Edmund Husserl

First published Fri Feb 28, 2003; substantive revision Mon Oct 17, 2022

Edmund Husserl was the principal founder of phenomenology—and thus one of the most influential philosophers of the 20th century. He has made important contributions to almost all areas of philosophy and anticipated central ideas of its neighbouring disciplines such as linguistics, sociology and cognitive psychology.

1. Life and work

Husserl was born in Prossnitz (Moravia) on April 8th, 1859. His parents were non-orthodox Jews; Husserl himself and his wife would later convert to Protestantism. They had three children, one of whom died in World War I. In the years 1876–78 Husserl studied astronomy in Leipzig, where he also attended courses of lectures in mathematics, physics and philosophy. Among other things, he heard Wilhelm Wundt’s lectures on philosophy. (Wundt was the originator of the first institute for experimental psychology.) Husserl’s mentor was Thomas Masaryk, a former student of Brentano’s, who was later to become the first president of Czechoslovakia. In 1878–81 Husserl continued his studies in mathematics, physics and philosophy in Berlin. His mathematics teachers there included Leopold Kronecker and Karl Weierstrass, whose scientific ethos Husserl was particularly impressed with. However, he took his PhD in mathematics in Vienna (January 1883), with a thesis on the theory of variations (Variationstheorie). After that he returned to Berlin, to become Weierstrass’ assistant. When Weierstrass got seriously ill, Masaryk suggested that Husserl go back to Vienna, to study philosophy with Franz Brentano, the author of Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874). After a brief military service in Vienna, Husserl followed Masaryk’s advice and studied with Brentano from 1884–86. Brentano’s lectures on psychology and logic had a lasting impact on Husserl, as had his general vision of a strictly scientific philosophy. Brentano then recommended Husserl to his pupil Carl Stumpf in Halle, who is perhaps best known for his Psychology of Tone (two volumes, 1883/90). This recommendation enabled Husserl to prepare and submit his habilitation dissertation On the Concept of Number (1887) with Stumpf.

That thesis was later integrated into Husserl’s first published monograph, Philosophy of Arithmetic, which appeared in 1891. In this work, Husserl combined his mathematical, psychological and philosophical competencies to attempt a psychological foundation of arithmetic (see Willard 1984, pp. 38–118; Bell 1990, pp. 31–84). The book was, however, criticized for its underlying psychologism in a review by Gottlob Frege. It seems that Husserl took that criticism very seriously (see Føllesdal 1958), although it is far from clear that the author of Philosophy of Arithmetic regards logic as a branch of psychology, as “strong psychologism” (Mohanty 1982, p. 20) has it. In any case, Husserl sharply attacked that kind of psychologism (raising about eighteen objections in total; see Soldati 1994, pp. 117 ff) and developed the philosophical method he is nowadays famous for: phenomenology.

In 1900/01 his first phenomenological work was published in two volumes, titled Logical Investigations. The first volume contains a forceful attack against psychologism, whereas the (much larger) second volume consists of six “descriptive-psychological” and “epistemological” investigations into (I) expression and meaning, (II) universals, (III) the formal ontology of parts and wholes (mereology), (IV) the “syntactical” and mereological structure of meaning, (V) the nature and structure of intentionality as well as (VI) the interrelation of truth, intuition and cognition. Husserl now adheres to a version of platonism that he derived from ideas of Hermann Lotze and especially Bernard Bolzano, where he embeds platonism about meaning and mental content in a theory of intentional consciousness (see Beyer 1996).

In the first decade of the 20th century, Husserl considerably refined and modified his method into what he called “transcendental phenomenology”. This method has us focus on the essential structures that allow the objects naively taken for granted in the “natural attitude” (which is characteristic of both our everyday life and ordinary science) to “constitute themselves” in consciousness. (Among those who influenced him in this regard are Descartes, Hume and Kant.) As Husserl explains in detail in his second major work, Ideas (1913), the resulting perspective on the realm of intentional consciousness is supposed to enable the phenomenologist to develop a radically unprejudiced justification of his (or her) basic views on the world and himself and explore their rational interconnections.

Husserl developed these ideas in Göttingen, where—thanks to his Logical Investigations and the support by Wilhelm Dilthey, who admired that work and recommended Husserl to the Prussian ministry of culture—he received an associate professorship (“Extraordinariat”, later turned into a “Persönliches Ordinariat”) in 1901. From 1910/11 and 1913, respectively, he served as founding (co-)editor of Logos (in the first issue of which his programmatic article “Philosophy as a Rigorous Science” appeared, containing a critique of naturalism) and of the Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Research (opening with his Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy). Husserl stayed in Göttingen until 1916. It is here that he made his most important philosophical discoveries (cf. Mohanty 1995), such as the transcendental-phenomenological method, the phenomenological structure of time-consciousness, the fundamental role of the notion of intersubjectivity in our conceptual system, the horizon-structure of our singular empirical thought, and more. In later works—most notably in On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1928), Formal and Transcendental Logic (1929), Cartesian Meditations (1931), The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology (1954) and Experience and Judgement (1939)—these results were developed further and put into new contexts, such as the path-breaking project of linking the basic notions of science back to their conceptual roots in the pre-scientific (regions of the) “lifeworld” (Crisis).

In the year 1916 Husserl became Heinrich Rickert’s successor as full professor (“Ordinarius”) in Freiburg/Breisgau, where (among many other things) he worked on passive synthesis (cf. Husserliana, vol. XI, XXXI). He gave four lectures on Phenomenological Method and Phenomenological Philosophy at University College, London, in 1922 (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXV). In 1923 he received a call to Berlin, which he rejected. Husserl retired in 1928, his successor being his (and Rickert’s) former assistant Martin Heidegger (whose major work Being and Time had been published in Husserl’s Yearbook in 1927). In 1929 he accepted an invitation to Paris. His lectures there were published as Cartesian Meditations in 1931. In the same year, Husserl gave a number of talks on “Phenomenology and Anthropology”, in which he criticized his two “antipodes”, Heidegger and Max Scheler (cf. Husserl 1997). In 1933 Hitler took over in Germany. Husserl received a call to Los Angeles but rejected. Because of his Jewish ancestors, he became more and more humiliated and isolated. In 1935 he gave a series of invited lectures in Prague, resulting in his last major work, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology.

Edmund Husserl died on April 27, 1938 in Freiburg. His manuscripts (more than 40000 pages in total) were rescued by the Franciscan Herman Leo Van Breda, who brought them to Leuven (Belgium), where the first Husserl archive was founded in 1939. (Today, there are further archives in Freiburg, Cologne, Paris, New York and Pittsburgh.) Since 1950 the Husserl archives are editing Husserl’s collected works, Husserliana.

2. Pure logic, meaning, intuitive fulfillment and intentionality

As a philosopher with a mathematical background, Husserl was interested in developing a general theory of inferential systems, which (following Bolzano) he conceived of as a theory of science, on the ground that every science (including mathematics) can be looked upon as a system of propositions that are interconnected by a set of inferential and grounding relations. Following John S. Mill, he argues in Logical Investigations that the best way to study the nature of such propositional systems is to start with their linguistic manifestations, i.e., (sets of) sentences and (assertive) utterances thereof.

How are we to analyse these sentences and the propositions they express? Husserl’s approach is to study the units of consciousness that the respective speaker presents himself as having—that he “gives voice to”—in expressing the proposition in question (for instance, while writing a mathematical textbook or giving a lecture). These units of consciousness he labels intentional acts or intentional experiences, since they always represent something as something—thus exhibiting what Brentano called intentionality. According to Husserl, there are non-intentional units of consciousness as well. (He quotes pain as an example.) What distinguishes intentional from non-intentional experiences is the former’s having intentional content.

Even objectless (i.e., empty) intentional experiences like your thought of the winged horse Pegasus have content. On Husserl’s view, that thought simply lacks a corresponding object; the intentional act is “merely as of”, but not really of, an object. Husserl rejects “representationalist” accounts of intentionality, such as the mental image theory, according to which intentional experiences represent intra-mental pictorial representations of objects, where like other pictures such images may exist without there being a depicted object in the actual world. For Husserl, this view leads to a “false duplication” of objects represented in the veridical case; and it already presupposes what an adequate conception of pictorial representation is yet to accomplish: an explanation of what it is that makes the underlying “phantasy content”, or phantasm, “the [r]epresenting image of something or other” (Husserl 1994, p. 347; Husserliana, vol. XXII, pp. 305f). It is precisely an intentional content that does the trick here (as in all cases of intentional consciousness), according to Husserl, in a way to be explained in more detail by his phenomenology of consciousness.

