Other Minds

First published Thu May 2, 2019; substantive revision Tue Dec 19, 2023

Textbooks in philosophy often refer to the problem of other minds. At a superficial glance it can look as if there is agreement about what the problem is and how we might address it. But on closer inspection one finds there is little agreement either about the problem or the solution to it. Indeed, there is little agreement about whether there is a problem here at all. What seems clear is that there was a period in philosophy, roughly around the mid-twentieth century, when there was much discussion about other minds. The problem here has most commonly been thought to arise within epistemology: how do I know (or how can I justify the belief) that other beings exist who have thoughts, feelings and other mental attributes? One standard line of reply to this question has been to appeal to analogy, another to best explanation. More recently it has been suggested that testimony can serve as a basic source of knowledge of another’s mental states; that is, testimony can serve as a way of knowing here in the absence of any other way of knowing (see Gomes 2015). A somewhat less standard approach to this question has been to appeal to criteria. Connected with this approach, and fueled by the later work of Ludwig Wittgenstein, some philosophers argue that the real problem of other minds is conceptual: why do I so much as think that there are other thinking, feeling beings? Both the conceptual and the epistemological problems may be thought to be connected with a more general metaphysical problem of understanding what minds and mental states are.

In analytic philosophy, towards the end of the twentieth century, interest in these problems waned, but there has been a revival of interest in recent years. This is in part due to the fact that philosophers have begun to explore in earnest the possibility that we come by our knowledge of other minds in much the same way that we come by our knowledge of objects in the world—by perception. This possibility is also explored in phenomenology and in recent times philosophers schooled in both the analytic and phenomenological traditions have contributed to discussion of this topic. Whatever account one gives of this knowledge, what must be remembered is that the thoughts and feelings I want to know about are the thoughts and feelings of another.[1]

Some philosophers who consider this problem have found inspiration even further afield, in the texts of classical Indian philosophers. There is much in the texts of Buddhist philosophers, as well as in the writing of their opponents, on the topic of the self and the existence of others. More recently, philosophical interest in other minds has also been stimulated by work in psychology and neuroscience. A more naturalistic turn in philosophy has led to questions concerning our understanding of others. One might see this work as leaving behind traditional epistemological concerns with radical scepticism, addressing instead the question of how we go about ascribing mental states to others—a question that can be asked not just of adult humans, but of infants (when and how do they come to ascribe mental states to others), and also of other, non-human, animals. Furthermore, one can consider the possibility of a deficit in the capacity to attribute minds to others and how this might manifest itself in, for example, autism.

1. The (Traditional) Epistemological Problem

The traditional epistemological problem of other minds is often associated with scepticism. The sceptic raises a doubt about the possibility of knowledge in connection with the mind of another, a doubt which is thought to follow from a more general doubt raised by Descartes concerning our knowledge of the external world. This latter doubt arises in stages, each of which is designed to draw us into a more wide-reaching scepticism: at stage one it is observed that the senses sometimes deceive; at stage two the possibility of an extended dream is considered; and at stage three the possibility is introduced that there is an Evil Demon deceiving me to think that there is a world beyond how things appear. It is with the third stage that Descartes thought we encounter the possibility of universal doubt about an entire domain, in this case the external world. Descartes has found a way to retreat into his own mind, where he claims to find both knowledge and truth: I can know how things appear to me; external things are now in doubt. Cartesian doubt is radical and it has been raised by philosophers not just in connection with our knowledge of the external world, but also of the past, induction, and other minds.

In connection with other minds, we might press Descartes’ first sceptical consideration, thus: I am sometimes deceived about what another is thinking or feeling. But, as with the external world, this is not sufficient for radical doubt concerning others. Radical doubt may be thought to arise when one presses the third sceptical consideration, the possibility that an Evil Demon (or mad scientist) has contrived that all others apart from myself are automata/zombies—non-thinking, non-feeling individuals who move in a manner similar to the way I move. We can associate a ‘thin’ sceptical problem with the former doubt and a ‘thick’ sceptical problem with the latter (Avramides 2015). The former is a problem we grapple with in our everyday lives; the latter is a distinctively philosophical problem. It is the thick skeptical problem that leads to the possibility of solipsism—that I am alone in the universe.

Once one teases out a thin from a thick problem, one can ask the following: (i) does any proposed response to the thick problem help with the thin?; (ii) does having knowledge (in any domain) depend upon a solution to the thick problem?; and (iii) are there any further questions that can be raised with respect to other minds beyond those associated with these two sceptical problems? It is fair to say that little to no consideration was paid to question (i) in the past. It is the threat of solipsism that largely preoccupied philosophers—at least until more recently. Question (ii) has received much discussion in recent decades. Epistemologists who favor an externalist approach (e.g., Goldman, Nozick, Dretske) concentrate on the question of what others think and feel. In line with the general externalist approach, these philosophers hold that there can be knowledge despite there being no response to the radical sceptical challenge. Others agree that having knowledge does not require responding to this challenge, but not because they believe that there is no response here but because they believe that the correct account of knowledge leaves no room for such a challenge (McDowell 1982). With respect to (iii), Zahavi (2014) has identified a further question that he labels the why question. In our everyday encounters with, and understanding of, others we want to know not only what they think and feel, but also why they think and feel as they do and what this means to them.

Not everyone takes the epistemological problem here to be a radical skeptical one. Some see the problem as arising from reflection on an apparent asymmetry in the way I know about my own and another’s mind: in my own case, at least most of the time, I know what I think and feel directly and without inference from any evidence (the qualification here is designed to reflect the fact that one can, at times, learn about one’s own mental states from others—see Austin 1946 [1979: 110]); in the case of others, all access to what they think or feel is thought to be indirect, mediated by the other’s behavior. Hyslop, for example, writes, “the problem of other minds is generated by an asymmetry in respect of knowledge” (1995: 6; cf. Davidson 1991 [2001]). Gomes (2018) has labeled the epistemological problem raised by attention to this asymmetry the problem of sources, which he distinguishes from the problem of error. Gomes finds the problem of sources in the work of Austin (1946 [1979]) who begins his discussion of other minds by asking, “How do we know that, for example, another individual is angry?”, a question which Austin distinguishes from, “Do we (ever) know…?” (cf. Cassam 2007 and Nozick 1981).

It is worth pausing to consider the seriousness of the problem of knowing others. While some draw a parallel between the problem of gaining knowledge of the past and of another mind, there is an important asymmetry to be noted here: in the case of the past it is at least logically possible that there should be direct knowledge, while in the case of another mind such knowledge seems to be logically ruled out. As A.J. Ayer writes:

It can be argued that one’s position to observe a past event is due to the accident of one’s position in time…. But it is not an accident that one is not someone else. (1953 [1954: 216–217])

(Discussions linking knowledge of other minds and the past provide a rich vein of philosophical discussion; see, for example, Dummett 1969, Wright 1980, and McDowell 1998.) It may be thought that there could be a way of knowing another’s mind—say by telepathy—and that it is simply a contingent fact that this is not a way that is open to human beings. Telepathy would allow one to know another’s thoughts and feelings by coming to share them. The problem, however, is that if I have your experiences, then those experiences are mine and not yours. As Ayer writes: “In this respect telepathy is no better than the telephone” (1953 [1954: 196]; cf. Austin 1946 and Wisdom 1940).

Philosophers, thus, find themselves saddled with the question, How do I know that others have minds? One can put the emphasis on the word know” and raise a sceptical question parallel to the one Descartes raises in connection with our knowledge of the external world, or one can put the emphasis on the word “how” and question the source of our knowledge given that I am not in a position to have direct knowledge of the mind of another.

