Reflective Equilibrium

First published Mon Nov 27, 2023

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Carl Knight replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

If you believe that conduct in some case is right or wrong, you have a moral judgment or intuition. Perhaps you have many such judgments about different cases. You might, nevertheless, consider that judgments alone do not justify the moral views they express. You and your moral interlocutors might be concerned that “what we actually accept is fraught with idiosyncrasy and vulnerable to vagaries of history and personality” (Elgin 1996: 108) or displays “irregularities and distortions” (Rawls 1971: 48).

John Rawls proposed to address these concerns through the method of reflective equilibrium. We first ensure that our judgments are considered, being made in circumstances appropriate for moral deliberation. We are then to consider general principles that might accommodate our set of considered judgments—and more than that, explain and extend them. On the standard wide reflective equilibrium, we are to consider

all possible descriptions to which one might plausibly conform one’s judgments together with all relevant philosophical arguments for them. (Rawls 1971: 49)

This requires that we reflect on a wide range of principles, arguments, and theories. Equilibrium is reached where principles and judgments have been revised such that they agree with each other. In short, the method of reflective equilibrium is the mutual adjustment of principles and judgments in the light of relevant argument and theory.

Reflective equilibrium is the dominant method in moral and political philosophy (McPherson 2015: 652; Anderson 2015; de Maagt 2017: 444). Its advocates suggest that “it is the only rational game in town for the moral theorist” or “the only defensible method” (DePaul 1993: 6; Scanlon 2003: 149; see also Freeman 2007: 35–36; Floyd 2017: 377–378). Though often endorsed, it is far more frequently used. Wherever a philosopher presents principles, motivated by arguments and examples, they are likely to be using the method. They are adjusting their principles—and with luck, their readers’—to the judgments suggested by the arguments and examples. Alternatively they might “bite the bullet” by adjusting initially discordant judgments to accommodate otherwise appealing principles. Either way, they are usually describing a process of reflective equilibrium, with principles adjusted to judgments or vice versa. Reflective equilibrium is a formal expression of standard methodological practice in moral and political philosophy. (See Rawls 1971, e.g., 19–21, for a famous application of reflective equilibrium, and Rechnitzer 2022 for a reconstruction of Thomson 2008 in terms of reflective equilibrium.)

This entry first addresses the judgments that are the starting point for reflective equilibrium, examining various interpretations of them found in the literature. It then explores the principles and theories that take us from merely having judgments to reaching reflective equilibrium. Finally, it considers some of the main objections to the method. Throughout the focus will be on reflective equilibrium in its archetypal setting of moral and political philosophy, especially as it has been developed by Rawls and Norman Daniels, though with some reference to versions of the method developed in other branches of philosophy (e.g., Goodman 1965; Lewis 1983; Elgin 1996).

1. Judgments

While the distinction between judgments and principles may intuitively correspond to that between the particular and the general,

[p]eople have considered judgments at all levels of generality, from those about particular situations and institutions up through broad standards and first principles to formal and abstract conditions on moral conceptions. (Rawls 1974: 8)

A first distinction is, then, that while principles necessarily generalize to more than one case (List & Valentini 2016; Slavny et al. 2021), judgments may be either general or particular. A second distinction is that judgments express an agent’s moral outlook while principles are candidate representations of that outlook (cf. Brun 2014). In reflective equilibrium, judgments are the views actually held by the moral deliberator while a “scheme of principles represents their moral conception and characterizes their moral sensibility” (Rawls 1974: 7; see also Rawls 1971: 48). This section examines judgments, while the next considers principles.

1.1 Considered Judgments

The method of reflective equilibrium starts with judgments. An initial question is which of these judgments should be allowed entry to the process.

An obvious position with some appeal is to allow any judgments or intuitions. A permissive view says that

[o]ur “intuitions” are simply opinions; our philosophical theories are the same. Some are commonsensical, some are sophisticated; some are particular, some general; some are more firmly held, some less. But they are all opinions, and a reasonable goal for a philosopher is to bring them into equilibrium … If our official theories disagree with what we cannot help thinking outside the philosophy room, then no real equilibrium has been reached. (Lewis 1983: x; cf. Goodman 1965: 63–64)

This might seem cavalier, but we are at the moment only discussing the starting point of the method. If reflective equilibrium does its job, our initial judgments may be transformed, and will at any rate cohere with theoretical considerations.

The mainstream view, by contrast, suggests that only considered judgments should be used in reflective equilibrium. These are “those judgments in which our moral capacities are least likely to be displayed without distortion” (Rawls 1971: 47). We should (1) be capable of reaching the right decision (e.g., be reasonably well informed), (2) be in circumstances where we can do so (e.g., not be scared or upset), and (3) be motivated to do so (e.g., not stand to gain or lose from the results of our deliberations). In short, we should have the ability, opportunity, and desire to make the right decision (Rawls 1971: 48). In moral and political philosophy, the judgments used in reflective equilibrium are usually these Rawlsian considered judgments.

