Original Position

First published Sat Dec 20, 2008; substantive revision Tue Oct 24, 2023

The original position is a central feature of John Rawls’s social contract account of justice, “justice as fairness,” set forth in A Theory of Justice (TJ). The original position is designed to be a fair and impartial point of view that is to be adopted in our reasoning about fundamental principles of justice. In taking up this point of view, we are to imagine ourselves in the position of free and equal persons who jointly agree upon and commit themselves to principles of social and political justice for a well-ordered democratic society. The main distinguishing feature of the original position is “the veil of ignorance”: To ensure complete impartiality of judgment, the parties are deprived of all knowledge of their personal characteristics and conceptions of the good, and of social and historical circumstances. They do know of certain fundamental interests they all have in exercising their moral powers, plus general facts about psychology, economics, political sociology, biology, and other social and natural sciences. The parties in the original position are presented with a list of the major conceptions of justice drawn from the tradition of social and political philosophy and are assigned the task of choosing from among these the conception of justice that best enables them to effectively pursue their final ends and commitments and their fundamental interests. Rawls contends that the most rational decision for the parties in the original position are the two principles of justice: The first principle guarantees the equal basic rights and liberties needed to secure the fundamental interests of free and equal citizens and to pursue a wide range of conceptions of the good. The basic liberties include freedom of conscience, thought, expression, and association; freedom and integrity of the person with the right to hold personal property; equal political liberties, and rights protected by the rule of law. The second principle regulates permissible social and economic inequalities: first it provides fair equality of educational, employment, and cultural opportunities that enable all to develop their capacities and fairly compete for social positions of office and responsibility. Next, the second principle requires economic inequalities of income, wealth, powers and prerogatives to be arranged to maximally benefit the least advantaged members of society, making them better off than they would be in any alternative economic system (the difference principle.)

1. Historical Background: The Moral Point of View

The idea of the moral point of view can be traced back to David Hume’s account of the “judicious spectator.” Hume sought to explain how moral judgments of approval and disapproval are possible given that people normally are focused on achieving their own interests and concerns. He conjectured that in making moral judgments individuals abstract in imagination from their own interests and adopt an impartial point of view from which they assess the effects of their own and others’ actions on the interests of everyone. Since, according to Hume, we all can adopt this impartial perspective in imagination, it accounts for our agreement in moral judgments (see Hume 1739 [1978, 581]; Rawls, LHMP 84–93, LHPP 184–187).

Subsequently, philosophers posited similar perspectives for moral reasoning designed to yield impartial judgments once individuals abstract from their own aims and interests and assess situations from an impartial point of view. But rather than being mainly explanatory of moral judgments like Hume’s “judicious spectator,” the role of these impartial perspectives is to serve as a basis from which to assess and justify moral rules and principles. Kant’s categorical imperative procedure, Adam Smith’s “impartial spectator,”, and Sidgwick’s “point of view of the universe” are all different versions of the moral point of view.

An important feature of the moral point of view is that it is designed to represent what is essential to the activity of moral reasoning. For example, Kant’s categorical imperative is envisioned as a point of view any reasonable morally motivated person can adopt in deliberating about what they ought morally to do (Rawls, CP 498ff; LHMP). When joined with the common assumption that the totality of moral reasons is final and override non-moral reasons, the moral point of view might be regarded as the most fundamental perspective that we can adopt in our reasoning about justice and what we morally ought to do.

Rawls’s idea of the original position, as initially conceived, is his account of the moral point of view regarding matters of justice. The original position is a hypothetical perspective that we can adopt in our moral reasoning about the most basic principles of social and political justice. What primarily distinguishes Rawls’s impartial perspective from its antecedents (in Hume, Smith, Kant, etc.) is that, rather than representing the judgment of one person, it is conceived socially, as a general agreement by (representatives of all adult) members of an ongoing society. The point of view of justice is then represented as a general “social contract” or agreement by free and equal persons on the basic terms of cooperation for their society.

2. The Original Position and Social Contract Doctrine

Historically the idea of a social contract had a more limited role than Rawls assigns to it. In Thomas Hobbes and John Locke the social contract serves as an argument for the legitimacy of political authority. Hobbes argues that in a pre-social state of nature it would be rational for all to agree to authorize one person to exercise the absolute political power needed to maintain peace and enforce laws necessary for productive social cooperation. (Hobbes, 1651) By contrast, Locke argued against absolute monarchy by contending that no existing political constitution is legitimate or just unless it could be contracted into starting from a position of equal right within a (relatively peaceful) state of nature, and without violating any natural rights or duties. (Locke, 1690) For Rousseau and perhaps Kant too, the idea of a social contract plays a different role: It is an “idea of reason” (Kant) depicting a point of view that lawmakers and citizens should adopt in their reasoning to ascertain the “general will,” which enables them to assess existing laws and decide upon measures that promote justice and citizens’ common good. (Rousseau, 1762; Kant, 1793, 296–7; Kant 1797, 480) Rawls generalizes on Locke’s, Rousseau’s and Kant’s natural rights theories of the social contract (TJ vii/xviii rev.; 32/28 rev.): The purpose of his original position is to yield principles to determine and assess the justice of political constitutions and of economic and social arrangements and the laws that sustain them. To do so, he seeks in the original position “to combine into one conception the totality of conditions which we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct towards one another” (TJ 587/514 rev.).

Why does Rawls represent principles of justice as originating in a kind of social contract? Rawls says that “justice as fairness assigns a certain primacy to the social” (CP 339). Unlike Kant’s categorical imperative procedure, the original position is designed to represent the predominantly social bases of justice. To say that justice is predominantly social does not mean that people do not have “natural” moral rights and duties outside society or in non-cooperative circumstances—Rawls clearly thinks there are human rights (see LP, §10) and certain “natural duties” (TJ, §§19, 51) that apply to all human beings as such. But whatever our natural or human rights and duties may be, they do not provide an adequate basis for ascertaining the rights and duties of justice that we owe one another as members of the same ongoing political society. It is in large part due to “the profoundly social nature of human relationships” (PL 259) that Rawls sees political and economic justice as grounded in social cooperation on terms of reciprocity and mutual respect. For this reason Rawls eschews the idea of a state of nature where pre-social but fully rational individuals agree to cooperative terms (as in Hobbesian views), or where pre-political persons with antecedent natural rights agree on the form of a political constitution (as in Locke). Rawls regards us as social beings in the sense that in the absence of society and social development we have but inchoate and unrealized capacities, including our capacities for rationality, morality, even language itself. As Rousseau says, outside society we are but “stupid and shortsighted animals” (Rousseau, 1762, bk.I, ch.8, par. 1). This draws into question the main point of the idea of a state of nature in Hobbesian and Lockean views, which is to distinguish the rights, claims, duties, powers and competencies we have prior to membership in society from those we acquire as members of society. Not being members of some society is not an option for us. In so far as we are rational and reasonable beings at all, we have developed as members of some society, within its social framework and institutions. Accordingly Rawls says that no sense can be made of the notion of that part of an individual’s social benefits that exceed what would have been that person’s situation in a state of nature (PL 278). The traditional idea of pre-social or even pre-political rational moral agents thus plays no role in Rawls’s account of justice and the social contract; for him the state of nature is an idea without moral significance (PL 278–280). The original position is set forth largely as an alternative to the state of nature and is regarded by Rawls as the appropriate initial situation for a social contract. (Below we consider a further reason behind Rawls’s rejection of the state of nature: it does not adequately allow for impartial judgment and the equality of persons.)

Another way Rawls represents the “profoundly social” bases of principles of justice is by focusing on “the basic structure of society.” The “first subject of justice,” Rawls says, is principles that regulate the basic social institutions that constitute the “basic structure of society” (TJ sect.2). These basic institutions include the political constitution, which specifies political offices and procedures for legislating and enforcing laws and the system of trials for adjudicating disputes; the bases and organization of the economic system, including laws of property, its transfer and distribution, contractual relations, etc. which are all necessary for economic production, exchange, and consumption; and finally norms that define and regulate permissible forms of the family, which is necessary to reproduce and perpetuate society from one generation to the next. It is the role of principles of justice to specify and assess the system of rules that constitute these basic institutions, and determine the fair distribution of rights, duties, opportunities, powers and positions of office, and income and wealth realized within them. What makes these basic social institutions and their arrangement the first subject for principles of social justice is that they are all necessary to social cooperation and have such profound influences on our circumstances, aims, characters, and future prospects. No stable, enduring society could exist without certain rules of property, contract, and transfer of goods and resources, for they make economic production, trade, and consumption possible. Nor could a society long endure without some political mechanism for resolving disputes and making, revising, interpreting, and enforcing its economic and other cooperative norms; nor without some form of the family, to reproduce, sustain, and nurture members of its future generations. This is what distinguishes the social institutions constituting the basic structure from other profoundly influential social institutions, such as religion; religion and other social institutions are not basic in Rawls’s sense because they are not generally necessary to social cooperation among members of society. (Even if certain religions have been ideologically necessary to sustain the norms of particular societies, many societies can and do exist without the involvement or support of religious institutions).

Another reason Rawls regards the original position as the appropriate setting for a social contract is implicit in his stated aim in A Theory of Justice: it is to discover the most appropriate moral conception of justice for a democratic society wherein persons regard themselves as free and equal citizens (TJ viii/xviii rev.). Here he assumes an ideal of citizens as “moral persons” who regard themselves as free and equal, have a conception of their rational good, and have a “sense of justice.” “Moral persons” (an 18th century term) are not all necessarily morally good persons. Instead moral persons are persons who are capable of being rational since they have the capacities to form, revise and pursue a rational conception of their good; moreover, moral persons also are capable of being reasonable since they have a moral capacity for a sense of justice—to cooperate with others on terms that are fair and to understand, apply, and act upon principles of justice and their requirements. Because people have these capacities, or “moral powers,” (as Rawls calls them, following Kant) we hold them responsible for their actions, and they are regarded as capable of freely pursuing their interests and engaging in social cooperation. Rawls’s idea is that, being reasonable and rational, moral persons (like us) who regard ourselves as free and equal should be in a position to accept and endorse as both rational and morally justifiable the principles of justice regulating our basic social institutions and individual conduct. Otherwise, our conduct is coerced or manipulated for reasons we cannot (reasonably or rationally) accept and we are not fundamentally free persons. Starting from these assumptions, Rawls construes the moral point of view from which to decide moral principles of justice as a social contract in which (representatives of) free and equal persons are given the task of coming to an agreement on principles of justice that are to regulate their social and political relations in perpetuity. How otherwise, Rawls contends, should we represent the justification of principles of justice for free and equal persons who have different conceptions of their good, as well as different religious, philosophical, and moral views? There is no commonly accepted moral or religious authority or doctrine to which they could appeal in order to discover principles of justice that all could agree to and accept. Rawls contends that, since his aim is to discover a conception of justice appropriate for a democratic society, it should be justifiable to free and equal persons in their capacity as citizens on terms which all can endorse and accept. The role of the social contract is to represent this idea, that the basic principles of social cooperation are justifiable hence acceptable to all reasonable and rational members of society, and that they are principles which all can commit themselves to support and comply with.

How is this social contract to be conceived? It is not an historical event that must actually take place at some point in time (TJ 120/104 rev.ed.). It is rather a hypothetical situation, a kind of “thought experiment” (JF 17), that is designed to uncover the most reasonable principles of justice. Rawls maintains (in LHPP, cf. p.15) that the major advocates of social contract doctrine—Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Kant—all regarded the social contract, as a hypothetical event. Hobbes and Locke thus posited a hypothetical state of nature in which there is no political authority, and where people are regarded as rational and (for Locke) also reasonable. The purpose of this hypothetical social contract is to demonstrate what types of political constitutions and governments are politically legitimate, and determine the nature of individuals’ political obligations (LHPP p.16). The presumption is that if a constitution or form government could be agreed to by rational persons subject to it according to principles and terms they all accept, then it should be acceptable to rational persons generally, including you and me, and hence is legitimate and is the source of our political obligations. Thus, Hobbes argues that all rational persons in a state of nature would agree to authorize an absolute sovereign to enforce the “laws of nature” necessary for society; whereas Locke comes to the opposite conclusion, contending that absolutism would be rejected in favor of constitutional monarchy with a representative assembly. Similarly, in Rousseau and Kant, the social contract is a way to reason about the General Will, including the political constitution and laws that hypothetical moral agents would all agree to in order to promote the common good and realize the freedom and equality of citizens. (Rousseau, 1762, I:6, p.148; II:1, p.153; II:11, p.170; Kant, 1793, 296–7; Kant 1797, 480; cf. Rawls, LHPP, 214–48).