1.1 The Argument from Analogy

While it may be the case that different considerations can give rise to an epistemological problem concerning other minds, on the whole what appears to have pre-occupied philosophers in the period under consideration (mid-twentieth century) was the question of solipsism, the question of whether I am alone in the universe. While it is often accepted that I cannot be certain that I am not alone, it is thought that it can be shown that we have good reason to believe that the others I encounter are like me in having thoughts and feelings. One form of reasoning has been taken to be “traditional” in this connection: the argument from analogy (Blackburn 1994). Analogical reasoning cites similarities between two things and uses this as support for concluding that further similarities may be taken to exist. Like all forms of inferential reasoning, analogical reasoning is employed in order to expand knowledge in the face of uncertainty (Bartha 2016).

A statement of the argument from analogy can be found in the writing of J.S. Mill. In reply to the question,

By what evidence do I know, or by what considerations am I led to believe … that the walking and speaking figures which I see and hear, have sensations and thoughts, or in other words, possess Minds?

Mill writes:

First, they have bodies like me, which I know in my own case, to be the antecedent condition of feelings; and because, secondly, they exhibit the acts, and outward signs, which in my own case I know by experience to be caused by feelings. (1865 [1872: 243])

While this argument was once popular (see, e.g., Russell 1923; Hampshire 1952), it soon came to be considered unfit for purpose due to the following considerations. Firstly, it was pointed out that while this way of proceeding may work in certain domains, in the case of other minds the conclusion is logically uncheckable (Locke 1968). Secondly, it was considered problematic that this way of extending one’s knowledge proceeds from a single case (Locke 1968). And thirdly, it was claimed that the very first premise of this argument (I know in my own case) is problematic (Malcolm 1958).

Various attempts have been made to salvage the argument. Against the first of these considerations it has been pointed out that we successfully appeal to analogy when extending our knowledge from the present to the past. However, Hyslop and Jackson (1972) remind us that this defense fails to register the fact that the impossibility of checking the conclusion in the case of other minds is logical (cf. §1), and prefer to defend appeal to analogy here by suggesting that, while this is true, it is not “obviously relevant”. They also suggest that the fact that the conclusion here cannot be verified may be “neutralized” by the fact that it also cannot be refuted (1972: 169–170).

Hyslop and Jackson also propose an alternative to the standard defense of the argument from analogy from the second of the above considerations. The standard defense insists that the argument does not proceed from a single case and that there are innumerable instances and many different contexts in which one observes a mental state and its associated behavior (Ayer 1956: 219–222); cf. Mill who writes that analogy is an “inferior degree of inductive evidence” that only works by providing one with an hypothesis which is then verified by further correlations, 1865 [1872: 260]). According to Hyslop & Jackson, however, there is no need to appeal to multiple cases here just so long as one can establish a link between mental states and behavior, something they claim can be done from observation of one’s own case (cf. Hill 1984). Hyslop (1995) warns that we must be careful here not to appeal to the (invalid) principle that like effects (behavior) have like causes (mental states)—your behavior may have a purely physical cause. We should instead appeal to the (valid) principle that like causes have like effects: what I observe in my own case leads me to hypothesize that my mental states are caused by physical states of my body, and I can argue that like physical states in others will cause like mental states. This, in effect, is to invoke the principle of the Uniformity of Nature; it is this principle that Hyslop believes lies at the heart of the argument from analogy. While many consider that generalization from a single instance is a crucial weakness in the argument from analogy, Hyslop takes this to be the argument’s strength. Indeed, he holds that the other main contender in the field, the argument from scientific inference/best explanation fails precisely because it does not take into account a crucial dependence on our own case when it comes to knowledge of other minds (cf. §1.2).

The third of the arguments that have been brought to bear against the argument from analogy requires careful consideration. The very premise that Hyslop believes recommends this way of supporting one’s belief in other minds is the one that some have thought to be irremediably problematic. Malcolm, inspired by the later work of Wittgenstein, has suggested that the premise—I know from my own case what it is like to think and feel—is committed to what he calls the “fundamental error” of thinking that one learns what thoughts and feelings are from one’s own case (Malcolm 1958: 974). This way of coming to learn about mind is associated with what is sometimes thought of as an ‘inward glance’ or introspection (cf. Locke 1689). It has been argued that this way of learning about mind or mental states is committed to the possibility of a private language (Wittgenstein 1953; Malcolm 1954). According to Malcolm, Wittgenstein advances both an “internal” and an “external” attack on the possibility of such a language (Malcolm 1954 [1966: 75]). The internal attack aims to show that, while a genuine language requires that one be able to articulate correctness conditions for the application of a word, it is not possible to articulate such conditions when the referent of the word is not intersubjectively available. As Wittgenstein points out: “Whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can’t talk about ‘right’” (1953: §258). (For a statement of the “external” attack here see §2.) The private language argument aside, the suggestion that I can come to know about mental states from my own case leads to a conception of mind as something not observable in behavior but as something lying behind and causing behavior. Malcolm contrasts this way of thinking with what he labels a criterial view of the relationship between mind and behavior. Much ink has been spilled over trying to understand this proposed alternative way of thinking of mind in relation to behavior (see §1.3). However we understand this proposal, it is important to appreciate the difficulties thought to be associated with the idea that one learns from one’s own case what it is to think and feel: it is believed to lead inexorably to solipsism. (This was something arguably first appreciated by Thomas Reid; see §4.1). It should, however, be noted that solipsism comes in two varieties: epistemological and conceptual. While the argument from analogy is proposed as a way of avoiding the former, it is arguable that it is really the latter to which Malcolm and others are drawing our attention. In effect, the claim here is that use of the argument from analogy as a way of avoiding epistemological solipsism (the only mind I can know is my own) falls foul of conceptual solipsism (the only mind I can think about is my own). Discussion of the conceptual problem in connection with other minds may be thought to take us in a direction at odds with that taken when one approaches these matters from an epistemological perspective (for the conceptual problem see §2.)

1.2 Best Explanation

The argument from best explanation has been advocated as an advance on the argument from analogy. While Hyslop insists that any justification for one’s belief in other minds must make crucial reference to one’s own case, it has been argued that not needing to rely on such reference makes the argument from best explanation preferable as an account of how we justify our belief here (Pargetter 1984). Whether or not one pauses to assess the relative merits of these two ways of defending the rationality of our belief in other minds, what is undoubtedly the case is that the argument from best explanation is—either explicitly or implicitly—a form of argument that enjoys wide acceptance today. David Chalmers, for example, writes, “It … seems that this [argument from best explanation] is as good a solution to the problem of other minds as we are going to get” (1996: 246).

While the argument from analogy was once popular in science (Hyslop & Jackson (1972) cite the example of the discovery of helium on the sun to have a characteristic spectrum by analogy with the characteristic spectrum of helium on earth) in more recent times science has tended to proceed in accordance with the principle that it is rational to believe that hypothesis that provides the best available explanation of a particular phenomenon at a given time. This style of argument is sometimes referred to as abduction, and it is placed alongside deduction and enumerative induction as another form of inferential reasoning. While simple enumerative inductive takes one from certain observations to the conclusion that one can expect more of the same, abduction allows for the introduction of entities that are not just unobserved, but that are unobservable (Lipton 2000; Harman 1965).

It is claimed that my reason for believing that others have minds similar to my own can be taken to be the same as the scientific realist’s reason for believing in the existence of electrons or other theoretical entities. On this way of thinking, mental states are taken to be inner states of an individual that provide the best explanation of the behavior we observe in others; any other explanation would be implausible. Pargetter (1984) considers the following as implausible alternative hypotheses: (i) God is working others like puppets; (ii) I am unique in having mental states as the cause of behavior; and (iii) that others have mental states but they are of an entirely different nature to my own.

According to Pargetter, the argument from best explanation is able to bypass all criticisms standardly brought to bear against the argument from analogy, as it relies solely on the explanatory power of the proposed hypothesis—in this case, that others have minds. This form of reasoning is also held to be superior to reasoning from analogy as it can be used to establish the existence of minds in individuals of other species whose behavior may not be similar to mine or who think and feel in ways that are dissimilar to the way that I think and feel. It may also be used to justify the belief in minds of (abnormal) humans who may either behave very differently or think and feel very differently from their conspecifics.

