Kant’s Account of Reason

First published Fri Sep 12, 2008; substantive revision Wed Jan 4, 2023

Kant’s philosophy focuses on the power and limits of reason. Two questions are central. In his theoretical philosophy, Kant asks whether reasoning can give us metaphysical knowledge. In particular, can reason ground insights that go “beyond” (meta) the physical world, as “rationalist” philosophers such as Leibniz and Descartes claimed? In his practical philosophy, Kant asks whether reason can guide action and justify moral principles. “Empiricist” philosophers claimed that only feelings can motivate us to act; reason cannot. In Hume’s famous words: “Reason is wholly inactive, and can never be the source of so active a principle as conscience, or a sense of morals” (Treatise,

Against rationalist metaphysics, Kant claims that reasoning faces strict limits. Reason cannot give us knowledge of God or a world beyond the senses; reasoning falls into contradiction and confusion if it does not respect these boundaries.

Against the empiricist account of motivation and morality, Kant argues that reason has a vital power. Reason enables us to act on principles that we can share with other rational beings. In a world of limits, reason reveals human freedom.[1]

This entry has the following structure. The first section sets out the role that reason plays in Kant’s account of knowledge and metaphysics. This focuses on the Critique of Pure Reason or “first Critique” (1781, second edition 1787). The second section examines his moral philosophy. This focuses on his Critique of Practical Reason or “second Critique” (1788). Reflecting Kant’s own works and most of the secondary literature, these two sections are relatively independent. The third section therefore considers the relations between theoretical and practical reason. Since Kant rarely discusses reason as a whole, his general view is a matter of interpretation: Onora O’Neill has given the most prominent account. The concluding remarks stress the philosophical interest of her unified interpretation.

1. Theoretical reason: reason’s cognitive role and limitations

In the first half of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant argues that we obtain substantive knowledge of the world through two capacities: sensibility and understanding. Empirical judgments depend on both sensory experience and concept formation. Kant emphasizes the solidity of empirical knowledge gained this way.

In the next large section, Kant discusses “theoretical reason”—especially philosophical reasoning. The “Transcendental Dialectic” attacks philosophical efforts to gain knowledge of a “transcendent” world, that is, a world beyond that revealed by the senses. “Dialectic,” says Kant, is “a logic of illusion” (A293/B349). Here, reason appears mainly as a source of empty or false ideas.

Many readers fall away before the final section of the book, where Kant reviews his overall method—his own use of “pure reason.” The closing “Transcendental Doctrine of Method” considers reason in terms of its “discipline,” “canon,” “architectonic,” and “history.”

This makes it easy to interpret the Critique of Pure Reason as simply critical of reason—as dismissing its claims to give us knowledge. But if this were all that Kant intended, how should we understand his own philosophical reasoning? Kant certainly wants to show the limits of reason. But he also needs to show how reason can play a constructive role. He does this in at least three ways: he relates reason to empirical truth (§1.1 below); he explores reason’s role in scientific enquiry (§1.2 below); and he explains the benefits of appreciating reason’s limits (§1.3 below).[2]

In addition, when we engage in philosophical reasoning, we ought to understand the capacity that we are using. As Kant puts it, reason must take on “the most difficult of all its tasks, namely, that of self-knowledge” (Axi). The first Critique begins this task, but does not complete it (§1.4 below).

1.1 Reason and empirical truth

Reason has an important role in our pursuit of knowledge. Kant writes: “the law of reason to seek unity is necessary, since without it we would have no reason, and without that, no coherent use of the understanding, and, lacking that, no sufficient mark of empirical truth…” (A651/B679).[3] Kant says relatively little to develop this claim, and the issue has not attracted much commentary. (But cf. Walker 1989: Ch. 4; Guyer and Walker 1990; Kant’s theory of judgment, §1.3.)[4]

However, the basic idea is clear from his text. We form judgments about the world around us all the time. We see a hand in front of us and judge it to exist; after a dream, we judge ourselves to have been dreaming and the dream’s contents to be illusory; we see the sun rise and assume that it orbits the earth. (Obviously this last judgment is false: see §1.2 below.) Kant devotes much effort to show how all these judgments rely on categories. Fundamental concepts such as cause and effect structure all our judgments. A belief that conforms to these categories meets the “formal” conditions of truth. However, unless we are fundamentally confused about something, all our beliefs meet these conditions.[5] So how do we decide which of our beliefs are true, and which mistaken?

Kant begins by noting that only judgments can be mistaken: “It is correctly said that the senses do not err; yet not because they always judge correctly, but because they do not judge at all” (A293). For example, there is no error involved in dreaming, however incoherent or fantastical the dream may be. But if someone got confused and supposed that a dreamed-of event had really happened, then she would be making a judgment—a false one. So Kant claims, “error is only effected through the unnoticed influence of sensibility on understanding, through which it happens that the subjective grounds of the judgment join with the objective ones” (A294). In the example, someone confuses a subjective ground of judgment (“I had this dream”) with an objective one (“these events took place”). As Kant puts it in the Prolegomena:

The difference between truth and dream… is not decided through the quality of the representations that are referred to objects, for they are the same in both, but through their connection according to rules that determine the combination of representations in the concept of an object, and how far they can or cannot stand together in one experience. (4:290)

How does reasoning help here? In the famous “Refutation of Idealism” (added to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason), Kant writes: “Whether this or that putative experience is not mere imagination [or dream or delusion, etc.] must be ascertained according to its particular determinations and through its coherence with the criteria of all actual experience” (B279).

To see what Kant means, consider a simple example. Suppose that our dreamer believes they have won a lottery, but then starts to doubt this belief. To decide whether it is true, they must ask how far such a belief connects up with their other judgments, and those of other people.[6] If it fails to connect up (they check the winning numbers, perhaps, and find no match with the actual ticket), the dreamer must conclude that the belief was false.

We can also see the logic here in terms of Kant’s claim that reason is “the faculty of the unity of the rules of understanding under principles” (A302/B359). One fundamental principle of experience is that we inhabit a single world in space and time. Therefore, all true judgments must find a place within a single, unified experience of the world. Reason seeks consistency. It helps separate factual mistakes from genuine knowledge by referring to this unifying condition.

1.2 Reason in science

The principle of reasoned unity also applies to scientific judgments and theories. However, it takes a more complex form, since science seeks universal laws.

Kant claims that reason is “the origin of certain concepts and principles” (A299/B355) independent from those of sensibility and understanding. Kant refers to these as “transcendental ideas” (A311/B368) or “ideas of [pure] reason” (A669/B697). He also defines reason as a “faculty of principles” (A299/B356). But what are these concepts and principles, and can they be justified? Since Kant also argues that “ideas of reason” often lead to error and contradiction, these are serious questions.

One sort of error arises when we claim knowledge of objects beyond sensory experience, such as God or the soul. Another sort arises when we form “transcendental ideas.” We may try to conceptualize the ultimate basis of everything that exists, such as the universe as a whole. Kant refers to these as “world wholes” or cosmological ideas. As discussed in a moment (§1.3), when we claim objective knowledge about these, we fall into contradictions or “antinomies.” For example, Kant holds that we can argue equally well for the opposing claims: that the universe has a beginning in time and that it does not.

Scientific enquiry assumes that the world forms a well-ordered, systematic unity where all events can be subsumed under causal laws. This is not just the idea that events have causes—an inescapable assumption that Kant refers to as a category of the understanding. Rather, the claim is that universal laws underlie all particular relations of cause and effect. This is what Kant has in mind when he speaks of the “unity of reason” in the first Critique. (See e.g. A302/B359, A665/B693, A680/B780.)

As an illustration, consider Copernicus’s hypothesis that the earth orbits the sun. This hypothesis contradicts our everyday perceptions—perceptions that we normally rely on without question. Historically, Galileo’s observations were a turning point. The telescope gave a much more extensive picture of planets and stars, casting doubt on our everyday perspective. Although a new scientific tool is involved (the telescope), the reasoning is quite ordinary. In the face of inconsistent appearances, we must decide which perspective to endorse—just as we may judge that an impression is merely an optical illusion, or a dream is only a dream.[7]

For Kant’s account of scientific reasoning, Newton is more important (Bxxii n; cf. §1.4 below). Newton’s laws of gravity unify Copernicus’s hypothesis and Galileo’s observations—and much more besides (A663/B691). The laws are universal: they extend to all heavenly objects, not only the sun’s motion relative to the earth.

But we can never experience all events. However extensive our experiences may be, and however many people’s experiences we draw on, experience is finite. As such, it can never justify the principle that laws are genuinely universal, or that these laws will continue to hold in the future.[8] Kant argues that reason is justified in adopting these principles (and others). However, he makes a subtle distinction. These principles should guide scientific inquiry—in Kant’s term, they are “regulative.” But they do not provide knowledge of the world—as Kant puts it, they are not “constitutive.” (See e.g., Buchdahl 1992; Friedman 1992c; Kant’s theory of judgment, §4.2.)

For Kant, the categories of the understanding are the paradigm example of constitutive ideas. For example, the category of causation structures all our knowledge. We do not perceive cause and effect directly. Instead, experience is only possible because we assume events have causes. (See Kant and Hume on causality for more detail.) Although we can make mistakes about specific causes, we also have the following knowledge about cause and effect: we know that every event has a cause. The category of cause and effect constitutes experience—it enables us to experience the world.

