Ancient Theories of Freedom and Determinism

First published Fri Oct 30, 2020

From at least Aristotle onwards, ancient philosophers engaged in systematic reflection on human agency. They asked questions about when people are morally responsible for their actions and what must be the case for people to deliberate and act effectively, and in doing so they confronted arguments that tried to establish that humans are not responsible and effective agents. But if we want to understand these philosophers correctly, we should be careful not to assimilate ancient theories of freedom and determinism too quickly to the problem of free will and determinism in contemporary philosophy, which asks whether causal determinism is compatible with the sort of freedom—or alternatively, with the sort of control over our actions—that is necessary for moral responsibility. (See the entries on free will and causal determinism.) While ancient philosophers did argue about whether causal determinism is compatible with moral responsibility, their concerns ranged more widely. We can divide their discussions into two broad areas.

The first is effective agency—do humans have the ability to act as they wish to, in order to get what they desire? Aristotle thinks that effective deliberation and action presupposes the openness or contingency of the future—that what is going to happen is not necessary. Aristotle confronts an argument that tries to establish that the future is necessary, and hence that deliberation and action are futile. This argument, however, proceeds not from causal determinism, but from what might be called “logical determinism”—the thesis that, from eternity, statements about the future have had fixed truth values. The Epicureans, Stoics, and academic skeptic Carneades confront the same argument, but they also consider the relationship between “logical determinism” and causal determinism, and whether causal determinism is compatible with effective agency.

The second area is moral responsibility, our ability to be justifiably subject to praise and reward, or blame and punishment for what we do. Aristotle gives an extended analysis of voluntary actions, ones for which a person is responsible. He asserts that humans are the origin of their voluntary actions, and that we have the ability to do otherwise than we do. But the problem of free will and determinism does not obviously arise in Aristotle’s discussion, because he does not consider whether moral responsibility is compatible with causal determinism, as a general thesis. Instead, he considers another threat to our responsibility, which we may dub “psychological determinism”: that our actions are automatically elicited by a combination of our psychological states, such as our desires and character traits, in conjunction with perceptual input, such that we are not really in control of what we do. In response, Aristotle argues that we are in control of our character, because it is a result of our earlier voluntary actions. Epicurus agrees with Aristotle that we are in charge of our character, which results in our actions, and he also contends that to argue that people are not responsible for their actions is self-refuting. Finally, Epicurus believes that causal determinism is incompatible with human freedom, and he introduces an indeterministic atomic motion, the “swerve”, to combat this threat—although how it is supposed to do so is unclear. The Stoics, on the other hand, affirm that every single event is causally determined by God in accordance with his providential plan, and they try to show how what we do is under our control in such a world. The later Aristotelian Alexander of Aphrodisias reacts to the Stoics by building an Aristotelian theory on which the ability to do otherwise is required for moral responsibility, and such an ability is incompatible with causal determinism. Plotinus, who takes himself to be following Plato, incorporates Stoic elements into his own theory of freedom, but his deep disagreements with Stoic metaphysics lead him to reject much of what they say about fate.

1. Fatalism, Bivalence, and Determinism

In the ancient world, a number of arguments were put forward that proceed from the Principle of Bivalence, a basic principle in logic, in order to establish fatalism—where “fatalism” is the view that the future is inevitable and we are powerless to do anything to shape it. Most prominently, these arguments are presented in chapter 9 of On Interpretation, Aristotle’s treatise on semantics, and in Cicero’s On Fate, which discusses the “Lazy Argument”. The “Master Argument”, a similar argument for the necessity of the future that was taken to have fatalist implications, is both put forward and endorsed by Diodorus Cronus (died c. 284 BCE). These arguments differ in their details, but in broad strokes here is how they all proceed. (Henceforward, “the fatalist argument” refers to this general argument.)

The Principle of Bivalence (PB) states that every statement has exactly one truth value: either true, or false. And because PB does apply to every statement, it applies also to statements about what will occur in the future. (The example Aristotle gives is “there will be a sea battle tomorrow”, while in On Fate Cicero talks about “you will recover from this illness”.) So for any pair of contradictory statements about the future—such as “you will recover from this illness” and “you will not recover from this illness”—exactly one of them is true, and has been true from eternity (Fat. 29, LS 55S; see the Bibliography for abbreviations used). But if it is true from eternity that an event will occur, then that event is necessary (Fat. 21, LS 38G). Since PB applies to every statement about what might occur in the future, every future event is necessary. (This is why, in the context of contemporary discussions of fatalist arguments that proceed from PB, PB is sometimes referred to as “logical determinism”.) However, because there is no point in deliberating about what is necessary (Int. 9 18b31–36), there is no point in deliberating about anything in the future. As Aristotle puts it, if the fatalist argument goes through,

there would be no need to deliberate or to take trouble (thinking that if we do this, this will happen, but if we do not it will not). For there is nothing to prevent someone’s having said ten thousand years beforehand that this would be the case, and another’s having denied it; so that whichever of the two was true to say then, will be the case of necessity. (Int. 9 18b31–36)

Aristotle makes it clear that it does not matter whether people actually made such predictions; what matters is that one of the uttered statements would have been true. Or as Cicero says, if it has been true from eternity that you will recover from an illness, then there would be no point in trying to bring about the recovery, since it will happen no matter what you do (Fat. 28, LS 55S).

Why believe the argument’s premise that, if a statement has been true from eternity, then the event that it predicts is necessary? One common reason is the immutability of the past, that we cannot now do anything to change the past. This immutability is the reason the Stoic Chrysippus gives (against Cleanthes, who preceded him as head of the Stoa) for why the past is necessary (Fat. 14, LS 38E). And if the past is necessary, it might seem to follow that I cannot now do anything to change the past truth of statements about the future. Aristotle thinks that the present is also necessary, saying “What is, necessarily is, when it is; and what is not, necessarily is not, when it is not” (Int. 19a23–5). After all, if I am presently bleeding from a wound, while it might be possible for me either to bleed to death or not, and I might do something to make it the case that I don’t bleed to death, I cannot do anything to change the fact that I am bleeding right now. But then, the present truth of a statement about what will result from my wound may also seem to make the outcome necessary, as much as the past truth would.

In connection with this argument, “necessary” does not mean metaphysically necessary, causally necessary, or logically necessary. Instead, things that are necessary are inevitable or beyond our power to affect. Aristotle gives mathematical truths, celestial motions and the past as examples of things we do not bother deliberating about. Aristotle, Epicurus, the academic skeptic Carneades, and the Stoic Chrysippus all wish to reject the conclusion of the fatalist argument, but they have different responses to the argument based on their views about whether the Principle of Bivalence is compatible with effective deliberation. After Aristotle, they also consider whether causal determinism is compatible with effective deliberation.

1.1 Aristotle and tomorrow’s sea battle

Aristotle thinks that the conclusion of the fatalist argument is false, because it is obvious that deliberation is not futile: we often deliberate about what to do, act upon that deliberation, and thereby bring things about that otherwise would not have occurred. And more generally, there are many things that are not necessary before they happen, but may either occur or not occur. Aristotle gives the example of a cloak wearing out: before it wore out, it did not have to wear out, as it was still possible that it be cut up instead. (Int. 9 19a8–a22)

Unfortunately, how Aristotle rejects the conclusion is less clear than that he rejects it, because De Interpretatione 9 is an extremely compressed text (see Gaskin 1995 and chapter 6 of Van Rijen 1989 for details). But on the most common and historically influential interpretation, Aristotle responds to the argument by rejecting its premise, that the Principle of Bivalence applies universally. Instead, it is true only for the most part and does not apply to statements about the future that can possibly be true or false, such as “there will be a sea battle tomorrow” or “this cloak will be cut up”. Let’s take the statement, “Over 100,000 people will die of Covid-19 in the United States in 2020”. Before 100,001 people die, it is not inevitable that this will occur; instead, it depends on what people do, and the statement is neither true nor false. Once 100,001 people die, then the statement changes truth value from Neutral or Indeterminate to True, as well as becoming necessary for us now, because we can no longer do anything about it.

1.2 Epicurus on the fatalist argument and determinism

In his response to the fatalist argument, Epicurus largely follows Aristotle (at least as Aristotle is commonly interpreted). He agrees with Aristotle that some things happen of necessity, and some by chance, while others depend on us (Ep. Men. 133, NE 3.3 1112a30–32). And he also thinks that, if the Principle of Bivalence applied to all statements, everything would be necessary, and so he rejects it, saying that statements like “Philoctetes will be wounded” are neither true nor false before Philoctetes is wounded or not (Fat. 37, LS 20H). Unlike Aristotle (Int. 9 19a30–33), Epicurus rejects not only PB, but also the Law of Excluded Middle—the principle that every statement of the form “p or not-p” is necessarily true. So Aristotle thinks that the statement “either there will be a sea battle tomorrow, or there will not be” is true, while Epicurus does not. Rejecting the Law of Excluded Middle might seem strange—after all, doesn’t p or not-p exhaust all of logical space? But Epicurus apparently thinks that for the disjunction as a whole to be true, one of its disjuncts would have to be true, and he does not want to admit this, because then (per the fatalist argument) that disjunct would also be necessary (Cicero, Academica 2.97, LS 20I).

