Frank Ramsey

First published Wed Aug 14, 2019; substantive revision Mon Oct 23, 2023

Frank Plumpton Ramsey (1903–30) made seminal contributions to philosophy, mathematics and economics. Whilst he was acknowledged as a genius by his contemporaries, some of his most important ideas were not appreciated until decades later; now better appreciated, they continue to bear an influence upon contemporary philosophy. His historic significance was to usher in a new phase of analytic philosophy, which initially built upon the logical atomist doctrines of Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein, raising their ideas to a new level of sophistication, but ultimately he became their successor rather than remain a mere acolyte.

This entry covers all of Ramsey’s contributions except to the discipline of economics, which is covered in the separate entry Ramsey and Intergenerational Welfare Economics. Note that all citations beginning solely with a date refer to works by Ramsey; these are listed by date in a subsection of the Bibliography. Also, collections of Ramsey’s works are cited by two-letter abbreviations, the keys to which are given in the first subsection of the Bibliography.

1. Life and Works

Ramsey was born in Cambridge on 22 February 1903. His father was a mathematician and Fellow of Magdalene College whilst his mother campaigned for women’s suffrage and other social causes. In 1920 Ramsey matriculated as an undergraduate student at Trinity College, Cambridge, from which he graduated in 1923 with a First in Mathematics. The year before he matriculated, whilst still a 17 year old school boy, Ramsey became friends, through his father’s connections, with C.K. Ogden and I.A. Richards, also a Fellow of Magdalene. Ramsey had already read Russell’s Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy and G.E. Moore’s Ethics but because he had become interested in learning German, Ogden gave Ramsey Mach’s Die Analyse der Empfindungen [Analysis of Sensations] to read. Ramsey, still in his final school year, went on to read Louis Couturat, Henri Poincaré and Hermann Weyl. By 1921, Ogden had become so impressed by Ramsey’s philosophical acumen and facility with German that he commissioned Ramsey, as a second year undergraduate, to translate Wittgenstein’s Tractatus into English – in the face of Moore’s scepticism that the Tractatus could be translated into English at all. Back in 1920, Ramsey also discussed with Ogden and Richards their theory of thought and language, later famously elaborated in The Meaning of Meaning (1923), which Ramsey reviewed – unfavourably – in Mind (1924). Ramsey nonetheless praised “the excellent appendix on C.S. Peirce” and this lead him to study the volume of Peirce’s papers, Chance, Love and Logic (1923), which Ogden had just published in his book series for Kegan Paul. During Ramsey’s first year as an undergraduate, Ogden also arranged for him to meet Russell in London and encouraged Ramsey to attend Moore’s lectures with him and Richards; Ramsey duly went along in his second term to Moore’s lectures on “Incomplete Symbols and Logical Constructions”. Moore was later to recall “In the early twenties F.P. Ramsey attended at least one course of my lectures. I had soon come to feel of him, as of Wittgenstein, that he was much cleverer than I was” (1944, 35).

In his first year as an undergraduate, Ramsey had met and befriended R.B. Braithwaite, then a mathematics undergraduate a year ahead of him. Braithwaite introduced Ramsey to J.M. Keynes, the economist. Ramsey was soon after elected to the Cambridge Apostles, the secret debating society of which Braithwaite and Keynes were both active members. Ramsey attended Keynes’ economics lectures and they discussed Keynes’ Treatise on Probability (1921). Ramsey’s criticisms appeared the following year in a review of Keynes’ book for Ogden’s journal, The Cambridge Magazine (1922); Keynes had maintained that probability is an objective relation between propositions but Ramsey denied we perceive such relations nor grasp them intellectually. After his finals, Ramsey turned to writing a critical notice for Mind of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (1923). Ogden had written to Wittgenstein suggesting that he meet with Ramsey and Ramsey duly went to Puchberg, near Vienna, in September 1923 to spend a fortnight with Wittgenstein working through the Tractatus with him. In 1924 Ramsey spent 6 months in Vienna being psychoanalysed, during which time he met Moritz Schlick and Hans Hahn, both members of the Vienna Circle. He returned to Cambridge in October 1924 where he had been appointed as a Fellow In Mathematics at King’s College, where Keynes, also a Fellow, had pushed for Ramsey’s appointment. At a meeting of the Moral Sciences Club that December, Ramsey met his future wife, Lettice Baker; they married in 1925 and had two daughters together.

Once back in Cambridge, Ramsey settled down to teach, including a course on the foundations of mathematics, and to write the papers in philosophy, economics and mathematics for which he was to become famous. He started by completing “The Foundations of Mathematics”, which he had begun in Vienna, and “Universals”, both published in 1925. The former was intended to rescue logicism by remedying the defects Ramsey found in Principia Mathematica, whilst the latter was a development of the programme of logical analysis advertised in the Tractatus; they won Ramsey immediate éclat. But it was the following year in which Ramsey really struck out on his own, writing “Truth and Probability” (1926a) although he did not publish it, which started from Ramsey’s criticisms of Keynes and provides a subjective theory of probability and a pragmatic view of induction, and “Facts and Propositions” (1927a), initially inspired by his reading of Peirce and Russell’s Analysis of Mind (1921), in which Ramsey’s philosophy of mind and language began to have, as he put it, a distinctive ‘pragmatist tendency’ (1927a, 170). It was also the year that Ramsey began dedicated work on economics which resulted in the first of his seminal papers on economics, ‘A contribution to the theory of taxation’ (1927b), later followed by his ‘Mathematical Theory of Saving’ (1928a). Ramsey also wrote his influential paper, ‘On a Problem of Formal Logic’ (1930), which contains the mathematical results now called ‘Ramsey’s Theorems’. In 1927 Ramsey also began work on a book manuscript, On Truth ([OT]). During the last two years of his life, Ramsey wrote a number of philosophical notes and papers, including ‘Theories’ and ‘General Propositions and Causality’, both completed in 1929. They were published by Braithwaite (in [FM]), along with ‘Truth and Probability’, in a posthumous volume of Ramsey’s papers, The Foundations of Mathematics and other Logical Essays, whilst the manuscript on truth did not appear until 1991.

After meeting and falling out with Ramsey when visiting Keynes in 1925, Wittgenstein returned to settle in Cambridge in 1929. He was admitted as a Ph.D. student, submitting the Tractatus as his thesis, Ramsey was his supervisor; they met regularly during what was to be the last year of Ramsey’s life. Wittgenstein was later to recall the significance of these conversations for his own intellectual development in the preface to Philosophical Investigations. Ramsey fell ill at the end of November 1929 and was diagnosed with jaundice. He had been corresponding with Schlick and had promised to write a review of Rudolf Carnap’s Aufbau. He died on 19 January 1930 in Guy’s Hospital in London. His death was unexpected and its causes remain uncertain. In an obituary for the Cambridge Review, Braithwaite wrote, ‘His intellectual subtlety was combined with the most delightful simplicity and candour. Intolerant of fools, he inspired others by his mental fertility and integrity. To one at least of his friends his death is as if a lighthouse were extinguished and we were left to grope our way in the dark’ (1930, 216).

Mellor’s BBC radio programme on Ramsey, produced in 1978 (see Other Internet Resources below), features the first hand testimony of Braithwaite, Lettice Ramsey, and I.A. Richards. See also Sahlin 1990, 221–9, Mellor 1995 and Taylor 2006. Ramsey’s sister, Margaret Paul, provides a more personal account of Ramsey’s life, drawing upon letters and diaries, in her memoir (2012). Misak (2020) provides an in-depth intellectual biography of Ramsey.

2. The Foundations of Logic and Mathematics

Ramsey, as we saw in the previous section, was still an undergraduate when, aged 19, he completed a translation of the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (Wittgenstein 1922). Alas, C. K. Ogden got all the credit and it has been known since as the ‘Ogden translation’. Ramsey’s translation is usually considered to be superseded by the Pears-McGuinness translation (1961), but one should not lose sight of the fact that it was carefully scrutinized by Wittgenstein, who gave it his seal of approval. Ramsey then wrote a searching review of the Tractatus (1923) in which he raised many serious objections (Methven 2015, chapter 4) (Sullivan 2005). One such objections is the ‘colour-exclusion problem’ (1923, 473), against Wittgenstein’s claim in 6.3751 that it is “logically impossible” that a point in the visual field be both red and blue. This claim was linked to the requirement that elementary propositions be logically independent (otherwise, the analysis of the proposition would not be completed), a pillar of the Tractatus. Wittgenstein’s recognition in 1929 that he could not sustain his claim (Wittgenstein 1929), probably under pressure at that stage from discussions with Ramsey, was to provoke the downfall of the Tractatus.

In 1923 and 1924, Ramsey also visited Wittgenstein, who was teaching at Puchberg am Schneeberg (Lower Austria). During these visits, Wittgenstein made changes to the text and translation, that were incorporated in later editions. (Details are given in (Lewy 1967).) At first under the spell, Ramsey became disillusioned. In 1923, he wrote home that he would “try and pump him for ideas for [Principia Mathematica’s] further development which I shall attempt” (Wittgenstein [LO], 78), but in 1924 he remarked laconically: “He is no good for my work” (Sahlin 1997, 64).

Ramsey’s first major self-assigned task in the foundations of mathematics was indeed to revise Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica, partly in the hope that his version would meet some of Wittgenstein’s criticisms of its axioms and treatment of identity, but also because of some further defects he diagnosed in its treatment of the paradoxes and in its inability properly to account for the ‘extensionality’ of mathematics (1925a, [PP] 177–178). For further details about the content of the following paragraph, see the entry for Principia Mathematica.