Intuitions are frequently used interchangeably with considered judgments in the critical literature on reflective equilibrium. But intuitions as typically described have characteristics that are not generally true of considered judgments, especially non-inferentiality (Brun 2014; Greenspan 2015; Cath 2016: 228–229). This entry will therefore focus on considered judgments rather than intuitions.

1.2 The Confidence Constraint

Rawls proposes that “we can discard those judgments made with hesitation, or in which we have little confidence” (Rawls 1971: 47). In other words, considered judgments are subject to a confidence constraint. Relatedly, Rawls frequently refers to considered judgments as “convictions” (e.g., Rawls 1971: 19–21, 45, 48, 53, 246, 318–320, 447, 520, 580). The confidence constraint extends to revisions of judgments, which must be made “with conviction and confidence” (Rawls 1974: 8). A more modest version of the confidence constraint is a compromise between the ideal of accounting for all judgments and practical limitations (Scanlon 2003: 144).

An alternative view suggests that, if, as Rawls supposes, we are trying to describe our moral capacity, it may appear self-defeating to exclude some of our moral judgments from consideration. Our lack of confidence in some judgments means they are likely to be rejected during the reflective process but gives no reason to dismiss them out of hand (Raz 1982: 318–319). Such a move may increase rather than decrease the distortion of moral sensibilities that reflective equilibrium is supposed to address (Knight 2017: 47–48). Consider someone with certain far right commitments, but not so far gone that they don’t recognize some appeal to such values as equality and liberty, though they have little confidence in them or a clear idea of their contours. It may seem peremptory to exclude the unconfident judgments supporting these values from consideration in reflective equilibrium, where they might have found principled support.

1.3 The Epistemic Constraint

Considered judgments, even those that satisfy the confidence constraint, are not limited as to their content. One might have the ability, opportunity, and desire to make the right decision, yet make a grossly mistaken decision, and be confident in it (see Sternberg [ed.] 2002). This may motivate an epistemic constraint. A modest version would exclude judgments that are logically inconsistent or founded on empirical error. A more ambitious constraint excludes any unjustified or unwarranted beliefs (Kelly & McGrath 2010). For example, Gerald Gaus comments that “clearly unjustified beliefs are, if anything, epistemic liabilities,” approvingly quoting Quine and Ullian’s suggestion that “insofar as we are rational, we will drop a belief when we have in vain tried to find evidence for it” (Gaus 1996: 86; Quine & Ullian 1970: 16).

Friends of reflective equilibrium largely reject such a constraint. The basic complaint is that it makes epistemological determinations in advance of the reflective process where these are rather the proper upshot of that process. Reflective equilibrium can be viewed as a negative method, i.e., as what we’re left with when we decide that positive criteria for epistemic success cannot be laid out prior to fully considering our substantive topics (Walden 2013: 255). On this view, what counts as justification, warrant, or consistency should be decided with all relevant theory on the table as part of the process of reflective equilibrium and is not prescribed by the method itself.

1.4 Initial Judgments

Cutting across the issue of which constraints, if any, to put on judgments is the question of the priority of initial judgments over those arising during the reflective process.

Narrow reflective equilibrium, described but not endorsed by Rawls and Daniels, matches principles to initial judgments, with only minor changes allowed (Rawls 1971: 49; Rawls 1974: 8; Daniels 1996: 22, 49). A more moderate position is that “initially tenable commitments have a presumption in their favor” (Elgin 1996: 107). On this view, “independently motivated, initially tenable commitments must underwrite coherence,” for however coherent the components of reflective equilibrium may be, “their mutual support may derive from a judicious disregard for contravening considerations” (Elgin 1996: 107; see also Baumberger & Brun 2021). Initial judgments anchor reflective equilibrium to something outside itself. A similar suggestion is that inchoate initial judgments are “a central constraint” (Schroeter 2004: 122).

An opposing view gives initial judgments no priority over subsequent judgments. Moral beliefs may be formed that are not just different from but discontinuous with one’s initial beliefs, which may be rejected. One may, for instance, undergo a moral conversion, becoming convinced by the worldview of a Marx or Nietzsche (DePaul 1993: ch. 1). This “radical” version of reflective equilibrium allows the moral deliberator to comprehensively change their mind.

