Feminist Metaphysics

First published Tue Feb 27, 2007; substantive revision Fri Aug 11, 2017

Metaphysics is the study of the basic structure of reality, of what there is and what it is like. It considers, for example, concepts such as identity, causation, substance, and kind, that seem to be presupposed by any form of inquiry; and it attempts to determine what there is at the most general level. For example, are there minds in addition to bodies? Do things persist through change? Is there freewill or is all action determined by prior events? But since metaphysics not only concerns itself with what there is (ontology), but also the nature of that which exists, metaphysicians ask, for example, whether numbers, if they exist, are dependent upon human thought and practices in some way, whether the concepts and categories we use to think of and describe reality influence or determine in any way what is described, and whether and how values are embodied in our categories and descriptions. It should thus not come as a surprise that there could be a specifically feminist metaphysics, where the question of prime importance is to what extent the central concepts and categories of metaphysics, in terms of which we make sense of our reality, could be value laden in ways that are particularly gendered.

In this way, feminist theorists have asked whether and, if so, to what extent our frameworks for understanding the world are distorting in ways that privilege men or masculinity. What, if anything, is eclipsed if we adopt an Aristotelian framework of substance and essence, or a Cartesian framework of immaterial souls present in material bodies? And is what’s left out of such frameworks relevant to the devaluation or oppression of women? Feminists have also considered the structure of social reality and the relationship between the social world and the natural world. Because social structures are often justified as natural, or necessary to control what’s natural, feminists have questioned whether such references to nature are legitimate. This has led to considerable work on the idea of social construction and, more specifically, the social construction of gender.

1. Questions

Speaking very generally, the project of feminist metaphysics asks: Have metaphysical claims about what there is, and what it is like, supported sexism, and if so, how? Are there particular metaphysical assumptions or patterns of inference that feminists should challenge (or endorse)? Replies to these questions have offered critiques and reconstructions of concepts for thinking about, e.g., the self (Meyers 1997, 2004a; Willett, Anderson, & Meyers 2016), sex and sexuality (Butler 1987, 1990, 1993; Fausto-Sterling 2000), mind and body (Bordo 1987, 1993; Young 1990; Scheman 1993; Gatens 1996; Wendell 1996; Schiebinger 2000), nature (Lloyd 1984; Haraway1991; Butler 1993; Warren 1997), essence (Witt 1993, 1995, 2011b,c; Schor & Weed 1994; Stoljar 1995), identity (Spelman 1988; Lugones 1994; Young 1994; Frye 1996; Lindemann Nelson 2001; Alcoff 2006; Warnke 2008; Heinämaa 2011; Lindemann 2014), and objectification (Papadaki 2015). Feminists have also questioned whether metaphysics is a legitimate form of inquiry at all, raising epistemological questions about, e.g., foundationalist assumptions implicit in metaphysical inquiry (Irigaray 1985; Flax 1986; Fraser & Nicholson 1990; Haslanger 2000a). We will focus here on the former set of issues, mentioning methodological and epistemological questions only in passing.

To begin an overview of feminist metaphysics in this century, it is helpful to return to Simone de Beauvoir’s classic work The Second Sex (Beauvoir 1949). Two of her most famous claims appear to have profound metaphysical implications: “One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman”, (Beauvoir [1949] 1989: 267) and “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other” (Beauvoir [1949] 1989: xxviii). There is disagreement about how to interpret both claims, yet to many the former serves as the slogan for the view that gender is socially constructed, and the latter identifies the content of feminine construction as what is opposed to the masculine, the masculine also being what counts as the subject or self. Three interconnected themes prominent in feminist metaphysics emerge here: (i) the social construction of gender (and other categories), (ii) the relational nature of the self (and other categories), (iii) the dangers of dualistic thinking. We will conclude by mentioning the challenges feminist metaphysics poses to the content and practice of mainstream metaphysics.

2. Social Construction

In claiming that one is not born a woman, Beauvoir was not suggesting that one is never born with female body parts; rather, her concern was that possession of female (or male) body parts, in and of itself, does not imply how one could or should be socially situated.[1] In spite of this, societies, for the most part, reserve for females certain social roles, norms, and activities that disadvantage them in relation to males, casting the differences as necessary because natural (Beauvoir [1949] 1989: Ch.1). If it is recognized, as Beauvoir urged, that what women and men are is at least partly a social matter, this opens up the possibility that gender roles could be and so should be made more equitable through social change. To simplify discussion, we will use the terms ‘male’/‘female’ to mark the currently familiar sex distinction drawn in terms of primary and secondary sex characteristics, and ‘man’/‘woman’ to mark the gender distinction, where gender is, according to the slogan, “the social meaning of sex”.