By contrast, regulative principles govern our investigations, without offering any guarantee as to what we will find. Science seeks the greatest possible completeness and systematicity (cf. Guyer 1989 & 2006, Abela 2006, Mudd 2017). Although scientists often pursue highly specialized inquiries, science also has a regulative goal. It must integrate all findings under the most all-encompassing laws. Newton’s laws have been modified by general relativity, for example, pointing to the open-ended, “regulative” nature of this quest. Likewise, scientists are still looking for a satisfactory way to integrate general relativity with quantum mechanics.[9]

We cannot know in advance how far science will succeed, or that nature is constituted as wholly law-like. This would represent a “constitutive principle,” a “cosmological” knowledge claim which goes beyond any possible experiences. Instead, the principle of seeking law-like unity represents a “maxim” or regulative principle of reason (A666/B694). Rather than determining what science must find, such principles guide scientific practice.

Kant’s account of science, and especially the role of “teleological” or purposive judgment, is further developed in the Critique of the Power of Judgment. See Guyer 1990, Freudiger 1996, and Nuzzo 2005, as well as Kant’s aesthetics and teleology (§3). On Kant’s account of science more generally, see Wartenberg 1992, Buchdahl 1992, Friedman 1992b & 2013, Mudd 2016 and Breitenbach 2018. On reason and science, see Neiman 1994: Ch. 2 and Grier 2001: Ch. 8. The entry on Kant’s philosophy of science considers Kant’s view of the natural sciences, especially physics.

1.3 The limits of reason

This is the best-known point, and is considered in detail in the entry on Kant’s critique of metaphysics. Kant demolishes a series of supposed proofs of the existence of God (“The Ideal of Pure Reason”) and the soul (“The Paralogisms”).

He also demonstrates that it is equally possible to prove some judgments about “world wholes” as it is to prove their opposites. “The Antinomies” contain arguments that space must be unbounded and that it must be bounded, that there must be an absolutely first cause and that there cannot be (the problem of freedom in the famous “Third Antinomy”).

These sections have always been regarded as the most convincing parts of the book. Mendelssohn spoke for many of Kant’s contemporaries in calling him the “all-destroyer.” These contradictions show the limits of metaphysical knowledge.

Kant’s intentions are not destructive, however. Philosophers must understand the capacity that they rely on—that is, reason (§1.4). Theologians and metaphysicians have often claimed knowledge that reason cannot deliver. This has led to empty battles that invite skepticism about reason. After all, if reasoning leads to inconsistent claims, how can we rely on it? By contrast, Kant aims to clear the ground: reason has limits but it is not powerless; philosophical reasoning can justify some claims. These include the claims discussed above (§1.1 and §1.2) as well as reason’s practical role (§2 below). Gava & Willaschek (forthcoming) usefully stress this aspect of the first Critique.

In the Doctrine of Method (the last, least-read part of the first Critique) Kant refers to the biblical story of Babel (Genesis, Ch. 11). The literal meaning of “Babel” is “confusion”—God punished human beings’ attempt to build “a tower that would reach the heavens” (A707/B735) by giving them many different languages. Since they were unable to understand one another, they could no longer cooperate in such hubristic ventures.[10] Again and again, reason returns to some simple ideas with towering implications—the immortal soul, God, freedom. Worse, it cooks up[11] more or less convincing proofs of these.

Since these ideas reach beyond experience of a shared world, people lack a shared way to test them. Perhaps they emptily repeat other people’s words without real understanding; quite possibly, they come up with conflicting versions of these ideas. They talk past one another; they might as well speak different languages. Most likely, they will fall into conflict, or find peace only by submitting to an unreasoned authority. In metaphysics, Kant refers to “the ridiculous despotism of the schools” (Bxxxv).[12] In practical life, however, despotism is far from ridiculous: it is the brutal last resort for securing order when people adopt conflicting ideas and pursue conflicting goals. Kant often alludes to Hobbes, who holds that peace is only possible if an unaccountable sovereign “overawes” every member of society.[13] On many interpretations, Kantian reason aims to build intersubjective order and avoid the dangers of Babel-like hubris, conflict and despotism (Saner 1967, O’Neill 1989, Neiman 1994).

In the Preface to the second edition of the Critique, Kant makes a famous claim: “I had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx). Human beings cannot have knowledge of the world as a whole. They cannot know entities that transcend this world, such as the immortal soul or God. We cannot experience these things through our senses; reason cannot supply such knowledge. However, Kant argues that knowledge is not the primary end of reason. Only our role within the world “necessarily interests everyone” (A839n/B867n). Kant rejects a “scholastic” or knowledge-oriented notion of philosophy. Instead, he offers a “cosmic” or world-oriented one (A838/B866; cf. Ypi 2021: Ch. 1 and Ferrarin 2015).

Kant proposes three questions that answer “all the interest of my reason”: “What can I know?” “What must I do?” and “What may I hope?” (A805/B833). We have seen his answer to the first question: we can only know the world as revealed through the senses. Kant does not answer the second question until the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, four years later. (Arguably, he sees no need to answer the question in this form, since he is confident that people have long known how they ought to act.[14]) But the first Critique does include some observations on hope—that is, faith in God and a future world. Kant argues that knowledge of these things is not only impossible—it would also corrupt practical reasoning. Rather than doing good for its own sake, we would be motivated by external incentives—eternal punishment and heavenly reward. Kant later calls this “heteronomy,” as opposed to “autonomy”—our own personal commitment to morality. Despite this, Kant argues that we have legitimate reasons to hope for God and immortality. We must also have confidence in our freedom to act morally. He connects and develops these claims in the second Critique, as discussed below (§2.3).

Since “reason” is a mental capacity, it may seem strange to speak of it having “needs” or “interests.” The basic idea is that there are preconditions for successfully exercising this capacity. For finite human beings, reason is not transparent or infallible, as some rationalist philosophers seemed to think. We may think we are reasoning, when actually we are cooking up false rationalizations and self-deceptions. We may think we are reasoning well, when we argue toward transcendent truths, such as the existence of God or a future world. So reason has an “interest” in appreciating its own limits, if it is to be valid. As Kleingeld puts it, reason “needs to present itself to itself in the process of gaining clarity about its own workings” (1998a: 97)—above all, the principles that it must give to itself. As the next section discusses, this means that Kant views reason as essentially self-reflexive.

1.4 Reason’s self-knowledge

The first Critique argues that there has, so far, been no real progress in metaphysics. In the second edition Preface, Kant proudly proclaims that his book has finally put metaphysics on “the sure path of a science” (Bvii; cf. Axiii). So we might ask: what is the relation of metaphysics—or philosophical reasoning more generally—to areas of human enquiry that generate certainty (geometry and mathematics) and expand knowledge (science in general)?

Kant insists that mathematics cannot provide a model for philosophy. “Mathematics gives the most resplendent example of pure reason happily expanding itself without assistance from experience” (A712/B740). But metaphysics cannot follow this course.[15] This is not simply a rhetorical point, since many of Kant’s predecessors had tried to do exactly this—Spinoza’s Ethics is one example, Christian Wolff’s philosophy another (see Gava 2018). Kant’s basic argument is that mathematicians are justified in constructing objects or axioms a priori, because they can work with pure intuitions—like a line or the form of a triangle, for example—rather than being restricted only to the analysis of concepts. (See the entry on Kant’s philosophy of mathematics.) Philosophers cannot follow this sort of procedure because they have no right to assume any a priori intuitions or axioms about metaphysical entities. Attempts that rely on such claims have only produced “so many houses of cards” (A727/B755).

The empirical sciences also offer an unpromising model for metaphysics. In the first place, Kant has argued that experience cannot reveal metaphysical entities. We could never know, for instance, that we are free: like everything else we can know, human conduct is open to causal explanation. Second, experience cannot generate the sort of necessity Kant associates with metaphysical conclusions. Experience reveals contingent facts: it cannot show that such-and-such must be the case. (Kant’s position here is complicated, since he also holds that scientific laws have the metaphysical quality of necessity. Genuine laws are universal, and not mere generalizations or rules of thumb. But this metaphysical claim requires philosophical justification—thus Kant’s short book, Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). It is not discovered by investigating the world.)

None of these points, however, deters Kant from using the imagery of science and experiment to describe his own philosophical efforts. These metaphors are especially prominent in the Preface to the second edition of the Critique, where he writes:

Reason, in order to be taught by nature, must approach nature with its principles in one hand, according to which the agreement among appearances can count as laws, and, in the other hand, the experiment thought out in accord with these principles—in order to be instructed by nature not like a pupil, who has recited to him whatever the teacher wants to say, but like an appointed judge who compels witnesses to answer the questions he puts to them. (Bxiii)

In other words, reason, as “[self-]appointed judge,” does not sit by and merely observe whatever comes along. It actively proposes principled accounts of the phenomenon it investigates—that is, law-like hypotheses. Then it devises experiments to confirm or disprove these.

Kant sees grounds for optimism in this picture. The natural sciences investigate the infinite scope of the empirical world. In contrast, philosophy only considers “what reason brings forth entirely out of itself… as soon as [its] common principle has been discovered” (Axx). The Transcendental Dialectic of the first Critique offers one application of this idea. Kant insists that there are only three transcendental ideas—the thinking subject (or soul), the world as a whole (the universe, or the entirety of time and space), and a being of all beings (that is, God) (A334/B391). As such, metaphysics is prone to three fundamental mistakes, which spring “from the nature of reason” itself (A339/B397; for more detail, see Kant’s critique of metaphysics). Philosophers have made many efforts to reach these ultimate or “unconditioned” objects. But these efforts always fail and they always involve the same basic mistakes.