Melnyk (1994) has argued that there is an important disanalogy between the scientific realist’s reason for believing in theoretical entities and an ordinary person’s reason for believing that other people have minds. His argument rests on the observation that gross behavioral evidence is insufficient for belief in another mind without additional reference to what one knows from one’s own case. Melnyk can be read as advocating a hybrid account of our knowledge here, incorporating elements from the argument from analogy as a supplement to the inference from best explanation. But he also makes the following, important, observation: “A complete response to the problem of other minds seems obliged to incorporate more than one approach, and may have to incorporate several” (1994: 487). This is an observation others have also begun to advocate (see §3.2).

1.3 Criteria

It has been suggested that an alternative to the view that mind lies behind and serves as the cause of behavior is the view that behavior serves as the criterion of mind (see §1.1). The former conception of mind in relation to behavior is associated with the following ideas: (i) my mind is private to me; (ii) I am both infallible and incorrigible with respect to my own mental states; and (iii) I can know my own mental state without having to observe anything about my body. This picture of mind is bolstered by the thought that, whatever another person says or does, it is always possible that they are deceiving me about what is going on in their minds—an extreme version of which leads to the thought that I am entirely deceived and all others are mere automata or zombies. In short, this conception of mind leads to the traditional epistemological problem of other minds. Standard responses to this problem—arguments from analogy and best explanation—draw a parallel between knowledge of another’s mind and explanation in science. In this connection Wittgenstein writes: “Misleading parallel: psychology treats of processes in the psychical sphere, as does physics in the physical” (1953: §571). In The Blue Book (24–25) Wittgenstein contrasts the business of citing criteria with that of giving symptoms in answer to the question, “How do you know?” He associates the giving of symptoms with the making of hypotheses; he associates the citing of criteria with “the grammar (the use)” of a word or with linguistic convention (1958: 23).

It has not proved an easy thing for philosophers to understand what Wittgenstein means here (see Albritton 1959; Shoemaker 1963; Kenny 1967; Baker 1974). What one can say is that a criterial relation between mind and behavior is designed to be distinct from, on the one hand, logical entailment, and on the other, inductive inference. Some see a connection between a criterial relation here and the possibility of perceptual knowledge of another’s mind (McDowell 1982, Hacker 1997; see §1.4.1). Those that advocate a criterial relation between mind and behavior also tend to understand the problem of other minds to be a conceptual one (see §2). As well as being associated with the rejection of a certain conception of mind that can be labeled ‘Cartesian’, appeal to a criterial relationship between mind and behavior is often thought to form part of an anti-sceptical stance in connection with others.

Some have seen in the appeal to criteria nothing but a form of behaviorism. Chihara and Fodor (1965) are among such philosophers, and their work has served to turn the tide against talk of criteria as a way of understanding the relationship between mental states and behavior. Chihara and Fodor sum up the Wittgensteinian argument as follows: if we are justified in claiming that one can tell or determine that a predicate ‘Y’ applies on the basis of the presence of X then either X is a criterion of Y or X can be shown to be correlated with Y. They then claim that this overlooks the possibility that in some cases the justification for the application of a predicate rests on an appeal to the “simplicity, plausibility and predictive adequacy of an explanatory system as a whole” (1965: 411). They point out that scientists use this method of explanation when it comes to the detection of particles that are not directly observable (see §1.2). Chihara and Fodor agree with the Wittgensteinian who holds that the child does not learn about mental states by introspection but rather learns about complex relations between mental states and behavior in the course of learning her language, but they point out that part of what the child learns is how to explain another’s behavior by reference to her thoughts and feelings and suggest that this may be the result either of explicit training or of an innate capacity.

Whether one is persuaded by Chihara and Fodor’s position against appeal to criteria will depend in part upon one’s assessment of the correctness of thinking about mental states on the model of unobservables in science. Furthermore, it may be thought that to understand mental states to be entirely explanatory phenomena is arguably to lose sight of the subjective aspect of these states. Finally, to think of mental states as lying behind and causing behavior may be thought to break what some see as a deep connection between mentality and behavior, thereby opening up the possibility that I am alone in the universe (Avramides 2013).

Many have continued to defend a criterial approach here. Crispin Wright and John McDowell have written extensively on this topic, each offering a very different interpretation of the notion of a criterion. While the debate here is complex and interwoven with issues such as realist vs anti-realist semantics, there is one thread in this debate that is particularly relevant to the epistemological problem of other minds: the question of whether criteria should be thought of as defeasible or indefeasible. Wright rightly sees this question as connected with the question of whether appeal to criteria can provide one with an anti-sceptical stance. Wright’s own understanding of criteria turns on an important distinction between constituting knowledge that P and an entitlement to a knowledge-claim that P. While a sceptic can always challenge the truth of any claim to know that which lies beyond the cognitive reach of the subject (examples here include the past and other minds), Wright suggests that the sceptic can make no inroads when one pulls in one’s horns and simply makes a statement about the reasonableness of one’s belief or claim to know in such cases. He then argues that reasonableness is secured if one can show that the criteria for the claim that, for example, another is in pain are satisfied and one knows of no consideration that would defeat the claim—in other words, just so long as one is using a word, e.g., “pain”, in accordance with the conventions in play in one’s linguistic community. It is a consequence of this understanding of criteria that, while one may be in the best position to make a claim to know that Tom is in pain by observing his behavior, one’s claim is defeasible—that is, it is open to being shown to be mistaken in the light of further evidence. Importantly, to hold that behavioral criteria are defeasible is not, according to Wright, to be committed to understanding behavior as ‘outer’ evidence (a symptom) of the other’s ‘inner’ mental states. Wright admits, however, that his position leaves room for scepticism: “a form of scepticism that is endemic in the very practice of assertion” (1984: [1993: 389–390]).[2]

McDowell is not content to concede any ground to the sceptic, and believes that appeal to criteria can confer (sceptic-proof) knowledge. But for this to be the case, criteria must be understood to be indefeasible (McDowell 1982). McDowell finds an incompatibility between, on the one hand, the legitimacy of a knowledge ascription and, on the other, the possible of its falsity (its defeasibility). McDowell is not persuaded by Wright’s understanding of criteria, and proposes an alternative to it. McDowell’s understanding of criteria is thought to form a part of his defense of a direct, perceptual, account of our knowledge of other minds (see §1.4.1).

In the work of Stanley Cavell one finds yet another understanding of criteria: “Criteria are ‘criteria for something’s being so”, not in the sense that they tell us of a thing’s existence, but of something like its identity, not of its being so, but of its being so. Criteria do not determine the certainty of statements, but the application of the concepts employed in statements“ (Cavell 1979: 45; for a good discussion of Cavell’s understanding of criteria see Mulhall 1994, Pt. II,). I may come to know that the criteria for pain have been satisfied, but this does not touch the question of whether the other really experiences thoughts and feelings (the thick sceptical question). Cavell insists that, rather than reply to the sceptic or show why this thick sceptical question does not arise (inferential arguments attempt to do the former, appeal to criteria have been used by some to do the latter), we need to understand what it is that gives rise to the sceptic’s worry. Cavell urges that we see the sceptic as being motivated by a genuine concern, but one that s/he misunderstands to be an epistemological concern. Rather than ask, How can I know the thoughts and feelings of others?, Cavell thinks we should look to how how I respond to the other. He draws attention to the Philosophical Investigations (p. 178) where Wittgenstein writes, My attitude towards him is an attitude towards a soul”. Cavell sees in this attitude an acknowledgement of another. Acknowledgment is active, it is something we do in relation to another; it is not a cognitive achievement. With his emphasis on acknowledgement, Cavell aims to turn us away from the idea that my fundamental relation to others is a cognitive one (see Cavell, 1979, Pt. IV, and Avramides 2023).