In the case of propositional acts, i.e., units of consciousness that can be given voice to by a complete sentence (paradigmatically, a declarative sentence), Husserl identifies their content with the propositional meaning expressed by that sentence. In the case of their non-propositional but still intentional parts, he identifies the corresponding intentional content with a sub-propositional meaning. For example, the judgement “Napoleon is a Frenchman” contains an act of thinking of Napoleon whose intentional content is the sub-propositional meaning expressed by the name “Napoleon”. (Accordingly, the judgement can be looked upon as an act of ascribing the property of being French to the referent of that name.) Experiences like this, which can be given voice to by either a singular or a general term, are called “nominal acts” (as opposed to the propositional acts containing them). Their contents are called “nominal meanings”.

Husserl regards both propositional and nominal meanings as the subject-matter of “pure logic” or “logic in the wide sense”—the study of (i) what distinguishes sense (alias meaning) from nonsense (this part of pure logic being called “pure grammar”) and (ii) which of the senses delivered by pure grammar are logically consistent and which of them are not (this part of pure logic being labelled “logic in the narrow sense”).

An important and still largely unexplored claim of Husserl’s is that any logically consistent meaning can in principle be subjectively fulfilled, more or less adequately, by a unified intuition, such as an act of continuous perception or intuitive imagination, where the structure and other essential features of the meaning in question can be read off from the respective mode of intuitive fulfillment. Inconsistent meanings can be singled out and studied by means of (reflection upon) corresponding experiences of intuitive conflict, like for instance the discrete switching back and forth between a duck-head-imagination and a rabbit-head-imagination in the case of an attempted intuitive imagination of a duck-head that is at the same time a rabbit-head. Some meanings are inconsistent for formal-logical reasons. According to Husserl, all analytically false propositions belong to this category. Other meanings are inconsistent because they conflict with some general material a priori truth, also called “essential law”. The proposition expressed by the sentence “There are perceptual objects whose surface is both (visibly) completely green and completely red at the same time” is a case in point.

Meanings generally and propositions in particular exist independently of their actually functioning as intentional content. Thus, true propositions such as the Pythagorean theorem can be discovered. Propositions and their components are abstract, i.e., atemporal, objects. However, what does it mean to grasp a proposition or, more generally, a sense? How can an abstract object become the content of an intentional act? Combining ideas of Bolzano and Lotze, Husserl answers this question by taking recourse to the notion of an ideal (i.e., abstract) species or type, as follows. Propositions and other meanings are ideal species that can be (but do not have to be) instantiated by certain particular features, i.e., dependent parts, of intentional acts. Those species are also called “ideal matters”. The particular features instantiating an ideal matter—Husserl refers to them as “moments of matter”—are laid bare by phenomenological description, a reflection-based (or introspective) analysis taking into account both the linguistic expression(s) (if any) and the modes of (possible) intuitive fulfillment or conflict associated with the respective experience.

Since phenomenological description yields ideal species, it involves what Husserl was later (notably in Ideas) to call “eidetic reduction”, i.e., an unfolding of abstract features shared by appropriate sets of fictitious or real-life examples, by way, e.g., of free imaginative variation on an arbitrarily chosen initial example (for the method of “free variation”, see Experience and Judgement, sec. 87).

Phenomenological description also yields the “moment of quality” of the intentional experience under investigation, i.e., the particular feature instantiating its psychological mode (judgement, conscious deliberation, conscious desire, conscious hope, etc.), which roughly corresponds to the speech act mode of an utterance giving voice to that experience. Furthermore, the description yields relations of “foundation”, i.e., one-sided or mutual relative existential dependencies between (1) the experience in question and other experiences and (2) the particular descriptive features of the experience. Thus, an experience of pleasure about a given event is one-sidedly founded, relative to the stream of consciousness it belongs to, in a particular belief-state to the effect that this event has occurred. (The relativization to a particular stream of consciousness makes sure that both founded and founding experience occur in the same person’s mind.) Like all foundation relations, this one holds in virtue of an essential law, to the effect that conscious pleasure about some state of affairs requires a corresponding (and simultaneous) belief. Quite generally, a given object a of type F is founded in a particular object b of type G (where a is different from b and F is different from G) relative to a particular whole c of type H if and only if (i) there is an essential law in virtue of which it holds that for any object x of type F there is an object y of type G and a whole z of type H, such that both x and y are (proper) parts of z, and (ii) both a and b are (proper) parts of c. Of course, the notion of an essential law needs further clarification (see De Santis 2021, pt. III ff).

3. Indexicality and propositional content

However, as Husserl was well aware, the species-theory of content faces at least one serious objection. This objection concerns utterances that are “essentially occasional”, i.e., systematically context-sensitive, expressions like “I am here now” and the ‘indexical’ experiences they give voice to. If the intentional content of an indexical experience is to serve as a (sub-)propositional content, it must uniquely determine the object (if any) that the respective experience refers to. That is to say: if two indexical experiences display the same intentional content, they must refer to the same object (if any). It seems, though, that the moments of matter of two such experiences can instantiate the same ideal matter—the same type of (particular) content—whilst representing different objects. If you and I both think “I am here”, our respective thoughts share the same type of content, or so it would seem, but they represent different states of affairs. In order to accommodate this observation, Husserl draws a distinction between, on the one hand, the “general meaning function” of an utterance (which corresponds to what David Kaplan calls “character”, roughly: the linguistic meaning of the expression used) and, on the other hand, the “respective meaning” (i.e., the propositional or sub-propositional content expressed in the relevant context of utterance). However, it is doubtful whether this distinction really helps Husserl overcome the difficulty the phenomenon of context-sensitivity poses for his species-theory of content. If intentional contents are ideal matters in the sense of types of particular matters, and if this kind of type may remain constant while the intentional object and hence the (sub-)propositional content differs, then surely intentional contents thus conceived cannot always function as (sub-)propositional contents, as Husserl’s theory would have it. Rather, there must be another intentional content involved, namely the “respective meaning”, which serves as the (sub-)propositional content of the indexical experience. And this content does not appear to be an ideal species. (It may be argued, however, that even (sub-)propositional contents of indexical utterances can be instantiated multiply in thought and speech, thus qualifying as ideal species after all. But the crucial question is whether this holds true in complete generality: consider the above example “I am here now”.)

However that may be, Husserl construes (sub-)propositional contents (“respective meanings”) as two-factored, with the general meaning function plus the relevant context of utterance (if any) determining the content in question. And at least in the case of indexical experiences he seems to identify their intentional contents with these two-factored contents, for he holds that intentional content, which is referred to as “noematic sense” or “noematic nucleus” in Ideas, uniquely determines reference, i.e., intentional object. (For the claim that noematic sense is contextually determined respective meaning rather than general meaning function—which rules out any internalist reading; see Section 4 below—cf. Husserliana, vol. XX/1, pp. 74–78; see also Husserliana, vol. XXVI, p. 212, fn.) Some scholars even go as far as to claim that Husserl defines the noematic sense as “a certain person, object, event, state of affairs which presents itself, taken exactly as it present itself or as it is intended” (Gurwitsch 1982, pp. 61 f.; cp. Sokolowski 1987 and Drummond 1992; for a much-discussed critique of Gurwitsch’s interpretation see Føllesdal 1969). The notion of an intentional object “as it is intended” is already introduced in LI. It is argued (in LI V, sec. 20) that the object (e.g. the situation of affairs) as it is intended is to be distinguished from the (sub-)propositional content, on the grounds that, for instance, the state of affairs judged (the situation of affairs as it is categorically formed in the judgment) exists iff it obtains (so that the judgment is true), whilst the propositional content judged exists even if it is false (cf. Husserliana, vol. XIX/1, 427).