Ramsey drew a distinction between ‘logical’ and ‘semantical’ paradoxes, with Russell’s paradox belonging to the former category and Richard’s or Grelling’s paradoxes to the latter (1925a, [PP] 183–184). According to him, the heart of the problem was in the way the theory of types was devised to deal with the paradoxes, as understood in terms of the ‘vicious-circle principle’ (‘whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection’):

These contradictions it was proposed to remove by what is called the Theory of Types, which consists really of two distinct parts directed respectively against two groups of contradictions. These two parts were unified by being both deduced in a rather sloppy way from the ‘vicious-circle principle’, but it seems to me essential to consider them separately. (1925a, [PP] 187)

Ramsey rightly saw that a ‘simple’ theory of types (sometimes called ‘ramseyfied’) that distinguishes types of propositional functions by their arguments would deal with ‘logical’ paradoxes, but in order to deal with the other paradoxes, Whitehead and Russell had introduced a ‘branched’ or ‘ramified’ theory of types with a hierarchy of levels of functions (and of propositions), that led to further difficulties, one of which being the inability even to formulate theorems of classical mathematics such as the least upper bound theorem, unless one introduced the ‘Axiom of Reducibility’ according to which for any function at any level there exists an equivalent one at the first level (1925a, [PP] 187–192). (Another worry, that one could not formulate mathematical induction in its full generality turns out to have been unfounded.) Wittgenstein had pointed out in the Tractatus that it is not a tautology (6.1233), so that it could hardly serve as an axiom. To circumvent this, Ramsey introduced his own notion of ‘predicative function’ and showed that if one gets rid of the ‘vicious-circle principle’, the levels can be collapsed and the need for the ‘Axiom of Reducibility’ is obviated (1925a, [PP] 195–205). Thus, Ramsey had in effect shown how to deal with the paradoxes and the ‘extensionality’ of mathematics without the need for a ‘ramified’ theory of types. (In this he was preceded by Leon Chwistek (Chwistek 1921).) This, Ramsey concluded, would secure mathematics against the “Bolshevik menace” of the intuitionist critique of Brouwer and Weyl (1925a, [PP] 219).

Ramsey also took seriously Wittgenstein’s critique (5.53–5.533) of the definition of identity in Principia Mathematica (∗13.01) in terms of indiscernibility (with F a predicative function):

\[ x\! =\! y \;=_{df}\; \forall F(Fx \to Fy) \]

Wittgenstein argued that to say that two things are the same, x = y, is nonsense, while x = x is empty and showed how to get rid of identity with an ‘exclusive’ reading of the variables (Hintikka 1956), (Wehmeier 2008), (Wehmeier 2012), with the exception of some propositions such as the axiom of infinity that cannot be so read, and are thus to be rejected (5.535). To save the latter (and the axiom of choice, which was then called the ‘Multiplicative Axiom’), Ramsey introduced ‘functions in extension’ (including arbitrary pairings of arguments with values, and indicated here with the subscript \(e\)), replacing the above with:

\[ \forall \phi_e (\phi_{e}x \equiv \phi_{e} y)\]

He then argued that this is a tautology if \(x = y\), and a contradiction if \(x \neq y\). This is the subject on which he eventually sparred with Wittgenstein, when the latter wrote a letter in 1927 (reproduced in [NP] 340–341). Wittgenstein argued that either way this formula is nonsensical and cannot be substituted for x = y. Two drafts of a rejoinder by Ramsey are preserved ([NP] 342–346), but the matter was dropped subsequently, although Wittgenstein came back to it repeatedly after Ramsey’s death, for example in (Wittgenstein [BT], § 113). (For further discussion see Marion 1995; Sullivan 1995; and Methven 2015, chapter 7.)

It is said that, when Wittgenstein returned to Cambridge in January 1929, it was primarily to discuss philosophy with Ramsey, who he obviously deemed a worthy interlocutor, and they reportedly met on a regular basis, until Ramsey’s death the following January. They both left behind manuscripts which show that Ramsey had shifted his views on a number of topics, while Wittgenstein’s thought was also set in motion towards his later views. In the preface to the Philosophical Investigations, he wrote:

For since I began to occupy myself with philosophy again, sixteen years ago, I could not but recognize grave mistakes in what I set out in that first book. I was helped to realize these mistakes – to a degree which I myself am hardly able to estimate – by the criticism which my ideas encountered from Frank Ramsey, with whom I discussed them in innumerable conversations during the last two years of his life.[1] (Wittgenstein 1953 [PI, 4])

Although one can at least point out with McGuinness that “Wittgenstein clearly learnt a lot from Ramsey” (McGuinness 2006, 25), if one asks who made the larger contribution in these discussions, there is considerable disagreement, with claims ranging from the idea that literally none of the later Wittgenstein’s key ideas can be traced to Ramsey (Kienzler 1997, 75–76), to claims of various degrees of a more substantial influence by Ramsey on Wittgenstein (Glock 2005, Majer 1991; Marion 1998, chapters 4–5; Marion 2012; Methven 2015, chapter 9; Misak 2016a, chapter 7; Misak 2016b; Misak 2018; Sahlin 1990; Sahlin 1997). It is perhaps better simply to talk of a confluence of ideas, and the following, being restricted to Ramsey, will show that he reasoned along lines largely independent from Wittgenstein, and began shifting his views before 1929.

This confluence is particularly visible in texts relating to the foundations of mathematics, where Ramsey became disillusioned with Principia Mathematica, perhaps under the influence of Wittgenstein, whose criticisms of the axioms of infinity and reducibility, he had already taken seriously in ‘The Foundations of Mathematics’, as was just pointed out. Ramsey initially adopted Wittgenstein’s view of the quantifiers in the Tractatus as ‘logical products’ and ‘sums’, with universality being expressed, for predicate F, as an infinite conjunction

\[Fa \: \wedge\: Fb \:\wedge\: Fc \:\wedge\: \ldots \]

And existence as an infinite disjunction

\[Fa \: \lor\: Fb \:\lor\: Fc \:\lor\: \ldots \]

(1926c, [PP] 240; 1927a, [PP] 48–49). In absence of a rule of generalization, one has at most that a universality implies any of its instances:

\[\tag{1.1} \forall x Fx \to Fa \]

and the product becomes infinite, and without a rule of existential elimination all one has is that an instance implies existence:

\[\tag{1.2} Fa \to \exists xFx \]

The disjunction being infinite, it cannot sum up all the disjuncts.

Wittgenstein had hinted in the Tractatus at a logic-free equational calculus for arithmetic (6.02–6.031 & 6.241), but Ramsey thought this to be a “ridiculously narrow view of mathematics” (1925a, [PP] 180), and wanted the convenience afforded by quantifiers. He assessed two alternatives to Wittgenstein, Thoralf Skolem’s proposal simply to do away with the quantifiers, in a paper where he introduced primitive recursive arithmetic (Skolem 1923 [1967]) and Hermann Weyl’s suggestion in ‘Über die neue Grundlagenkrise der Mathematik’ (Weyl 1921 [1998]) – the very paper in which he joined Brouwer in his critique of classical mathematics, – that universality should be understood in analogy with bank drafts, as ‘instructions for judgements’, while existence would be a ‘judgment abstract’, classical existence being compared to a treasure map that does not tell us where to find the treasure (Weyl 1921 [1998], 97–98). These explanations happen to justify (1.1) and (1.2) above. Weyl claimed further that (1.1) and (1.2) cannot be negated since one could not, say, survey infinitely many disjuncts, so the law of excluded middle would not hold.

In two of his last papers, ‘Principles of Finitist Mathematics’ and ‘The Formal Structure of Intuitionist Mathematics’ ([NP] 197–200), Ramsey sided with Weyl. It appears that he wanted to obtain arithmetic by adding quantifiers, with Weyl’s rules, to Skolem’s primitive recursive arithmetic. But he did not provide a rule of existential elimination and rules that he proposed in these papers appear to restrict formulas with quantifiers to those that can be converted to prenex normal form (with quantifiers prefixed on the left, followed with a quantifier-free matrix). In intuitionism, the law of the excluded middle applies to atomic formulas and, if quantifiers are in prenex normal form, the theory remains constructive. This is what Ramsey captured, but the result is not the full intuitionistic arithmetic, as not all intuitionistic formulas are equivalent to prenex formulas. In ‘Principles of Finitist Mathematics’, he stated that his rules provide “all the logical modes allowed by the finitists” ([NP] 201), but if he meant ‘intuitionism’, the claim was inaccurate.

Ramsey already discussed Weyl earlier, for example in ‘Mathematical Logic’ (1926c, [PP] 230 & 233), without approving him, so one needs to explain why he changed his mind in 1928–29. This may be the result of changes in his underlying conception of theories from his 1928 manuscript On Truth ([OT] 33–34) to ‘Theories’ (1929). According to his later view, a ‘primary system’ of true or false observational statements is entailed, via a ‘dictionary’, by a ‘secondary system’ of hypotheses (1929a, [PP] 112–115). This is a view that has roots in both the introduction to Heinrich Hertz’s The Principles of Mechanics (Hertz 1899) and in chapter VI of Norman Campbell’s Physics. The Elements (Campbell 1920), but Ramsey described, as we shall see, hypotheses not as statements or propositions, but, adapting Weyl’s expression, as ‘rules for judging’.

At a deeper level, Ramsey’s change of mind can be traced back to his having read C. S. Peirce’s Chance, Love and Logic (Peirce 1923). In ‘Fact and Propositions’ (1925) he had already written: “The essence of pragmatism I take to be this, that the meaning of a sentence is to be defined by reference to the actions to which asserting it would lead, or, more vaguely still, by its possible causes and effects” (1927a, [PP] 51). This forms part of what Nils-Eric Sahlin called ‘British Pragmatism’ (Sahlin 1997, 65; Marion 2012), and Cheryl Misak ‘Cambridge Pragmatism’ (Misak 2016). This causal theory allowed him to tie logical form with causal properties, for example when he argued that disbelieving p and believing its negation ¬ p have the same causal properties (1927a, [PP] 44). (There is a link worth noticing here with his view on ‘Universals’ (1925), since this suggestion allows him to avoid ‘negative facts’.) Ramsey suggested at that stage that a causal theory of this sort could accommodate the quantifiers as understood (as above) by Wittgenstein: “Feeling belief towards ‘For all \(x\), \(fx\)’ has certain causal properties which we call its expressing agreement only with the possibility that all the values of \(fx\) are true” (1927a, [PP] 49). By 1928–1929, however, his pragmatism finally led him to abandon this suggestion.