This theme—that social hierarchies are sustained through myths of their natural basis—has prompted a tremendous amount of work on the construction of gender in particular (Delphy 1984; Scott 1986; MacKinnon 1989; Butler 1990; Wittig 1992; Alcoff 2006; Warnke 2008; Witt 2011a,c; Haslanger 2012), but also on the construction of other “naturalized” social categories such as race (Appiah 1996; Zack 2002; Warnke 2008) and in a somewhat different way, sexuality (Butler 1990, 1993; Fausto-Sterling 2000). Research in history, anthropology, literature, and sociology has chronicled the various mechanisms by which gender (and other such categories) is enforced, and research in psychology and biology has further loosened the ties between body types and social roles. Having witnessed the power of naturalizing “myths”, feminists tend to be wary of any suggestion that a category is “natural” or that what’s “natural” should dictate how we organize ourselves socially. However, there are several different de-naturalizing projects that are often mistaken for each other that engage different sorts of metaphysical issues.

2.1 The Construction of Ideas and Concepts

It is important to distinguish first the construction of ideas and the construction of objects[2] (Hacking 1999: 9–16). Let’s start with ideas. On one reading, the claim that an idea or a concept is only possible within and due to a social context is utterly obvious. It would seem to be a matter of common sense that concepts are taught to us by our parents through our language; different cultures have different concepts (that go along with their different languages); and concepts evolve over time as a result of historical changes, science, technological advances, etc. Let’s (albeit contentiously) call this the “ordinary view” of concepts and ideas. Even someone who believes that our scientific concepts perfectly map “nature’s joints” can allow that scientists come to have the ideas and concepts they do through social-historical processes. After all, social and cultural forces (including, possibly, the practices and methods of science) may help us develop concepts that are apt or accurate, and beliefs that are true.

We may sometimes forget that what and how we think is affected by social forces because our experiences seem to be caused simply and directly by world itself. However, it does not take much prompting to recall that our culture is largely responsible for the interpretive tools we bring to the world in order to understand it. Once we’ve noted that our experience of the world is already an interpretation of it, we can begin to raise questions about the adequacy of our conceptual framework. Concepts help us organize phenomena; different concepts organize it in different ways. It is important, then, to ask: what phenomena are highlighted and what are eclipsed by a particular framework of concepts? What assumptions provide structure for the framework?

For example, our everyday framework for thinking about human beings is structured by the assumptions that there are two (and only two) sexes, and that every human is either a male or a female. But in fact a significant percentage of humans have a mix of male and female anatomical features. Intersexed bodies are eclipsed in our everyday framework (Fausto-Sterling 2000). This should invite us to ask: Why? Whose interests are served, if anyone’s, by the intersexed being ignored in the dominant conceptual framework? (It can’t be plausibly argued that sex isn’t important enough to us to make fine-grained distinctions between bodies!) Further, once we recognize the intersexed, how should we revise our conceptual framework? Should we group bodies into more than two sexes, or are there reasons instead to complicate the definitions of male and female to include everyone in just two sex categories? More generally, on what basis should we decide what categories to use? (Fausto-Sterling 2000; Butler 1990: Ch. 1) What is the proper scope of application of these categories? In asking these questions it is important to remember that an idea or conceptual framework may be inadequate without being false, e.g., a claim might be true and yet incomplete, misleading, unjustified, biased, etc. (Anderson 1995).

Saying that this or that idea is socially constructed may just be an invitation to recall the ordinary view of concepts and note the motivations behind and limitations of our current framework. Every framework will have some limits; the issue is whether the limits eclipse something that, given the (legitimate) goals of our inquiry, matters. However, sometimes a social constructionist is making a more controversial claim. The suggestion would be that something or other is “merely” a social construction, in other words, that what we are taking to be real is only a fiction, an idea that fails to capture reality. Feminists have argued, for example, that certain mental “disorders” that have been used to diagnose battered women are merely social constructions. Andrea Westlund points out how

[b]attered women’s “abnormalities” have been described and redescribed within the psychiatric literature of the twentieth century, characterized as everything from hysteria to masochistic or self-defeating personality disorders (SDPD) to codependency (Herman 1992, 116–118; Tavris 1992, 170–207). Moreover, such pathologies measure, classify, and define battered women’s deviance not just from “normal” female behavior but also from universalized male norms of independence and self-interest. (Westlund 1999, 1050–1)