Rawls employs the idea of a hypothetical social contract for more general purposes than his predecessors. He aims to provide principles of justice that can be applied to determine not only the justice of political constitutions and the laws, but also the justice of the institution of property and of social and economic arrangements for the production and distribution of income and wealth, as well as the distribution of educational and work opportunities, and of powers and positions of office and responsibility.

Some have objected that hypothetical agreements cannot bind or obligate people; only actual contracts or agreements can impose obligations and commitments (Dworkin, 1977, 150ff). But the original position is not intended to impose new obligations on us; rather it is a device for discovery and justification: It is to be used, as Rawls says, “to help us work out what we now think” (CP 402); it incorporates “conditions…we do in fact accept” (TJ 587/514 rev.) and is a kind of “thought experiment for the purpose of public- and self-clarification” (JF, p.17). Hypothetical agreement in the original position does not then bind anyone to duties or commitments they do not already have. Its point rather is to help discover and explicate the requirements of our moral concepts of justice and enable us to draw the consequences of considered moral convictions of justice that we all presumably share. Whether we in turn consciously accept or agree to these consequences and the principles and duties they implicate once brought to our awareness does not undermine their moral justification. The point rather of conjecturing the outcome of a hypothetical agreement is that, if the premises underlying the original position correctly represent our most deeply held considered moral convictions and concepts of justice, then we are morally and rationally committed to endorsing the resulting principles and duties whether or not we actually accept or agree to them. Not to do so implies a failure to accept and live up to the consequences of our own moral convictions about justice.

Here critics may deny that the original position incorporates all the relevant reasons and considered moral convictions for justifying principles of justice (e.g. it omits beneficence, or the parties’ knowledge of their final ends), and/or that some reasons it incorporates are not relevant to moral justification to begin with (such as the publicity of fundamental principles, as utilitarians argue, Sidgwick, 1907, or the separateness or persons, temporal neutrality and rationality of the parties in promoting their own conception of the good). (Parfit, 1985, 163, 336; Cohen, G.A., 2009; Cohen, J., 2015,). Or they may argue that the state or nature, not the original position, is the appropriate perspective from which to ascertain fundamental principles of justice, since individuals moral and property rights are pre-social and not dependent upon social cooperation. (Nozick, 1974, 183–231).

3. The Veil of Ignorance

Rawls calls his conception “justice as fairness.” His aim in designing the original position is to describe an agreement situation that is fair among all the parties to the hypothetical social contract. He assumes that if the parties are fairly situated and take all relevant information into account, then the principles they agree to are also fair. The fairness of the original agreement situation transfers to the principles everyone agrees to; furthermore, whatever laws or institutions are required by the principles of justice are also fair. The principles of justice chosen in the original position are in this way the result of a choice procedure designed to “incorporate pure procedural justice at the highest level” (CP, 310, cf. TJ 120/104). This feature of Rawls’s original position is closely related to his constructivism, and his subsequent understanding of the original position as a “procedure of construction”; see the supplementary section:

Constructivism, Objectivity, Autonomy, and the Original Position,

in the supplementary document Further Topics on the Original Position.

There are different ways to define a fair agreement situation depending on the purpose of the agreement and the description of the parties to it. For example, certain facts are relevant to entering a fair employment contract – knowledge of a prospective employee’s talents, skills, prior training, experience, motivation, and reliability – that may not be relevant to other fair agreements. What is a fair agreement situation among free and equal persons when the purpose of the agreement is fundamental principles of justice for the basic structure of society? What sort of facts should the parties to such a fundamental social contract know, and what sort of facts are irrelevant or even prejudicial to a fair agreement? Here it is helpful to compare Rawls’s and Locke’s social contracts. A feature of Locke’s social contract is that it transpires in a state of nature among free and equal persons who know everything about themselves that you and I know about ourselves and each other. Thus, Locke’s parties know their natural talents, skills, education, and other personal characteristics; their racial and ethnic group, gender, social class, and occupations; their level of wealth and income, their religious and moral beliefs, and so on. Given this knowledge, Locke assumes that, while starting from a position of equal political right, the great majority of free and equal persons in a state of nature – including all women and racial minorities, and all other men who do not meet a rigid property qualification – could and most likely would rationally agree to alienate their natural rights of equal political jurisdiction in order to gain the benefits of political society. Thus, Locke envisions as legitimate a constitutional monarchy that is in effect a gender-and-racially biased class state wherein a small restricted class of amply propertied white males exercise political rights to vote, hold office, exercise political and social influence, and enjoy other important benefits and responsibilities to the exclusion of everyone else (see Rawls, LHPP, 138–139).

The problem with this arrangement, of course, is that gender and racial classifications, social class, wealth and lack thereof, are, like absence of religious belief, not good reasons for depriving free and equal persons of their equal political rights or opportunities to occupy social and political positions. Knowledge of these and other facts are not then morally relevant for deciding who should qualify to vote, hold office, and actively participate in governing and administering society. Rawls suggests that the reason Locke’s social contract results in this unjust outcome is that it transpires (hypothetically) under unfair conditions of a state of nature, where the parties have complete knowledge of their circumstances, characteristics and social situations. Socially powerful and wealthy parties then have access to and can unfairly benefit from their knowledge of their “favorable position and exercise their threat advantage” to extract favorable terms of cooperation for themselves from those in less favorable positions (JF 16). Consequently, the parties’ judgments regarding constitutional provisions are biased by their knowledge of their particular circumstances and their decisions are insufficiently impartial.

The remedy for such biases of judgment is to redefine the initial situation within which the social contract transpires. Rather than a state of nature Rawls situates the parties to the social contract so that they do not have access to factual knowledge that can distort their judgments and result in unfair principles. Rawls’s original position is an initial agreement situation wherein the parties are without information enabling them to tailor principles of justice favorable to their personal circumstances and interests. Among the essential features of the original position are that no one knows their place in society, class position, wealth, or social status, nor does anyone know their race, gender, fortune or misfortune in the distribution of natural assets and abilities, level of intelligence, strength, education, and the like. Rawls even assumes that the parties do not know their values or “conceptions of the good,” their religious or philosophical convictions, or their special psychological propensities. The principles of justice are chosen behind a “veil of ignorance” (TJ 12/11). This veil of ignorance deprives the parties of all knowledge of particular facts about themselves, about one another, and even about their society and its history.

The parties are not however completely ignorant of facts. They know all kinds of general facts about persons and societies, including knowledge of relatively uncontroversial scientific laws and generalizations accepted within the natural and social sciences – economics, psychology, political science, biology, and other natural sciences (including applications of Darwinian evolutionary theory that are generally accepted by scientists, however controversial they may be among religious fundamentalists). They know then about the general tendencies of human behavior and psychological development, about neuropsychology and biological evolution, and about how economic markets work, including neo-classical price theory of supply and demand. As discussed below, they also know about the circumstances of justice—moderate scarcity and limited altruism—as well as the desirability of the “primary social goods” that are needed by anyone in modern society to live a good life and to develop their “moral powers” and other capacities. What the parties lack however is knowledge of any particular facts about their own and other persons’ lives, as well as knowledge of any historical facts about their society and its population, its level of wealth and resources, religious institutions, etc.. Rawls thinks that since the parties are required to come to an agreement on objective principles that supply universal standards of justice applying across all societies, knowledge of particular and historical facts about any person or society is morally irrelevant and potentially prejudicial to their decision.

Another reason Rawls gives for such a “thick” veil of ignorance is that it is designed to be a strict “position of equality” (TJ 12/11) that represents persons purely in their capacity as free and equal moral persons. The parties in the original position do not know any particular facts about themselves or society; they all have the same general information. They are then situated equally in a very strong way, “symmetrically” (JF 18) and purely as free and equal moral persons. They know only characteristics and interests they share in their capacity as free and equal moral persons—their “higher-order interests” in developing the moral powers of justice and rationality, their need for the primary social goods, and so on. The moral powers, Rawls contends, are the “basis of equality, the features of human beings in virtue of which they are to be treated in accordance with the principles of justice” (TJ, 504/441). Knowledge of the moral powers and their essential role in social cooperation, along with knowledge of other general facts, is all that is morally relevant, Rawls believes, to a decision on principles of justice that are to reflect people’s status as free and equal moral persons. A thick veil of ignorance thus is designed to represent the equality of persons purely as moral persons, and not in any other contingent capacity or social role. In this regard the veil of ignorance interprets the Kantian idea of equality as equal respect for moral persons (cf. CP 255).

Many criticisms have been leveled against Rawls’s veil of ignorance. Among the more common criticisms are that the parties’ choice in the original position is indeterminate (Sen, 2009, 11–12, 56–58), or would result in choice of the principle of (average) utility (Harsanyi, 1975), or a principle of relative prioritarianism that gives greater weight to but does not maximize the least advantaged position (Buchak, 2017) (The argument for the choice of the principle of average utility is discussed below.) Among reasons given for the indeterminacy of decision in the original position are that the parties are deprived of so much information about themselves that they are psychologically incapable of making a choice; or they cannot decide between a plurality of reasonable principles. (Sen 2009, 56–58). Or they are incapable of making a rational choice, since we cannot decide upon ethical principles without knowing our primary purposes in life, the values of community, or certain other final ends and commitments. (MacIntyre, 1981; Sandel 1982)

One answer to to the criticism of inability to make a rational choice due to ignorance of our final ends is that we do not need to know everything about ourselves, including these primary purposes, to make rational decisions about the background social conditions needed to pursue these primary purposes. For example, whatever our ends, we know that personal security and an absence of social chaos are conditions of most anyone’s living a good life (as Hobbes contends). Similarly, though Rawls’s parties do not know their own values and commitments, they do know that as free and equal persons they require an adequate share of primary social goods (rights and liberties, powers and opportunities, income and wealth, and the social bases of self-respect) to effectively pursue their purposes, whatever they may be. They also know they have a “higher-order interest” in adequately developing and exercising their “moral powers” – the capacities to be rational and reasonable – which are conditions of responsible agency, effectively pursuing one’s purposes, and engaging in social cooperation. Rawls contends that knowledge of these “essential goods” is sufficient for a rational choice on principles of justice by the parties in the original position.

To the objection that choice behind the veil of ignorance is psychologically impossible, Rawls says that it is important not to get too caught up in the theoretical fiction of the original position, as if it were some historical event among real people who are being asked to do something impossible. The original position is not supposed to be realistic but is a “device of representation” (PL 27), or a “thought experiment,” (JF, 83), that is designed to organize our considered convictions of justice and clarify their implications. The parties in it are not real but are “artificial persons” who have a role to play in this thought experiment. They represent an ideal of free and equal reasonable and rational moral persons that Rawls assumes is implicit in our reasoning about justice. The veil of ignorance is a representation of the kinds of reasons and information that are relevant to a decision on principles of justice for the basic structure of a society of free and equal moral persons (TJ 17/16). Many kinds of reasons and facts are not morally relevant to that kind of decision (e.g., information about people’s race, gender, religious affiliation, wealth, and even, Rawls says more controversially, their conceptions of their good), just as many different kinds of reasons and facts are irrelevant to mathematicians’ ability to work out the formal proof of a theorem. As a mathematician, scientist, or musician exercise their expertise by ignoring knowledge of particular facts about themselves, presumably we can do so too in reasoning about principles of justice for the basic structure of society. Rawls says we can “enter the original position at any time simply by reasoning in accordance with the enumerated restrictions on information,” (PL 27) and considering general facts about persons, their needs, and social and economic cooperation that are provided to the parties (TJ 120/104, 587/514).

