refers to these moments as “limit” or “boundary situations” (Grenzsituationen)—situations “when everything that is said to be valuable and true collapses before our eyes” (1932 [1956, 117]).

Although terrifying, the existentialist makes it clear that we should not close our eyes or flee from these experiences because they are structural to the human condition. They are, as Jaspers puts it, “impassable, unchangeable situations that belong to human existence as such” (1913 [1997, 330]). Instead of turning away from this basic anxiety, the existentialist asks us to turn toward and face it, because it is amidst a collapsing world that the ultimate questions emerge: Who am I? and What now? In this way, the existentialist sees the experience of anxiety and its related moods as an opportunity for personal growth and transformation. World-shattering moods open me up to the possibility of being authentic, of accepting and affirming the unsettling givens of my condition, of being released from distractions and trivialities, and of recognizing the self-defining projects that matter to me as an individual.

5.2 Kierkegaard’s Knight of Faith

For Kierkegaard, the authentic individual is someone that is “willing to be one’s own self.” (1843 [1989, 43]) He, she, or they recognize(s) that there is more to life than following the crowd or chasing surface pleasures. Such a life is invariably scattered and disjointed, pulled apart by temporal desires and the fleeting fads and fashions of the public. Authenticity requires a passionate, “personality defining” (personligheds definerende) decision or commitment that binds together and unifies the fragmented and disjointed moments of our life into a focused and coherent whole. The “unifying power” of commitment is embodied in, what Kierkegaard calls, an attitude of “earnestness” (alvor), a sober recognition that existence is a serious affair, not a pleasure-seeking masquerade. But authenticity cannot be achieved simply by means of renouncing temporal pleasures and doing one’s duty according to some universal moral principle—such as the Ten Commandments or Kant’s Categorical Imperative. This is because, for Kierkegaard, the subjective truth of the individual is higher than the universal truths of morality. And this means there may be times in our lives where we must suspend our obligation to the ethical sphere and accept the terrible fact that it may be more important to be authentic (to be true to oneself) than it is to be moral (to do what is right.)

In Fear and Trembling, Kierkegaard draws on the biblical figure of Abraham to make this point. As a father, Abraham has a moral duty to love and protect his son, but when God demands that he break this commandment and kill Isaac, he is confronted with a personal truth that is higher than the universal. In committing himself to this truth, Abraham becomes a “knight of faith” by “leaping” (springer) into a paradox, one where the truth of “the singular individual is higher than the universal” (1843 [1985, 84]). As a religious existentialist, Kierkegaard contends that this is what is required to enter the sphere of faith and become a Christian. It has nothing to do with membership in a congregation or obedience to doctrinal statements. It is, rather, a willingness to commit to a truth that is fundamentally irrational and absurd. How, for example, can one make rational sense of God’s command to Abraham to kill his own son? “The problem,” writes Kierkegaard, “is not to understand Christianity, but to understand that it cannot be understood” (1835–1854 [1959, 146]).[7] An authentic or religious life, then, is always accompanied by anxiety and loneliness because the leap individualizes us; it cuts us off from the comforting truths of the public and its blanket conceptions of right and wrong. It compels us to follow a path that no one else may understand. Abraham’s decision is, for this reason, fraught with despair. In his willingness to suspend his moral duty, he appears “insane” because he “cannot make himself understood to anyone.” (1985 (1843], 103)

But with the despair of faith comes feelings of intensity, even joy, as we recognize the absurdity of religious existence, that the eternal or divine is not found in some otherworldly realm, it is bound up in the temporal; that it is this life, the finite, that has infinite significance. Freed from the temptations of the crowd and of blind obedience to moral principles, the knight of faith “takes delight in everything he sees” because he is now fully aware of the majesty and richness of finitude. For him, “finitude tastes just as good as to one who has never known anything higher” (1843 [1985, 69–70]).