Such diagnoses invite us to explain domestic violence by reference to the woman’s psychological state rather than the batterer’s need for power and control; they also “deflect attention from the social and political aspects of domestic violence to the private neuroses to which women as a group are thought to be prone” (Westlund 1999: 1051). Westlund and others have argued that although victims of domestic violence often do suffer from psychological conditions, e.g., major depression, there is a range of gender coded mental disorders included in the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorder (DSM) for which there is little, if any, good evidence. These diagnoses, it could be claimed, are merely social constructions in the sense that they are ideas used to interpret and regulate social phenomena, but do not describe anything real. Applying this to the case at hand would entail that “Self-Defeating Personality Disorder” doesn’t really exist. The description of SDPD does not capture a mental disorder of the sort alleged.[3]

So in considering the claim that something is socially constructed, we should ask first: Is it an object or an idea? If it is an idea, then we should raise a series of epistemological questions, e.g., are we justified in employing this idea as we do, and metaphysical questions, e.g., is there anything real corresponding to the idea, or is it a fiction? Social constructionists often begin by noticing that an idea is functioning socially to support an unjust institution and then consider how that idea functions within a broader framework of ideas and concepts to structure our experience: does it illegitimately or inappropriately privilege one set of phenomena over another? Does it obscure some phenomena completely? Does it create an illusion of certain kinds of things?

Of course in some contexts privileging certain phenomena is useful and even necessary: medical sciences are not “neutral” with respect to what phenomena count as significant and how they are categorized; medicine has a legitimate concern with human health and the organisms that affect human health. However, other things being equal, medicine that privileges phenomena related to men’s health or the health of the wealthy would not be epistemically or politically legitimate (Anderson 1995). Considering what is left out of a framework of categories, or what assumptions structure it can also reveal biases of many sorts.

In some cases of social construction what’s at issue is the aptness of the classification, in other cases it is whether the classification captures a natural kind or a social kind. In yet further cases, the point is to reveal that classification does not describe anything real at all and, instead, is just a fiction being treated as real. In such cases, substantial work must be done to demonstrate that the idea in question is only a fiction. But that’s not all, for we should also ask: How are such distortions and fictions established and maintained? Whose interests do they serve?

2.2 The Construction of Objects

Now consider objects (understanding ‘objects’ in the broadest sense as virtually anything that’s not an idea). There is a sense in which any artifact is a construction; but claiming that scissors or cars are social constructions would not have much point, given how mundane this claim would be. Social constructionists, on the whole, are arguing for a surprising thesis that they believe challenges our everyday view of things. It is much more surprising to say that women or Asian-Americans, homosexuals, child abusers, or refugees, are social constructions. What could this mean?

In considering the construction of objects, the first point to note is that our classificatory schemes, at least in social contexts, may do more than just map pre-existing groups of individuals; rather our attributions have the power to both establish and reinforce groupings which may eventually come to “fit” the classifications. This works in several ways. Forms of description or classification provide for kinds of intention; e.g., given the classification “cool”, we can set about to become cool, or avoid being cool, etc. But also, such classifications can function in justifying behavior; e.g., “we didn’t invite him because he’s not cool”, and such justifications, in turn, can reinforce the distinction between those who are cool and those who are uncool. Drawing on Ian Hacking’s work, Haslanger has referred to this as “discursive” construction:

Discursive construction: something is discursively constructed just in case it is (to a significant extent) the way it is because of what is attributed to it or how it is classified. (Haslanger 1995: 99)

Admittedly, the idea here is quite vague (e.g., how much is “a significant extent”?). However, social construction in this sense is ubiquitous. Each of us is socially constructed in this sense because we are (to a significant extent) the individuals we are today as a result of what has been attributed and self-attributed to us. For example, being classified as able-bodied females from birth has profoundly affected the paths available to us in life and the sort of persons we have become.

Note, however, that to say that an entity is “discursively constructed” is not to say that language or discourse brings a material object into existence de novo. Rather something in existence comes to have—partly as a result of having been categorized in a certain way—a set of features that qualify it as a member of a certain kind or sort.[4] Someone’s having been categorized as a female at birth (and consistently since then) has been a factor in how she has been viewed and treated; these views and treatments have, in turn, played an important causal role in her becoming gendered as a woman. For example, let us suppose for current purposes that being gendered as a woman is to occupy in one’s social context a broad role associated with female reproductive capacities. It is through a process of socialization—being viewed and treated as a girl—that she learned, and eventually internalized, what the “proper” role for females is and how to mark herself as occupying it. So she learned that girls only eat so much, only play such games, only wear certain clothes. Whether or not she accepts these norms, negotiating them was the process by which she became a woman; but discourse didn’t bring her into existence.