In his review of the Tractatus, Ramsey thought that Wittgenstein’s suggestion for eliminating the subject (5.542) was “an important advance” (1923, 469), but he assumed the opposite in ‘Truth and Probability’ (1928). In a passage where he admitted following Peirce (1926a, [PP] 90 n. 2), he argued that the human mind “works essentially according to general rules or habits” (1926a, [PP] 90):

The mind works by general laws; therefore if it infers \(q\) from \(p\), this will generally be because \(q\) is an instance of a function \(\phi x\) and \(p\) the corresponding instance of a function \(\psi x\) such that the mind would always infer \(\phi x\) from \(\psi x\). (1926a, [PP] 91)

And, again in pragmatist manner, he argued that one judges habits in terms of their success: “given a habit of a certain form, we can praise or blame it accordingly as the degree of belief it produces is near or far from the actual proportion in which the habit leads to truth” (1926a, [PP] 92).

In ‘General Propositions and Causality’ (1929), Ramsey followed this with Peirce’s idea that beliefs “guide our actions” (Peirce 1992, 114), describing a belief as a “map by which we steer” (1929b, [PP] 146). It is for this very reason that he could not countenance the belief qua map being infinite: “if we professedly extend it to infinity, it is no longer a map; we cannot take it in or steer by it. Our journey is over before we need its remoter parts” (1929b, [PP] 146). He then introduced the notion of ‘variable hypotheticals’ as forming the “system with which the speaker meets the future” and described them in terms strongly reminiscent of Weyl:

Variable hypotheticals are not judgments but rules for judging ‘If I meet a \(\phi\), I shall regard it as a \(\psi\)’. This cannot be negated but it can be disagreed with by one who does not adopt it. (1929b, [PP] 149)

… when we assert a causal law we are asserting not a fact, not an infinite conjunction, nor a connection of universals, but a variable hypothetical which is not strictly a proposition at all, but a formula from which we derive propositions. (1929b, [PP], 159)

There is indeed a definite connection here with his growing qualms, of a ‘finitist’ nature, about the axiom of infinity: “So too there may be an infinite totality, but what seems to be propositions about it are again variable hypotheticals and ‘infinite collection’ is really nonsense” (1929b, [PP] 160).

Ramsey’s last papers thus show that he was moving towards an original synthesis of Weyl’s intuitionism (or finitism) with pragmatism (Majer 1989; Majer 1991; Marion 2012; Misak 2016a (chapter 6); Misak 2018; Sahlin 1990, chapter 4). As for the confluence of ideas, it is possible that Wittgenstein’s notion of ‘hypothesis’ had other sources (Marion 2008), but he also came to reject his own view of the quantifiers in the Tractatus (for example in his Cambridge lectures (Wittgenstein [LC], 217 & 219)), and his own language bore strong resemblance to that of Weyl and Ramsey when he spoke of a hypothesis as a “law for forming expectations” (Wittgenstein [PR], §228).

3. Ontology

Ramsey is famous for his denial of the particular-universal distinction. But his ontological vision was even more radical and austere than this suggests because Ramsey also denied the existence of complex entities, including complex universals, facts and propositions. Ramsey’s main arguments for this austere ontology appear in his two landmark papers “Universals” (1925b) and “Facts and Propositions” (1927a). At a general level we can think of Ramsey as endeavoring to bring our views of ontology clear of the shadows of words (MacBride 2005a, 2018 chapter 10).

At this point in his intellectual development, the mid-1920s, Ramsey was developing the insights he found in Russell and Wittgenstein. But Ramsey not only took many of their ideas to a new level of detail and sophistication but pushed boundaries by showing that they had not gone far enough. “Universals” provides a luminous example of Ramsey pushing against boundaries that had held Russell back. According to Russell, “The influence of language on philosophy has, I believe, been profound and almost unrecognized. If we are not to be misled by this influence it is necessary to become conscious of it and to ask how far it is legitimate” (Russell 1924, 330). Russell was specifically concerned that the subject-predicate form common to Indo-European languages had misled Western philosophers, conditioning them to take for granted a substance-attribute ontology whilst being blind to the existence of relations. Russell proposed to remedy the situation by introducing alongside the category of particulars, a broader category of universals which subsumed both (monadic) attributes and (polyadic) relations. But, in “Universals”, Ramsey argued that Russell had not gone far enough, because the particular-universal distinction itself was just a further shadow cast by language. Ramsey wrote, “nearly all philosophers, including Mr Russell himself have been misled by language in a far more far-reaching way than that”, i.e. more far-reaching than being led merely to deny the existence of relations, because “the whole theory of particulars and universals is due to mistaking for a fundamental characteristic of reality, what is merely a characteristic of language” (1925b, 405). But Ramsey wasn’t aiming to replace the particular-universal distinction with an alternative distinction of his own. Instead he aimed to inculcate in his reader a studied indifference, which meant withholding judgment, at least a priori, about the forms or categories of atomic objects, as Wittgenstein had done in the Tractatus.

Ramsey diagnosed that Russell had been led astray by supposing the subject-predicate distinction to be a logical distinction. So Ramsey devoted “Universals” to arguing it isn’t logical. Ramsey recognised there wasn’t just one candidate for being the subject-predicate distinction. So “Universals” is divided into an examination of several candidates. Ramsey argued they reflect merely accidental features of our language or subjective needs or biased interests, so none of them provide a basis for an objective classification of what there is.

Ramsey begins ‘Universals’ with what was to became a celebrated argument of early analytic philosophy (see Sahlin 1990, 192–202 and Simons 1991 for helpful accounts of Ramsey’s main lines of argument in “Universals”). To persuade us there are serious issues to engage here, Ramsey compared

  • (3.1) Socrates is wise.


  • (3.2) Wisdom is a characteristic of Socrates.

Whilst they are different sentences, Ramsey invites us to agree that they say the same about what’s out there even though they differ in their surface forms. He reflected, ‘Now of one these sentences ‘Socrates’ is the subject, of the other ‘wisdom’; and so which of the two is subject, which predicate, depends upon what particular sentence we use to express our proposition, and so had nothing to do with the logical nature of Socrates or wisdom, but is a matter entirely for language’ (1925b, 404). Ramsey hypothesises that the subject-predicate distinction isn’t a semantic or representational distinction at all, hence not in the business of marking a division of things, but rather a distinction which we employ to communicate to conversational partners the focus of our discussion: “If the centre of our interest is Socrates we say ‘Socrates is wise’, if we are discussing wisdom we may say ‘wisdom is a characteristic of Socrates’; but whichever we say we mean the same thing”.

Ramsey’s aim was not to conclusively establish this hypothesis on the basis that (3.1) and (3.2) are used to make the same assertion–as indeed many of his critics have supposed. What they miss is that to be fit for purpose, Ramsey’s argument only had to be strong enough to make us seriously entertain the possibility that the subject-predicate distinction doesn’t serve a representational function, because that’s enough to throw doubt upon the procedure of classifying things on the basis of the subject-predicate distinction, hence strong enough to make it evident that “the question requires a new examination” (1925b, 405).

(Anscombe [1959, 108], Geach [1950, 474–5; 1975, 143–4] and Dummett [1973, 63–4] have all criticised Ramsey’s argument here on the grounds that whilst a predicate may be negated a name may not – although see Anscombe’s ‘Retractation’ [1965]. Coming from a different direction, Simons [1991, 159], Dokic and Engel [2002, 40–1] and Lowe [2004, 307] argue that Ramsey was mistaken to think that ontological issues could ever be settled in logico-linguistic terms. MacBride [2005a,b] argues that the former criticisms miss their intended mark because Ramsey was committed to denying that negative predicates correspond to the constituents of atomic facts; whereas the latter criticisms miss their mark because Ramsey was in fact arguing that logical reflection fails to determine the nature of the atomic facts. Hochberg [2004, 197–9], Mulligan [2000], Simons [1992, 151–2] raise further difficulties for Ramsey’s initial argument that builds upon the equivalence of (3.1) and (3.2) but MacBride [2018, 207–10] argues that these criticisms rest upon a failure to appreciate the radical character of Ramsey’s challenge.)

Ramsey begins his new examination by considering whether molecular statements can be analysed into subjects and predicates – specifically predicates which stand for complex universals. He argues, reductio ad absurdum, that they don’t. He assumes that if two analyses of a proposition invoke different constituents then they are analyses of different propositions. Absurdity results when this assumption is combined with the claim that complex predicates are terms for complex universals. This is because more than one complex predicate may be isolated in a sentence of the form ‘aRb’ – predicates that may be represented by ‘xRb’, ‘aRy’ and‘xRy’. If these predicates are terms for different universals, then the sentence ‘aRb’ expresses no less than three propositions. The propositions are distinct because they correspond to the three different collections of constituents: (i) xRb, a, (ii) aRx, b, and (iii) xRy, a, b. But this is absurd because ‘aRb’ says only one thing: that aRb. Ramey concluded, “so the theory of complex universals is responsible for an incomprehensible trinity, as senseless as that of theology” (1925b, 406). Ramsey must also have thought but doesn’t spell out, that it’s a consequence of this argument that complex particulars should be dismissed too – otherwise particulars would be distinguished from universals in terms of complexity. (For discussion of Ramsey’s argument against complex universals see Oliver 1992; Mellor 1992; and MacBride 2005a, 86–94; 2018, 210–220.)