Causal determinism does not figure into the fatalist argument in Aristotle’s De Interpretatione, or in Diodorus Cronus’ Master Argument for the necessity of the future. Instead, the arguments rely entirely on semantic and logical considerations. Cicero’s On Fate, however, introduces the topics of the relationship of causal determinism to the principle of bivalence, and of whether causal determinism has fatalistic implications. In this treatise, Cicero presents the positions of Epicurus, the Academic skeptic Carneades, and the Stoic Chrysippus.

Epicurus and the Stoics believe that the principle of bivalence with regard to statements about the future and causal determinism are interentailing: that is, a statement about the future is true if and only if there exists at that time sufficient causal conditions to bring about the state of affairs described in the statement. (Likewise, a statement will be false if and only if there exist sufficient conditions to preclude the state of affairs described in the statement, and neither true nor false if current conditions are sufficient neither to bring about nor to preclude the state of affairs described in the statement.) As the Stoics put it,

There cannot be things which are going to be true if they do not have causes of their future being. So things which are true must necessarily have causes. (Fat. 26, LS 70G)

Epicurus agrees (Fat. 19). On the other hand, if there is “motion without a cause”, i.e., events that are not causally determined, then both Epicurus and the Stoics agree that not every statement is either true or false (Fat. 20–1, LS 38G). The future has not occurred yet, so nothing exists at present to make a statement about the future true unless there presently exist sufficient conditions to bring about the state of affairs predicted by the statement.

Epicurus is a materialist in his metaphysics. For Epicurus, the two entities that exist per se are bodies and the empty space (the void) that they move in. The bodies that we see are aggregates of atoms, which are minute, uncuttable bodies. Anything else that exists—such as colors, time, or justice—depends for its existence on the existence of bodies and void. And so, everything that occurs depends ultimately on the motions of atoms through the void, with atomic motions caused by things like the atoms’ past motions and their collisions and entanglements with other atoms. Epicurus’ predecessor Democritus, one of the original inventors of atomism, thought that these were the only causes of atomic motion. The Epicureans believe that Democritus’ position would imply that the future is predetermined in a way that would make action and deliberation futile (Diogenes of Oinoanda, (inscription) 32.1.14—3.14, LS 20G), and Epicurus wants to avoid being

a slave to the ‘fate’ of the natural philosophers…which involves an inexorable necessity. (Ep. Men.134, LS 20A)

Since he thinks that both the logical principle of bivalence and causal determinism have fatalistic implications, he rejects both bivalence and causal determinism. In order to avoid fatalism, within his materialism and atomism, Epicurus posits an indeterministic atomic motion, the “swerve” (Fat. 22, LS 20E). As the Epicurean poet Lucretius puts it, if atomic motion were caused only by the weight of atoms and their collisions and entanglements, human beings, as well as all other animals, would be subject to necessity and unable to move themselves around as they please. But we obviously can move ourselves around as we please, and so there is another cause of atomic motion, an occasional minute swerve to the side that occurs “at no fixed region of space or fixed time” and liberates us from fate (DRN 2.251–93, LS 20F). Because determinism is false, the future is still open, and statements like “you will recover from an illness” are, at present, neither true nor false.

1.3 Carneades on the fatalist argument and a voluntary motion of our minds

Carneades also wishes to rebut the fatalist argument and deny that what will occur is inevitable.[1] Unlike Aristotle and Epicurus, however, he does not reject the Principle of Bivalence, and he says that whenever you have a pair of contradictory statements, such as “Tim O’Keefe will die from cancer” and “Tim O’Keefe will not die from cancer”, one is true and the other false (Fat. 37, LS 20H). Instead of rejecting PB, he thinks the fatalist argument goes wrong when it assumes that if it is true from eternity that an event will occur, then that event is necessary. That is because both Epicurus and Stoics are wrong to believe that the principle of bivalence and causal determinism are interentailing. The truth of a statement does not imply that there are “immutable eternal causes” that make it true (Fat. 28, LS 70G). Instead, it is simply the fact that things will turn out as the statement says they will that makes it true.

An example to illustrate Carneades’ position: let us imagine that Tim O’Keefe develops cancer, but he seeks out treatment, recovers, and ends up dying peacefully in his sleep of other causes at the age of 100, in 2068. If somebody were to say, in 2020, “Tim O’Keefe will not die of cancer”, they said something true, because, just as they said, Tim O’Keefe in fact did not die of cancer. Their statement was not “neutral” when they made it, and later became true; it was true all along. In order to defend his position, Carneades appeals to the symmetry of the past and future:

For just as we call “true” those past things of which it was at an earlier time true that they were being actualized, so we will call “true” those future things that of which it will later be true that they are being actualized. (Fat. 27, LS 70G)

Just as something’s being true in the past does not depend on its having certain effects now, something’s being true in the future does not depend on its having certain causes now. If the statement “Tim O’Keefe was adopted in 1968” is now true, it is not true because he presently remembers being told by his mother and father that they adopted him, or because of any of the other present effects of his adoption. Instead, it is true simply because he was, as a matter of fact, adopted in 1968.

To understand Carneades’ position, we should distinguish between the truthmaker for a statement and the cause of an event. If I go to the doctor and recover from my cancer, the cause of my recovering from the disease is the doctor’s treatment, and the cause of my going to the doctor is my decision to do so. The truthmaker for the statement “Tim will recover from his cancer” is my recovering from the cancer, but the statement’s eternal truth doesn’t cause my future recovery. Once we make this distinction, then we should see that the principle of bivalence does not threaten our freedom. According to Carneades, our own voluntary actions are one of the causes of events. And these actions are under our control. The way Carneades puts it is that the cause of our actions is a “voluntary motion of the mind”, a motion which has an intrinsic nature of being in our power and of obeying us (Fat. 24–5, LS 20E). There is a truth beforehand concerning how I will act, e.g., that I will seek out treatment for my cancer. But my action of seeking out treatment is nonetheless under my control, and my seeking out the treatment is not necessary, as I have the ability not to seek out the treatment. (Consider here Carneades’ analogy with the past: just because there is a truth about how I did voluntarily act in the past, this does not imply that my past actions were not under my control, or that it was necessary that I act in the ways that I did.)

Carneades thinks that, while the fatalist argument from bivalence fails, the fatalist argument can be successfully restated in terms of causal determinism, since causal determinism is incompatible with our actions truly being in our power (Fat. 31, LS 70G.) That is because, for our actions to be in our power, we must have the ability to make things turn out otherwise than they actually do turn out (Fat. 45), and this ability is incompatible with all things being predetermined by an interconnected chain of natural causes (Fat. 31, LS 70G). According to Carneades, human actions have a cause—the “voluntary motion of the mind”—but the way in which we exercise this power and move ourselves is not itself causally necessitated.

This is why Carneades denies that even the gods can foretell the future. Carneades assumes that to know what is going to occur in the future, you must know the present causes which will bring about that future event. For instance, in order to know that a major earthquake will occur in California a year hence, I would need to have information about the present disposition of California’s various faults and the pressure they are exerting on one another, along with the facts about things like how faults operate, which all together will bring about the future quake. Not even Apollo, however, can foretell events like Oedipus killing his father, even though it has always been true that Oedipus would do so. That is because such actions, before they occur, have no pre-existing causes that would bring them about, that Apollo could inspect in order to tell that they are going to occur (Fat. 32–33, LS 70G).

1.4 The Stoics on the fatalist argument and co-fated events

Epicurus believes that both the Principle of Bivalence and causal determinism are false; the Stoics believe that both are true, and that their truth does not render us powerless or make what will happen inevitable. In fact, the Stoics think that every event is both causally determined and fated. The Stoics believe that God is wise, good, perfectly happy, and creator of the world (DL 7.147, LS 54A). But God is not an immaterial entity separate from the world who created it ex nihilo—instead, god is the world. and his mind pervades and organizes all things (Cicero, On the Nature of the Gods 1.39, LS 54B; Alexander, On Mixture 225, 1–2, LS 54H). Because God is good, he wishes to benefit everything (Clement, The teacher 1.8.63 1–2, LS 60I). So God’s providential will is to make the world the best he can. God is extremely powerful but not omnipotent, as he works within the limits of what is physically possible, like a craftsman skillfully building something with the materials at hand. The way God realizes his providential will is through setting up the causal order of the world to bring it about. Fate is an everlasting “ordering and sequence of causes” which brings about every single thing that has happened, is happening, and is going to happen. This is “not the ‘fate’ of superstition, but that of physics” (Cicero, On Divination 1.125–6, LS 55L). So for example, if God has it as part of his providential plan that I will recover from cancer, God will fate my recovery by building that future event into the overall organization of the cosmos from its foundation, so that the fated recovery will necessarily arise as the series of causes unspools itself over time.