4. Singularity, consciousness and horizon-intentionality

Husserl sees quite clearly that indexical experiences (just as experiences given voice to by means of genuine proper names) are characterized, among other things, by their singularity: they represent a particular object, or set of objects, x, such that x is to be regarded as the intentional object of the respective experience in all relevant possible worlds (i.e., in all actual or counterfactual circumstances relative to which we are determining the object represented by that experience). Thus, for instance, in sec. 47 of Ideas, he describes what an experiencing subject, at a given time, in the light of his (or her) current indexical experiences, considers to be “the actual world” as a “special case” of a whole manifold of “possible worlds” each of which corresponds to a possible future course of experience (possible, that is, relative to the indexical experience in question). These (actual or potential) future experiences can be said to be (more or less) anticipated by the experiencing subject at the respective time, and they constitute what Husserl calls the “intentional horizon” of the indexical experience in the light of whose intentional content they are anticipated (cf. Smith and McIntyre 1982). For example, if you see something as a table, you will expect it to appear to you in certain ways if you go around and observe it.

What binds together the intentional horizon of a given indexical experience? According to Husserl, all of the (actual or potential) experiences constituting that horizon share a sense of identity through time, which sense he labels as the determinable X they belong to. As a first approximation, two experiences of a given subject belong to the same determinable X if and only if the subject believes them to represent the same object. (For a related criterion of intersubjective identity of determinable X, see Beyer 2000, sec. 7.) Hence, experiences belonging to a determinable X must be accompanied by at least one higher-order belief. This view fits in well with the thesis (shared, at least in part, by so-called dispositional higher-order belief theories of consciousness) that intentional experiences automatically give rise to (i.e., motivate) momentary dispositions to make corresponding reflective higher-order judgements, based on something like inner perception, thus constituting a form of implicit or “pre-reflective self-consciousness” (to use Sartre’s term).

It is controversial whether such a dispositional higher-order view may be ascribed to Husserl (see Zahavi 2015, sec. 1; for a reply see Beyer 2018, sec. 1). It should be uncontroversial that on his view the motivational basis of the relevant higher-order dispositional beliefs must already display the essential feature of consciousness independently of occurrent higher-order thought in order to be available for such thought in the first place (see Beyer 2011, p. 44). This becomes clear on a close study of Husserl’s work on “inner time-consciousness” (see the entry on phenomenological approaches to self-consciousness; also see Section 6 below). However, there is ample textual evidence showing that he regards the availability to inner perception (in the sense of a “real possibility” or “practical ability”; see Section 8 below) and to accordingly motivated reflective higher-order judgements (in which a hitherto “latent Ego” becomes “patent”) as an essential feature of consciousness, constituting its “mode of being” (cf. Husserliana, vol. III/1, p. 77, l. 27–35; p. 95, l. 36–38; Husserliana, vol. VIII, p. 90).

The determinable X a given indexical experience belongs to, with respect to certain other experiences, helps us answer the question of what determines the reference of that experience, if not its ideal meaning species alone. In order to take the role played by the determinable X into account properly, we have to employ a Husserlian research strategy that could be called the dynamic method. That is to say, we have to look upon intentional acts as momentary components of certain transtemporal cognitive structures—dynamic intentional structures—in which one and the same object or state of affairs is represented throughout a period of time during which the subject’s cognitive perspective upon that object or state of affairs is constantly changing (see, e.g., Ideas, sec. 86). (Typical examples of dynamic intentional structures include continuous observations—which represent Husserl’s standard example—as well as those totalities of successive judgements, or momentary belief-states, that actualize one and the same continuous belief. For instance, my judgement that yesterday was Thursday actualizes the same belief as the judgement I could have given voice to yesterday by “Today is Thursday”.) Consequently, the determinable X is apt to lead us back through time towards the original situation where the reference of the relevant unified series of successive intentional horizons was fixed, like for instance the occasion of the subject’s first perceptual encounter with a particular object: the corresponding perceptual experience will belong to the same determinable X as all of the (remaining) experiences belonging to the relevant series. In a more recent terminology, one may say that in this perceptual situation the subject has opened a mental file about a particular object (cf. Perry 1980).

In a research manuscript from 1913 Husserl refers to mental files associated with proper names as “individual notions (Eigenbegriffe)” (cf. Husserliana, vol. XX/2, p. 358), characterizing them as being infinitely “open” and “in flux” (cf. ibid., p. 359). Now it is the “referent” of the relevant mental file, or individual notion, that will normally count as the common intentional object of the experiences bound together in a unified series of successive intentional horizons in which the object “constitutes itself” empirically. (In cases where the “referent” of a mental file changes across time—i.e., is unnoticedly replaced by another object—the situation becomes more complicated. The same goes for cases of perceptual judgements leading to, or taken by the respective subject to be confirming, entries into an already existing file. See Beyer 2000, sec. 7.) Note that “constitution” so conceived does not mean creation.

On this reading of Husserl’s notion of the determinable X, there is a link, at least in the case of proper names and in the ubiqituous indexical case, between intentional content (including determinable X) on the one hand, and extra-mental reality on the other, such that intentional content thus understood determines reference in much the same way more recent externalist theories of content would have it, i.e. in such a way that the referent can in turn be said to help determine the intentional content (see Beyer 2000, 2001; cf. also Husserl’s discussion of Twin Earth in Husserliana, vol. XXVI, p. 212). Notice, however, that Husserl does not naively take the existence of an extra-mental referent for granted. Instead, he asks which structures of consciousness entitle us to represent the world as containing particular objects transcending what is currently given to us in experience (see Sections 7 and 8 below).

Husserl can thus be read (or at least be rationally reconstructed) as both an early direct reference theorist (headword: singularity) and a non-naive externalist about intentional content and (respective) meaning.

The dynamic method has us look upon noematic Sinn under the “functional aspect” of how it enables us to keep the intentional object “in mind (im Sinn)” (Husserliana, vol. II/1, pp. 196 ff), instead of viewing it merely statically as a psychological type or species to be instantiated by isolated moments of consciousness. It makes us regard any content of the latter sort, particularly “static perceptual content”, as a mere “abstraction from dynamic content” (Mulligan 1995, pp. 195, 197). This may help to explain why the species-theory of content had become less important to Husserl by the time he wrote Ideas.

5. The phenomenological epoché

An externalist reading (or rational reconstruction) of Husserl’s theory of content might, however, be taken to conflict with the methodological constraints posed by the phenomenological epoché, which—together with the dynamic method and eidetic reduction—builds the essential core of the transcendental-phenomenological method introduced in Ideas.

Husserl developed the method of epoché or “bracketing” around 1906. It may be regarded as a radicalization of the methodological constraint, already to be found in Logical Investigations, that any phenomenological description proper is to be performed from a first person point of view, so as to ensure that the respective item is described exactly as is experienced, or intended, by the subject. Now from a first-person point of view, one cannot, of course, decide whether in a case of what one takes to be, say, an act of perception one is currently performing, there actually is an object that one is perceptually confronted with. For instance, it is well possible that one is hallucinating. From a first-person point of view, there is no difference to be made out between the veridical and the non-veridical case—for the simple reason that one cannot at the same time fall victim to and detect a perceptual error or misrepresentation. In the non-veridical case, too, a transcendent object appears to “constitute itself” in consciousness. It is for such reasons that Husserl demanded (in Ideas) that in a phenomenological description proper the existence of the object(s) (if any) satisfying the content of the intentional act described must be “bracketed”. That is to say, the phenomenological description of a given act and, in particular, the phenomenological specification of its intentional content, must not rely upon the correctness of any existence assumption concerning the object(s) (if any) the respective act is about. Thus, the epoché has us focus on those aspects of our intentional acts and their contents that do not depend on the existence of a represented object out there in the extra-mental world.

On closer inspection, however, Husserl actually draws upon two different versions of the epoché when introducing this method in Ideas, which versions he does not separate as clearly as one might have hoped: the “universal epoché” on the one hand, and a weaker “local epoché” (as one could label it) on the other. The former version (as described in Ideas) seems to require the phenomenologist to put all his existence assumptions regarding the external world into brackets at once, at any point, whereas the weaker version merely requires him to bracket particular existence assumptions. The weaker version underlies the introducing of the notion of noema in Ideas in connection with examples like the perceptual hallucination (a concept not applicable within the universal epoché; see Overgaard 2004, p. 23) of a blooming apple tree (Husserliana, vol. III/1, pp. 204 ff): Husserl here in fact only brackets the existence of particular real objects (Beyer 2000, pp. 140–148). By contrast, the sole function of the universal epoché in Ideas seems to be to establish the “residuum” thesis, according to which the realm of “pure consciousness” exists independently of the external world. His argument for this thesis in Ideas, referring to the possibility of “world annihilation”, is flawed, however (see Beyer 2000, pp. 138 ff; 2007, pp. 76ff) and, as Erhard (2014, fn. 718) has observed, Husserl later discovered the relevant fallacy himself (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXIX, 256f).