Ramsey next looks to see if a logical distinction between subject and predicate applies to atomic statements. Russell had argued that predicates can be distinguished from subjects by the fact that the former exhibit a distinctive incompleteness because they carry the form of the statements in which occur. Ramsey agreed that it’s natural to feel that an adjective like ‘wise’ is incomplete in a manner that ‘Socrates’ is not. But, Ramsey argued, predicates only appear to be especially incomplete because as ordinary language users we overlook relevant data: we routinely distinguish wide from narrow scope occurrences of predicates but we don’t do the same for subjects even though the same distinction can be drawn for them. Ramsey cites Russell’s theory of descriptions as the inspiration for the wide-narrow scope distinction, which Ramsey elaborates in terms of a distinction between more and less encompassing ranges of propositions in which an expression figures. Ramsey concludes that to be a substantive (or adjective) “is not an objective but a subjective property, in the sense that it depends not indeed on any one mind but on the common elements in all men’s minds and purposes” (1925b, 413).

Since the difference between ‘Socrates’ and ‘wise’ turns out to be subjective in this way, it tells us nothing about the objective classification of the constituents of atomic facts. Moreover, Ramsey continued, once we are explicit about the wide and narrow scope occurrences of atomic expressions, there is no reason to think that any of them are especially incomplete. Ramsey held that it is only the ‘biassed interest’ of mathematicians, i.e. their extensionalism, that make things appear otherwise (1925b, 416). They neglect to distinguish between complex predicates which really do require variables for their depiction (\(xRa \lor xSb\)) and atomic expressions which don’t (‘\(f\)’ in ‘\(fa\)’), because they are only interested in the extensional matter whether these expressions are true or false of the same things. But to avoid ‘useless complication’ mathematicians treat the latter terms as requiring variables for their representation too (‘\(fx\)’), hence producing the appearance that there is some class of atomic terms which are incomplete because they require variables (1925b, 414–5). But, Ramsey continued, if it were not for the biased interests of the mathematician, we would allow ‘\(f\)’ to stand alone, so removing the appearance of an especially incomplete class of atomic terms.

Having completed his examination, Ramsey concluded that we can know nothing whatever about the classification of the constituents of atomic facts. But when he came to reprise his argument a year later in “Universals and ‘the Method of Analysis’” (1926b), Ramsey adopted the more modest conclusion that whilst we cannot know a priori the forms of the atomic facts we may yet know them a posteriori: “When I wrote my article I was sure that it was impossible to discover atomic propositions by actual analysis. Of this I am now very doubtful, and I cannot be sure that they may not be discovered to be all of one or another of a series of forms which can be expressed by \(R_1(x)\), \(R_2(x,y)\), \(R_3(x,y,z)\)…. This I admit may be found to be the case, but no one can as yet be certain what atomic propositions there are, it cannot be positively asserted; and there is no strong presumption in its favour, for I think that the argument of my article establishes that nothing of the sort can be known a priori” (1926b, 31) (see Methven 2018 for discussion of the relationship between Ramsey 1925b and 1926b).

Ramsey’s less well-known arguments against the ontology of facts and propositions appear in the context of Ramsey’s discussion of the nature of truth and belief. In “Facts and Propositions” (1927a) he argued against the existence of facts on the grounds that the expression ‘the fact that…’ cannot be completed to make either a name or a description of a fact (1927a, 155–7). Indeed, he claimed, ‘the fact that…’ disappears upon paraphrase of the contexts in which it occurs. As Ramsey put the point (1927a, 159):

  • (3.3) the fact that \(a\) has \(R\) to \(b\) exists

is no different from

  • (3.4) \(a\) has \(R\) to \(b\)

By ‘is no different from’ (his words) Ramsey meant something like “semantically equivalent”. So his argument is that (3.3) is just a long-winded way of saying (3.4) and because (3.4) has no constituent expression that refers to a fact, it follows that (3.3) has no constituent expression that refers to a fact either.

We can imagine Ramsey unpacking this argument further. Statements like (3.3) commit us to the existence of facts if any statements do; they constitute our best effort to explicitly affirm the existence of facts. Since even statements like (3.3) don’t commit us to facts, because they’re just paraphrases of statements like (3.4), we cannot have reason to believe in the existence of facts at all. To transpose a remark of Ramsey’s from another context, if you can’t say that facts exist, you can’t whistle it either. We could call this Ramsey’s ‘redundancy theory of facts’, emphasising another parallel, this time with his famous redundancy theory of truth (according to which ‘\(a\) has \)(R\) to \(b\) is true’ says the same as ‘\(a\) has \(R\) to \(b\)’).

Ramsey renounced propositions conceived as the single objects of judgment, which may be true or false, for the reasons that had already led Russell to give up propositions so conceived, namely ‘the incredibility of the existence of objects as “that Caesar died in his bed” which could be described as objective falsehoods, and the mysterious nature of the difference, on this theory, between truth and falsehood’ (1927a, 153–4). Ramsey, like Russell, didn’t spell this out, but we can think of Ramsey as pointing, inter alia, to the difficulty of explaining the unity of a proposition \(aRb\) in terms of \(R\)’s holdings between \(a\) and \(b\), which is difficult to understand if the proposition is false since then \(R\) doesn’t hold between \(a\) and \(b\). Ramsey continued to find objective falsehoods incredible in his later manuscript ‘On Truth’: ‘it is only the hardiest verbalists who can persuade themselves ‘that the earth is flat’ is the name of something real’ ([OT] 85).

Ramsey concluded with Russell, ‘that a judgment had no single object, but is a multiple relation of the mind or mental factors to many objects, those, namely, which we should ordinarily call constituents of the propositions judged’ (1927a, 154). So we can think of Ramsey offering two arguments for renouncing propositions conceived as single objects: a negative argument, that they’re incredible and mysterious, but also a positive argument arguing that propositions so conceived are dispensable based upon Ramsey’s own views about truth and belief which don’t require them. In ‘Facts and Propositions’ Ramsey put forward a version of Wittgenstein’s picture theory according to which a subject ‘will believe that \(aRb\) by having names for \(a\), \(R\), and \(b\) connected in his mind and accompanied by a feeling of belief’ (1927a, 160) but Ramsey was already pushing in more radical, pragmatist direction which emphasised the significance of action for understanding the notion of belief, hence shifting attention further away from an ontology of facts and propositions. (See the section on Belief and Truth.)

It is Ramsey’s ontological views on the particular-universal distinction that have attracted the most attention. On the historical front, Ruth Barcan Marcus (1993) argues that Ramsey’s “Universals” bore a significant influence on Russell’s subsequent intellectual development; see MacBride 2004 and Hochberg 2004 for further discussion. MacBride (2018) puts Ramsey’s “Universals” in historical context, arguing that “Universals” should be interpreted as the final stage in an extended conversation about particulars and universals, involving G.E. Moore, Russell, Wittgenstein and Whitehead. Misak (2020) explores the connection between “Universals” and Ramsey’s later pragmatist writings. Braithwaite (1926) and Strawson (1959, chapter 5) argued, contra Ramsey, that the particular-universal distinction may be understood in spatio-temporal terms. See MacBride 2005c and Lowe 2006 (chapter 7) for further discussion of Ramsey’s views on universals from a contemporary point of view.

4. Belief and Truth

4.1 Belief and Assertion

Ramsey’s primary analysis of belief and assertion appears in his papers ‘Truth and Probability’ (1926a), ‘Facts and Propositions’ (1927a) and ‘The Nature of Truth’ (1929c), with some significant remarks on general beliefs made in ‘Universals of Law and of Fact’ (1928b) and ‘General Propositions and Causality’ (1929b).

In ‘Truth and Probability’ Ramsey presents his view on the nature of partial belief, and this paper is considered the inaugural work of the family of approaches to probability known as subjectivism. Since the present section focuses on his semantic analysis of belief and assertion, and not on subjective probabilities, the analysis of partial belief developed in ‘Truth and Probability’ will be left aside.

Ramsey was a pragmatist about belief (Hookway 2005, 182ff; Dokic and Engel 2002, 2, 8, 55), although not about truth. He explicitly declares his pragmatism in ‘Truth and Probability’ (1926a) and in ‘Fact and Propositions’ (1927a). In ‘Truth and Probability’, he explains his approach to rationality as ‘a kind of pragmatism: we judge mental habits by whether they work’ (1926a, [PP] 93–94). In ‘Facts and Propositions’, in contrast, the topic is the notion of meaning: ‘The essence of pragmatism I take to be this, that the meaning of a sentence is to be determined by reference to the actions to which asserting it would lead’ (1927a, [PP] 51). He attributes his pragmatism about meaning to the influence of Bertrand Russell. In fact, in The Analysis of Mind (1921), Russell explained the intentional properties of words through their causal history. As Acero (2005, 16) stresses, Russell at that time identified the meaning of a word with its use, and it seems to be this aspect of Russell’s philosophy of mind that Ramsey acknowledges as the source of his pragmatism about meaning in ‘Facts and Propositions’ (cf. Dokic and Engel 2002, 22). Sahlin (1990, 70) and Hookway (2005, 185–187) point out that Peirce must also have had an effect on Ramsey’s pragmatist views since many themes in Peirce’s early works are detectable in Ramsey’s writings (Hookway 2005, 185–6). More recently, Misak (2016a) has tracked Peirce’s influence on Ramsey in full detail, using the entries on Peirce that Ramsey inserted into his diary. It is now clear that Ramsey read Peirce extensively and that the American philosopher deeply influenced Ramsey’s views on meaning, truth and probability (Misak 2016a, 157).