A related criticism of Rawls’s “thick” veil of ignorance is that even if the parties can make certain rational decisions in their interest without knowledge of their final ends, still they cannot come to a decision about principles of justice without knowing the desires and interests of people. For justice consists of the measures that most effectively promote good consequences, and these ultimately reflect facts about individuals’ utility or welfare. This criticism is mirrored in utilitarian versions of the moral point of view, which incorporate a “thin” veil of ignorance that represents a different idea of impartiality. The impartial sympathetic spectator found in David Hume and Adam Smith, or the self-interested rational chooser in John Harsanyi’s average utilitarian account, all have complete knowledge of everyone’s desires, interests and purposes as well as knowledge of particular facts about people and their historical situations. Impartiality is achieved by depriving the impartial observer or rational chooser of any knowledge of its own identity. This leads it to give equal consideration to everyone’s desires and interests, and impartially take everyone’s desires and interests into account. Since rationality is presumed to involve maximizing something – or taking the most effective means to promote the greatest realization of one’s ends – the impartial observer/chooser rationally chooses the rule or course of action that maximizes the satisfaction of desires, or utility (aggregate or average), summed across all persons. (See TJ, §30)

Rawls’s original position with its “thick” veil of ignorance represents a different conception of impartiality than the utilitarian requirement that equal consideration be given to everyone’s desires, preferences, or interests. The original position abstracts from all information about current circumstances and the status quo, including everyone’s desires and particular interests. Utilitarians assume peoples’ desires and interests are given by their circumstances and seek to maximize their satisfaction; in so doing utilitarians suspend judgment regarding the moral permissibility of peoples’ desires, preferences, and ends and of the social circumstances and institutions within which these are shaped and cultivated. For Rawls, a primary reason for a thick veil of ignorance is to enable an unbiased assessment of the justice of existing social and political institutions and of existing desires, preferences, and conceptions of the good that they sustain. People’s desires and purposes are not then assumed to be given, whatever they are, and then promoted and fulfilled. On Rawls’s Kantian view, principles of right and justice are designed to put limits on what satisfactions and purposes have value and impose restrictions on what are reasonable conceptions of persons’ good. This basically is what Rawls means by “the priority of right over the good.” People’s desires and aspirations are constrained from the outset by principles of justice, which specify the criteria for determining permissible ends and conceptions of the good. (TJ 31–32/27–28) If the parties to Rawls’s original position had knowledge of peoples’ beliefs and desires, as well as knowledge of the laws, institutions and circumstances of their society, then this knowledge would influence their decisions on principles of justice. The principles agreed to would then not be sufficiently detached from the very desires, circumstances, and institutions these principles are to critically assess. Since utilitarians take peoples’ desires, preferences, and/or ends as given under existing circumstances, any principles, laws, or institutions chosen behind their thin veil of ignorance will reflect and be biased by the status quo. To take an obvious counterexample, there is little if any justice in laws approved from a utilitarian impartial perspective when these laws take into account racially prejudiced preferences which are cultivated by grossly unequal, racially discriminatory and segregated social conditions. To impartially give equal consideration to everyone’s desires formed under such under unjust conditions is hardly sufficient to meet requirements of justice. This illustrates some of the reasons for a “thick” as opposed to a “thin” veil of ignorance.

4. Description of the Parties: Rationality and the Primary Social Goods

Rawls says that in the original position, “the Reasonable frames the Rational” (CP 319). He means the OP is a situation where rational choice of the parties is made subject to reasonable (or moral) constraints. In what sense are the parties and their choice and agreement rational? Philosophers have different understandings of practical rationality. Rawls seeks to incorporate a relatively uncontroversial account of rationality into the original position, one that he thinks most any account of practical rationality would endorse as at least necessary for rational decision. The parties are then described as rational in a formal or “thin” sense that is characteristic of the theories of rational and social choice. They are resourceful, take effective means to their ends, and seek to make their preferences consistent. They also take the course of action that is more likely to achieve their ends (other things being equal). And they choose courses of action that satisfy more rather than fewer of their purposes. Rawls calls these principles of rational choice the “counting principles” (TJ §§25, 63; JF 87).

More generally, for Rawls rational persons upon reflection can formulate a conception of their good, or of their primary values and purposes and the best way of life for themselves to live given their purposes. This conception incorporates their primary aims, ambitions, and commitments to others, and is informed by the conscientious moral, religious, and philosophical convictions that give meaning for them to their lives. Ideally, rational persons have carefully thought about these things and their relative importance, and they can coherently order their purposes and commitments into a “rational plan of life,” which extends over their lifetimes (TJ §§63–64). For Rawls, rational persons regard life as a whole, and do not give preference to any particular period of it. Rather in drawing up their rational plans, they are equally concerned with their (future) good at each part of their lives. In this regard, rational persons are prudent—they care for their future good, and while they may discount the importance of future purposes based on probability assessments, they do not discount the achievement of their future purposes simply because they are in the future (TJ, §45). (For a different view, see Parfit, 1984)

These primary aims, convictions, ambitions, and commitments are among the primary motivations of the parties in the original position. The parties want to provide favorable conditions for the pursuit of the various elements of the rational plan of life that defines a good life for them. This is ultimately what the parties are trying to accomplish in their choice of principles of justice. In this sense they are rational.

Rawls says the parties in the original position are “mutually disinterested,” in the sense that “they take no interest in each other’s interests” (TJ 110/[omitted in rev. ed.]). This does not mean that they are self-interested or selfish persons, indifferent to the welfare of others. The interests advanced by the parties’ life plans, Rawls says, “are not assumed to be interests in the self, they are interests of a self that regards its conception of the good as worthy of satisfaction…” (TJ 127/110) Most people are concerned, not just with their own happiness or welfare, but with others as well, and have all kinds of commitments, including other-regarding, beneficent, and moral purposes, that are part of their conceptions of the good. But in the original position itself the parties are not altruistically motivated to benefit each other, in their capacity as contracting parties. They try to do as best as they can for themselves and for those persons and causes that they care for. Their situation is comparable, Rawls says, to that of trustees or guardians” acting to promote the interests of the beneficiaries they represent. (JF, 84–85) Trustees cannot sacrifice the well-being of the beneficiary they represent to benefit other trustees or individuals. If they did, they would be derelict in their duties. It is perhaps to address the common criticism that the parties to the original position are self-interested that Rawls in the revised edition (TJ 110 rev.) omitted the phrase from the 1st edition, cited above, that “the parties take no interest in each other’s interest.” Moreover in later writings increasingly he says that we should imagine that the parties are “representatives” of free and equal citizens and their interests and “act as guardians or trustees,” seeking to do as best as they can for the particular individuals that each trustee represents. (PL §4, JF§24) In either case, Rawls believes this account of the parties’ motivations promotes greater clarity, and that to attribute to the parties moral motivations or benevolence towards each other would not result in definite choice of a conception of justice (TJ, 148–9/128–9; 584/512). (For example, how much benevolence should the parties have towards one another or towards people in general? Surely not impartial benevolence towards everyone, for then we might as well dispense with the social contract and rely on a disinterested impartial spectator point of view. It is one of the “circumstances of justice” that people have different and conflicting values, and they value their own purposes and special commitments to others more than they value others’ purposes and special commitments, This is a good thing, not to be discouraged or undermined by justice, but rather regulated by it, since special obligations and commitments to specific others give meaning to people’s lives. (cf. Scheffler, 2001, chs.3, 4, 6) But if not equal concern for other parties and/or persons including themselves (and perhaps other animals), then how much care and concern should the parties in the original position exhibit towards others generally, as compared with concern for themselves and their own good? (Half as much concern for others’ good as for their own? One-fifth as much? There is no clear answer.) Rawls’s thought is that, so far as justice is concerned, fair regard for others’ interests is best represented by each party’s rational choice behind a thick veil of ignorance; for each party has to be equally concerned with the consequences of their choice of principles for each position in society, since they could end up in that same position.

Mutual disinterest of the parties also means they are not moved by envy or rancor towards each other or others generally. This implies that the parties do not strive to be wealthier or better off than others for its own sake, and thus do not sacrifice advantages to prevent others from having more than they do. Instead, each party in the original position is motivated to do as well as they can in promoting the optimal achievement of the many purposes that constitute their rational conception of the good, without regard to how much or how little others may have. For this reason they strive to guarantee themselves a share of primary social goods that is at least sufficient to enable them each to effectively pursue their (unknown) conception of the good.

Another feature of the parties is that they represent not just themselves, but also family lines, including their descendants, or at least their own children. This assumption is needed, Rawls says, to include representation of “the interests of all,” including children and future generations. In the first edition of Theory Rawls says. “For example, we may think of the parties as heads of families and therefore as having a desire to further the welfare of their nearest descendants” (Rawls 1971, 128). Because of criticisms of the heads of families assumption, (by English, 1977 and others) Rawls said in the revised edition that the problem of future generations can be addressed by the parties assuming that all preceding generations have followed the same principles that the parties choose to apply to future generations. (Rawls 1999a, 111 rev.). The “heads of families” assumption is discussed further in connection with feminist criticisms of Rawls in the supplementary section:

A Liberal Feminist Critique of the Original Position and Justice within the Family

in the supplementary document Further Topics on the Original Position.

Though the parties are not motivated by beneficence or even a concern for justice, still they have a moral capacity for reasonableness and a sense of justice (TJ, 145/125 rev.). Rawls distinguishes between the requirements of rationality and reasonableness; both are part of practical reasoning about what we ought to do (JF 6–7; 81–2). The concept of “the Rational” concerns a person’s good—hence Rawls refers to his account of the good as “goodness as rationality.” A person’s good for Rawls is the rational plan of life they would choose under hypothetical conditions of “deliberative rationality,” where there is full knowledge of one’s circumstances, capacities, and interests, as well as knowledge of the likelihood of succeeding at alternative life plans one may be drawn to (TJ, §64). “The Reasonable” on the other hand addresses the concept and principles of right, including individual moral duties and obligations as well as moral requirements of right and justice that apply to institutions and society. Both rationality and reasonableness are independent aspects of practical reason for Rawls. They are independent in that Rawls, unlike Hobbes and other interest-based social contract views, does not regard justice and the reasonable as simply principles of prudence that are beneficial for a person to comply with in order to successfully pursue their purposes in social contexts. (Cf. Gauthier, 1984) Unlike Hobbes, Rawls does not argue that an immoral or unjust person is irrational, or that morality is necessarily required by rationality in the narrow sense of maximizing individual utility or taking effective means to realize one’s purposes. But rational persons who violate demands of justice are unreasonable in so far as they infringe upon moral principles and requirements of practical reasoning. Being reasonable, even if not required by rationality, is still an independent aspect of practical reason. Rawls resembles Kant in this regard (PL 25n); his distinction between the reasonable and rational parallels Kant’s distinction between categorical and hypothetical imperatives.

Essential to being reasonable is having a sense of justice with the capacities to understand and reason about and act upon what justice requires. The sense of justice is a normally effective desire to comply with duties and obligations required by justice; it includes a willingness to cooperate with others on terms that are fair and that reasonable persons can accept and endorse. Rawls sees a sense of justice as an attribute people normally have; it “would appear to be a condition for human sociability” (TJ, 495/433 rev.). He rejects the idea that people are motivated only by self-interest in all that they do; he also rejects the Hobbesian assumption that a willingness to do justice must be grounded in enlightened self-interest. It is essential to Rawls’s argument for the feasibility and stability of justice as fairness that the parties upon entering society have an effective sense of justice, and that they are capable of doing what justice requires of them for its own sake, or at least because they believe this is what morality requires of them. An amoralist, Rawls believes, is largely a philosophical construct; amoralists who actually exist Rawls regards as sociopaths. “A capacity for a sense of justice … would appear to be a condition of sociability” (TJ 495/433).