Though Michael DePaul states the radical position most clearly, contrasting it with a “conservative” reflective equilibrium that he takes as dominant (DePaul 1993: 31), the radical view seems more in line with canonical reflective equilibrium, which encourages revision of judgment on theoretical grounds (see, e.g., Daniels 1996: 2–4, 26–28, 60–61, 70–71). While Rawls’ applications of reflective equilibrium assume that we have certain “convictions” (such as those opposing racial discrimination or religious intolerance), in explaining the method he is clear that “a person’s sense of justice may or may not undergo a radical shift” (Rawls 1971: 49)—and on closer inspection we see that convictions are only “provisional fixed points” (Rawls 1971: 20; Rawls 2005: 8, emphasis added; see also Rawls 1974: 8). Even Elgin allows that “considerations with no initial tenability sometimes dislodge initially tenable commitments”; it’s just that the latter “are not to be given up without reason” (Elgin 1996: 108, 107).

There is, then, significant agreement that initial judgments can be overridden by subsequent ones, with a residual disagreement as to whether they nevertheless receive weak presumptive priority.

2. Principles and Theories

Reflective equilibrium, at least on its classic construal, arises where judgments are brought together with their representation in principles. Theories play a dual role as agglomerations of the principles and priority rules that are the outputs of reflective equilibrium, and as sources of argument for selecting those principles. This section considers the role of principles and theories in reflective equilibrium.

2.1 Wide Reflective Equilibrium

As mentioned above, a narrow reflective equilibrium is reached where principles are matched to initial judgments, allowing only for the “smoothing out of certain irregularities” (Rawls 1971: 49). In moral and political philosophy this is of interest mainly as a contrast with the wide reflective equilibrium endorsed by Rawls, Daniels, and many others in their wake (but see Beisbart, Betz, & Brun 2021). A wide reflective equilibrium is achieved where the deliberator has brought judgments and principles into agreement having reflected on a wide range of considerations. Wide reflective equilibrium contrasts with narrow reflective equilibrium in several respects.

First, we are not merely looking for principles that look like our initial judgments, giving our pre-theoretical opinions a philosophical sheen. Rather, a wide range of principles should be considered. Indeed, we should consider all principles to which our judgments might plausibly conform, though “it is doubtful whether one can ever reach this state” (Rawls 1971: 49). We will return to this contrast between the ideal and the practical.

Second, our initial judgments are revisable. If you encounter a principle that seems to fit many of your most important judgments, or even that does not fit them but has appeal nonetheless, you are free to change judgments that disagree with that principle. Perhaps a principle even ranges over terrain on which you had no prior judgments (e.g., moral dimensions of generative AI), in which case you can make new judgments that agree or disagree with it, as you see fit. Everything is up for grabs. (Note that this second feature is consistent with giving initial judgments either no priority or weak presumptive priority as discussed earlier.)

Third, we are to consider not just a very wide range of principles, but a wide range of arguments for them. Ideally we should consider all such arguments (Rawls 1971: 49). We are also to consider arguments against principles. The arguments show the strengths and weaknesses of the principles under consideration (Daniels 1996: 82). One important kind of argument is the thought experiment. For instance, in relation to the principle of utility, one might consider utilitarian sheriffs, utility monsters, experience machines, trolley problems, and repugnant conclusions, among countless others. A “directed reflective equilibrium” offers a sequencing for consideration of such cases (Slavny et al. 2021). Note that such arguments may not only support one principle over another, but generate new principles, such as variant forms of utilitarianism—and there will be new arguments for and against these variants, which generate their own variants, and so on.

Fourth, as well as arguments, we should consider “devices of representation” (Rawls 2005: 23–28) or “justificatory devices” (Daniels 1996: 59–60). It may be that we have greater confidence in certain conditions on the selection of principles than we antecedently have in any particular principles. Prominent examples of such justificatory devices are Rawls’ original position, other contemporary (Scanlon 1998) and historical (Locke 1689; Rousseau 1762) contractualist devices, as well as their contractarian (Hobbes 1651; Gauthier 1986) and ideal observer (Hume 1740, book 3; Smith 1759) counterparts. Whether we find any such device useful is a matter of whether it fits our judgments in wide reflective equilibrium. If we do, we may have a powerful new argument for the principles that the device supports.

Finally, moral and non-moral background theories can inform our equilibrium. Arguments for and against principles referred to above are “inferences from relevant background theories” (Daniels 1996: 82). Background theories can similarly be used to inform our assessment of justificatory devices. For instance, our view of Rawls’ contract device may be informed by our view of personal identity (Daniels 1996: 60). Indeed, Rawls

went to great lengths to insure that the principles of justice did ‘fit’ with what we know about psychology, biology, evolutionary theory, economics, and other social and natural sciences. (Freeman 2007: 40)

A wide reflective equilibrium achieves coherence not only between judgments and principles regarding the issue at hand, but across the full breadth of the deliberator’s thought that might have implications for it.