1.4 Perceptual Knowledge of Other Minds

Those who defend either the argument from analogy or from best explanation are firmly of the view that any knowledge we may have of other minds (or any justification there may be for our belief in them) must be indirect. They accept that, while our knowledge of our own mental states is direct, our knowledge of the mental states of others must proceed by reasoning from what we observe—the other’s behavior—to what we cannot observe—the other’s mental states.[3] The idea that the mind of another is not directly observable is one that seems common to many philosophers. As early as the fifth century AD, St. Augustine writes: “For even when a living body is moved, there is no way opened to our eyes to see the mind, a thing which cannot be seen by the eyes…” (De Trinitate 140; cf. Descartes 1641, Second Meditation; and Berkeley 1710, Principle 148) The idea that we should have direct knowledge of another’s mental states has also come under fire more recently by Colin McGinn, who writes that direct perceptual reports specifying the mental states of another “seem definitely wrong” (1984: 123, n. 2; cf. Plantinga 1966: 441).

Direct knowledge is often associated with perception and it is this, as we have just seen, that so many philosophers have rejected in association with other minds. While our knowledge of the world of things around us is taken to come about through perception, it has been thought that knowledge of another’s mind cannot come about by this means.[4] Nonetheless, we find Nathalie Duddington writing, “My object in the present paper is to maintain that our knowledge of other minds is as direct and immediate as our knowledge of physical things” (1919: 147). It is not at all clear that philosophers at the time paid much attention to this very interesting paper, but philosophers today have found in Duddington’s work a precursor for an idea that has come to be taken very seriously—at least in some circles.[5]

Many analytic philosophers in the past few decades have written in defense of the idea that our knowledge of other minds comes about through perception (e.g., McDowell 1978 and 1982, Dretske 1969 and 1976, Cassam 2007, McNeil 2012, Stout 2010, and Green, 2010). The idea is also defended by some philosophers writing in the phenomenological tradition (§1.4.2). Many philosophers working today bring together work in both traditions in defense of this idea (e.g., Overgaard 2019, Krueger 2014, and J. Smith 2010). Consideration of issues to do with the self in relation to others has been thought by some to have the power to bridge the chasm between these two traditions in philosophy.

1.4.1 McDowell and Dretske on perceptual knowledge of other minds

Those attracted by the idea that our knowledge of other minds comes about through perception often appeal to the following in defense of their position: we all acknowledge that we often claim to be in the position where we can just see that another is angry, in pain, and the like. These philosophers are careful to point out that we don’t always claim that this is the case and we do not claim it with respect to all mental states, but they hold that attention to such cases can teach us that the mental is not always “withdrawn from direct engagement with the world” (McDowell 1995: 413). Duddington writes that to say that knowledge of another’s mind can be direct and immediate is to say that there is no veil or barrier intervening between the knowing subject and what is known—it is not to say either that our knowledge here is complete or that there are no difficulties that stand in the way of our attainment of such knowledge (1919: 167; cf. McDowell 1982).

McDowell has written that

we should not jib at, or interpret away, the common-sense thought that … one can literally perceive, in another person’s facial expression or his behavior, that he is in pain, and not just infer that he is in pain from what one perceives. (1978: 305)

McDowell’s perceptual account involves two crucial moves, one concerning our understanding of experience and the other concerning our understanding of behavior. He proposes that we think of our experience as being “open” to the world, allowing objects to figure in it directly; and in a parallel fashion he proposes that we think of behavior as giving expression to mental states thereby allowing them to figure in behavior (McDowell 1982, 1986). According to McDowell, when one has an experience of genuinely expressive behavior, one is not actually experiencing the mental state of the other; nonetheless, behavior in the veridical case should not be thought to fall short of mind in such a way as to allow for the possibility of its total absence. McDowell believes that this understanding of experience and behavior can support (sceptic-proof) knowledge of both the world and other minds.

The challenge for McDowell is to explain how error can arise in both cases. To accommodate error, McDowell introduces a disjunctive understanding of both experience and behavior (McDowell 1982; Soteriou 2016). Considering the former we can say: either our experience is such as to yield access to the world or it is such as to yield only apparent access. Considering the latter we can say: either the observed behavior is such as to be expressive of the other’s mentality or it only appears to be such. In both cases the way things seem to the experiencing subject is such as to fall short of infallible knowledge as to which disjunct is in question (McDowell 1986 [1998: 240]). We may be fallible with respect to how things are in the world, but McDowell insists that we must be careful to locate this fallibility in the right place. We should not conclude, as so many have, that all experience may be fallible; this is the move that paves the way for radical scepticism. It is, rather, our perceptual capacities that are fallible: sometimes they provide us with experience which is veridical and sometimes they do not (McDowell 2006). The important thing is that, when experience is veridical, we can take it to give us (sceptic-proof) knowledge of the world.

When it comes to our knowledge of other minds, the disjunctive move allows us to hold that, where behavior is genuinely expressive of another’s mental life, there our experience of her behavior will yield (sceptic-proof) knowledge of another’s mental life. Genuinely expressive behavior is being thought of not as evidence (a symptom) of another’s mental life but as a criterion of it. This, McDowellian, understanding of criteria—in contrast to Wright’s (§1.3)—requires that we accept behavior in at least some cases to be expressive of, a criterion of, mental states. So understood, behavioral criteria are indefeasible. This is not to say that error is not possible, as the person I encounter may be deceiving me. However, in such cases the criterion for the mental state is not satisfied. The important thing is that this possibility should not be taken to negate the fact that, when the other person is not deceiving me, my experience of her behavior can result in (sceptic-proof) knowledge that she is, for example, in pain. The genuine possibility that others may deceive me should not be taken to open up the possibility that all others may be zombies and that I am in the world alone.[6] (We may here consider something Wittgenstein writes (1992, 94e): “But of course it isn’t true that we are never certain about the mental processes in someone else. In countless cases we are.”)

Dretske’s defense of our direct, perceptual knowledge of another mind differs significantly from the one that is found in the work of McDowell or Duddington. Dretske is not interested in scepticism, or in giving an account of knowledge that is sceptic-proof. He is interested only in saying how it is that we come to know what others think and feel, to identify the source of our knowledge here (cf. §1). While we often say that we just can see what another is thinking or feeling, it is also thought that there is an obstacle to taking perception to be a possible source of this knowledge. Dretske identifies the obstacle here to arise from the fact that it is generally thought that another’s mind is unobservable: while one can see the smile, the clenched fist or the hunched shoulder, one cannot see what lies behind these things (Dretske 1973: 36). While Dretske agrees that you cannot see another’s joy, anger or depression, he believes you can see (the fact) that another is happy, angry or depressed. The distinction here goes along with another that Dretske draws between what he calls “non-epistemic” and “epistemic seeing”. The former is a relation between a person and a thing (Dretske likens this relation to stepping on a bug), while the latter has “positive belief content” (Dretske 1966). He points out that just as one can see that someone is wealthy without seeing their wealth, or see that the metal rod is hot without seeing the heat, so one can see that another is happy, angry, depressed and the like without seeing the other’s joy, anger or depression (Dretske 1966 and 1973). Dretske suggests an analysis of epistemic seeing, which analysis contains an all-important reliability condition: the conditions under which, for example, Sally sees that Tom is angry must be such that Tom would not look angry to Sally unless he was angry. It is the satisfaction of this reliability condition that allows the satisfaction of the analysis to amount to both a visual and an epistemic achievement.[7]

Dretske appreciates that a given behavior on Tom’s part is not always a reliable indicator of, say, anger. What he holds is that under certain conditions and to those who know Tom well—such as his wife—his behavior can be taken to be a reliable indicator of his anger (for a critique of this idea see Avramides 2019). Therefore, according to Dretske, we can have direct perceptual knowledge of another’s mental states in the following sense: we can see what others are feeling andand thinking, even though we cannot see another’s mental states or know that solipsism is false.[8]

Quassim Cassam brings the work of Dretske together with that of McDowell in his defense of a perceptual account of our knowledge of other minds (Cassam 2007, ch. 5). Cassam uses Dretske’s work to show that one can know what another thinks and feels despite the fact that one cannot see another’s mental states. But rather than follow Dretske in holding that behaviour is a reliable indicator of another’s mental states, Cassam follows McDowell and holds that behaviour manifests another’s mental states. Behaviour, according to Cassam, is revealing of another’s state of mind without being that state of mind (Cassam 2007, 165). The result of bringing the work of these two philosophers together allows Cassam to claim that I can know both what another thinks and feels and that he is a thinking, feeling being. Dretske, on the other hand, holds that I can only know what another thinks and feels. According to Dretske, that another is a genuine thinking, feeling being is not something that can be known; rather, this is a presumption or presupposition (for a discussion of Cassam’s work in relation to McDowell and Dretske see Avramides 2023).