It would appear that gender (in different senses) is both an idea-construction and an object-construction. Gender is an idea-construction because the classification men/women is the contingent result of historical events and forces. As we saw above, the everyday distinction between males and females leaves out the intersexed population that might have been given its own sex/gender category. Arguably, in fact, some cultures have divided bodies into three sexual/reproductive groups. At the same time the classifications ‘woman’ and ‘man’ are what Hacking calls “interactive kinds”: gender classifications occur within a complex matrix of institutions and practices, and being classified as a woman (or not), or a man (or not), or third, fourth, fifth sex/gender or not, has a profound effect on an individual. Such classification will have a material effect on one’s social position as well as affect one’s experience and self-understanding. In this sense, women and men—concrete individuals—are constructed as gendered kinds of people, i.e., we are each object constructions (see Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2015 for further details).

2.3 Construction and Constitution

There is yet a further sense in which something might be a social construction. So far we’ve been focusing on social causation: to say that something is socially constructed is to say that it is caused to be a certain way, and the causal process involves social factors, e.g., social forces were largely responsible for my coming to have the idea of a husband, and social forces were largely responsible for there being husbands. But often when theorists argue that something is a social construction the point is not about causation. Rather, the point is to distinguish social kinds from physical kinds. In the case of gender, the point is that gender is not a classification scheme based simply on anatomical or biological differences, but marks social differences between individuals. Gender, as opposed to sex, is not about testicles and ovaries, the penis and the uterus, but about a system of social categories (see, e.g., Haslanger 1993, 2000b; also Wittig 1992; Delphy 1984; MacKinnon 1989).

Consider, for example, the category of landlords. To be a landlord one must be located within a broad system of social and economic relations which includes tenants, private property, and the like. It might be that all and only landlords have a mole behind their left ear. But even if this were the case, having this physical mark is not what it is to be a landlord. Similarly, one might want to draw a distinction between sex and gender, sex being an anatomical distinction based on locally salient sexual/reproductive differences (see Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2011 for an alternative conception), and gender being a distinction between the social/political positions of those with bodies marked as of different sexes. One could allow that the categories of sex and gender interact (so concerns with distinctions between bodies will influence social divisions and vice versa); but even to be clear how they interact, we should differentiate them. With this distinction between sex and gender in hand, it is possible that some males are women and some females are men. Because, on this conception, one is a female by virtue of some (variable) set of anatomical features, and one is a woman by virtue of one’s position within a social and economic system, the sex/gender distinction gives us some (at least preliminary) resources for including trans* people within our conceptual framework (see further Bettcher 2014).

In considering this form of social construction, or we might call it social constitution, it is important to note that social kinds cannot be equated with things that have social causes. Sociobiologists claim that some social phenomena have biological causes; some feminists claim that anatomical phenomena have social causes, e.g., the gap in average height and strength differences between men and women in a particular context depends on, among other things, gender norms in that context concerning food and exercise.[5] As Ruth Hubbard explains,

…we live in dynamic interaction with our environment. Sex differences are socially constructed because being raised as a girl or a boy produces biological as well as social differences. Society defines the sex-appropriate behavior to which each of us learns to conform, and our behavior affects our bones, muscles, sense organs, nerves, brain, lungs, circulation, everything. In this way society constructs us as biologically, as well as socially, gendered people. (Hubbard 1990: 138)

It is also significant that not all social kinds are obviously social. Sometimes it is assumed that the conditions for membership in a kind concern only or primarily biological or physical facts. Pointing out that this is wrong can have important consequences. For example, the idea that whether or not a person is white is not simply a matter of their physical features, but concerns their position in a social matrix, has been politically significant, and to many surprising. How should we construe the constructionist project of arguing that a particular kind is a social kind? What could be interesting or radical about such a project?

Suppose Sally says “I am a white woman”. What does this mean? Suppose we pose these questions to someone who is not a philosopher, someone not familiar with the academic social constructionist literature. A likely response will involve mention of her physical features: reproductive organs, skin color, etc. The gender and race constructionists will reject this response and will argue that what makes the claim apt concerns the social relations in which she stands. On this construal, the important social constructionist import in Beauvoir’s claim that “one is not born but rather becomes a woman”, (Beauvoir 1949) is not that one is caused to be feminine by social forces; rather, the important insight was that being a woman is not an anatomical matter but a social matter.

Because being a woman is a social matter, if we allow that social phenomena are highly variable across time, cultures, groups, then this also allows us to recognize that the specific details of it is to be a woman will differ depending on one’s race, ethnicity, class, etc. Sally’s being a woman occurs in a context in which she is also white and privileged; her actual social position will therefore be affected by multiple factors simultaneously. She learned the norms of WASP womanhood, not Black womanhood. And even if she rejected many of those norms, she benefits from the fact that they are broadly accepted.