5.3 Nietzsche’s Overman

Like Kierkegaard, Nietzsche is critical of our tendency to follow the herd and cling to universal moral principles. He forwards a conception of authenticity that accepts our nihilistic predicament and rises above Christian values of good and evil. He sees these values as representative of a tame and submissive way of being, a “slave morality” (Sklavenmoral) that is subservient to authority and bereft of any originality or style. Nietzsche contrasts this with a “master morality” (Herrenmoral) embodied in those who have the courage to face, even affirm, the cruel and tragic aspects of life and the self-directed power to create their own meanings and values against the backdrop of God’s death. Nietzsche refers to the individual who can overcome the meek and slavish values of tradition for the sake of self-creation as an “Overman” (Übermensch), an aristocratic figure who embodies the freedom, courage, and strength to be original, that is, to “give style” to life. “Such spirits,” writes Nietzsche, “are always out of fashion or explain themselves and their surroundings as free nature—wild, arbitrary, fantastic, and surprising” (1887 [1974], §290).

The key to living with style is, for Nietzsche, a radical acceptance of one’s existence and the world as it is, embracing all our strengths and weaknesses and all the blessed and cursed events that have been and will be. The Overman is a “yes-sayer” who affirms every aspect of his life, “every truth, even the simple, bitter, ugly, unchristian, immoral truths” (1887 [1996], §1). In The Gay Science, Nietzsche captures this attitude with a famous thought experiment called the “doctrine of eternal recurrence.” Here, he asks if we have the audacity to live the same life we are living now over and over for eternity. “And there will be nothing new about it,” he explains, “but every pain and every pleasure, and every thought and sigh, and everything unspeakably small and great in your life must come back to you and all in the same series and sequence.” On Nietzsche’s view, most of us would recoil in horror at the prospect of eternally suffering through the same boredom, failures, and disappointments. But overflowing with amor fati (love of one’s fate), the Overman welcomes this possibility, proclaiming, “I have never heard anything more godlike” (1887 [1974], §341). Camus describes this attitude as a form of rebellion against servile and conformist ways of being. Like the Overman, “the rebel” is someone “born of abundance and fullness of spirit,” and he embodies “the unreserved affirmation of human imperfection and suffering, of evil and murder, of all that is problematic and strange in our existence. It is born of an arrested wish to be what one is in a world that is what it is” (1951 [1956, 72]).

But not everyone has the inborn power to rebel against tradition and creatively express their unique style of living. For Nietzsche, only “the highest types” can manifest this kind of freedom and capacity for self-overcoming. To this end, his account of authenticity is unapologetically elitist and anti-democratic. Most of us are too mired in self-deception, too frightened and weak to break with the herd and become who we are. “Only a very few people can be free,” writes Nietzsche, “It is a prerogative of the strong” (1886 [1998], §29).

5.4 Heidegger’s Resolute Dasein

Heidegger devotes much of the second half of Being and Time to an analysis of authenticity, employing the German term Eigentlichkeit—formed from the stem of the adjective eigen (“own” or “property”)—that literally means “being own’s own” or “ownnness.” But he sets up his analysis of authenticity by first claiming that self-deception or “inauthenticity” is unavoidable; it is a structure of the human condition, one that he refers to as “falling” (Verfallen). What this means is that in our everyday lives we invariably conform (or “fall prey”) to the norms and values of the public world. This results in a kind of complacency and indifference about the question of existence, where we are not our own selves, where “everyone is the other, and no one is himself” (1927 [1962, 128]). Falling creates the illusion that our existence (or being-in-the-world) is secure and thing-like because we are doing what everyone else does. But, for Heidegger, there is nothing that fundamentally secures our existence. As a self-making activity, I am not a stable thing. I am nothing, a “not yet” (noch nicht) that is always unsettled, always in the process of making myself. The awareness of our own unsettledness emerges in moments of anxiety when the familiar and routinized world “collapses into itself” (1927 [1962, 186]), and I “die” (sterben) because I am no longer able-to-be, that is, to understand or make sense of who I am.[8]