1.4.2 Perceptual knowledge of other minds and the phenomenological tradition

The late 19th and early twentieth centuries saw the emergence of the phenomenological movement associated with such figures as Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty and Sartre. One important dimension of the work of these philosophers is discussion of intersubjectivity. There are two other philosophers in this tradition whose work is also strongly associated with intersubjectivity, Max Scheler and Edith Stein. It can be said of the phenomenological approach as a whole that it rejects the isolationism of the self that characterizes Cartesian philosophy. Scheler specifically criticizes the argument from analogy, claiming (i) that it is mistaken in its starting point or first premise and (ii) that it wrongly assumes that we cannot have access to another’s mind.

The first premise of the argument from analogy is, in effect, the Cartesian starting point: one is secure in the knowledge that one has of one’s own conscious experience. These phenomenologists reject this starting point. In its place Husserl (1931) adopts the starting point of embodied subjectivity, Heidegger (1927) insists that the structure of human experience is such as to involve a relation to the world and to others (Dasein is essentially characterized by Mitsein), and Merleau-Ponty holds that “I find myself already situated and involved in a physical and social world” (1945 [2003: 419]). Sartre takes things further and draws attention to the extent to which the encounter with another is an encounter with someone who takes me as an object (1943).

These philosophers refuse to allow themselves to be pre-occupied by the epistemological issues that they see as arising from a mistaken starting point. Instead of asking how I can justify my belief in the world and others, they take for granted that the individual’s experience is such as to exist in a world and for others and address questions that concern this starting point, such as: what makes this starting point possible (Husserl & Merleau-Ponty); how can we explain/understand the structures of the being of subjectivity in such a way as to include the world and others (Heidegger); how do I encounter the Other (Sartre). Crucial to the defense of this non-Cartesian starting point is a non-Cartesian conception of mind in relation to body. The conceptual divide between mind and body that one finds in Descartes’ philosophy is taken by these thinkers to be “inadequate to phenomenology” (Overgaard 2006).

These phenomenologists also reject the idea that we cannot have access to the mind of another. Scheler points out that

we believe ourselves to be directly acquainted with another person’s joy in his laughter, with his sorrow and pain in his tears, with his shame in his blushing

and the like (1913 [1954: 260]). And in the same paragraph Scheler insists that we should not allow philosophical theory to tempt us away from the obvious: that we know the minds of others through perception. In a similarly vein, Merleau-Ponty (1945 [2003: 415]) writes:

I perceive the grief or the anger of the other in his conduct, in his face or his hands, without recourse to any ‘inner’ experience of suffering or anger….

Scheler suggests that philosophical theory tries to turn us away from the obvious by insisting that “there is certainly no sensation of another person’s mind nor any stimulus from such a source”, and he insists that to think like this is to turn one’s back on the “expressive unity” of behavior (1913 [1954: 181]). He writes: “We can … have insight into others, in so far as we treat their bodies as a field of expression for their experiences” (1913 [1954: 10]). Whether we take knowledge here to come about either as the reult of an inference (as in the argument from analogy) or though perception turns, according to Scheler, on the question of how one views the relationship between mind and behavior.

Scheler considers a crying child and the various responses that one may have to her. Firstly there is the possibility that one sees the face but does not see it as expressing distress. Secondly there is the possibility that one sees the face as expressive of distress while remaining indifferent. And finally, there is the situation where one sees the child’s distress and responds emotionally. Scheler associates empathy with the second situation, and labels the emotional response in the final situation “sympathy.”[9] The relationship between perception and empathy is explored in somewhat more detail in the work of both Husserl and his student Edith Stein. While Husserl struggles with the idea of empathy in relation to others throughout his career we find in Stein’s work a more settled view (Zahavi 2014). Stein distinguishes empathy from perception, holding that empathy “is a kind of act of perceiving sui generis” (Stein 1917 [1989: 5]): it is like perception in so far as it is direct (like Scheler, Stein rejects the idea that knowledge of others comes about through inference); it is unlike perception in the way in which it gives us its object. Empathy is the way in which we experience foreign consciousness. Stein follows Scheler in holding that our experience of the other is an experience of a soul which is “always necessarily a soul in a body” (1917 [1989: 44]), but she emphasizes the way in which this experience is always imperfect: there is always a distance between what I am aware of when I empathize with the other and what the other is experiencing; I experience the other as other, as a center of intentionality or as a perspective on the world that is different from mine (cf. Zahavi 2014: 192). Without the distance introduced by an imperfect understanding—if understanding here could be perfect—I would be the other (cf. Levinas 1979: 89: “the absence of the other is exactly his presence as other”). It is this distance that Stein accuses Scheler of failing to capture in his more straightforwardly perceptual account.[10] As well as appreciating the otherness of the other, there is an appreciation in the work of Stein and Scheler of the ethical nature of my encounter with the other (cf. Levinas, Wittgenstein and Cavell).

1.4.3 Indirect vs direct accounts

It is sometimes taken to be the case that perception and inference exhaust the alternatives when we consider how we might account for our knowledge of others. But, as we have seen in §1.4.2, Stein’s account eschews a straightforwardly perceptual account of our knowledge here without yet succumbing to an inferential one. It may be more fruitful if one thought of the opposition here to be between indirect and direct accounts of our knowledge of others. What many who oppose inference are against is the mind-body relationship upon which it is based. Many who reject indirect accounts are opposed to an idea that they see as lying at the heart of such accounts – the idea that the behaviour of the other acts as a veil cutting me off from the other’s mental states. Once this idea is rejected, it remains open how to understand direct accounts. McDowell suggests two possible interpretations. On the first, the fact of the other’s mental states is presented to view; on the other,

… we might think of what is directly available to experience in some such terms as “his giving expression to his being in the ‘inner’ state”: this is something that, while not itself actually being the “inner” state of affairs in question, nevertheless does not fall short of it…. (McDowell 1982, 472–3).

Those that advocate a direct account of our knowledge of other minds are faced with the following question: does their account entail a rejection of the asymmetry that philosophers have identified between knowledge of one’s own and another’s mind (see §1)? Some philosophers who propose a direct account would insist that they can still allow for an asymmetry here, just so long as we are careful how we understand it.[11] They believe that we must be careful not to understand the asymmetry here as committing us to a picture of mind as lying behind behavior. One alternative to this picture can be found in the work of Merleau-Ponty who writes,

The grief and anger of another have never quite the same significance for him as they have for me. For him these situations are lived through, for me they are displayed. (Merleau-Ponty 1945 [2003: 415])

(Cf. Wittgenstein 1992: 10e, who writes: “My words and my actions interest me in a completely different way than they do someone else … I do not relate to them as an observer”.)

2. The Conceptual Problem of Other Minds

Thomas Nagel once wrote:

The interesting problem of other minds is not the epistemological problem…. It is the conceptual problem, how I can understand the attribution of mental states to others. (1986: 19–20)

Bilgrami agrees (1992). Some philosophers go further than Nagel and insist that the conceptual is the fundamental problem; others see little in it (Hyslop 1995). How one understands this problem is a matter of some contention (Gomes 2011). What all agree is that the problem is associated with the work of Wittgenstein, and in particular section 302 from the Philosophical Investigations:

If one has to imagine someone else’s pain on the model of one’s own, this is none too easy a thing to do: for I have to imagine pain which I do not feel on the model of pain which I do feel. That is, what I have to do is not simply to make a transition in imagination from one place of pain to another. As, from the pain in the hand to pain in the arm. For I am not to imagine that I feel pain in some region of his body….