To summarize, wide reflective equilibrium consists of agreement between revisable judgments and principles following reflection on a wide range of principles, arguments, justificatory devices, and background theories. In its pure form, it is an impossibly demanding method, drawing a vast and ever-growing expanse of principles, arguments and theories within its ambit. This exacting standard can nevertheless inform our approach to a more modest reflective equilibrium, as where Rawls compares his theory of justice’s “principles and arguments with a few other familiar views,” which “moves us closer to the philosophical ideal; it does not, of course, achieve it” (Rawls 1971: 49, 50; see also Rawls 2005: 97).

2.2 The Independence Constraint

A large part of the appeal of wide reflective equilibrium is its appeal to deeper background theories. For example, my principles of justice may depend in part on my views of individual agency; and my views on agency may in turn depend on my views about free will and causation. But isn’t there a danger that this broad coherence is bought at the cost of circularity?

Suppose, for instance, that I have the conviction that no one should be very badly off. This judgment might support a sufficientarian principle of justice requiring that no one is very badly off (e.g., Frankfurt 1987). But suppose I now claim that this principle is also supported by the combination of the luck egalitarian background theory that no one should be badly off through no genuine choice of their own (Cohen 1989) with the hard determinist background theory that no one is responsible for their choices, and my basis for the latter theory is the original judgment no one should be very badly off. In such a case it seems that the background theories give no independent support for the sufficientarian principle, i.e., no support that was not already there in the bare judgment that no one should be very badly off. If it were not for that judgment, I would not have a basis for my hard determinist background theory, and the luck egalitarian background theory alone would not support the sufficientarian principle, as it is consistent with some being very badly off due to choice.

In response to such cases we can utilize an independence constraint (Daniels 1996: 22–24). Suppose we distinguish principle judgments, which support the principles, from background judgments, which support the background theories. The independence constraint requires that principle judgments are not also background judgments. Background theories must draw on their own judgments and cannot “recycle” principle judgments. As Daniels puts it,

[t]he background theories in (c) should show that the moral principles in (b) are more acceptable than alternative principles on grounds to some degree independent of (b)’s match with relevant considered moral judgments in (a). If they are not in this way independently supported, then there seems to be no gain over the support the principles would have had in a corresponding narrow equilibrium, where there never was any appeal to (c). (Daniels 1996: 22)

He applies this to Rawls’ theory of justice, arguing that Rawls’ theories of the person and the role of morality are not just redescriptions of the judgments that support Rawls’ two principles of justice and thereby satisfy the constraint (Daniels 1996: 23–24, 50–62).

Some commentators consider the independence constraint objectionable, for instance suggesting that it encourages holding back some principle judgments so they can be used as background judgments to create a wide reflective equilibrium (Haslett 1987: 307–308). Yet the independence constraint doesn’t allow judgments to be held back in this way—if they support the principles they are necessarily principle judgments and cannot be used as background judgments (Knight 2006: 211).

Others argue that the constraint is superfluous, as

[a] person who explicitly cooked up all her relevant background beliefs on the basis of her considered moral judgments would not be following the method of reflective equilibrium in the first place. (DePaul 1993: 15)

But perhaps the more serious problem the constraint addresses is not deliberate circularity. We want to ensure that our moral principles are not merely “accidental generalizations” of “moral facts,” and we can do this by independently testing them against background theories, just as scientific generalizations that inadvertently correspond to observations can be distinguished from scientific laws by their lack of coherence with connected theory (Daniels 1996: 22). Critics suggest accidental generalizations might alternatively be weeded out simply by considering a sufficiently large number of cases (DePaul 1993: 15). A combination of the two approaches may be preferable (Holmgren 1989: 59).

2.3 Coherentist or Foundationalist?

A commonsense form of justification is inferential and linear. It is inferential because each belief is justified by another, and it is linear because beliefs cannot justify any of their antecedent beliefs. A is justified by B, which is justified by C, and so on. The problem with such inferential and linear justification is that it falls into infinite regress. For anything to be justified at all, it seems we have to give an endless chain of justification that we cannot possibly proffer. The regress can be ended either by permitting non-inferential justification, as foundationalism proposes, or by permitting non-linear justification, as coherentism proposes (Brink 1989: 105–106). Some have interpreted reflective equilibrium as foundationalist, but most interpret it as coherentist.

Support for the foundationalist interpretation comes from considered judgments’ clear justificatory role in reflective equilibrium. All justification in reflective equilibrium relies on the deliberator’s actual considered judgments. The most powerful principle or elegantly coherent theory must be rejected if they do not agree with judgment. Principles and theories have no influence on the process except through the medium of considered judgments—if the deliberator is not won around to them, they do not move the equilibrium one iota. For the foundationalist, a judgment does not need to prove itself as a principle or theory does. The mere fact that the deliberator holds it is enough for it to guide equilibrium. That said, the kind of foundationalism at hand is clearly rather modest (Ebertz 1993; Cath 2016: 219–220). Judgments are treated as revisable even where they are viewed as empirical data (Floyd 2017). The method, at least in its usual, wide form, gives no place to the unrevisable beliefs of traditional foundationalism or intuitionism (DePaul 1993: 34).

