Legal Interpretation

First published Wed Jul 7, 2021

Legal interpretation involves scrutinizing legal texts such as the texts of statutes, constitutions, contracts, and wills. This chapter introduces the foundational question of what legal interpretation, by its nature, seeks – and competing answers to that question. It goes on to canvas leading substantive theories of legal interpretation and examines in greater depth a few influential theories and difficulties they encounter. Finally, the chapter considers how theories of legal interpretation should be defended and evaluated.

1. Introduction

Legal interpretation is familiar to lawyers, judges, and legal theorists. Public and private disputes of tremendous importance turn on questions of how to interpret legal texts. Yet there is deep and pervasive controversy over the proper theory or method of legal interpretation. Part of the reason for such controversy is that, perhaps surprisingly, there is no consensus with respect to the more fundamental issue of what legal interpretation is – in particular, what its constitutive aim is. Does legal interpretation, for example, seek the linguistic meaning of legal texts, the best resolution of disputes, or legal provisions’ contribution to the content of the law? Without progress on this foundational issue, progress on understanding the proper method of legal interpretation cannot be expected.

This chapter begins, in section 2, by canvassing different accounts of what legal interpretation is. Section 3 sketches leading theories or methods of legal interpretation. Section 4 explores a few of these methods, especially intentionalism and textualism (including original meaning originalism), in much greater detail and examines difficulties they encounter. Several distinctions are introduced that enable more precise analysis than the characterizations generally offered in the literature. Section 5 turns to the question of how to defend and evaluate theories of legal interpretation. It concludes with a brief discussion of various kinds of idealization in the theory of legal interpretation.

The discussion is necessarily compressed, and references to further reading are provided. The focus is on statutory and constitutional interpretation, though much of the discussion applies with appropriate qualifications and modifications to the interpretation of administrative regulations and private instruments such as contracts and wills. The interpretation of judicial decisions is a topic best addressed separately. See entry on Precedent and Analogy in Legal Reasoning.

2. What Legal Interpretation Seeks

Lawyers and judges are familiar with various competing theories or methods of legal interpretation and with arguments for and against those theories. (This chapter uses the terms theory of legal interpretation and method of legal interpretation interchangeably.) Leading theories include, for example, textualism, originalism, intentionalism, and purposivism. The questions of which theory is correct, and of the different theories’ pros and cons, are important. But there is a more fundamental question that is less often addressed: what is legal interpretation? More specifically, what does legal interpretation, by its nature, seek? What is its constitutive aim?

Many activities are defined or constituted in part by their aims. Medicine and cooking are examples. Someone who examines people, prescribes medicines, and performs surgeries is not practicing medicine unless these activities are undertaken for the appropriate purposes. Of course, individual physicians may have many other purposes, such as earning money or impressing people, but such ends are not what the practice of medicine, by its nature, seeks.

Legal interpretation starts from certain input, such as legal texts and practices, actions and mental states of certain legal actors, and customs. (It is controversial exactly what the input should include, though certain texts are central.) And legal interpretation yields an output – “an interpretation.” The familiar debate concerns which method of getting from the input to the output is correct. But the more basic issue concerns what the output is supposed to be – what legal interpretation seeks. (For brevity, I will often write simply of what legal interpretation seeks; the qualification “by its nature” should be understood.) In the case of constitutional and statutory provisions, for example, is it the linguistic meaning of the text of the relevant provision? The provision’s contribution to the content of the law? The best resolution of disputes? Or something else?

This issue is more fundamental than more familiar questions about the method of interpretation because which method is correct (and which reasons or arguments count in favor of a method) depends on what legal interpretation seeks. In general, how good a method is depends on what the method is for. The appropriate method for finding, say, the linguistic meaning of a text is likely very different from the appropriate method for finding the best resolution of a dispute. Similarly, the fact that a method is fair or democratic might well be irrelevant if legal interpretation seeks linguistic meaning, but highly relevant if it seeks the best resolution of disputes.

Before turning to the leading candidates for what legal interpretation seeks, it is worth considering the recurrent suggestion that interpretation takes place only when the answer to a legal question is not obvious.[1] We can quickly dispense with this suggestion. It does not capture what paradigmatic theories of legal interpretation are engaged in, for the prescriptions offered by such theories apply to easy problems as well as difficult ones. Moreover, the suggestion would have the unfortunate consequence that legal interpretation would not be a unified subject matter. (Compare excluding from the subject of chemistry those chemical reactions that are already well understood.) Whether one is seeking linguistic meaning, the content of the law, or the best resolution of a dispute, one is engaged in the same enterprise when the issues are easy as when they are difficult. A closely related point is that whether a particular legal issue is easy or difficult is relative to the interpreter. For an experienced tax lawyer, the answer to an arcane tax question may be obvious. The suggestion would therefore have the consequence that what counts as legal interpretation depends on who is doing the interpretation (and when).

Perhaps surprisingly, most of the literature on legal interpretation does not consider the foundational question of legal interpretation’s constitutive aim.[2] In evaluating methods of interpretation, writers tend to appeal to whatever considerations strike them as valuable without addressing what legal interpretation is for. For example, Philip Frickey suggests that the way to evaluate purposivism is by asking “whether the interpretations that this theory produces are more worthwhile for a legal system than would be literalist or intentionalist ones” (2006, 851–52).[3]

It is likely that the term “legal interpretation” is not always used with a precise and univocal meaning. We have some paradigms of theories of legal interpretation, but it may well be that they are not all engaged in exactly the same enterprise. To the extent that the term has different uses, it’s probably not helpful to try to identify the uniquely correct use of the term. Instead, we should ask how the term would be usefully regimented. The primary desideratum should be to accurately capture the central enterprise of influential theories such as textualism, purposivism, and originalism. Another factor that could favor a particular understanding of legal interpretation is whether it has the consequence that the term picks out a theoretically unified enterprise.

2.1 Linguistic Meaning

In discussions of legal interpretation, there is a widespread assumption – sometimes explicit, sometimes implicit – that legal interpretation seeks the meaning of the legal texts. Frequently, all sides to a legal interpretive debate ostensibly agree that the debate concerns the meaning of a particular legal text (Berman and Toh 2013, 547, fn. 11; Greenberg 2014, 1297 fn. 19; see, e.g., Greenawalt 2004, 275–77; Alexander and Prakash 2004, 991; Goldsworthy 2009, 683; Fallon 2015, 1237, 1297–1307; Lawson 1997; Barak 2005, 3; Whittington 2010, 121; Fiss 1982, 739, 743–45; Dickerson 1975, 3, 217; for judicial examples, see the various opinions in Smith v. United States, and District of Columbia v. Heller).[4] But this apparent agreement does not in fact tell us much because the term “meaning” (and its cognates) is often used loosely and, in any event, has several senses. There is a broad use of the term in which it is a rough synonym of “implication” or “consequence.” One might ask what the outcome of a particular election means for international trade or for abortion rights.

Again, “meaning” can be used to mean, roughly, significance, as when we catch someone doing something inappropriate and ask, “what is the meaning of this?”

Differently again, “meaning” can be used for the information or content that a symbol expresses or represents. This symbolic meaning can be called meaning in the strict sense. Mathematical symbols and semaphore flags have meanings in the strict sense.

Linguistic meaning is a species of symbolic meaning. Linguistic meaning is the information that is reliably and systematically conveyed by words, sentences, and other linguistic entities. In fact, there are several kinds and components of linguistic meaning, such as word meaning, semantic content, what is said, speaker meaning, and implicature.[5] (In this subsection, in considering the possibility that legal interpretation seeks linguistic meaning, I set aside the issue of the type of linguistic meaning.)

The widespread acceptance that legal interpretation seeks the meaning of a statute or constitutional provision most likely reflects some combination of 1) a lack of clarity about the sense in which the term “meaning” is being used; 2) misunderstandings about what linguistic meaning is; 3) a conflation of a provision’s linguistic meaning with its contribution to the content of the law (its contribution, for short); 4) and an assumption that a provision’s contribution is its linguistic meaning.[6] See Berman and Toh 2013, 547. Even sophisticated theorists who carefully distinguish between different kinds of linguistic meaning fail to distinguish between a provision’s linguistic meaning and its contribution to the content of the law.[7]

The “new originalists” (see section 3) explicitly advocate using the term “constitutional interpretation” for the process of discovering the meaning of the constitutional text (to be distinguished from “constitutional construction,” an “essentially creative” process of constructing meaning). But, with the important exception of Larry Solum (2010), it is clear from their writings that they are not using the term “meaning” consistently for linguistic meaning, often seeming to have in mind, for example, a legal norm or understandings about how a legal norm was to be applied to specific cases (e.g., Whittington 1999a, 5–11; Barnett 2013, 419). For further examples, see section 4.2. As suggested below, it is arguable that their view is best reconstructed as holding that legal interpretation seeks the content of the law, which they hold to be constituted by “public meaning.”

It is crucial not to conflate a provision’s linguistic meaning with its contribution to the content of the law. It might turn out that a statute’s contribution is constituted by its linguistic meaning (or, more precisely, by a specific kind of linguistic meaning), but this is a highly controversial claim about how the content of the law is determined. If, in addressing the preliminary question of what legal interpretation seeks, we simply conflate a statute’s contribution with its linguistic meaning, then, among other mistakes, we miss the need for a substantive argument for that claim.

Despite the widespread assumption that legal interpretation seeks linguistic meaning, many prominent and influential theories of legal interpretation – including purposivism, some forms of intentionalism, Ronald Dworkin’s theory, and pragmatism – do not make any kind of linguistic meaning the focus of their inquiry, though this fact is often obscured by confusions about the nature of linguistic meaning as well as claims by the advocates of the theories. (See sections 3 and 4.) In fact, as we will see (section 4.2), there is a good case that even contemporary textualism is not best understood as trying to ascertain linguistic meaning.