Like Kierkegaard, Heidegger interprets anxiety as an individualizing mood, one that momentarily “snatches one back” from the tranquilizing routines of “the They,” leaving us vulnerable and exposed to confront our lives (1927 [1962, 384]). And this is potentially liberating because it can temporarily free us from patterns of self-deception, providing insight, a “moment of vision” (Augenblick) that can give our lives a renewed sense of urgency and focus. But this experience of individuation does not detach me from the world, turning me into a radical subject or “free floating ‘I’” (1927 [1962, 298]). Heidegger claims that our self-defining choices are always guided in advance by our historical embeddedness, what he calls “historicity” (Geschichtlichkeit). The meanings we choose to give to our lives, then, are not created out of thin air; they have already been interpreted and made intelligible by a historical community or “people” (Volk).[9] The moment of vision shakes me out of my fallen, everyday existence and allows me to come back to my historical world with fresh eyes, to seize hold of the publicly interpreted meanings that matter to me and make them “mine” (Jemeinig).

Heidegger refers to this authentic attitude in terms of “resoluteness” (Entschlossenheit), where I “pull [myself] together,” giving life a sense of cohesion and focus that was missing when I was lost and scattered in “the They.” But being resolute does not mean that I stubbornly cling to whatever possibilities I happen to choose. For Heidegger, authenticity demands an openness and flexibility with how I interpret myself.[10] Understanding that existence is a situated process of self-making, whatever values or meanings I commit myself to, I must also be willing to let go or give up on them depending on the circumstances of my life, that is, to “hold [myself] free for the possibility of taking it back” (1927 [1962, 308]). Resoluteness, on this view, does not mean “becoming rigid” and holding fast to a chosen identity because my self-understanding is always insecure; it can die at any time. For this reason, authenticity requires “readiness” or “anticipation” (Vorgriff), where we passionately hold ourselves open and free for the inescapable breakdowns and emergencies of life. It is, in Heidegger’s words, “an impassioned freedom towards death—a freedom which has been released from the illusions of the ‘They’” (1927 [1962, 266]).

5.5 Self-Recovery in Sartre and Beauvoir

Sartre and Beauvoir follow Heidegger in viewing self-deception as structural to the human condition. It is, as Sartre writes, “an immediate, permanent threat to every project of the human being” (1943 [1956, 116]). Although I can certainly deceive myself by over-identifying with freedom and denying the extent to which my possibilities are constrained by facticity, the most common and familiar form of bad faith is when I over-identify with my facticity, as if I were a fully realized object or thing, a being “in-itself” (en-soi). This form of self-deception is understandable as it creates the consoling impression that there is something secure and thing-like about my identity, that “I am what I am,” and there is nothing that can change me. But to live this way is to deny my freedom and transcendence, that I am self-making, that I live for myself—or, in the vernacular of Sartre and Beauvoir, “for-itself” (pour-soi). Human beings are, on their view, always in the process of making or constituting themselves, modifying and negating their being through moment-to-moment choices and actions. This means my identity is never fixed or stable because I can always choose to take a new path or interpret myself in other ways. Regardless of how I see myself at a given time—as a professor, a father, or a political activist—I am also “not” that person, because my identity is never realized and complete; I am always free to negate a given identity and define myself differently in the future. This means I am “what I am not” (1943 [1956, 103]). And this situation appears to undermine the prospect of authenticity altogether. If the self is always unstable, always in question, how can I ever be genuine or true to myself?