Subsequent to A Theory of Justice, beginning in ‘Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory,’ (1980) (CP 303ff.) Rawls says that the parties to the original position have a “highest-order interest” in the development and full and informed exercise of their two “moral powers”: their capacity for a sense of justice as well as in their capacity for a rational conception of the good. Fulfilling these interests in the moral powers is one of the main aims behind their agreement on principles of justice. Subsequently in Political Liberalism (1993) Rawls changed this to the parties’ “higher order interests” in development and exercise of the two moral powers (to avoid giving the appearance that the moral powers were final ends for free and equal moral persons, as was argued in TJ). The parties’ interest in developing these two moral powers is a substantive feature of Rawls’s account of the rationality of free and equal persons in the original position itself. (In this regard, his account of goodness as rationality is not as “thin” as in social theory; cf. TJ 143/124 rev.) Here Rawls is still not attributing specifically moral motives—a desire to be reasonable and do what is right and just for their own sake—to the parties in the original position. The idea behind the parties’ rationality in cultivating their sense of justice is that, since being reasonable and exercising one’s sense of justice by complying with fair terms is a condition of human sociability and social cooperation, then it is in people’s rational interest—part of their good—that they normally develop their capacities for justice under social conditions. Otherwise they will not be in a position to cooperate with others and benefit from social life. A person who is without a sense of justice is wholly unreasonable and as a result is normally eschewed by others, for they are not trustworthy or reliable or even safe to interact with. Since having a sense of justice is a condition of taking part in social cooperation, the parties have a “higher-order interest” in establishing conditions for the development and full exercise of their capacity for a sense of justice. The parties’ interest in developing their capacity for a sense of justice is then a rational interest in being reasonable; justice is then regarded by the parties as instrumental to their realizing their conception of the good. (Here again, it is important to distinguish the purely rational motivation of the parties or their trustees in the original position from that of free and equal citizens in a well-ordered society, who are normally morally motivated by their sense of justice to do what is right and just for its own sake.)

Three factors then play a role in motivating the parties in the original position: (1) First, they aim to advance their determinate conception of the good, or rational plan of life, even though they do not know what that conception is. Moreover, they also seek conditions that enable them to exercise and develop their “moral powers,” namely (2) their rational capacities to form, revise and rationally pursue a conception of their good, and (3) their capacity to be reasonable and to have an effective sense of justice. These are the three “higher-order interests” the parties to Rawls’s original position aim to promote in their agreement on principles of justice.

The three higher-order interests provide the basis for Rawls’s account of primary social goods. (TJ §15, PL 178–190) The primary goods are the all-purpose social means that are necessary to the exercise and development of the moral powers and to pursue a wide variety of conceptions of the good. Rawls describes them initially in Theory as goods that any rational person should want, whatever their rational plan of life. The primary social goods are basically: rights and liberties; powers and diverse opportunities; income and wealth; and the social bases of self-respect. ‘Powers’ refer not (simply) to a capacity to effect outcomes or influence others’ behavior. Rawls rather uses the term ‘powers’ to refer to the legal and other institutional abilities and prerogatives that attend offices and social position. Hence, he sometimes refers to the primary goods of “powers and prerogatives of offices and positions of authority and responsibility” (JF 58). Members of various professions and trades have institutional powers and prerogatives that are characteristic of their position and which are necessary if they are to carry out their respective roles and responsibilities. By income and wealth Rawls says he intends “all-purpose means” that have an exchange value, which are generally needed to achieve a wide range of ends (JF 58–59). Finally, “the social bases of self-respect” are features of institutions that are needed to enable people to have the confidence that they and their position in society are respected and that their conception of the good is worth pursuing and achievable by themselves. These features depend upon history and culture. Primary among these social bases of self respect in a democratic society, Rawls will contend, are equal recognition of persons as citizens, and hence the institutional conditions needed for equal citizenship, including equality of basic rights and liberties with equal political rights; fair equality of opportunities; and personal independence guaranteed by adequate material means for achieving it. The social bases of self-respect are crucial to Rawls’s argument for equal basic liberties, especially political equality and equal rights of political participation.

The parties to the original position are motivated to achieve a fully adequate share of primary goods so they can achieve their higher-order interests in pursuing their rational plans of life and exercising their moral powers. “They assume that they normally prefer more primary social goods rather than less” (TJ, 142/123 rev.). This too is part of being rational. Because they are not envious, their concern is with the absolute level of primary goods, not their share relative to other persons.

To sum up, the parties in the original position are formally rational in that they are assumed to have and to effectively pursue a rational plan of life with a schedule of coherent purposes and commitments that they find valuable and give their lives meaning. As part of their rational plans, they have a substantive interest in the adequate development and full exercise of their capacities to be rational and to be reasonable. These “higher-order interests” together with their rational life plans provide them with sufficient reason to procure for themselves in their choice of principles of justice an adequate share of the primary social goods that enable them to achieve these higher-order ends and effectively pursue their conceptions of the good.

A final feature of Rawls’s account of rationality is a normal human tendency he calls “the Aristotelian principle” (TJ sect.65). This “deep psychological fact” says that, other things being equal, people normally find activities that call upon the exercise of their developed capacities to be more interesting and preferable to engaging in simpler tasks, and their enjoyment increases the more the capacity is developed and realized and the greater the complexity of activities (TJ, 426/374). Humans enjoy doing something as they become more proficient at it, and of two activities they perform equally well, they normally prefer the one that calls upon a larger repertoire of more intricate and subtler discriminations. Rawls’s examples: someone who does both activities well generally prefers playing chess to checkers, and studying algebra to arithmetic. (TJ 426/374) Moreover Rawls, citing J.S. Mill believes that development at least some of our “higher capacities” (Mill’s term) is normally important to our sense of self-respect. These general facts imply that rational people should incorporate into their life plans activities that call upon the exercise and development of their talents and skills and distinctly human capacities (TJ 432/379). This motivation becomes especially relevant to Rawls’s argument for the stability of justice as fairness, the good of social union, and the good of justice (TJ §79, §86; see below, §5.3). The important point here is that the Aristotelian principle is taken into account by the parties in their decision on principles of justice. They want to choose principles that maintain their sense of self-respect and enable them to freely develop their human capacities and pursue a wide range of activities, as well as engage their capacities for a sense of justice.

5. Other Conditions on Choice in the Original Position

The veil of ignorance is the primary moral constraint upon the rational choice of the parties in the original position. There are several other conditions imposed on their agreement.

5.1 The Circumstances of Justice (TJ §22)

Among the general facts the parties know are “the circumstances of justice.” Rawls says these are “conditions under which human cooperation is both possible and necessary” (TJ 126/109 rev.). Following Hume, Rawls distinguishes two general kinds: the objective and subjective circumstances of justice. The former include physical facts about human beings, such as their rough similarity in mental and physical faculties, and vulnerability to the united force of others. Objective circumstances also include conditions of moderate scarcity of resources: there are not enough resources to satisfy everyone’s desires, but there are enough to provide all with adequate satisfaction of their basic needs; unlike conditions of extreme scarcity (e.g. famine), cooperation then seems productive and worthwhile for people.

Among the subjective circumstances of justice are the parties’ mutual disinterestedness, which reflects the “limited altruism” (TJ 146/127) of persons in society.. Free and equal persons have their own plans of life and special commitments to others, as well as different philosophical and religious beliefs and moral doctrines (TJ 127/110). Hume says that if humans were impartially benevolent, equally concerned with everyone’s welfare, then justice would be unnecessary. People then would willingly sacrifice their interests for the greater advantage of other. They would not be concerned about their personal rights or possessions, and property would be unnecessary (Hume 1777 [1970, 185–186]). But we are more concerned with our own aims and interests—which include our interests in the interests of those nearer and dearer to us—than we are with the interests of strangers with whom we have few if any interactions. This implies a potential conflict of human interests. Rawls adds that concern for our interests and plans of life does not mean we are selfish or have interests only in ourselves—again, interests of a self should not be confused with interests in oneself; we have interests in others and in all kinds of causes, ends, and commitments to other persons (TJ 127/110). But, as history shows, our benevolent interests in others and in religious and philosophical doctrines are at least as often the cause of social and international conflict as is self-interest.

The subjective circumstances of justice also include limitations on human knowledge, thought, and judgment, as well as emotional influences and great diversity of experiences. These lead to biases and inevitable disagreements in factual and other judgments, as well as to differences in religious, philosophical, and moral convictions. In Political Liberalism, Rawls highlights these subjective circumstances, calling them “the burdens of judgment” (PL 54–58). They imply, significantly, that regardless how impartial and altruistic people are, they still will disagree in their factual judgments and in religious, philosophical and moral doctrines. Disagreements in these matters are inevitable even among fully rational and reasonable people. This is “the fact of reasonable pluralism” (PL 36), which is another general fact known to the parties in the original position. Reasonable pluralism of doctrines lends significant support to Rawls’s arguments for the first principle of justice, especially to equal basic liberties of conscience, expression, and association.

5.2 Publicity and other Formal Constraints of Right (TJ §23)

There are five “formal constraints” associated with the concept of right that Rawls says the parties must take into account in coming to agreement on principles of justice. The more a conception of justice satisfies these formal constraints of right, the more reason the parties have to choose that conception. The formal constraints of right are: generality, universality in application, ordering of conflicting claims, publicity, and finality. The ordering condition says that a conception of justice should aspire to completeness: it should be able to resolve conflicting claims and order their priority. Ordering implies a systematicity requirement: principles of justice should provide a determinate resolution to problems of justice that arise under them; and to the degree that a conception of justice is not able to order conflicting claims and resolve problems of justice, that gives greater reason against choosing it in the original position compared with those that do. The ordering condition is important in Rawls’s argument against pluralist moral doctrines he calls “Intuitionism.”

Sidgwick attaches a great deal of importance to the ordering condition, and contends that “Universal Hedonism” is the only reasonable moral doctrine that can satisfy it (Sidgwick 1907 [1981], 406). Rawls would have to concede that justice as fairness does not possess, at least theoretically, the same degree of systematic ordering of claims as does hedonistic utilitarianism which has cardinal measures of utility. For example, Rawls’s priority principles can resolve conflicting claims regarding the priority of basic liberties over fair equality of opportunity, fair opportunity over the difference principle, the difference principle over the principle of efficiency and the general welfare, as well as many disputes arising within the difference principle itself regarding measures that maximally promote the position of the least advantaged. But there is no priority principle or algorithm to resolve many conflicts between basic liberties themselves (e.g. conflicts between freedom of speech vs. rights of security and integrity of persons in hate speech cases; or the conflict between free speech and the fair value of equal political liberties in restrictions on campaign finance contributions). Often in such conflicts we have to weigh competing considerations and come to a decision about where the greater balance of reasons lies, much like intuitionist views. (See Hart, 1973). Rawls in ‘Basic Liberties and their Priority,’ 1980, PL ch.VIII, addresses this problem to some degree with the idea of the significance of a basic liberty to the development and full and informed exercise of the moral powers.) The lack of a priority or algorithmic ordering principle does not mean the balance of reasons in such conflicts regarding basic liberties is indeterminate but rather that reasonable individuals will often disagree, and that final decisions practically will have to be made through the appropriate democratic, judicial, or other procedures (which of course can be mistaken). But for Rawls a moral conception’s capacity to clearly order conflicting claims is not dispositive, but one among several formal and substantive moral conditions that a conception of justice should satisfy (ultimately in reflective equilibrium).

The publicity condition says that the parties are to assume that the principles of justice they choose will be publicly known to members of society and recognized by them as the bases for their social cooperation. This implies that people will not be uninformed, manipulated, or otherwise have false beliefs about the bases of their social and political relations. There are to be no “noble lies”, false ideologies, or “fake news” obscuring a society’s principles of justice and the moral bases for its basic social institutions. The publicity of principles of justice is ultimately for Rawls a condition of respect for persons as free and equal moral persons. Rawls believes that individuals in a democratic society should know the bases of their social and political relations and not have to be deceived about them in order to cooperate and live together peacably and on fair terms. Publicity plays an important role in Rawls’s arguments against utilitarianism and other consequentialist conceptions. The idea of publicity is further developed in Political Liberalism through the ideas of public justification and the role of public reason in political deliberation.

Related to publicity is that principles should be universal in application. This implies not simply that “they hold for everyone in virtue of their being moral persons” (TJ 132/114 rev.). It also means that everyone can understand the principles of justice and use them in their deliberations about justice and its requirements. Universality in application then imposes a limit on how complex principles of justice can be—they must be understandable to common moral sense, and not so complicated that only experts can apply them in deliberations. For among other things, these principles are to guide democratic citizens in their judgments and shared deliberations about just laws and policies.