What can be said in favor of the claim that legal interpretation seeks linguistic meaning? It is often taken as a starting point that interpretation is the activity of attributing meaning. (e.g., Knapp and Michaels 1982; 1983; Graglia 1992; Fish 2005; 2008; Michaels 2009; Alexander 2013). By definition, one version of the argument goes, interpretation of any object seeks its meaning – presumably in the strict sense of what that object symbolizes or represents. (If “meaning” were intended in the loose sense of significance, the argument could yield no real constraint on legal interpretation.) A different but related argument is that legal interpretation is an instance of linguistic interpretation, and linguistic interpretation seeks linguistic meaning (e.g., Soames, 2009; Alexander 2011).

The former argument does not take us very far. To begin with, the claim that interpretation of an object is, by definition, the search for its meaning is dubious. Radiologists interpret x-rays, and x-rays don’t have meanings in the strict sense. More to the point, the meaning of the word “interpretation” or the nature of interpretation (in general, as opposed to legal interpretation specifically) is peripheral to our concerns. Rather, as noted above, the central consideration is what the paradigm theories – textualism, purposivism, and the like – are engaged in. If it turns out that they are engaged in some enterprise that is not correctly designated “interpretation,” then so be it. It would not be problematic if legal interpretation – the topic of this chapter – is not in fact a type of interpretation properly so called (cf. Sunstein 2015).

The second argument – that linguistic interpretation in general seeks the linguistic meaning of texts – begs the question because it starts from the assumption that legal interpretation is a type of linguistic interpretation. It’s uncontroversial that legal interpretation typically involves scrutinizing linguistic texts, among other things – even that interpreting linguistic texts is typically part of what goes into legal interpretation. But in an inquiry into the constitutive aim of legal interpretation, it is question begging to assume that legal interpretation is linguistic interpretation in a sense that entails that legal interpretation has the constitutive aim of linguistic interpretation.[8]

An important reason for rejecting the claim that legal interpretation seeks linguistic meaning derives from three propositions that are widely shared by theorists of legal interpretation: 1) legal interpretation often yields interpretations that resolve legal disputes; 2) in resolving disputes, judges must follow the content of the law except in extremely unusual circumstances; 3) the content of the law is often determinate enough to resolve disputes. Given these tenets, the output of legal interpretation cannot be merely the linguistic meaning of the relevant texts. If it were, and if judges must in general follow the content of the law, then legal interpretation would not be able to yield outputs that resolve legal disputes; there would have to be a further step of ascertaining the content of the law. In addition, as will be evident from the discussion in sections 3 and 4, most theories of legal interpretation make legal interpretation depend on factors that are not relevant to ascertaining linguistic meaning.

It might be objected that finding the linguistic meaning of the relevant legal texts does resolve disputes because the linguistic meaning constitutes the provision’s contribution to the law. This objection concedes that legal interpretation seeks a provision’s contribution to the law and assumes that that contribution is constituted by linguistic meaning. The objection therefore should be understood as taking the position that legal interpretation, by its nature, seeks the (provisions’ contribution to the) content of the law, and further holding, based on a controversial substantive claim about how the content of the law is determined, that the correct method of legal interpretation is to ascertain linguistic meaning. At any rate, legal interpretation’s constitutive aim should not be understood in a way whose plausibility depends on a controversial substantive claim about how the content of the law is determined.

The argument based on the three widely shared propositions counts strongly in favor of either the position that legal interpretation seeks the correct resolution of disputes or the position that it seeks the content of the law. Let us address these positions in turn.

2.2 The Correct Resolution of Disputes

According to the former position, legal interpretation seeks something broader than linguistic meaning and provisions’ contribution to the law. It seeks the resolution of disputes that come before courts or other adjudicators. The position is not often explicitly defended. In fact, there has been a recent tendency to insist on distinguishing between adjudication (understood as encompassing everything that courts must do to resolve disputes) and interpretation.[9]

The most important factors favoring the dispute-resolution understanding of legal interpretation (over an understanding on which legal interpretation seeks a provision’s contribution) are the open-ended process characteristic of much legal interpretation and the ad hoc or eclectic approach to evaluating methods of legal interpretation employed by much writing on legal interpretation. Lawyers and judges typically take into account a wide range of factors in legal interpretation without a well-structured conception of how and why these different factors are relevant.

In addition, traditional writings on legal interpretation, as well as many contemporary ones, take an eclectic approach to defending and evaluating methods of interpretation, appealing to whatever aspects or consequences of a method are valuable or desirable. (E.g., Posner 1986, 201; Molot 2006, 64–65.)[10] This kind of approach seems better suited to identifying the best method of resolving disputes than to finding the most reliable method of ascertaining a provision’s contribution to the law. On the other hand, as noted above, the use of such an approach may simply reflect the fact that most writers have not carefully considered the question what legal interpretation seeks.

Several factors mitigate against the understanding of legal interpretation as seeking the best overall resolution of disputes. First, this understanding would exclude the possibility that legal interpretation can be engaged in by actors who are not resolving specific disputes. It would even exclude the possibility of legal interpretation by an institution in an authoritative opinion whenever the institution is not considering how to resolve a dispute. Second, more importantly, on this understanding of legal interpretation, it would comprise several different activities: ascertaining what the law is; creating so-called decision rules to implement broad legal norms, such as constitutional doctrines; making discretionary decisions not governed by dispositive legal standards, such as fixing criminal sentences under statutes that specify a range of permissible sentences; fashioning new legal standards; figuring out how to resolve disputes when not resolved by applicable first-order legal norms, for example by applying burdens of proof or other closure rules; and deciding whether to depart from the law in cases of exceptional injustice or extraordinary harm. But our paradigm theories of legal interpretation do not even address most of these activities. For example, intentionalism, purposivism, and textualism have nothing to say about how to fix defendants’ sentences within a statutory range, how to fashion new legal standards, and whether to depart from the law in cases of exceptional injustice.

2.3 A Provision’s Contribution to the Content of the Law

On this position, theories of legal interpretation seek to discover how determinants of the content of the law, such as the ratification of the Constitution or the enactment of a bill, affect the content of the law. Increasingly, there is a perceptible trend toward recognizing this position.[11] On this approach, the linguistic meanings of legal texts are obviously a highly relevant factor, but theories of legal interpretation seek more than just the linguistic meaning of legal texts; they seek to ascertain the law. Theories of legal interpretation do not, however, purport to offer guidance on other issues, such as how to make discretionary decisions not controlled by legal standards or whether to follow the law.

The most important arguments in favor of this understanding of legal interpretation are the main arguments against the linguistic-meaning and dispute-resolution understandings. If legal interpretation is to resolve many disputes, and judges are in general bound to follow the law, then (assuming that there often are relevant legal standards) legal interpretation must at least yield the content of the law. On the other hand, theories of legal interpretation do not include components that would be necessary if they were theories of how to resolve disputes generally. Similarly, though the term “legal interpretation” is often used loosely and is sometimes used in a way that encompasses activities such as creating law interstitially, when the different activities necessary to resolve disputes are carefully distinguished, few would classify all of them as part of legal interpretation. For example, it would stretch the term beyond recognition to categorize deciding whether to refuse to follow the law as legal interpretation.

Moreover, if we use the term “legal interpretation” for the entire process of resolving disputes, it will not pick out a theoretically unified subject. What is involved in, for example, ascertaining the content of the law is extremely different from what is involved in fashioning new legal standards, making discretionary decisions, and deciding whether to refuse to apply the law. Understanding legal interpretation as seeking a provision’s contribution to the content of the law has the great advantage that it gives legal interpretation a theoretically unified subject matter.

One objection is that many of the arguments that courts and theorists make suggest that they are engaged in a broader enterprise than merely ascertaining the law (a point closely related to the argument, noted in section 3.2, that the typically eclectic approach to evaluating methods of legal interpretation favors the dispute-resolution understanding of legal interpretation). For example, Justice Scalia, the most prominent advocate of textualism, often argued that any other approach would leave judges less constrained and make them more likely to decide cases in accordance with their personal preferences (e.g., 1997, 17–18, 23). And early originalists, including Scalia and Robert Bork, used similar kinds of arguments to advocate originalism (Bork 1971, 7; Scalia, 1989, 862–63).

In the influential textualist and originalist movements, however, there has been a discernible trend away from arguments about restraining judges and toward arguments that textualism and originalism accurately identify the content of the law. Berman (2018, 1340–44) identifies this trend in originalist scholarship. (See also Whittington 2004, 608–09.) As Randy Barnett puts it, “the original meaning of the text provides the law that legal decision-makers are bound by” (Barnett 2013, 417). See, e.g., Calabresi and Prakash 1994, 552; Bork, 1990, 5, 144. Similarly, textualists seem to be gravitating towards the idea that “the text is the law.” Scalia 1997, 22; Scalia and Garner 2012, 383, 397–98; Easterbrook, 2017, 82. As Berman (2018, 1343 n. 60) points out, however, Scalia was not consistent in this regard. See Scalia and Garner 2012, xxviii–xxix, 22, 364–66, 394–96.

On the other hand, as noted, prominent new originalists insist that the term “constitutional interpretation” should be used for identifying the meaning of the constitutional text. As they officially draw the interpretation/construction distinction, however, it contains no stage at which a court ascertains the content of the law; when a court is not interpreting, it is engaged in constitutional construction, which is supposed to be a creative and political process of constructing meaning (Barnett 2013, 619; 1999, 645–46; Whittington 1999a, 7). See section 3. A charitable reading of the new originalists might therefore take them to assume that a provision’s contribution is constituted by the meaning of the text or simply to equate a provision’s contribution with “the meaning of the text.” In that case, the new originalists may be understood, despite their rhetoric, as taking legal interpretation to seek a provision’s contribution.[12] (In addition, as we will see in section 4.2, what the new originalists’ take to be the meaning of the text – “public meaning” – is probably best understood as not a kind of linguistic meaning at all.)