In Being and Nothingness, Sartre provides an answer, referring to authenticity in terms of a “recovery” (récupération) of a self or way of being “that was previously corrupted” (1943 [1956, 116]).[11] But this act of “self-recovery” has nothing to do with creating or holding on to a particular identity. It involves, rather, a clear-eyed awareness and acceptance of the instability and ambiguity of the human condition. And, along with this acceptance, a willingness to act in the face of this ambiguity and to take responsibility, however horrible, for wherever these actions might lead. As Sartre writes, “authenticity consists in a lucid consciousness of the situation, in assuming the responsibilities and risks it involves, in accepting it […] sometimes with horror and hate” (1946 [1948, 90]). But just because existence is fundamentally ambiguous does not mean that our chosen projects are meaningless or absurd. My projects have meaning and value because I chose these projects, but the meaning is contingent; it is never enduring or stable. In The Ethics of Ambiguity, Beauvoir explains: “The notion of ambiguity must not be confused with that of absurdity. To declare that existence is absurd is to deny that it can ever be given a meaning; to say that it is ambiguous is to assert that its meaning is never fixed” (1947 [1948, 129]). The point of authenticity, then, is not to be concerned with who I am—because, at bottom, I am nothing. It is to be concerned with what I do. As Sartre writes, “Authenticity reveals that the only meaningful project is that of doing (not that of being)” (1948 [1992, 475]). For Sartre and Beauvoir, to be authentic is to recover and accept the ambiguous tension of the self, that: we are who we are not—and—we are not who are. And by means of this recovery, recognize that the task of existence involves acting and doing, that is, realizing our freedom through projects in the world but also, as we will see, taking responsibility for how these projects might enhance or diminish freedom for others.

6. Ethics

Existentialist ethics generally begins with the idea that there is no external moral order or table of values that exists a priori. “It must be understood,” as Beauvoir writes in The Ethics of Ambiguity, “that the passion in which man has acquiesced finds no external justification. No outside appeal, no objective necessity permits of its being called useful.” But this does not mean that the existentialists are promoting a form of moral nihilism. Beauvoir admits it is true that the human being “has no reason to will itself. But this does not mean that it cannot justify itself, that it cannot give itself reasons for being that it does not have.” It is human existence itself “which makes values spring up in the world on the basis of which it will be able to judge the enterprise in which it will be engaged.” (1947 [1948, 12, 15]).[12] There is, then, a coherent account of ethical responsibility grounded in freedom, not as a theoretical abstraction but as a concrete expression of transcendence, and the obligation to help others realize their own freedom so that I can realize mine. When I acknowledge that freedom is my essence, I must also acknowledge that it is the essence of others and work, to the best of my ability, to help them realize it. My freedom, then, is not free-floating; it is invariably bound up in the freedom of others. As Sartre puts it: “We want freedom for freedom’s sake and in every particular circumstance. And in wanting freedom we discover that it depends entirely on the freedom of others, and that freedom of others depends on ours […] I am obliged to want others to have freedom at the same time that I want my own freedom” (1945 [2001, 306]).

6.1 Authentic Being-for-Others

Sartre and Beauvoir argue that we generally exist as “a being-for-others” (un être-pour-autrui), which is to say that I understand or see myself in the way that I do through “the look” (le regard) of the Other. And the look has the power to strip away my freedom and turn me into an object. Human relations, on this account, are best understood as a form of conflict, a dyadic power struggle where I try to assert my freedom and subjectivity by turning the Other into an object, while the Other tries to do the same to me. “While I attempt to free myself from the hold of the Other,” writes Sartre, “the Other is trying to free himself from mine; while I seek to enslave the Other, the Other seeks to enslave me… Conflict is the original meaning of being-for-others” (1943 [1956, 475]). This struggle for self-assertion leads to Sartre’s famous claim in his play Huis Clos (No Exit) that “Hell is—other people” (1944 [1989, 45]).

But the struggle to objectify and possess the Other by stripping them of their freedom is a manifestation of inauthentic being-for-others. There is an authentic counterpart. Beauvoir, for example, explores what it means to develop and cultivate freedom for others with her account of “authentic love” (l’amour authentique), describing it as a relationship where we acknowledge and nurture the other’s freedom and transcendence while at the same time resisting the temptations of bad faith, that is, to see the Other as an object or thing to be manipulated and possessed. As a moral stance, authentic being-for-others is a form of reciprocity that involves “the mutual recognition of two freedoms […] [where] neither would give up transcendence [and] neither would be mutilated” (1949 [1952, 667]). In this way authenticity and morality belong together, whereby we have a shared obligation to liberate or free each other so that we can create ourselves and take responsibility for the life we lead. Therefore, as Beauvoir puts it, “to will oneself moral and to will oneself free are one and the same decision” (1947 [1948, 24]).