This leaves it an open question what other function the epoché may serve in the context of Husserl’s methodology. The most plausible interpretation seems to be that “the only thing that is excluded as a result of the epoché is a certain naivety, the naivety of simply taking the world for granted, thereby ignoring the contribution of consciousness (Husserliana, vol. 27/173)” (Zahavi 2017, p. 67; also cf. Landgrebe 1982a, pp. 26 ff), where “the suspension [of existential positings] in question is merely propaedeutic and provisional” (Zahavi 2017, p. 58).

Only the method of universal epoché as introduced in Ideas seems to conflict with our externalist reading: if no extra-mental existence assumptions whatsoever are admitted at any point, then phenomenologically there cannot be object-dependent intentional contents, as externalism would have it. By contrast, there may be some such contents, even many of them, without intentional content generally having to be dependent on a particular extra-mental object. Which leaves enough room for the method of epoché to apply to any given particular case, as will become clear in Section 6.

6. Epoché, perceptual noema, hýle, time-consciousness and phenomenological reduction

The point of the local epoché can perhaps best be brought out if we follow Husserl in applying it to the case of perceptual experience. The phenomenologist is supposed to perform his or her descriptions from a first-person point of view, so as to ensure that the respective item is described exactly as it is experienced. Now in the case of perceptual experience one cannot, of course, both fall victim to and at the same time discover a particular perceptual error; it is always possible that one is subject to an illusion or even a hallucination, so that one’s perceptual experience is not veridical. If one is hallucinating, there is really no object of perception. However, phenomenologically the experience one undergoes is exactly the same as if one were successfully perceiving an external object.

Therefore, the (adequacy of a) phenomenological description of a perceptual experience should be independent of whether for the experience under investigation there is an object it represents or not. Either way, there will at least be a perceptual content (if not the same content on both sides, though). It is this content that Husserl calls the perceptual noema. Thanks to its noema, even a hallucination is an intentional act, an experience “as of” an object. Phenomenological description is concerned with those aspects of the noema that remain the same irrespective of whether the experience in question is veridical or not. Thus, our phenomenologist must not employ—he (or she) must “bracket”—his belief in the existence of the perceptual object.

However, this lands him in a methodological dilemma. If, on the one hand, the phenomenologist leaves the “natural attitude” and brackets his corresponding existence-belief, he cannot at the same time perform the perceptual experience he wishes to investigate. (This is the first horn of the dilemma.) For, as Husserl himself stresses (cf. Ideas, sec. 90, 109), the existence-belief is an indispensable part of the perceptual phenomenon: such experiences are essentially thetic, i.e., there can be no such thing as a perceptual experience without “belief-character” (cf. 5th Logical Investigation, sec. 23). If, on the other hand, our phenomenologist makes use of that belief, then he is bound to violate the constraints put upon him by the local epoché: he cannot but fail to assume the phenomenological attitude. (This is the second horn.)

There are at least three possible ways out of this dilemma. First, the phenomenologist could choose the first horn of the dilemma, but analyse an earlier perceptual experience of his, one that he now remembers. He just has to make sure here not to employ his earlier (and perhaps still persisting) belief in the existence of a perceptual object. Secondly, he could again decide in favour of the first horn and analyse a perceptual experience that he merely intuitively imagines himself to have. (For Husserl’s view on imagination see esp. Husserliana, vol. XXIII.) Thirdly, he could instead choose the second horn, keep employing his existence-belief, but make a kind of “pragmatic ascent” and describe the perceptual experience in such a way that the description, i.e., the speech act thus performed, does not presuppose the existence of a perceptual object. (The following sort of description may serve that function: “I am demonstratively identifying a so-and-so”; “I am performing an act of this-meaning under the aspect so-and-so”.) In any case, Husserl regards “bracketing” as what he calls the “neutrality modification” of a positing act, to be distinguished both from a corresponding supposition (hypothesis) and from what is commonly referred to as suspension of judgment, as in a case of serious doubt (cf. Hua III/1, 247 ff). While in the latter case the subjective probability may be 0.5, no degree of belief whatsoever can be assigned to an act of neutrality-modification (cf. Hua III/1, 252).

It is not entirely clear if Husserl considers all of these strategies to be admissible. The second one is certainly in line with the important methodological role he ascribes to “phantasy”, i.e., mere intuitive imagination, when it comes to eidetic reduction, which in turn constitutes an important part of the phenomenological method. The third strategy—pragmatic ascent—fits in well with the way he uses to specify the common element of the noema of both veridical perceptions and corresponding hallucinations (see, e.g., the first-person description of someone’s experience of “this blooming tree there in space” presented in sec. 90 of Ideas; also see ibid., sec. 89f).

Now we can apply the local epoché to specify the noema of both veridical perceptions and hallucinations so as to bring out their singularity. Already in his 1894 essay “Intentional Objects” (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXII; English translation of a somewhat different version of the essay in: Rollinger 1999) Husserl stressed that objectless representations such as hallucinations can in a sense be characterized as “representing an intentional object”, provided that this characterization is understood to be made “under an existential assumption”, as follows: “If the act of hallucination were veridical, it would successfully represent such-and-such an object (under such-and-such aspects)”. Something similar goes with regard to the singularity of a hallucinatory experience’s noema: if such an experience were veridical, it would, in virtue of its noema, represent a particular perceptual object in all relevant possible worlds (see Section 3 above). Thus, we can provide an existentially neutral specification of the noema of a (veridical, illusory or hallucinatory) perceptual experience, just as local epoché demands, and still bring out the singular character of their content that Husserl has done so much to uncover, especially in his investigations into indexicality and the role of the determinable X in our constitution of spatio-temporal reality. The specification might run as follows: The noema of a perceptual experience i is such that either (1) there is an object x that i represents in virtue of its noema, where x is to be regarded as the referent of i in all relevant possible worlds, or (2) there would be an object meeting condition (1) if i were veridical. Condition (2) enables us to make sense of the behaviour of a speaker/thinker making counterfactual assumptions about an object which he, unknowingly, merely hallucinates, or of quantifying into modal statements about that alleged object (cf. Beyer 2000, pp. 26–31). Notice that on the above-proposed externalist reading of Husserl’s notion of intentional content, the noema will differ depending on whether condition (1) or (2) is satisfied. Nevertheless, our noematic specification meets the requirements of local epoché, as it does not rely on the existence of a particular perceptual object. If there is no such object, condition (2) will be satisfied—provided that we are dealing with a perceptual experience. The rationale behind condition (2) is that even in the non-veridical case an individual notion (a mental file) and consequently a unified series of intentional horizons gets activated, on the basis of the same sensory material, or hýle (see the following paragraph), as in the veridical case.

It should be noted that according to Husserl the complete noema of a perceptual experience contains an additional element, to be distinguished from the intentional content, notably its “thetic” or “positing” character, i.e., its quality. Moreover, the manner in which the perceptual object (if any) presents (or would present) itself includes the sensual matter or “hýle” underlying the respective perceptual experience. Typical examples of hýle include sense impressions (i.e., sensory experiences), as opposed to the perceptual experiences based upon them. Thus, to take Jastrow’s/Wittgenstein’s duck-rabbit head as an example, the perception of a duck-head may be founded in the same sense impressions or hýle as the perception of a rabbit-head (cf. Føllesdal 1988, pp. 108f). (For Husserl all remaining intuitive acts involve something analogous (in a sense needing further explanation) to hýle, which he labels as their “intuitive representational content”. In the case of acts of phantasy, he refers to the intuitive representational content as “phantasma”.) Husserl regards sense impressions as non-intentional (and thus non-conceptual) in nature. It is only the intentional content of a perceptual experience that “forms” its underlying hýle so as to yield the perception of an object (for critical discussion see Hopp 2011, esp. sec. 7.3). Husserl compares this process of intentional “forming” of sensual matter to the interpretation of a linguistic expression, but this comparison should not mislead us to conclude that he subscribes to a sense-datum theory of perception (see Section 2 above, headword: mental image theory). Rather, his view on perception is best characterized as a sophisticated version of direct (i.e., non-representationalist) realism.