As a pragmatist, Ramsey individuates beliefs by attending to their causes and effects. Thus, attitudes towards two sentences prompted by the same causes and producing the same effects express the same belief, no matter the linguistic constitution of the sentences used to express it. ‘Belief’, Ramsey acknowledges, is an ambiguous term (1927a, [PP] 40). Both human beings and non-linguistic animals can be said to possess beliefs. In non-linguistic animals, beliefs are dispositions to act; in linguistic animals, beliefs are mental states with a particular kind of content that involves entertaining words. Chickens that avoid eating a particular kind of caterpillar, due to systematically connecting it with disagreeable past experiences, believe that caterpillars of this kind are poisonous. This is Ramsey’s causal theory of belief, which Dokic and Engel (2002, 24) extend to beliefs of any kind and attribute to Peirce’s influence on Ramsey. The beliefs of linguistic animals are specifically defined in terms of attitudes towards complexes of signs with logical structure (Hookway 2005, 185). Both kinds of belief, linguistic and non-linguistic, are analysed in pragmatist terms, in which ‘the relations between belief and action do take centre stage in some of [Ramsey’s] most influential writings on this topic’ (Hookway 2005, 186).

Even if the main targets of Ramsey’s analysis are those beliefs expressed in words and ‘consciously asserted and denied’ (1927a, [PP] 40), it is still illuminating to consider his treatment of animal beliefs, in which the pragmatist connection between belief and action is yet more perspicuous.

Ramsey distinguishes mental and objective factors in his analysis of belief. In the case of the chicken, the simplest one, the mental factor is part of the animal’s external behaviour (1927a, 159), i.e. its behaviour of refraining from eating caterpillars on the basis of disagreeable past experiences. The objective factor in this case is a conglomerate of relevant aspects of the world, i.e. the caterpillar and the property of being poisonous, with which the mental factor stands in some kind of relation. In beliefs expressed in words, on the other hand, the mental factor is partly constituted by those words or symbols ‘spoken aloud or merely imagined, connected together’. Beliefs expressed in words can be classified into three different categories: (i) those whose content is represented by predicates or relations together with their arguments, i.e. by atomic sentences with simple structures such as ‘aRb’, (ii) those whose content includes logical connectives (‘not’, ‘and’, ‘or’), and (iii) general beliefs. In (i), the simplest linguistic case, an agent having a belief that aRb means that she connects the words ‘a’, ‘R’ and ‘b’ in her mind in a certain way. A further ingredient of the mental factor in linguistic creatures is a sort of feeling that accompanies the words in one’s mind. By ‘feeling’ Ramsey does not mean a private sentiment, but rather some attitude of the agent that might be expressed in less subjective terms, such as ‘“specific quality” or “act of assertion” and “act of denial”’ (loc. cit., n. 2).

Purely private feelings towards contents, Ramsey argues, play no role in the analysis of belief and are useless for measuring degrees of belief, as he explains in ‘Truth and Probability’:

As soon as we regard belief quantitatively, this seems to me the only view we can take of it. It could well be held that the difference between believing and not believing lies in the presence or absence of introspective feelings. But when we seek to know what is the difference between believing more firmly and believing less firmly, we can no longer regard it as consisting in having more or less of certain observable feelings; at least I personally cannot recognize any such feelings. (1926a, [PP] 65).

There are basically two reasons why he takes private feelings to be irrelevant for the analysis of belief. The first of these concerns the difficulty of assigning objective measurements, but undoubtedly the definitive reason rests on the fact that our most unshakable beliefs come without any particular sensation (Dokic and Engel 2002, 7). As Ramsey puts it: ‘[N]o one feels strongly about things he takes for granted’ (loc. cit.). At this point, the similarities with the view that Wittgenstein held in his pragmatist period are evident (for the mutual influence between Ramsey and Wittgenstein, see §2 above).

Linguistic beliefs of the second category, i.e. those that also include logical terms such as ‘not’, ‘and’ and ‘or’ are more complex. Concerning them, Ramsey heavily relies on the Tractarian view of logical constants. Like Wittgenstein, Ramsey thinks that logical words are not names, i.e. they do not represent. The meanings of ‘not’ and ‘or’ are determined by the agents’ attitudes towards the sentences that include them. Believing that not-p and disbelieving that p are ‘equivalent occurrences’ (1927a, [PP] 43), i.e. they express the same attitude because their practical effects are indistinguishable (1927a, [PP] 44; Dokic and Engel 2002, 24).

A specific difficulty in analyzing beliefs of this second category derives from the need to identify attitudes held towards several atomic sentences at the same time, while when atomic sentences are considered one by one only two mutually exclusive feelings must be taken into account: full belief and full disbelief. The ‘intermediate attitudes of partial belief’, which he proposes to ‘leave to the theory of probability’ (1927a, [PP] 45), are discussed in ‘Truth and Probability’. To deal with attitudes held towards various atomic sentences at once, Ramsey borrows from the former Wittgenstein the notion of truth-possibility. When n atomic sentences are at play, there are 2n possible combinations of fully believing and fully disbelieving. Thus, ‘the meaning of a sentence is agreement and disagreement with such and such truth-possibilities’ (op. cit., 46), and a proposition is ‘a disjunction of the truth-possibilities with which [it] agrees’ (op. cit., 47).

The third category of linguistic beliefs is general beliefs, i.e. those whose expression involves the words ‘all’ and ‘some’. Concerning general propositions, Ramsey successively held two different views. The first of these, explained in ‘Facts and Propositions’ (1927a) and ‘Universals of Law and Fact’ (1928b), is essentially the Tractarian view that quantified sentences are conjunctions and disjunctions of atomic propositions (Sahlin 1990, 76; Dokic and Engel 2002, 30). The only difference he found between conjunctions and disjunctions, on the one hand, and universal and particular sentences, on the other, was that the arguments of genuine conjunctions and disjunctions can be enumerated, whereas the arguments of quantified sentences are given by means of propositional functions. These propositional functions show their usefulness in those cases in which either we do not know their particular instances, or there are so many of them that enumerating them is impossible. When such enumeration is logically possible we have universals of fact; when it is not, we have universals of law. One might think that the details that distinguish conjunctions, disjunctions, and universals of fact from genuine general propositions would vanish from the perspective of an omniscient subject who could entertain the totality of all application instances. Ramsey nevertheless rejects this idea because the role of general propositions is pragmatic, as an aid in the task of systematizing ‘our knowledge as a deductive system’ (1928b, [PP] 143), rather than semantic.

The second view appears in ‘General Propositions and Causality’ (1929b), and this is a fully pragmatist account according to which general beliefs do not have a truth-value (Dokic and Engel 2002, 30; Sahlin 1990, 78). Here Ramsey presents his famous account of atomic beliefs as maps: ‘A belief of the primary sort’, i.e. one without quantifiers, ‘is a map of neighbouring space by which we steer’ (1929b, [PP] 146). If beliefs are maps of the neighbourhood, general beliefs – understood as codifying general inferences – should be maps of infinite extension, except that an infinite map is ‘no longer a map; we cannot take it in or steer by it. Our journey is over before we need its remoter parts’ (loc. cit.). Quantified sentences are thus ‘rules for action or attitudes’ (Dokic and Engel 2002, 31), and express ‘an inference we are at any time prepared to make’ (1929b, [PP] 146). Dokic and Engel (2002) also stress the similarities between Ramsey’s account of general beliefs and Wittgenstein’s view of laws as rules of inference.

General beliefs with general contents, ‘variable hypotheticals’ as Ramsey calls them, are not propositions at all. With respect to the role of general beliefs, Ramsey is prepared to explicitly endorse a central thesis of any pragmatist approach to meaning: ‘[m]any sentences express cognitive attitudes without being propositions’ (1929b, [PP] 147). The cognitive attitude they express is still belief, which in the case of general beliefs Ramsey characterizes as composed of (i) a general enunciation, i.e. the endorsement of a sentence that expresses it – ‘all men are mortal’, for instance – and (ii) ‘a habit of singular belief’ (1929b, [PP] 148). These two steps are connected by the psychological law that gives the meaning of ‘all’ (1929b, [PP] 149).

4.2 Truth

The posthumously-published paper ‘The Nature of Truth’ (1929c) is specifically devoted to the analysis of truth, and there Ramsey develops the few lines about truth included in ‘Facts and Propositions’ (1927a). Even if that earlier paper mostly deals with belief, the brief remarks it contains on truth are among Ramsey’s most influential contributions to philosophy. What he has to say in there about truth is stated almost as ‘an obvious fact’ (Sahlin 1990, 56), hence his famous remark that ‘there is really no separate problem of truth but merely a linguistic muddle’ (1927a, [PP] 38).

In ‘The Nature of Truth’ Ramsey explains that beliefs, in the sense that is relevant here, are necessarily beliefs that ‘something or other is so-and-so’ (1929c, 7ff). He calls this ‘so-and-so’ the ‘propositional reference’ (loc. cit.) and uses it as the criterion of propositional individuation, in the sense that if ‘two men both believe that the earth is flat we say they have the same belief’ (loc. cit.). Individuating beliefs by their propositional references might seem at odds with the pragmatist method given in terms of causes and effects that Ramsey used in ‘Facts and Propositions’. But this superficial tension is defused if propositional references, which are not linguistic but conceptual, are individuated by their consequences (which include actions). Other mental states – doubts, desires, fears, regrets, etc. – have propositional references too, but only beliefs have ‘affirmative or assertive character’ (1929c, 8). Ramsey proposes to extend the ordinary meaning of the term ‘belief’ to cover mental states with any degree of assertive force – from mere conjecture to full certainty – and propositional content. The contents of beliefs, in this extended sense, are the bearers of truth: ‘Truth and falsity are ascribed primarily to propositions’, he says (1927a, [PP] 38). Later, he substitutes ‘proposition’ with ‘propositional reference’ (1929c, 7), but this rewording owes more to philosophical precaution than any substantial change in view.