The social constructionist’s goal is often to challenge the appearance of inevitability of the category in question; as things are arranged now, there are men and women, and people of different races. But if social conditions changed substantially, there would be no men and women, and no people of different races. It would be possible, then, to do away with the conceptual frameworks that we currently use. But an important first step is to make the category visible as a social as opposed to physical category. This sometimes requires a rather radical change in our thinking.

It is worth keeping in mind, also, that constitutive social constructionist projects offer a metaphysics of the category in question, i.e., an answer to the question what the nature of the category is. Causal constructionist projects do not do that, but rather cast light on the ways in which social practices are implicated as the causes or effects of phenomena (Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2015).

Considerable amount of recent work has focused on the metaphysics of social kinds and social properties more generally (Frye 2011; Mikkola 2006, 2011; Stoljar 2011; Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2011; Witt 2011a,c). There has also been a lot of attention given to accounts of gender. We turn to that now.

2.4 The Construction of Gender

While the question of what gender is has always been a central question for feminism and feminist theory, it has received increased attention in recent years. We will discuss why an account of gender is important for feminist theory and point out how any theorizing is always situated in a political landscape that is both spatially and temporally bounded. The examples we will use are two recent book length treatments of gender, by Sally Haslanger and Charlotte Witt; both offer accounts of the metaphysics of gender, i.e., of the nature of gender categories. We will also mention in passing some other recent accounts, but for a fuller discussion of gender see Mikkola 2016a.

The aim of feminism is, in the most general terms, to end the oppression of women. The goal of feminist theory is, therefore, to theorize how women are oppressed and how we can work towards ending it. But what is this group women? Whose oppression is the movement aiming to end? For articulating the various ways in which women are oppressed, there is a need for a working definition of what it is to be a woman (for a contrary view see Mikkola 2016b). But the various accounts of the different dimensions (social, economical, psychological, etc.) of the oppression of women may in fact call for different accounts of gender. It is, therefore, not always clear that seemingly incompatible accounts of gender are in fact incompatible. They may in fact often be answering different questions.

Let’s go back to Simone de Beauvoir’s words, “One is not born a woman, but rather becomes one”. On this picture, one is born biologically female or male and slowly becomes socialized into a woman or man. What is the relationship between sex and gender here? The slogan used by feminists since the seventies, as mentioned before, is gender is the social meaning of sex and gender is thought to be a social construction.

Sally Haslanger embraces the slogan gender is the social meaning of sex and the conception of gender that she offers is to do justice to that slogans (Haslanger 2012). While she discusses many ways something can be socially constructed, a central conception of social construction she is aiming to articulate is one that makes sense of that slogan. Here is her account of gender (Haslanger 2012: 234):

S is a woman if and only if

  1. S is regularly and for the most part observed or imagined to have certain bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female’s biological role in reproduction;
  2. that S has these features marks S within the dominant ideology of S’s society as someone who ought to occupy certain kinds of social position that are in fact subordinate (and so motivates and justifies S occupying such a position); and
  3. the fact that S satisfies (i) and (ii) plays a role in S’s systematic subordination, that is, along some dimension, S’s social position is oppressive, and S’s satisfying (i) and (ii) plays a role in that dimension of subordination.

S is a man if and only if

  1. S is regularly and for the most part observed or imagined to have certain bodily features presumed to be evidence of a male’s biological role in reproduction;
  2. that S has these features marks S within the dominant ideology of S’s society as someone who ought to occupy certain kinds of social position that are in fact privileged (and so motivates and justifies S’s occupying such a position); and
  3. the fact that S satisfies (i) and (ii) plays a role in S’s systematic privilege, that is, along some dimension, S’s social position is privileged, and S’s satisfying (i) and (ii) plays a role in that dimension of privilege.

Genders are socially constructed constitutively. To be of a gender is to have a place in a hierarchical structure and genders are constituted by the hierarchical power relations. So here we have an account of constitutive construction: genders are social statuses constituted by hierarchical power relations. How does this do justice to the aforementioned slogan? To be of a certain gender is to be taken to have bodily features presumed to be evidence of a role in biological reproduction and occupy a hierarchical social position because of that.

Haslanger’s account of the social construction of gender is an answer to the question what type of thing genders are, how they are created and maintained. According to her account, genders are social statuses within a hierarchical social structure and not, for example, biological categories. On her view, when offering a theory of something, be it gender or something else, we always have to ask what we want the theory for: what questions is the theory supposed to answer, what bring to light? And a theory is always a child of its maker, and their time and place, and is offered in the context of the conversations and political and activist struggles that are taking place then. For instance, Haslanger first articulated her theory of gender in 1995–1996, and wanted to give an account that didn’t define women in terms of some intrinsic (biological or psychological) trait, but rather, in the materialist feminist tradition, considered women to be a social class. The aim was to highlight certain structural injustices we are all party to, but not to give an account of gender to settle all questions regarding gender. A structural account differs in aims from one that has as its central target to capture people’s own conceptions of their experience. For critical engagements with Haslanger’s theory, it is helpful to begin with Mills 2014, Jones 2014, Haslanger 2014, Mikkola 2016a, and Bettcher 2012.