Whether or not Kant is correct in this, his own picture of philosophical reasoning may seem puzzling. He suggests that reason must conduct an experiment upon itself—an idea that is hard to make sense of. In addition, although he talks about reason’s “common principle,” he does not explain what this may be.

Kant’s “experiment” may be less puzzling if we consider his hypothesis about everyday knowledge. He makes an analogy with Copernicus’s suggestion that the earth orbits the sun (Bxvi f). Only if we take account of the earth’s motion can we understand what we see in the heavens: we need to appreciate how our own (relative, moving) standpoint affects our observations. Kant’s parallel hypothesis is that our experience depends on the standpoint and capacities of the observer. Our knowledge is not like God’s (albeit more confused and limited), as rationalist philosophers sometimes suggested. Human knowledge has a structure of its own, and its own limits too.

The first main sections of the Critique explain and defend Kant’s philosophical hypothesis. We must take account of our human standpoint in order to explain the “a priori structure” of our experience—for example, how it is unified in a single order of space and time. The hypothesis is supported partly because the main alternative fails. The non-Copernican or non-Kantian view assumes a “single standpoint.” It does not distinguish between everyday knowledge and metaphysical speculation “beyond the bounds of experience” (Bxix). This leads to all sorts of problems. For example, we might suppose that immortal souls could interact with material objects and mortal human beings. Kant satirized this view in his earlier book, Dreams of a Spirit-Seer Elucidated by Dreams of Metaphysics (1766). His stated target was a religious visionary called Emanuel Swedenborg. But the subtitle reveals Kant’s philosophical point: metaphysicians have been dreaming, too. They have not appreciated the structure and limitations of the human standpoint. So their arguments have created “an unavoidable conflict of reason with itself” (Bxviii n). The “Antinomies” mentioned above (§1.3) explain the basic contradictions that result.

Even if Kant’s arguments succeed, this still leaves awkward questions about philosophical reasoning. Kant is not just concerned with our capacities for everyday knowledge. As the book’s title says, he means to “critique” or examine reason. But reasoning is the only means we have to do this. Does it make sense to think of reason as criticizing or justifying itself? Might it even point to something distinctive about our capacity to reason, that it can examine itself in this way?

§3 below discusses the most thorough reply to these question in the literature, by Onora O’Neill. To anticipate briefly: Kant’s metaphors—of reason’s experiment upon itself, as well as legal metaphors about testimony and examination[16]—point to a general problem: reason’s self-knowledge (cf. Axi f).

Kant assumes that we have a capacity to reason and that “to philosophize [is] to exercise the talent of reason…” (A838/B866). But since metaphysical reasoning has often gone wrong, he cannot merely assert the supremacy of reason. As he exclaims in the second edition Preface:

how little cause have we to place trust in our reason if in one of the most important parts of our desire for knowledge it does not merely forsake us but even entices us with delusions and in the end betrays us! (Bxv)

Kant’s question, then, is how we might defend reason from various doubts[17] and how we might discipline reason without begging questions—for instance, by invoking claims that are themselves open to doubt (cf. O’Neill 1989: Ch. 1, 1992, 2004 & 2015). This is the central task of critique (cf. Bxxxv): reason’s examination of itself. This should establish reason’s powers and limits. It should give an account of reason’s “common principle” and its authority.

2. Practical reason: morality and the primacy of pure practical reason

The first Critique only hints at the form of Kant’s moral theory would take.[18] The account of practical reason in the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) and Critique of Practical Reason (1788) is radically new. Kant now presents the supreme principle of practical reason—the Categorical Imperative. It is an imperative: it represents a command for human beings, who have needs and inclinations and are not perfectly rational. It is categorical or unconditional: it must always guide our action.

Kant’s first formulation of this principle runs as follows: “act only according to that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). (Kant also gives other versions of this Imperative, which he sees as equivalent: see Kant’s Moral Philosophy, §5–§9.) Kant argues that this principle is implicit in common human reasoning. Although it requires much philosophical effort to articulate this principle, we rely on it whenever we make moral judgments.

Alongside the Categorical Imperative, Kant also mentions the principle of “hypothetical imperatives.” As he puts it, “Whoever wills the end also wills (in so far as reason has decisive influence on his actions) the indispensably necessary means to it that is in his control” (4:417; cf. 5:19f[19]). Following Hume, many philosophers hold that practical reasoning is essentially instrumental. In this case, practical reason only gives conditional or “hypothetical” instructions. These have an “if—then” structure. If someone has particular ends or inclinations, then they should adopt suitable means. (This is the idea of instrumental rationality; see also Kant’s moral philosophy, §4; Kant and Hume on morality, §3.)

In Kant’s view, this is just a matter of consistency. In his terms, the principle of hypothetical imperatives is analytic—to pursue an end is to employ “the indispensably necessary means” (4:417; cf. Korsgaard 1997, Newton 2017, Pollok 2017: Ch. 8). Someone who fails to take up necessary means is not, in fact, pursuing that end. At best, they are hoping or wishing. At worst, they are involved in a practical contradiction—a sure sign of irrationality. However, they can overcome this contradiction by abandoning the end. Seen as mere consistency, rationality cannot require more.

By contrast, the categorical imperative is synthetic (4:420, 447). It provides an end that every rational agent must adopt.[20] For Kant, the requirement to adopt universalizable maxims means that we must respect all rational beings as “ends-in-themselves” (4:428). For Kant, reason—and only reason—is the source of this unconditional demand.

2.1 Freedom implies moral constraint: the Categorical Imperative

Alongside the derivation of his supreme moral principle, the most difficult questions about Kant’s view of practical reason center on its relation to freedom. Although the broad outlines are consistent, Kant’s views on this topic seem to shift more than other aspects of his critical thought. (See Kant’s moral philosophy, §10, for a brief sketch, and Allison 1990 for a full account.) This section and the following §2.2 focus on Kant’s radical claim that “freedom and unconditional practical law [that is, the Categorical Imperative] reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f). Freedom implies that practical reason can be pure (non-instrumental, unconditional), and hence that we are subject to the Categorical Imperative. Our subjection to morality implies that we must be free.

Kant’s argument that freedom implies the Categorical Imperative is brief (see Critique of Practical Reason, 5:19–30). If I am free to step back from my inclinations, those inclinations cannot provide a definitive reason to act. Inclinations motivate, but they do not compel. If someone asks me why I did something, inclinations may explain my action—the action helped me achieve something I wanted. But there is still an open question: should I have acted on those inclinations?

An example may help here. Pushing you out of the way might satisfy my desire to get to the front of the queue. The desire motivates me; we might say that it provides a “reason for me.” For other people, my desire only explains my rudeness. It does not supply others with a reason to endorse my behavior; it does not justify my doing this. Compare the entry on reasons for action: justification, motivation, explanation: “Because I wanted to” may be a “motivating reason” for me; it may be an “explanatory reason” for other people. But it is not a “justificatory reason.” Kant accepts that desires are relevant to practical reasoning. His claim is that they need not, and should not, determine our reasoning. Simply put, my inclinations do not matter more than other people’s.

How can we find reasons that others should also accept? Kant claims the only possibility is to look to “the mere form of giving universal law” (5:27). There is, he says, “only a single categorical imperative… act only according to that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). This principle is categorical (no if-s or but-s!); it is an imperative (we must follow it!). When our action passes this test, we have done our duty. (In fact, the first section of the Groundwork argues that this principle follows just by analyzing the idea of duty. For more detailed discussion see Kant’s moral philosophy, §2–§5.)

Kant’s emphasis on duty may sound old-fashioned; the idea of justifying your conduct is more familiar, especially when we think about practical reasoning. However, duty and justification are inseparable. To claim that you have done your duty is to hold that your actions are justified. Other people should endorse your actions as the right thing to do. If they resent or frustrate your actions, they are acting unreasonably—not you.

But why does Kant think that “the mere form of giving universal law” can capture the idea of duty, or reveal what sort of action is justified?

Two points are central. First, the “form of… law” refers to an overall policy or principle. Without this, my actions would be random and make no sense, even to me. Second, Kant refers to “giving universal law.” Not just any policy or principle will do. A justification is meant to provide other people with reasons to endorse my conduct—common sense already tells us that many policies won’t do this. In fact, Kant argues that there is only one. My policy must be to act on principles that everyone else can also adopt. This is what he means by “universal law.”

To give a better sense of what he means, Kant notes some other principles that seem law-like, but go beyond the “mere form of universal law”—and thereby fail to be justifiable. In the second Critique (5:39ff), he discusses six such candidates. Here is one example to illustrate.

Kant sees Epicurus as advocating the following policy: always follow your inclinations, wherever they might lead. This might sound law-like—it directs action, just as ordinary laws tell you to pay your taxes or drive on the left. It may even sound like a law that a free agent could adopt. While it deprives you of the freedom to act in ways you don’t want, it preserves something that sounds much more worthwhile: the freedom to do whatever you do want. However, it goes beyond the “form of law” because it tells you to submit to merely subjective factors—your inclinations, whatever they may be. This raises two problems.

