The Language of Thought Hypothesis

First published Tue May 28, 2019; substantive revision Mon Oct 16, 2023

The language of thought hypothesis (LOTH) proposes that thinking occurs in a mental language. Often called Mentalese, the mental language resembles spoken language in several key respects: it contains words that can combine into sentences; the words and sentences are meaningful; and each sentence’s meaning depends in a systematic way upon the meanings of its component words and the way those words are combined. For example, there is a Mentalese word whale that denotes whales, and there is a Mentalese word mammal that denotes mammals. These words can combine into a Mentalese sentence whales are mammals, which means that whales are mammals. To believe that whales are mammals is to bear an appropriate psychological relation to this sentence. During a prototypical deductive inference, I might transform the Mentalese sentence whales are mammals and the Mentalese sentence Moby Dick is a whale into the Mentalese sentence Moby Dick is a mammal. As I execute the inference, I enter into a succession of mental states that instantiate those sentences.

LOTH emerged gradually through the writings of Augustine, Boethius, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, and many others. William of Ockham offered the first systematic treatment in his Summa Logicae (c. 1323), which meticulously analyzed the meaning and structure of Mentalese expressions. LOTH was quite popular during the late medieval era, but it slipped from view in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries. From that point through the mid-twentieth century, it played little serious role within theorizing about the mind.

In the 1970s, LOTH underwent a dramatic revival. The watershed was publication of Jerry Fodor’s The Language of Thought (1975). Fodor argued abductively: our current best scientific theories of psychological activity postulate Mentalese; we therefore have good reason to accept that Mentalese exists. Fodor’s analysis exerted tremendous impact. LOTH once again became a focus of discussion, some supportive and some critical. Debates over the existence and nature of Mentalese continue to figure prominently within philosophy and cognitive science. These debates have pivotal importance for our understanding of how the mind works.

1. Mental Language

What does it mean to posit a mental language? Or to say that thinking occurs in this language? Just how “language-like” is Mentalese supposed to be? To address these questions, we will isolate some core commitments that are widely shared among LOT theorists.

1.1 The Representational Theory of Thought

Folk psychology routinely explains and predicts behavior by citing mental states, including beliefs, desires, intentions, fears, hopes, and so on. To explain why Mary walked to the refrigerator, we might note that she believed there was orange juice in the refrigerator and wanted to drink orange juice. Mental states such as belief and desire are called propositional attitudes. They can be specified using locutions of the form

X believes that p.

X desires that p.

X intends that p.

X fears that p.


By replacing “p” with a sentence, we specify the content of X’s mental state. Propositional attitudes have intentionality or aboutness: they are about a subject matter. For that reason, they are often called intentional states.

The term “propositional attitude” originates with Russell (1918–1919 [1985]) and reflects his own preferred analysis: that propositional attitudes are relations to propositions. A proposition is an abstract entity that determines a truth-condition. To illustrate, suppose John believes that Paris is north of London. Then John’s belief is a relation to the proposition that Paris is north of London, and this proposition is true iff Paris is north of London. Beyond the thesis that propositions determine truth-conditions, there is little agreement about what propositions are like. The literature offers many options, mainly derived from theories of Frege (1892 [1997]), Russell (1918–1919 [1985]), and Wittgenstein (1921 [1922]).

Fodor (1981: 177–203; 1987: 16–26) proposes a theory of propositional attitudes that assigns a central role to mental representations. A mental representation is a mental item with semantic properties (such as a denotation, or a meaning, or a truth-condition, etc.). To believe that p, or hope that p, or intend that p, is to bear an appropriate relation to a mental representation whose meaning is that p. For example, there is a relation belief* between thinkers and mental representations, where the following biconditional is true no matter what English sentence one substitutes for “p”:

X believes that p iff there is a mental representation S such that X believes* S and S means that p.

More generally:

  • (1) Each propositional attitude A corresponds to a unique psychological relation A*, where the following biconditional is true no matter what sentence one substitutes for “p”: X As that p iff there is a mental representation S such that X bears A* to S and S means that p.

On this analysis, mental representations are the most direct objects of propositional attitudes. A propositional attitude inherits its semantic properties, including its truth-condition, from the mental representation that is its object.

Proponents of (1) typically invoke functionalism to analyze A*. Each psychological relation A* is associated with a distinctive functional role: a role that S plays within your mental activity just in case you bear A* to S. When specifying what it is to believe* S, for example, we might mention how S serves as a basis for inferential reasoning, how it interacts with desires to produce actions, and so on. Precise functional roles are to be discovered by scientific psychology. Following Schiffer (1981), it is common to use the term “belief-box” as a placeholder for the functional role corresponding to belief*: to believe* S is to place S in your belief box. Similarly for “desire-box”, etc.

(1) is compatible with the view that propositional attitudes are relations to propositions. One might analyze the locution “S means that p” as involving a relation between S and a proposition expressed by S. It would then follow that someone who believes* S stands in a psychologically important relation to the proposition expressed by S. Fodor (1987: 17) adopts this approach. He combines a commitment to mental representations with a commitment to propositions. In contrast, Field (2001: 30–82) declines to postulate propositions when analyzing “S means that p”. He posits mental representations with semantic properties, but he does not posit propositions expressed by the mental representations.

The distinction between types and tokens is crucial for understanding (1). A mental representation is a repeatable type that can be instantiated on different occasions. In the current literature, it is generally assumed that a mental representation’s tokens are neurological. For present purposes, the key point is that mental representations are instantiated by mental events. Here we construe the category of events broadly so as to include both occurrences (e.g., I form an intention to drink orange juice) and enduring states (e.g., my longstanding belief that Abraham Lincoln was president of the United States). When mental event e instantiates representation S, we say that S is tokened and that e is a tokening of S. For example, if I believe that whales are mammals, then my belief (a mental event) is a tokening of a mental representation whose meaning is that whales are mammals.

According to Fodor (1987: 17), thinking consists in chains of mental events that instantiate mental representations:

  • (2) Thought processes are causal sequences of tokenings of mental representations.

A paradigm example is deductive inference: I transition from believing* the premises to believing* the conclusion. The first mental event (my belief* in the premises) causes the second (my belief* in the conclusion).

(1) and (2) fit together naturally as a package that one might call the representational theory of thought (RTT). RTT postulates mental representations that serve as the objects of propositional attitudes and that constitute the domain of thought processes.[1]

RTT as stated requires qualification. There is a clear sense in which you believe that there are no elephants on Jupiter. However, you probably never considered the question until now. It is not plausible that your belief box previously contained a mental representation with the meaning that there are no elephants on Jupiter. Fodor (1987: 20–26) responds to this sort of example by restricting (1) to core cases. Core cases are those where the propositional attitude figures as a causally efficacious episode in a mental process. Your tacit belief that there are no elephants on Jupiter does not figure in your reasoning or decision-making, although it can come to do so if the question becomes salient and you consciously judge that there are no elephants on Jupiter. So long as the belief remains tacit, (1) need not apply. In general, Fodor says, an intentional mental state that is causally efficacious must involve explicit tokening of an appropriate mental representation. In a slogan: “No Intentional Causation without Explicit Representation” (Fodor 1987: 25). Thus, we should not construe (1) as an attempt at faithfully analyzing informal discourse about propositional attitudes. Fodor does not seek to replicate folk psychological categories. He aims to identify mental states that resemble the propositional attitudes adduced within folk psychology, that play roughly similar roles in mental activity, and that can support systematic theorizing.

Dennett’s (1977 [1981]) review of The Language of Thought raises a widely cited objection to RTT:

In a recent conversation with the designer of a chess-playing program I heard the following criticism of a rival program: “it thinks it should get its queen out early”. This ascribes a propositional attitude to the program in a very useful and predictive way, for as the designer went on to say, one can usefully count on chasing that queen around the board. But for all the many levels of explicit representation to be found in that program, nowhere is anything roughly synonymous with “I should get my queen out early” explicitly tokened. The level of analysis to which the designer’s remark belongs describes features of the program that are, in an entirely innocent way, emergent properties of the computational processes that have “engineering reality”. I see no reason to believe that the relation between belief-talk and psychological talk will be any more direct.