Finally, we should note that on Husserl’s view there is a further important dimension to perceptual experience, in that it displays a phenomenological deep- or micro-structure constituted by time-consciousness (Husserliana, vol. X, XXXIII; also see Miller 1984). This merely seemingly unconscious structure is essentially indexical in character and consists, at a given time, of both retentions, i.e., acts of immediate memory of what has been perceived “just a moment ago”, original impressions, i.e., acts of awareness of what is perceived “right now”, and protentions, i.e., immediate anticipations of what will be perceived “in a moment”. It is by such momentary structures of retentions, original impressions and protentions that moments of time are continuously constituted (and reconstituted) as past, present and future, respectively, so that it looks to the experiencing subject as if time were permanently flowing off.

This deep-structure of intentional consciousness comes to light in the course of what Husserl calls the “phenomenological reduction” (Husserliana, vol. XIII, pp. 432 ff), which uses the method of epoché in order to make coherent sense, in terms of the essential horizon-structure of consciousness, of the transcendence of objective reality. The most global form of epoché is employed when this reality in total is bracketed. There is still something left at this point, though, which must not, and cannot, be bracketed: the temporal flow of one’s “present” experience, constituted by current retentions and original impressions. These recurrent temporal features of the horizon-structure of consciousness cannot be meaningfully doubted. They provide a kind of hýle for “inner perception” and corresponding reflective judgements, but it is a very special kind of hýle: one that is a proper part of the “perceived” item and does not get conceptually “formed” in the course of perception (reflecting the fact that unlike spatio-temporal objects, lived experiences “do not adumbrate themselves”; cf. Husserliana, vol. III/1, p. 88). Hence, there is no epistemically problematic gap between experience and object in this case, which therefore provides an adequate starting point for the phenomenological reduction, that may now proceed further by using holistic justification strategies. After all, intentional consciousness has now been shown to be coherently structured at its phenomenologically deepest level.

7. Passivity vs. activity

Hyletic data are arguably experiences, in the sense of “non-intentional”, “pre-reflective lived experiences that can be grasped only abstractly in reflection” (Gallagher 2011, p. 3). At the same time, at least some of them (the “kinaesthetic” sensations; cf. Zahavi 2003, p. 107) belong to the sphere of bodily passivity: they “serve in the constitution of the experiencing body (the body-as-subject)” (Gallagher 2011, p. 4; for the distinction between “body-as-subject” and “body-as-object”, cf. Zahavi 2003, pp. 101–106). The notion of passivity is given particular emphasis both in the context of Husserl’s genetic-phenomenological analyses, focussing on the dynamic aspects of self- and object-constitution, and in his reply to the “objection of solipsism” against transcendental phenomenology developed in the 5th of his Cartesian Meditations (see Section 10 below). In Experience and Judgement Husserl stresses “that the distinction between activity and passivity is not a rigid one, that it cannot be a matter of terms that can be defined once and for all, but only of means of description and contrast, the meaning of which must originally be recreated in each individual case with regard to the concrete situation of the analysis” (Husserl 1939, p. 119). On a plausible (i.e., epistemological) interpretation, a unit of consciousness in which something constitutes itself is to be described as “passive” just in case this constitution occurs independently of any simultaneous execution of the subject’s will, e.g., its will to acquire knowledge; otherwise, it is to be described as “active”. Passive constitution is sometimes referred to as “pre-constitution”, as it is an indispensible precondition for active constitution (cf. Landgrebe 1982b, p. 72.) According to the above interpretation, active constitution in the form of judgements in turn initiates beliefs as personal “acquisitions (Erwerbe)” or “habitualities” that help pre-constitute the further course of experience, thus forming a “secondary” level of passivity (cf. ibid.; for an overview of Husserl’s “phenomenology of habituality” cf. Moran 2011; Caminada 2019 investigates into Husserl’s view of habit against the background of the re-edition of Ideas II on the basis of his original texts; see esp. ch. 10f).

In the context of the analysis of the constitution of individual perceptual objects, the spatio-temporally structured “field of pre-givenness” (Husserl 1939, p. 74) against whose background the object stands out contrastively (ready to catch the perceiver’s attention) counts as primarily passive (cf. Wu 2021, sec. 58). This field is structured by “syntheses of association” between (hyletic adumbrations of) similar and dissimilar elements (cf. Wu 2020, p. 189). These associative syntheses are such that (in the case at issue) one of those elements, e.g. a colored three-dimensional (and thus non-hyletic; cf. Lee 1993, p. 99) dot, serves as sensual “stimulus” by “instinctively driving” (Husserliana Mat., vol. VIII, p. 326) the perceiver to attend to it unwillingly, thus passively “affecting” the perceiver (Husserliana, vol. XXXIII, pp. 275f; cf. Yamaguchi 1982; Lee 1993; also cf. Mensch 1997; and Brudzinska 2020, containing a detailed comparison with Freud). If the stimulus then catches the subject’s attention, it can subsequently be “explicated” perceptually according to its objectual determinations, in which case the subject enters “the first main stage of the striving for knowledge, i.e. the pre-predicative or receptive stage” (Wu 2021, p. 190). Thus, passivity precedes receptivity, which in turn precedes the second main stage, i.e. the “predicative” stage – the level of the “spontaneity” of judgement (cf. Wu 2021, p. 191). Both of these stages (the receptive and the spontaneous one) constitute the level of cognitive “activity”. At the second stage, the processing of mental files such as “individual notions” (see Section 4 above), guided by the subject’s “will to knowledge” (Husserl 1939, p. 92), is located. In Experience and Judgement Husserl calls the perceptual acts motivating predicative file entries (i.e., habitual yet variable empirical beliefs) “explications” of perceptual objects (cf. Husserl 1939, ch. 2). Such explications are founded in “attention as a tendency of the ego” “toward the intentional object” (Husserl 1939, p. 85). (For the multifarious use of the term “attention” in Husserl cf. the introduction to Husserliana, vol. XXXVIII, p. XXXII; see also the entry on “Aufmerksamkeit” in Gander 2010, pp. 36ff, and the secondary literature cited there, as well as Breyer 2011, ch. V, and Wehrle 2013, ch. I.)

Note that while Husserl sometimes describes the field of pre-givenness in which pre-predicative and predicative acts are founded as “originarily passive” (cf. Husserl 1939, p. 300), he holds that this field is itself pre-constituted at an even more basic level of constitution, also sometimes (in another context) described as originarily or primarily passive. This more basic level is the “absolutely” originary one of (1) bodily and (2) temporal pre-reflective self-consciousness, at which (1) the spatial and (2) the temporal aspects of the field, respectively, constitute themselves (cf. Wu 2021, pp. 187f). This pre-constitution occurs automatically or “instinctively”, by “association” of “acquired” affective “drives” and teleologically directed “courses of drives (Triebverläufe)” rather than mere “(courses of) ideas”, such that “the ego as the subject of the drive […] is awakened” (transcr. A VII 13, p. 20, cited after Yamaguchi 1982, p. 57). If the subject then acquires an according affective “habituality”, then a new level of “secondary passivity” has been constituted (cf. Yamaguchi 1982, p. 56). For example, the above-mentioned colored dot is then ready to be perceived as located, at ‘this current moment’ of (internal) time, at ‘that position’ in ‘my own’ (egocentric) perceptual field; it “affects” the subject accordingly, thus serving as a visual stimulus. This perceptual field is regarded as ‘my own’ and ‘my current’ one in virtue of its pre-constitution in pre-reflective self-awareness, in which both the subject’s stream of consciousness and its living body (as it would appear in the “sphere of ownness”, i.e. independently of intersubjective experience) constitute themselves, notably by both internal time-consciousness (see Sections 4 and 6 above; cf. Held 1966) and the instinctive “originary kinestheses” (Husserliana, vol. XV, p. 385) or “kinesthetic syntheses” associated with the bodily movements involved in perception (cf. Landgrebe 1982b, pp. 81 ff; also cf. Dodd 1997 for a further analysis of Husserl’s phenomenology of the body, taking into account the rich material to be found in Ideas II, but also in Thing and Space and the 5th of the Cartesian Meditations; and Taipale 2014, stressing the importance of the living body for the different levels of constitution in Husserl; more recent literature on embodiment in Husserl, covering topics like the constitution of the ego’s own living body and the living bodies of others, also includes Behnke 1996; Heinämaa 2011, 2018; Moran and Janssen, eds., 2018; Carr 2019; and Jardine 2022, ch. 5f).