First, the policy is not actually law-like in practice—my inclinations change and conflict with one another. For example, short-term inclinations often undermine longer-term ones; often it’s impossible to get everything we wish for. This isn’t so much freedom, more a recipe for confusion. To act coherently, I need to discipline and rank my inclinations. In other words, my will would contradict itself if I tried only to follow inclinations. I would not really have a will—in Kant’s terms, there is a contradiction in even conceiving this policy.

Second, it is not a policy that everyone can follow. If they did, the results would be utterly chaotic; they would defeat anyone’s attempts to satisfy their inclinations. In Kant’s terms, there is a contradiction in willing such a policy. So far as we can even imagine this, we see straightaway that each person’s willing would predictably fail. (Kant’s moral philosophy, §5, explores these two contradictions, in conception and in willing.)

In more abstract terms: such a policy is unreasonable because it gives authority to particular features of one particular agent—worse, to features that aren’t even stable or mutually consistent. In Kant’s words:

it is requisite to reason’s lawgiving that it should need to presuppose only itself, because a rule is objectively and universally valid only when it holds without the contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another. (5:21)

No principle is truly law-like unless it abstracts from an agent’s particular motivations and situation. Every other possibility looks for substantive guidance from outside of reason itself—just as a hypothetical imperative only guides you if you already want to pursue that end. Kant refers to this basic difficulty as heteronomy—that is, reasoning directed from the outside. This external authority might be my inclinations, or religious dogma, or even a political authority. But it is merely assumed or imposed; it cannot justify itself. Heteronomous reasoning does not address the fundamental problem: to find principles that are entitled to guide everyone’s acting and thinking. In the word Kant has made so famous, reasoning must be autonomous—that is, self-governed.

There have been many doubts whether the mere “form of law” can really provide concrete guidance. In reply, Kantians argue that it represents a substantial constraint: we must avoid all ways of thinking and acting that cannot be followed by all. (For discussion see inter alia O’Neill 1989: Ch. 5; Herman 1993; Allison 1990: Ch. 10 §II.) If this is true, then the autonomy of reason reveals the positive sense of freedom at the heart of Kant’s practical philosophy (cf. Brandom 1979). That is, reason enables us to act in ways that do not rely on “contingent, subjective conditions that distinguish one rational being from another” (5:21). It enables us to justify our conduct to one another. It empowers us to build communities around principles that everyone can share.

2.2 Moral constraint implies freedom: Kant’s “fact of reason”

As well as claiming that freedom implies the Categorical Imperative, Kant claims that moral obligation implies freedom.

Kant insists that “nothing in appearances can be explained by the concept of freedom” (5:30). Morality, he claims, “exists in the sensible world [the world as known through the senses and by science] but without infringing on its laws” (5:43). Every action counts as an event in the world of everyday objects (or “appearances,” in Kant’s terminology). We must take every event to be caused—in terms of everyday explanations as well as in sciences such as physics and neuroscience. Considered as events in the objective world, human actions do not provide us with a warrant for freedom.

Instead, it is to our consciousness or subjectivity that Kant turns:

Ask [someone] whether, if his prince demanded, on pain of… immediate execution, that he give false testimony against an honorable man who the prince would like to destroy under a plausible pretext, he would consider it possible to overcome his love of life… He would perhaps not venture to assert whether he would do it or not, but he must admit without hesitation that it would be possible for him. He judges, therefore, that he can do something because he is aware that he ought to do it and cognizes freedom within him, which, without the moral law, would have remained unknown to him. (5:30; cf. 5:155f)

As Kant also says, “the moral law, and with it practical reason, [have] come in and forced this concept [freedom] upon us” (5:30). In the next section, Kant refers to this as a “fact of reason”: “Consciousness of this fundamental law may be called a fact of reason because one cannot reason it out from antecedent data of reason” (5:31; cf. 5: 6, 42f, 47, 55, 91, 104).

This “fact” has caused considerable controversy, for several reasons. Kant is not altogether clear about what he takes this fact to demonstrate. He has argued that facts about human beings cannot provide the basis for morality—morality must be given a priori, that is, independently of experience. Further, Kant speaks of “cognizing the moral law.” But he is well aware that his own account of this “law” is quite new. Not least, this “fact, as it were” does not feature in his earlier treatise, the Groundwork, and does not appear again.

One school of thought—which includes many influential Kant scholars, and is sympathetically represented in Allison 1990 (Chs. 12 and 13)—sees a fundamental change in Kant’s thought here. Part III of the Groundwork seems to give a “deduction” (justification) of freedom. But in the second Critique Kant realizes that his own premises do not allow such an argument. So he stops argument short by appealing to a supposedly indubitable fact.

Other commentators emphasize the clear continuities between the two books. In particular, Kant relies on common moral consciousness in both. Łuków 1993 emphasizes the parallel between Achtung (“respect” or “reverence” for morality) and the fact of reason. Kant refers to respect in all his ethical writings: it is the only feeling “self-wrought by a rational concept [= the moral law]” (4:401n). As such, it clearly resembles what he now calls “the sole fact of pure reason” (5:31). (See also O’Neill 2002 and Timmermann 2010.) Moreover, Kant uses the Latin word factum. Arguably, this is better translated as deed rather than fact. In other words, Kant points to an act of reason as well as the fact that it creates (Kleingeld 2010).

In any case, Kant’s line of thought in the long passage quoted above is fairly clear: We all (most of us) recognize that there are situations where we ought to do something, even though it will cost us dearly. In other words, we feel that we are subject to an unconditional moral imperative. When we acknowledge this “ought,” we show our belief in the possibility of acting on it. This shows us to be free—not merely in the negative sense that we could go against our inclinations, but also in the positive sense that we can do our duty (4:446). Only our moral awareness reveals this freedom.

Clearly, this line of thought is not immune to criticism. For example, our feeling of moral constraint might be explained in terms of a Freudian super-ego. But it shows why Kant thought that moral awareness—unlike any other sort of experience—gives us a practical certainty of our freedom. While this is not knowledge in the empirical or scientific sense, it provides a basis for practical reasoning: “a fact [Faktum] in which pure reason in us proves itself actually practical” (5:42). And if Kant is right that only the Categorical Imperative reveals our capacity to act in ways that we can justify to others, then we can see why he claims, “freedom and unconditional practical law reciprocally imply each other” (5:29f).

2.3 The primacy of (pure) practical reason

Kant does not give a complete account of the relation between practical reason and theoretical reason. However, the second Critique does include an important section, “On the primacy of pure practical reason in its connection with speculative reason” (5:119–121). (See Gardner 2006 and Willaschek 2010.)

We have already seen two reasons why Kant must give some priority to “pure practical reason.” First, assume that Kant is correct—against rationalist philosophers—that theoretical reason cannot have insight into the supersensible. This means that reason cannot have access to any transcendent authority (such as God on many traditional conceptions) that might command thought or action.

Second, Kant says that practical reason can either be “pure”—i.e., “proceed from a priori principles”—or it can proceed “from empirical determining grounds” (5:90). Desires and inclinations are empirical, for Kant. Reasoning that helps us fulfill them is “hypothetical”—it applies only if you have those desires. For Kant, merely following your desires represents “heteronomy,” especially when they conflict with morality. On this view, reason is just an instrument to help you fulfill your desires. As Hume put it, in an especially horrible metaphor, reason would be “the slave of the passions” (Treatise, It cannot issue its own commands.[21]

These two points suggest that neither theoretical nor instrumental reasoning can supply authoritative reasons for action. If there are such reasons—as Kant’s “fact of reason” supposes—then only pure practical reason can supply them.

Now, however, Kant makes a stronger claim. He argues that pure practical reason has “primacy” even on the home territory of theoretical reason. That is, pure practical reason should guide some of our beliefs, as well as our actions.

Kant defines primacy as “the prerogative of the interest of one insofar as the interests of others is subordinated to it” (5:119). He gives at least three considerations to support this “prerogative” of practical reason.[22]

One point just reflects Kant’s talk of reason’s “interests.” “[A]ll interest,” says Kant, “is ultimately practical and even that of speculative reason is only conditional and is complete in practical use alone” (5:121). In this sense, to accept the metaphor of “interests” is to see reasoning as ultimately practical. (Cf. Kant’s notion of philosophy as “world-oriented” rather than “scholastic”—§1.3 above. See also Neiman 1994: Ch. 3; Kleingeld 1998a; Rauscher 1998.)

Second, practical reason can be “pure” or independent from “pathological conditions,” that is, our inclinations. As just noted, Kant holds that practical reason can be “pure” or “a priori.” That is, it need not be governed by our inclinations. By contrast, theoretical reason goes wrong when it seeks knowledge by itself—for example, in merely “speculative” proofs that God exists. Theoretical reasoning can only gain knowledge through sensibility and understanding. Practical reason is independent in a way that theoretical reasoning can never be.

A third line of thought is less abstract, and rests on the specific interests that Kant attributes to these two forms of reasoning. When their interests conflict, we must decide which are to come first.