Charlotte Witt offers an account of gender in her recent book, The Metaphysics of Gender (2011c) that draws on Aristotle as well as feminist theory. The chief aim of Witt’s account is to give a metaphysics of gender that can elucidate the centrality of gender in our lived experience and she develops a framework to make sense of that centrality. Her claim is that as a matter of fact, in western late-capitalist societies like the United States, gender is uniessential to social individuals. Let us flesh this out (here we draw on Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2012).

First, for a function to be uniessential to an entity is for it to unify and organize all the parts of that individual into the whole that is the individual. For example, the time-telling function unifies and organizes all the tiny metal parts (hands, spring, gears, etc) into the whole which is the watch itself. Similarly, the sheltering function unifies and organizes all the planks of a wooden house into the entity that is the house itself.

Gender, understood in this way, is a function that organizes all the parts of a social individual into the social individual it is. The parts in question are all the other social roles the social individual occupies: parent, friend, professor, child, colleague, etc. Gender (man, woman) is a mega social role that unifies all the other social roles into the agent that is the social individual. Being a woman, a parent, etc, is to occupy a social position, with which come norms of behavior. The social individual is the entity that occupies all these social positions, the bearer of these social properties, if you will.

The social individual is distinct from the human organism and the person because the social individual stands in social relations essentially, but human organisms and persons do so only accidentally. Similarly, the person is distinct from the human organism and the social individual because the person has the capacity to take a first person perspective on itself essentially, but the human organism and the social individual only have that accidentally. Finally, the human organism has certain biological features essentially, but the person and the social individual does so only accidentally. For critical engagements with Witt’s theory, it is helpful to begin with Cudd 2012, Mikkola 2012, and Ásta Sveinsdóttir 2012.

There are a number of other recent accounts of gender. We mention some here briefly. For a fuller discussion, see Mikkola 2016a.

Natalie Stoljar (1995) argues that the concept of gender is a cluster concept. There are no features that all and only women share; rather the concept of woman stands for a cluster of features and one can be a woman in virtue of having one or more of these features. Linda Alcoff (2006) argues that gender is a position in a network of social and cultural institutions and ideologies. The gender position one occupies is defined by the possibilities one has with regard to biological reproduction. Ásta Sveinsdóttir (2011, 2013) offers a radically contextual account of gender, on which gender is a conferred social status. In different contexts different features serve as base features for the conferral of gender (role in biological reproduction, sexual role, self-identification, etc.). Theodore Bach (2012) argues that genders are natural kinds with a historical essence. To be a woman, on his view, is to be produced in the right way, have the right lineage. A woman has the right lineage if she is the product of “ontogenetic processes through which a historical gender system replicates women” (Bach 2012: 271). Jennifer McKitrick (2015) argues that gender is a dispositional property. One is of a certain gender just in case one is disposed to behave in certain ways in certain situations. Following Haslanger 2012, Katharine Jenkins (2016) gives an ameliorative account of gender, but one in which there are two target concepts: gender as class and gender as identity.

It is important to keep in mind when approaching the literature on gender that different theorists have different aims in mind when offering a theory of gender, and different phenomena that the accounts are to capture. Some want to capture something about lived experience, others highlight certain dimensions of injustice. For instance, while gender is a social position for both Witt and Haslanger, in our brief discussion we see that they are focused on different things in developing their accounts. Witt is focused on the centrality of gender and gender norms in our lived experience; Haslanger on structural gender oppression. Also, some theorists approach gender by giving an account of the (or a) concept of gender, others how certain words get used. Still others offer a real definition, a definition of the phenomenon itself, as opposed to a concept of it, or words used to refer to it. Yet others focus on gender identity. How all these projects are related and whether they do conflict may not be evident at first glance.