The Stoics believe that having everything that occurs fated in this way is compatible with our deliberating and acting effectively. To see this, consider the following example. Suppose that I am a Stoic, and I contract cancer. As a Stoic, I realize that it has been true from eternity and fated either that I will recover from the cancer, or that I will not. But that does not render the outcome of my cancer inevitable or make it pointless for me to seek treatment. The Stoic Chrysippus says that certain outcomes are simple, while others are conjoined. Simple outcomes are ones that will occur no matter what I do. For instance, as a mortal being, that I will die is inevitable; it will happen no matter what I do.[2] In the case of such simple outcomes, deliberation and action would be pointless. However, other things are conjoined, where an outcome is linked to its cause, which is necessary for it to occur. For instance, if Oedipus is going to be born of Laius, that is conjoined with Laius and Jocasta having intercourse. In the case of my fated recovery from cancer, that fated recovery is conjoined to my action of seeking treatment, and Chrysippus says that the two are “co-fated”: it is fated (and causally determined) both that I will recover from the cancer and that I will seek treatment; it is through my fated action of seeking treatment that my fated recovery will occur (Fat. 30, LS 55S). Since my action of seeking treatment is causally efficacious in bringing about its purpose, it isn’t pointless. My action is itself both causally determined and causally efficacious. Furthermore, even if it’s causally determined that I’ll recover, counterfactuals like “if I don’t seek treatment, I will die” can still be true. As Chrysippus puts it, even if it’s true (and causally determined) that somebody will wrestle, it doesn’t follow that they’ll wrestle whether or not they have an opponent, and even if it’s true (and causally determined) that somebody will recover from a disease, it doesn’t follow that they’ll recover whether or not they call a doctor (Fat. 30, LS 55S).

The Stoics say that actions like my seeking treatment for cancer, which are brought about by fate through the animal, are “in the power” of the animal, but they deny that we are free to choose between opposite actions—seeking treatment or not seeking treatment (Alexander, On Fate ch 13, 181,13–182,20, LS 62G). The Stoics believe Carneades is wrong to think that we need such a power to choose between opposite actions in order to stave off the fatalist argument and avoid its conclusion that the future is inevitable and we are powerless to do anything to shape it. Even if my action of seeking treatment is causally determined, and I do not have the ability not to seek treatment, seeking treatment can still lead to the cure of my cancer, a cure that would not have happened if I had not sought treatment. Like Aristotle, who was not willing to give up the idea that we effectively deliberate about our actions, the Stoics posit that I can effectively and rationally deliberate about what to do, even if the outcome of my deliberation and the actions that result from it are both causally determined. If I am in an unclear situation, considering the pros and cons of various actions is rational and will likely lead to a better decision than acting impulsively. Consider an example where I am offered a job, and I think things through before deciding to accept it. I had to go through the process of deliberation to reach that fated outcome; it’s no more true that I would have accepted the job whether or not I deliberated about the offer than it is that I would have recovered from cancer whether or not I sought treatment. So in the original fatalist argument, the Stoics would reject the premise that if it is true from eternity that an event will occur, then that event is necessary, in the sense of inevitable or beyond our power to effect, and they also reject Carneades’ assertion that events that have been causally determined from eternity are necessary in that sense.

Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, and Chrysippus were each said to compare the relationship of humans and fate to that of a dog tied to a cart:

When a dog is tied to a cart, if it wants to follow it is pulled and follows, making its spontaneous act coincide with necessity, but if it does not want to follow it will be compelled in any case. So it is with men too: even if they do not want to, they will be compelled in any case to follow what is destined. (Hippolytus, Refutation of all heresies 1.21, LS 62A)

This analogy suggests that god has preordained certain outcomes that will happen no matter what decisions people make, with our decisions affecting only the manner in which this fated outcome occurs. God will bypass and override any efforts to defy him. (Perhaps if I irrationally decide not to seek treatment for my cancer, god implements a contingency plan that ensures my fated recovery, albeit in a way that involves far more trouble and pain for me.)

But at least as deployed by Chrysippus, the above interpretation of the dog and cart analogy is probably incorrect. If certain outcomes were fated to occur no matter what we were to decide or to do, that would seem to make deliberation and action futile, whereas Chrysippus wishes to assert that our actions do have an impact on what occurs, with god bringing about the fated outcome through our fated action. Instead, Chrysippus is probably making the more general point that it is impossible to resist god’s providential plan and the edicts of fate, and that trying to do so is a bad idea. That is because god’s providential plan encompasses everything whatsoever that occurs in the cosmos, which would include even vicious actions and attempts to defy god (Plutarch, On Stoic Self-Contradiction 1050c-d, LS 54T). The Stoics also share the Greek ethical commonplace that vice is a kind is psychic disharmony and disorder that causes agitation and distress (Cicero, Tusculan disputations 4.29, 34–5, LS 61O). Furthermore, the wise person willingly submits themself to god’s will—they wish for things to happen as they do happen, which is the same as wishing for them to happen as god wills them to happen. Such submission brings happiness (Epictetus, Handbook 8; Seneca, On Benefits 4.34.4). And so, a vicious person who tries to defy the will of god fails in their plan, as even their attempted defiance has been fated by god, but through their foolish actions they do “succeed” in bringing about their own misery, just like the dog being dragged along the path.

2. Voluntary Action, Moral Responsibility, and What is “Up to Us”

Ancient Greek philosophers considered when we are rightly held accountable for our actions, and these discussions overlap considerably with contemporary debates about free will and determinism. But we should be cautious about framing these debates in terms of their views on free will and determinism. First of all, there is no phrase in the ancient texts that should obviously be translated as “free will”. (The later Epicurean Lucretius uses the Latin phrase libera voluntas, which is often translated as “free will”, but whether libera voluntas is the same as “free will” is far from obvious—see section 2.4.1 below.) Instead of talking about whether humans possess a faculty of will, and what the conditions are for that will to be free, they talk about when actions are voluntary, and what must obtain in order for our actions or states of character to be “up to us” (eph’ hemin) or to “depend on us” (par’ hemas). Secondly, the ancient discussions do not have at their center the question of whether causal determinism is compatible with our having control over our actions—in particular, whether it is compatible with the ability to do otherwise—although they do raise this issue.

2.1 Aristotle on voluntary action

The first extended treatment of moral responsibility is Aristotle’s in NE 3.1–5. Voluntary actions, says Aristotle, are subject to praise and blame, whereas involuntary ones are excused (NE 3.1 1109b30–32). Voluntary actions are ones with their origin in the agent themself, where they know the particular circumstances of the action (NE 3.1 1111a23–24). To say that the origin of an action is the agent simply means that the cause or explanation of an action is the person’s own beliefs, desires, states of character, and other psychological states. If I decide to poison my mother for the sake of getting my inheritance, the action of putting cyanide into a mug of chamomile and almond tea can be explained by my greed and callousness, by my resulting desire for the inheritance and disregard for the welfare of my mother, and by my belief that poisoning my mother would be an effective means to obtaining the inheritance. On the other hand, forced actions are involuntary—for instance, the movement of a sea voyager who is blown astray by a wind or carried away by kidnappers. In such cases, the person’s movements have an external origin, and they themself don’t contribute anything to their movements.

Besides force, another excusing condition is non-culpable ignorance of particular matters of fact regarding the circumstances of the action. If my mother’s joints are aching, and I bring her some Tylenol capsules that, unbeknownst to me, have been laced with cyanide, I should not be blamed for her death. Even though my action of bringing the capsules has an “internal origin”, I did not willingly kill my mother—rather, it was inadvertent, and my action evinces no malevolent desires or character flaws. (Nonetheless, says Aristotle, I should regret what I have done and feel pain at it. If I do not, then something is wrong with me, and so the action is not entirely involuntary, but “non-voluntary” (NE 3.1 1110b18–24).) But not all ignorance excuses. For instance, if I willingly get drunk, and therefore I don’t notice a stop sign and end up inadvertently harming somebody when I run the stop sign, I am responsible for putting myself into the state of ignorance, and hence responsible for my subsequent actions. Also, Aristotle believes that ignorance of what is good and bad does not excuse a person. If I am depraved enough, I might sincerely believe that I am doing nothing wrong when I poison my mother, that I am simply being savvy and appropriately ruthless in pursuing my self-interest. That kind of ignorance, says Aristotle, is what makes people vicious, and being a bad person isn’t an excuse for acting badly (NE 3.1 110b28–1111a2). (As we shall see, Aristotle believes that people are at least partly responsible for their own characters.)

Aristotle also discusses “mixed actions”, ones that are done knowingly but unwillingly. He gives the examples of a captain tossing their cargo overboard to save their ship during a storm, and a person doing something dishonorable at the order of a tyrant in order to save the lives of their family. These are not the sorts of actions they would normally perform, but they feel forced to do so under the circumstances. Such actions, says Aristotle, are voluntary, and the agent is responsible for them—after all, the origin of the action was inside the agent, and they knew the particular circumstances of their actions. However, when assessing actions, we need to take those circumstances in account, so that actions that normally would be wrong, like tossing cargo overboard, are sometimes actually praiseworthy and reflect well on the agent.

Finally, Aristotle says that sometimes people do wrong actions “under pressure which overstrains human nature and which no one could withstand”, and such actions are forgiven (NE 3.1 1110a23–25). Unfortunately, he does not give an example or explain why such actions are pardoned. But a plausible example would be in the novel 1984, when Winston Smith betrays his lover Julia at the point where O’Brien threatens to have his face chewed off by rats, after months of torture in the bowels of the Ministry of Love. While the betrayal does have an “internal origin” in Smith’s terror of the rats and his belief that betraying Julia would spare him, almost any human being would have been broken under the circumstances. Therefore, when we wish to explain why Smith betrays Julia, it is not because of any character flaws or disordered desires particular to Smith—instead, we say that no matter whether a person was virtuous or vicious, they would have acted as Smith did in such a situation, so Smith’s betrayal doesn’t reflect badly on him.