Heidegger develops a similar idea in Being and Time with his account of “liberating concern” (befreiend Fürsorge), a form of care where the central aim is to free the Other from patterns of self-deception so that they can anxiously face and create their own existence. It is a relational stance that “helps the Other become transparent to himself in his care and to become free for it” (1927 [1962, 122]). When we care in this way, we resist the temptation to “leap-in” (einspringen) for the Other, as if the Other were a dependent thing or object that needs to be sheltered from the unsettling question of existence. Heidegger refers to this sheltering tendency in terms of a kind of tacit mastery or “domination” (Beherrschung) that strips the Other of the anxious responsibility they have for their own life. Instead of leaping-in for the Other and disburdening them of their responsibility, an authentic relation is one that “leaps-ahead” (vorausspringt) of the Other, giving them back their anxiety and the freedom to care for and confront their condition. As Heidegger writes, we leap-ahead of the Other, “not in order to take away his ‘care’ but rather to give it back to them authentically as such for the first time” (1927 [1962, 122]). Here, we see the development of an ethical maxim: to act in such a way as to will the realization of your own freedom and the realization of freedom for others.

6.2 The Ethics of Recognition

There is also heterodox current among some religious existentialists, one that suggests that moral demands are placed on us when we recognize ourselves not as voluntaristic subjects—or, in the words of Iris Murdoch, “brave naked wills” (1983, 46) severed from bonds of community and attachment—but as relational beings who are fundamentally bound together in mutual vulnerability. And this recognition may serve as the foundation for an ethics by pulling us out of our everyday self-absorption and awakening us, not to our freedom, but to our essential dependency.

Speaking through the religious elder Father Zossima in The Brothers Karamazov, Dostoevsky offers a powerful indictment of the “terrible individualism” that he sees as endemic to modernity, where unfettered freedom and self-affirmation have become the highest values. Such a view leads not to self-actualization but to loneliness and despair. The modern man, says Zossima, “is accustomed to rely upon himself alone and to cut himself off from the whole; he has trained himself not to believe in the help of others, in men and in humanity […] but this terrible individualism must inevitably have an end, and all will suddenly understand how unnaturally they are separated from one another” (1879 [1957–80, 279]). Against the vision of the willful subject who makes choices without evaluative limits or constraints, Dostoevsky suggests it is only in recognizing the Other as dependent and vulnerable that we can come to recognize ourselves. True freedom emerges when we release ourselves from the bondage of our own egoistic striving and adopt an attitude of humility and self-sacrifice. The aim is to show that the human being is not an isolated will but a frail and defenseless being that is dependent on the self-less love, compassion, and charity of others.[13] When we free ourselves from the temptations of individualism in this way, Zossima says a moral demand is placed on us, one where we begin to see that “we are all responsible to all and for all” (1879–80 [1957, 228).

The Jewish existentialist Martin Buber expands on this idea in his masterwork I and Thou. He claims that in our everyday lives we generally relate to others from an instrumental and objectifying standpoint, what he calls the “I-It” (Ich-Es) relation, where the other is encountered as a thing (or “it”) to be manipulated and controlled for one’s own use. This relation is comforting because it creates the illusion that we have control of our situation. But there are moments in our lives when this illusion collapses, and we become vulnerable to the other, not as an “it” but as a “you.” In the “I-You” (Ich-Du) relation, all the egoistic defenses we rely on to conceal our essential dependency and openness to the Other break down. Buber refers to this as an experience of grace, where the Other is revealed to me as a whole person, defenseless and exposed, and I am revealed in the same way. It is a moment where “two human beings reveal the You to one another” (1923 [1970, 95]). In this way, anxiety isn’t a radically individualizing affair, where the forlorn subject is cut off from the relational world to confront their own freedom. For Buber, exposure to the I-You relation shakes us out of our own egoistic concerns and awakens us to the fact that we are not isolated individuals but beings who are always in living relation with others. With this experience “the barriers of the individual are breached,” and this creates an affective union, a “bridge from self-being to self-being across the abyss of dread” (1938 [1965], 201, 207]).