In Dennett’s example, the chess-playing machine does not explicitly represent that it should get the queen out early, yet in some sense it acts upon a belief that it should do so. Analogous examples arise for human cognition. For example, we often follow rules of deductive inference without explicitly representing the rules.

To assess Dennett’s objection, we must distinguish sharply between mental representations and rules governing the manipulation of mental representations (Fodor 1987: 25). RTT does not require that every such rule be explicitly represented. Some rules may be explicitly represented—we can imagine a reasoning system that explicitly represents deductive inference rules to which it conforms. But the rules need not be explicitly represented. They may merely be implicit in the system’s operations. Only when consultation of a rule figures as a causally efficacious episode in mental activity does RTT require that the rule be explicitly represented. Dennett’s chess machine explicitly represents chess board configurations and perhaps some rules for manipulating chess pieces. It never consults any rule akin to Get the Queen out early. For that reason, we should not expect that the machine explicitly represents this rule even if the rule is in some sense built into the machine’s programming. Similarly, typical thinkers do not consult inference rules when engaging in deductive inference. So RTT does not demand that a typical thinker explicitly represent inference rules, even if she conforms to them and in some sense tacitly believes that she should conform to them.

1.2 Compositional Semantics

Natural language is compositional: complex linguistic expressions are built from simpler linguistic expressions, and the meaning of a complex expression is a function of the meanings of its constituents together with the way those constituents are combined. Compositional semantics describes in a systematic way how semantic properties of a complex expression depend upon semantic properties of its constituents and the way those constituents are combined. For example, the truth-condition of a conjunction is determined as follows: the conjunction is true iff both conjuncts are true.

Historical and contemporary LOT theorists universally agree that Mentalese is compositional:

Compositionality of mental representations (COMP): Mental representations have a compositional semantics: complex representations are composed of simple constituents, and the meaning of a complex representation depends upon the meanings of its constituents together with the constituency structure into which those constituents are arranged.

Clearly, mental language and natural language must differ in many important respects. For example, Mentalese surely does not have a phonology. It may not have a morphology either. Nevertheless, COMP articulates a fundamental point of similarity. Just like natural language, Mentalese contains complex symbols amenable to semantic analysis.

What is it for one representation to be a “constituent” of another? According to Fodor (2008: 108), “constituent structure is a species of the part/whole relation”. Not all parts of a linguistic expression are constituents: “John ran” is a constituent of “John ran and Mary jumped”, but “ran and Mary” is not a constituent because it is not semantically interpretable. The important point for our purposes is that all constituents are parts. When a complex representation is tokened, so are its parts. For example,

intending that \(P \amp Q\) requires having a sentence in your intention box… one of whose parts is a token of the very same type that’s in the intention box when you intend that \(P\), and another of whose parts is a token of the very same type that’s in the intention box when you intend that \(Q\). (Fodor 1987: 139)

More generally: mental event \(e\) instantiates a complex mental representation only if \(e\) instantiates all of the representation’s constituent parts. In that sense, \(e\) itself has internal complexity.

The complexity of mental events figures crucially here, as highlighted by Fodor in the following passage (1987: 136):

Practically everybody thinks that the objects of intentional states are in some way complex… [For example], what you believe when you believe that \(P \amp Q\) is… something composite, whose elements are—as it might be—the proposition that P and the proposition that Q. But the (putative) complexity of the intentional object of a mental state does not, of course, entail the complexity of the mental state itself… LOT claims that mental states—and not just their propositional objects—typically have constituent structure.

Many philosophers, including Frege and Russell, regard propositions as structured entities. These philosophers apply a part/whole model to propositions but not necessarily to mental events during which thinkers entertain propositions. LOTH as developed by Fodor applies the part/whole model to the mental events themselves:

what’s at issue here is the complexity of mental events and not merely the complexity of the propositions that are their intentional objects. (Fodor 1987: 142)

On this approach, a key element of LOTH is the thesis that mental events have semantically relevant complexity.

Contemporary proponents of LOTH endorse RTT+COMP. Historical proponents also believed something in the vicinity (Normore 1990, 2009; Panaccio 1999 [2017]), although of course they did not use modern terminology to formulate their views. We may regard RTT+COMP as a minimalist formulation of LOTH, bearing in mind that many philosophers have used the phrase “language of thought hypothesis” to denote one of the stronger theses discussed below. As befits a minimalist formulation, RTT+COMP leaves unresolved numerous questions about the nature, structure, and psychological role of Mentalese expressions.

1.3 Logical Structure

In practice, LOT theorists usually adopt a more specific view of the compositional semantics for Mentalese. They claim that Mentalese expressions have logical form (Fodor 2008: 21). More specifically, they claim that Mentalese contains analogues to the familiar logical connectives (and, or, not, if-then, some, all, the). Iterative application of logical connectives generates complex expressions from simpler expressions. The meaning of a logically complex expression depends upon the meanings of its parts and upon its logical structure. Thus, LOT theorists usually endorse a doctrine along the following lines:

Logically structured mental representations (LOGIC): Some mental representations have logical structure. The compositional semantics for these mental representations resembles the compositional semantics for logically structured natural language expressions.

Medieval LOT theorists used syllogistic and propositional logic to analyze the semantics of Mentalese (King 2005; Normore 1990). Contemporary proponents instead use the predicate calculus, which was discovered by Frege (1879 [1967]) and whose semantics was first systematically articulated by Tarski (1933 [1983]). The view is that Mentalese contains primitive words—including predicates, singular terms, and logical connectives—and that these words combine to form complex sentences governed by something like the semantics of the predicate calculus.

The notion of a Mentalese word corresponds roughly to the intuitive notion of a concept. In fact, Fodor (1998: 70) construes a concept as a Mentalese word together with its denotation. For example, a thinker has the concept of a cat only if she has in her repertoire a Mentalese word that denotes cats.

Logical structure is just one possible paradigm for the structure of mental representations. Human society employs a wide range of non-sentential representations, including pictures, maps, diagrams, and graphs. Non-sentential representations typically contain parts arranged into a compositionally significant structure. In many cases, it is not obvious that the resulting complex representations have logical structure. For example, maps do not seem to contain logical connectives (Fodor 1991: 295; Millikan 1993: 302; Pylyshyn 2003: 424–5). Nor is it evident that they contain predicates (Camp 2018; Rescorla 2009c), although some philosophers contend that they do (Blumson 2012; Casati & Varzi 1999; Kulvicki 2015).

Theorists often posit mental representations that conform to COMP but that lack logical structure. The British empiricists postulated ideas, which they characterized in broadly imagistic terms. They emphasized that simple ideas can combine to form complex ideas. They held that the representational import of a complex idea depends upon the representational import of its parts and the way those parts are combined. So they accepted COMP or something close to it (depending on what exactly “constituency” amounts to).[2] They did not say in much detail how compounding of ideas was supposed to work, but imagistic structure seems to be the paradigm in at least some passages. LOGIC plays no significant role in their writings.[3] Partly inspired by the British empiricists, Prinz (2002) and Barsalou (1999) analyze cognition in terms of image-like representations derived from perception. Armstrong (1973) and Braddon-Mitchell and Jackson (2007) propose that propositional attitudes are relations not to mental sentences but to mental maps analogous in important respects to ordinary concrete maps.

One problem facing imagistic and cartographic theories of thought is that propositional attitudes are often logically complex (e.g., John believes that if Plácido Domingo does not sing then either Gustavo Dudamel will conduct or the concert will be cancelled). Images and maps do not seem to support logical operations: the negation of a map is not a map; the disjunction of two maps is not a map; similarly for other logical operations; and similarly for images. Given that images and maps do not support logical operations, theories that analyze thought in exclusively imagistic or cartographic terms will struggle to explain logically complex propositional attitudes.[4]

There is room here for a pluralist position that allows mental representations of different kinds: some with logical structure, some more analogous to pictures, or maps, or diagrams, and so on. The pluralist position is widespread within cognitive science, which posits a range of formats for mental representation (Block 1983; Camp 2009; Johnson-Laird 2004: 187; Kosslyn 1980; Mandelbaum et al. 2022; McDermott 2001: 69; Pinker 2005: 7; Sloman 1978: 144–76). Fodor himself (1975: 184–195) suggests a view on which imagistic mental representations co-exist alongside, and interact with, logically structured Mentalese expressions.