Malcolm understands 302 as providing an “external attack” on the possibility of a private language (contrast the argument of §1.1). That is to say, 302 is designed to show the difficulty that one runs into if one begins with the idea that one knows from one’s own case what it is to feel pain: one risks conceptual solipsism. [12] Colin McGinn has suggested that the problem raised in 302 can be thought of in the following way: if I learn through introspection what it is, say, to be in pain, then there is a “a way of thinking about my experiences which (a) only I have and (b) enters into my understanding of the concept in question” (1984: 127). The way I learn about the object of my thought here is as something that has a “distinctively first-person element” from which it seems impossible to prescind (ibid). This explains why I can make a transition from the pain in my hand to the pain in my arm, but it is “none too easy a thing” to make a transition from a pain that I feel in my hand to a pain that you feel somewhere in your body (for a very different interpretation of the 302, see Kripke 1982, Postscript).

Some associate the conceptual problem here with the problem of coming to have mental concepts that are completely general. Gareth Evans has proposed that to have a thought about an object to the effect that it is F (consider: Tom is angry) requires the exercise of the following two capacities:

One being the capacity to think of x, which could be equally exercised in thoughts about x to the effect that it is G or H; and the other being a conception of what it is to be F, which could be equally exercised in thoughts about other individuals, to the effect that they are F. (1982: 75)

Evans labels this the “generality constraint” (Ibid, ftnt. 15), and it has been thought to raise a problem for thoughts about mental states if one takes it that one comes to know what a mental state is by inward reflection alone. The problem, reflected in 302, is how to understand the extension to others of a concept acquired in this way.

P.F. Strawson in effect acknowledges the generality constraint when he writes:

It is a necessary condition of one’s ascribing states of consciousness, experiences, to oneself, in the way that one does, that one should also ascribe them, or be prepared to ascribe them, to others who are not oneself. (1959: 99)

Strawson considers how it is that one ascribes mental states to others and concludes that one cannot do this if we insist on divorcing mental states from the behaving body. Strawson claims that we must acknowledge what he calls the “primitiveness of the concept of a person”, the concept of

a type of entity such that both predicates ascribing states of consciousness and predicates ascribing corporeal characteristics … are equally applicable…. (1959: 101–2)

While many will accept that the conceptual problem is the first problem we encounter in connection with others, others go further and claim that once one addresses the conceptual problem there is no room for the epistemological one. This is because our way of thinking and talking about mind will have application to others built into it from the start. It has been pointed out that to say what is required for grasp of a concept is not yet to show that that concept is instantiated.[13] It can be said in reply that it is a particular proposed solution to this conceptual problem that may be thought to make the epistemological question otiose. As we can see with Strawson’s proposal, the idea is that we break down the gap between mind and behavior and understand what one experiences when one sees another’s behavior as itself requiring mental state attributions to the other. Some can only see in this proposal a retreat into behaviorism. Others, however, insist that this is not the case—at least if behaviorism is understood as a reductionist thesis. It is not reductionist to hold that behavior is expressive of another’s mental life; genuinely expressive behavior is held to be distinguishable from ‘mere behavior’ (cf. Austin 1946).

McDowell claims to echo Strawson’s work when he writes in this connection that we must regain the concept of a human being from what he takes to be a “philosophically generated” concept of a human body (McDowell 1982: 469; cf. Cook 1969). Some take issue with McDowell over whether the latter is only a philosophically generated concept (Wright 1998), but it is hard to deny that the move from the former concept to the latter is deeply significant.

3. The Naturalist Turn

Alvin Goldman (2006) has distinguished a descriptive from a normative epistemological problem of other minds. Section 1 and section 2 were largely concerned with the latter; this section will concern itself with the former. The descriptive problem is associated with what Goldman terms mind reading (or mentalizing). Mind reading involves the capacity to think about mind and is a second or higher order activity that involves representing or conceptualizing others (as well as oneself) as “loci of mental life” (Goldman 2006: 3). While many species of animal may be thought to have minds, only some will be capable of representing another as having minds. Questions of justification and conceptual difficulty are not of concern to the descriptive theorist, nor are metaphysical questions concerning the nature of mind; what concerns the descriptive epistemologist is how what she says measures up with what is being learned in the empirical disciplines of developmental psychology and neuroscience. Work on the descriptive problem is developing at a rapid pace and, while at first attention in all the relevant disciplines was concentrated on two prominent accounts of mind reading—theory-theory and simulation theory—a variety of accounts now exist which challenge both of these accounts (see §3.2).

3.1 Theory-Theory and Simulation Theory

Theory-theory has its roots in a paper by Premack and Woodruff (1978), which argued that certain problem-solving behavior observed in chimpanzees should be taken as evidence that they possess a theory of mind, as evidence that they are able to make predictions about the behavior of others that impute to them unobservable mental states. Premack and Woodruff take this imputation to be a rather primitive and unsophisticated reaction to the observation of certain behavior, so natural in both humans and chimpanzees that it would take an effort to suppress it.[14]

In their commentaries on this paper (1978), Dennett, Bennett, and Harman pointed out that further experimentation was required in order to determine whether a creature possesses the concept of belief (which concept is required in order to have thoughts about another’s mental states). In particular, it would need to be shown that the creature possesses the concept of false belief. Wimmer and Perner (1983) devised a test that purported to show just that. The original test was carried out with normally developing human children and taken to show that the capacity to represent false beliefs is present in 4 to 6 year olds, but absent in 3 year olds.[15] Two different proposals have been put forward to explain this developmental change. One proposal (see, e.g., Gopnik & Wellman 1992) suggests that the child possesses a naïve psychological theory that it uses to explain and predict the behavior of others and that gets revised by the child over time. The other proposal (see, e.g., Leslie & Roth 1993) suggests a native, domain-specific (or modular) mechanism that matures at a certain point as what explains the child’s success with the false-belief test.

This approach to understanding how we attribute mental states to others has several notable features: (i) it dovetails with the dominant approach to solving the knowledge-of-other-minds problem as it proposes that our belief here is the result of postulating mental states as the best explanation of observed behavior; (ii) it dovetails with a functionalist account of mind; and (iii) it can solve the asymmetry problem, as some hold the child comes to attribute mental states to herself on the same model as she does others (Gopnik 2009). All three features of this theory have come under criticism. This approach has also been challenged by further empirical work that purports to show that infants as young as 15 months have the concept of false belief (Onishi & Baillargeon 2005). One suggestion to accommodate this data is that we postulate two systems: one that operates in the infant and that is fast, efficient, inflexible and non-normative, and another that develops later (and operates in tandem with the earlier one in the mature human) and that is effortful, inflexible, normative and language-dependent (Apperly and Butterfill 2009; for a good summary of this work and a critique of it, see Jacob 2019). Much recent work has challenged the conclusion that the child who fails the false belief test lacks a competence, suggesting instead that the young child’s failure with the false belief test should be accounted for in terms of performance factors (in this connection see work by Fabricius and Oktay-Gür & Rakoczy). Questions have been raised about various aspects of the design of the original false belief test, including questions regarding the way national or community identity may be thought to play a role in the performance and understanding of the tasks.