Truth adds nothing substantive to the content of beliefs, according to Ramsey. He claims that the meaning of truth is ‘perfectly obvious, that anyone can see what it is and that difficulty only arises when we try to say what it is, because it is something which ordinary language is rather ill-adapted to express’ (1929c, 9). Because of this, Ramsey’s view is generally interpreted as a redundancy theory of truth (Sahlin 1990, 56–59; Dokic and Engel 2002, 18; Hookway 2005, 56–58), a kind of minimalism or deflationism about truth similar to the views put forward by Aristotle and Frege (cf. Sahlin 1990, 56), and later on by Tarski, Wittgenstein, Quine (cf. Hookway 2005, 57), Field and Horwich (cf. Koslow 2005, 106).

Nevertheless, there is more to Ramsey’s view than what the label ‘redundancy’ suggests. The bearers of truth, i.e. propositions, can be referred to directly, as in ‘that Caesar was murdered’, or identified by description, as in ‘what she said’. Correspondingly, truth can be attached to the direct expression of a proposition, as in ‘It is true that Caesar was murdered’, or to a description, as in ‘what she says is true’. When truth applies to expressions of the first kind, Ramsey characterizes its role as eliminable: ‘it is evident that “It is true that Caesar was murdered” means no more than that Caesar was murdered, and “It is false that Caesar was murdered” means that Caesar was not murdered’ (1927a, [PP], 38–9). But when the truth predicate applies to expressions of the second kind, Ramsey explicitly claims that it cannot be dispensed with: ‘In the second case in which the proposition is described and not given explicitly we have perhaps more of a problem, for we get statements from which we cannot in ordinary language eliminate the words “true” and “false”’ (loc. cit.).

Let us consider the following three examples of truth ascriptions in English:

  • (4.1) All Joan’s thoughts are true.
  • (4.2) What follows from a true premise is true.
  • (4.3) Evolutionism is true.

To say what truth consists in, and deal with any kind of truth ascription, Ramsey enriches ordinary English into English* by the addition of single propositional variables – ‘p’, ‘q’, etc., ranging over the set of declarative sentences – and propositional quantifiers. In English* the truth predicate vanishes and its role is taken over by propositional variables and quantifiers. The semi-formal sentences (4.1*)–(4.3*) are translations of (4.1)–(4.3) into English*:

  • (4.1*) For all p, if Joan thinks that p, p.
  • (4.2*) For all p and q, if q follows from p, and p, then q.
  • (4.3*) For all p, if p follows from the theory of evolution, then p.

Note that the translation shows that the truth apparatus is redundant in English*, but not that it is redundant in English.

The definition of truth Ramsey provides in ‘The Nature of Truth’ is: ‘A belief is true if it is a belief that p, and p’ (1929c, [OT] 9), where the first instance of the propositional variable ‘p’ represents the propositional reference that individuates the belief at issue (1929c, [OT] 7), and the second instance represents the objective factor. This definition is expressed in English*, since ordinary English does not have the necessary resources:

As we claim to have defined truth we ought to be able to substitute our definition for the word “true” wherever it occurs. But the difficulty we have mentioned renders this impossible in ordinary language which treats what should really be called pro-sentences as if they were pro-nouns. […] “that” and “what” even when functioning as short for sentences always require to be supplied with a verb: this verb is often “is true” and this peculiarity of language gives rise to artificial problems as to the nature of truth, which disappear at once when they are expressed in logical symbolism, in which we can render “what he believed is true” by “if p was what he believed, p” (1929c, [OT] 10, his emphasis).

This text is possibly the first unequivocal expression of a prosentential theory of truth (Dokic and Engel 2002, 19; Frápolli 2005a, 113–138; 2013, 61ff).

Ramsey (1929c, [OT] 9) anticipated a possible reaction to his use of propositional variables and to the translation of (4.1)–(4.3) as (4.1*)–(4.3*). The objection is the following: (4.1*)–(4.3*) cannot be English* counterparts of English sentences because they are not well-formed. Free-standing instances, the objection goes, of the variables ‘p’ and ‘q’ cannot fill the argument-slots of truth-functions, such as conjunction and material implication, which need complete sentences as arguments. Free-standing uses of the variables in ‘and p’ and ‘then q’ would lack a verb to complete these clauses into genuine instances of the grammatical category of sentences. Ramsey’s reply insists on the sentential status of the variables ‘p’ and ‘q’, which stand for items that already contain a verb and express a truth-bearer (loc. cit.).

What Ramsey did not anticipate was the classification of his view either as a redundancy or as a pro-sentential theory. On the contrary, he thought that it would be interpreted as a correspondence theory of truth, and although he did not accept the metaphysical commitments of the many versions of correspondentism, he did not reject the label either. In fact, he acknowledges that truth is objective correspondence to the facts (see for instance 1929c, [OT] 11; 1929d, 36). Dokic and Engel (2002, 25) point out that Ramsey was a realist about truth conditions and also about truth, but this realism was modulated by his pragmatism: ‘his kind of realism is distinct from the kind of realism which underlies a full-blown correspondence theory of truth. It is a form of pragmatic realism, which associates truth to beliefs-habits and to actions.’ Thus, Ramsey’s take on truth has a pragmatist background, but it is not a pragmatist view of truth. It is a kind of sophisticated redundancy theory that is realist about truth conditions, and also includes some of the technical apparatus that prosentential theories developed later on (see Williams 1976, Grover 1992, Brandom 1994, Frápolli 2013).

5. Conditionals

In “General Propositions and Causality” (1929b) Ramsey made some remarks about conditional judgements, which have influenced thinking about conditionals since the 1960s. Most famous is this footnote:

If two people are arguing ‘If \(p\), will \(q\)?’ and are both in doubt about \(p\), they are adding \(p\) hypothetically to their stock of knowledge and arguing on that basis about \(q\); … they are fixing their degrees of belief in \(q\) given \(p\). (1929b, [FM] 247)

To understand what Ramsey means by “degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)” we need to turn to his earlier essay “Truth and Probability” (1926a), where he develops an interpretation of probability as the logic of partial belief ([FM] 157). (Note, Ramsey did not take this to be the only notion of probability: “The conclusions we shall come to as to the meaning of probability in Logic must not … be taken as prejudging its meaning in physics” (ibid.). The editor adds that a final chapter, on probability in science, was designed but not written.) Here he introduces a “very useful new idea – ‘the degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)’” (1926a, [FM] 180). One of his basic laws is:

Degree of belief in (\(p\) and \(q\)) = degree of belief in \(p\) × degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\) (1926a, [FM] 181)

As a law of probability, this was not new. It was in use since the eighteenth century. It is needed to answer a compulsory question: how likely is it that two events will happen? Answer: it is the probability of the first, multiplied by the probability of the second on the supposition that the first happens. What was novel in Ramsey’s essay was the interpretation of probability as degree of belief; and what was novel in the 1929 paper (1929b) was the linking of “degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)” with our ordinary, typically uncertain, conditional judgements.

Explaining “degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)”, Ramsey says “It roughly expresses the odds at which [the subject] would now bet on \(q\), the bet only to be valid if \(p\) is true” (1926a, [FM] 180). Ramsey was aware that the link between degrees of belief and betting behaviour is imperfect (1926a, [FM] 170). Here the message is that a conditional degree of belief is to a conditional bet, as an unconditional degree of belief is to an unconditional bet. For a bet on \(q\), you ask yourself, which is more likely and by how much, \(q\) or \(\neg q\)? For a bet on \(q\) given \(p\), you ask yourself, which is more likely, and by how much, \(p \:\&\: q\), or \(p \:\&\: \neg q\)? If you judge \(p \:\&\: q\) much more likely than \(p \:\&\: \neg q\), you have a high degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\). Equivalently, under the hypothesis or supposition that \(p\), you judge it to be likely that \(q\).

Ramsey then warns against some possible misunderstandings of “degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)”, which will be discussed below.

The main business of “General Propositions and Causality” is to discuss the nature of causal generalisations, also called variable hypotheticals – and naturally this leads him to discuss their singular conditional instances. He argues that “variable hypotheticals are not judgements but rules for judging ‘If I meet a \(\phi\) I shall treat it as a \(\psi\)’. This cannot be negated, but it can be disagreed with by one who does not adopt it” (1929b, [FM] 241, italics original). There is emphasis throughout on the idea that these conditional judgements are not propositions. After an example in which \(A\) says “If I eat the pie I will get a stomach-ache” and \(B\) disagrees, Ramsey writes:

Many sentences express cognitive attitudes without being propositions; and the difference between saying yes and no to them is not the difference between saying yes or no to a proposition. This is even true of the ordinary hypothetical (as can be seen from the last example, it asserts something for the case in which the [antecedent] is true: we apply the Law of Excluded Middle not to the whole thing but to the [consequent] only). (1929b, [FM] 239–240)

Later, with the same example, “it is not that he believes [a proposition] \(p\), we \(\overline{p}\); but he has a different degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\) from ours; and we can obviously try to convert him to our view” (1929b, [FM] 247, followed by the famous footnote). Here is another passage:

When we deliberate about a possible action, we ask ourselves what will happen if we do this or that. If we give a definite answer of the form ‘If I do \(p\), \(q\) will result’, this can be properly regarded as a material implication or disjunction ‘Either not \(p\), or \(q\)’. But it differs, of course from any ordinary disjunction in that one of its members is not something of which we are trying to discover the truth, but something within our power to make true or false. …

Besides definite answers ‘If \(p\), \(q\) will result’, we often get ones ‘If \(p\), \(q\) might result’ or ‘\(q\) would probably result’. Here the degree of probability is not a degree of belief in ‘Not-\(p\) or \(q\)’, but a degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\), which it is evidently possible to have without a definite degree of belief in \(p\), \(p\) not being an intellectual problem. And our conduct is largely determined by these degrees of hypothetical belief. (1929b, [FM] 246)

Two observations are in order: first, in the case of certainty that if \(A\), \(B\), provided that \(A\) does not have probability 0, degree of belief in the material conditional and the conditional degree of belief in \(B\) given \(A\) coincide. Writing “\(\bel\)” for degree of belief: if \(\bel(A \amp \neg B\)) = 0 but \(\bel(A) \neq 0\), both \(\bel(A \supset B) = 1\) and \(\bel(B \given A) = 1.\) The only other case in which they coincide is if \(\bel(A) = 1.\) Otherwise, \(\bel(A \supset B) \gt \bel(B \given A),\) radically so when \(\bel(B \given A)\) is low but \(\bel(\neg A)\) is high. Second, it is clear that Ramsey does not reductively define conditional degree of belief in terms of the ratio: \(\bel(A \amp B)/\bel(A),\) for the conditional degree of belief can be assessed even without any specific value for \(\bel(A).\) Indeed, in the fundamental law stated above, the right-hand side is much more use as a route to the probability of a conjunction, rather than the other way round.