When an action is voluntary and its origin is within us, it is up to us either to perform the action or not (NE 3.1 1110a17–18), so if it’s up to us to perform some action which is noble, we also have the ability not to act, which would be base (NE 3.5 1113b5–14). Since we have the ability to do otherwise in the case of all voluntary actions, and it is only for voluntary actions that people are rightly held responsible, Aristotle endorses the Principle of Alternate Possibilities (PAP): a person is morally responsible for what they have done only if they could have done otherwise.

Whether Aristotle’s theory of what is voluntary is compatibilist or incompatibilist with regard to causal determinism is highly contested. But the question itself may be misguided, as Aristotle never formulates the thesis of causal determinism or asks whether determinism is compatible with people engaging in voluntary actions. The best we can do is ask whether, given his other philosophical commitments, Aristotle’s conditions on voluntary action are best understood as compatible with determinism, or incompatible with it. Some contemporary philosophers believe that causal determinism is incompatible with an agent genuinely being the source of his action, as his action could be traced back to environmental, genetic, and other factors outside of and prior to the agent. But Aristotle seems not to be working with that strong a notion of sourcehood when he says that the agent is the origin of his actions: he says that choice is origin of action, while desire and practical reason are the origin of choice (NE 6.2 1139a32–33). So Y can be the origin of Z, while Y itself has an origin in X. Likewise, many philosophers believe that PAP is incompatible with causal determinism, while others believe that they are compatible. Aristotle himself is silent on the issue, and he never produces an explication of what exactly he means when he says an agent who acts voluntarily could have done otherwise. However, he does think that virtue is a perfection of a person’s character, one that reliably produces virtuous actions. The virtuous person has both correct beliefs about what to do, and correct desires, so he would seem to have no motive to do anything other than the right thing, and Aristotle does say that the virtuous person would never voluntarily do anything vicious (NE 4.9 1128b25–30). So it seems that, while the virtuous person who voluntarily performs a virtuous action could have acted otherwise and done something vicious, nonetheless there are sufficient conditions—ones that include his own virtue—which preclude him from exercising this ability. While opinions on the question are divided, perhaps the safest thing to say is that Aristotle’s theory is compatible with compatibilism. (See Destrée (2011) for an incompatibilist interpretation of Aristotle based on ‘sourcehood’ and Aristotle’s acceptance of PAP, and Bobzien (2014) for criticisms. Meyer (2011) gives an interpretation on which Aristotle’s theory of voluntary action and of character formation is compatible with compatibilism.)

2.2 Aristotle on character formation

Although Aristotle says that voluntary actions are subject to praise and blame, he does not simply identify morally responsible actions with voluntary ones. Small children and animals can engage in voluntary behavior, moving themselves around, using the information they have about their environment, in order to get what they want. What distinguishes adult humans from small children and other animals is our possession of practical reason, which allows us to deliberate about what to do in order to best achieve what we believe to be good and then to make choices on the basis of that deliberation (NE 3.2–4). Only creatures who can make these sorts of deliberative choices are capable of virtue or vice, and only such creatures are accountable for what they do.

Furthermore, our capacity for deliberative choice allows us to shape our own characters, and Aristotle thinks that we need to be able to do so in order to be responsible for the actions that flow from those characters. In NE 3.5, Aristotle considers an argument against our responsibility for our actions that proceeds from psychological determinism. It goes as follows: let us suppose that a careless person exceeds the speed limit because they did not notice the sign posting the limit. Aristotle says that the law rightly punishes such cases of ignorant wrongdoing, because the person is responsible for his own negligent ignorance, just as in the case of the ignorant drunkard. But, the objection goes, some people just are careless; they’re simply the sort of people who aren’t going to take care (NE 3.5 1114a3–4). So it’s not up to them not to be careless. More generally, people do what they do because they believe it gets them what is good. But what seems good to a person is not under their control; instead, it is determined by their character (NE 3.5 1114a30–1114b12). If I choose to poison my mother, it’s because I believe that doing so will be good for me. But I did not choose to believe that wealth is so incredibly important for my well-being, and the interests of others and considerations of justice so negligible, that getting lots of money through undetected murder would be good for me. As Plato says in his dialogue the Timaeus, nobody is willingly evil. Instead, through some combination of poor natural endowments and poor education, neither of which the evil person had under their control, they become vicious. So they are not to blame for their vice; rather, those who nurtured them are to blame (Tim. 86d-87a).

Aristotle agrees that what seems good to us is determined by our character, and that we aim at what we believe is good. There are cases of akrasia, or “weakness of will”, where a person’s beliefs about what is good and their desires conflict, and they do what they believe is bad in order to gratify their desires (NE 7.3). But when a person’s beliefs and desires are in harmony—as in the case of a thoroughly virtuous or vicious person—their actions will follow from their beliefs about and desires for what seems to be good, plus their beliefs about what means will achieve that apparent good. So in the case of the vicious and willing murderer, while he may be able to refrain from murder, he will not do so, given who he is. He will not choose to go against what his beliefs and desires have set before him as good. For Aristotle, choice is the final step of a process of deliberation, in which we work through the possible means to achieve our end, until we hit upon the one that we think will work best to get us what we wish to achieve, whereupon we choose that means and act (NE 3.3).

But Aristotle thinks that this does not absolve the vicious person of responsibility for their actions, because they are responsible for making themselves into the person they currently are through their past actions. Virtue is a state of character developed through practice in a way analogous to how we gain craft knowledge or other practical skills: I become courageous by acting courageously, just as a person becomes a good carpenter by practicing making cabinets or a good basketball player by working on their free throws (NE 2.1). But vice is also developed through a person’s repeated actions; it’s by cheating that a person makes themselves unjust and by engaging in drinking bouts that they become dissolute drunkards (NE 3.5 1114a4–7). Aristotle admits that some people are incorrigibly bad, because they have firmly fixed bad characters, and hence they cannot now control what appears good to them. But at one time, they had the ability to change their character, and hence they are responsible for what now seems good to them. Aristotle compares such a person to an incurably sick person, who made themself ill through their dissolute living and their refusal to listen to their doctor’s orders. The sick person is responsible for their sickness, even though there is nothing they can do about it now; so too with the thoroughly vicious person (NE 3.5 1114a12–22).

It might seem that Aristotle’s response implies a vicious regress. My present action is caused by my present character plus my other psychological states, such as my beliefs. In order to be responsible for this action, I must be responsible for the state of character that in part causes it. Aristotle responds that my past voluntary actions caused my present character, and so I am responsible for it. But if I must be responsible for these actions in order to be responsible for the character state that they cause, we ask in turn whether I am responsible for the character states that caused these actions, and so on and so forth, until we are drawn back to factors of heredity and environment which I am not responsible for. In response to this problem, some scholars have proposed that Aristotle believes that some character-forming actions are not caused by my past states of character (Kane (2014), who attributes such a view to Aristotle and uses it as inspiration for his own view), or that he believes there are some breaks or “fresh starts” in the causal process leading to my present character, so that it cannot be drawn back to past factors that were not in my power (Furley 1967; Bobzien 2000). But it is difficult to see how positing causal breaks would help make the process of character formation more under the control of a person, and in any case, Aristotle apparently is not aware of this supposed problem with his response. Instead, he seems to think that, as long as we need to refer to a person’s past actions in order to explain how they came to be the sort of person they are, this suffices for showing that they helped form their own character and it is was up to them who they became.

2.3 Epicurus on reason, character formation, and what “depends on us”

Like Aristotle, Epicurus believes that our ability to shape the development of our character is central to our being responsible for our actions, and that we have this ability because of our reason. Furthermore, the person who argues that our actions do not depend on us refutes themself in the very act of arguing for their thesis.

The Epicureans think that all of our actions are explained by our desire for pleasure, our aversion to pain, and our beliefs about how best to obtain pleasure and avoid pain (Ep. Men 128, Fin. 1.23, 1.30 1.46). People engage in wrongdoing because they have incorrect beliefs about what will bring them pleasure (KD 7, 10, SV 16, Fin. 1.32–33, 1.55). If a person wrongly believes that pursuing great wealth will make them happy, then they will pursue wealth. But this psychological hedonism does not render us helpless, because our beliefs are under our control, and it is reason which gives us this control over our beliefs. We can learn to distinguish which of our desires are for things we really need, and which desires cause us harm, and thereby reject the harmful desires (KD 18–22, 29–30). Using our reason, we can overcome hate, envy, contempt, and other emotions that might lead us to wrongdoing (DL 10.117).

This reasons-responsiveness is what distinguishes us from other animals and allows us to control our own development, while other animals cannot. Other animals have in-born temperaments: for instance, lions are naturally irascible because their minds contain many fire atoms, while stags are timid because they have more wind atoms (DRN 3.288–306). People also have natural temperaments: some are easily moved to anger, while others are too fearful (DRN 3.307–318). But we can use our reason to expel any harmful dispositions, so that only trivial traces of these temperaments remain, and we are able to achieve a life worthy of the gods (DRN 3.319–322).