The prevalence of the coherentist interpretation is, in part, based on the obvious contrast with this traditional foundationalism. Wide reflective equilibrium is, furthermore, an exemplar of the broadly coherentist idea that beliefs can be justified by their coherence with a system of beliefs (Rawls 1974: 8; Daniels 1996: 60–61; Tersman 2008: 398–400). The deliberator is not expected to consider a principle in isolation, but rather to consider its connections with other principles as well as a wide range of moral and non-moral background theories. A principle can be justified by its fit with a comprehensive system of thought exhibiting logical, probabilistic, and explanatory relations among its members (Brink 1989: 103). For example, and as we have seen, Rawls’ theory of justice justifies its principles of justice by appeal to theories of the person and of morality, among other background theories. Coherentists claim that moral beliefs alone are not enough for reflective equilibrium; they rely on theory-grounded second-order beliefs about the reliability of first order beliefs (Brink 1989: 127; Tersman 2008: 399).

2.4 Reflective Equilibrium without Principles?

The standard construal of reflective equilibrium seeks a theoretically-driven balance between judgments and principles. It is therefore unsurprising that it has been opposed by anti-theorists, who set themselves against “an approach to ethical enquiry that seeks a systematizing account of correct ethical thought and practice” (Robertson 2017: 678). Bernard Williams objected that Rawls’ reflective equilibrium failed to deliver mutually acceptable principles (Williams 1985: 110–116), while Annette Baier was

not content, like Rawls (1971: 50) to retreat to the aim of finding a theory that accommodates all my considered judgments, while resigning myself to the likelihood that yours are different and require a different theory. (Baier 1985: 140)

This criticism of reflective equilibrium may be misplaced. Williams appears to “conflate Rawls’s contractualism with his coherentist justification” (Clarke 1987: 243). It is Rawls’ original position, not his reflective equilibrium, which aims to provide principles for a well-ordered society. Reflective equilibrium has no commitment to contractualism or justificatory devices generally; these are useful, where they are, simply because they place conditions on practical reason that the individual deliberator finds appealing. This may, however, seem to put reflective equilibrium in Baier’s sights, and in danger of solipsism; this concern is addressed below in the discussion of public reflective equilibrium.

While reflective equilibrium is not committed to devices of justification, it is usually understood as being committed to principles. Rawls and Daniels understand an equilibrium as between judgments and principles, so if there are no principles, there can be no equilibrium. This could, nevertheless, be seen as an arbitrary restriction on moral deliberation. Someone might be convinced by anti-theory, so that their considered judgments will settle on no moral principles, maintaining that ethics should be more local and practical. A supplementary line of thought inspired by foundationalism might suggest that principles are superfluous to the method because the real balance is struck between judgments. Such principle-less moral conclusions do not seem admissible on the standard understanding of reflective equilibrium. It is not clear why the formal category of principles should be considered untouchable when everything else, including the entire content of all principles and the background theories by which they are assessed, is available for revision.

We might, then, consider whether reflective equilibrium is possible without principles. On one view the core of reflective equilibrium is inspired by Socrates’ transformation of his pupils’ “inarticulate hunches into fully explicit beliefs” (Schroeter 2004: 121). This “maieutic reflection” makes our inchoate moral notions more precise; sometimes we will endorse them, but at other times we may find they conflict and revise some of them. Maieutic reflection is a valuable tool of moral enquiry even if there is no “stable resting point” and no intention to build a moral theory (Schroeter 2004: 122). Even antitheorists could use this method. An apparent qualification is that constructivists—those that hold that “moral facts are epistemically constrained” (Schroeter 2004: 111)—are committed to moral theory after all.

Curiously, the index of Rawls’ Political Liberalism provides a concise statement of a principle-less method: “Reflective equilibrium: defined as when judgments at all levels of generality are in line on due reflection” (Rawls 2005: 514). Rather than bringing principles and judgments into agreement, as per Rawls’ official position, this variant would only bring judgments into agreement with each other. This would still allow us to retain major justificatory elements of wide reflective equilibrium, arriving at a coherent set of considered judgments revised in light of a wide range of competing principles, arguments, and background theories. The only difference is that our judgments are not necessarily represented in principles. Deliberators are free to follow the classic mutual adjustment of principles and judgments should they wish, but the output that is measured is judgments alone, “at all levels of generality”: utilitarians’ one big judgment, anti-theorists’ countless smaller ones, and every position in between.

2.5 Public Reflective Equilibrium

The mainstream reflective equilibrium of the early Rawls and Daniels is individualist. It is a method for a philosopher to work out her views (Rawls 1971; Daniels 1996). Further, they claim it is a method that makes those views reasonable or justified. Yet it might be claimed that a single philosopher’s views on a topic of public interest, such as Rawls’ and Daniels’ main substantive topic of social justice, cannot really be justified in that way. That individual may have justified their view to themselves, but they have not justified it to other people, who have different considered judgments and find different principles and theories appealing.