6.3 The Ethics of Engagement

The Nazi occupation of France, his own experience as a prisoner of war, and the attacks on his philosophy from influential Marxist critics, compelled Sartre to shift his focus from the individual to the social. Following the war, he, along with Merleau-Ponty and Beauvoir, launched the influential journal of social criticism Le Temps Modernes (Modern Times), and Sartre made his aims clear in the first issue, writing: “Our intention is to help effect certain changes in the Society that surrounds us… one is responsible for what one is … Totally committed and totally freed. And yet it is the free man who must be delivered, by enlarging his possibilities of choice” (Sartre 1945 [1988, 264–65]). Here we see existentialists making the connection that for the Other to realize their freedom, philosophy must engage the “bases and structures” that limit and constrain them. This is because these structures are not philosophical abstractions; they “are lived as schematic determinates of the individual’s future” (Sartre 1957 [1968, 94]). Society, here, is viewed not as an aggregate of voluntaristic subjects; it is the mediating background of our lives, and if we are going to create a situation of freedom and “enlarge the possibilities of choice,” we must recognize how this background can be violent and oppressive—especially to historically marginalized and undervalued people—and to act in such a way as to transform it.

Of all the major developers of existentialism, it is unquestionably Beauvoir who offered the most sustained and influential analyses of oppression and of possibilities for emancipation, not only in her feminist masterwork The Second Sex, but in her bleak account of the dehumanization of the elderly in The Coming of Age (1970 [1996]) and her reflections on the experience of Black populations in the Jim Crow South in her memoir America Day by Day (1954 [1999]). In these works, Beauvoir illuminates how socioeconomic and political structures can restrict the human capacity for freedom and transcendence, how they have the power to “freeze” the Other, strip away possibilities for agency and self-creation, and trap them in “immanence.” But in these works, Beauvoir makes it clear that this situation is not a destiny. Human beings have no essential nature; no one is born inferior or submissive. We are constituted intersubjectively by growing into, internalizing, and enacting ready-made structures of oppression. But insofar as these structures are constituted and maintained by the choices and actions of individuals, they are not fixed and static. Like human beings, they too are subject to change. Here we see how the recognition that existence precedes essence moves from the ontological realm to the ethical, it becomes a call to action, to engage and transform the material conditions that limit the possibilities of choice for those who are oppressed and marginalized.

In this way, postwar existentialism began to engage the realities of the social sphere and the painful “isms”—classism, racism, colonialism, sexism, anti-Semitism—haunting the western world. It was a philosophy that had come to recognize, in Sartre’s words, that “the individual interiorizes his social determinations; he interiorizes the relations of production, the family of his childhood, the historical past, the contemporary in institutions, and he then re-exteriorizes these acts and options which necessarily refer us back to them” (1972 [2008, 35]). And insofar as these social determinations are not fixed and timeless but contingent human constructs, they can be resisted and transformed to free others.

7. Contemporary Relevance

Existentialism has had a profound impact on how philosophers conceptualize and understand the human condition, with rich accounts of affectivity and embodiment, facticity (or worldliness), and the ways in which we are constituted intersubjectively. It has opened new paths for philosophy to engage with concrete and acute human problems, from sexuality, race, disability, and old age to broader issues of social and political violence and oppressive relations in general. And the movement continues to thrive in the academy today. Not only is the Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy (SPEP) flourishing as the second largest philosophical organization in the English-speaking world, with smaller research groups (or “Circles”) devoted to every major figure. There is a cascade of scholarship published every year in leading journals and academic presses that captures the enduring relevance of existentialist thought, including important new work engaging the significance of French existentialism as an ethical theory (Webber 2018), reframing our conceptions of virtue and human flourishing (McMullin 2019), and even addressing current analytic debates in philosophies of life-extension, anti-natalism, and transhumanism (Buben 2022). Indeed, the core ideas and major figures of existentialism are not just alive and well; they are shaping developments in a diverse range of areas across the humanities and social sciences.