In book 25 of his treatise On Nature (LS 20B–C), Epicurus also asserts that how we develop depends on us, and then he tries to show that it is self-refuting to maintain that all things occur of necessity. Unfortunately, while this is an important text for understanding Epicurus, it is also extremely unclear. Epicurus has a contorted and jargon-ridden writing style, and the text as we have it is full of gaps, because it is preserved on charred scrolls from an Epicurean villa buried by the eruption of Mount Vesuvius in 79 CE. So the summary of his arguments below, like any summary of this text, is bound to be controversial, and it is considerably more clear than Epicurus’ own arguments.

Epicurus says some people have disordered congenital dispositions, e.g., they are naturally hotheaded due to their atomic make-up. But unlike wild animals, we blame a person who develops badly and remains a hothead as an adult, because the way we actually develop depends on us, and not on the nature of our atoms. We each have “seeds”, psychological potentials to develop one way or the other, and which “seeds” develop depend on us and on beliefs of our own making. Further evidence for our control over ourselves, says Epicurus, is that we rebuke, oppose, and reform each other as if the responsibility for what we do lies also “in ourselves”, not just in our congenital dispositions and in our environment. If somebody argues against this thesis and maintains that everything we do is necessitated, he refutes himself. That is because in his action of engaging in debate, the person is assuming that he is responsible for reasoning correctly and that his opponent is responsible for talking nonsense.

At first blush, this self-refutation argument appears quite unpromising, as Epicurus’ opponent has an obvious reply: they can maintain that the actions of the people engaging in the debate, including their own, are necessitated, and nonetheless try to show that their own position is better-supported and thereby convince their opponent to change their mind. Epicurus, however, thinks that this reply fails. We have a concept of what it means for something to be necessitated, versus for something to depend on us. And the empirical basis for these concepts is observing ourselves in action—in particular, observing our actions of rebuking, opposing, and reforming one another. We see that we can dissuade other people from an action, e.g., I can talk to my friend and convince him not to give in to a bully’s demands and to stand up to him instead. We also see that sometimes we decide to do things we don’t feel like doing, e.g., I undergo painful dental work in order to avoid greater pain in the future. From these observations, we form the distinction between things that depend on us, versus ones that are necessitated, and we show our understanding of this distinction in our actions, as we try to dissuade one another from things that “depend on us”, while it would be pointless to do so for those that are necessitated. According to Epicurus, if his opponent claims that all of our actions are necessitated, and they do not challenge the empirical basis of our distinction, they are merely “changing a name”. To show that our actions are necessitated in a substantial way, the opponent would have to show how we are mistaken when we think that we can use our reason to persuade one another to act differently, that we can decide to undergo short-term pain for the sake of long-term gain, and the like. But the action of trying to persuade somebody to change their mind, by giving them reasons to think that their current conviction is mistaken, is precisely the sort of thing that forms the basis for the conceptions that Epicurus’ opponent is trying to challenge (see Castagnoli 2010: 145–159 for more on this argument).

2.4 The role of the swerve in protecting our freedom

As noted above (in section 1.2), Epicurus introduces an indeterministic atomic motion, the swerve, in order to protect human freedom. It is not mentioned in any of the extant texts by Epicurus himself, but a variety of later sources attribute the doctrine to him. The two most extensive discussions we have of the swerve’s role in protecting human freedom are in Cicero’s On Fate, which describes how the swerve is needed in order to preserve the openness of the future and avert the fatalistic implications of the Principle of Bivalence, and in lines 251–293 of Book 2 of On the Nature of Things, Lucretius’ exposition of Epicurean physics.

Lucretius argues that is evident that animals can and do act freely. However, if atoms did not sometimes randomly swerve to the side, animals would not be able to act freely. Therefore, atoms sometimes randomly swerve to the side. In this argument, Lucretius moves from something he thinks we can observe (that animals act freely), and on its basis infers something that we cannot directly perceive (that atoms swerve slightly to the side). Free actions are ones where the body follows the mind’s desires (DRN 2.268), and free actions have an “internal source” in a literal sense for Lucretius: they are produced by the animal’s mind, which is a bodily organ in its chest.

Lucretius spends most of his argument establishing the premise that animals do, in fact, act freely, by giving two examples. Both examples are supposed to show that animals have an internal capacity to initiate motion, which distinguishes animal motion from the way in which inanimate objects are simply moved around by external blows. The first example is of race horses eager to burst from the starting gates. Lucretius claims that we see a slight delay between the external stimulus of the opening of the gates and the resultant motion of the horses surging forward. This delay supposedly shows that there exists motion initiated by the mind, in which case it takes some time for the decision of the mind to stir together and move all of the matter of the horse. The second example appeals to our own experience, in cases such as being in a jostling crowd: we are not always helplessly shoved around by these outside forces but are sometimes able to fight against them to go where we wish, and we initiate this motion ourselves.

Unfortunately, Lucretius is much less forthcoming in supporting or elucidating his other premise. If there were not a swerve, and causal determinism were true, why would animals be unable to act freely? And how exactly is the swerve supposed to help preserve freedom? At the start of his argument, Lucretius says that if there were not an atomic swerve, to prevent all motion from being interlinked in an endless chain of causation and thereby to annul the decrees of fate, we would not have the ability to move ourselves around as we wished. And at the end of his argument, Lucretius says that, in order for our actions not to be subject to an “internal necessity”, there must be an atomic motion that is not necessitated, since nothing comes to be from nothing (DRN 2.284–293). A number of answers to the above questions have been advanced, but each of these interpretations suffers from philosophical and textual problems. Below are some of these answers.

2.4.1 Free will and the ability to do otherwise

A common way of answering these questions is to say that free will is incompatible with causal determinism because determinism precludes us from having the ability to do otherwise than we do, and this ability is needed to have free will (Purinton 1999). Human beings are aggregates of atoms, and our decisions are caused by the motions of the atoms that make up our minds. If the atoms that make us up moved in accordance with deterministic laws—if we were subject to “internal necessity”—then we would be unable to act otherwise than how we do act. But because the atoms in our mind can swerve, then it is possible for me to do otherwise than I do. There is a range of possible outcomes for any action I take, depending on whether, when, and how many atoms in my mind swerve. And so, I have free will and can be rightly held responsible for my actions.

One problem with this interpretation is that Lucretius does not seem concerned with moral responsibility or the ability to do otherwise. The Latin phrase Lucretius uses for what allows us to “act freely” is libera voluntas, which is often translated as “free will”. But libera voluntas is not something particular to adult humans, who can be held morally responsible for their actions. It is shared by all animals. And libera voluntas is not described as an ability to do otherwise, which allows animals to be accountable for what they do. Instead, libera voluntas is effective agency; it allows living creatures all over the earth to do what they want to do and to advance wherever pleasure leads them (DRN 2.251–260). And in any case, inserting random atomic swerves into one’s mind is an unpromising basis for the production of free and responsible actions; instead, it would seem to result in random and blameless twitches. Let us imagine that after thinking things over, I am getting ready to pick up the phone and accept a job offer, but before I pick up the phone, a series of atomic swerves occur in my mind, and I start singing Queen’s “We Are the Champions” instead. Is the singing a free and responsible action? Or if I do pick up the phone and accept the job, does the possibility that random atomic swerves might have caused me to sing instead help preserve my free will? To the extent that random swerves are involved in action, they seem to undercut our control over our actions, rather than preserve it.

2.4.2 Character development and internal necessity

Alternatively, it has been proposed that the Epicureans’ concern is with our control over character development, which Epicurus discusses in On Nature book 25, not free will (Furley 1967; Bobzien 2000). If determinism were true, how we develop would be necessitated—our current character would be the inevitable result of eternal chains of cause and effect, and traceable entirely to external factors of environment and heredity beyond our control. Lucretius is referring to this threat when he talks about the “internal necessity” that the swerve saves us from by breaking the chains of cause and effect. Once again, however, Lucretius’ concern when he describes the swerve does not seem to be the ability of humans to shape their own character development, or the way determinism may threaten it. And leaving that worry aside, having the process of character development caused in part by random atomic swerves seems no better than having it caused entirely by deterministic atomic motions, as far as our control over it. What is needed is not to falsify determinism, but to preserve our ability to use our reason to change ourselves.

2.4.3 The self and emergence

In On Nature 25, Epicurus says that how we develop depends on us, and not on the nature of our atoms. Based on this assertion and some other passages in On Nature 25, David Sedley (1983, 1988) argues that Epicurus believes that how we act is not determined by the atoms that make up our minds. Instead, from complex atomic systems like the atoms that makes up our minds, there emerges human reason, our desires, and other psychological entities, which cannot be identified with atomic states. All together, these entities make up the person, or the self. According to Sedley, Epicurus thinks that the self acquires causal powers that transcend the laws that bind atomic motion and that can even “reach down” and cause changes to the atoms that make up my mind, and thereby initiate actions. However, the self would not be able to exercise this power if physical laws were sufficient on their own to determine all atomic motions. As a minimal indeterminacy at the atomic level, the swerve allows the self “elbow room” where it can exercise its power to act one way or the other within the laws of physics, but in a way that is not determined by the laws of physics.