The “interest” of theoretical reason consists in expanding our knowledge and avoiding error. As Kant has argued, reason can help broaden scientific knowledge, but it cannot justify speculative metaphysical claims. However, practical reason has a conflicting interest—in beliefs that lie beyond the bounds of knowledge. Kant writes:

But if pure reason of itself can be and really is practical, as the consciousness of the moral law proves it to be [cf. §2.2 on the “fact of reason”], it is still only one and the same reason which, whether from a theoretical or a practical perspective, judges according to a priori principles; it is then clear that, even if from the first [theoretical] perspective its capacity does not extend to establishing certain propositions affirmatively, although they do not contradict it, as soon as these same propositions belong inseparably to the practical interest of pure reason[, then theoretical reason] must accept them. (5:121)

In other words, even if it is finally “one and the same reason,” reason seems divided. Used practically, reason has an interest in “certain propositions”—specifically, the reality of freedom, immortality and God. But theoretical reasoning says these cannot be proven. The practical interest has greater weight, because it is rooted in morality.

Here, Kant introduces the idea of a “postulate.” This is “a theoretical proposition, though one not demonstrable as such, insofar as it is attached inseparably to an a priori unconditionally valid practical law” (5:122). For Kant, there is only one unconditional law: the Categorical Imperative or “moral law.” He claims that three postulates are “attached” to it: “immortality, freedom considered positively (as the causality of a being insofar as it belongs to the intelligible world), and the existence of God” (5:132).

Freedom has a special status—as discussed in §2.2, the second Critique’s “fact of reason” is meant to establish this. But why does he think we must “postulate” God and immortality?[23] (See also the entry on Kant’s philosophy of religion.)

As we have seen, Kant holds that we should act out of “respect” for morality—for the sake of duty. Morality must have priority over my inclinations. (Remember: inclinations can motivate and explain actions, but they are not enough to justify action.) This means that there is no guarantee that acting well will lead to my own happiness, or even other people’s. This creates a conflict—in Kant’s terms, a “dialectic”—between happiness and morality. While morality is the only unconditional good for human beings, Kant does not deny that happiness is important. It is the natural and necessary end of every human being (cf. 4:415); duty requires us to make others’ happiness our end.[24]

Kant expresses the combined importance of morality and happiness as “the highest good”:[25]

virtue (as worthiness to be happy) is the supreme condition of whatever can even seem to us desirable and hence of all our pursuit of happiness… and is therefore the supreme good. But it is not the whole and complete good for finite rational beings; for this, happiness is also required, and that not merely in the partial eyes of a person who makes himself an end, but even in the judgment of an impartial reason [in other words, this is not about my subjective wish to be happy, but rather an objective judgment that happiness is the natural end for human beings, just as goodness is our moral end—GW]… happiness distributed in exact proportion to morality (as the worth of a person and his worthiness to be happy) constitutes the highest good of a possible world. (5:110)

The argument here is bold but dubious. We must think of moral activity as resulting in happiness. Yet human agency cannot achieve this: “I [or even all of us acting together—GW] cannot hope to produce this [highest good] except by the harmony of my will with that of a holy and beneficent author of the world” (5:129). So, Kant argues, we must “postulate” that God exists. We must also postulate immortality. Only this enables us to hope that we will finally come close to virtue, hence become worthy of happiness.

3. The unity of theoretical and practical reason

We have seen one link between theoretical and practical reason. In answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant claims that practical reason has “primacy.” Theoretical reason may accept the postulates of God, freedom and immortality “as a foreign possession handed over to it” (5:120). Theoretical reason can only show that these things are not impossible. Our practical interests—at root, our moral obligations—demand that we believe in them. To cite Kant’s famous words again: “I had to deny knowledge in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx).

Kant’s arguments for freedom are more extensive and compelling. His arguments for God and immortality find little favor among contemporary authors. Perhaps the strongest support comes from Jens Timmermann, who claims: “the principle that unifies the spheres of theoretical and practical reason… is the assumption of a wise and benevolent God who has created a teleological world that coheres with morality” (2009: 197). (On teleology in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, see Guyer 1989, Freudiger 1996; Kant’s aesthetics and teleology, §3. Outside that work, see also Wood 1970, Kleingeld 1998b.)

Even if Kant did believe this—in his weaker moments, perhaps[26]—such a position lacks wider philosophical resonance. Most contemporary philosophers assume that the world does not “harmonize with” morality in this way—or at any rate, that it is a human task to foster such harmony, for example, by building decent societies and just institutions. Reath 1988 argues that Kant sometimes deploys a more defensible, “secular” or this-worldly, notion of the highest good. Kleingeld 1995 and Guyer 2000a & 2000b also offer interesting discussions.

Onora O’Neill has made the leading attempt to uncover the unity of Kantian reason and to relate it to contemporary philosophical concerns (1989 and subsequent essays). This section will focus on her central claim concerning the unifying role of the Categorical Imperative, and the main bases for this claim in Kant’s texts. O’Neill’s interpretation of Kantian reason enjoys considerable respect among Kant scholars, although there are relatively few critical responses to her work. Engstrom 1992 and Wood 1992 offer early reviews; Westphal 2011 and Cohen 2014, 2018 take up her account, as does Bagnoli 2022: Ch. 4; see further constructivism in metaethics, §2 (especially §2.3).[27]

3.1 Reason’s “common principle”

In the original Preface to the first Critique, Kant suggested that reason has a “common principle”: “Nothing here can escape us, because what reason brings forth entirely out of itself cannot be hidden, but is brought to light by reason itself as soon as reason’s common principle (gemeinschaftliches Prinzip) has been discovered” (Axx). Unfortunately, neither edition of the Critique considers what this principle might be.

Kant also raises this principle in his works on practical reason, without giving a clear account. In the Preface to the Groundwork, Kant explains why the book is not entitled a Critique of Pure Practical Reason:

[A critique of pure practical reason] is not of such utmost necessity as [a critique of pure theoretical reason], since human reason, even in the commonest understanding, can easily be brought to a high measure of correctness and accuracy in moral matters, whereas in its theoretical but pure use it is totally and entirely dialectical [i.e., a source of illusion]… I require that the critique of a pure practical reason, if it is to be complete, also be able to present its unity with speculative reason in a common principle; because in the end there can be only one and the same reason, which must differ merely in its application. (4:391)

In the second Critique, Kant compares the book’s structure with the first Critique and comments: “such comparisons [are] gratifying; for they rightly occasion the expectation of being able some day to attain insight into the unity of the whole rational faculty (theoretical as well as practical) and to derive everything from one principle—the undeniable need of human reason, which finds complete satisfaction only in a complete systematic unity of its cognitions” (5:91). Kant’s tone is confident. But once again, he has postponed an account of “the unity of the whole rational faculty.” (Prauss 1981 argues that Kant failed to achieve this insight, in part because he did not appreciate how cognitive success is a fundamentally practical goal. Förster 1992 discusses Kant’s reflections on this topic in his final manuscript, the Opus Postumum.)

However, as Onora O’Neill points out in a celebrated essay (1989: Ch. 1), Kant’s claims about practical reason imply a further claim about reason’s “common principle.” Kant has argued that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of practical reason. He has also argued that practical reason has primacy over theoretical reason. It follows, therefore, that the Categorical Imperative is the supreme principle of reason.

To be sure, Kant never states this conclusion explicitly. But there are reasons for thinking that this ought to have been his view, and in some places he comes very close to this claim.[28]

The clearest passage is a footnote (!) in Kant’s essay, “What is it to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” (1786):

To make use of one’s own reason means no more than to ask oneself, whenever one is supposed to assume something, whether one could find it feasible to make the ground or the rule on which one assumes it into a universal principle for the use of reason. (8:146n)

This bears an obvious parallel with the first formulation of the Categorical Imperative—“act only according to that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). Kant now says: think only in accordance with that maxim that could be a universal law.[29]

To rephrase the point: Thinking and judging are activities. If the Categorical Imperative is truly “categorical” then it applies to all our activities—“theoretical” as well as “practical.”

Other strands of Kant’s thought support this interpretation. The most important are his “maxims of reason” and his account of the “public use of reason.”

3.2 The maxims of reason

Kant sets out three “maxims of reason” or “maxims of common human understanding.” They appear twice in his published writings, in relation to both acting and thinking.[30] These maxims are closely related to the Categorical Imperative. (For discussion, see O’Neill 1989: Ch. 2 & 1992, and Neiman 1994: Ch. 5.)

In his last published work, the Anthropology (1798), Kant presents the maxims in a practical context, as guidelines for achieving some degree of wisdom:

Wisdom, as the idea of a practical use of reason that conforms perfectly with the law, is no doubt too much to demand of human beings. But also, not even the slightest degree of wisdom can be poured into a man by others; rather he must bring it forth from himself. The precept for reaching it contains three leading maxims: (1) Think for oneself, (2) Think into the place of the other [person] (in communication with human beings), (3) Always think consistently with oneself. (7:200; cf. 228f)

The maxims also appear in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). Here, Kant relates them to the theoretical use of reason. A famous section describes human beings’ capacity for a sensus communis or “community sense”:

a faculty for judging that… takes account (a priori) of everyone else’s way of representing in thought, in order as it were to hold its judgment up to human reason as a whole and thereby avoid the illusion which, from subjective private conditions that could easily be held to be objective, would have a detrimental influence on the judgment. (5:293)

That is, the maxims are precepts for judging in accordance with “reason as a whole” and avoiding the distortions that arise from “subjective private conditions.”

Kant describes (1) thinking for oneself as the maxim of unprejudiced thought; its opposite is passivity in thought, leading to prejudice and superstition. Kant also labels this “heteronomy,” clearly recalling his interpretation of reason and morality in terms of autonomy (4:433).[31] (2) To think in the place of everyone else is the maxim of enlarged or broad-minded thought. And (3) always to think in accord with oneself is the maxim of consistent thought (5:294).