Given the prominent role played by logical structure within historical and contemporary discussion of Mentalese, one might take LOGIC to be definitive of LOTH. One might insist that mental representations comprise a mental language only if they have logical structure. We need not evaluate the merits of this terminological choice.

2. Scope of LOTH

RTT concerns propositional attitudes and the mental processes in which they figure, such as deductive inference, reasoning, decision-making, and planning. It does not address perception, motor control, imagination, dreaming, pattern recognition, linguistic processing, or any other mental activity distinct from high-level cognition. Hence the emphasis upon a language of thought: a system of mental representations that underlie thinking, as opposed to perceiving, imagining, etc. Nevertheless, talk about a mental language generalizes naturally from high-level cognition to other mental phenomena.

Perception is a good example. The perceptual system transforms proximal sensory stimulations (e.g., retinal stimulations) into perceptual estimates of environmental conditions (e.g., estimates of shapes, sizes, colors, locations, etc.). Helmholtz (1867 [1925]) proposed that the transition from proximal sensory input to perceptual estimates features an unconscious inference, similar in key respects to high-level conscious inference yet inaccessible to consciousness. Helmholtz’s proposal is foundational to contemporary perceptual psychology, which constructs detailed mathematical models of unconscious perceptual inference (Knill & Richards 1996; Rescorla 2015). Fodor (1975: 44–55) argues that this scientific research program presupposes mental representations. The representations participate in unconscious inferences or inference-like transitions executed by the perceptual system.[5]

Navigation is another good example. Tolman (1948) hypothesized that rats navigate using cognitive maps: mental representations that represent the layout of the spatial environment. The cognitive map hypothesis, advanced during the heyday of behaviorism, initially encountered great scorn. It remained a fringe position well into the 1970s, long after the demise of behaviorism. Eventually, mounting behavioral and neurophysiological evidence won it many converts (Gallistel 1990; Gallistel & Matzel 2013; Jacobs & Menzel 2014; O’Keefe & Nadel 1978; Weiner et al. 2011). Although a few researchers remain skeptical (Mackintosh 20002), there is now a broad consensus that mammals (and possibly even some insects) navigate using mental representations of spatial layout. Rescorla (2017b) summarizes the case for cognitive maps and reviews some of their core properties.

To what extent should we expect perceptual representations and cognitive maps to resemble the mental representations that figure in high-level human thought? It is generally agreed that all these mental representations have compositional structure. For example, the perceptual system can bind together a representation of shape and a representation of size to form a complex representation that an object has a certain shape and size; the representational import of the complex representation depends in a systematic way upon the representational import of the component representations. On the other hand, it is not clear that perceptual representations have logical structure (Block 2023: 182–190; Burge 2022: 190–201), including even predicative structure (Burge 2010: 540–544; Burge 2022: 44–45: Fodor 2008: 169–195). Nor is it evident that cognitive maps contain logical connectives or predicates (Rescorla 2009a, 2009b). Perceptual processing and non-human navigation certainly do not seem to instantiate mental processes that would exploit putative logical structure. In particular, they do not seem to instantiate deductive inference.

These observations provide ammunition for pluralism about representational format. Pluralists can posit one system of compositionally structured mental representations for perception, another for navigation, another for high-level cognition, and so on. Different representational systems potentially feature different compositional mechanisms. As indicated in section 1.3, pluralism figures prominently in contemporary cognitive science. Pluralists face some pressing questions. Which compositional mechanisms figure in which psychological domains? Which representational formats support which mental operations? How do different representational formats interface with each other? Further research bridging philosophy and cognitive science is needed to address such questions.

3. Mental Computation

Modern proponents of LOTH typically endorse the computational theory of mind (CTM), which claims that the mind is a computational system. Some authors use the phrase “language of thought hypothesis” so that it definitionally includes CTM as one component.

In a seminal contribution, Turing (1936) introduced what is now called the Turing machine: an abstract model of an idealized computing device. A Turing machine contains a central processor, governed by precise mechanical rules, that manipulates symbols inscribed along a linear array of memory locations. Impressed by the enormous power of the Turing machine formalism, many researchers seek to construct computational models of core mental processes, including reasoning, decision-making, and problem solving. This enterprise bifurcates into two main branches. The first branch is artificial intelligence (AI), which aims to build “thinking machines”. Here the goal is primarily an engineering one—to build a system that instantiates or at least simulates thought—without any pretense at capturing how the human mind works. The second branch, computational psychology, aims to construct computational models of human mental activity. AI and computational psychology both emerged in the 1960s as crucial elements in the new interdisciplinary initiative cognitive science, which studies the mind by drawing upon psychology, computer science (especially AI), linguistics, philosophy, economics (especially game theory and behavioral economics), anthropology, and neuroscience.

From the 1960s to the early 1980s, computational models offered within psychology were mainly Turing-style models. These models embody a viewpoint known as the classical computational theory of mind (CCTM). According to CCTM, the mind is a computational system similar in important respects to a Turing machine, and certain core mental processes are computations similar in important respects to computations executed by a Turing machine.

CCTM fits together nicely with RTT+COMP. Turing-style computation operates over symbols, so any Turing-style mental computations must operate over mental symbols. The essence of RTT+COMP is postulation of mental symbols. Fodor (1975, 1981) advocates RTT+COMP+CCTM. He holds that certain core mental processes are Turing-style computations over Mentalese expressions.

One can endorse RTT+COMP without endorsing CCTM. By positing a system of compositionally structured mental representations, one does not commit oneself to saying that operations over the representations are computational. Historical LOT theorists could not even formulate CCTM, for the simple reason that the Turing formalism had not been discovered. In the modern era, Harman (1973) and Sellars (1975) endorse something like RTT+COMP but not CCTM. Horgan and Tienson (1996) endorse RTT+COMP+CTM but not CCTM, i.e., classical CTM. They favor a version of CTM grounded in connectionism, an alternative computational framework that differs quite significantly from Turing’s approach. Thus, proponents of RTT+COMP need not accept that mental activity instantiates Turing-style computation.

Fodor (1981) combines RTT+COMP+CCTM with a view that one might call the formal-syntactic conception of computation (FSC). According to FSC, computation manipulates symbols in virtue of their formal syntactic properties but not their semantic properties.

FSC draws inspiration from modern logic, which emphasizes the formalization of deductive reasoning. To formalize, we specify a formal language whose component linguistic expressions are individuated non-semantically (e.g., by their geometric shapes). We describe the expressions as pieces of formal syntax, without considering what if anything the expressions mean. We then specify inference rules in syntactic, non-semantic terms. Well-chosen inference rules will carry true premises to true conclusions. By combining formalization with Turing-style computation, we can build a physical machine that manipulates symbols based solely on the formal syntax of the symbols. If we program the machine to implement appropriate inference rules, then its syntactic manipulations will transform true premises into true conclusions.

CCTM+FSC says that the mind is a formal syntactic computing system: mental activity consists in computation over symbols with formal syntactic properties; computational transitions are sensitive to the symbols’ formal syntactic properties but not their semantic properties. The key term “sensitive” is rather imprecise, allowing some latitude as to the precise import of CCTM+FSC. Intuitively, the picture is that a mental symbol’s formal syntax rather than its semantics determines how mental computation manipulates it. The mind is a “syntactic engine”.

Fodor (1987: 18–20) argues that CCTM+FSC helps illuminate a crucial feature of cognition: semantic coherence. For the most part, our thinking does not move randomly from thought to thought. Rather, thoughts are causally connected in a way that respects their semantics. For example, deductive inference carries true beliefs to true beliefs. More generally, thinking tends to respect epistemic properties such as warrant and degree of confirmation. In some sense, then, our thinking tends to cohere with semantic relations among thoughts. How is semantic coherence achieved? How does our thinking manage to track semantic properties? CCTM+FSC gives one possible answer. It shows how a physical system operating in accord with physical laws can execute computations that coherently track semantic properties. By treating the mind as a syntax-driven machine, we explain how mental activity achieves semantic coherence. We thereby answer the question: How is rationality mechanically possible?