Resistance to understanding legal interpretation as the search for a provision’s contribution to the content of the law may be due in some quarters to a tacit assumption that there is no clear line between searching for a provision’s contribution to the law and creating legal norms or finding ways of resolving disputes when there is no applicable first-order law. Although many lawyers and judges seem to be attracted to some version of this assumption, it’s not entirely clear how to make sense of it. On the face of it, the factors and decisions relevant to ascertaining the content of the law are very different from those relevant to fashioning legal norms or to deciding how to resolve disputes not controlled by legal norms.

One possibility is that lawyers and judges have a tendency, encouraged by early 20th century movements like logical empiricism and American legal realism, to confuse uncertainty with indeterminacy. (See the entry on logical empiricism.) There is often uncertainty about how a provision contributes to the content of the law. Any interesting legal interpretation begins from such uncertainty. If one confuses such uncertainty with indeterminacy, then one will conclude that legal interpretation includes cases in which it is indeterminate how the relevant provisions contribute to the content of the law – and therefore that legal interpretation must not be limited to ascertaining the content of the law.

A related point is that much legal interpretation seems to involve value judgments. If one assumes a metaphysics of law according to which the content of the law cannot depend on such value judgments – as some legal theorists do – then one will think that legal interpretation must not be merely a search for provisions’ contributions to the law.

These issues cannot be pursued further here. The discussion in sections 3 and 4 of different substantive theories of legal interpretation will not assume a particular view of legal interpretation’s constitutive aim. Section 5 develops the point that the plausibility of particular substantive theories, and the aptness of arguments for and against them, depends on legal interpretation’s constitutive aim.

3. Overview of Methods of Legal Interpretation

This section provides a brief overview of several well-known methods of legal interpretation. The goal is to introduce readers to standard formulations, not to offer in-depth analysis of what the methods actually come to. The section therefore sketches the way in which proponents typically gloss their methods, without attempting to look behind these characterizations.


Textualists give priority in statutory and constitutional interpretation to the relevant texts.[13] Textualism is typically formulated in opposition to intentionalism or purposivism, as it rejects the search for legislative intentions or more general statutory purposes – at least to the extent that they are not enacted in the text. If the meaning of a text is taken to be clear, textualists reject the appeal to other sources to modify or depart from that meaning, even when the meaning of the text seems to be in tension with apparent legislative purposes. (Eskridge 1990, 686; Scalia 1997, 17–23; Manning 2001, 7, 17; 2006, 92–93, 110–11). A prominent feature of contemporary textualism is a rejection of appeals to legislative history, which textualists regard as unreliable and manipulable (Scalia 1997, 29–37; Scalia and Garner 2012, 376–78; Easterbrook 1990, 448–49; 1994, 65; 2017, 90–91; Manning 2011, 123–24).


Intentionalists maintain that the primary or exclusive role of the interpreter is finding the intentions of the enacting legislature or of the constitutional framers or ratifiers (Bork 1971; Alexander and Prakash 2004; Knapp and Michaels 2005; Fish 2005; 2008; Michaels 2009; Alexander 2013). Although the meaning of the text is an important guide to the relevant intentions, intentionalism contemplates that other evidence of intentions, including legislative history, may override the evidence of the text. The discussion of intentionalism below will distinguish between several kinds of legislative intentions that are frequently conflated in the legal interpretation literature. These distinctions yield several kinds of intentionalism. See below section 4.1.


One important strand of intentionalism has come to be called purposivism. According to the seminal account, interpreters should “decide what purpose ought to be attributed to the statute and to any subordinate provision of it which may be involved” on the assumption that the legislature consisted of “reasonable persons pursuing reasonable purposes reasonably.” (Hart and Sacks 1994, 1374, 1378). This formulation makes clear that the relevant purpose is not a psychological state of any actual person or body, but an “objectified” purpose that is imputed to the provision based on an idealization (though some writers understand purposivism as making an empirical assumption about actual intentions). (On “objectified” intentions, see section 4.1.) For purposivists, the meaning of the words is to be subordinated to, and interpreted in light of, the purpose of the provision.


Originalism comprises the family of theories of constitutional interpretation that give primacy to some aspect of the Constitution at the time it was ratified. This original aspect is variously taken to be the intentions of the framers or ratifiers of the Constitution, the meaning of the text, the way in which the text would have been understood by the ratifiers of the Constitution, or well-established practices at the time.[14] See entry on Constitutionalism. Originalism thus includes both intentionalist and non-intentionalist theories of interpretation. What the various forms of originalism have in common is their taking the correct interpretation of the Constitution to be fixed by a particular feature of the Constitution at the time of ratification. It promotes clarity to frame this core idea in terms of the Constitution’s contribution to the content of the law (though originalists do not always do so): that contribution is fixed by the relevant aspect of the Constitution at the time of ratification and does not change thereafter.

The intentionalist approach to constitutional interpretation, which takes the relevant aspect of the Constitution to be the framers’ or ratifiers’ intentions, flourished for a time in the second half of the 20th century (fading in the 1980s), but, in recent decades, originalists have shifted their focus to original meaning (see Whittington 2013, 379–82; Kesavan and Paulsen 2003, 1134–48). Contemporary originalism tends to focus on “original public meaning,” by which originalists mean, roughly speaking, the way in which reasonable readers of the Constitution would have understood its meaning at the time it was ratified. See section 4.2 below.

New Originalism

A prominent camp of public meaning originalists are the new originalists (Whittington 2004; 2013; Barnett 1999; 2013; Solum 2010; 2013a; 2013b; 2015; see also Goldsworthy 1997).

In addition to the focus on public meaning, as mentioned in the previous section, a characteristic position of the new originalists is an emphasis on – in their vocabulary – a distinction between “constitutional interpretation” and “constitutional construction.” As the new originalists draw this distinction, constitutional interpretation involves ascertaining the “public meaning” of the Constitution at the time it was ratified. (On “public meaning,” see section 4.2.) Constitutional construction, as defined by some of the new originalists, involves constitutional adjudication in cases where the original meaning “runs out,” “fails to provide a unique rule of law,” or does not “dictate a unique application”. Barnett 2013, 619; 1999, 645–46; Whittington 1999a, 7. In such cases, the new originalists think that “an act of creativity beyond interpretation” – “the construction of meaning” – is required. Whittington 1999a, 7. Solum (2010) and Barnett (2011) draw the distinction importantly differently, taking constitutional construction to be the ascertaining of the “legal effect” of a provision, including both its contribution and its application to particular cases (see Berman and Toh 2013 564–70).


Non-originalism and living constitutionalism are terms used for positions that deny that the proper interpretation of the Constitution is fixed at the time of ratification (e.g., Eisgruber 2001; Breyer 2005; Strauss 2010). See entry on Constitutionalism. Aleinikoff 1988 and Eskridge 2005 are examples of non-originalist theories of statutory interpretation.

Notice that it is consistent with some versions of originalism that the correct application of constitutional norms may be different from the way in which the Constitution was originally intended and expected to apply. In one kind of case, the correct application of the Constitution changes over time as a result of changes in circumstances. The commerce clause, for example, specifies that Congress shall have power over “commerce among the several states” (U.S. Constitution, Article I, section 8, clause 3). If the relevant original aspect of the Constitution is the meaning of the words or the framers’ intention about what legal rule to adopt (on such intentions, see section 4.1), then, without any change in constitutional law, changes in the country’s economy may have the effect that types of businesses that were formerly not within the scope of Congress’s power over interstate commerce may now be within the scope of the power. (Greenberg and Litman 1998).

In a second kind of case, original intentions about the application of a provision were based on beliefs now understood to be false. If the relevant original aspect of the Constitution is, say, the rule that the framer’s intended to enact, the correct application of the Constitution will be governed by the best understanding of what falls under that rule, not the original false beliefs. To take a simple example, consider someone who, at the time of ratification, was believed to be ineligible to be president because he was incorrectly believed to have been born in a foreign country and therefore not “a natural born Citizen” (U.S. Constitution Article II, section 1, clause 5). In this case, the way in which the provision was originally understood to apply was incorrect even at the time of ratification (Whittington 2013, 384).

Despite this point, it is common to classify a theory as non-originalist if it allows that the application of the Constitution should be governed by the best available understanding of what falls under broad language of the Constitution – especially when that language includes moral terms. For example, a theory that allows that punishments not considered cruel at the time the Constitution was ratified may violate the eighth amendment because they are in fact cruel would standardly be considered a non-originalist theory. See entry on Constitutionalism, section 9. Such a position is, however, consistent with the Constitution’s contribution to the law’s being fixed by the original linguistic meaning of the text or by certain kinds of original intentions (see Whittington 2004, 610–11). There is thus an anomaly in the use of the originalism and non-originalism labels: positions that meet the definition of originalism given by its own proponents are standardly treated by both sides of the debate as non-originalist (see Eisgruber 2001, 27).

Because non-originalism is simply defined as the denial of originalism, it does not pick out a distinctive method of interpretation, but encompasses several different positions. For example, common-law constitutionalism holds that courts develop constitutional law based on a body of precedents and past practices in much the same way that they develop common law (Strauss 1996; 2010; Waluchow 2007). I now turn to several other non-originalist positions – Ronald Dworkin’s view, pluralism, and pragmatism – that also apply to statutory interpretation.

Dworkin’s Law as Integrity

Ronald Dworkin’s influential work yields a distinctive account of legal interpretation. Two points are critical to an understanding of Dworkin’s contribution. First, Dworkin begins from a general theory of creative (as opposed to conversational and scientific) interpretation – one that encompasses, for example, literature, art, and non-legal social practices (1986, 50-51). According to this theory, an interpreter tries to show the object of interpretation in its best light, all things considered, by imposing a point or purpose on it. The best interpretation of an object is the one that makes it the best of its type or genre that it can be. (Dworkin 1986, chapter 2). Dworkin uses the term constructive interpretation for this distinctive type of interpretation (Dworkin, 1986, 52).