Both publicity and universality in application (as Rawls defines it) are controversial conditions. Utilitarians, for example, have argued that the truth about morality and justice is so complicated and controversial that it might be necessary to keep fundamental moral principles (the principle of utility) hidden from most individuals’ awareness. For morality and justice often require much that is contrary to peoples’ beliefs and personal interests. Also sometimes it’s just too complicated for people to understand the reasons for their moral duties. So long as they understand their individual duties, it may be better if they do not understand the principles and reasons behind them. So Sidgwick argues that the aims of utilitarianism might better be achieved if it remains an “esoteric morality,” knowledge of which is confined to “an enlightened few” (Sidgwick 1907 [1981], 489–90). The reason Rawls sees publicity and universality as necessary relates to the conception of the person implicit in justice as fairness. If we conceive of persons as free and equal moral persons capable of political and moral autonomy, then they should not be under any illusions about the bases of their social relations, but should be able to understand, accept, and apply these principles in their deliberations about justice. These are important conditions Rawls contends for the freedom, equality, and autonomy (moral and political) of democratic citizens.

Finally, the generality condition is straightforward in that it requires that principles of justice not contain any proper names or rigged definite descriptions, which Rawls says rules out free-rider and other forms of egoism together with the ordering condition. The finality condition says that moral principles of justice provide conclusive reasons for action, providing “the final court of appeal in practical reasoning.” They override demands of law and custom, social rules, and reasons of personal prudence and self-interest. (TJ 135–36/116–17). Finality is one of several Kantian conditions Rawls imposes that have been questioned by critics on grounds that it underestimates inevitable and sometimes irresolvable conflicts of moral reasons with other values. For example, should reasons of justice always be given priority over special obligations owed to specific persons or associations? Should moral reasons always be given priority over reasons of love, prudence, or even self-interest? (See Williams 1981, chs.1, 5; Wolf, 2014, chs.2, 3, 9)

5.3 The Stability Requirement

Rawls says, “An important feature of a conception of justice is that it should generate its own support. Its principles should be such that when they are embodied in the basic structure of society, people tend to acquire the corresponding sense of justice and develop a desire to act in accordance with its principles. In this case a conception of justice is stable” (TJ, 138/119). The parties in the original position are to take into account the “relative stability” of a conception of justice and the society that institutes it. The stability of a just society does not mean that it must be unchanging. It means rather that in the face of inevitable change members of a society should be able to maintain their allegiance to principles of justice and the institutions they support. When disruptions to society do occur (via economic crises, war, natural catastrophes, etc.) and/or society departs from justice, citizens’ commitments to principles of justice are sufficiently robust that just institutions are eventually restored. The role of the stability requirement for Rawls is twofold: first, to test whether potential principles of justice are compatible with human natural propensities, or our moral psychology and general facts about social and economic institutions; and second, to determine whether acting on and from principles of justice are conducive and even essential to realizing the human good.

To be stable principles of justice should be realizable in a feasible and enduring social world, the ideal of which Rawls calls a “well-ordered society.” (See below, §6.3.) They need to be practicably possible given the limitations of the human condition. Moreover, this feasible social world must be one that can endure over time, not by just any means, but by gaining the willing support of people who live in it. People should knowingly want to uphold and maintain society’s just institutions not just because they benefit from them, but on grounds of their sense of justice. In choosing principles of justice, the parties in the original position must take into account their “relative stability” (TJ §76). They have to consider the degree to which a conception (in comparison with other conceptions) describes an achievable and sustainable system of social cooperation, and whether the institutions and demands of such a society will attract people’s willing compliance and generally engage their sense of justice.

For example, suppose principles of justice were to impose a duty to practice impartial benevolence towards all people, and thus a duty to show no greater concern for the welfare of ourselves and loved ones than we do towards billions of others. This principle demands too much of human nature and would not be sustainable or even feasible—people simply would reject its onerous demands. But Rawls’s stability requirement implies more than just ‘ought implies can.’ It says that principles of justice and the scheme of social cooperation they describe should evince “stability for the right reasons” ((as Rawls later says in PL xli, 143f., 459f.,). Recall here the higher-order interests of the parties in development and exercise of their capacities for justice. A just society should be able to endure not simply as a modus vivendi, or compromise among conflicting interests; nor simply endure by promoting the majority of peoples’ interests and/or coercive enforcement of its provisions. Stability “for the right reasons,” as conceived in Theory, requires that people support society for moral reasons of justice. Society’s basic principles must respond to reasonable persons’ capacities for justice and engage their sense of justice. Rawls regards our moral capacities for justice as an integral part of our nature as sociable beings. He believes that one role of a conception of justice is to accommodate human capacities for sociability, the capacities for justice that enable us to be cooperative social beings. So not only should a conception of justice advance human interests, but it should also answer to our moral psychology by enabling us to knowingly and willingly exercise our moral capacities and sensibilities, which are among the moral powers to be reasonable. This is one way that Rawls’s conception of justice is “ideal-based” (CP 400–401 n.): it is based in an ideal of human beings as free and equal moral persons and an ideal of their social relations as generally acceptable and justifiable to all reasonable persons whatever their circumstances (the ideal of a well-ordered society).

This relates to the second ground for the stability condition, which can only be mentioned here: it is that the correct principles of justice should be compatible with, and even integral to realizing the human good. It speaks strongly in favor of a conception of justice that it is compatible with and promotes the human good. First, if a conception of justice requires of many reasonable people that they change their conscientious philosophical or religious convictions for the sake of satisfying a majority’s beliefs, or abandon their pursuit of the important interests that constitute their plan of life, this conception could not gain their willing support and would not be stable over sustained periods of time. Moreover, Rawls contends that a conception of justice should enable citizens to fully exercise and adequately develop their moral powers, including their capacities for justice. It must then engage their sense of justice in such a way that they do not regard justice as a burden but should come to experience that acting on and from principles of justice is worth doing for its own sake. For Rawls, it speaks strongly in favor of a conception of justice that acting for the sake of its principles is experienced as an activity that is good in itself (as Rawls contends in Theory of Justice); or at least that willing compliance with requirements of justice is an essential part of the reasonable comprehensive philosophical, religious, or moral doctrines that reasonable persons affirm (as Rawls contends later in Political Liberalism). For then justice and the full and informed exercise of the sense of justice are for reasonable and rational persons essential goods, preconditions for their living a good life, as that is defined by their rational conception of the good.

6. The Arguments for the Principles of Justice from the Original Position

The original position is not a bargaining situation where the parties make proposals and counterproposals and negotiate over different principles of justice. Nor is it a wide ranging discussion where the parties debate, deliberate, and design their own conception of justice (unlike, for example, Habermas’s discourse ethics; see Habermas, 1995). Instead, the parties’ deliberations are much more constrained and regulated. They are presented with a list of conceptions of justice taken from the tradition of western political philosophy. These include different versions of utilitarianism, perfectionism, and intuitionism (or pluralist views), rational egoism, justice as fairness, and a group of “mixed conceptions” that combine elements of these. (For Rawls’s initial list see TJ 124/107) Rawls later says libertarian entitlement principles should also be added to the list, and contends the principles of justice are still preferable. (JF 83). (Nozick agrees and says the OP is incapable of yielding historical entitlement principles, but only patterned end-state principles instead. Nozick 1974, 198–204. Rawls replies that the difference principle does not conform to any observable pattern but grounds fair distributions in a fair social process that must actually be carried out. PL, 282–83)

The parties’ deliberations are confined to discussing and agreeing upon the conception that each finds most rational, given their specified interests. In a series of pairwise comparisons, they consider all the conceptions of justice made available to them and ultimately agree unanimously to accept the conception that survives this winnowing process. In this regard, the original position is best seen as a kind of selection process wherein the parties’ deliberations are constrained by the background conditions imposed by the original position as well as the list of conceptions of justice provided to them. They are assigned the task of agreeing on principles for designing the basic structure of a self-contained society under the circumstances of justice.

In making their decision, the parties are motivated only by their own rational interests. They do not take moral considerations of justice into account except in so far as these considerations bear on their achieving their interests within society. Their interests again are defined in terms of their each acquiring an adequate share of primary social goods (rights and liberties, powers and opportunities, income and wealth, etc.) and achieving the background social conditions enabling them to effectively pursue their conception of the good and realize their higher-order interests in developing and exercising their moral powers. Since the parties are ignorant of their particular conceptions of the good and of all other particular facts about their society, they are not in a position to engage in bargaining. In effect they all have the same general information and are motivated by the same interests.

Rawls makes four arguments in Theory, Part I for the principles of justice. The main argument for the difference principle is made later in TJ §49, and is amended and clarified in Justice as Fairness: A Restatement. The common theme throughout the original position arguments is that it is more rational for the parties to choose the principles of justice over any other alternative. Rawls devotes most of his attention to the comparison of justice as fairness with classical and average utilitarianism, with briefer discussions of perfectionism (TJ, §50) and intuitionism (TJ 278–81) Here I’ll focus discussion primarily on Rawls’s comparison between justice as fairness and utilitarianism.

6.1 The Principles of Justice

Before turning to Rawls’s arguments from the original position, it is helpful to have available the principles of justice and other principles that constitute Justice as Fairness.

First Principle: “Each person has an equal right to the most extensive total system of equal basic liberties compatible with a similar system of liberty for all.” (TJ 266)

The first principle was revised in 1982 to say “Each person has an equal right to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties …” (PL, 291) replacing “… the most extensive scheme of equal basic liberties.”) Notably, Rawls also introduces in Political Liberalism, almost in passing, a principle of basic needs that precedes the first principle and requires that citizens’ basic needs be met at least to the extent that they can understand and fruitfully exercise their basic rights and liberties. (PL 7; JF 79n.) This social minimum is also said in Political Liberalism to be a “constitutional essential” for any reasonable liberal conception of justice. (PL 166, 228ff.; JF 47, n.7)

The basic rights and liberties protected by the first principle are specified by a list (see TJ 53f., PL 291): liberty of conscience and freedom of association, (TJ §§33–4); freedom of thought and freedom of speech and expression (PL, pp.340–363); the integrity and freedom of the person and the right to hold personal property; equal rights of political participation and their fair value (TJ §§36–37); and the rights and liberties protected by the rule of law (due process, freedom from arbitrary arrest, etc. TJ §38). (Rawls says the right to ownership of means of production and laissez faire freedom of contract are not included among the basic liberties. TJ, 54 rev. Also freedom of movement and free choice of occupation are said to be primary goods protected by fair equality of opportunity principle. PL 76, JF 58f.))

Second Principle: “Social and economic inequalities are to satisfy two conditions. First they must attach to offices and positions open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; and second they must be to the greatest advantage of the least advantaged members of society [the difference principle]” consistent with the just savings principle. (PL 281, JF 42–43, TJ 301/266 rev.)

Just Savings Principle: Each generation should save for future generations at a savings rate that they could rationally expect past generations to have saved for them. (TJ §44; JF 159–160)

Principles for individuals, include (a) the natural duties to uphold justice, mutual respect, mutual aid, and not to injure or harm the innocent (TJ §§19, 51); and (b) the principle of fairness, to do one’s fair share in just or nearly just practices and institutions from which one accepts their benefits, (which grounds the principle of fidelity, to keep one’s promises and commitments. (TJ §§18, 52).

The Priority Principles: the principles of justice are ranked in lexical order. (a) The priority of liberty requires that basic liberties can only be restricted to strengthen the system of liberties shared by all. (b) Fair equality of opportunity is lexically prior to the difference principle. (c) The second principle is prior to the principle of efficiency and maximizing the sum of advantages. (TJ 302/266 rev.)

The General Conception of Justice: “All social goods—liberty and opportunity, income and wealth, and the bases of self-respect, are to be distributed equally unless an unequal distribution of any or all of these goods is to the advantage of the least favored.” TJ 1971, 302. Note: The general conception is the difference principle generalized to all primary goods (TJ 1971, 83); it applies in non-ideal conditions where the priority of liberty and opportunity is not sustainable.