On (one reading of) Husserl’s view, these very basic levels or strata underlying self- and world-constitution are still “anonymous”, i.e. not available through (self-)“reflection” (cf. Landgrebe 1982b, p. 76), but only through the “genetic-phenomenological” method of “deconstruction” or “dismantling (Abbau)”. Dismantling starts from a given noematic sense, like ‘this coloured dot’, and tells a story about how (the intentionality correlated with) this sense could have come about, to which kinds of “subjective sources” or origins it implicitly refers back (as their “sedimentation”), given the transcendental conditions for the possibility of the corresponding forms of intentionality (cf. Husserl 1939, p. 47). This dismantling leads back to the associative “originary pairing” of ‘my own’, originarily-kinesthetic pre-constituted living body, on the one hand, and a foreign one affecting ‘my own’, on the other, due to similarities which passively drive the “first ‘ego’ of the reduction” (Husserliana, vol. XV, p. 586) to co-constitute ‘my own’ and the ‘other’ bodily ego by accordingly motivated “apperceptive transfer” (Husserliana, vol. I, 140) of the pre-constituted sense ‘this living body of mine’ to the similarly behaving body ‘over there’ (cf. A. D. Smith 2003, pp. 224–251). This co-constitution forms the basis of, first, the co-constitution of the alter ego as a personal human being and (on this basis; cf. Husserliana, vol. XIV, p. 418) myself as the same kind of being and, secondly, the constitution objective reality. The (analysis of the) constitution of the latter is sketched in Section 10 below. Husserl supposes that its passive pre-constitution “‘instinctively’ predeliniates the constitution of the whole world for me”, a teleological “facticity” perhaps deriving from “God” (Husserliana, vol. XV, p. 385; see Held 2010). (In other words, the spade bends back here.)

8. Communication, sociality, personhood and personal values

As for the constitution of oneself as a person, Husserl (Husserliana, vol. XIV, pp. 170 ff) holds that it occurs, among other things, in connection with communicative or social acts (“Mitteilungen”, “soziale Akte”), which are pre-constituted by the mutual drives and instincts involved in the education of small children who confidently “imitate” the linguistic behavior of educators “loving” them like parents (Husserliana, vol. XIV, 165f). (For additional aspects of the constitution of personhood, see the last two paragraphs of this section and the literature cited there. Further elements of Husserl’s view of personal love, esp. concerning his ethics, are discussed in Melle 2002; Römer 2011; Kern 2019, sec. 22f; Crespo 2019; Heinämaa 2020.) The relevant communicative acts are “I-thou acts”, in which the utterer empathetically ascribes to the addressee the empathetic ascription of the “intention (Absicht)” to motivate the addressee, by means of his or her recognition of that very intention (cf. Husserliana, vol. IV, p. 192), to behave a certain way (Husserliana, vol. XIV, 166f in the light of Husserliana, vol. IV, p. 192); where utterer and addressee simultaneously perceive each other (Husserliana, vol. XIV, p. 167). Thus, these acts are based on “reciprocal empathy” (Zahavi 2018, p. 746), notably on “iterated, reflexive empathy: I empathetically ascribe to the Other(s) an empathetic ascription of an intention to me” (Beyer 2018, p. 100). In I-thou acts, the “originarily social I-thou relationship” is constituted, in which ego and alter ego deliberately and reflexively motivate each other to display certain practical forms of behavior (Husserliana, vol. XIV, pp. 171f). It is at this stage that the subject constitutes itself as a person (belonging to the “world of persons”) by gaining “personal ‘self-consciousness’” of the sort just described in the course of I-thou acts (Husserliana, vol. XIV, pp. 171, 175f). This enables the subject to see him- or herself as subject to acts of self-determination: “If I agree [Vereinbare ich mich] with an other [...], the other determines me to determine myself to take on this or that [commitment; CB]” (Husserliana, vol. XIV, p. 180). (For some other aspects of the role of communicative acts in Husserl’s analyses of constitution see, e.g., Zahavi 2003, ch. 3, sec. C–D; Caminada 2019, esp. ch. 6., sec. 2f.; also see Sections 9f below.)

It is by self-determination through “position-taking”, in the form of “judgement” or “will”, that the subject constitutes itself as an individual person. (For the following cf. Beyer 2013, pp. 94, 110f. For a more recent analysis, also taking into account the new critical edition of Ideas II, see Jardine 2022. Also see Jacobs 2010, pp. 353–356.) What distinguishes an individual personal subject from other such subjects is a “total” personal “style and habitus”, including “a certain pervasive unitary style in the way [the subject] decides by judgement and will” (Husserliana, vol. IV, §61 p. 277; Husserl 1989, p. 290; also cf. Husserliana, vol. IV, §59, p. 256). This latter style depends on the subject’s habits to let itself be determined by value-motives, that is, by emotional valuings (“Wertnehmungen”; cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVII, p. 72) and, sometimes, also by accordingly motivated explicit value judgements, which concern the subject’s volitional motives, regarding which the free subject says ‘yes’ or ‘no’. (These valuings, which motivate the subject’s will, stand to passive emotional affections as full-fledged perceptual acts stand to their underlying sensual hyle; they can be looked upon as nonveridical or veridical, and, in the latter case, more or less adequate perceptions of (instances of) values; cf. Husserliana, vol. IV, sec. 44, p. 215, sec. 45, pp. 227f; Husserliana, vol. XXXVII, p. 326.)

In the former case (the subject says ‘yes’) the respective motive becomes “a position-taking that issues from [the subject’s] own ego”, as opposed to a mere stimulus coming from outside; the subject “annexes” it on his or her “own accord” (eignet es sich selbsttätig an), i.e. it internalizes the corresponding value (Husserliana, vol. IV, §60, p. 269; Husserl 1989, p. 281). This enables the subject to get to know itself as an individual person, i.e. with regard to its “personal character-traits” (Husserliana, vol. XIV, p. 18), notably by learning “how such and such motives [...] would affect me, how I, as the one that I am, would act and could act, how I could, and how I could not, judge, value and will” (Husserliana, vol. IV, §60, p. 265f; Husserl 1989, p. 278). Husserl’s conception of individual personhood also underlies his ethics (see end of Section 9).

9. Empathy, intersubjectivity and lifeworld; ethics and value theory

One of the main themes of transcendental phenomenology is intersubjectivity. Among other things, it is discussed in considerable detail in the 5th of the Cartesian Meditations and in the manuscripts published in vol. XIII–XV of Husserliana (see Kern 2019 for an overview). (A particularly important critique of Husserl’s view on intersubjectivity from a sociological viewpoint is found in Schütz 1966.)

According to Husserl, intersubjective experience plays a fundamental role in our constitution of both ourselves as objectively existing subjects, other experiencing subjects, and the objective spatio-temporal world. Transcendental phenomenology attempts to reconstruct the rational structures underlying—and making possible—these constitutive achievements.

From a first-person point of view, intersubjectivity comes in when we undergo acts of empathy. Intersubjective experience is empathic experience; it occurs in the course of our conscious attribution of intentional acts to other subjects, in the course of which we put ourselves into the other one’s shoes. In order to study this kind of experience from the phenomenological attitude, we must bracket our belief in the existence of the respective target of our act-ascription qua experiencing subject and ask ourselves which of our further beliefs justify that existence-belief as well as our act-ascription. It is these further beliefs that make up the rational structure underlying our intersubjective experience. Since it takes phenomenological investigation to lay bare these beliefs, they must be first and foremost unconscious when we experience the world in the natural attitude.

Among the fundamental beliefs thus uncovered by Husserl is the belief (or expectation) that a being that looks and behaves more or less like myself, i.e., displays traits more or less familiar from my own case, will generally perceive things from an egocentric viewpoint similar to my own (“here”, “over there”, “to my left”, “in front of me”, etc.), in the sense that I would roughly look upon things the way he does if I were in his shoes and perceived them from his perspective. This belief allows me to ascribe intentional acts to others immediately or “appresentatively”, i.e., without having to draw an inference, say, by analogy with my own case. So the belief in question must lie quite at the bedrock of my belief-system. It forms a part of the already pregiven (and generally unreflected) intentional background, or “lifeworld” (cf. Crisis), against which my practice of act-ascription and all constitutive achievements based upon that practice make sense in the first place, and in terms of which they get their ultimate justification.