Robert Gordon, Jane Heal and Alvin Goldman propose an alternative to the theory-theory account of how to understand the attribution of mental states to others. Heal identifies in theory-theory a scientific motivation that runs roughshod over important differences between human beings and the rest of the natural world. While theory-theorists extend a style of understanding from its application in connection with the latter to the former, Heal and others propose that we come to understand what the other persons are thinking “from the inside”, that we “exploit the fact that we are or have minds” (Heal 1998 [2003: 84]). Heal is particularly concerned with the question, What further thoughts will a person have given what thoughts I already know her to have? (Heal (1998) also traces out further questions about others that may concern us.) Gordon (1986, 1995) insists that simulation theory must be formulated in such a way as to avoid reliance on both introspection and inference from oneself to the other. Rather than imagine what I would do in your situation, he suggests that I imagine being you in your situation. In this way, thinking about others is taken to parallel understanding of one’s own future behavior: one predicts what one will do by imagining or pretending that the world is a certain way. Simulation theory has its roots in Verstehen theories favored by sociologists and historians such as Collingwood and Dilthey (as well as work by Lipps on empathy; for an overview here see Stueber 2018). Simulation theory was thought to be given neurophysiological backing by the discovery of mirror neurons in the pre-motor cortex and in Broca’s area of the human brain that are activated both when an individual acts and when she observes the actions of another (Gallese and Goldman 1998; Gallese 2001; Rizzolatti et al. 1996). (For an overview of the different versions of simulation theory that have been advocated see Barlassina and Gordon 2017.)

3.2 The Second Person and Person Model Theory

Over the years theory-theory and simulation theory have moved closer towards each other, giving rise to various hybrid accounts of how it is that we attribute minds to others. But there are those who challenge both theories and any hybrid versions that they have spawned. One such challenge arises from Gallagher & Zahavi 2008 who urge that we cast aside both third-person (theory) and first-person (simulation) approaches, and concentrate instead on second-person interaction. (In its development in Gallagher’s work, this approach has come to be known as “interaction theory”.) Influenced by work in phenomenology and embodied cognition, Gallagher and Zahavi propose that our attribution of mental states to others is the result of perception of and reaction to behavior understood as expressive of mental life. Furthermore, they suggest that the activation of mirror neurons be understood as serving action or response preparation (rather than as supporting simulation, cf. §3.1). Drawing on the work of developmental psychologists such as Meltzoff, Trevarthen, and Hobson, they identify two forms of intersubjectivity: a primary form identifiable in early infancy that involves a differential response to persons and inanimate objects; and a secondary form when the behavior of persons is interpreted “in terms of their goals and intentions set in contextualized situations” (Gallagher & Zahavi 2008: 190). In addition to primary and secondary intersubjectivity, and at the point when the child has language, it is suggested that a more nuanced way of understanding others becomes possible through the development of communicative and narrative practices (Hutto 2008; Gallagher & Hutto 2008). Gallagher and Zahavi reject inferential accounts of how we know others in favor of a direct perceptual one, and they understand behavior (e.g., gesture, facial expressions, contextualized actions) to be constitutive of mental life. Importantly, they point out that one shouldn’t conceive of interpersonal understanding as if it was merely and primarily a question of bridging the gap between two isolated subjects. Interpersonal understanding occurs in a context and through “our shared engagement in the common world” (Gallagher & Zahavi 2008: 190; cf. Gurwitsch 1977 [1979]).

This work aims to move us away from an overly-intellectualized way of thinking of other minds and to turn our attention to the world that we live and act in with others. The emphasis here is less on individual beliefs and desires than in shared intentions and goals. As Gallagher says in one place, “social cognition is often nothing more than … social interaction” (2008: 541).

Interaction theory can be seen as an extension of enactivist theories of perception that understand perception as a highly complex action-oriented phenomenon, incorporating both meaning and emotion: to see an object is to see it as affording me opportunity for action, and this opportunity is taken to be part of how I make sense of the world and what gives the world value for me (cf. Clarke, Noe, Varela et al). The extension of this idea allows that social interactions also constitute for me “novel domains of possibilities for sense making” (De Jaegher 2009). To see the other person is to see her as affording interaction; in this regard, direct perception is direct enactive perception. Interactionist theorists have suggested concrete proposals for empirical work in psychology and neuroscience in the hopes of moving this research away from what they see as individualism and methodological solipsism (De Jaegher, DiPaulo, & Gallagher 2010). Rather than taking individual agents to be constitutive of social interaction, these interaction theorists take them to be constituted by their interaction with others.

Person model theory challenges theory-theory (TT) and simulation theory (ST)—as well as interaction theory (IT; Newen 2015, Newen & Schlicht 2009). Person model theory finds certain limitations in each of the theories that it opposes. In the place of the two forms of intersubjectivity recommended by Gallagher and Zahavi, person theory suggests that the infant works with a “non-conceptual person-schema” which develops—through the combined work of observation and narrative—into “conceptualized person-images”. Thus, it is proposed that the understanding of persons is a step-by-step process of enrichment, central to which is the acceptance of a multiplicity of strategies (TT, ST, and IT among them). Which strategy is deployed is dependent upon such things as context, how similar or different the other is from oneself, whether the understanding is of an emotion or a propositional attitude, and the complexity of the mental state. The idea of the deployment of a multiplicity of strategies is not unique to Person Theory. Gallagher and Fiebich (2019) argue for what they call a “pluralist approach” to the understanding of others, drawing on inference, simulation, direct perception, and/or interaction—depending on the situation (cf. Nichols & Stich 2003). What this work highlights is how much may be involved when it comes to understanding others.

It is possible to see a connection between ideas that are fundamental to interaction theory (which brings together work from phenomenology and embodied cognition) and some ideas that can be found in the work of Stanley Cavell (which aims to interpret and develop the work of Austin and Wittgenstein, as well as integrating work from phenomenology with work in analytic philosophy). Where Gallagher and Zahavi emphasize social interaction, Cavell writes of a duality in the problem of other minds. Cavell understands this duality to be what the radical Cartesian sceptic overlooks when she presses her question about our knowledge of the mind of another. What we must appreciate, according to Cavell, is that in so far as there is a problem about how I know you, there is equally a problem about how you know me (herein lies the duality in the problem). Cavell holds that appreciating this duality will help us to see the error of the sceptic’s ways. The sceptic considers only one side of the problem and insists that we suffer from an epistemological lack. Cavell draws attention to the side of the problem that the sceptic misses and finds in this a fear on our part of not being understood by another. It is this fear that gets misunderstood by the sceptic and turned into a darkness which is projected on to the other. Cavell thinks we must resist this projection and understand that acknowledgment by another is made possible by expression on my part. Expression is what makes acknowledgement possible. We must take responsibility to give expression to our mental states which can in turn be acknowledged by others. Importantly, for Cavell acknowledgement is not the same as knowledge. While the latter is a form of cognition, the forner is to be understood as behaviour oriented towards another (for more on the duality that Cavell finds in the problem of other minds see Avramides, forthcoming). According to Cavell, I must take responsibility for acknowledging the humanity in others, which acknowledgement is evident in the way I behave towards them.

4. Thinking about Mind Prior to the Twentieth Century

4.1 From Descartes to Mill

As so much of the debate concerning others in the heyday of its discussion in analytic philosophy in the twentieth century can be read as a reaction to Mill’s formulation of the argument from analogy, it is instructive to consider the context for Mill’s work here.[16] In proposing his argument, Mill was responding to a challenge laid down by the eighteenth century philosopher Thomas Reid who argued that Descartes’ philosophy, when traced through the work of philosophers such as Malebranche, Locke, Hume and Berkeley, leads to solipsism. In order to avoid this conclusion, Reid argued that philosophers must jettison the Cartesian framework of ideas and its trust in reason over the deliverances of sense. According to Reid, the faculties of reason and perception should be regarded as being on an equal footing. Rather than insist that all human belief is regulated by reason, Reid holds that we should allow that our perceptions of the world are guided by principles for which no proof can be offered. Amongst the regulative principles Reid identifies there are two concerning others: (i) there is life and intelligence in our fellow men; and (ii) certain features of the countenance, sounds of the voice and gestures of the body indicate certain thoughts and dispositions of mind (Reid 1785). Mill’s work is designed as a defense of the Cartesian framework in response to Reid’s claim that it leads inexorably to solipsism. According to Mill, all truths are known in one of two ways: either directly, through the authority of consciousness, or indirectly, by inference from truths known directly. Mill believes that knowledge arrived indirectly in this way is sufficient to avoid the concern of solipsism.