The last maxim may sound more straightforward, but Kant emphasizes its difficulty. Consistency “can only be achieved through the combination of the first two and after frequent observance of them has made them automatic” (5:295). Consistency does not just involve getting rid of obvious contradictions in explicit beliefs. It also requires consistency with regard to the implications of our beliefs—and these are often not apparent to us. To achieve this sort of law-likeness in thought requires genuine attempts (1) to judge for oneself and the determination (2) to expose one’s judgments to the scrutiny of others. In other words, a person must try to make themselves: (1) really the author of their judgments; (2) accountable to others; and (3) consistent in their claims. We must take responsibility for our judgments.

The maxims support the thesis that theoretical and practical reasoning have a unified structure. In particular, they flesh out the implications of the Categorical Imperative. The imperative demands respect for “the mere form of law”—consistency, law-likeness, and autonomy in thought and action. Equally, it demands respect for other people as fellow reasoners and “ends-in-themselves” (Russell 2020, Lenczewska 2021). As a matter of thought, reasoning requires us to discipline our judgments so that others can follow them. As a matter of practical wisdom, reasoning requires us to discipline our actions so that others can adopt the same guiding principles.

3.3 The public use of reason

Anyone concerned with Kantian reason and politics must consider his famous essay, “What is Enlightenment?” (1784). Among many discussions, see O’Neill 1989: Ch. 2, 1990 & 2015: Ch. 3; Velkley 1989; Deligiorgi 2005; Patrone 2008.

As we have seen, Kant’s first maxim of reason is to think for oneself. He says this is the way to achieve “liberation from superstition,” and equates this with “enlightenment” (5:294). His second maxim asks us to “think into the place of others.” Communication is essential for this. As he writes: “…how much and how correctly would we think if we did not communicate with others to whom we communicate our thoughts, and who communicate theirs with us!”[32]

In “What is Enlightenment?” Kant places both maxims in a political context. He demands that we “have the courage to use our own reason”:

Enlightenment is the human being’s emergence from his self-incurred immaturity. Immaturity is the inability to use one’s own understanding [= reason[33]] without the guidance of another. This immaturity is self-incurred if its cause is not lack of understanding, but lack of resolution and courage to use it without the guidance of another. Sapere aude! [Dare to be wise!] Have courage to make use of your own understanding [= reason]! is thus the motto of enlightenment. (8:35)

Kant’s main concern is not with individuals, however. Enlightenment is a collective endeavor. It therefore has cultural and political aspects. For enlightenment, Kant says, “nothing is required but… the least harmful… freedom: namely, freedom to make public use of one’s reason in all matters” (8:36).

This “least harmful freedom” is not the freedom to act politically. It is not even freedom of speech in the now-familiar sense that covers many forms of personal expression. Instead, it is the freedom to reason “as a scholar before the entire public of the world of readers” (8:37).

As we might expect, Kant contrasts public reasoning with private reasoning. However, the distinction has an unfamiliar meaning. For Kant, employees reason privately. He mentions civil servants, military officers, or clerics in an established church. In contemporary terms, these are all more or less “public” roles. However, these employees are bound by the policies, procedures and dictates of their organization. They reason about how to act—but only to judge the best way of fulfilling tasks laid down by their employers.

We can draw a parallel with an individual who reasons instrumentally—about the best way to satisfy their inclinations, for example. Instrumental reason decides the best means to achieve pre-given ends. In Kant’s terms, it is heteronomous—directed by a source outside reason itself.

Similarly, these employees are directed by state or church. Their offices may be “public,” but their reasoning is private—deprived of full publicity. The employee “carries out another’s commission” (8:38). His reasoning is not free: it is “impermissible to argue; instead, one must obey” (8:37). The employee does not abandon his own moral judgment—Kant is careful to add that he must resign if he could not “in conscience [continue to] hold his office” (8:38). But within that office, he acts as a “passive member” (8:37) of the commonwealth.

By contrast, the public use of reason is active and autonomous. It does not follow directions; it is accountable to all. When a person reasons publicly, he thinks for himself and speaks as a member of “the society of citizens of the world” (8:37). Outside of his post, an employee may reason freely, and may even criticize government policies or religious teachings.

The same applies to the ordinary citizen. He must obey—for example, by paying taxes—and may not speak in a way that encourages others to disobey. But he “does not act against the duty of a citizen when, as a scholar, he publicly expresses his thoughts about the inappropriateness or even injustice of [governmental] decrees” (8:38).

This creates a stark contrast between roles: the obedient citizen or employee, as opposed to the “scholar” who makes “public use of reason.” But Kant sees no inconsistency. Peaceful co-existence requires that citizens do not undermine, let alone rebel against, existing governments—that risks chaos and even civil war. In Kant’s words, “morally practical reason pronounces [an] irresistible veto: there is to be no war” (6:354). As citizens of a given state, we must act as political institutions demand. As citizens of the world, however, we may criticize those demands and advocate reform.[34]

Kant’s views invite criticism. In his day, only a few citizens could read and publish their views; hardly any women could. So his position may seem elitist and sexist. It implies a gulf between theory and practice—between what employees and citizens may believe ought to be done, and what they must do (“obey”!). “The least harmful freedom” may seem not just harmless but powerless. Freedom to publish is only a small part of the freedoms essential to modern democracy. Hence Kant’s views may seem antiquated. Certainly, they fall far short of democratic citizenship as we understand it. Kant’s social and political philosophy (§4 and §6) discusses these issues.

For this entry, the key point is this. Kant equates reason with full publicity. “To use one’s own reason” is to make a sincere attempt to address all “citizens of the world.” Judgments and principles are only reasonable to the extent that they can be accepted by all. Our actions must respect existing boundaries and governments, because the duty to pursue and maintain peace is categorical. But reason itself aspires to universality. So as citizens of the world, we have another categorical duty: to see ourselves as accountable to every human being, and hence to improve existing institutions so that they recognize the claims of all. For reasoning to be fully public, citizens and non-citizens, rulers and ruled must discuss as equals—despite their inequalities in practice.

A famous passage from the Critique of Pure Reason expresses this idea, linking reason, critique, and autonomy:

Reason must subject itself to critique in all its undertakings, and cannot restrict the freedom of critique through any prohibition without damaging itself and drawing upon itself a disadvantageous suspicion. For there is nothing so important because of its utility, nothing so holy, that it may be exempted from this searching review and inspection, which knows no respect for persons [i.e. no person bears more authority than any other—GW]. On this freedom rests the very existence of reason, which has no dictatorial authority, but whose claim is never anything more than the agreement of free citizens, each of whom must be able to express his reservations, indeed even his veto, without holding back. (A738f/B766f, translation modified)

In the term used by several contemporary Kantians, this procedure constitutes reason. (See Herman 2007: Ch. 10, Korsgaard 2008, Reath 2013, Bagnoli 2017; Møller 2020 focuses on Kant’s legal metaphors.) Reason is the only unconditional (that is, non-heteronomous) authority for thinking and acting.

4. Concluding remarks

No one doubts that belief and action are subject to demands of rationality. Theoretical reasoning aims at knowledge of the world around us (perhaps also knowledge of ourselves). Practical reasoning aims to make a difference in the world (perhaps also a difference in ourselves).

This distinction hides a larger question: what is reason, exactly?[35] Rationality clearly involves the capacity to make logical and causal inferences: to draw out the consequences of our beliefs; to judge what consequences are likely to follow from different possibilities for action. Rationality clearly requires consistency. Our beliefs should not contradict one another, or have contradictory implications. We should use means that support our goals, rather than defeat them. We should avoid contradictory goals.[36] Beyond this, however, it is not obvious that “reason” is a unitary capacity or that “rationality” is a unitary requirement. If truth seems self-evident as a criterion of thinking, the criteria for rational action are much harder to make out.

If we accept the basic lesson of the first Critique, it is even harder to discern the criteria of rational action. Against rationalist philosophers, Kant argues that theoretical reason cannot discover realities beyond empirical experience. (Recall the literal meaning of metaphysics: beyond the physical world.) So we cannot know any sort of moral authority, be it God or revelation, that tells us how to think and act. Traditionally, truth and goodness stood together. Mendelssohn called Kant the “all-destroyer” partly because his critique undercut this traditional pairing. Experience can disclose (empirical) truth, but not goodness.

Perhaps, then, we can only reason practically in order to satisfy pre-existing feelings or goals. These factors can motivate us to reasoning, but they are not themselves open to rational justification. Hume’s empiricist account of morality illustrates the point. Reason is “the slave of the passions.” We can only hope that our fellow human beings feel sympathy, and will put reason to work in its cause. Although we may disapprove, we cannot say it is irrational to feel or pursue more anti-social “passions” such as spite or envy or pride. In Hume’s own words, “’Tis not contrary to reason to prefer the destruction of the whole world to the scratching of my finger… ’Tis as little contrary to reason to prefer even my own acknowledg’d lesser good to my greater…” (Treatise

Since Kant has cut off (theoretical) knowledge of goodness, doesn’t consistency drive him to similar skepticism? Since his account is structured by a distinction between theoretical and practical reason, how can he show their unity?