On Nature 25, however, is extremely unclear. The better-preserved and clearer texts we have by the Epicureans that deal with their philosophy of mind, such as On the Nature of Things and The Letter to Herodotus (Epicurus’ summary of his physics) seem to support an identity theory of mind—that the mind is just a bodily organ (like the brain, but located in the chest), and that psychological states and events are the same as atomic states and events. The passages cited to support an “emergent self” do not obviously commit Epicurus to the position, and they can be read in a way that is consistent with an identity theory of mind. And even if Epicurus did believe in an emergent self that acquires causal powers that transcend the powers of the atoms, he would not need to posit the swerve. The “laws of physics” simply sum up the effects of a number of causal factors that determine how an atom will move, like its weight and its collisions with other atoms. If there really were an emergent and transcendent self, that self would add another causal factor that could move the atoms. There doesn’t need to be an antecedent indeterminacy to ensure that the atoms can be moved by the self. In his solution to the fatalist “lazy argument” (see section 1.3), Carneades says something along these lines: once we have a “voluntary motion of the mind” that obeys us, we do not need a random swerve to help ensure our freedom.

2.4.4 Bivalence and the swerve

Finally, the swerve may do nothing more than fulfill the function, described above, that Cicero gives to it in On Fate—because of the swerve, statements about what will happen in the future are, at present, neither true nor false. And so, what will happen is not inevitable, and our deliberations about what to do and our actions are not futile (O’Keefe 2005). This fits with Lucretius’ description of how determinism threatens our libera voluntas—if each motion were linked to a prior motion from eternity, animals would not be able to do what they want to do and to advance wherever pleasure leads them. So the swerve is not directly involved in the production of free action, it simply helps dispose of one threat to our freedom, the one spelled out by the fatalist argument: if the Principle of Bivalence were true, and applied to statements about the future, the future would be necessitated, and we would be helpless.

However, the Epicureans need not have such concerns about the Principle of Bivalence. If the Stoics are right, neither the Principle of Bivalence nor causal determinism would rob us of freedom, since action and deliberation can still be effective even if the Principle of Bivalence holds and causal determinism is true. However, if one is not convinced by the Stoics, then Carneades’ position seems more cogent than Epicurus’. To secure our ability to shape the future, what matters is our ability to control our actions in a way that is not causally predetermined—Carneades’ “voluntary motion of the mind”—whereas positing a random atomic motion to falsify a logical principle is beside the point. And if the swerve has no direct role either in the production of action or the formation of our character, it is unclear what Lucretius might be referring to when he says that the swerve saves us from “internal necessity”.

No matter which interpretation is correct, it looks like introducing an atomic swerve to preserve our freedom was not a good idea.

2.5 The Stoics on what is “up to us”, the principle of alternate possibilities, and punishment

The Stoics are materialists, and they believe that every action we perform is causally determined by god as part of his divine plan. This might seem to make us helpless puppets of god, puppets who cannot rightly be held responsible for what we do. The Stoics, however, develop a theory of animal behavior generally and human action in particular that tries to counter this suspicion. Like both Aristotle and Epicurus, for the Stoics, the possession of reason is key to making humans responsible for their actions.

According to the Stoics, inanimate objects like logs and stones are moved around from the outside. Animals, however, move themselves around. Animal motion has an internal source, the animal’s own mind, which is a material, bodily organ. The Stoics’ distinction between inanimate and animate motion is reminiscent of Lucretius’ distinction between the passive way inanimate objects are moved around, compared to the active motion of animals, which have libera voluntas and can move themselves around as they wish. The Stoics, however, believe that animals moving themselves around is compatible with the way in which animals move being causally determined. Animals move themselves when an impression occurs which arouses an impulse. For instance, a hungry dog may see a hunk of meat, and this arouses an impulse to run up to the meat and eat it. The impulse is triggered by the impression, but this is still a case of the dog moving itself toward the meat, not merely being passively pushed around by the impression.

In the case of rational animals, like humans, there is a crucial additional step. We have

reason, which passes judgment on impressions, rejecting some of these and accepting others, in order that the animal may be guided accordingly. (Origen, On principles 3.1.2–3, LS 53A)

For instance, I may see a pulled-pork sandwich in front of me when I am hungry. But instead of saying, “Mmmm, looks good”, and straightaway gobbling it down, I think “Eating meat produced by factory farms would be wrong” and refrain. On the other hand, Chrysippus believes that animals are made for the sake for human beings—for instance, that appetizing pigs have no purpose other than slaughter and that god created them as part of our cuisine (Porphyry, On Abstinence, 3.20.1, 3, LS 54P). And so, given his foolish and vicious views about the moral status of animals, Chrysippus would gladly decide to chow down on a pulled-pork sandwich.

Any action proper will include this step of assent to an impression that leads to an impulse, and it is this additional step that distinguishes human action from mere animal behavior. This does not mean that actions require extended and self-conscious deliberation. If you insult my hipster sideburns and I straightaway get angry and punch you in the face, I have assented to the impression that you have wronged me and it would be good to retaliate and cause you pain, even though I haven’t thought it over carefully.

To illustrate the Stoic doctrine of the internal source of animal motion Chrysippus uses the analogy of a stone cylinder rolling down a slope. The cylinder’s rolling down the slope may require an initial shove. But that initial shove only triggers the motion, and the primary cause of the motion is the cylinder’s own shape and “rollability”. Likewise, human action may require an initial impression as its trigger, but how a person acts depends on the person themself, on the sort of person they are and how they respond to their impressions (Cicero, Fat. 39–43, LS 62C).

Assent is up to us and under our control, and assent is the cause of our actions. Therefore, our actions are attributable to us, and we are rightly held responsible for them. I do not control whether I am healthy, although I can aim at maintaining my health. I do not control whether other people hurl insults at me, but it is up to me whether I react angrily when I am insulted. What we do is controlled by our will and intellect, and the misdeeds of bad people can rightly be attributed to their own vice (Gellius, Noctes Atticae, 7.2.6–13, LS 62D).

The Stoics reject the Principle of Alternate Possibilities (PAP). We don’t have

the freedom to choose between opposite actions … [instead], it is what comes about through us that is up to us. (Alexander, On fate ch. 13, 181,13, LS 62G1)

Assent is up to us and under our control, and we are rightly held responsible for what we do, even though we do not have the ability to do otherwise than we do. If we accept PAP, then the actions of the virtuous person will be praiseworthy only if they are capable of acting in a way other than how they do act. But the truly virtuous person is incapable of acting viciously, of doing anything wrong. Imagine that I am a virtuous person, and that I have promised my young daughter a piece of cake if she finishes her dinner. She finishes her dinner and asks for the cake. There is only one action that I can and will do in that particular situation: give her the cake as promised. Let us suppose that there was some small chance that I would not keep my promise—that I’d pretend to look for the cake and not find it, and lie to her about its being missing, so that I could have it for myself later. If I were capable of depriving my daughter of her promised cake so that I could chow down on it later, then I would not really be a virtuous person. There would have to be something wrong with me. And so if we accept PAP, we would have to accept the absurd result that we should not praise virtuous people for acting virtuously, as they cannot do anything other than the virtuous action in any situation. And so, we should reject PAP (Alexander, On fate ch. 26, 196,24–197,3, LS 61M).

Aristotle would say that the virtuous person will not break their promise to their daughter, but that they are capable of doing so. The Stoics reject this response. Virtue is a reliable disposition to do what one should. I am not forced to get the cake for my daughter, but if I am truly a good person, I am incapable of doing otherwise, because I cannot but want to get her the cake (Seneca On Benefits 6.21.2–3). The Stoics conceive of virtue as a kind as practical skill that allows a person to live well, and the wise person will consistently exercise this skill, so that everything they do they do well (Stobaeus Eclogues 2.66,14–67,4, LS 61G). So an “ability” to break my promise to my daughter is something I do not want to have, as it would be a defect, a form of folly, and a disability.

The Stoics believe that their doctrine that god causally determines our every action is compatible with all of our ordinary moral practices. They share with Aristotle the idea that virtue is a perfection of our nature as rational and social animals, and they believe that the proper action to perform is the one that can be given a reasonable justification. (See the texts in Long and Sedley sections 59–61.) Let us suppose that causal determinism is true and that I break my promise to my daughter and chow down on the cake. Even if every action is causally determined by God, right reason still commands right actions and prohibits wrong ones. We can still give the reasons why breaking my promise to my daughter is irrational and wrong, and why keeping my promise would be rational and right. So, even though I was causally determined to break my promise, my doing so was wrong. And if there are right and wrong actions, there are also virtues and vices, character traits that dispose us to act rightly and wrongly, respectively. So, in the example above, I am a vicious person: I am the kind of person who will break his promise to his daughter for the sake of filling his belly. But virtue is noble, and thus commendable, whereas vice is shameful, and thus reprehensible. And commendable things deserve honor, whereas reprehensible things deserve censure and punishment. So I am a shameful, reprehensible person, and I am rightly criticized for my action (Alexander, On Fate ch. 35, 207, 5–21, LS 62J).