Husserl’s notion of lifeworld is a difficult (and at the same time important) one. It can roughly be thought of in two different (but arguably compatible) ways: (1) in terms of belief and (2) in terms of something like socially, culturally or evolutionarily established (but nevertheless abstract) sense or meaning.

(1) If we restrict ourselves to a single subject of experience, the lifeworld can be looked upon as the rational structure underlying his (or her) “natural attitude”. That is to say: a given subject’s lifeworld consists of the beliefs against which his everyday attitude towards himself, the objective world and others receive their ultimate justification. (However, in principle not even beliefs forming part of a subject’s lifeworld are immune to revision. Hence, Husserl must not be regarded as an epistemological foundationalist; see Føllesdal 1988.)

(2a) If we consider a single community of subjects, their common lifeworld, or “homeworld”, can be looked upon, by first approximation, as the system of senses or meanings constituting their common language, or “form of life” (Wittgenstein), given that they conceive of the world and themselves in the categories provided by this language.

(2b) If we consider subjects belonging to different communities, we can look upon their common lifeworld as the general framework, or “a priori structure”, of senses or meanings that allows for the mutual translation of their respective languages (with their different associated “homeworlds”) into one another.

The term “lifeworld” thus denotes the way the members of one or more social groups (cultures, linguistic communities) use to structure the world into objects (Husserliana, vol. VI, pp. 126–138, 140–145). The respective lifeworld is claimed to “predelineate” a “world-horizon” of potential future experiences that are to be (more or less) expected for a given group member at a given time, under various conditions, where the resulting sequences of anticipated experiences can be looked upon as corresponding to different “possible worlds and environments” (Husserliana, vol. III/1, p. 100). These expectations follow typical patterns, as the lifeworld is fixed by a system of (first and foremost implicit) intersubjective standards, or conventions, that determine what counts as “normal” or “standard” observation under “normal” conditions (Husserliana, vol. XV, pp. 135 ff, 142) and thus as a source of epistemic justification. Some of these standards are restricted to a particular culture or “homeworld” (Husserliana, vol. XV, pp. 141 f, 227–236), whereas others determine a “general structure” that is “a priori” in being “unconditionally valid for all subjects”, defining “that on which normal Europeans, normal Hindus, Chinese, etc., agree in spite of all relativity” (Husserliana, vol. VI, p. 142). Husserl quotes universally accepted facts about “spatial shape, motion, sense-quality” as well as our prescientific notions of “spatiotemporality”, “body” and “causality” as examples (ibid.). These conceptions determine the general structure of all particular thing-concepts that are such that any creature sharing the essential structures of intentional consciousness will be capable of forming and grasping them, respectively, under different lifeworldly conditions.

The notion of lifeworld was already introduced in the posthumously published second volume of Ideas, under the heading of “Umwelt”, to be translated as “surrounding world” or “environment”. Husserl there characterizes the environment as a world of entities that are “meaningful” to us in that they exercise “motivating” force on us and present themselves to us under egocentric aspects. Any subject taking the “personalistic attitude” builds the center of an environment containing such objects. The personalistic attitude is “the attitude we are always in when we live with one another, talk to one another, shake hands with one another in greeting, or are related to one another in love and aversion, in disposition and action, in discourse and discussion” (Husserliana, vol. IV, p. 183; Husserl 1989, p. 192). The central notion of Husserl’s “Umweltanalyse” is the concept of motivation, whose application he explains as follows: “how did I hit upon that, what brought me to it? That questions like these can be raised characterizes all motivation in general” (Husserliana, vol. IV, p. 222; Husserl 1989, p. 234, with translation change). The entities exercising motivating force on us owe their corresponding “meaning” or significance to certain forms of intentional consciousness and intersubjective processes. Thus, to quote one of Husserl’s examples, “I see coal as heating material; I recognize it and recognize it as useful and as used for heating, as appropriate for and as destined to produce warmth. [...] I can use [a combustible object] as fuel; it has value for me as a possible source of heat. That is, it has value for me with respect to the fact that with it I can produce the heating of a room and thereby pleasant sensations of warmth for myself and others. [...] Others also apprehend it in the same way, and it acquires an intersubjective use-value and in a social context is appreciated and is valuable as serving such and such a purpose, as useful to man, etc.” (Husserliana, vol. IV, pp. 186f; Husserl 1989, pp. 196f).

On Husserl’s view, it is precisely this “subjective-relative lifeworld”, or environment, that provides the “grounding soil” of the more objective world of science (Husserliana, vol. VI, p. 134), in the twofold sense that (i) scientific conceptions owe their (sub-)propositional content and thus their reference to reality to the prescientific notions they are supposed to “naturalize” and that, consequently, (ii) when things get into flux in science, when a crisis occurs, all that is left to appeal to in order to defend new scientific approaches against their rivals is the prescientific lifeworld, as manifested in our according intuitive acceptances (for references cf. Føllesdal 1990a, pp. 139f). This view offers an alternative to the “naturalistic” stance taken by many analytic philosophers today.

One of the constitutive achievements based upon my lifeworldly determined practice of act-ascription is my self-image as a full-fledged person existing as a psycho-physical element of the objective, spatio-temporal order. This self-image can be justified by what Edith Stein, in a PhD thesis on empathy supervised by Husserl (Stein 1917), has labelled as iterated empathy, where I put myself into the other subject’s shoes, i.e., (consciously) simulate him, under the aspect that he (or she) in turn puts himself into my shoes. In this way, I can figure out that in order for the other subject to be able to ascribe intentional acts to me, he has to identify me bodily, as a flesh-and-blood human being, with its egocentric viewpoint necessarily differing from his own. This brings home to me that my egocentric perspective is just one among many, and that from all foreign perspectives I appear as a physical object among others in a spatio-temporal world. So the following criterion of subject-identity at a given time applies both to myself and to others: one human living body, one experiencing subject. However, Husserl does not at all want to deny that we also ascribe experiences, even intentional ones, to non-human animals. This becomes the more difficult and problematic, though, the less bodily and behavioural similarity obtains between them and ourselves.

Before finally turning to the question of what “objectivity” amounts to in this connection, let us notice that in Husserl’s eyes something like empathy also forms the basis of both our practical, aesthetical and moral evaluations and of what might be called intercultural understanding, i.e., the constitution of a “foreign world” against the background of one’s own “homeworld”, i.e., one’s own familiar (but, again, generally unreflected) cultural heritage (cf. Husserliana, vol. XV). Husserl studied many of these phenomena in detail, and he even outlined the beginnings of a phenomenological ethics and value theory (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXVIII, XXXVII). In this context, he formulates a “categorical imperative” that makes recourse to the notion of lifeworld, or environment, as follows: Always act in such a way that your action contributes as well as possible to the best (the most valuable) you recognize yourself to be able to achieve in your life, given your individual abilities and environment (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVII, pp. 251 ff). (This version of the “categorical imperative” stems from Husserl’s post-war lectures on ethics and value theory. Earlier versions differ significantly; for the development of Husserl’s thought on this and related issues, see, e.g., Melle 1991; Peucker 2008; Donohoe 2016, ch. 4; Drummond 2018; and Crespo 2021.)

Note that on Husserl’s view the will of a free agent, capable of following this imperative, is always already embedded in a “volitional context” predelineating the open “future horizon” of a “full individual life” that the agent is currently able to lead (Husserliana, vol. XXXVII, p. 252), thus qualifying as a dynamic intentional structure. This individual life corresponds to the agent‘s self-determination as an individual person (see Section 8 above). The valuings underlying this self-determination can be veridical, and thus suitable for motivating objectively valid evaluative judgments, because their correlates, i.e. values, are part of the ideal (but still intersubjectively constituted) spiritual world (Husserliana, vol XXXVI, pp. 217 ff). These values stand in hierarchical relations to each other, governed by laws to be studied in what Husserl calls formal axiology (ibid., pp. 226–232). Value-perception in the form of emotional valuing thus allows for a priori insights. It is such insights that determine the good will, in that the latter orients itself by the highest values the subject, on reflection, including a priori reflection, based on emotion, recognizes him- or herself to be able to realize in life, given his or her abilities and environment (for the present paragraph cf. Beyer 2013, sec. 1; for more detailed analyses of Husserl’s ethics and value theory see, e.g., Luft 2010, the contributions to Luft, ed., 2011 and the literature cited there, as well as the secondary literature cited at the end of the foregoing paragraph.)