7.1 Post-Structuralism

The legacy is most clearly present in the European philosophies that proceeded it. Existentialism’s critique of foundationalism and the authority of reason as well as its rejection of universalism, essentialism, and “grand narratives” (or metanarratives) all had a decisive impact on post-structural philosophies in France. Nietzsche and Heidegger in particular served as decisive influences on the project of “de-centering the subject” in Jacques Derrida’s method of deconstruction and in Michel Foucault’s genealogy of power, demonstrating how the subject is not the privileged center or origin of truth and knowledge. The subject is, rather, shaped in advance by sociohistorical structures, an overlapping network of norms and practices, linguistic conventions, and shared meanings, and this shaping takes place in a way that we are never fully conscious of.[14] The individual, on this view, is more of a placeholder or crossing point in these anonymous structures, where the subject exists as “the inscribed surface of events […] totally imprinted by history” (Foucault 1977, 148). Of course, existentialists reject the idea that this historical imprinting or “decentering” is total or absolute. They are, after all, still committed to the value of freedom and authenticity, but they recognize that freedom is never unconditioned. Beyond the philosophies of Heidegger and Nietzsche, we see this recognition in Merleau-Ponty’s conception of mediated freedom, in Sartre’s postwar account of “freedom-in-situation,” and in what Beauvoir calls “la force des choses” (the power of circumstances). The recognition of historicity as an impersonal force that structures our identity had such an impact on Foucault’s work that he once remarked: “My entire philosophical development was determined by my reading of Heidegger” (Foucault 1985, cited in Dreyfus 1995, 9).

7.2 Narrative and Hermeneutic Philosophy

In viewing the self not as a substance or thing but as a self-interpreting, meaning-giving activity that is always already bound up in the world, existentialism has also informed key developments in narrative and hermeneutic philosophy. Prominent anglophone philosophers such as Harry Frankfurt (1971), Charles Taylor (1985), and Alasdair MacIntyre (1981) have drawn on classical existentialism to illuminate how we exist in the meanings and self-interpretations that we create for ourselves. My sense of who I am is constituted by an ongoing process of choosing, pulling together, and consolidating the roles, projects, and meanings that matter to me and that are made available by the sociohistorical situation I find myself in. On this view, the story I create for myself is held together by the narrative unity and cohesion that I give to it. This is what Taylor means when he says that we can only understand or “grasp our lives in a narrative” (1989, 47). And this conception of narrative identity not only offers a response to overly reductive conceptions of the self that are grounded in the substance ontologies of mind and body; it demonstrates an attentiveness to the ambiguous tension of our condition, that our choices are both self-fashioning and socially embedded, that we simultaneously make ourselves and are already made.

7.3 Philosophy of Mind and Cognitive Science

Beginning with Hubert Dreyfus’s (1972) groundbreaking critique of Artificial Intelligence (AI), philosophers of mind and cognitive scientists have been drawing on existentialist philosophy—especially Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty—to challenge the overly mentalistic picture of selfhood and agency that modern philosophy inherits from Descartes and Kant and to dismantle traditional representational theories of knowledge. Key works by Shaun Gallagher (2005), Thomas Fuchs, (2018), and Dan Zahavi (2005) have replaced the picture of the disembodied mind with the now widely accepted notion of the embedded, enactive, and embodied self. This is a rejection of the long-held assumption that human action must somehow be represented or “mirrored” in the mind. Existentialism illuminates how—as a situated way of being-in-the-world—human beings already embody a tacit understanding of the world in a way that we are not and can never be thematically conscious of. This means we do not understand things as discrete objects. We understand things in terms of how we use and handle them and in terms of the purposive, meaning-giving roles these things play in our everyday lives. The traditional view of the mind as something resembling the rule-governed processes of a computer program have continually failed to capture this ambiguous and embodied sense of being-in-the-world.