Second, Dworkin’s law as integrity theory is primarily a theory of law – of how the content of the law is determined (metaphysically) – rather than a theory of legal interpretation. (See the entry on legal interpretivism.) According to law as integrity, the content of the law is constituted by the best constructive interpretation of the legal system (as well as more specific consequences that follow from those principles) (Dworkin 1986, chap. 7). Thus, Dworkinian constructive interpretation figures centrally in his account of what determines the content of the law. Dworkin further argues that the best interpretation of the legal system is the set of principles that best fits and justifies the legal practices, including constitutional provisions, statutes, regulations, and judicial decisions (1986, chaps. 4–10). And he offers a well-known account of the dimensions of fit and justification (1986, especially chapter 7).

Thus, despite the importance of interpretation in Dworkin’s work, his focus is on the theory of law, not on legal interpretation as it is understood here. He seems to take for granted that there is little or no space between a theory of law and a theory of legal interpretation. (On the issue of how such theories may come apart, see section 5.2.) Consequently, he assumes that, if he is right that the content of the law is constitutively determined by constructive interpretation, then the best way to ascertain a provision’s contribution is to ask which principles best fit and justify the enactment or ratification of the provision.

Dworkin’s work has inspired other theories of constitutional interpretation. A notable example is Sager’s (2004) justice-seeking theory of constitutional interpretation.


Judges, lawyers, and legal academics are commonly pluralists, relying on many different kinds of sources, methods, and modes of reasoning, including, for example, textual analysis, purposive reasoning, consideration of historical sources, precedent-based reasoning, forward-looking assessment of consequences, and appeals to moral values such as fairness, democracy, and rule of law (e.g., Fallon 1987; Eskridge and Frickey 1990; Breyer 2005; see Berman 2018, 1341–42).

Philip Bobbitt, the best-known pluralist theorist of constitutional interpretation, distinguished six modalities of constitutional argumentation. These include, for example, structural, ethical, and prudential argumentative modalities. (Bobbitt 1982; 1991). Bobbitt’s work is neither merely descriptive of existing practice, nor based on a larger underlying theory, e.g., of what determines the content of the law. Instead, Bobbitt takes constitutional practices generally to legitimate the use of the different modalities, though in some instances he offers criticisms of existing practices (Bobbitt 1982; 1991).

Pluralism is probably the approach to interpretation employed by a majority of practitioners and legal academics (though often not under that name). (See Berman 2011, 413–414; Griffin 1994, 1758–61.) (It is more difficult to say whether it is the most commonly endorsed approach among scholars who explicitly theorize about statutory and constitutional interpretation.) [15]

An obvious question for pluralism is how to resolve conflicts between different interpretive sources and methods. For the most part, pluralist theorists have not tried to give a rigorous answer to this question (Berman 2011, 414; Griffin 1994, 1764–65; but see Berman 2018).


Pragmatism is most prominently associated with Judge Richard Posner (Posner 1998; 2003; 2008).[16] The basic idea is to resolve cases in the way that produces the best results. Constitutional provisions, statutes, judicial decisions, and the like are relevant only to the extent that paying attention to them will yield better results. According to Posner, pragmatism seeks “the best decision having in mind present and future needs, and so does not regard the maintenance of consistency with past decisions as an end in itself, but only as a means for bringing about the best results in the present case” (Posner 1998, 238).

Although the pragmatist judge will take into account authoritative texts, he or she does not regard them as binding, but merely as factors that are relevant to what will produce the best results. Given this emphasis on producing the best results going forward, pragmatism gives more weight to empirical matters, including both the specific facts of the controversy and empirical – especially economic – theory than to the authoritative texts (Posner 1998, 238–241). Pragmatism’s attitude towards legal rights and duties thus bears comparison with consequentialist approaches to moral rights and duties. (See the entry on consequentialism.)

Pragmatism as I have explicated the position is almost never endorsed by judicial opinions and has few advocates among theorists of legal interpretation, though, as Berman (2011, 415) notes, some pluralists who emphasize the importance of results, classify themselves as pragmatists (e.g., Eskridge and Frickey 1990).

This chapter will focus on a few of the positions sketched above, especially textualism, intentionalism, purposivism, and original public meaning originalism. One reason for this focus is that the debate between textualism and intentionalism or purposivism has dominated recent theoretical discussion in the statutory field. And, in the constitutional field, originalism has set the terms of debate. (As explained below, original intent originalism will be included in the discussion of intentionalism and public meaning originalism will be included in the discussion of textualism.) Space constraints do not permit in-depth exploration of all of the positions in the field, and the focus adopted here provides a natural and topical way of introducing many of the fundamental issues concerning legal interpretation.

4. Theories of Legal Interpretation

In recent years, textualism has taken center stage in discussions of legal interpretation. (As the term is used here, it includes both textualism in statutory interpretation and “public meaning” originalism in constitutional interpretation. (See section 4.2.) There is a lively debate between textualism on the one hand and intentionalism and purposivism on the other, including a debate about how and whether the opposing positions differ (see, e.g., Molot 2006; Manning 2006; 2011; Nelson 2005). This section examines intentionalism (including purposivism) and textualism more closely. It introduces several distinctions necessary to get clear about what the positions involve and raises important problems for the positions.

4.1. Intentionalism and Purposivism

Intentionalists give primacy to the intentions of lawmakers (the legislature in the case of statutory law or framers or ratifiers in the case of constitutional law).

According to these theorists, interpreters should effectuate the lawmakers’ intentions even when they conflict with the meaning of the text. Accordingly, the interpreter should consult evidence of the relevant intentions other than the text.

Legislative intent is probably the most common factor cited by courts in statutory interpretation, and the original intent approach to constitutional interpretation flourished for a time in the second half of the 20th century (fading in the 1980s). The importance of legislative intent in statutory interpretation and of original intent in constitutional interpretation is often thought to follow from the demands of democracy. A familiar democratic idea, for example, is that courts should faithfully carry out the intentions of the people’s chosen representatives. Though initially appealing, intentionalism has been subjected to a battery of important criticisms.

4.1.1 Types of Legislative Intentions

In the literature on legal interpretation, an important three-way distinction is made between 1) actual, or subjective, intention; 2) conventional, or presumed, intention; and 3) objectified intention.

An actual intention is a real psychological state of the relevant body. A conventional intention, by contrast, is a rationale treated as if it were the intention of the relevant body regardless of psychological reality. For example, a court might treat as the legislature’s intention a rationale explicitly offered for a statute by its sponsors or other legislative leaders in reports of legislative committees, floor debates, or the like. Finally, an objectified intention is the intention that a reasonable person would attribute to the legislature under specified conditions. Since intentions are mental items, and conventional and objectified intentions are not – a body can have such “intentions” despite the absence of any corresponding mental state – conventional and objectified intentions are not genuine intentions at all.

This actual/conventional/objectified distinction concerns the metaphysical status of the intention. A second distinction, not generally recognized in the literature, involves the content of the intention. A lawmaking body may have many intentions with different contents with respect to one provision. A minimal legislative intention is an intention to enact legislation by voting for a particular bill. A semantic intention is an intention that concerns semantic matters, such as an intention to use particular words with particular meanings in a given combination. A communicative intention is an intention, by uttering specific words, to communicate a particular message at a relatively granular level such as that of individual sentences. A legal intention is an intention to create a particular legal norm. An application intention is an intention that a particular type of entity or situation be covered by or excluded by a legal standard. A policy intention is an intention to achieve some policy goal, for example to stimulate the economy. An interpretive intention is an intention concerning what method of interpretation should be used (see Bassham 1992, 29).

Discussions of legislative intentions often fail to distinguish between these different kinds of intentions. It is especially common to conflate legal, application, and communicative intentions. A legislature might intend a legal rule that requires (all and only) persons with contagious diseases to be quarantined for two weeks (a legal intention). The legislature might also intend that a particular disease that is in fact not contagious, e.g., psoriasis, be included within the quarantine (an application intention). These two intentions are in conflict with each other, so it is important for an intentionalist to be clear about which one is the relevant one. Similarly, a lawmaker may intend to use a particular sentence to communicate a particular content in the service of creating a complex legal norm, not recognizing that the intended communication is ill-suited to accomplish the legal intention (Greenberg 2011a, 241–50). One might think that it would require carelessness to make a mistake about whether a particular communicative content is well-chosen to effectuate a given legal intention, but in complex statutes, the way in which information conveyed sentence by sentence relates to the creation of an intended legal norm is not straightforward (see citations to recent empirical work below).

The metaphysical-status and content distinctions cut across each other. In order to specify the relevant intention, we therefore need to specify both dimensions. For example, we might be interested in actual communicative intentions, conventional legal intentions, or objectified legal intentions. Unfortunately, theorists tend to write simply of “legislative intent.” Traditional intentionalists are probably best understood as concerned with actual intentions, but it is less clear where they stand with respect to the second distinction.

4.1.2 Problems with Legislative Intentions

Appeals to actual legislative intentions in statutory and constitutional interpretation have been powerfully criticized on several fronts – metaphysical, existential, and epistemic.[17]

The metaphysical problem concerns what would constitute a collective intention of the framers or ratifiers in the case of a constitution or of a multimember and bipartite or tripartite legislature under the complex, competitive, and disunified conditions typical of contemporary legislatures.

Even if we understood what would constitute the intention of a legislature (or of a constitution’s framers or ratifiers), we face the existential problem: do the relevant bodies in fact typically have collective intentions – and ones that are precise and detailed enough to be helpful in resolving difficult questions of legal interpretation?

Finally, the epistemic problem is how such intentions could be reliably identified if they existed. Space does not permit a thorough discussion of these problems with actual legislative intentions. Instead, the flavor of the difficulties will be briefly sketched.