6.2 The Argument from the Maximin Criterion (TJ, §§26–28)

Describing the parties’ choice as a rational choice subject to the reasonable constraints imposed by the original position allows Rawls to invoke the theory of rational choice and decision under conditions of uncertainty. In rational choice theory there are a number of potential “strategies” or rules of choice that are more or less reliably used depending on the circumstances. One rule of choice—called “maximin”—directs that we play it as safe as possible by choosing the alternative whose worst outcome leaves us better off than the worst outcome of all other alternatives. The aim is to “maximize the minimum” regret or loss to one’s position (measured in terms of welfare or, for Rawls, one’s share of primary social goods). To follow this strategy, Rawls says you should choose as if your enemy were to assign your social position in whatever kind of society you end up in. By contrast another strategy leads us to focus on the most advantaged position and says we should “maximize the maximum” potential gain—“maximax”—and choose the alternative whose best outcome leaves us better off than all other alternatives. Which, if either, of these strategies is more sensible to use depends on the circumstances and many other factors.

A third strategy advocated by orthodox Bayesian decision theory, says we should always choose to directly maximize expected utility. To do so under conditions of uncertainty of outcomes, the degree of uncertainty should be factored into one’s utility function, with probability estimates assigned to alternatives based on the limited knowledge that one has. Given these subjective estimates of probability incorporated into one’s utility function, one can always choose the alternative that maximizes expected utility. Since it simplifies matters to apply the same rule of choice to all decisions this is a highly attractive idea, so long as one can accept that it is normally safe to assume that that the maximization of expected utility leads over time to maximizing actual utility.

What about those extremely rare instances where there is absolutely no basis upon which to make probability estimates? Suppose you don’t even have a hunch regarding the greater likelihood of one alternative over another. According to orthodox Bayesian decision theory, the “principle of insufficient reason” should then be observed; it says that when there is no reason to assign a greater likelihood to one alternative rather than another, then an equal probability is to be assigned to each potential outcome. This makes sense on the assumption that if you have no more premonition of the likelihood of one option rather than another, they are for all you know equally likely to occur. By observing this rule of choice consistently over time, a rational chooser presumably should maximize expected individual utility, and hopefully actual utility as well.

What now is the appropriate decision rule to be used to choose principles of justice under conditions of complete uncertainty of probabilities in Rawls’s original position? Rawls argues that, given the enormous gravity of choice in the original position, plus the fact that the choice is not repeatable (there’s no opportunity to renegotiate or revise one’s decision), it is rational for the parties to follow the maximin strategy when choosing between the principles of justice and principles of average or aggregate utility (or any other principles that do not guarantee basic rights, liberties, opportunities, and a social minimum). Not surprisingly, following the maximin rule of choice results in choice of the principles of justice over the principles of utility (average or aggregate); for unlike utilitarianism, justice as fairness guarantees equal basic liberties, fair equal opportunities, and an adequate social minimum for all citizens.

Why does Rawls think maximin is the rational choice rule? Recall what is at stake in choice from the original position. The decision is not an ordinary choice. It is rather a unique and irrevocable choice where the parties decide the basic structure of their society, or the kind of social world they will live in and the background conditions against which they will develop and pursue their aims. It is a kind of superchoice—an inimitable choice of the background conditions for all one’s future choices. Rawls argues that because of the unique importance of the choice in the original position—including the gravity of the choice, the fact that it is not renegotiable or repeatable, and the fact that it determines all one’s future prospects—it is rational to follow the maximin rule and choose the principles of justice. For should even the worst transpire, the principles of justice guarantee an adequate share of primary goods enabling one to maintain one’s conscientious convictions and sincerest affections and pursue a wide range of permissible ends by protecting equal basic liberties and fair equal opportunities and guaranteeing an adequate social minimum of income and wealth. The principles of utility, by contrast, provide no guarantee of any of these benefits.

Rawls says that in general there are three conditions that must be met in order to make it rational to follow the maximin rule (TJ 154–55/134 rev.). First, there should be no basis or at most a very insecure basis upon which to make estimates of probabilities. Second, the choice singled out by observing the maximin rule is an acceptable alternative we can live with, so that one cares relatively little by comparison for what is to be gained above the minimum conditions secured by the maximin choice. When this condition is satisfied, then no matter what position one eventually ends up in, it is at least acceptable. The third condition for applying the maximin rule is that all the other alternatives have worse outcomes that we could not accept and live with. Of these three conditions Rawls later says that the first plays a minor role, and that it is the second and third conditions that are crucial to the maximin argument for justice as fairness (JF 99). This seems to suggest that, even if the veil of ignorance were not as thick and parties did have some degree of knowledge of the likelihood of ending up in one social position rather than another, still it would be more rational to choose the principles of justice over the principle of utility.

Rawls contends all three conditions for the maximin strategy are satisfied in the original position when choice is made between the principles of justice and the principle of utility (average and aggregate). Because all one’s values, commitments, and future prospects are at stake in the original position, and there is no hope of renegotiating the outcome, a rational person would agree to the principles of justice instead of the principle of utility. For the principles of justice imply that no matter what position you occupy in society, you will have the rights and resources needed to maintain your valued commitments and purposes, to effectively exercise your capacities for rational and moral deliberation and action, and to maintain your sense of self-respect as an equal citizen. With the principle of utility there is no such guarantee; everything is “up for grabs” (so to speak) and subject to loss if required by the greater sum of utilities. Conditions (2) and (3) for applying maximin are then satisfied in the comparison of justice as fairness with the principle of (average or aggregate) utility.

It is often claimed that Rawls’s parties are “risk-averse;” otherwise they would never follow the maximin rule but would take a chance on riskier but more rewarding outcomes provided by the principle of utility. Thus, John Harsanyi contends that it is more rational under conditions of complete uncertainty always to choose according to the principle of insufficient reason and assume an equal probability of occupying any position in society. When the equiprobability assumption is made, the parties in the original position would choose the principle of average utility instead of the principles of justice (Harsanyi 1975).

Rawls denies that the parties have a psychological disposition to risk-aversion. They have no knowledge of their attitudes towards risk. He argues however that it is rational to choose as if one were risk averse under the highly exceptional circumstances of the original position. His point is that, while there is nothing rational about a fixed disposition to risk aversion, it is nonetheless rational in some circumstances to choose conservatively to protect certain fundamental interests against loss or compromise. It does not make one a risk averse person, but instead it is normally rational to purchase auto liability, health, and home insurance against accident or calamity (assuming it is affordable). The original position is such a situation writ large. Even if one knew in the original position that the citizen one represents enjoys gambling and taking great risks, this would still not be a reason to gamble with their rights, liberties and starting position in society. For if the high risktaker were born into a traditional, repressive, or fundamentalist society, they might never have an opportunity for gambling and taking other risks they normally enjoy. It is rational then even for high risktakers to choose conservatively in the original position and guarantee their future opportunities to gamble or otherwise take risks.

Harsanyi and other orthodox Bayesians contend that maximin is an irrational decision rule, and they provide ample examples. To take Rawls’ own example, in a lottery where the loss and gain alternatives are either (0, n) or (1/n, 1) for all natural numbers n, maximin says choose the latter alternative (1/n, 1). This is clearly irrational for almost any number n except very small numbers. (TJ 136 rev.). But such examples do not suffice here; simply because maximin is under most circumstances irrational does not mean that it is never rational. For example, suppose n>1 and you must have 1/n to save you own life. Given the gravity of the circumstances, it would be rational to choose conservatively since you are guaranteed 1/n according to the maximin strategy, and there is no guarantee you will survive if you choose according to the principle of insufficient reason.

No doubt maximin is an irrational strategy under most circumstances of choice uncertainty, particularly under circumstances where we will have future opportunities to recoup our losses and choose again. But these are not the circumstances of the original position. Once the principles of justice are decided, they apply in perpetuity, and there is no opportunity to renegotiate or escape the situation. One who relies on the equiprobability assumption in choosing principles of justice in the original position is being foolishly reckless given the gravity of choice at stake. It is not being risk-averse, but rather entirely rational to refuse to gamble with one’s basic liberties, fair equal opportunities and adequate resources needed to pursue one’s most cherished ends and commitments, simply for the unknown chance of gaining the marginally greater social powers, income and wealth that might be available to some in a society governed entirely by the principle of utility.

Rawls exhibits the force of the maximin argument in discussing liberty of conscience. He says (TJ, sect. 33) that a person who is willing to jeopardize their right to hold and practice their conscientious religious, philosophical and moral convictions, all for the sake of gaining uncertain added benefits via the principle of utility, does not know what it means to have conscientious beliefs, or at least does not take such beliefs seriously (TJ 207–08/181–82 rev.). A rational person with convictions about what gives life meaning is not willing to negotiate with and gamble away the right to hold and express those convictions and the freedom to act on them. After all what could be the basis for negotiation, for what could matter more than the objects of one’s most sincere convictions and commitments? Some people (e.g. some nihilists) may not have any conscientious convictions (except the belief that nothing is worthwhile) and are simply willing to act on impulse or on whatever thoughts and desires they happen to have at the moment. But behind the veil of ignorance no one knows whether they are such a person, and it would be foolish to make this assumption. Knowing general facts about human propensities and sociability, the parties must take into account that people normally have conscientious convictions and values and commitments they are unwilling to compromise. (Besides, even the nihilist should want to protect the freedom to be a nihilist, to avoid ending up in an intolerant religious society.) Thus it remains irrational to jeopardize basic liberties by choosing the principle of utility instead of the principles of justice.

None of this is to say that maximin is normally a rational choice strategy. Rawls himself says it “is not, in general, a suitable guide for choices under uncertainty” (TJ 153). It is not even a rational strategy in the original position when the alternatives for choice guarantee basic liberties, equal opportunities, and a social minimum guaranteed by the principle of average utility – see the discussion in the supplementary section:

The Argument for the Difference Principle

in the supplementary document The Argument for the Difference Principle and the Four Stage Sequence.

Rawls relies upon the maximin argument mainly to argue for the first principle of justice and fair equality of opportunity. Other arguments are needed to support his claim that justice requires the social minimum be determined by the difference principle.

6.3 The Strains of Commitment

There are three additional arguments Rawls makes to support justice as fairness (all in TJ, sect. 29). Each of these depends upon the concept of a “well-ordered society.” The parties in the original position are to choose principles that are to govern a well-ordered society where everyone agrees, complies with, and wants to comply with its principles of justice. The ideal of a well-ordered society is Rawls’s development of social contract doctrine. It is a society in which (1) everyone knows and willingly accepts and affirms the same public principles of justice and everyone knows this; (2) these principles are successfully realized in basic social institutions, including laws and conventions, and are generally complied with by citizens; and (3) reasonable persons are morally motivated to comply by their sense of justice – they want to do what justice requires of them (TJ 4–5, §69). There are then two sides to Rawls’s social contract. The parties in the original position have the task of agreeing to principles that all can rationally accept behind the veil of ignorance under the conditions of the original position. But their rational choice is partially determined by the principles that free and equal moral persons in a well ordered society who are motivated by their sense of justice reasonably can accept, agree to.and comply with, as the basic principles governing their social and political relations.

The parties are to assess principles according to the relative stability of the well ordered societies into which they are incorporated. Thus a well-ordered society of justice as fairness is to be compared with a well-ordered society whose basic structure is organized according to the average utility principle, aggregate utility, perfectionism, intuitionism, libertarianism, and so on. They are to consider which of these societies’ basic struture is relatively more stable and likely to endure over time from one generation to the next, given natural and socially influenced psychological propensities and conditions of social cooperation as they interact with alternative principles of justice.

Now to return to Rawls’s arguments for his principles of justice. The first of Rawls’s three arguments highlights the idea that choice in the original position is an agreement, and involves certain “strains of commitment.” It is assumed by all the parties that all will comply with the principles they agree to once the veil is lifted and they are members of a well-ordered society (TJ 176f./153f. and CP 250ff). Knowing that they will be held to their commitment and expected to comply with principles for a well-ordered society, the parties must choose principles that they sincerely believe they will be able to accept, endorse and willingly observe under conditions where these principles are generally accepted and enforced. For reasons to be discussed shortly, Rawls says this condition favors agreement on the principles of justice over utilitarianism and other alternatives.