One response here is to insist that, if you have followed the method correctly, it does justify one’s principles, and not only to oneself (see the discussions of credibility and relativism below). It might nevertheless be urged that, if our views are to have some impact in the real world, they should move other people as well as ourselves (Anderson 2015). This is a challenge to reflective equilibrium from political practice rather than moral epistemology, and philosophers may feel it is not their role to address it—it is enough for them to set out justified views. Still, those with policy ambitions for reflective equilibrium have described three broad forms of public reflective equilibrium.

The first keeps individualist reflective equilibrium as its starting point, but aims to achieve convergence between equilibria (Daniels 1996: 33–39). The later Rawls particularly appeals to the idea of an “overlapping consensus” (Rawls 2005). The broad motivation here is that in a plural society with a diversity of comprehensive moral doctrines we cannot rely on any one comprehensive doctrine, such as utilitarianism, Kantianism, or a specific religious faith, to support our political principles. Rather, the reflective equilibria of adherents of each of these comprehensive doctrines can converge on a specific set of liberal principles, each for different reasons. The later Rawls continues to assume that reflective equilibria are wide, but now maintains that they should be general: “the same conception is affirmed in everyone’s considered judgments” (Rawls 2005: 384 n. 16). He refers to wide and general reflective equilibrium as full reflective equilibrium.

An alternative form of public reflective equilibrium appears to reject individualism even as a starting point, drawing on empirical work to form judgments and principles. One version of this approach is quantitative, drawing on survey data (Savulescu et al. 2021). Another version is qualitative, using interviews or “semi-structured discussions” (Wolff & de Shalit 2007: 11). For instance, in a study on social disadvantage, the researchers

consulted our interviewees about our views and we learnt from them. In this process we revised and modified our theory according to the theories and intuitions expressed by the interviewees. (Wolff & de Shalit 2007: 12)

The specific topic might make particular interviewees appropriate—in the disadvantage case, those that provide services to the disadvantaged as well as disadvantaged people themselves—or more informal selection methods may be used:

If possible, the decision with whom to talk should be done by strolling in different parts of the city, bumping into people every now and then, and asking them to enter into a discussion. (de Shalit 2020: 19)

A difficulty with this approach is that it may be too ambitious in its expectations of the general public’s theorizing, as it takes not only judgments but theories from consultees. Yet the general public may not have moral and political principles, if they do have such principles they may conflict, and their views certainly do not mirror theoretical divides in philosophy (e.g., between Kantians and utilitarians) (Baderin 2017: 11–12).

This may motivate a final form of public reflective equilibrium, which uses the public’s judgments but not their theories, and in particular their case-specific judgments (Baderin 2017; see also Miller 1999). The merit of using the public’s judgments is that they are independent of principles, which might be considered an essential requirement if a meaningful balance is to be struck between judgments and principles, but one which can hardly be met by philosophers’ judgments (Baderin 2017: 15–19). The point is similar to Elgin’s reason for giving priority to initial judgments—principles can enslave as well as enlighten. The philosopher remains the one undergoing reflective equilibrium, and is free to reject the public’s judgments, but a persistent refusal to adapt theory to public judgment suggests a refusal to earnestly engage in reflective equilibrium (Baderin 2017: 19–20). Among challenges for such a view are the lack of mutual adjustment of judgments and principles where judgments are the public’s rather than the individual’s.

3. Objections

Given its central role in contemporary ethics, it is no surprise that reflective equilibrium has been confronted with many objections. Here we will consider a selection of the main objections along with responses put forward by reflective equilibrium’s defenders.

3.1 Initial Credibility

Critics have queried the epistemic value of the considered judgments or “intuitions” that underpin reflective equilibrium (Williamson 2022: 246–248). While reflective equilibrium may deliver a coherent set of beliefs, the objection is that there are no grounds for supposing that this set is credible:

In the case of normative beliefs, no reason has been offered why we should think that initial credence levels, for a person, correspond to credibilities. (Brandt 1979: 20)

The outcome of reflective equilibrium may be believed, but that is consistent with it being coherent fiction. Indeed, some considered judgments seem plainly unreasonable. The judgment that killing at random is morally required would have to be accepted as a considered judgment on the standard account of reflective equilibrium that rejects an epistemic constraint on considered judgments (Kelly & McGrath 2010).