It is plausible that groups, such as families, can have genuine intentions, at least when the groups are relatively small, cohesive, and cooperative. In the circumstances of contemporary multi-member bicameral legislatures, however, there are many problems. To begin with, it is unclear what constitutes the relevant group. In the case of the U.S. Constitution, is it a group composed of the members of the state conventions that ratified the Constitution? Or, more plausibly, the group composed of the state conventions, each of which may have its own collective intention? What about the delegates to the Constitutional Convention?

In the case of Congress or state legislatures, is the relevant collective intention that of both houses and the president or governor who signs the legislation? Or is the relevant group comprised only of those in the majority who voted for (or signed) the bill? Or is the collective intention constituted by the intentions of pivotal political actors who occupy veto gates in the legislative process? (see McNollgast 1992; 1994). What about statutes that are enacted piecemeal by different legislatures over time? Suppose, for example, that a later legislature amends a small part of a complex statute. In such a case, in interpreting the complex statute, including the amendment, is the relevant intention that of a collective comprising both the original legislature that enacted most of the existing statute and the later legislature that passed the amendment? (See, e.g., Texas v. United States.)

Even more pressing, when, as is often the case, the relevant members of a legislature have extremely different and often competing attitudes, what makes it the case that a particular intention is the collective intention of the group? Even among members who vote for the bill, there will typically be a great deal of disagreement about, for example, the intended legal effect. (For simplicity, let’s suppose that what matters is only the legislature’s legal intentions, not its communicative or application intentions.)

To take a concrete example, in United Steelworkers of America v. Weber, the Supreme Court faced the question whether employers could voluntarily adopt affirmative action programs under Title VII of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, which specified that employers may not “discriminate … because of … race” in hiring. Some of the legislators who voted for the Civil Rights Act may have intended to establish a legal rule banning only invidious discrimination; others may have intended to establish a legal rule banning any use of race. Many members may have had little or no intention with respect to legal effect – they may have voted for the bill for irrelevant motives without giving much thought to what legal effect it would produce. Granting that groups can have collective intentions in some circumstances, how plausible is it that the Congress and President in fact had a collective intention on the crucial issue in this case?

In criticizing intentionalism, contemporary textualists have emphasized the messiness and opacity of the legislative process, and the importance of compromise in that process (see Manning 2001, 71–78; 2003, 2408–19; Easterbrook 1983, 540–41; 1988, 63–64; 1990, 444–48; 1994, 68; 2010, 916, 922; 2012, xxii; Scalia and Garner 2012, 392–93). Individual legislators who originally propose legislation may have a specific legal intention – to enact a particular legal rule. But, in order to secure passage of the legislation, compromises have to be made. Legislative bargains are often verbal rather than substantive – that is, they often take the form of adding particular words to the legislation without reaching agreement on the net effect of the change in wording. Indeed, compromises are often successful precisely because controversial issues are left opaque and unresolved. In the case of complex and controversial legislation, there may be no reason to think that there is a coherent and discoverable legal intention. (That’s not to say that there isn’t a semantic intention – to use these words – or a minimal intention – to modify the law by passing this bill.) Even setting aside the metaphysical question of what would constitute a collective intention in the relevant circumstances, it is often extremely implausible that a collective legal intention exists and that, if it did, courts could reliably identify it.

It is even less likely that the legislature has communicative intentions with respect to most provisions that generate interpretive controversies. Recall that a communicative intention is an intention to communicate a particular message by uttering specific words. Most members of the legislature will not have read a typical provision and, in statutes of any complexity, lack the technical skill to understand what message would need to be communicated in order to create a particular legal norm or achieve a specific policy goal. (For recent empirical work suggesting that members of the legislature rarely engage with the details of the statutory text and, even if they did, would not be capable of working out whether the text is well calculated to effect their legal or policy intentions, see Bressman and Gluck 2013; 2014.) Thus, even if members of the legislature had relevant legal intentions with respect to provisions that are at the center of interpretive disputes, it is far-fetched to take them to have corresponding communicative intentions.

In response to skeptics who make these kinds of points – for example, that many individual legislators do not have the relevant intentions, and that, even when they do, the intentions of individual legislators conflict with each other – it is sometimes objected that individual legislators’ intentions are not the issue. Despite difficulties regarding individual intentions, the legislature as an institution may still have a collective intention.

It is plausible that collective intentions are not mere aggregations of individual intentions. But pointing out the mere possibility that a collective intention exists, despite deep conflict between – and in many cases an absence of – individual intentions, does not take us very far.

According to the most developed proposal, because the legislature has a standing secondary intention “to stand ready to change the law when there is good reason to do so,” which all legislators share, when the legislature enacts a bill, the legislature has a primary legal intention whose content is the content of the bill, regardless of the intentions of individual legislators (Ekins and Goldsworthy 2014, 65; Ekins 2012, 56–58, 224). The proposal faces an uphill battle to establish the psychological reality of its central claim. The proposal runs into further difficulty by explicating the “content of the bill” as what the speaker intended to communicate (which may go well beyond the literal meaning of the text) (Ekins 2012, chap. 7; Ekins and Goldsworthy 2014, 66–67).[18] The proposal therefore seems to address worries about the existence of collective legislative intentions by appealing to a collective legislative intention. In addition, in the case of contemporary legislation, it is typical that a form of words is chosen as a compromise in order to enable a bill to pass without agreement on what that form of words is to communicate (or what legal norm it is to create). See section 4.2. So it is question begging to assume the existence of the crucial communicative intention that is supposed to constitute the content of the text and, in turn, the legislature’s primary intention. When the verbal formulation constitutes the compromise, it is of no help to say that “the nature of [legislators’] compromise may be discernible from the text and publicly available contextual and purposive evidence” (Ekins and Goldsworthy 2014, 66).

4.1.3 The Relevance of Different Kinds of Legislative Intentions

There is another type of problem with the suggestion about collective intention. Suppose that a philosopher develops an account of what constitutes the collective intention of a large, diverse group whose members’ attitudes conflict with each other. According to this account, let’s further suppose, the collective intention of such a group depends in a complex way on how the group would behave in various counterfactual circumstances. (One complication is that it might be that what constitutes the collective intention of a group is relative to the purposes for which the question is asked. But let’s set this complication aside for the sake of argument.) Even if the philosopher’s account is a correct account of the nature of group minds, it is a further question whether and to what extent legal interpretation should care about the intentions specified by such an account. That question cannot be resolved by the philosophy of mind, for the answer depends on distinctively legal concerns, and the details of the putative account of collective intentions would obviously matter.

The issue concerns not the nature, existence, or ascertainment of the intentions, but to what extent they should make a difference in legal interpretation. Suppose that, according to the hypothetical philosophical account of group minds, the legislature that enacted a particular provision had a collective intention that supports an interpretation not discernible from the words of the provision. Allowing such a legislative intention to control the provision’s interpretation raises serious questions of democracy, rule of law, and fairness. For example, rule of law values require that legal rules be readily publicly available. Democratic values militate against the relevance of legislative intentions that were not expressed in the bills voted on by the legislature. (This kind of point is closely related to familiar textualist arguments against the use of legislative history (see section 4.2).

This issue is really an aspect of a larger issue about the relevance of different kinds of legislative intentions in light of what legal interpretation seeks. For example, if legal interpretation seeks the linguistic meaning of the relevant legal texts, then legal, as opposed to semantic and communicative, intentions will have little or no relevance. The linguistic meaning of a text does not depend on what legal rules people intend to create by adopting the text.[19] Similarly, application intentions are only weak evidence of linguistic meaning. By contrast, for example, communicative intentions are highly relevant to pragmatically conveyed content such as speaker meaning (see section 4.2 and entries on Pragmatics; Implicature; Paul Grice).

On the other hand, if legal interpretation seeks a provision’s contribution to the content of the law, then the relevance of different legislative intentions depends on the bearing of those intentions on the content of the law. Does the content of the law depend on what legal rule the legislature actually intended? Or on what legal rule a reasonable person under specified circumstances would have taken a hypothetical coherent lawmaker to have intended to create by uttering the words of the provision? Or, perhaps, on what the legislature asserted or said? Normative arguments might be relevant at this juncture. For example, there may be reasons of democracy why legal intentions have an important bearing on the content of the law only if they are publicly available in certain authoritative sources.

One variation on actual legislative intention is counterfactual intention (see Posner 1986). To say that the legislature had a particular counterfactual intention is to say that, if the legislature had considered the relevant issue, it would have had the intention in question. The metaphysical, existential, and epistemic problems are especially severe for counterfactual intentions. Moreover, because the focus is on what the legislature would have intended with respect to the specific issue before the court, counterfactual intentions tend to be understood as counterfactual application intentions rather than as counterfactual legal or communicative intentions. And the relevance of application intentions to legal interpretation is especially problematic. (see Greenberg and Litman 1998; Berman 2007, 385; 2009, 28; McConnell 1997, 1284; Whittington 2013, 382–83).

Conventional intentions exist and can be identified when the relevant sources, such as committee reports, floor debates, and the like, identify rationales for the relevant legislation. Of course, when the sources identify conflicting rationales, the existence of conventional intentions becomes problematic. More fundamentally, however, there are well-known objections to treating conventional intentions as consequential. As critics of the use of legislative history have emphasized, it is relatively easy for legislators to insert ostensible purposes for legislation into the legislative history (see Scalia 1997, 29–37; Scalia and Garner 2012, 376–78; Easterbrook 1990, 448–49; 1994, 65). Such rationales are often offered with extraneous motives, such as to defeat the legislation by making its purposes seem unacceptably broad or to increase the chances of passage by making the purposes seem unexceptionable. There is no reason in general to take such proffered rationales as representative of the attitudes of members of the legislature, and they are not part of what is voted on by the legislature. Probably for this kind of reason, conventional intentions are assigned a relatively minor role by most contemporary theorists of legal interpretation. For a critique of reliance on conventional intentions, see Eskridge 1994, 18–21.