But first, consider the frequent objection that there is no genuine agreement in the original position, for the thick veil of ignorance deprives the parties of all bases for bargaining (cf. TJ, 139–40/120–21 rev.). In the absence of bargaining, it is said, there can be no contract. For contracts must involve a quid pro quo—something given for something received (called ‘consideration’ at common law). The parties in the OP cannot bargain without knowing what they have to offer or to gain in exchange. So (the objection continues) Rawls’s original position does not involve a real social contract, unlike those that transpire, say, in a state of nature. Rather, since the parties are all “described in the same way,” there is no need for multiple parties but simply the rational choice of one person in the original position (see Hampton, 1980, 334; see also Gauthier, 1974 and 1985, 203).

In response, not all contracts involve bargaining or are of the nature of economic transactions. Some involve a mutual pledge and commitment to shared purposes and principles. Marriage contracts, or agreements among friends or the members of a religious, benevolent, or political association are often of this nature. For example, the Mayflower Compact was a “covenant” to “combine ourselves together into a civil body politic” charged with making and administering “just and equal laws…for the general good.” Likewise the U.S. Constitution represents itself as a commitment wherein “We The People … ordain and establish this Constitution” in order “to establish justice,” “promote the general welfare,” “secure the blessings of liberty,” and so on. The agreement in Rawls’s original position is more of this nature. Even though ignorant of particular facts about themselves, the parties in fact do give something in exchange for something received: they all exchange their mutual commitment to accept and abide by the principles of justice and to uphold just institutions once they enter their well-ordered society. Each agrees only on condition others do too, and all tie themselves into social and political relations in perpetuity. Their agreement is final, and they will not permit its renegotiation should circumstances turn out to be different than some had hoped for. Their mutual commitment to justice is reflected by the fact that once these principles become embodied in institutions there are no legitimate means that permit anyone to depart from the terms of their agreement. As a result, the parties have to take seriously the moral and legal obligations and potential social sanctions they will incur as a result of their agreement, for there is no going back to the initial situation. So if they do not sincerely believe that they can accept the requirements of a conception of justice and voluntarily conform their actions and life plans accordingly, then these are strong reasons to avoid choosing those principles. It would not be rational for the parties to take risks, falsely assuming that if they end up badly, they can violate at will the terms of agreement or later regain their initial situation and renegotiate terms of cooperation (see Freeman, 1990; Freeman, 2007b, 180–182).

Rawls gives special poignancy to this mutual commitment of the parties by making it a condition that the parties cannot choose and agree to principles in bad faith; they have to be able, not simply to live with and grudgingly accept, but instead to willingly endorse the principles of justice as members of society. Essential to Rawls’s argument for stability is the assumption of everyone’s willing compliance with requirements of justice. This is a feature of a well-ordered society. The parties are assumed to have a sense of justice; indeed the development and exercise of it is one of their fundamental interests. Hence they must choose principles that that they can not only accept and live with, but which are responsive to their sense of justice and they can unreservedly endorse. Given these conditions on choice, the parties cannot take risks with principles they know they will have difficulty complying with voluntarily. They would be making an agreement in bad faith, and this is ruled out by the conditions of the original position.

Rawls contends that these “strains of commitment” created by the parties’ agreement strongly favor the principles of justice over the principles of utility and other teleological (and most consequentialist) views. For everyone’s freedom, basic rights and liberties, and basic needs are met by the principles of justice because of their egalitarian nature. Given the lack of these guarantees under the principle of utility, it is much more difficult for those who end up worse off in a utilitarian society to willingly accept their situation and commit themselves to the utility principle. It is a rare person indeed who can freely and without resentment sacrifice their life prospects so that those who are better off can have even greater comforts, privileges, and powers. This is too much to demand of our capacities for human benevolence. It requires a kind of commitment that people cannot make in good faith, for who could willingly support laws that are so detrimental to oneself and the people one cares about most that they must sacrifice their fundamental interests for the sake of those more advantaged? Besides, why should we encourage such subservient dispositions and the accompanying lack of self-respect? The principles of justice, by contrast, conform better with everyone’s interests, their desire for self-respect and their natural moral capacities to reciprocally recognize and respect others’ legitimate interests while freely promoting their own good. The strains of commitment incurred by agreement in the original position provide strong reasons for the parties to choose the principles of justice and reject the risks involved in choosing the principles of average or aggregate utility.

6.4 Stability, Publicity, and Self-Respect

Rawls’s strains-of-commitment argument explicitly relies upon a rarely noted feature of his argument: as mentioned earlier, there are in effect two social contracts. First, hypothetical agents situated equally in the original position unanimously agree to principles of justice. This agreement has attracted the most attention from Rawls’s critics. But the parties’ hypothetical agreement in the original position is patterned on the general acceptability of a conception of justice by free and equal persons in a well-ordered society. Rawls says, “The reason for invoking the concept of a contract in the original position lies in its correspondence with the features of a well-ordered society [which] require…that everyone accepts, and knows that the others accept, the same principles of justice” (CP 250). In order for the hypothetical parties in the original position to agree on principles of justice, there must be a high likelihood that real persons, given human nature and general facts about social and economic cooperation, can also agree and act on the same principles, and that a society structured by these principles is feasible and can endure. This is the stability requirement referred to earlier. One conception of justice is relatively more stable than another the more willing people are to observe its requirements under conditions of a well-ordered society. Assuming that each conception of justice has a corresponding society that is as well-ordered as can be according to its terms, the stability question raised in Theory is: Which conception of justice is more likely to engage the moral sensibilities and sense of justice of free and equal persons as well as affirm their good? This requires an inquiry into moral psychology and the human good, which takes up most of Part III of A Theory of Justice.

Rawls makes two arguments in Theory from the original position that invoke the stability requirement, the arguments (1) from publicity and (2) from self-respect (see TJ, §29)

(1) The argument from publicity: Rawls contends that utilitarianism, perfectionism, and other “teleological” conceptions are unlikely to be freely acceptable to many citizens when made fully public under the conditions of a well-ordered society. Recall the publicity condition discussed earlier: A feature of a well-ordered society is that its regulative principles of justice are publicly known and appealed to as a basis for deciding laws and justifying basic institutions. Because all reasonable members of society accept the public conception of justice, there is no need for the illusions and delusions of ideology for a society to function properly and citizens to accept its laws and institutions willingly. In this sense a well-ordered society lacks false consciousness about the bases of social and political relations. (PL 68–69n.) A conception of justice that satisfies the publicity condition but that cannot maintain the stability of a well-ordered society is to be rejected by the parties in the original position. Rawls contends that under the publicity condition justice as fairness generally engages citizens’ sense of justice and remains more stable than utilitarianism (TJ 177f./154f.rev.) For public knowledge that reasons of maximum average (or aggregate) utility determine the distribution of benefits and burdens would lead those worse-off to object to and resent their situation, and reject the principle of utility as the basic principle governing social institutions. After all, the well-being and interests of the least advantaged, perhaps even their basic liberties, are being sacrificed for the greater happiness of those who are already more fortunate and have a greater share of primary social goods. It is too much to expect of human nature that people should freely acquiesce in and embrace such publicly known terms of cooperation. By contrast, the principles of justice are designed to advance reciprocally everyone’s position; those who are better off do not achieve their gains at the expense of the less advantaged. “Since everyone’s good is affirmed, all acquire inclinations to uphold the scheme” (TJ, 177/155). It is a feature of our moral psychology, Rawls contends, that we normally come to form attachments to people and institutions that are concerned with our good; moreover we tend to resent those persons and institutions that take unfair advantage of us and act contrary to our good. Rawls argues at length in chapter 8 of Theory, §§70–75, that justice as fairness accords better than alternative principles with the reciprocity principles of moral psychology that are characteristic of human beings’ moral development.

In Political Liberalism, Rawls expands the publicity condition to include three levels: First, the principles of justice governing a well-ordered society are publicly known and appealed to in political debate and deliberation; second, so too are the general beliefs in light of which society’s conception of justice is generally accepted—including beliefs about human nature and the way political and social institutions generally work—and citizens generally agree on these beliefs that support society’s onception of justice. Finally the full justification of the public conception of justice is also publicly known (or at least publicly available to any who are interested) and is reflected in society’s system of law, judicial decisions and other political institutions, as well as its system of education.

(2) The argument from the social bases of self-respect: The publicity condition is also crucial to Rawls’s fourth argument for the principles of justice, from the social bases of self-respect (TJ, 178–82/155–59 rev.). These principles, when publicly known, give greater support to citizens’ sense of self-respect than do utilitarian and perfectionist principles. Rawls says self-respect is “perhaps the most important primary good,” (TJ, 440/386 rev.) since few things seem worth doing if a person has little sense of their own worth or no confidence in their abilities to execute a worthwhile life plan or fulfill the duties and expectations in their role as citizens. The parties in the original position will then aim to choose principles that best secure their sense of self-respect. Now being regarded by others as a free and independent person of equal status with others is crucial to the self-respect of persons who regard themselves as free and equal members of a democratic society. Justice as fairness, by affording and protecting the priority of equal basic liberties and fair equal opportunities for all, secures the status of each as free and equal citizens. For example, because of equal political liberties, there are no “passive citizens” who must depend on others to politically protect their rights and interests; and with fair equal opportunities no one has grounds to experience the resentment that inevitably arises in societies where social positions are effectively closed off to those less advantaged or less powerful. Moreover, the second principle secures adequate social powers and economic resources for all so that they find the effective exercise of their equal basic liberties to be worthwhile. The second principle has the effect of making citizens socially and economically independent, so that no one need be subservient to the will of another. Citizens then can regard and respect one another as equals, and not as masters or subordinates. (“Non-domination,” an idea central to contemporary Republicanism, is then essential to citizens’ sense of self-respect in Rawls’s sense. See Pettit 1997.) Equal basic liberties, fair equal opportunities, and political and economic independence are primary among the social bases of self-respect in a democratic society. The parties in the original position should then choose the principles of justice over utilitarianism and other teleological views both to secure their sense of self-respect, and to procure the same for others, thereby guaranteeing greater overall stability.

In connection with Rawls’s argument for the greater stability of principles of justice on grounds of their publicity and the bases of self-respect, Rawls provides a Kantian interpretation of difference principle. He says: “[T]he difference principle interprets the distinction between treating men as means only and treating them as ends in themselves. To regard persons as ends in themselves in the basic design of society is to agree to forgo those gains that do not contribute to everyone’s expectations. By contrast to regard persons as means is to be prepared to impose on those already less favored still lower prospects of life for the sake of the higher expectations of others” (TJ 157 rev.). Rawls says the principle of utility does just this; it treats the less fortunate as means since it requires them to accept even lower life prospects for the sake of others who are more fortunate and already better off. This exhibits a lack of respect for the less advantaged and in turn has the effect of undermining their sense of self respect. (TJ 158 rev.) The difference principle, by contrast, does not treat people as means or undermine their sense of self respect, and this adds to the reasons the parties have for choosing the principles of justice instead of the principle of utility.

Rawls substantially relies on the publicity condition to argue against utilitarianism and perfectionism. He says publicity “arises naturally from a contractarian standpoint” (TJ, 133/115 rev.). In Theory he puts great weight on publicity ultimately because he thinks that giving people knowledge of the moral bases of coercive laws and the principles governing society is a condition of fully acknowledging and respecting them as free and responsible rational moral agents. With publicity of principles of justice, people have knowledge of the real reasons for their social and political relations and the formative influences of the basic structure on their characters, plans and prospects. In a well-ordered society with a public conception of justice, there is no need for an “esoteric morality” that must be confined “to an enlightened few” (as Sidgwick says of utilitarianism, Sidgwick 1907 [1981], 490). Moreover, public principles of justice can serve agents in their practical reasoning and provide democratic citizens a common basis for political argument and justification. These considerations underlie Rawls’s later contention that having knowledge of the principles that determine the bases of social relations is a precondition of individuals’ freedom.(CP 325f.) Rawls means in part that publicity of society’s fundamental principles is a condition of citizens’ exercise of the powers and abilities that enable them to take full responsibility for their lives. Full publicity is then a condition of the political and (in TJ) moral autonomy of persons, which are significant values according to justice as fairness. (TJ §78, PL 68, CP 325–26)

Utilitarians often regard Rawls’s emphasis on the publicity of the fundamental principles underlying social cooperation as unwarranted. They contend that publicity of laws is of course important for them to be effective, but there’s no practical need for the publicity of the fundamental principles (such as the principles of efficiency and utility) that govern political decisions, the economy, and society, much less so for the publicity of the full justification of these principles. Most people are not interested and have little understanding of the complex often technical details that must go into deciding laws and social policies. Moreover, as Sidgwick claimed, utilitarianism functions better as an “esoteric morality” that is not generally incorporated into the public justification of laws and institutions. Others claim that Rawls’s arguments from publicity are exaggerated. If people were properly educated to believe that promoting greater overall happiness or welfare is the ultimate requirement of justice and more generally of morality, then just as they have for centuries constrained their conduct and their self-interests and accepted political constraints on their own liberties for the sake of their religious beliefs, so too could they be educated to accept the promotion of social utility and the general welfare as the fundamental bases for social and political cooperation.