Ramsey does not treat counterfactual conditionals in terms of conditional degrees of belief. The famous footnote continues:

If \(p\) turns out false, these degrees of belief are rendered void. If either party believes ¬\(p\) for certain, the question ceases to mean anything to him except as a question about what follows from certain laws or hypotheses.

That is, a degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\) exists only when the degree of belief in \(p\) is non-zero. Ramsey does make a few remarks about counterfactuals, noticing the ‘subtle syntactic variations’. For instance, “If he was there, he must have voted for it (for it was passed unanimously), but if he had been there, he would have voted against it (such being his nature)” (1929b, [FM] 249). (Here we have an early precursor of the Oswald-Kennedy pair: if Oswald didn’t do it, someone else did; but if Oswald hadn’t done it, no one else would have; see Adams 1970.) There are a few remarks about counterfactuals in Ramsey’s paper but no settled view of them is presented.

Bruno de Finetti (1937, based on lectures of 1935), shortly after Ramsey and independently, also developed an account of probability as degree of belief. (Unlike Ramsey, de Finetti argued that this was the only kind of probability.) In a separate lecture (1936) he gave a theory of “conditional events” or “tri-events” as he called them. Like Ramsey, he provided an account of conditional judgements in terms of conditional probabilities, and gave a three-valued account of such a conditional “if \(p\), \(q\)”: true if \(p \:\&\: q\), false if \(p \:\&\: \neg q\), void if \(\neg p\). He also connects this with conditional bets: won if \(p \:\&\: q\), lost if \(p \:\&\: \neg q\), called off if \(\neg p\). He gives three-valued truth tables for the other connectives when applied to conditionals, and claims that the probability of a “tri-event” is the probability of its truth given that it has a truth value – which, in the case of “if \(p\), \(q\)” is just the probability of \(q\) given \(p\). The results for more complex sentences are controversial, but there has been a fair amount of work in this tradition, much of it summarised by Peter Milne (1997). It is interesting that this second exposition of probability as degree of belief also connected conditional degree of belief to ordinary conditional judgements, and also recognised that the latter could not then be treated as ordinary propositions.

Ernest Adams wrote two papers (1965, 1966), and later a book (1975) developing a logic for conditionals assessed as conditional probabilities. Like Ramsey, he was sceptical of the idea of conditionals as propositions with truth conditions, and developed a logic based on probability. He showed that valid arguments have an interesting probability-preserving property: the uncertainty (i.e. 1 − the probability) of the conclusion cannot exceed the sum of the uncertainties of the premises. He applied this criterion to arguments with conditionals, and an interesting logic emerged. The paradoxes of material implication are invalid. Specifically, with material implication, \(\neg A\) guarantees the truth of \(A \to B\). But here, the probability of \(\neg A\) can be high while the probability of \(B\) given \(A\) is low. (\(B\) given \(A\) is the analog of \(A \to B\).) More surprisingly, there are counterexamples to transitivity, contraposition, and strengthening of the antecedent (see Section 3.2 of the entry on indicative conditionals, for examples and more details).

Robert Stalnaker’s first paper on the subject, “A Theory of Conditionals”, appeared in 1968. Stalnaker refers to Ramsey. He also mentions Adams (1966) in a footnote, and indicates that he will devote another paper to the probabilistic aspects of the theory. This is his “Probability and Conditionals” (1970), and its abstract announces that “conditional propositions are introduced as propositions whose absolute probability is equal to the conditional probability of the consequent given the antecedent”. Then David Lewis (1976) proved that there is no proposition the probability of whose truth can be systematically equated with the conditional probability of \(B\) given \(A\) – a result which Ramsey and de Finetti appear to have foreseen.

Probability is not discussed in the 1968 paper, but Adams’s logic is in the background as a guide: it turns out that Stalnaker’s logic coincides with Adams over their common domain (Adams puts aside sentences in which conditionals are embedded in other connectives). Thus, for example, Stalnaker also has the counterexamples to transitivity, contraposition and strengthening of the antecedent (1968, 48–9).

Stalnaker puts Ramsey’s suggestion thus: “add the antecedent (hypothetically) to your stock of knowledge (or beliefs), and then consider whether the consequent is true. Your belief about the conditional should be the same as your hypothetical belief, under this condition, in the consequent” (1968, 43).

Stalnaker was interested in a theory which covered both indicative conditionals and counterfactual conditionals. He held that something similar happened with the latter:

First, add the antecedent (hypothetically) to your stock of beliefs; second, make whatever adjustments are required to maintain consistency (without modifying the hypothetical belief in the antecedent); finally, consider whether the consequent is then true.

… Now we have found an answer to the question, “How do we decide whether or not to believe a conditional statement?” the problem is to make the transition from belief conditions to truth conditions; that is, to find a set of truth conditions for statements having conditional form which explains why we use the method we do use to evaluate them. The concept of a possible world is just what we need to make this transition, since a possible world is the analogue of a stock of hypothetical beliefs. The following set of truth conditions, using this notion, is a first approximation to the account that I shall propose:

Consider a possible world in which \(A\) is true, and which otherwise differs minimally from the actual world. “If A, then Bis true (false) just in case B is true (false) in that possible world. (44–45, italics original)

And close-possible-world semantics for conditionals was born.

A consequence of Stalnaker’s setting the probabilistic considerations aside in his influential 1968 paper is that Ramsey’s idea came to be taken differently: it was applied in the context of full, all-or-nothing belief; it was applied to counterfactuals as well as indicatives; and consequently, there was much emphasis on belief revision. The phrase “the Ramsey Test” was coined by William Harper (1975, 1976), and it caught on. He explains it thus: “Accept ‘if \(A\), \(B\)’ if and only if the minimum revision of your system of beliefs needed to accept \(A\) also requires accepting \(B\)” (1975, 245; 1976, 118). Peter Gärdenfors (1986, 81) says the same. Sven Ove Hansson (1992) says “In modern studies of belief dynamics, the Ramsey test is taken to ‘presume … some method of revising states of belief’ [quoting Gärdenfors]. Thus ‘If \(p\) then \(q\)’ is taken to be believed if and only if \(q\) would be believed in the belief state that would result from revising the present belief state by \(p\)” (1992, 522). Stephen Read says “Ramsey’s idea was simple, but appealing. One should believe a conditional ‘If \(A\), \(B\)’ if one would come to believe \(B\) if one were to add \(A\) to one’s stock of beliefs” (1995, 47).

This emphasis on belief revision is not found in Ramsey’s work. Indeed, he distances himself from that idea. On the page where he introduces “degree of belief in \(q\) given \(p\)”, Ramsey writes:

This does not mean the degree of belief which the subject would have in \(q\) is he knew \(p\), or that which he ought to have. … [And again] This is not the same as the degree he would believe \(q\), if he believed \(p\) for certain; for knowledge of \(p\) might for psychological reasons profoundly alter his whole system of beliefs. (1926a, [FM] 180)

Thus, for Ramsey conditional degree of belief is a synchronic notion, not a diachronic one. It is a feature of one’s present belief-state, not to be defined in terms of how one’s belief-state would change on acquiring more information.

Why did Ramsey issue these warnings? Here is one example which may be what he had in mind. Mary is an atheist. However, if she were to learn that she had a fatal disease, she would acquire a belief in God. But she doesn’t now believe “If I get a fatal disease, there is a God”! Another example: I am about to pick a card and look at it. I know there are three kings in the pile, two red and one black. My conditional degree of belief that I pick a red card, given that I pick a king, is 2/3. That determines the odds on which I would bet on Red given King. But if I do pick a king, I won’t have a degree of belief 2/3 that it is red. I am not colour blind. Then there examples like Lewis’s “If Reagan was in the pay of the KGB, we’ll never find out”. This is something he believes. But if he were to learn the antecedent, he would not then believe the consequent! As Lewis says, “It might be no easy thing to judge what would be learned if [\(A\)] were learned, in view of the variety of ways that something might be learned” (1986, 156). He concludes that a conditional degree of belief is a good but fallible guide to the degree of belief you would have in \(B\) if you learned \(A\). Edgington’s (1995) reply to Read, §1, discusses the disparity between what Ramsey himself said, and much that goes under the name “the Ramsey Test”. In the famous footnote, Ramsey speaks of people “adding \(p\) hypothetically to their stock of knowledge” – that is, supposing that \(p\). The consequences of doing so for one’s conditional beliefs, is not invariably equivalent to the consequences of coming to believe \(p\), for one’s unconditional beliefs.