4.1.4 Objectified Intentions and Purposivism

Objectified intentions are imputed to the legislature by making various, typically counterfactual, assumptions about the audience and the author of the legislation. For example, we might ask what legal norm a reasonable person would have taken a coherent and reasonable lawmaker to have intended to create by enacting the words of a statutory provision.

Because there are many possible objectified intentions of the legislature depending on what idealizing assumptions are made, any specific set of assumptions needs defense. Talk of objectified intentions is, in fact, misleading; the methodology of asking what a reasonable member of the audience would attribute, given certain stipulations, is really just a way of constructing a content – whether that content is taken to be an intention, a provision’s contribution to the content of the law, a linguistic content, or something else.

Purposivism is best understood as a form of intentionalism that is concerned with objectified intentions. Given the closeness in meaning of the terms intentions and purposes, it is confusing that intentionalism and purposivism are frequently distinguished in the legal interpretation literature. The term intentionalism tends to be used for positions that focus on relatively specific communicative, application, or legal intentions of the legislature that enacted the statute, while purposivism is reserved for positions that give central place to more general legal or policy purposes that might reasonably be attributed to the statute.

According to the seminal account of purposivism, interpreters should “decide what purpose ought to be attributed to the statute and to any subordinate provision of it which may be involved” on the assumption that the statute consisted of “reasonable persons pursuing reasonable purposes reasonably” (Hart and Sacks 1994, 1374, 1378). This formulation makes clear that the relevant purpose is not that of any actual person or body, but a purpose that is imputed based on an idealization. In addition, the meaning of the words is to be subordinated to the objectified purpose: purposivists “[i]nterpret the words of the statute immediately in question so as to carry out the purpose” as well as possible (Hart and Sacks 1994, 1374). Barak (2005, chaps. 6–8) develops a more complex position that gives a role to both actual and objectified purpose.

As noted, the relevant type of purpose seems to be legal or even policy, certainly not semantic or communicative (see Eskridge 1993, 1744–45; 1994, 29; Hart and Sacks 1994, 148; Barak 2005; Dickerson 1975, 88–90; Manning 2006; Scalia and Garner 2012, 35–39). The famous purposivist case of Church of the Holy Trinity illustrates this point. The case concerned whether a statute that made it unlawful to facilitate the immigration of a foreigner under a pre-existing contract to perform “labor or service of any kind” applied to a church’s attempt to hire an English minister. The Supreme Court relied on evidence outside of the text of the statute to find that the purpose of the statute was limited to regulating the immigration of manual laborers, though the Court conceded that the meaning of the words covered the work of a clergyman.

Writers have criticized purposivism on the ground that the assumption that the legislature consists of reasonable people with reasonable purposes is false (Posner 1985, 288–89). The assumption is best understood not as an empirical one, however, but as an idealizing stipulation used to construct a content. As noted, objectified intentions are not genuine intentions at all. Purposivism, like any theory of legal interpretation that appeals to constructed contents based on counterfactual assumptions, faces challenges both to specify the relevant assumptions in a way that yields a unique content and, more fundamentally, to explain why the content thus constructed should be given primacy in legal interpretation (see further discussion in section 4.2). For example, the simple democratic rationale that may seem to support an appeal to actual intentions – that courts should carry out the intentions of the elected representatives of the people – does not apply to objectified intentions, as they are not in fact the intentions of the legislature.

4.1.5 Linguistically Motivated Intentionalism

Traditional forms of intentionalism were motivated by democratic ideas, including especially the idea that the courts should be faithful agents of the legislature. A relatively recent development is the emergence of a strong form of intentionalism driven by linguistic arguments.

One popular argument starts from the premise that sounds or marks produced without intentions are meaningless. Proponents of this argument take this premise to imply that a text means whatever the author intends it to mean. From this proposition, they conclude that legal interpretation must seek the intention of the legislature. In light of the claim that a text means whatever the author intends, the relevant intention is best understood as a communicative intention, and some of the theorists in this camp are explicit on this point. Also, given the nature of the argument, the relevant intentions must be actual intentions. Proponents of this kind of intentionalism often tend to be surprisingly unconcerned about whether the relevant communicative intentions exist and, if so, how they could be ascertained.[20]

Even if we grant for the sake of argument the not-at-all-obvious premise that marks without intentions are meaningless, the proposition that a text means whatever the author intends does not follow (see Sinnott-Armstrong 2005; Berman 2009, 47-49) – and it is false. Given the premise, the marks “the cat is on the mat” would have no meaning unless their maker produced them intentionally. So, let’s assume that an author produces those marks intentionally – specifically, with the intention of using those words in English – and, in addition, intends the words to mean that dogs are carnivorous. Regardless of the latter intention, the sentence “the cat is on the mat” does not mean that dogs are carnivorous, though (by hypothesis) the speaker, in uttering it, means that dogs are carnivorous.

The argument runs roughshod over the distinction between word meaning and speaker meaning. The proponents of the argument deny the existence of word meaning, claiming, in effect, that the only meaning is speaker meaning. But their argument does not support the denial, and much of what speakers mean (and successfully communicate) would not be possible if it were not for word meaning.[21] You could not use the words, “children under 11 may enter free” to mean that children 11 and over must pay for admission if the words did not have a stable conventional meaning in English.

There is a more fundamental and more interesting problem with the position – one that is endemic to much literature on legal interpretation. The position moves without argument from a claim about linguistic meaning to a conclusion about the correct method of legal interpretation. Even if it were true that a text meant whatever the speaker meant or intended to communicate, it would not follow that legal interpretation should seek the speaker’s communicative intention. Substantive argument is needed to derive claims about legal interpretation from claims about language and communication. As set out above, there are powerful reasons for thinking that legal interpretation seeks at least a provision’s contribution to the content of the law. (Even if it seeks the overall best resolution of disputes, it must still ascertain a provision’s contribution, given the importance of the law to the resolution of disputes.) A provision’s contribution to the content of the law may be something other than its linguistic meaning, such as the objectified legal intention, the best justification for the enactment of the provision, or a complex function of multiple factors.[22] And there are strong reasons for rejecting the general proposition that the legal impact of an action is constituted by the actor’s communicative intention (see Greenberg 2011a).

4.2 Textualism

In recent decades, in part in reaction to skepticism about actual legislative intentions, theorists of both statutory and constitutional interpretation have moved away from accounts that focus on intentions. One important trend has been toward textualism in statutory interpretation and “public meaning” originalism in constitutional interpretation. (Textualism here will be used to encompass public meaning originalism, including the position of the so-called new originalists.[23])

The core idea of textualism is that the text prevails over other factors. Traditional textualism focused on “plain meaning” and held that, if the plain meaning is clear, a court should not consult other indications of legislative intent. This older textualism saw itself as seeking legislative intent, but took the position that a clear text is the best evidence of that intent.

The focus here will be on a more recently influential form of textualism, sometimes called new textualism. New textualists are skeptical about the existence of coherent and discoverable legislative intentions. For reasons for such skepticism, see section 4.1. They emphasize, not plain meaning, but a reasonable reading of the text in context.

Textualism’s emphasis on the text has to be understood as an emphasis on the linguistic meaning of the text, rather than the text understood as marks on a page. Within linguistic meaning, there are two basic types: semantic content and pragmatically conveyed content (or pragmatic content, for short). See entry on Pragmatics. There is a lively debate in philosophy of language and linguistics over how exactly to draw the line between semantics and pragmatics. Roughly speaking, however, semantic content is what is conventionally encoded in the words, and pragmatic content is what a speaker or author, by an utterance of words on a particular occasion in a particular context, manages to convey beyond, or different from, the semantic content of the words.[24] Central to pragmatic content are the communicative intentions of the speaker. To take a well-known type of example, when one says to a new acquaintance at a dinner party, “I have three children,” one likely intends to communicate that one has exactly three children and the hearer will likely recognize that intention, though the literal meaning of the words is that one has at least three children. This chapter uses “linguistic content” to encompass both semantic content and pragmatic content.

On the face of it, pragmatic content seems a poor candidate for what textualists are after, given their skepticism about legislative intentions (though we will see that much of what they say points toward pragmatic content nevertheless).

Given textualism’s emphasis on text and objective meaning, it would be natural to understand it as seeking semantic content.[25] This cannot be the right understanding of contemporary textualism, however. Leading textualists explicitly reject literal meaning (a rough synonym for semantic content), which they associate with the more traditional “plain meaning” textualism. They insist that textualism seeks a reasonable reading in context, not a literal one (Scalia 1997, 23–24; Easterbrook 1994, 64, 67; Manning 2001, 108–15; 2003, 2457–58; 2006, 79–81; see also Whittington 1999a, 176–77). As Justice Scalia puts it: “A text should not be construed strictly…; it should be construed reasonably, to contain all that it fairly means” (Scalia 1997, 23).

At first blush, the idea of a reasonable reading seems hard to quarrel with. On closer examination, however, it raises a host of problems largely unrecognized by textualists. To begin with, what is reasonable depends on what one seeks and what one knows or believes.

In ordinary communication, in interpreting a note from one’s spouse or an instruction manual, say, the goal is normally to identify what the speaker or author meant or intended to communicate, as opposed, for example, to what the words literally mean or what a reasonable person with certain assumptions would take the speaker to have intended to communicate. In other words, one is successful in interpreting in ordinary communication just to the extent that one accurately recovers what the speaker intended to communicate.[26] A reasonable interpretation in a conversational setting is therefore one that is reasonably calculated to recover the speaker’s communicative intentions given the audience’s beliefs about the speaker and the situation. On the other hand, if one is engaged in a different enterprise – playing a word game, trying to decide whether a witness committed perjury (see Bronston v. United States), interpreting a poem, or working out the impact on the law of the enactment of a provision – what is reasonable might be quite different. Textualists do not clearly address what a reasonable reader is supposed to be seeking in part because they have not recognized the issue, saying things that point in different directions.