This entry has suggested that Kant’s account of reason is constructive (not skeptical) and unified (not divided). In thought and in action, reasoners must look for principles that others can also adopt:

To make use of one’s own reason means no more than to ask oneself, whenever one is supposed to assume something, whether one could find it feasible to make the ground or the rule on which one assumes it into a universal principle for the use of reason. (“What is it to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” 8:146n)

In theoretical enquiry, we seek knowledge of the world and explore the limits of knowledge; we think and philosophize. We hope to reach judgments that are valid for all and draw on principles that all can rely on.

In practical reasoning, we decide how to act, individually and with others. Kant often emphasizes duty, but this entry has stressed the related idea of reasoning as justification. If an action is justified, other people should endorse it, rather than resent or criticize it. If their circumstances are similar, they should act similarly. Even if their circumstances differ, the same underlying principles should guide their actions. If we can share principles, we can justify our conduct and find a basis for cooperation.

O’Neill (2000) situates the Kantian account against three alternatives. (i) The instrumental account of reason remains popular. Following Hume, rational choice theory and consequentialism see practical reasoning as a tool. Reason works out how to achieve given ends (cf. practical reason, §4; reasons for action: internal vs. external; instrumental rationality; philosophy of economics, §5). (ii) The communitarian account sees reason as embedded within shared traditions. Rationality is what a historical community takes it to be—for example, its usual modes of argument and accepted authorities (cf. MacIntyre 1988; communitarianism). (iii) The perfectionist account sees reason as an individual capacity to discern moral truth or goodness. This view resembles the rationalism which Kant opposed, except that it stresses divine revelation or moral intuition, rather than abstract thought (cf. moral non-naturalism, §3).

Arguably, all three accounts fail in providing reasoned justification to some audiences. (i) The instrumental reasoner cannot justify their action to people who do not endorse their goal. Instrumental reasons explain action in terms of the actor’s desires or ends. They can make sense of the action, but they do not give the audience reasons to endorse it. Explanation is not justification. (ii) For the communitarian, their tradition defines what beliefs and practices count as reasonable. If someone disagrees, such a reasoner can say little except: this is how I have been taught; this is how we do things round here. This sort of reasoning cannot justify itself to outsiders, nor to insiders who dissent. (Recall Kant’s free citizens who “must be able to express [their] reservations, indeed even [their] veto.”) (iii) The perfectionist believes that they can intuit how it is good to act or to be. But what can they say to someone who has different “intuitions,” or none—except perhaps to condemn them as blind or confused?

On the interpretations advanced by Saner, O’Neill, Neiman and others, Kant was aware of these options and rejected them all. We saw above (§1.4) that Kant characterizes reason in terms of a self-reflexive procedure. Reason is autonomous—that is, it rejects all external authorities. Reason has authority only because it rests on on-going critique. Openness to critique means giving up any mode of thinking or acting that cannot be adopted by all.

To put the same point in more concrete terms: Kant ties reasoning to justification. His account stresses the limits of many everyday justifications. Consider the modes of reasoning just mentioned. (i) “Because I wanted to” is sometimes a perfectly good reason—so long as I don’t infringe on others’ legitimate claims. (ii) “Because that’s how we usually do things” is sometimes a perfectly good reason—so long as our practices don’t endanger or humiliate or exploit. (iii) “Because it felt like the right thing to do” may be a perfectly good reason—so long as my “intuitions” reflect a moral sensibility that fits my circumstances.

The Kantian point is this: Don’t forget the proviso, “so long as…” In the wrong circumstances, desires, customs and intuitions can lead us astray. Reasoning is incomplete unless we can also justify giving weight to the desires, customs or intuitions that make something seem reasonable to us. By contrast, reasoning is complete when it meets the following test: Everyone could think and act on the same principles that now guide my thought and action. To judge whether our thinking and acting meet this demanding test, we must consider objections from different points of view. As Kant says, each person “must be able to express [their] reservations.” This is an on-going process, with no fixed or final endpoint. Only this active process can make reasoning fully “public,” “autonomous” and “universal(izable).”

The Kantian view does not assume that we are hemmed in by our interests and inclinations—as many instrumental accounts do. It does not ask us to rely on what others already accept—as the communitarian account does. It does not suppose that we can intuit what everyone should accept—as the perfectionist account does. Not least, it does not suppose that reason can teach us about God or any other moral authority beyond everyday experience—as many rationalist philosophers supposed. Kant’s account sees human beings as able to step back from their inclinations, habits and intuitions. Reasoning is not the voice of God, but rather a capacity to heed the voices of those we share a world with. Kant asks us to use this ability to seek principles that all can think and live by, and to organize our lives together on this basis.

This account depends on a particular interpretation of Kant’s texts. It is abstract, ambitious, and complex in its ramifications. But if it succeeds, it captures two powerful aspects of Kant’s philosophy: a universalism that transcends self and community boundaries; a modesty that respects the limits of human insight.


Primary sources

Kant’s works are cited by volume and page numbers of the Akademie edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften (Berlin, 1902–). The only exception is the Critique of Pure Reason, cited by the standard A and B pagination of the first (1781) and second (1787) editions respectively. The Groundwork is printed in Akademie volume 4 and the Critique of Practical Reason in volume 5; unless otherwise noted, references beginning with “4:” are to the Groundwork and those beginning with “5:” to the second Critique. The Akademie pagination is found in the margins of all modern translations. Apart from the 2011 edition of the Groundwork, translations are from the standard Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant:

  • Critique of Pure Reason, translated/edited by P. Guyer & A. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Practical Philosophy, translated/edited by M. Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Includes “What is Enlightenment?”, the Critique of Practical Reason, and the Metaphysics of Morals.]
  • Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (German-English Edition), translated/edited by M. Gregor & J. Timmermann, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011.
  • Religion and Rational Theology, translated/edited by A. Wood & G. di Giovanni, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Includes “What Does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” and Conflict of the Faculties.]
  • Lectures on Ethics, translated/edited by J. B. Schneewind & P. Heath, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Theoretical Philosophy 1755–1770, translated/edited by D. Walford, with R. Meerbote, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992. [Includes Dreams of a Spirit-Seer.]
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, translated/edited by H. Allison, M. Friedman, G. Hatfield & P. Heath, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Includes the Prolegomena.]
  • Anthropology, History, and Education, translated/edited by G. Zoller, R. Louden, M. Gregor & P. Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Includes the Anthropology.]
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, translated/edited by P. Guyer & E. Matthews, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.