This objection arguably foregrounds considered judgments to the extent of neglecting the justificatory heart of the method, which is its process. This

involves identifying our considered judgments, learning more about them, and perhaps modifying them in the process of considering principles that would account for them. (Scanlon 2014: 84)

Indeed, the objection seems directed more at narrow reflective equilibrium, where the reflective process has little effect on the outcome. Consider the coherentist interpretation of reflective equilibrium discussed above, which highlights that judgments and principles in equilibrium cohere with the deliberator’s entire system of thought, which has arisen from reflection on all relevant principles and argument. It is hard to claim that this is not at least something in favour of their position. Someone who has not followed the method, and whose judgments and principles are only partially formed, extend only to a few cases, are flagrantly contradictory in some of those cases, and result from consideration of a limited range of principles and argument, does not, at least typically, have a view that is as credible.

It is true that there is little about wide reflective equilibrium that would prevent implausible considered judgments from entering the process, but this is because it is supposed that this filtering is properly conducted with all relevant theory on the table. Filtering in advance would require epistemic and (given the above examples) moral criteria that could well conflict with the theories accepted in wide reflective equilibrium.

To be sure, it is possible that some of those who claim to follow the method start with such unreasonable views (e.g., a cast iron commitment to random killing) that they will still have unreasonable views in equilibrium, but this could be seen as analogous to a scientist having such unreasonable views (e.g., a cast iron commitment to creationism or climate change denial) that their findings are unreasonable despite apparently following scientific procedure (Knight 2017: 53–54). It might be held that, for people starting with such radically different beliefs from our own, it is not unreasonable to reach seemingly perverse equilibria (Cath 2016: 225–226). Alternatively, and as explored below, the method might allow that their views are unjustified even though they are in equilibrium.

3.2 Relativism

Several critics object that there is no unique reflective equilibrium. There are two objections here, one interpersonal, one intrapersonal. The interpersonal objection is considered first.

Some advocates of reflective equilibrium combine the view with moral realism, maintaining that the method can provide evidence of objective moral truth (Brink 1989 and more tentatively Daniels 1996: 37–39). Rawls takes a less metaethically ambitious approach, his constructivist theory providing “objectivity for its limited political purposes” (Rawls 2005: 110; see also Nielsen 1993; Brandstedt & Brännmark 2020). On either view reflective equilibrium can offer objective support for moral principles.

Critics disagree, claiming that reflective equilibrium falls victim to relativism. The objection starts with the observation that different people following the method may reach different, conflicting equilibria (Dworkin 1973 [1975: 34–36]; de Maagt 2017: 450–451). How can it be the case that each of two or more conflicting views are objectively justified? The justification rather looks to be relative to the deliberator.

But reflective equilibrium is properly understood as a potential source of justification. There is no need to claim that it always offers evidence of moral truth or practical guidance. Hence, the mere existence of conflicting equilibria does not mark the descent into relativism. As Scanlon notes,

accepting that some person is well informed and has carried out the search for reflective equilibrium conscientiously does not even commit one to the conclusion that this person is justified in accepting the principles that result, let alone the conclusion that those principles are justified. (Scanlon 2003: 152)

He asks us to enquire as to the reasons for divergences between our equilibrium and that of another. Did we start with different considered judgments? Did the divergence arise due to later adjustments in considered judgments? Is it due to consideration of different moral principles? At each stage we are to ask whether we feel we made the better decisions or whether we might now revise our judgments and principles (Scanlon 2003: 152–153; Scanlon 2014: 79–81).

What if we are content with the decisions leading to both equilibria? Two conflicting views being equally justified is not really suggestive of relativism, but rather supports a pluralistic position (Scanlon 2014: 79). It seems no less objective to judge that two equilibria are equally justified than it is to judge that one is more justified than the other.

3.3 Indeterminacy

On, then, to the objection to the lack of a unique intrapersonal equilibrium. Just as different people may reach different equilibria, the same person may reach different equilibria at different times, as their judgments are revisable. The ethical deliberator can simply change their mind even if the relevant facts stay the same, the claimed standard of justification being a drifting one (Copp 1985: 165). Alternatively, there may be multiple simultaneous equilibria even for a single person, where principles and judgments can be made to fit each other in different combinations (Haslett 1987: 310). Critics worry that such an indeterminate procedure cannot tell us what to believe or results in an arbitrary outcome (McPherson 2015: 662–663; List & Valentini 2016: 542).

This line of objection is largely anticipated by Rawls, who acknowledges that there may be no unique equilibrium even for one person, and that the judgments we start with, or the “course of reflection itself,” may affect the principles we settle on (Rawls 1971: 50). He simply sets such questions aside, saying that reflective equilibrium “is, if you wish, a kind of psychology and does not presuppose the existence of objective moral truths” (Rawls 1974: 9). For reasons parallel to those in the interpersonal case, it may also be that the truth of moral realism, and the existence of objective moral facts, are compatible with drifting equilibria (Knight 2006: 220). Advocates of reflective equilibrium do not claim that it gives direct access to or perfectly tracks moral truth, only that it can justify moral beliefs. Even where the ultimate facts are static, a belief can become more justified by becoming endorsed by the deliberators’ judgments and cohering with their reflectively-derived system of beliefs.