7.4 Critical Phenomenology

The attentiveness to conditions of oppression, subjugation, and violence among postwar existentialists in France has had a decisive impact on recent developments in critical phenomenology by giving voice to those who have been historically marginalized or undervalued in the western tradition. Beauvoir’s pioneering account of the woman’s experience in The Second Sex is well known for laying the conceptual foundations for second wave feminism, and her late career phenomenology of aging broke new ground by shedding light on the existence of older persons and exposing the toxic ageism in contemporary capitalist societies. Together with Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, her ideas would inform Franz Fanon’s Black Skin, White Masks (1952 [1967]), a seminal work that disclosed the dehumanizing experience of colonized Black populations and helped give birth to Africana critical theory or “black existentialism” (Gordon 2000). The focus on the ways in which structures of discrimination along with the limits of our own embodiment can constrain our capacities for freedom and transcendence has, in turn, influenced recent phenomenological accounts of intersectionality and the lived experience of, among others, indigenous peoples, immigrants, and exiles (Coulthard 2014; Ortega 2016), queer and trans identities (Ahmed 2006; Salamon 2010), those who are imprisoned or in solitary confinement (Guenther 2013; Leder 2016), and the elderly, disabled, and chronically ill (Aho 2022; Reynolds 2022; Dickel 2022).

7.5 Comparative and Environmental Philosophy

Interpreting existence in terms of the situated activity of being-in-the-world not only serves as a rejection of substance ontology and the metaphysical dualisms (subject-object; mind-body; inner-outer) that we inherit from Cartesian and empiricist epistemologies; it also reveals deep affinities with the nonduality of Buddhism and other incarnations of Eastern thought. (Loy 2018; Kalmanson 2020) And the recognition of our enmeshment in the world has informed a range of important advances in the philosophy of place, deep ecology, and eco-phenomenology (Brown & Toadvine 2003; Malpas 2017; Morton 2016; Rentmeester 2016). These endeavors have exposed the limitations of the scientific worldview and our uncritical dependence on technological innovation to address the current ecological crisis. Modern science generally assumes a binary paradigm of the subject as separate and distinct from a value-less domain of objects (or nature), a domain that can, in turn, be mastered and controlled by technoscience. In this way, it betrays our ordinary experience, that in our day-to-day lives we are not atomistic, self-certain subjects but beings that are fundamentally entwined with the world and the meaning and value that this intertwining brings to our experience. For the existentialist, then, extricating ourselves from environmental doom requires not a technoscientific fix but an ontological transformation in our own self-understanding, an awaking to the reality of our interdependence with nature, that the earth is not apart from us but rather part of us.

7.6 Philosophy of Health and Illness

Outside of the humanities and social sciences, existentialism has also had a deep and lasting impact on the allied health professions. The role it has played in the development of existential and humanistic approaches to psychotherapy (Cooper 2003; Spinneli 2007; van Deurzen 2015) and to phenomenological psychopathology (Parnas & Gallagher 2015; Ratcliffe 2015; Stanghellini et al. 2019) is well-known, but in recent years we have seen its influence emerge in a range of different areas, from narrative medicine to nursing, and from gerontology to palliative care. To this end, existentialism has informed a move away from the reductive and objectifying tendencies of modern biomedicine to recover the first-person experience of health and illness, viewing the body not so much as a biophysical machine that needs to be adjusted and maintained but as the experiential and interpretative medium of our existence. This shift has not only allowed clinicians to challenge the emergent tendency to medicalize ever-expanding swaths of the human condition; it makes it possible for the clinician to better understand the patient’s experience by getting a sense of “what it means” and “what it feels like” to suffer when the body breaks down (Aho 2018; Slatman 2014; Svenaeus 2022; Zeiler & Käll 2014).

7.7 A New Generation

Beyond its ascendency in the healing arts, its myriad cultural influences, and its wide-ranging impact on the humanities and social sciences, the enduring legacy of existentialism is perhaps most visible in the classroom. Existentialist-themed courses are often among the most popular in the philosophy curriculum as young students confront, for the first time, the unsettling questions of freedom and the meaning of their own existence. And these questions have never been more pressing as they develop against the backdrop of anthropogenic climate change, species extinction, global pandemics, and the reemergence of authoritarian and fascist politics. Amidst these planetary emergencies, a new generation is facing the predicament of nihilism and the death of God and owning up to the uncanny truth of the human condition: that existence precedes essence.


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