Fodor’s argument convinced many researchers that CCTM+FSC decisively advances our understanding of the mind’s relation to the physical world. But not everyone agrees that CCTM+FSC adequately integrates semantics into the causal order. A common worry is that the formal syntactic picture veers dangerously close to epiphenomenalism (Block 1990; Kazez 1994). Pre-theoretically, semantic properties of mental states seem highly relevant to mental and behavioral outcomes. For example, if I form an intention to walk to the grocery store, then the fact that my intention concerns the grocery store rather than the post office helps explain why I walk to the grocery store rather than the post office. Burge (2010) and Peacocke (1994) argue that cognitive science theorizing likewise assigns causal and explanatory importance to semantic properties. The worry is that CCTM+FSC cannot accommodate the causal and explanatory importance of semantic properties because it depicts them as causally irrelevant: formal syntax, not semantics, drives mental computation forward. Semantics looks epiphenomenal, with syntax doing all the work (Stich 1983).

Fodor (1990, 1994) expends considerable energy trying to allay epiphenomenalist worries. Advancing a detailed theory of the relation between Mentalese syntax and Mentalese semantics, he insists that FSC can honor the causal and explanatory relevance of semantic properties. Fodor’s treatment is widely regarded as problematic (Arjo 1996; Aydede 1997b, 1998; Aydede & Robbins 2001; Perry 1998; Prinz 2011; Wakefield 2002), although Rupert (2008) and Schneider (2005) espouse somewhat similar positions.

Partly in response to epiphenomenalist worries, some authors recommend that we replace FSC with an alternative semantic conception of computation (Block 1990; Burge 2010: 95–101; Figdor 2009; O’Brien & Opie 2006; Peacocke 1994, 1999; Rescorla 2012a). Semantic computationalists claim that computational transitions are sometimes sensitive to semantic properties, perhaps in addition to syntactic properties. More specifically, semantic computationalists insist that mental computation is sometimes sensitive to semantics. Thus, they reject any suggestion that the mind is a “syntactic engine” or that mental computation is sensitive only to formal syntax.[6] To illustrate, consider Mentalese conjunction. This mental symbol expresses the truth-table for conjunction. According to semantic computationalists, the symbol’s meaning is relevant (both causally and explanatorily) to mechanical operations over it. That the symbol expresses the truth-table for conjunction rather than, say, disjunction influences the course of computation. We should therefore reject any suggestion that mental computation is sensitive to the symbol’s syntactic properties rather than its semantic properties. The claim is not that mental computation explicitly represents semantic properties of mental symbols. All parties agree that, in general, it does not. There is no homunculus inside your head interpreting your mental language. The claim is rather that semantic properties influence how mental computation proceeds. (Compare: the momentum of a baseball thrown at a window causally influences whether the window breaks, even though the window does not explicitly represent the baseball’s momentum.)

Proponents of the semantic conception differ as to how exactly they gloss the core claim that some computations are “sensitive” to semantic properties. They also differ in their stance towards CCTM. Block (1990) and Rescorla (2014a) focus upon CCTM. They argue that a symbol’s semantic properties can impact mechanical operations executed by a Turing-style computational system. In contrast, O’Brien and Opie (2006) favor connectionism over CCTM.

Theorists who reject FSC must reject Fodor’s explanation of semantic coherence. What alternative explanation might they offer? So far, the question has received relatively little attention. Rescorla (2017a) argues that semantic computationalists can explain semantic coherence and simultaneously avoid epiphenomenalist worries by invoking neural implementation of semantically-sensitive mental computations.

Fodor’s exposition sometimes suggests that CTM, CCTM, or CCTM+FSC is definitive of LOTH (1981: 26). Yet not everyone who endorses RTT+COMP endorses CTM, CCTM, or FSC. One can postulate a mental language without agreeing that mental activity is computational, and one can postulate mental computations over a mental language without agreeing that the computations are sensitive only to syntactic properties. For most purposes, it is not important whether we regard CTM, CCTM, or CCTM+FSC as definitive of LOTH. More important is that we track the distinctions among the doctrines.

4. Arguments for LOTH

The literature offers many arguments for LOTH. This section introduces four influential arguments, each of which supports LOTH abductively by citing its explanatory benefits. Section 5 discusses some prominent objections to the four arguments.

4.1 Argument from Cognitive Science Practice

Fodor (1975) defends RTT+COMP+CCTM by appealing to scientific practice: our best cognitive science postulates Turing-style mental computations over Mentalese expressions; therefore, we should accept that mental computation operates over Mentalese expressions. Fodor develops his argument by examining detailed case studies, including perception, decision-making, and linguistic comprehension. He argues that, in each case, computation over mental representations plays a central explanatory role. Fodor’s argument was widely heralded as a compelling analysis of then-current cognitive science. The argument from cognitive science practice has subsequently been developed and updated both by Fodor and by other authors, such as Quilty-Dunn, Porot, and Mandelbaum (forthcoming).

When evaluating cognitive science support for LOTH, it is crucial to specify what version of LOTH one has in mind. Specifically, establishing that certain mental processes operate over mental representations is not enough to establish RTT. For example, one might accept that mental representations figure in perception and animal navigation but not in high-level human cognition. Gallistel and King (2009) defend COMP+CCTM+FSC through a number of (mainly non-human) empirical case studies, but they do not endorse RTT. They focus on relatively low-level phenomena, such as animal navigation, without discussing human decision-making, deductive inference, problem solving, or other high-level cognitive phenomena.

4.2 Argument from the Productivity of Thought

During your lifetime, you will only entertain a finite number of thoughts. In principle, though, there are infinitely many thoughts you might entertain. Consider:

Mary gave the test tube to John’s daughter.

Mary gave the test tube to John’s daughter’s daughter.

Mary gave the test tube to John’s daughter’s daughter’s daughter.

The moral usually drawn is that you have the competence to entertain a potential infinity of thoughts, even though your performance is bounded by biological limits upon memory, attention, processing capacity, and so on. In a slogan: thought is productive.

RTT+COMP straightforwardly explains productivity. We postulate a finite base of primitive Mentalese symbols, along with operations for combining simple expressions into complex expressions. Iterative application of the compounding operations generates an infinite array of mental sentences, each in principle within your cognitive repertoire. By tokening a mental sentence, you entertain the thought expressed by it. This explanation leverages the recursive nature of compositional mechanisms to generate infinitely many expressions from a finite base. It thereby illuminates how finite creatures such as ourselves are able to entertain a potential infinity of thoughts.

Fodor and Pylyshyn (1988) argue that, since RTT+COMP provides a satisfying explanation for productivity, we have good reason to accept RTT+COMP. A potential worry about this argument is that it rests upon an infinitary competence never manifested within actual performance. One might dismiss the supposed infinitary competence as an idealization that, while perhaps convenient for certain purposes, does not stand in need of explanation.

4.3 Argument from the Systematicity of Thought

There are systematic interrelations among the thoughts a thinker can entertain. For example, if you can entertain the thought that John loves Mary, then you can also entertain the thought that Mary loves John. Systematicity looks like a crucial property of human thought and so demands a principled explanation.

RTT+COMP gives a compelling explanation. According to RTT+COMP, your ability to entertain the thought that p hinges upon your ability to bear appropriate psychological relations to a Mentalese sentence S whose meaning is that p. If you are able to think that John loves Mary, then your internal system of mental representations includes a mental sentence John loves Mary, composed of mental words John, loves, and Mary combined in the right way. If you have the capacity to stand in psychological relation A* to John loves Mary, then you also have the capacity to stand in relation A* to a distinct mental sentence Mary loves John. The constituent words John, loves, and Mary make the same semantic contribution to both mental sentences (John denotes John, loves denotes the loving relation, and Mary denotes Mary), but the words are arranged in different constituency structures so that the sentences have different meanings. Whereas John loves Mary means that John loves Mary, Mary loves John means that Mary loves John. By standing in relation A* to the sentence Mary loves John, you entertain the thought that Mary loves John. Thus, an ability to think that John loves Mary entails an ability to think that John loves Mary. By comparison, an ability to think that John loves Mary does not entail an ability to think that whales are mammals or an ability to think that \(56 + 138 = 194\).