10. The intersubjective constitution of objectivity and the case for “transcendental idealism”

Even the objective spatio-temporal world, which represents a significant part of our everyday lifeworld, is constituted intersubjectively, says Husserl. (The same holds true for its spatio-temporal framework, consisting of objective time and space.) How so? Husserl starts (again, from a first-person viewpoint) from a “solipsistic” abstraction of the notion of a spatio-temporal object which differs from that notion in that it does not presuppose that any other subject can observe such an object from his (or her) own perspective. His question is what justifies us (i.e., each of us for him- or herself) in the assumption of an objective reality consisting of such objects, given only this “solipsistic” conception of a spatio-temporal thing (or event) as our starting point. On Husserl’s view, “the crucial further step” in order to answer this question consists in disclosing the dimension that opens up when the epistemic justification, or “motivation”, of intersubjective experience, or empathy, is additionally taken into account and made explicit (Husserliana, vol. VII, p. 435).

Roughly, his argument goes as follows. In order for me to be able to put myself into someone else’s shoes and simulate his (or her) perspective upon his surrounding spatio-temporal world, I cannot but assume that this world coincides with my own, at least to a large extent; although the aspects under which the other subject represents the world must be different, as they depend on his own egocentric viewpoint. Hence, I must presuppose that the spatio-temporal objects forming my own world exist independently of my subjective perspective and the particular experiences I perform; they must, in other words, be conceived of as part of an objective reality. This result fits in well with—in fact, it serves to explain—Husserl’s view, already stressed in Ideas, that perceptual objects are “transcendent” in that at any given moment they display an inexhaustive number of unperceived (and largely even unexpected) features, only some of which will become manifest—will be intuitively presented—in the further course of observation.

However, according to Husserl this does not mean that the objective world thus constituted in intersubjective experience is to be regarded as completely independent of the aspects under which we represent the world. For on his view another condition for the possibility of intersubjective experience is precisely the assumption that by and large the other subject structures the world into objects in the same style I myself do. It is partly for this reason that Husserl can be said to adhere to a version of both “realism” and “idealism” at the same time.

Another, related, reason is that Husserl’s argument for realism is developed in a context in which he defends what he refers to as “transcendental idealism” (a terminological choice he would later regret; see Føllesdal 1990a, p. 128). During the years in which his transcendental phenomenology took shape, he developed a number of “proofs” of this position, most of which are based upon his conception of a “real possibility” regarding cognition or the acquisition of knowledge. By a “real possibility”, Husserl understands a possibility that is such that “something—more or less— ‘speaks in favour of it’” (Husserliana, vol. XX/1, p. 178). Real possibilities are, in other words, conceived of as more or less (rationally) motivated possibilities; and Husserl understands motivation in such a way that it is always someone who is motivated a certain way (cf. Husserliana, vol. IV, p. 222). This is why Husserl subscribes to the following dependency thesis: The real possibility to acquire (empirical) knowledge regarding a contingent object A (possible world, individual thing, state of affairs involving such thing; cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, pp. 139f) “requires” an “epistemic subject”, which “either experiences A, or acquires knowledge regarding A on the basis of experience, or else has the practical possibility (or the practical ability) to experience A and acquire knowledge regarding it” (Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, p. 139). Husserl also adheres to the following correlation thesis with regard to empirical reality and real epistemic possibility: If a contingent object A is real (really exists), then the real (as opposed to the merely logical) possibility obtains to acquire knowledge regarding A (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, p. 138, l. 35–36). From these two propositions—the dependency and the correlation thesis—he derives the conclusion that the existence of a contingent object A requires “the necessary co-existence of a subject either acquiring knowledge” regarding A “or having the ability to do so” (Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, pp. 139f). This is nothing but “[t]he thesis of transcendental idealism [...]: A nature without co-existing subjects of possible experience regarding it is unthinkable; possible subjects of experience are not enough” (Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, p. 156).

Why are actual subjects of experience supposed to be necessary? Husserl’s answer refers to the notion of full epistemic justification, or full degree of real possibility (with regard to empirical knowledge): “In order for [a thing of nature] to really exist, and thus in order for the assumption that it exists to be reasonable or justified not merely in a restricted but rather in an unrestricted way, i.e. to the fullest extent, there must be an actual ego in whose experiences [...] the being of the thing manifests itself [...].” (Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, pp. 76f). Husserl takes this notion to be applicable (as far as empirical consciousness is concerned) in case of truth only. Thus, in sec. 16 of Formal and Transcendental Logic he first equates “truth” with “genuine knowledge” which is “repeatable by any [...] rational being” (Husserliana, vol. XVII, p. 46) and then makes the (somewhat weaker) claim that truth and such knowledge are “correlated” (Husserliana, vol. XVII, p. 47). This conception of (empirical) truth, which is already to be found in Logical Investigations, has been compared to ideal verificationism (cf. Soldati 1994, p. 119) and to Putnam’s internal realism (cf. Beyer 2020, p. 69).

Husserl seems to regard real possibilities as epistemic dispositions (habitualities), or abilities, that require an actual “substrate” (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, p. 139). At the same time, he stresses that “surely no human being and no animal” must exist in the actual world (adding that their non-existence would however already result in a “change of the world”) (cf. Husserliana, vol. XXXVI, p. 121). One way to make sense of this would be to weaken the dependency thesis, and the requirement of an actual substrate, and to merely require what might be called real higher-order possibilities—possibilities for acquiring epistemic dispositions in counterfactual (or actual) cases where epistemic subjects would be co-existing—that may remain unactualized but could be actualized by someone properly taking into account a multitude of individual epistemic perspectives, by means of intersubjective experience. But even under this reconstruction there remains a sense in which the criteria of real possibility and reality constitution, and the corresponding structure of the real world, are dependent on an “ego”, on Husserl’s view: What counts as a real possibility, or as epistemically justified, is dependent on the phenomenological subjects reflecting about such counterfactual cases in the methodological context of the transcendental reduction and the results they arrive at in this context.


Primary Literature

The collected works of Husserl were published over the course of several years, starting in 1950, in Husserliana: Edmund Husserl—Gesammelte Werke, The Hague/Dordrecht: Nijhoff/Kluwer. The following works by Husserl have been translated into English, and they are listed in the chronological order of the publication dates of the German originals (if these were originally published).

  • 1900/1 [2nd, revised edition 1913], Logical Investigations, trans. J. N. Findlay, London: Routledge 1973.
  • 1910, “Philosophy as Rigorous Science,” trans. in Q. Lauer (ed.), Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy, New York: Harper 1965.
  • 1913, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy—First Book: General Introduction to a Pure Phenomenology, trans. F. Kersten. The Hague: Nijhoff 1982 (= Ideas).
  • 1929, Formal and Transcendental Logic, trans. D. Cairns. The Hague: Nijhoff 1969.
  • 1931, Cartesian Meditations, trans. D. Cairns, Dordrecht: Kluwer 1988.
  • 1939, Experience and Judgement, trans. J. S. Churchill and K. Ameriks, London: Routledge 1973.
  • 1954, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, trans. D. Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press (= Crisis) 1970.
  • 1980, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy—Third Book: Phenomenology and the Foundations of the Sciences, trans. T. E. Klein and W. E. Pohl, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • 1989, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy—Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution, trans. R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • 1990, On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893–1917), trans. J. B. Brough, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • 1994, Early Writings in the Philosophy of Logic and Mathematics, trans. D. Willard, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • 1997, Psychological and Transcendental Phenomenology and the Confrontation with Heidegger (1927–1931), trans. T. Sheehan and R. Palmer, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • 1999, The Essential Husserl, ed. D. Welton, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.

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  • –––, 1982b, “Das Problem der passiven Konstitution,” in: Ludwig Landgrebe, Faktizität und Individuation, Hamburg: Meiner, 71–87.
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Other Internet Resources


Research on an earlier version of this article was supported by the German Research Foundation (DFG) in the framework of the Lichtenberg-Kolleg of the Georg-August University of Göttingen. A later version was based on research pursued at the Centre for Advanced Study in Oslo, Norway, that funded and hosted the research project “Disclosing the Fabric of Reality—The Possibility of Metaphysics in the Age of Science” during the academic year of 2015/16.

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Christian Beyer

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