While the Stoics think that vicious people are responsible for what they do, and that wrongdoing merits censure and punishment, they reject retributive punishment, punishment that seeks to set back a person’s interests as fitting payback for the wrong they have done. Like god, the virtuous person wishes to harm none and to benefit all. We should regard ourselves as akin to all human beings, and we should seek to benefit as many people as we can (Cicero Fin. 3.62–8, LS 57F). Punishment is a fitting response to wrongdoing, but right punishment is rehabilitative, a loving correction of the person punished (Alexander, On fate ch. 35, 207,5–21, LS 62J). The model here is akin to parental discipline. If my sons are squabbling, and one of them angrily hits the other, I might send him to time-out, deprive him of dessert, and ground him for a week. But I do not do so because I want my son to suffer or I think he had it coming to him. Instead, while my son might find the punishment painful, I inflict the punishment because I think that the discipline will be good for him, that it will help him realize that he has done something wrong and that he needs to change himself. In their theory of punishment, as in much of their ethical theory, the Stoics are following the lead of Plato, who also rejects retributive punishment in favor of rehabilitative punishment. (See in particular Protagoras 323d-324d and Gorgias 472d-479e.) Plato, however, rejects retribution in part because he believes that all wrongdoing is due to ignorance of what is good. Hence, he thinks, nobody does wrong willingly, and nobody is deserving of retributive punishment.

According to the Stoics, both the virtuous, wise person and the vicious fool are responsible for their actions, because the actions of each of them are equally a result of their assent, which is under their control. Nonetheless, in another sense, only the wise person is truly free (DL 7.33). The later Stoic Epictetus often compares the foolish person to a slave, under the yolk of vicious and damaging desires (for instance, Handbook 14 and Discourses 2.2). Similarly, the Stoic emperor Marcus Aurelius likens the fool to a puppet who is jerked here and there by irrational impulses (for instance, Meditations 2.2, 6.16). The fool is dominated by desires and beliefs that are alien to his nature as a rational being, because right reason commands all virtuous actions and forbids all vicious actions. Only the wise person is free from these alienating and disturbing desires and beliefs; only the wise person has mastered himself and is in harmony with himself.

2.6 Alexander of Aphrodisias’ incompatibilist Aristotelianism

Alexander of Aphrodisias is an adherent of Aristotle’s philosophy, best known for his extensive commentaries on Aristotle’s texts. In his treatise On Fate, Alexander develops an Aristotelian theory on human freedom in reaction to the Stoics’ clearly determinist and compatibilist theory. Alexander’s theory is based on what Aristotle says, and he claims simply to be presenting Aristotle’s views. But Alexander’s treatment takes many elements of Aristotle, which on their own can be read as either compatible with causal determinism or incompatible with causal determinism, and develops them in incompatibilist ways. Alexander thinks that causal determinism is incompatible both with effective deliberation and with the sort of control over our actions needed for moral responsibility.

The Stoics identify fate with the causal organization of the cosmos. Every thing that occurs has a cause which is sufficient to produce exactly that outcome. And given the totality of circumstances, it is causally impossible for things not to turn out the particular way that they do (Alexander, On Fate ch. 22). Alexander believes that having things causally determined by fate in this way is incompatible with some outcomes being contingent. On the Stoic position, if there is going to be a sea battle tomorrow, the causal structure of the cosmos guarantees that there will be a sea battle tomorrow and makes it impossible that there not be a sea battle tomorrow (Alexander, On Fate ch. 9). But deliberating about things that will necessarily occur or necessarily not occur is pointless; it makes sense to deliberate only about things that can either possibly occur or not. Furthermore, if I deliberate about whether to instigate a sea battle or not, it makes sense to do so only if I have the ability either to instigate a sea battle or not to do so. I do not deliberate whether or not to fly if I cannot fly, or if I must fly (Alexander, On Fate ch. 11–12). So, effective deliberation requires that a person have the ability to do otherwise than they do, and Alexander thinks that such an ability is incompatible with causal determinism.

Alexander also believes that the Stoic position implies that our actions are not really “up to us”, i.e., that we do not have the sort of control over our actions which is required to be rightly praised, blamed, rewarded, or punished for them. Alexander thinks this because he subscribes to something like the principle that “ought implies can”, i.e., that a person can be morally obligated to do something only if they have the ability to do it. This is shown in our own case, when we feel regret and blame ourselves for doing something because we think we were able not to choose to do the evil thing we had done (Alexander, On Fate ch. 12, 180.29–31). And in the case of other people, too, we blame and punish them on the assumption that they were able to refrain from wrongdoing. If they had to do what they did, under the circumstances, they are blameless. (Alexander thinks that it is inadequate to say that they would have acted differently if circumstances had been different; Alexander, On Fate ch. 16.)

Alexander turns Chrysippus’ analogy of the cylinder rolling down the slope against the Stoic position. Chrysippus says that, while an initial shove is required to get the cylinder moving, whether and how the cylinder rolls depends on its shape, and likewise, while an initial impression is needed to get a person moving, how they respond to the impression depends on the type of person they are, and thus they are responsible for how they act. But, says Alexander, round things must roll down a slope when shoved; it is not up to them whether or not to roll. Instead, they are compelled to roll by a kind of internal necessity. And if the Stoics are right, vicious people are likewise compelled by their vicious natures, by a kind of internal necessity, to do their evil deeds (Alexander, On Fate ch. 17).

Like Carneades, Alexander believes that his own doctrine of free choice doesn’t introduce motion without a cause. A person has various motives they can act on: they may want to obtain this pleasure or that one, or to get something that they believe is to their advantage, or to do something because they think it’s the right thing to do. Nothing predetermines or necessitates what the person will end up freely choosing to do: they might accept this job or that one, given the competing considerations in favor of each, and they can value the pleasure of cake over the importance of keeping their promises, or vice-versa. But no matter what they end up choosing, they are the cause of their own choices and of the actions that result from them (Alexander, On Fate ch. 15).

But what about the thoroughly virtuous person? Alexander agrees with the Stoics that virtuous people are psychologically incapable of doing anything vicious. However, it does not follow that every action they perform is causally necessitated. There is often a range of available actions that are consistent with virtue, or some leeway in the precise way in which they may do the action which virtue requires, and it is up to them which of these options they choose (Alexander, On Fate ch. 29). Alexander also follows Aristotle in thinking that people are responsible for developing their character through their own voluntary actions, in a way analogous to developing skills through practice. This, thinks Alexander, distinguishes virtuous humans from the gods. Humans are not by nature virtuous. Instead, they have to develop their virtue, and they are capable of either becoming virtuous or not. And so, we praise the person who develops the virtues, because the type of person they became was up to them. But the gods necessarily possess their goodness as a kind of natural gift, and they are incapable of becoming bad. And so, because their goodness was not up to them, we rightly honor the gods for their goodness, but we do not praise them (Alexander, On Fate chs. 27, 32).

2.7 Plotinus on freedom and the good

Plotinus is a follower of Plato, and in his attempt to spell out systematically the truths contained in Plato’s dialogues, he founded the philosophical movement nowadays called Neoplatonism. He develops a distinctive position on human freedom, one that overlaps considerably with the Stoics’ position. However, because of his deep metaphysical differences with the Stoics, he breaks with them on the role of fate in producing human action.

For Plotinus, to say that something is “up to us” is to say that we have power or mastery over it. He contrasts this mastery with servitude or slavery. True power is the power to do what we wish, in order to gain what we desire. So Plotinus thinks that a person who acts under compulsion is not acting freely. He also agrees with Aristotle that a person who acts in ignorance of the particulars of his situation is not acting voluntarily: if I inadvertently poison my mother with cyanide-laced Tylenol, I am not doing what I wished to do, as I did not wish to poison my mother. But he disagrees with Aristotle, and agrees with Plato, in thinking that ignorance of the rightness or wrongness of what I propose to do excuses (Enn. VI.8[39].1). Plotinus believes that all desire is desire for the good (Enn. VI.8[39].7). If I poison my mother, I do so because I believe that doing so is good for me. But if I’m wrong about that, then when I kill her, I’m not really gaining what I desire, because I wanted to get what was good for me. (It’s for these sorts of reasons that Plato, in Gorgias 466c-468e, denies that a tyrant who is able to kill, torture, or imprison anybody as he sees fit has great power. Power enables a person to get what they desire, which is what is good for them, and the tyrant’s so-called “power” actually harms him.)

Following Plato in the Republic, Plotinus repeatedly asserts that for the mind to be controlled by the appetites or passions is a kind of slavery, because the mind is being controlled by something outside of itself (Enn. VI.8[39].2, VI.8[39].3). Reason should rule the person, and an action is free if it proceeds from knowledge (Enn. VI.8[39].1, VI.8[39].6). So Plotinus joins the Stoics in thinking that only the wise person is free. “Freedom” in this sense is primarily an ethical ideal, not a condition on moral responsibility.