Fodor (1987: 148–153) supports RTT+COMP by citing its ability to explain systematicity. In contrast with the productivity argument, the systematicity argument does not depend upon infinitary idealizations that outstrip finite performance. Note that neither argument provides any direct support for CTM. Neither argument even mentions computation.

4.4 Argument from the Systematicity of Thinking

There are systematic interrelations among which inferences a thinker can draw. For example, if you can infer p from p and q, then you can also infer m from m and n. The systematicity of thinking requires explanation. Why is it that thinkers who can infer p from p and q can also infer m from m and n?

RTT+COMP+CCTM gives a compelling explanation. During an inference from p and q to p, you transit from believing* mental sentence \(S_1 \amp S_2\) (which means that p and q) to believing* mental sentence \(S_{1}\) (which means that p). According to CCTM, the transition involves symbol manipulation. A mechanical operation detaches the conjunct \(S_{1}\) from the conjunction \(S_1 \amp S_2\). The same mechanical operation is applicable to a conjunction \(S_{3} \amp S_{4}\) (which means that m and n), corresponding to the inference from m and n to n. An ability to execute the first inference entails an ability to execute the second, because drawing the inference in either case corresponds to executing a single uniform mechanical operation. More generally, logical inference deploys mechanical operations over structured symbols, and the mechanical operation corresponding to a given inference pattern (e.g., conjunction introduction, disjunction elimination, etc.) is applicable to any premises with the right logical structure. The uniform applicability of a single mechanical operation across diverse symbols explains inferential systematicity. Fodor and Pylyshyn (1988) conclude that inferential systematicity provides reason to accept RTT+COMP+CCTM.

Fodor and Pylyshyn (1988) endorse an additional thesis about the mechanical operations corresponding to logical transitions. In keeping with FSC, they claim that the operations are sensitive to formal syntactic properties but not semantic properties. For example, conjunction elimination responds to Mentalese conjunction as a piece of pure formal syntax, much as a computer manipulates items in a formal language without considering what those items mean.

Semantic computationalists reject FSC. They claim that mental computation is sometimes sensitive to semantic properties. Semantic computationalists can agree that drawing an inference involves executing a mechanical operation over structured symbols, and they can agree that the same mechanical operation uniformly applies to any premises with appropriate logical structure. So they can still explain inferential systematicity. However, they can also say that the postulated mechanical operation is sensitive to semantic properties. For example, they can say that conjunction elimination is sensitive to the meaning of Mentalese conjunction.

In assessing the debate between FSC and semantic computationalism, one must distinguish between logical versus non-logical symbols. For present purposes, it is common ground that the meanings of non-logical symbols do not inform logical inference. The inference from \(S_1 \amp S_2\) to \(S_{1}\) features the same mechanical operation as the inference from \(S_{3} \amp S_{4}\) to \(S_{4}\), and this mechanical operation is not sensitive to the meanings of the conjuncts \(S_{1}\), \(S_{2}\), \(S_{3}\), or \(S_{4}\). It does not follow that the mechanical operation is insensitive to the meaning of Mentalese conjunction. The meaning of conjunction might influence how the logical inference proceeds, even though the meanings of the conjuncts do not.

5. The Connectionist Challenge

In the 1960s and 1970s, cognitive scientists almost universally modeled mental activity as rule-governed symbol manipulation. In the 1980s, connectionism gained currency as an alternative computational framework. Connectionists employ computational models, called neural networks, that differ quite significantly from Turing-style models. There is no central processor. There are no memory locations for symbols to be inscribed. Instead, there is a network of nodes bearing weighted connections to one another. During computation, waves of activation spread through the network. A node’s activation level depends upon the weighted activations of the nodes to which it is connected. Nodes function somewhat analogously to neurons, and connections between nodes function somewhat analogously to synapses. One should receive the neurophysiological analogy cautiously, as there are numerous important differences between neural networks and actual neural configurations in the brain (Bechtel & Abramson 2002: 341–343; Bermúdez 2010: 237–239; Clark 2014: 87–89; Harnish 2002: 359–362).

Connectionists raise many objections to the classical computational paradigm (Rumelhart, McClelland, & the PDP Research Group 1986; Horgan & Tienson 1996; McLaughlin & Warfield 1994; Bechtel & Abrahamsen 2002), such as that classical systems are not biologically realistic or that they are unable to model certain psychological tasks. Classicists in turn launch various arguments against connectionism. The most famous arguments showcase productivity, systematicity of thought, and systematicity of thinking. Fodor and Pylyshyn (1988) argue that these phenomena support classical CTM over connectionist CTM.

Fodor and Pylyshyn’s argument hinges on the distinction between eliminative connectionism and implementationist connectionism (cf. Pinker & Prince 1988). Eliminative connectionists advance neural networks as a replacement for the Turing-style formalism. They deny that mental computation consists in rule-governed symbol manipulation. Implementationist connectionists allow that, in some cases, mental computation may instantiate rule-governed symbol manipulation. They advance neural networks not to replace classical computations but rather to model how classical computations are implemented in the brain. The hope is that, because neural network computation more closely resembles actual brain activity, it can illuminate the physical realization of rule-governed symbol manipulation.

Building on Aydede’s (2015) discussion, we may reconstruct Fodor and Pylyshyn’s argument like so:

  1. Representational mental states and processes exist. An explanatorily adequate account of cognition should acknowledge these states and processes.
  2. The representational states and processes that figure in high-level cognition have certain fundamental properties: thought is productive and systematic; inferential thinking is systematic. The states and processes have these properties as a matter of nomic necessity: it is a psychological law that they have the properties.
  3. A theory of mental computation is explanatorily adequate only if it explains the nomic necessity of systematicity and productivity.
  4. The only way to explain the nomic necessity of systematicity and productivity is to postulate that high-level cognition instantiates computation over mental symbols with a compositional semantics. Specifically, we must accept RTT+COMP.
  5. Either a connectionist theory endorses RTT+COMP or it does not.
  6. If it does, then it is a version of implementationist connectionism.
  7. If it does not, then it is a version of eliminative connectionism. As per (iv), it does not explain productivity and systematicity. As per (iii), it is not explanatorily adequate.
  8. Conclusion: Eliminative connectionist theories are not explanatorily adequate.

The argument does not say that neural networks are unable to model systematicity. One can certainly build a neural network that is systematic. For example, one might build a neural network that can represent that John loves Mary only if it can represent that Mary loves John. The problem is that one might just as well build a neural network that can represent that John loves Mary but cannot represent that Mary loves John. Hence, nothing about the connectionist framework per se guarantees systematicity. For that reason, the framework does not explain the nomic necessity of systematicity. It does not explain why all the minds we find are systematic. In contrast, the classical framework mandates systematicity, and so it explains the nomic necessity of systematicity. The only apparent recourse for connectionists is to adopt the classical explanation, thereby becoming implementationist rather than eliminative connectionists.

Fodor and Pylyshyn’s argument has spawned a massive literature, including too many rebuttals to survey here. The most popular responses fall into five categories:

  • Deny (i). Some connectionists deny that cognitive science should posit representational mental states. They believe that mature scientific theorizing about the mind will delineate connectionist models specified in non-representational terms (P.S. Churchland 1986; P.S. Churchland & Sejnowski 1989; P.M. Churchland 1990; P.M. Churchland & P.S. Churchland 1990; Ramsey 2007). If so, then Fodor and Pylyshyn’s argument falters at its first step. There is no need to explain why representational mental states are systematic and productive if one rejects all talk about representational mental states.
  • Accept (viii). Some authors, such as Marcus (2001), feel that neural networks are best deployed to illuminate the implementation of Turing-style models, rather than as replacements for Turing-style models.
  • Deny (ii). Some authors claim that Fodor and Pylyshyn greatly exaggerate the extent to which thought is productive (Rumelhart & McClelland 1986) or systematic (Dennett 1991; Johnson 2004). Horgan and Tienson (1996: 91–94) question the systematicity of thinking. They contend that we deviate from norms of deductive inference more than one would expect if we were following the rigid mechanical rules postulated by CCTM.
  • Deny (iv). Braddon-Mitchell and Fitzpatrick (1990) offer an evolutionary explanation for the systematicity of thought, bypassing any appeal to structured mental representations. In a similar vein, Horgan and Tienson (1996: 90) seek to explain systematicity by emphasizing how our survival depends upon our ability to keep track of objects in the environment and their ever-changing properties. Clark (1991) argues that systematicity follows from the holistic nature of thought ascription.
  • Deny (vi). Chalmers (1990, 1993), Smolensky (1991), and van Gelder (1991) claim that one can reject Turing-style models while still postulating mental representations with compositionally and computationally relevant internal structure.