3.4 Bias

The further objection might then be raised that reflective equilibrium is vulnerable to arbitrary order or framing biases (McPherson 2015: 662–663; List & Valentini 2016: 542). One study found that professional philosophers were vulnerable to order and framing effects, and that this was not reduced by reflection or expertise on the topics in question (Schwitzgebel & Cushman 2015). The judgments of participants in reflective equilibrium might be considered unreliable in the sense that they vary with factors that they themselves consider irrelevant (Paulo 2020: 335–336).

Additional biases are suggested by experiments bringing out the emotional nature of moral reasoning. They show, for instance, that there is greater activation of brain areas associated with emotional processing in personal cases, such as the variant of the trolley problem where a large person is pushed from a footbridge, than in otherwise similar impersonal cases, such as the original trolley problem (Greene et al. 2001). Peter Singer suggests that considered judgments in such cases are emotionally-driven evolved responses to circumstances that no longer obtain:

the salient feature that explains our different intuitive judgments concerning the two cases is that the footbridge case is the kind of situation that was likely to arise during the eons of time over which we were evolving; whereas the standard trolley case describes a way of bringing about someone’s death that has only been possible in the past century or two, a time far too short to have any impact on our inherited patterns of emotional response. But what is the moral salience of the fact that I have killed someone in a way that was possible a million years ago, rather than in a way that became possible only two hundred years ago? I would answer: none. (Singer 2005: 348)

He therefore concludes that reflective equilibrium is mistaken in giving considered judgments a central role in moral theorizing. Other critics similarly suggest that considered judgments may be based on prejudice (Brandt 1979: 22; Hare 1981: 12; Anderson 2015).

Wide reflective equilibrium may be able to take on board these concerns, and revise judgments accordingly. For instance, if we are moved by Singer’s argument about the strongly emotional and evolutionary character of some of our moral judgments, we could use a revised conception of considered judgments that excludes judgments distorted in this way (Tersman 2008: 398). Alternatively, we could allow such judgments to enter the process, but revise them given the background theory that Singer introduces (see Tersman 2008: 397). Order or framing effects would similarly be highlighted by psychological background theories, allowing the deliberator to take compensatory measures.

3.5 An Empty Method?

By this point the critic may be exasperated. If you identify a problem with someone’s way of doing philosophy, and they agree that it’s a problem, you might expect them to change how they do it. But the adherent of wide reflective equilibrium accepts the criticism but maintains their method, saying that they have adopted the criticism within the method. To critics this suggests that the method is “close to vacuous” (Singer 2005: 349), absorbing methodological controversies rather than adjudicating them (McPherson 2015: 661; Paulo 2020: 346; de Maagt 2017: 458). It just takes us

back to the usual philosophical argument about the merits and demerits of various methods of argument and of various theories. The method of reflective equilibrium is then not a method in moral philosophy at all. (Raz 1982: 309)

Defenders of wide reflective equilibrium describe it in similar terms to the critics, while rejecting their negative evaluation. Its ability to absorb apparent rivals is seen as a feature, not a bug:

This charge of emptiness seems to me to be largely correct, but nonetheless mistaken in one important respect, and therefore not as damaging as it sounds. The charge is largely correct because the search for wide reflective equilibrium, as Rawls describes it, allows for what might have been seen as alternative methods of justification to be incorporated within it. … What the method of reflective equilibrium prescribes is, so to speak, a level playing field of intuitive justification on which principles and judgments of all levels of generality must compete for our allegiance. It thus allows all possible sources of justificatory force to be considered. But the method is not vacuous because it is incompatible with some views about these sources. It is incompatible, first, with the idea that any particular class of judgments or principles can be singled out in advance of this process as justified on some other basis and, second, with the idea that any class of considered judgments should be left out of this process. (Scanlon 2003: 151).

It might be added that critics of reflective equilibrium are rich sources of methods incompatible with reflective equilibrium. For instance, Brandt’s cognitive psychotherapy, Hare’s universal prescriptivism, Anderson’s pragmatism, or de Maagt’s transcendentalism describe methods for justifying moral views prior to, or without, reflective equilibrium (Brandt 1979; Hare 1981; Anderson 2015; de Maagt 2017). Reflective equilibrium rules out

moral skepticism and nihilism and other doctrines that doubt our capacities for morality altogether, as well as naturalism and other reductionist efforts to justify moral principles purely on the basis of factual, linguistic, or metaphysical claims. (Freeman 2007: 37; see also Rawls 1971: 51)

Given the many methods and theories at odds with reflective equilibrium, it is hard to maintain that it is devoid of content, or nearly so. If it looks that way it may be because its assumptions are widely accepted in moral and political philosophy, a victim of its own success.


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