Supplementary Documents on Other Topics

Additional topics concerining the original position are discussed in the following supplementary documents:

  • The Argument for the Difference Principle. Explains the Difference Principle and the least advantaged class. Comparison of the difference principle with mixed conceptions, including restricted utility. Arguments from reciprocity, stability and self-respect, and the strains of commitment. Rawls’s reasons why the difference principle supports property owning democracy rather than welfare-state capitalism.
  • The Four Stage Sequence. How principles chosen in OP (first stage) apply to choice of political constitution (second-stage), democratic legislation (third stage), and application of laws to particular circumstances (fourth stage).
  • Ideal Theory, Strict Compliance and the Well-Ordered Society. Why strict compliance is said to be necessary to justification of universal principles. Sen’s, Mills’s, and others’ criticisms of ideal theory. Rawls’s contention that ideal theory is necessary to determine injustice in non-ideal conditions. Role of non-ideal theory.
  • A Liberal Feminist Critique of the Original Position and Justice within the Family. Criticism of “heads of families” assumption in OP and Rawls’s response to criticisms that principles do not secure equal justice for women and children. Rawls’s discussion of justice within the family.
  • The Original Position and the Law of Peoples. Rawls’s extension of OP to decisions on the Law of Peoples governing relations among liberal and decent societies. Human rights, the duty to assist burdened peoples, oulaw societies, and Rawls’s rejection of a global principle of distributive justice.
  • Constructivism, Objectivity, Autonomy, and the Original Position. Kantian Interpretation of the OP and Constructivism. OP as a procedure of construction and objective point of view. Response to Humean argument that social agreements cannot justify. Role of OP in reflective equilibrium.
  • Is the Original Position Necessary or Relevant? Reply to claims that OP is superfluous or irrelevant. Why Rawls thinks rational acceptance of principles in OP and congruence of Right and Good is essential to justice.


Primary Sources

The following works by John Rawls are cited above.

  • [TJ] A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. Revised edition, 1999. The page citations refer first to the 1971 edition first, and the revised edition thereafter, as in (TJ 17/16 rev.).
  • [PL] Political Liberalism, New York: Columbia University Press, 1993. Paperback edition, 1996; Expanded edition, 2005.
  • [LP] The Law of Peoples, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • [CP] Collected Papers, S. Freeman (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • [LHMP] Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, B. Herman (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999.
  • [JF] Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, E. Kelly (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2001.
  • [LHPP] Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy, S. Freeman (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2007.

Secondary Sources

  • Appiah, Anthony, 2017, As If: Idealization and Ideals, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Audard, Catherine, 2007, John Rawls (Philosophy Now), McGill-Queens University Press.
  • Beitz, Charles, 1999, Political Theory and International Relations (revised edition), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Buchak, Lara, 2017, “Taking Risks behind the Veil of Ignorance”, Ethics, 127(3): 610–644.
  • Cohen, G. A., 2008, Rescuing Justice and Equality, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press. [see index for discussions of original position]
  • Cohen, Joshua, 2015, ‘The Original Position and Scanlon’s Contractualism,’ in T. Hinton (ed.), The Original Position, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press..
  • Daniels, Norman (ed.), 1975, Reading Rawls: Critical Studies on John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice, New York: Basic Books. Reissued with new Preface, 1989.
  • –––, 1996, Justice and Justification, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [see especially Daniels’ essays on reflective equilibrium]
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 1977, ‘Justice and Rights’ in Taking Rights Seriously, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press. (Also in Daniels 1975, entitled ‘The Original Position’.)
  • Edmundson, William A., 2017, John Rawls: Reluctant Socialist, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • English, Jane, 1977, “Justice Between Generations,” Philosophical Studies, 31: 91–104.
  • Freeman, Samuel (ed.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Freeman, Samuel, 1990, ‘Reason and Agreement in Social Contract Views,’ Philosophy and Public Affairs, 19(2): 122–157. (Also in Freeman, 2007a, 17–44.)
  • –––, 2007a, Justice and the Social Contract: Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2007b, Rawls, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2013, ‘Property Owning Democracy and the Difference Principle,’ Analyse & Kritik, 35(1): 9–36.
  • –––, 2018, Liberalism and Distributive Justice, Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Gaus, Gerald, 2016, The Tyranny of the Ideal, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Gauthier, David, 1974, ‘Justice and Natural Endowment: Towards a Critique of Rawls’s Ideological Framework,’ in D. Gauthier, Moral Dealing: Contract, Ethics, and Reason, Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 1990, 150–170.
  • –––, 1985, ‘Bargaining and Justice,’ in D. Gauthier, Moral Dealing: Contract, Ethics, and Reason, Ithaca NY: Cornell University Press, 1990, 187–206.
  • Griffin, S., and Solum, L. (eds.), 1994, Symposium on John Rawls’s Political Liberalism, Chicago Kent Law Review, 69: 549–842.
  • Habermas, Juergen, 1995, ‘Reconciliation through the Public Use of Reason: Remarks on John Rawls’s Political Liberalism,’ The Journal of Philosophy, 92(3): 109–131.
  • Hampton, Jean, 1980, ‘Contracts and Choices: Does Rawls Have a Social Contract Theory?’ Journal of Philosophy, 77: 315–38.
  • Hare, R.M., 1981, Moral Thinking: Its Levels, Method, and Point, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hart, H.L.A., 1973, ‘Rawls on Liberty and its Priority,’ University of Chicago Law Review, 40 (3): 551–55, reprinted Daniels (ed.), 1975, 249–52.
  • Harsanyi, John, 1975, ‘Can the Maximin Principle Serve as the Basis for Morality? A Critique of John Rawls’s Theory,’ American Political Science Review, 69: 594–606.
  • Hinton, Timothy (ed.), 2016, The Original Position, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1651, Leviathan, Richard Tuck (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Hume, David, 1748 [1777], ‘Of the Original Contract,’ in his Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, 1777; reprinted Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1985, 465–87.
  • –––, 1739 [1978], A Treatise of Human Nature (Book III, Part 3, Sec. I), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2nd edition, 1978.
  • –––, 1777 [1970], Enquiries Concerning the Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2nd edition, 1970.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1785, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, in Kant: Practical Philosophy, Mary Gregor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • –––, 1793, ‘On the common saying: that may be true in theory but it is of no use in practice, in Kant: Practical Philosophy, Mary Gregor (ed.).
  • –––, 1797, “Doctrine of Right” (The Metaphysics of Morals: Part I), in Kant: Practical Philosophy, Mary Gregor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kaufman, Alexander, 2018, Rawls’s Egalitarianism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [chap.3 on constructivism; chap. 4 on the maximin argument]
  • Kittay, Eva Feder, 1997, “Human Dependency and Rawlsian Equality,” in Feminists Rethink the Self, Diana Meyers (ed.), Boulder: Westview.
  • –––, 2019, Love’s Labor: Essays on Women, Equality, and Dependency, New York: Routledge, 2nd edition.
  • Locke, John, 1689, The Second Treatise on Government, in Two Treatises on Government, Peter Laslett (ed.), Cambridge: University Press, 1960, 1988.
  • Lloyd, Sharon (ed.), 1994, John Rawls’s Political Liberalism, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 75 [special double issue].
  • Maffetone, Sebastiano, 2010, Rawls: An Introduction, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Mandle, Jon, 2009, Rawls’s A Theory of Justice: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mandle, Jon, and David Reidy (eds.), 2013, A Companion to Rawls, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1981, After Virtue, Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press.
  • Martin, R. and Reidy, D. (eds), 2006, Rawls’s Law of Peoples: A Realistic Utopia?, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Mills, Charles, 2016, Black Rights, White Wrongs, Oxford: Oxford University Press, chs. 8–10.
  • –––, 2020, ‘Theorizing Racial Justice’ (Tanner Lecture on Human Value), University of Michigan [Mills 2020 available online].
  • Nozick, Robert, 1974, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
  • Nussbaum, Martha, 2006, Frontiers of Justice, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2003, ‘Rawls and Feminism,’ in The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, S. Freeman (ed.).
  • Okin, Susan Moller, 1987, ‘Justice and Gender,’ Philosophy & Public Affairs, 16 (1): 42–72.
  • –––, 1989, Justice, Gender, and the Family, New York: Basic Books, ch. 5.
  • Parfit, Derek, 1984, Reasons and Persons, Oxford: University Press.
  • Pateman, Carol, and Charles Mills, 2007, The Contract and Domination, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Pettit, Philip, 1997, Republicanism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pogge, T., 1989, Realizing Rawls, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 2007, John Rawls: His Life and Theory of Justice, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Raz, Joseph, 1990, ‘The Face of Epistemic Abstinence,’ Philosophy and Public Affairs, 19(1): 3–46.
  • Richardson, H., and Weithman, P. (eds.), 1999, The Philosophy of Rawls: A Collection of Essays, 5 volumes, New York: Garland.
  • Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1762, The Social Contract, in R. Masters and C. Kelly (eds.), The Collected Writings of Rousseau (Volume IV), Hanover: University Press of New England.
  • Sandel, Michael, 1982, Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Shelby, Tommie, 2004, ‘Race and Social Justice: Rawlsian Considerations, Fordham Law Review, 72 (Symposium on John Rawls and the Law): 1697–1714
  • –––, 2013, ‘Racial Realities and Corrective Justice: A Reply to Charles Mills,’ Critical Philosophy of Race, 1 (2): 145–162.
  • Scanlon, T.M., 1973 [1975], ‘Rawls’s Theory of Justice,’ University of Pennsylvania Law Review, 121 (1973): 1020–69; reprinted in N. Daniels (ed.), Reading Rawls, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1975, 169–205.
  • –––, 1982, ‘Contractualism and Utilitarianism,’ in A. Sen & B. Williams, Utilitarianism and beyond, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 103–128.
  • –––, 1998, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, ch. 5.
  • –––, 2003, ‘Rawls on Justification,’ in S. Freeman (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, 139–167.
  • –––, 2004, Being Realistic About Reasons, Oxford: Oxford University Press
  • Scheffler, Samuel, 2001, Boundaries and Allegiances, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Schmidtz, David, 2018, ‘Ideal Theory,’ in The Oxford Handbook of Distributive Justice, Serena Olsaretti (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schouten, Gina, 2019, Liberalism, Neutrality, and the Gendered Division of Labor, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sen, Amartya, 2009, The Idea of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1907 [1981], The Methods of Ethics, 7th edition, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Simmons, John, 2010, ‘Ideal and Nonideal Theory,’ Philosophy & Public Affairs, 38: 5–36.
  • Stemplowska, Zofia and Adam Swift, 2012, ‘Ideal and Non-Ideal Theory,’ in The Oxford Handbook of Political Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tan, Kok Chor, 2000, Toleration, Diversity and Global Justice, State College, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • van Parijs, Philippe, 2003, ‘Difference Principles,’ in S. Freeman (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Rawls.
  • Waldron, Jeremy, 1986, ‘John Rawls and the Social Minimum,’ Journal of Applied Philosophy, 3(1): 21–33.
  • Weithman, Paul, 2013, Why Political Liberalism?: On John Rawls’s Political Turn, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Bernard, 1981 Moral Luck, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolf, Susan, 2014, The Variety of Values: Essays on Morality, Meaning and Love, New York: Oxford University Press.

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