Some examples that textualists offer suggest that they are assuming the model of ordinary communication. In the well-known case of Smith v. United States, Smith had offered to trade a gun for cocaine. The Supreme Court divided over the question whether he was properly sentenced under a statute that provides for increased penalties if the defendant “uses … a firearm” in a drug-trafficking or violent crime. In a much-quoted dissenting opinion, Justice Scalia pointed out that “When someone asks ‘Do you use a cane?’ he is not inquiring whether you have your grandfather’s silver handled walking stick on display in the hall; he wants to know whether you walk with a cane” (508 U.S. 223, 242; see Manning 2003, 2460). Properly understood, the example illustrates that, in ordinary conversation, in the imagined situation, the speaker would likely intend to ask whether you walk with a cane. The communication would therefore be successful if the audience correctly identified that intention.[27] Textualists also endorse the use of linguistic canons of interpretation that, properly understood, are rules of thumb for inferring what a speaker likely intended to communicate, as opposed to the literal meaning of the words (e.g., Scalia 1997, 25–26).[28]

Thus, the examples that textualists give involving the interpretation of ordinary communications and their use of certain canons of interpretation suggest that the relevant inquiry is what it would be reasonable to take the speaker to intend to communicate. Indeed, textualists often assert that what words mean is what a reasonable person would take the speaker to mean or to intend to convey – thus confusing word meaning with reasonable inferences about communicative intent (e.g., Scalia and Garner 2012, 16, 56). Similarly, textualists often say that the relevant inquiry is “objectified legal intention,” understood as what a reasonable person, given the context, would take the legislature to have intended.[29]

The notion of what a reasonable person would take the speaker to have intended to communicate is coherent (though what a reasonable person would take the speaker to have intended to communicate is not the meaning of a text or utterance). In the case of legislation, however, by the textualists’ own lights, it is not reasonable to take the legislature to have intended to communicate anything. (For skepticism about legislative intentions, see section 4.1)

A textualist could respond by suggesting that we stipulate fictional assumptions about the speaker or the situation. In this way, we could construct counterfactual-based contents. Plainly, we would get diverse such contents depending on which stipulations we make (see Alexander 2011, 91–93). For example, one might ask what a reasonable person would have taken the speaker’s communicative intention to be if the text of a provision had been uttered by one rational speaker in ordinary conversation with the goal of communicating a message. It is important to note that, as stated, the answer to this question will likely be indeterminate – that is, without more specification of, for example, the reasonable person’s beliefs about the speaker and the conversational context, there will be no fact of the matter as to what the reasonable person would have taken the speaker’s intention to be. Moreover, fleshing out the counterfactual situation in a specific way, rather than indefinitely many others, needs to be justified. Why should legal interpretation be concerned with what a reasonable person would take a speaker to intend under this particular set of fictional assumptions? (See Greenberg 2020, 116–124, for extended discussion of the options available to textualism and difficulties with those options.)

5. How to Argue for and Evaluate Theories of Legal Interpretation

5.1 Theories of Legal Interpretation and Theories of Law

In the literature on legal interpretation, theorists offer various arguments in favor of their preferred theories of legal interpretation. As noted, normative arguments, appealing to moral values such as democracy, fairness, and the rule of law, are the most common. For example, both textualists and intentionalists offer arguments based on democracy (see Eskridge 1994, 13; Eskridge and Frickey 1990, 326; Barak 2005, 248; Alexander 2013, 540; Easterbrook 1994, 63). According to Justice Scalia, “it is simply incompatible with democratic government, or indeed, even with fair government, to have the meaning of a law determined by what the lawgiver meant, rather than by what the lawgiver promulgated.” (Scalia 1997, 17.)

Typical linguistic arguments defend a particular approach to legal interpretation by appealing to claims about how language or communication works. For example, in section 3, we saw that a recent form of intentionalism is defended on the ground that any linguistic text must mean whatever its author intends it to mean. And theorists influenced by philosophy of language have argued that the proper approach to legal interpretation is to find the total pragmatically conveyed content of the legal texts, on the ground that that is what linguistic interpretation normally seeks.[30]

Conceptual arguments claim that a particular approach to legal interpretation follows from the concept of interpretation, the concept of law, the concept of authority, or some other relevant concept (e.g., Neale 2012 [Other Internet Resources]; see Berman 2009, 37–68). For example, as noted in section 2, some writers have argued that any approach to a text that does not seek the intentions of the author does not count as interpretation (Fish 2005; Graglia 1992).[31]

Such arguments for particular theories of legal interpretation are typically offered without any account of why these arguments are the relevant ones and often without consideration of other kinds of arguments. What is the appropriate way to choose between competing theories of legal interpretation? What kinds of arguments are relevant? How do we adjudicate between competing arguments if they conflict? It is unusual for theorists to explicitly address the question of how to choose between competing theories of interpretation. For exceptions, see, e.g., Shapiro 2009 chaps. 1, 12–13; Greenberg 2017a; Fallon 1999.

Section 2 made the point that which method of legal interpretation is correct – and which reasons or arguments count in favor of a method – depends on what legal interpretation seeks. To a first approximation, whether a method of legal interpretation is correct depends on whether it reliably yields what legal interpretation seeks. For example, if legal interpretation seeks the best resolution of disputes, then a method of legal interpretation is correct if, and only if, it yields the best resolution of disputes.[32]

We saw that the strongest candidate for what legal interpretation seeks is provisions’ contribution to the content of the law. (As noted, even if legal interpretation seeks the best resolution of disputes, legal interpretation must begin by seeking provisions’ contributions, given plausible assumptions. See section 2.) If that is what legal interpretation seeks, then a method cannot be a good one unless it reliably yields the content of the law.

Let’s use the term legal facts for facts about the content of the law, for example, the fact that, in California, contracts for the sale of land are not valid unless in writing.[33] Legal facts are not among the most basic facts of the universe. They are determined by metaphysically more basic facts, such as facts about what various people and institutions have said and done and decided and, on some views, moral or other normative facts. A theory of law is an account of how the more basic, determining facts determine the legal facts.[34] Different theories of law make different claims about what the determining facts are and how they combine to determine the legal facts.

The most widely held theory of law, at least in law schools, is HLA Hart’s (1994) inclusive positivist theory, and many theorists of legal interpretation profess to accept Hartian positivism (Alexander 2015; Baude and Sachs 2018; Baude 2015, 2364–65; Sachs 2014, 2261; 2015, 825–26; Fallon 2018, 90–91; Goldsworthy 2019). What are its implications for legal interpretation? On Hart’s account, the content of the law is determined at the most fundamental level by the convergent practices of judges and other officials.[35] In Hart’s well-known terminology, judges’ convergent practices and attitudes constitute a rule of recognition that specifies how the content of the law is determined (Hart 1994, 100–10).[36] (For simplicity, I restrict attention to judges.) To illustrate with respect to statutes, if judges (in a particular jurisdiction): (1) regularly treat statutes as contributing to the law in a particular way; (2) are disposed to criticize other judges who fail to do so (or threaten to fail to do so); and (3) regard such criticisms as justified, then the rule of recognition in the jurisdiction is that statutes contribute to the content of the law in that way. (See entry on Legal Positivism.)

In addition to the rule of recognition’s specification of how sources of law contribute to the content of the law at the most fundamental level, legal norms that are themselves validated by the rule of recognition could further specify how sources of law are to contribute to the content of the law.

Thus, if Hart’s theory is true, in order to defend a preferred theory of legal interpretation, a theorist must argue either: 1) that the way in which the theory takes a provision to contribute to the content of the law is incorporated in the rule of recognition because it is treated as correct by a large majority of judges; or 2) that the way in which the theory takes a provision to contribute to the content of the law is validated by a criterion that, in turn, is treated as correct by a large majority of judges.[37] This would be a challenging task. (As these are the only two possibilities that Hart’s account allows, to the extent that there is no consensus on a theory of legal interpretation and no criterion grounded in consensus that validates a particular theory of interpretation, it is indeterminate which theory of interpretation is correct.)[38]

Take the first possibility. There seems to be no consensus among judges about the proper method of legal interpretation. Instead, there is widespread controversy (Hart and Sacks 1994, 1169; Eskridge 1994, 13–47; Eskridge, Frickey & Garret 2007, 689–846; for a few haphazardly chosen examples, see the various methods employed and advocated in the United States Supreme Court’s decisions in Smith, Bond, Yates, Weber, and King v. Burwell). A theorist could try to argue that, at a high level of generality, there is a consensus among judges on the theorist’s preferred method of interpretation, and that the disagreement is in the application of that consensus.

The only kind of consensus among judges, however, is on bland platitudes such as that original meaning matters or legislative intention is important. Such platitudes are too underspecified to yield a uniquely correct application. Which kind of original meaning? Semantic content? Communicative content? “Public meaning”? Exactly how does original meaning matter, and what other factors matter and in what way? Which kind of legislative intention?

The second possibility is a little more promising. It is possible for judges to agree on a criterion (or chain of criteria) that validates a particular method of legal interpretation, yet be unaware that the criterion does so because the application of the criterion is controversial. Thus, for example, a theorist could try to argue that the judges agree on a normative criterion, but they disagree about what that criterion, properly understood, entails. Or a theorist could argue that judges converge on a descriptive criterion, but they have a factual disagreement about what that descriptive criterion entails. Perhaps there is a forgotten custom, validated by the rule of recognition, that specifies (when understood as the rule of recognition requires) that statutes contribute to the law according to their literal meaning, and there are no conflicting norms validated by the rule of recognition. Such possibilities can’t be ruled out a priori, but it is clear that it would be a tall order to show that there is consensus on a criterion that, properly understood, yields a controversial method of interpretation.