3. Relations

The previous section outlined ways in which feminists have problematized the idea that particular categories are “natural”. Similarly, feminists have problematized the idea that particular categories are intrinsic or non-relational. The critical charge, stated very generally, is that dominant frameworks for representing the world, especially the social world, purport to classify things on the basis of intrinsic properties when in fact the classifications are crucially dependent on relational properties.[6]

There are two forms of this critique, and correspondingly, two kinds of response. On the first form, the charge is that dominant frameworks misrepresent their subject matter by ignoring important relational aspects of what they purport to be talking about. For example, feminists have long charged that philosophical conceptions of the self, e.g., the conception of the independent rational self-regulator, are framed in atomistic terms, ignoring our inevitable and valuable dependence on each other. In response, feminists have urged us to recognize and revalue the complexity of subjectivity not addressed in models of rational agency, and to incorporate in our understanding of the self facts about the realities of human dependence and interdependence for which women have been primarily responsible (Meyers 1997; Kittay 1999; Stoljar 2015; Willett et al. 2016).

The second form of such critique also alleges that the dominant frameworks misrepresent their subject matter by obscuring what’s relational. However, the goal is not to capture and revalue the background relations as in the first form of this critique, but to challenge them. In the cases in question, the charge is that although the system of classification appears to be sorting individuals on the basis of intrinsic properties, in fact there are invidious relations that are being masked by these appearances (Flax 1986: 199–202). Just as there are reasons why dominant frameworks construct myths about what’s natural to justify subordinating practices, likewise they construct myths about what’s intrinsic.

Consider again Beauvoir’s claim that “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other”. Part of what is at stake in Beauvoir’s conception of women as Other is the idea that our conceptions of gender and of the self are implicitly relational, e.g., although it may seem that we can define what it is to be a woman without reference to men, in fact we cannot (Wittig 1992; MacKinnon 1989; Haslanger 1993). For Beauvoir, very roughly, women are those positioned as “Absolute Other”, i.e., as “Other” in relation to a group counting as “Subject” where the relation between these two groups never reverses so the “Other” becomes “Subject” (Beauvoir [1949] 1989: xxii, also xv–xxxiv). So, to be a woman is to stand in a complex set of social (and hierarchical) relations to men (mutatis mutandis for men). And to be a Subject is to stand in a complex set of social relations to some group of Others. For a nuanced recent account of Beauvoir’s view of subjectification and objectification’s role in that see Bauer 2011.

These particular claims of Beauvoir’s are, of course, controversial and would need further argument to be made plausible; but the claims are less important than the general idea that relations, especially social relations, are sometimes obscured by our ordinary frameworks for thinking of things. This is of special interest to feminists (and antiracists) for reasons linked to those we have for questioning the representation of a category as “natural”. Begin with a background assumption that social life cannot help but accommodate what’s “natural”. We then can contribute to some category’s appearing “natural” by supposing that the basis for membership in the category is intrinsic (thus obscuring the social relations that are the real basis for membership). In this context, pressure to change or abolish the category seems unreasonable.

These critiques raised invite us to ask: how should we re-conceptualize the self and other parts of our social ontology? What is the relation between intrinsicness and naturalness? On what basis can we claim that one framework is “masking” another?

4. Dualisms

In the previous section we outlined a project of “uncovering” relations in apparently non-relational frameworks. In the sort of cases we had in mind what’s “uncovered” are concrete social relations, e.g., relations of sexual subordination. However, Beauvoir’s claims about Subject and Other point to additional insights not yet explored.

In saying that “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—She is the Other”, part of Beauvoir’s point is that although it may appear that our distinction between subjects and non-subjects is a purely descriptive demarcation of a specific category of substances (selves), in fact, the distinction in use is normative and non-substantive. Begin with the issue of substances: one of the traditional characteristics of substances is that substances do not have opposites, i.e., there is no opposite of horse (non-horse does not count as an opposite). This is in contrast to many qualities: long/short, inside/outside, loud/quiet. One way of explicating Beauvoir’s suggestion is that once we look at the conditions for subjecthood, we see that there is an opposite to being a subject: subjects are, for example, free and autonomous persons, and the opposite of a free and autonomous person is someone unfree, in her terms, someone condemned to immanence. Moreover, it is not only the case that being a subject has an opposite, but that the opposition in question carries normative weight—so much so that the devalued side of the opposition (the Other) is denied reality in its own terms: what it is to be Other just is to be opposite to the Subject.

Again the feminist project is one of unmasking certain ordinary assumptions about our classifications of things: the category of Subject is not—ontologically speaking—what it may seem. More specifically, categories that appear to be descriptive may in fact be functioning normatively; and categories that appear to be substantive, may in fact be functioning as one end of a qualitative spectrum. Although Beauvoir’s example has us focus on the notion of a subject or self; feminists have explored the same form of argument with other notions, notably, sex, gender, and race.