We focus here on (vi).

As discussed in section 1.2, Fodor elucidates constituency structure in terms of part/whole relations. A complex representation’s constituents are literal parts of it. One consequence is that, whenever the first representation is tokened, so are its constituents. Fodor takes this consequence to be definitive of classical computation. As Fodor and McLaughlin (1990: 186) put it:

for a pair of expression types E1, E2, the first is a Classical constituent of the second only if the first is tokened whenever the second is tokened.

Thus, structured representations have a concatenative structure: each token of a structured representation involves a concatenation of tokens of the constituent representations. Connectionists who deny (vi) espouse a non-concatenative conception of constituency structure, according to which structure is encoded by a suitable distributed representation. Developments of the non-concatenative conception are usually quite technical (Elman 1989; Hinton 1990; Pollack 1990; Smolensky 1990, 1991, 1995; Touretzky 1990). Most models use vector or tensor algebra to define operations over connectionist representations, which are codified by activity vectors across nodes in a neural network. The representations are said to have implicit constituency structure: the constituents are not literal parts of the complex representation, but they can be extracted from the complex representation through suitable computational operations over it.

Fodor and McLaughlin (1990) grant that distributed representations may have constituency structure “in an extended sense”. But they insist that distributed representations are ill-suited to explain systematicity. They focus especially on the systematicity of thinking, the classical explanation for which postulates mechanical operations that respond to constituency structure. Fodor and McLaughlin argue that the non-concatenative conception cannot replicate the classical explanation and offers no satisfactory substitute for it. Chalmers (1993) and Niklasson and van Gelder (1994) disagree. They contend that a neural network can execute structure-sensitive computations over representations that have non-concatenative constituency structure. They conclude that connectionists can explain productivity and systematicity without retreating to implementationist connectionism.

Aydede (1995, 1997a) agrees that there is a legitimate notion of non-concatenative constituency structure, but he questions whether the resulting models are non-classical. He denies that we should regard concatenative structure as integral to LOTH. According to Aydede, concatenative structure is just one possible physical realization of constituency structure. Non-concatenative structure is another possible realization. We can accept RTT+COMP without glossing constituency structure in concatenative terms. On this view, a neural network whose operations are sensitive to non-concatenative constituency structure may still count as broadly classical and in particular as manipulating Mentalese expressions.

The debate between classical and connectionist CTM is still active, although not as active as during the 1990s. Recent anti-connectionist arguments tend to have a more empirical flavor. For example, Gallistel and King (2009) defend CCTM by canvassing a range of non-human empirical case studies. According to Gallistel and King, the case studies manifest a kind of productivity that CCTM can easily explain but eliminative connectionism cannot.

6. Regress Objections to LOTH

LOTH has elicited too many objections to cover in a single encyclopedia entry. We will discuss two objections, both alleging that LOTH generates a vicious regress. The first objection emphasizes language learning. The second emphasizes language understanding.

6.1 Learning a Language

Like many cognitive scientists, Fodor holds that children learn a natural language via hypothesis formation and testing. Children formulate, test, and confirm hypotheses about the denotations of words. For example, a child learning English will confirm the hypothesis that “cat” denotes cats. According to Fodor, denotations are represented in Mentalese. To formulate the hypothesis that “cat” denotes cats, the child uses a Mentalese word cat that denotes cats. It may seem that a regress is now in the offing, sparked by the question: How does the child learn Mentalese? Suppose we extend the hypothesis formation and testing model (henceforth HF) to Mentalese. Then we must posit a meta-language to express hypotheses about denotations of Mentalese words, a meta-meta-language to express hypotheses about denotations of meta-language words, and so on ad infinitum (Atherton and Schwartz 1974: 163).

Fodor responds to the threatened regress by denying we should apply HF to Mentalese (1975: 65). Children do not test hypotheses about the denotations of Mentalese words. They do not learn Mentalese at all. The mental language is innate.

The doctrine that some concepts are innate was a focal point in the clash between rationalism versus empiricism. Rationalists defended the innateness of certain fundamental ideas, such as god and cause, while empiricists held that all ideas derive from sensory experience. A major theme in the 1960s cognitive science revolution was revival of a nativist picture, inspired by the rationalists, on which many key elements of cognition are innate. Most famously, Chomsky (1965) explained language acquisition by positing innate knowledge about possible human languages. Fodor’s innateness thesis was widely perceived as going way beyond all precedent, verging on the preposterous (P.S. Churchland 1986; Putnam 1988). How could we have an innate ability to represent all the denotations we mentally represent? For example, how could we innately possess a Mentalese word carburetor that represents carburetors?

In evaluating these issues, it is vital to distinguish between learning a concept versus acquiring a concept. When Fodor says that a concept is innate, he does not mean to deny that we acquire the concept or even that certain kinds of experience are needed to acquire it. Fodor fully grants that we cannot mentally represent carburetors at birth and that we come to represent them only by undergoing appropriate experiences. He agrees that most concepts are acquired. He denies that they are learned. In effect, he uses “innate” as a synonym for “unlearned” (1975: 96). One might reasonably challenge Fodor’s usage. One might resist classifying a concept as innate simply because it is unlearned. However, that is how Fodor uses the word “innate”. Properly understood, then, Fodor’s position is not as far-fetched as it may sound.[7]

Fodor gives a simple but striking argument that concepts are unlearned. The argument begins from the premise that HF is the only potentially viable model of concept learning. Fodor then argues that HF is not a viable model of concept learning, from which he concludes that concepts are unlearned. He offers various formulations and refinements of the argument over his career. Here is a relatively recent rendition (2008: 139):

Now, according to HF, the process by which one learns C must include the inductive evaluation of some such hypothesis as “The C things are the ones that are green or triangular”. But the inductive evaluation of that hypothesis itself requires (inter alia) bringing the property green or triangular before the mind as such… Quite generally, you can’t represent anything as such and such unless you already have the concept such and such. All that being so, it follows, on pain of circularity, that “concept learning” as HF understands it can’t be a way of acquiring concept C… Conclusion: If concept learning is as HF understands it, there can be no such thing. This conclusion is entirely general; it doesn’t matter whether the target concept is primitive (like green) or complex (like green or triangular).

Fodor’s argument does not presuppose RTT, COMP, or CTM. To the extent that the argument works, it applies to any view on which people have concepts.

If concepts are not learned, then how are they acquired? Fodor offers some preliminary remarks (2008: 144–168), but by his own admission the remarks are sketchy and leave numerous questions unanswered (2008: 144–145). Prinz (2011) critiques Fodor’s positive treatment of concept acquisition.

The most common rejoinder to Fodor’s innateness argument is to deny that HF is the only viable model of concept learning. The rejoinder acknowledges that concepts are not learned through hypothesis testing but insists they are learned through other means. Three examples:

  • Margolis (1998) proposes an acquisition model that differs from HF but that allegedly yields concept learning. Fodor (2008: 140–144) retorts that Margolis’s model does not yield genuine concept learning. Margolis and Laurence (2011) insist that it does.
  • Carey (2009) maintains that children can “bootstrap” their way to new concepts using induction, analogical reasoning, and other techniques. She develops her view in great detail, supporting it partly through her groundbreaking experimental work with young children. Fodor (2010) and Rey (2014) object that Carey’s bootstrapping theory is circular: it surreptitiously presupposes that children already possess the very concepts whose acquisition it purports to explain. Beck (2017) and Carey (2014) respond to the circularity objection.
  • Shea (2016) argues that connectionist modeling can explain concept acquisition in non-HF terms and that the resulting models instantiate genuine learning.