Because freedom is a power to obtain what is truly good for yourself, Plotinus also joins the Stoics in rejecting the principle that, in order to be in control of what you do, you must have the ability to do otherwise than you do. Let us imagine that my daughter has a serious heart condition, and after researching the options to repair her heart, I follow the correct course of action, both because I love her and because I recognize that doing so is also good for me. If my reason is in charge of what I do, and I know that what I am doing is for the best, then I am incapable of not doing what I do. But it not some lack of power or external obstacle that prevents me from neglecting my daughter and doing what is worse. Instead, my action is an expression of my knowledge and my will, and that is why I cannot do otherwise (Enn. VI.8[39].10). Likewise, Plotinus thinks it would be perverse to say that I am forced or compelled to help my daughter, that my action is involuntary because it springs from some sort of “internal necessity”. Instead, an action is free when it is directed towards a good that you recognize, and slavery consists in being powerless to move towards your good. This is the kind of freedom enjoyed by the divine intellect. Plotinus believes that the Form of the Good, as described in places like book 6 of Plato’s Republic, is the transcendent source of everything that exists. (Plotinus sometimes calls it the One, to stress its simplicity.) The divine intellect fully understands and eternally contemplates the Good, and it does so freely—for why would it not do so? (Enn. VI.8[39].4)

Plotinus wants to allow the wise person untrammeled mastery, and so he restricts the scope of their freedom to their reasoning and will, and not, strictly speaking, to their actions. If I am wise, I have control over my reasoning and the decisions I make on account of my reasoning. But which actions I perform are not entirely up to me, but depend on external circumstances beyond my control. If I am a brave person, I will stand ready to risk my life in war for a noble cause, but such a war may never arise. And of course, the effects of my actions are not up to me—perhaps my daughter will die of her heart condition despite my best efforts (Enn. VI.8[39].5). However, because happiness consists in wisdom and virtue, the wise person’s inability to entirely control their actions or their actions’ effects does nothing to prevent them from having the sort of power that matters—the power to obtain what is good. This aspect of Plotinus’ thought echoes the Roman Stoic Epictetus. In order to be happy, says Epictetus, we must distinguish between what is up to us and what is not, and the one thing that god has placed under our control is the correct use of impressions i.e., to decide rightly what to believe and what to do (Epictetus, Discourses 1.1.7–12, LS 62K). Because Epictetus thinks that freedom consists in our control over an internal power of assent, Frede (2011) claims that the notion of a “free will” first appears in Epictetus.

Despite the considerable overlap between Plotinus and the Stoics on freedom, they differ significantly on fate. The Stoics think that god’s mind is a fiery breath. It is a material substance that pervades the cosmos and causally determines every event that will occur through its organization of the cosmos, which includes the matter that makes up our own minds. The motions in the cosmos, then, are the result of both the operations of matter and of reason. Plotinus, on the other hand, distinguishes the causal influences of matter and of mind. The One, the divine intellect, soul, and our intellects are all immaterial, and bodies are the lowest form of beings. For Plotinus, any purely materialistic metaphysics, such as the Epicureans’ scheme of atoms moving in the void, cannot explain the operations of mind, which stands above matter (Enn. III.1[3].3).

Plotinus criticizes the Stoics because, on their theory, humans and their minds are parts of god, and god works his will through human actions. Plotinus believes that, if this were true, our decisions would be caused by something outside of ourselves and would not really be our own—we would not be agents any more than our feet are, when we use them to kick something. (The Stoics would reply that humans both move themselves and are moved by god through fate.) Furthermore, the Stoics’ theory has the unacceptable result of making god the cause of evil, when humans act wrongly (Enn. III.1[3].4). Instead, says Plotinus, we should hold that human minds are genuinely separate things, and that they are self-movers, the cause of their own thoughts and decisions (Enn. III.1[3].4, III.1[3].8, III.2[47].7). Here, Plotinus again follows Plato, who in his creation-myth the Timaeus asserts that human souls are distinct from the world-soul that animates the cosmos (Tim. 41d).

For Plotinus, wrongdoing is involuntary, because it is always due to ignorance, but the evil person is still its cause (Enn. III.2[47].10). The wrongdoer is not culpable for what they do, but they still suffer two sorts of punishments—although these punishments might better be called “consequences”. The first penalty they pay for their wrongdoing is becoming evil, which is bad for them (Enn. III.2[47].4; III.2[47].8; cf. Plato, Laws 728b-c). Secondly, our behavior in this life will have an impact on how we will fare in our future lives. Plotinus believes in a cycle of reincarnation in which past wrongs lead to future suffering (Enn. III.2[47].12). Furthermore, the choices a person makes within this life will determine the sort of animal (or plant) they are reincarnated as, with those who maintain the human level becoming humans once again, whereas those dominated by passions or appetites reincarnated as an appropriate sort of animal or plant (Enn. III.4[15].2).

Plotinus develops his theory of reincarnation as a reading of Plato’s Myth of Er, which closes the Republic (Rep. 614b-621d). In the Myth, disembodied souls between cycles of reincarnation have a variety of lives to choose between. Which life they choose is entirely up to them, and the gods are not to blame. However, once they choose a particular life, they are bound by necessity to that life and to the events within that life—for instance, a greedy soul chooses the life of a tyrant without examining it closely, only to realize after his choice that he is fated to eat his children. On a literal reading, the myth seems to confine control over what will happen within one’s life to the choice one makes prior to that life, as a disembodied soul. But Plotinus thinks that the Myth is an allegory for how all of the soul’s choices in this life shape what will happen to it in the future (Enn. III.4[15].3; III.4[15].5). It is better to be incarnated in some bodies rather than others—it is better to be a human rather than a wolf, and some humans have bodily temperaments more conducive to goodness than others. Nonetheless, the body one is incarnated into does not determine what one will do; it is up to the soul what it will do given the opportunities available to it within that life (Enn. III.4[15].5).


Primary texts in translation

Translations of Aristotle are from Barnes (1984), and of other texts are from Long and Sedley (1987). Citations of texts contained in Long and Sedley (1987) also include LS [text number].

  • Armstrong, A.H., (trans.), 1968–88, Plotinus, 7 volumes, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library).
  • Barnes, Jonathan, (ed.), 1984, The Complete Works of Aristotle. The Revised Oxford Translation, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Inwood, Brad and L. P. Gerson, 1997, Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, second edition, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rackham, H. (trans.), 1942, Cicero. On the Orator: Book 3. On Fate. Stoic Paradoxes. Divisions of Oratory, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (Loeb Classical Library).
  • Sharples, R. W. (ed. and trans.), 1983, Alexander of Aphrodisias “On Fate”: text, translation, and commentary, London: Duckworth.
  • Smith, Martin Ferguson (trans.), 2001, Lucretius. On the Nature of Things, Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.

Primary texts cited

The following ancient texts are cited (by abbreviation, where given):

  • Alexander of Aphrodisias
    • On Fate
    • On Mixture
  • Aristotle
    • [NE] Nicomachean Ethics
    • [Int.] De Interpretatione (On Interpretation)
  • Cicero
    • Academica
    • [Fat.] De Fato (On Fate)
    • [Fin.] De Finibus (On Goals)
    • On the Nature of the Gods
    • On Divination
    • Tusculan disputations
  • Clement of Alexandria, The Teacher
  • Diogenes Laertius, [DL] Lives of the Philosophers
  • Diogenes of Oinoanda (inscription)
  • Epictetus
    • Handbook
    • Discourses
  • Epicurus
    • [KD] Kuriai Doxai (Principle Doctrines)
    • [SV] Sententiae Vaticanae (Vatican Sayings)
    • [Ep. Men.] Letter to Menoeceus
    • [On Nature] Peri phuseôs
    • The Letter to Herodotus
  • Gellius, Noctes Atticae
  • Hippolytus, Refutation of All Heresies
  • Lucretius, [DRN] De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things)
  • Marcus Aurelius, Meditations
  • Origen, On principles
  • Plato
    • Gorgias
    • Laws
    • Protagoras
    • [Rep.] Republic
    • [Tim.] Timaeus
  • Plotinus, [Enn.] Enneads
  • Plutarch, On Stoic Self-Contradiction
  • Porphyry, On Abstinence
  • Seneca, On Benefits
  • Stobaeus, Eclogues

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  • Johnson, Monte, 2014, “Changing Our Minds: Democritus on What is Up to Us”, in Destrée, Salles, and Zingano 2014: 1–18. (Argues that Epicurus and others are wrong to attribute to Democritus the view that human actions are necessitated.)
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  • Meyer, Susan Sauvé, 2011, Aristotle on Moral Responsibility: Character and Cause, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199697427.001.0001 (Thorough and well-argued.)
  • O’Keefe, Tim, 2005, Epicurus on Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511482571
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  • Sedley, David, 1983, “Epicurus’ refutation of determinism”, in SUZETESIS. studi sull’ epicureismo Greco e romano offerti a M Gigante, Naples: Bibliopolis, pp. 11–51.
  • –––, 1988, “Epicurean Anti-Reductionism”, in Matter and Metaphysics: Fourth Symposium Hellenisticum, Jonathan Barnes and Mario Mignucci (eds.), Naples: Bibliopolis. pp. 295–327.
  • Segvic, Heda, 2000, “No One Errs Willingly: the Meaning of Socratic Intellectualism”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 19: 1–45.
  • Sharples, R.W., 1975, “Aristotelian and Stoic Conceptions of Necessity in the De Fato of Alexander of Aphrodisias”, Phronesis, 20(3): 247–274. doi:10.1163/156852875X00111
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Other Internet Resources


I’d like to thank Anne Farrell and the SEP’s reviewer for their helpful comments and suggestions, and Jennifer Daigle, whose M.A. thesis work on Aristotle on moral responsibility had an impact on my understanding of Aristotle, which is reflected in my discussion. Portions of this entry draw upon O’Keefe (2005), O’Keefe (2009), and O’Keefe (2017).

Copyright © 2020 by
Tim O’Keefe <>

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