Secondary literature

  • Abela, P., 2006, “The Demands of Systematicity: Rational Judgment and the Structure of Nature,” in A Companion to Kant, G. Bird (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 408–422.
  • Allison, H., 1990, Kant’s Theory of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2004, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism, revised and expanded edition, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Ameriks, K., 2003, Interpreting Kant’s Critiques, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bagnoli, C., 2017, “Kant in Metaethics: The Paradox of Autonomy, Solved by Publicity,” in The Palgrave Kant Handbook, M. Altman (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 355–77.
  • –––, 2022, Ethical Constructivism (Cambridge Element), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Brandom, R., 1979, “Freedom and Constraint by Norms,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 16(3): 187–196.
  • Breitenbach, A., 2018, “Laws and Ideal Unity,” in Laws of Nature, W. Ott & L. Patton (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 108–121.
  • Buchdahl, G., 1992, Kant and the Dynamics of Reason: Essays on the Structure of Kant’s Philosophy, Oxford: Basil Blackwell (Chs. 7 & 8).
  • Cohen, A., 2014, “Kant on the Ethics of Belief,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 114(3): 317–334.
  • –––, 2018, “Kant on Science and Normativity,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 71(October): 6–12.
  • Deligiorgi, K., 2005, Kant and the Culture of Enlightenment, Albany NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Engstrom, S., 1992, Review of Onora O’Neill, Constructions of Reason, Ethics, 102(3): 653–655.
  • Ferrarin, A., 2015, The Powers of Pure Reason: Kant and the Idea of Cosmic Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Förster, E., 1992, “Was darf ich hoffen? Zum Problem der Vereinbarkeit von theoretischer und praktischer Vernunft bei Immanuel Kant,” Zeitschrift für philosophische Forschung, 46(2): 168–185.
  • Freudiger, J., 1996, “Kants Schlußstein: Wie die Teleologie die Einheit der Vernunft stiftet,” Kant-Studien, 87(4): 423–435.
  • Friedman, M., 1992a, “Causal Laws and Foundations of Natural Science,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, P. Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 161–199.
  • –––, 1992b, Kant and the Exact Sciences, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1992c, “Regulative and Constitutive,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 30(Supplement): 73–102.
  • –––, 2013, Kant’s Construction of Nature: A Reading of the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gardner, S., 1999, Kant and the Critique of Pure Reason, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2006, “The Primacy of Practical Reason,” in A Companion to Kant, G. Bird (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 259–274.
  • Gava, G., 2018, “Kant, Wolff and the Method of Philosophy,” in Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy (Volume VIII), D. Garber & D. Rutherford (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 271–303.
  • Gava, G. & M. Willaschek, forthcoming, “The Transcendental Doctrine of Method of the Critique of Pure Reason,” in The Kantian Mind, S. Baiasu & M. Timmons (eds.), London & New York: Routledge.
  • Gelfert, A., 2006, “Kant on Testimony,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 14(4): 627–652.
  • Grier, M., 2001, Kant’s Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Guyer, P., 1989, “The Unity of Reason: Pure Reason as Practical Reason in Kant’s Early Conception of the Transcendental Dialectic,” Monist, 72(2): 139–167; reprinted as Ch. 2 of his Kant on Freedom, Law and Happiness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • –––, 1990, “Reason and Reflective Judgment: Kant on the Significance of Systematicity,” Noûs, 24(1): 17–43.
  • –––, 1997, Review of Susan Neiman, The Unity of Reason, The Philosophical Review, 106(2): 291–295.
  • –––, 2000a, “Freedom as the Inner Value of the World,” Ch. 3 of his Kant on Freedom, Law and Happiness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 96–125.
  • –––, 2000b, “The Unity of Nature and Freedom: Kant’s Conception of the System of Philosophy,” in The Reception of Kant’s Critical Philosophy, S. Sedgwick (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 19–53.
  • –––, 2006, “Bridging the Gulf: Kant’s Project in the Third Critique,” in A Companion to Kant, G. Bird (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 423–440.
  • Guyer, P. & R. Walker, 1990, “Kant’s Conception of Empirical Law,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volumes), 64: 221–258.
  • Herman, B., 1993, The Practice of Moral Judgment, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2007, Moral Literacy, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hieronymi, P., 2021, “Reasoning First,” in Routledge Handbook of Practical Reasoning, R. Chang & K. Sylvan (eds.), Abingdon: Routledge, pp. 349–65.
  • Kleingeld, P., 1995, “What Do the Virtuous Hope for? Re-reading Kant’s Doctrine of the Highest Good,” in Proceedings of the Eighth International Kant Congress (Volume 1), H. Robinson (ed.), Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, pp. 91–112.
  • –––, 1998a, “The Conative Character of Reason in Kant’s Philosophy,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 36(1): 77–97.
  • –––, 1998b, “Kant on the Unity of Theoretical and Practical Reason,” Review of Metaphysics, 52(2): 311–339.
  • –––, 2010, “Moral consciousness and the ‘fact of reason’,” in Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason: A Critical Guide, A. Reath & J. Timmermann (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 55–72.
  • –––, 2016, “Kant on ‘Good’, the Good, and the Duty to Promote the Highest Good,” in The Highest Good in Kant’s Philosophy, T. Höwing (ed), Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 33–49.
  • Klemme, H., 2014. “Is the Categorical Imperative the Highest Principle of Both Pure Practical and Theoretical Reason?” Kantian Review, 19(1): 119–126.
  • Korsgaard, C., 1996, Creating the Kingdom of Ends, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1997, “The Normativity of Instrumental Reason,” in Ethics and Practical Reason, G. Cullity & B. Gaut (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 215–254; reprinted as Ch. 1 of her 2008, pp. 27–68.
  • –––, 2008, The Constitution of Agency: Essays on Practical Reason and Moral Psychology, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lenczewska, O., 2021, “Becoming Pluralists: Kant on the Normative Features of Pluralistic Thinking,” Kant Yearbook, 13(1): 107–28.
  • Łuków, P., 1993, “The Fact of Reason: Kant’s Passage to Ordinary Moral Knowledge,” Kant-Studien, 84(2): 204–221.
  • MacIntyre, A., 1988, Whose Justice? Which Rationality?, London: Duckworth.
  • Mikalsen, K. K., 2010, “Testimony and Kant’s Idea of Public Reason,” Res Publica, 16(1): 23–40.
  • Møller, S., 2020, Kant’s Tribunal of Reason: Legal Metaphor and Normativity in the Critique of Pure Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mudd, S., 2016, “Rethinking the Priority of Practical Reason in Kant,” European Journal of Philosophy, 24(1): 78–102.
  • –––, 2017, “The Demand for Systematicity and the Authority of Theoretical Reason in Kant,” Kantian Review, 22(1): 81–106.
  • Neiman, S., 1994, The Unity of Reason: Rereading Kant, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Newton, A., 2017, “The Analytic Proposition Underlying Kantian Hypothetical Imperatives,” Kant-Studien, 108(4): 543–67.
  • Nuzzo, A., 2005, Kant and the Unity of Reason, West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press.
  • O’Neill, O., 1984, “Transcendental Synthesis and Developmental Psychology,” Kant-Studien, 75(2): 149–167.
  • –––, 1989, Constructions of Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1990, “Enlightenment as Autonomy: Kant’s Vindication of Reason,” in The Enlightenment and its Shadows, P. Hulme & L. Jordanova (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 184–199.
  • –––, 1992, “Vindicating Reason,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, P. Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 280–308; reprinted as Ch. 1 of O’Neill 2015.
  • –––, 1996, Towards Justice and Virtue, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2000, “Four Models of Practical Reason,” in her Bounds of Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 11–28; German version, 1994, “Vier Modelle praktischer Vernunft,” in Vernunftbegriffe in der Moderne, H. F. Fulda & R. Horstmann (eds.), Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, pp. 586–606.
  • –––, 2002, “Autonomy and the Fact of Reason in the Kritik der praktischen Vernunft, 30–41,” in Immanuel Kant, Kritik der praktischen Vernunft, O. Höffe (ed.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 81–97.
  • –––, 2004, “Kant: Rationality as Practical Reason,” in The Oxford Handbook of Rationality, A. Mele & P. Rawling (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 93–109; reprinted as Ch. 2 of O’Neill 2015.
  • –––, 2015, Constructing Authorities: Reason, Politics and Interpretation in Kant’s Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Patrone, T., 2008, How Kant’s Conception of Reason Implies a Liberal Politics: An Interpretation of the “Doctrine of Right”, Lewiston NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Pollok, K., 2017, Kant’s Theory of Normativity: Exploring the Space of Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Prauss, G., 1981, “Kants Problem der Einheit theoretischer und praktischer Vernunft,” Kant-Studien, 72(3): 286–303.
  • Rauscher, F., 1998, “Kant’s Two Priorities of Practical Reason,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 6(3): 397–419.
  • Reath, A., 1988, “Two Conceptions of the Highest Good in Kant,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 26(4): 593–619.
  • –––, 2013, “Formal Approaches to Kant’s Formula of Humanity,” in Kant on Practical Justification: Interpretive Essays, S. Baiasu & M. Timmons (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 201–228.
  • Rescher, N., 2000, Kant and the Reach of Reason: Studies in Kant’s Theory of Rational Systemization, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ripstein, A., 2021, Kant and the Law of War, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ruffing, M., 2015, “Kants ‘Stimme der Vernunft’—Analyse einer unauffälligen Metapher,” in Kant and the Metaphors of Reason, P. Kauark-Leite, G. Cecchinato, V. de Araujo Figuereido, M. Ruffing & A. Serra (eds.), Hildesheim: Olms, pp. 195–204.
  • Russell, F., 2020, “Kantian Self-Conceit and the Two Guises of Authority,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 50(2): 268–83.
  • Saner, H., 1967/73, Kant’s Political Thought: Its Origins and Development, E. Ashton (trans.), Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Schadow, S., 2022, “Acting for a Reason. What Kant’s Concept of Maxims Can Tell Us about Value, Human Action, and Practical Identity,” in Kant’s Theory of Value, C. Horn & R. Dos Santos (eds.), Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 65–88.
  • Sticker, M., 2021, Rationalizing (Vernünfteln). Elements in the Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108625661
  • Stoddard, E., 1988, “Reason on Trial: Legal Metaphors in the Critique of Pure Reason,” Philosophy and Literature, 12(2): 245–260.
  • Timmermann, J., 2009, “The Unity of Reason: Kantian Perspectives,” in Spheres of Reason, S. Robertson (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 183–198.
  • –––, 2010, “Reversal or retreat? Kant’s Deductions of Freedom and Morality,” in Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason: A Critical Guide, A. Reath & J. Timmermann (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 73–89.
  • Velkley, R., 1989, Freedom and the Ends of Reason: On the Moral Foundations of Kant’s Critical Philosophy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Walker, R., 1989, The Coherence Theory of Truth: Realism, Anti-Realism, Idealism, London: Routledge.
  • Wartenberg, T., 1992, “Reason and the Practice of Science,” in The Cambridge Companion to Kant, P. Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 228–248.
  • Westphal, K., 2011, “Kant’s Moral Constructivism and Rational Justification,” in Politics and Metaphysics in Kant, S. Baiasu, S. Pihlström & H. Williams (eds.), Cardiff: University of Wales Press, pp. 28–46.
  • Willaschek, M., 2010, “The Primacy of Practical Reason and the Idea of a Practical Postulate,” in Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason: A Critical Guide, A. Reath & J. Timmermann (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 168–196.
  • Wood, A., 1970, Kant’s Moral Religion, Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1992, Review of Onora O’Neill, Constructions of Reason, Philosophical Review, 101(3): 647–650.
  • Ypi, L., 2021, The Architectonic of Reason: Purposiveness and Systematic Unity in Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources


For comments on this entry over the years, my thanks to Carla Bagnoli, Graham Bird, Tatiana Patrone, Alison Stone, Lea Ypi, and the referees for this Encyclopedia, including R. Lanier Anderson and Paul Guyer. For additional assistance my thanks to Alix Cohen, Sebastian Gardner, Katharina Kraus, Onora O’Neill, Margit Ruffing, and Jens Timmermann. My grateful thanks, too, to Nick Bunnin, for organizing the Chinese philosophy summer school which gave me the opportunity to lecture on this topic, and to Diana Diaconescu for invaluable research assistance with the most recent (2023) revisions.

Copyright © 2023 by
Garrath Williams <g.d.williams@lancaster.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free