While there is little direct discussion of this question in Descartes’ work, one can find passages devoted to it in post-Cartesian philosophy.[17] Malebranche, for example, differentiates knowledge of one’s own mind, of bodies, and of other men’s mind: the first is through consciousness, the second through ideas, and the third through conjecture (1674–5 [1980: 239]). In the case of another man’s sensations, Malebranche first considers the possibility that everyone has the same sensations when confronted with the same objects, but then notes that it can happen that “the internal fibers of the optic nerve do not produce the same sensation for different people” (Ibid, 66). Despite this possibility, Malebranche thinks there is reason to believe that God arranged things so that the same physical conditions do produce the same sensations (i.e., that nature is uniform). Nonetheless, he argues that we cannot know another’s sensations as there is “a great deal of diversity in different people’s organs of sight as well as of hearing and taste” (ibid).[18] Writing in response to Malebranche, Arnauld (1683) insists that we do know other men’s minds through ideas: we have ideas of their bodies and must reason from these to the conclusion that they have minds. In Arnauld’s work we have, arguably, an early formulation of the argument from analogy.

It may be worth remembering that, in so far as Descartes’ philosophy raises a problem about other minds, it is a thick or radical sceptical problem. What one finds in Malebranche’s work is a thin sceptical problem. Malebranche appears to take it for granted that others have minds; what interests him is whether the sensations that others feel are the same as those that I feel. John Locke follows Malebrance in not taking seriously the thick or radical sceptical problem here. Locke asks whether the idea produced in one man’s mind by a violet may not be exactly the same as the idea produced in another man’s mind by a marigold (Locke 1689, II, xxxii, 15). But as Locke is concerned less with the “metaphysical Sense of the word Truth” and more with “the more ordinary Acceptation of those words” he allows that “the sensible Ideas, produced by any Object in different Men’s Minds, are most commonly very near and undiscernible alike” (Locke 1689, II, XXXii, 13 & 15).

The threat of solipsism is particularly problematic for the idealism of George Berkeley. Without proof of other minds, idealism will amount to nothing but solipsism. Berkeley admits that I cannot have immediate evidence of the mind of another; what he holds is that there is “a certain collection of ideas, as directs us to think there is a distinct principle of thought and motion like until ourselves, accompanying and represented by it” (Berkeley 1710: Principle 148). While some find in Berkeley’s work another early formulation of the argument from analogy (Urmson 1982), others argue that his work should be read as putting forwards a causal argument: in the case of God, I reason that He is the cause or Author of everything in nature that I see around me; in the case of other finite spirits, I reason that they are the cause of the movements in the bodies I observe and the words that I hear (Bennett 1971 and Falkenstein 1990).

Some philosophers also find an argument from analogy in the work of David Hume, while others interpret his work in a more naturalistic vein. One thing that cannot be denied is that Hume introduces an important element into the discussion of others when he writes in The Treatise, “No quality of human nature is more remarkable, both in itself and in its consequences, than that propensity we have to sympathize with others” (1738–40 [1888: 316]). It is by means of sympathy that we are affected by the passions and mental states of others, which otherwise “remain concealed in the minds of others” (ibid, 593). Precisely how this remarkable capacity operates is a matter of some debate. There are those who agree with Reid and find Hume unable to escape the confines of his own mind. These philosophers argue that Hume recognizes the problem of other minds that arises for the Cartesian framework that he endorses, and holds that sympathy can do no more than get us to feel our own feelings in response to what we observe in the other. But there are others who take Hume to turn his back on scepticism and the very business of providing reasons for the belief that others have thoughts and feelings. They read Hume’s work as giving us a psychological account of how it is that we are able to understand the thoughts and feelings of our fellow men through the operation of sympathy (Greco 2012; see also work by Waldow 2009).

Hume’s understanding of the working of sympathy was challenged by his contemporary Adam Smith. Smith rejects the idea that I can feel what another feels. He writes,

Though our brother is upon the rack, as long as we ourselves are at our ease, our senses will never inform us of what he suffers. They never did, and never can, carry us beyond our own person, and it is by the imagination only that we can form any conception of what are his sensations….

A little later he writes,

That this is the source of our fellow-feeling for the misery of others, that it is by changing places in fancy with the sufferer, that we come either to conceive or to be affected by what he feels, may be demonstrated by many obvious observations, if it should not be thought sufficiently evident of itself. (1759: I.i.i.2–3)

With Smith’s work we take a step closer to the work of the simulation theorists of more recent times (cf. §3.1).

It is Reid’s contention that, so long as one is working within a Cartesian framework of ideas, our relations to others must be a taken to be a matter of probability, hypothesis, or conjecture, and this he takes to be at odds with the conviction with which, for example, the child interacts with her nurse. While the Cartesian recognizes only the solitary operations of mind, Reid proposes that we also recognize the social operations of mind (Reid 1785 [1969: 71]).

4.2 Before Descartes

Philosophers are inclined to trace the problem of other minds back to the writing of Descartes. If it is true that there is something in Descartes’ philosophy that gives rise to this problem, then one may expect to find the ‘problem of other minds’ less pressing in the work of pre-Cartesian philosophy. With the possible exception of Augustine (whose work is taken by some to be a pre-cursor to Descartes’), this is arguably the case.

While philosophers in ancient Greece raise sceptical questions concerning others, it is has been suggested that the problems they raise tend to be ‘thin’ rather than ‘thick’ ones (see §1 and Avramides 2001). Plato and Aristotle, for example, discuss the value of friendship, but do not ask why we should think others exist to be friends. Sorabji claims that “it never occurs to Aristotle to raise doubts about other minds” (1974: 88). According to Sextus Empiricus, sceptics of the Cyrenaic school raise problems about the minds of others, but it is not clear that the problem they raise goes beyond the ‘thin’ one, How can I know what another thinks and feels? (Tsouna 1998a).[19]

4.3 Another History

While philosophers in the West trace their lineage back to ancient Greece, it is worth remembering that philosophical ideas were also being discussed elsewhere in the world. One tradition that has a long history of concern with issues to do with the minds of others is the classical Indian tradition. While one should not read texts from other philosophical traditions only to find parallels with one’s own, it is striking that these early Eastern philosophers may be thought to have grappled with many of the same issues concerning others as have philosophers in the Western tradition. It is possible to find discussion of both epistemological and conceptual problems in connection with others in these texts. There are two important works in this tradition devoted to questions concerning others, one by Dharmakīrti in the seventh century and another by Ratnakirti in the 11th. Indeed, Sharma (1985) writes that “Dharmakīrti is perhaps the first ever thinker to make a systematic attempt to come to grips with this problem [of other minds]”. Dharmakīrti is an idealist who denies the reality of the external world and whose work, therefore, is open to the charge of solipsism. In his Proof of the Existence of Other Streams of Consciousness, Dharmakīrti first points out that the mind of another is imperceptible; he then goes on to argue that other minds are inferred from observed speech and action. Many find in the writing of Dharmakirti an argument not dissimilar to the one found in the writing of John Stuart Mill (see, for example, Chakrabarti 2020, Pt. 3) Dharmakīrti is careful to acknowledge that there are limits to our understanding of others (we cannot know what it is like for them) (Inami 2001). Ganeri (2012) suggests that what we find in Dharmakīrti’s text is “a sort of argument from analogy” for the existence of others. Responding to Dharmakīrti here, Ratnakirti points out the difficulties in reasoning to the mind of another that one can never be in a position to verify. In effect, Ratnakirti argues that other minds cannot be taken to exist, and solipsism must be accepted. However, Ratnakirti is careful to draw a distinction between conventional and ultimate existence—while other minds do not exist ultimately, they do exist conventionally. It is this conventional existence that explains our actions with regards to others. According to Ganeri, we can also find in Ratnakirti’s work arguments to show that it is not possible even to form a conception of another mind (2012: 203). This problem is particularly pressing for the Buddhist philosopher for, as Ganeri reminds us (2012: 202), without a conception of others it is a question how one can cultivate compassion.


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