A lot depends here upon what counts as “learning” and what does not, a question that seems difficult to adjudicate. A closely connected question is whether concept acquisition is a rational process or a mere causal process. To the extent that acquiring some concept is a rational achievement, we will want to say that one learned the concept. To the extent that acquiring the concept is a mere causal process (more like catching a cold than confirming a hypothesis), we will feel less inclined to say that genuine learning took place (Fodor 1981: 275).

These issues lie at the frontier of psychological and philosophical research. The key point for present purposes is that there are two options for halting the regress of language learning: we can say that thinkers acquire concepts but do not learn them; or we can say that thinkers learn concepts through some means other than hypothesis testing. Of course, it is not enough just to note that the two options exist. Ultimately, one must develop one’s favored option into a compelling theory. But there is no reason to think that doing so would reinitiate the regress. In any event, explaining concept acquisition is an important task facing any theorist who accepts that we have concepts, whether or not the theorist accepts LOTH. Thus, the learning regress objection is best regarded not as posing a challenge specific to LOTH but rather as highlighting a more widely shared theoretical obligation: the obligation to explain how we acquire concepts.

For further discussion, see the entry on innateness. See also the exchange between Cowie (1999) and Fodor (2001).

6.2 Understanding a Language

What is it to understand a natural language word? On a popular picture, understanding a word requires that you mentally represent the word’s denotation. For example, understanding the word “cat” requires representing that it denotes cats. LOT theorists will say that you use Mentalese words to represent denotations. The question now arises what it is to understand a Mentalese word. If understanding the Mentalese word requires representing that it has a certain denotation, then we face an infinite regress of meta-languages (Blackburn 1984: 43–44).

The standard response is to deny that ordinary thinkers represent Mentalese words as having denotations (Bach 1987; Fodor 1975: 66–79). Mentalese is not an instrument of communication. Thinking is not “talking to oneself” in Mentalese. A typical thinker does not represent, perceive, interpret, or reflect upon Mentalese expressions. Mentalese serves as a medium within which her thought occurs, not an object of interpretation. We should not say that she “understands” Mentalese in the same way that she understands a natural language.

There is perhaps another sense in which the thinker “understands” Mentalese: her mental activity coheres with the meanings of Mentalese words. For example, her deductive reasoning coheres with the truth-tables expressed by Mentalese logical connectives. More generally, her mental activity is semantically coherent. To say that the thinker “understands” Mentalese in this sense is not to say that she represents Mentalese denotations. Nor is there any evident reason to suspect that explaining semantic coherence will ultimately require us to posit mental representation of Mentalese denotations. So there is no regress of understanding.

For further criticism of this regress argument, see the discussions of Knowles (1998) and Laurence and Margolis (1997).[8]

7. Naturalizing the Mind

Naturalism is a movement that seeks to ground philosophical theorizing in the scientific enterprise. As so often in philosophy, different authors use the term “naturalism” in different ways. Usage within philosophy of mind typically connotes an effort to depict mental states and processes as denizens of the physical world, with no irreducibly mental entities or properties allowed. In the modern era, philosophers have often recruited LOTH to advance naturalism. Indeed, LOTH’s supposed contribution to naturalism is frequently cited as a significant consideration in its favor. One example is Fodor’s use of CCTM+FSC to explain semantic coherence. The other main example turns upon the problem of intentionality.

How does intentionality arise? How do mental states come to be about anything, or to have semantic properties? Brentano (1874 [1973: 97]) maintained that intentionality is a hallmark of the mental as opposed to the physical: “The reference to something as an object is a distinguishing characteristic of all mental phenomena. No physical phenomenon exhibits anything similar”. In response, contemporary naturalists seek to naturalize intentionality. They want to explain in naturalistically acceptable terms what makes it the case that mental states have semantic properties. In effect, the goal is to reduce the intentional to the non-intentional. Beginning in the 1980s, philosophers have offered various proposals about how to naturalize intentionality. Most proposals emphasize causal or nomic links between mind and world (Aydede & Güzeldere 2005; Dretske 1981; Fodor 1987, 1990; Stalnaker 1984), sometimes also invoking teleological factors (Millikan 1984, 1993; Neander 2017l; Papineau 1987; Dretske 1988) or historical lineages of mental states (Devitt 1995; Field 2001). Another approach, functional role semantics, emphasizes the functional role of a mental state: the cluster of causal or inferential relations that the state bears to other mental states. The idea is that meaning emerges at least partly through these causal and inferential relations. Some functional role theories cite causal relations to the external world (Block 1987; Loar 1982), and others do not (Cummins 1989).

Even the best developed attempts at naturalizing intentionality, such as Fodor’s (1990) version of the nomic strategy, face serious problems that no one knows how to solve (M. Greenberg 2014; Loewer 1997). Partly for that reason, the flurry of naturalizing attempts abated in the 2000s. Burge (2010: 298) reckons that the naturalizing project is not promising and that current proposals are “hopeless”. He agrees that we should try to illuminate representationality by limning its connections to the physical, the causal, the biological, and the teleological. But he insists that illumination need not yield a reduction of the intentional to the non-intentional.

LOTH is neutral as to the naturalization of intentionality. An LOT theorist might attempt to reduce the intentional to the non-intentional. Alternatively, she might dismiss the reductive project as impossible or pointless. Assuming she chooses the reductive route, LOTH provides guidance regarding how she might proceed. According to RTT,

X A’s that p iff there is a mental representation S such that X bears A* to S and S means that p.

The task of elucidating “X A’s that p” in naturalistically acceptable terms factors into two sub-tasks (Field 2001: 33):

  1. Explain in naturalistically acceptable terms what it is to bear psychological relation A* to mental representation S.
  2. Explain in naturalistically acceptable terms what it is for mental representation S to mean that p.

As we have seen, functionalism helps with (a). Moreover, COMP provides a blueprint for tackling (b). We can first delineate a compositional semantics describing how S’s meaning depends upon semantic properties of its component words and upon the compositional import of the constituency structure into which those words are arranged. We can then explain in naturalistically acceptable terms why the component words have the semantic properties that they have and why the constituency structure has the compositional import that it has.

How much does LOTH advance the naturalization of intentionality? Our compositional semantics for Mentalese may illuminate how the semantic properties of a complex expression depend upon the semantic properties of primitive expressions, but it says nothing about how primitive expressions get their semantic properties in the first place. Brentano’s challenge (How could intentionality arise from purely physical entities and processes?) remains unanswered. To meet the challenge, we must invoke naturalizing strategies that go well beyond LOTH itself, such as the causal or nomic strategies mentioned above. Those naturalizing strategies are not specifically linked to LOTH and can usually be tailored to semantic properties of neural states rather than semantic properties of Mentalese expressions. Thus, it is debatable how much LOTH ultimately helps us naturalize intentionality. Naturalizing strategies orthogonal to LOTH seem to do the heavy lifting.

8. Individuation of Mentalese Expressions

How are Mentalese expressions individuated? Since Mentalese expressions are types, answering this question requires us to consider the type/token relation for Mentalese. We want to fill in the schema

e and e* are tokens of the same Mentalese type iff R(e, e*).

What should we substitute for R(e, e*)? The literature typically focuses on primitive symbol types, and we will follow suit here.

It is almost universally agreed among contemporary LOT theorists that Mentalese tokens are neurophysiological entities of some sort. One might therefore hope to individuate Mentalese types by citing neural properties of the tokens. Drawing R(e, e*) from the language of neuroscience induces a theory along the following lines:

Neural individuation: e and e* are tokens of the same primitive Mentalese type iff e and e* are tokens of the same neural type.