There are two significant consequences of this sort of analysis. First, with substances, it is standardly supposed that you are a member of the kind or not and there is no middle ground: you are a horse or you aren’t. (Because there is no opposite or contrary to horse, the only negative option a contradictory.) Again we can contrast this with other opposites: there is a middle ground between long/short, inside/outside, loud/quiet; and some things avoid the opposition altogether, e.g., my coffee mug is neither loud nor quiet. Casting a category as substantial, then, limits the available categories for classification. For example, suppose we understand ‘male’ substantively. If males are a substance kind, then everything is either male or not-male, with no middle-ground. But if, in practice, ‘not-male’ actually functions as a way of picking out females, then it would seem that everything must be either male or female, and there can be no space for genuine categories of people who are intersexed, or other-sexed, or for refusing to sex people at all. One strategy, then, for undermining the idea that a category is substantival is to highlight the multiplicity of individuals and categories “in between” the primary category and its implicit opposite. Category proliferation—the generation of a continuum or genuinely “mixed” categories—can loosen the grip of substantival assumptions (Butler 1987; Lugones 1994; Haraway 1988; Zack 1995).

Second, in the case of substance kinds, those things that are not in the kind don’t themselves form a kind of their own. They are what’s “left over”. The class of all things that are not-horses includes computers, stars, dust, basketballs, people, etc. So, if we elide ‘not man’ and ‘woman’, then women are not read as a kind. As Marilyn Frye puts it,

When woman is defined as not-man, she is cast into the infinite undifferentiated plenum…[this partly explains why] many men can so naturally speak in parallel constructions of their cars and their women, and say things like, “It’s my house, my wife, and my money, and the government can’t tell me what to do about any of it”. It also illuminates the fact that women are so easily associated with disorder, chaos, irrationality, and impurity….There are no categories in not-man; it is a buzzing booming confusion. (Frye 1996: 1000)

Frye’s strategy is not to challenge the substantive status of the man-kind by proliferation, but to challenge its hegemony in the space of persons. So she proposes the construction of a woman-kind that is defined in its own terms, not simply by opposition to men (see Schor & Weed 1994). She argues, among other things, that this will require a recognition of real differences not only between men and women, but among women.[7]

This barely scratches the surface of feminist discussion of the dualisms that guide our thinking, both in philosophy and common sense. These include mind/body, reason/emotion (Jaggar 1989; Scheman 1993; Rooney 1993, 1994; Campbell 1998), nature/culture (Ortner 1972; Butler 1993), freedom/necessity (Mackenzie & Stoljar 2000; Hirschmann 2003; Holroyd 2011), agent/patient (Meyers 2004a,b). However, it does, hopefully, provide some introduction to the feminist issues that arise in thinking about classification, substances, dichotomy, and the potential political import of ontology and the prime importance of the question of value ladenness and attention to ideology in feminist theorizing (Alcoff 2011; Haslanger 2011; Janack 2011).

5. Overarching Themes

There are a couple of over-arching questions that are worth raising now with a (brief) overview in place. The outline offered here suggests that in a number of different ways feminists are keen to “unmask” or “uncover” or “demythologize” certain aspects of our ordinary (and philosophical) thinking. Where ordinarily we take ourselves to be dealing with an ontology of substances, natural things, intrinsic properties, we’re in fact dealing with an ontology of social things, relations, and non-substantive (and often normative) kinds. But what is the relationship between these sorts of “unmasking” projects and projects that count as part of “mainstream” philosophy, or more specifically, “mainstream” metaphysics? So much analytic metaphysics consists in “reconstructions” of our ordinary concepts; a significant amount of it is unabashedly “revisionary”. So along those lines, feminist metaphysics would seem to fit right in. Clearly feminist metaphysics differs from the mainstream in its subject matter and background assumptions, in particular in its focus on the possible value ladenness of our concepts, categories and theories, and its attention to the potential harms of justificatory ideologies. But are there more substantial differences? Is feminist metaphysics just “mainstream” metaphysics directed at different issues, or is there a deep difference? And if there is a deep difference, what exactly is it? Barnes and Mikkola have recently charged that certain prevalent conceptions of metaphysics in non-feminist circles even rule out feminist metaphysics. The charge is that prevalent conceptions of metaphysics in mainstream metaphysics take metaphysics to be concerned with the basic structure of reality and what is “fundamental”, where it is assumed that social reality cannot be fundamental or basic (Barnes 2014, forthcoming; Mikkola forthcoming). Jonathan Schaffer and Ted Sider have engaged with these charges (Schaffer forthcoming; Sider forthcoming), attempting to show that their respective metametaphysical theories allow room for feminist metaphysics and metaphysics of the social more generally.


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Thanks to Elizabeth Hackett. Some sections of this entry are drawn from Haslanger 1992.

Copyright © 2017 by
Sally Haslanger

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