In sum, on Hart’s theory of law, it is difficult to defend any controversial theory of legal interpretation.[39] (But see Baude and Sachs 2017; 2018.)

Dworkin’s well-known “law as integrity” theory of law, sketched above, is the most influential alternative to Hart’s account. See section 3. (Dworkin 1986, 225, Ch. 7.) As discussed, Dworkin does not consider the distinction between theory of law and theory of legal interpretation – i.e., between an account of how the content of the law is determined and an account of how to ascertain the content of the law. He assumes that, if his theory of law is true, the proper method of legal interpretation is simply to seek the set of principles that best justify the legal practices.

In principle, however, a proponent of a different theory of legal interpretation, textualism, say, could argue that Dworkin’s theory of law in fact supports textualism. The theorist would have to argue that textualism is the best method of ascertaining the set of principles that best justify the legal practices.

In light of these implications of well-known theories of law for how to defend theories of legal interpretation, it’s worth returning to the kinds of arguments that theorists of legal interpretation in fact offer to support their preferred accounts. As already noted, normative arguments are probably the most common. The typical argument is that a method is supported by a certain value – democracy or fairness, for example – because the method treats sources of law as contributing to the law in the way that that value requires.

It may be that theorists give such arguments simply because they have not carefully considered what legal interpretation seeks. But are such arguments apt – that is, are they an appropriate way of defending a theory of legal interpretation given the assumption that legal interpretation seeks a provision’s contribution to the content of the law?

The fact that a method of legal interpretation treats a provision as contributing to the law in the way that is supported by fairness (say) is an argument in favor of the correctness of that method only if fairness is relevant to the method’s ability to identify a provision’s contribution to the content of the law. But whether fairness is relevant in this way depends on how the content of the law is determined. Thus, whether typical normative arguments are apt depends on how the content of the law is determined. For example, if normative factors play no role in determining the content of the law, then it’s hard to see how the fact that a method of interpretation treats a source as contributing to the law in a way that is fair bears on whether it accurately identifies a provision’s contribution to the content of the law.

Returning to Hartian positivism, normative factors can play a role if, and only if, there is a consensus among judges that does the necessary work (or a consensus on another criterion that picks out those normative factors). If, as seems likely, there is no consensus among judges that does the necessary work, Hart’s theory implies that normative factors do not play a role in determining the content of the law. In that case, the fact that a method of legal interpretation is supported by democracy, fairness, or other values has no bearing on whether it accurately ascertains the content of the law.

Exclusive positivist theories of law, by contrast with inclusive accounts like Hart’s, maintain that normative factors can play no role in determining the content of the law at any level (Raz 1979; 1994; Shapiro 2011, 271–81; Leiter 1998, 535–36; see entry on Legal Positivism). On such accounts, it is clear that normative arguments have no bearing on whether a theory of interpretation is true.

As we saw above, Dworkin’s theory makes normative arguments relevant. But the type of normative argument that it makes relevant is very different from the normative arguments typically offered in favor of theories of legal interpretation. On Dworkin’s theory, the way to show that a method of interpretation accurately identifies how sources, such as statutory and constitutional provisions, contribute to the law is to show that the method yields the principles that best justify the enactment of those provisions. An argument that a method yields the best justification of enactments is, however, very different from the kind of normative argument typically offered in favor of theories of legal interpretation.

One theory of law – really a family of theories – offers a natural explanation of the relevance of the typical normative arguments. Theories in this family hold that legal obligations are constituted by certain genuine normative (or moral) obligations.[40] For example, according to the moral impact theory, the relevant obligations are, roughly speaking, those that obtain in virtue of the actions of legal institutions (Greenberg 2014). At the fundamental level, therefore, what the determinants of the content of the law are – and how they contribute to the content of the law – is determined by all relevant values. Thus, for example, a statute’s contribution to the content of the law is the impact of its enactment, in light of fairness, democracy, and any other relevant values, on our obligations (and rights, permissions, powers, and so on). Consequently, on the moral impact theory, a natural way to argue for a method of interpretation is to argue that the way in which the method of interpretation takes sources to contribute to the content of the law is supported, on balance, by the relevant values.

The moral impact theory thus seems to fit nicely the way in which theorists of legal interpretation employ normative arguments to defend their theories (see Greenberg 2020, 133–34). And, perhaps surprisingly, on many competing theories of law, it may be difficult to defend the aptness of such normative arguments. Of course, the moral impact theory implies that it is not enough to argue, as theorists often do, that a particular democratic or fairness consideration supports a preferred theory of interpretation. What is needed is an argument that the way in which a theory takes sources to contribute to the content of the law is supported, on balance, by all relevant values.

5.2 The Potential for Divergence between Theories of Law and Theories of Legal Interpretation

In the preceding subsection, I relied on the simplifying assumption that, if legal interpretation seeks the content of the law, then whether a method of legal interpretation is correct depends only on whether it treats the determinants of the content of the law as contributing to the content of the law in the way that they in fact do so. On this assumption, there is no gap between a theory of law and a theory of legal interpretation. If the correct theory of law is that the content of the law is determined by, say, the semantic content of the authoritative legal texts, then the best method of legal interpretation is to ascertain the semantic content of the authoritative legal texts.

Depending on how we understand the province of a theory of legal interpretation, it may be important to qualify this straightforward approach in several ways. (See Greenberg 2020, 136–141 for fuller discussion.) To begin with, legal interpretation is sensitive to evidentiary considerations in a way that the theory of law is not. Thus, a theory of legal interpretation may provide guidance as to what kinds of evidence are most reliable. Differently, there may be legal or moral reasons – as opposed to reasons of accuracy – not to permit consulting certain kinds of evidence. For example, it is plausible that, for reasons of democracy and fairness, private diaries of legislators are not appropriate kinds of evidence, even if consulting them would yield more accurate conclusions about the content of the law.

More generally, the theory of legal interpretation may take into account goals other than accurately identifying a provision’s contribution. For example, it is often suggested that courts should adhere to the plain meaning of a provision in order to provide an incentive for good drafting. Improving the drafting of statutory and other provisions may in the long run help legal interpreters to identify provisions’ contributions accurately as well as providing other benefits. In the short run, however, the goal of improving the drafting of legal texts may conflict with the goal of accurately identifying a provision’s contribution. There is an important question to what extent it is appropriate for legal interpretation to pursue the former goal at the expense of the latter. To take a very different kind of example, there may be moral reasons why some kinds of mistakes are worse than others (or why mistakes by certain decision-makers are worse than mistakes by others). Such reasons may support following methods that would minimize the more problematic kinds of mistakes at the expense of overall accuracy.

Another important departure from the straightforward assumption that the correct theory of legal interpretation simply tracks the true theory of law would take into account the abilities and limitations of legal interpreters. Consideration of bounded rationality raises important issues for a theory of legal interpretation. Judges, to take an especially important group, operate with limited time and information and they are subject to human cognitive limitations and biases much discussed in recent literature. See entry on Bounded Rationality. Given these facts, it might be counterproductive for judges to directly aim to treat legal sources as contributing to the law in the way that they in fact contribute. They might do better overall at accurately identifying the way in which sources contribute to the content of the law if they instead followed some kind of relatively simple rule of thumb.[41] Similarly, we might also have special accounts for other participants in the legal system, for example, for legislators, executive officials, and police officers.

It could be debated whether taking into account agents’ abilities and limitations properly belongs in the theory of legal interpretation. It might be, for example, that the proper place to take into account judges’ biases and limitations is the theory of adjudication. Let’s set aside this largely terminological question. Instead, we can distinguish between different degrees and kinds of idealization in the theory of legal interpretation. For example, one type of highly idealized theory asks how a legal interpreter without cognitive or time limitations best ascertains what the law is given the legally and morally permissible evidence (without taking into account values other than accuracy, except for the restriction to permissible evidence). A somewhat less idealized kind of theory asks how agents with specific abilities and limitations would, under real-world conditions, including limited time, do best at accurately identifying provisions’ contributions. Finally, we could ask how a legal interpreter should proceed taking into account not just accuracy, but also the kinds of values illustrated above, such as promoting good drafting.

6. Conclusion

Several competing approaches to legal interpretation, such as intentionalism and textualism, are familiar to lawyers and legal theorists. Despite a large literature, there is a great deal of unclarity about what these approaches amount to – that is, about precisely which methods they recommend. Understanding can be greatly improved by attention to how language and meaning work and by explication of important distinctions, such as those between different types of intentions.

But there is a more fundamental question that has to be addressed in order to make progress on the question of which method of legal interpretation is correct. The question is what legal interpretation, by its nature, seeks. Although this question is not often explicitly addressed, several different candidates can be found in the literature. We assessed these candidates and saw that there is a powerful case that legal interpretation seeks provisions’ contribution to the law.

Given this conclusion, which method of interpretation is correct will depend on how the content of the law is determined. On Hart’s theory of law and other influential accounts, many familiar arguments deployed to defend methods of interpretation are not even of the appropriate sort.

Although attention to the theory of law is critical to progress in the field of legal interpretation, there is space between the theory of legal interpretation and the theory of law. The theory of legal interpretation may take into account values other than accurately identifying the content of the law. And there is also the possibility that legal interpreters will more accurately identify the content of the law by following relatively simple rules of thumb than by trying to identify the content of the law directly.


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I thank Mitch Berman, David Dolinko, Erik Encarnacion, Russell Korobkin, Jennifer Mnookin, Steve Munzer, Seana Shiffrin, and many other UCLA colleagues for helpful comments. For excellent research assistance, I am grateful to Sarah Burns, Jennifer Erickson, Zak Fisher, Ricky Fox, Martin Gandur, Shahin Mohammadi, Bronson Van Opijnen, and Jordan Wolf.

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