This schema leaves open how neural types are individuated. We may bypass that question here, because neural individuation of Mentalese types finds no proponents in the contemporary literature. The main reason is that it conflicts with multiple realizability: the doctrine that a single mental state type can be realized by physical systems that are wildly heterogeneous when described in physical, biological, or neuroscientific terms. Putnam (1967) introduced multiple realizability as evidence against the mind/brain identity theory, which asserts that mental state types are brain state types. Fodor (1975: 13–25) further developed the multiple realizability argument, presenting it as foundational to LOTH. Although the multiple realizability argument has subsequently been challenged (Polger 2004), LOT theorists widely agree that we should not individuate Mentalese types in neural terms.

The most popular strategy is to individuate Mentalese types functionally:

Functional individuation: e and e* are tokens of the same primitive Mentalese type iff e and e* have the same functional role.

Field (2001: 56–67), Fodor (1994: 105–109), and Stich (1983: 149–151) pursue functional individuation. They specify functional roles using a Turing-style computationalism formalism, so that “functional role” becomes something like “computational role”, i.e., role within mental computation.

Functional roles theories divide into two categories: molecular and holist. Molecular theories isolate privileged canonical relations that a symbol bears to other symbols. Canonical relations individuate the symbol, but non-canonical relations do not. For example, one might individuate Mentalese conjunction solely through the introduction and elimination rules governing conjunction while ignoring any other computational rules. If we say that a symbol’s “canonical functional role” is constituted by its canonical relations to other symbols, then we can offer the following theory:

Molecular functional individuation: e and e* are tokens of the same primitive Mentalese type iff e and e* have the same canonical functional role.

One problem facing molecular individuation is that, aside from logical connectives and a few other special cases, it is difficult to draw any principled demarcation between canonical and non-canonical relations (Schneider 2011: 106). Which relations are canonical for SOFA?[9] Citing the demarcation problem, Schneider espouses a holist approach that individuates mental symbols through total functional role, i.e., every single aspect of the role that a symbol plays within mental activity:

Holist functional individuation: e and e* are tokens of the same primitive Mentalese type iff e and e* have the same total functional role.

Holist individuation is very fine-grained: the slightest difference in total functional role entails that different types are tokened. Since different thinkers will always differ somewhat in their mental computations, it now looks like two thinkers will never share the same mental language. This consequence is worrisome, for two reasons emphasized by Aydede (1998). First, it violates the plausible publicity constraint that propositional attitudes are in principle shareable. Second, it apparently precludes interpersonal psychological explanations that cite Mentalese expressions. Schneider (2011: 111–158) addresses both concerns, arguing that they are misdirected.

A crucial consideration when individuating mental symbols is what role to assign to semantic properties. Here we may usefully compare Mentalese with natural language. It is widely agreed that natural language words do not have their denotations essentially. The English word “cat” denotes cats, but it could just as well have denoted dogs, or the number 27, or anything else, or nothing at all, if our linguistic conventions had been different. Virtually all contemporary LOT theorists hold that a Mentalese word likewise does not have its denotation essentially. The Mentalese word cat denotes cats, but it could have had a different denotation had it born different causal relations to the external world or had it occupied a different role in mental activity. In that sense, cat is a piece of formal syntax. Fodor’s early view (1981: 225–253) was that a Mentalese word could have had a different denotation but not an arbitrarily different denotation: cat could not have denoted just anything—it could not have denoted the number 27—but it could have denoted some other animal species had the thinker suitably interacted with that species rather than with cats. Fodor eventually (1994, 2008) embraces the stronger thesis that a Mentalese word bears an arbitrary relation to its denotation: cat could have had any arbitrarily different denotation. Most contemporary theorists agree (Egan 1992: 446; Field 2001: 58; Harnad 1994: 386; Haugeland 1985: 91: 117–123; Pylyshyn 1984: 50).

The historical literature on LOTH suggests an alternative semantically permeated view: Mentalese words are individuated partly through their denotations. The Mentalese word cat is not a piece of formal syntax subject to reinterpretation. It could not have denoted another species, or the number 27, or anything else. It denotes cats by its inherent nature. From a semantically permeated viewpoint, a Mentalese word has its denotation essentially. Thus, there is a profound difference between natural language and mental language. Mental words, unlike natural language words, bring with them one fixed semantic interpretation. The semantically permeated approach is present in Ockham, among other medieval LOT theorists (Normore 2003, 2009). In light of the problems facing neural and functional individuation, Aydede (2005) recommends that we consider taking semantics into account when individuating Mentalese expressions. Rescorla (2012b) concurs, defending a semantically permeated approach as applied to at least some mental representations. He proposes that certain mental computations operate over mental symbols with essential semantic properties, and he argues that the proposal fits well with many sectors of cognitive science.[10]

A recurring complaint about the semantically permeated approach is that inherently meaningful mental representations seem like highly suspect entities (Putnam 1988: 21). How could a mental word have one fixed denotation by its inherent nature? What magic ensures the necessary connection between the word and the denotation? These worries diminish in force if one keeps firmly in mind that Mentalese words are types. Types are abstract entities corresponding to a scheme for classifying, or type-identifying, tokens. To ascribe a type to a token is to type-identify the token as belonging to some category. Semantically permeated types correspond to a classificatory scheme that takes semantics into account when categorizing tokens. As Burge emphasizes (2007: 302), there is nothing magical about semantically-based classification. On the contrary, both folk psychology and cognitive science routinely classify mental events based at least partly upon their semantic properties.

A simplistic implementation of the semantically permeated approach individuates symbol tokens solely through their denotations:

Denotational individuation: e and e* are tokens of the same primitive Mentalese type iff e and e* have the same denotation.

As Aydede (2000) and Schneider (2011) emphasize, denotational individuation is unsatisfying. Co-referring words may play significantly different roles in mental activity. Frege’s (1892 [1997]) famous Hesperus-Phosphorus example illustrates: one can believe that Hesperus is Hesperus without believing that Hesperus is Phosphorus. As Frege put it, one can think about the same denotation “in different ways”, or “under different modes of presentation”. Different modes of presentation have different roles within mental activity, implicating different psychological explanations. Thus, a semantically permeated individuative scheme adequate for psychological explanation must be finer-grained than denotational individuation allows. It must take mode of presentation into account. But what it is to think about a denotation “under the same mode of presentation”? How are “modes of presentation” individuated? Ultimately, semantically permeated theorists must grapple with these questions. Rescorla (2020) offers some suggestions about how to proceed.[11]

Chalmers (2012) complains that semantically permeated individuation sacrifices significant virtues that made LOTH attractive in the first place. LOTH promised to advance naturalism by grounding cognitive science in non-representational computational models. Representationally-specified computational models seem like a significant retrenchment from these naturalistic ambitions. For example, semantically permeated theorists cannot accept the FSC explanation of semantic coherence, because they do not postulate formal syntactic types manipulated during mental computation.

How compelling one finds naturalistic worries about semantically permeated individuation will depend on how impressive one finds the naturalistic contributions made by formal mental syntax. We saw earlier that FSC arguably engenders a worrisome epiphenomenalism. Moreover, the semantically permeated approach in no way precludes a naturalistic reduction of intentionality. It merely precludes invoking formal syntactic Mentalese types while executing such a reduction. For example, proponents of the semantically permeated approach can still pursue the causal or nomic naturalizing strategies discussed in section 7. Nothing about either strategy presupposes formal syntactic Mentalese types. Thus, it is not clear that replacing a formal syntactic individuative scheme with a semantically permeated scheme significantly impedes the naturalistic endeavor.

No one has yet provided an individuative scheme for Mentalese that commands widespread assent. The topic demands continued investigation, because LOTH remains highly schematic until its proponents clarify sameness and difference of Mentalese types.


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I owe a profound debt to the Murat Aydede, author of the previous entry on the same topic. His exposition hugely influenced my work on the entry, figuring indispensably as a springboard, a reference, and a standard of excellence. Some of my formulations in the introduction and in sections 1.1, 2, 3, 4.3, 5, 6.1, and 7 closely track formulations from the previous entry. Section 5’s discussion of connectionism is directly based on the previous entry’s treatment. I also thank Calvin Normore, Melanie Schoenberg, and the Stanford Encyclopedia editors for helpful comments.

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