Many philosophers have followed the path along which Ramsey took the first steps, and Adams developed – of understanding our typically uncertain conditional judgements in terms of conditional degrees of belief (see Edgington 2014 for more details and references).

6. Partial Belief and Subjective Probability

In ‘Truth and Probability’ (1926a), Ramsey sets out an influential account of the nature, measurement, and norms of partial belief. The essay is a pioneering work on subjectivist interpretations of probability (also known as personalist interpretations; see the entry on interpretations of probability). According to subjectivism, probabilities can be interpreted as numerical representations of an individual’s subjective degrees of confidence. First written in 1926 and still incomplete at the time of its publication in 1931 (a year after Ramsey’s death), ‘Truth and Probability’ was not very widely discussed until after the publication of Savage’s The Foundations of Statistics (1954), at which time subjectivism came to prominence. Many of the key ideas and arguments original to the essay have reappeared in later foundational works in the subjectivist tradition (e.g., de Finetti 1937, Savage 1954, Jeffrey 1965). This section outlines some of Ramsey’s major contributions to this tradition, focusing primarily on the procedure he suggests for measuring subjective probability.

Ramsey’s central goal in ‘Truth and Probability’ is to show that the laws of probability provide us with a ‘logic of partial belief’. That is, the laws specify necessary conditions on any consistent set of partial beliefs, in a manner analogous to how the laws of classical logic might be taken to generate necessary conditions on any consistent set of full beliefs. The argument for this claim is grounded in Ramsey’s subjectivist approach to probability. The essay begins, however, with a discussion of the two major approaches to understanding probabilities at the time in Cambridge: frequentism, and a version of the logical interpretation put forward by the economist John Maynard Keynes in A Treatise on Probability (1921).

Regarding frequentism – according to which the probability of an event is the relative frequency with which that type of event occurs, or would occur, over repeated trials – Ramsey adopts a conciliatory tone. For many cases (e.g., coin flips and rolls of a die), frequencies provide a natural interpretation of the probability calculus, but they are insufficiently general for Ramsey’s purposes and relate not to the consistency of partial beliefs but to their reasonableness. (We’ll return to the role of frequencies in Ramsey’s theory below.) On the other hand, Ramsey presents a detailed critique of Keynes’ theory. According to Keynes, probabilities are an objective and quantifiable relation between propositions – roughly, the probability of an hypothesis \(h\), given evidence \(e\), is the degree to which \(h\) is logically implied by \(e\). Importantly, Keynes’ assumed that this relation could be perceived through intuition – to which Ramsey objects:

[T]here really do not seem to be any such things as the probability relations [Keynes] describes. He supposes that, at any rate in certain cases, they can be perceived; but speaking for myself I feel confident that this is not true. I do not perceive them… moreover I shrewdly suspect that others do not perceive them either, because they are able to come to so very little agreement as to which of them relates any two given propositions. (1926a, [FM] 161)

For example, for even very simple pairs of propositions (such as ‘This is red’ and ‘That is blue’), where one might have expected objective relations to be more readily accessible, there is very little agreement as to what probability relation might connect them. Ramsey also notes that, while most people will agree that the probability of a fair coin landing heads is \(\frac{1}{2}\), ‘we can none of us say exactly what is the evidence which forms the other term for the probability relation about which we are then judging’ (1926a, [FM] 162).

Having dismissed Keynes’ theory, Ramsey moves on to his alternative, subjectivist view. The guiding idea throughout is that:

[T]he degree of a belief is a causal property of it, which we can express vaguely as the extent to which we are prepared to act on it. (1926a, [FM] 169)

That is, partial beliefs are connected to choice and action, in that the more confidence one has in a proposition \(p\), the more willing one will be to choose those options that lead to favourable outcomes under the assumption that \(p\) is true. Although he does not say much about the nature of this connection in ‘Truth and Probability,’ in ‘Facts and Propositions’ (1927a, 170) Ramsey expresses sympathy for the pragmatist view according to which a full belief that \(p\) just is a set of actions that tends to lead to favourable outcomes at worlds where \(p\) is true:

It is, for instance, possible to say that a chicken believes a certain sort of caterpillar to be poisonous, and mean by that merely that it abstains from eating such caterpillars on account of unpleasant experiences connected with them. The mental factors in such a belief would be parts of the chicken’s behaviour… Thus any set of actions for whose utility \(p\) is a necessary and sufficient condition might be called a belief that \(p\)… (1927a, [FM] 144)

It is plausible that Ramsey intended a similar account for partial beliefs – that partial beliefs either are patterns of behaviour, or perhaps behavioural dispositions, or that they’re otherwise definable primarily in terms of such things. In any case, Ramsey recognised that, if this vague connection between belief and choice could be suitably precisified, then it could be used to build a definition of degrees of belief in terms of choices.

Like other quantities throughout the sciences, Ramsey argues, ‘the degree of a belief… has no precise meaning unless we specify more exactly how it is to be measured’ (1926a, [FM] 167). To precisify his account, therefore, Ramsey sketches a procedure for the measurement of partial belief, which includes as an initial part also the measurement of desires (or ‘utilities’). The procedure takes as input the subject’s preferences over

  • worlds, or more accurately propositions that are maximally specific with respect to matters the subject cares about, and
  • gambles, including especially binary gambles of the form ‘world \(\omega_1\) if \(p\), and world \(\omega_2\) otherwise’, and ternary gambles of the form ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p \amp q\), \(\omega_2\) if \(p \amp \neg{q}\), and \(\omega_3\) otherwise’.

With those as inputs, the procedure supplies precise numerical representations of her partial beliefs and utilities provided the agents’ preferences satisfy a number of ‘coherence’ requirements. The procedure can be roughly summarised as follows. First, we elicit the subject’s preferences by offering her a sequence of choices between pairs of worlds and/or gambles. Then, on the assumption that the subject is an expected utility maximiser, we can use her preferences to determine her numerical utilities. Given her utilities, we can finally define the subject’s degree of belief towards the proposition \(p\) in terms of her utilities for gambles conditional on \(p\). The following paragraphs will briefly discuss these three steps in turn. More thorough treatments of Ramsey’s procedure can be found in Sahlin 1990, Bradley 2001, and Elliott 2017; see also Neth 2019 for an extension of the Ramseyan procedure beyond expected utility theory.

Regarding the first step, which requires us to elicit the subject’s preferences, Ramsey says:

[Suppose] that our subject has certain beliefs about everything; then he will act so that what he believes to be the total consequences of his action will be the best possible. If then we had the power of the Almighty, and could persuade our subject of our power, we could, by offering him options, discover how he placed in order of merit all possible courses of the world… Suppose next that the subject is capable of doubt; then we could test his degree of belief in different propositions by making him offers of the following kind. Would you rather have world [\(\omega_1\)] in any event; or world [\(\omega_2\)] if \(p\) is true, and world [\(\omega_3\)] if \(p\) is false? (1926a, [FM] 177)

A common objection to this early stage of the procedure is that if the experimenter were to convince their subject that they ‘had the power of the Almighty’, then this would radically alter the beliefs supposedly being measured (e.g., Jeffrey 1983, 158–60; cf. Sobel 1998, 255–6; Bradley 2001, §3.2; Eriksson & Rabinowicz 2013). A measurement procedure can be considered accurate only if it doesn’t itself significantly alter the measurand. Measurement procedures usually involve some unavoidable change to the quantity being measured – placing a cold thermometer into a hot liquid will slightly cool the liquid, for example, but for most purposes this effect is negligible. The objection at hand is therefore that merely having the subject come to believe that they have some choice over these worlds and gambles will generally involve a substantial change to their beliefs – enough to undermine the accuracy of Ramsey’s procedure. For example, the process might alter the subject’s beliefs regarding the claim ‘Experimenters have the capacity to make it the case that \(\omega_1\) obtains if \(p\) is true, and \(\omega_2\) obtains otherwise’, with potentially many ripple on effects through to her other beliefs. Interestingly, Ramsey makes note of a similar problem for an alternative procedure (1926a, [FM] 170), though does not discuss the worry as it arises for his own proposal.

The second step of Ramsey’s procedure takes us from preferences to utilities. This step is the most complicated, and it requires a suite of background assumptions about the partial beliefs, utilities, and preferences of the subject. In his words,

I propose to take as a basis a general psychological theory, which is now universally discarded, but nevertheless comes, I think, fairly close to the truth in the sort of cases with which we are most concerned. I mean the theory that we act in the way we think most likely to realize the objects of our desires, so that a person’s actions are completely determined by his desires and opinions. (1926a, [FM] 174)

Ramsey’s point here is that, given some background psychological assumptions, it will be possible – at least sometimes – to specify exactly what a subject’s degrees of belief and utilities are once we have enough information about her preferences. However, Ramsey leaves the details of this ‘general psychological theory’ almost entirely implicit. We can clarify matters on his behalf by breaking the theory into three parts:

  • First, there exists a function \(\varphi\) that associates gambles with real numbers, such that the subject weakly prefers a gamble \(\gamma_1\) to another gamble \(\gamma_2\) just in case \(\varphi(\gamma_1)\geq\varphi(\gamma_2)\)

  • Second, this function \(\varphi\) ‘decomposes’ into two further real-valued functions \(\bel\) and \(des,\) in the sense that if \(\gamma\) is the binary gamble \(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_2\) if \(\neg{p}\)’ then

    \(\varphi(\gamma) = bel(p){\cdot}des(\omega_1\&{}p) + (1-bel(p)){\cdot}des(\omega_2\&\neg{}p)\)

    (and likewise for ternary gambles, mutatis mutandis)

  • Third, \(bel\) and \(des\) represent the subject’s partial beliefs and utilities respectively; for instance, \(bel(p)\geq\bel(q)\) just in case the subject’s degree of belief towards \(p\) is at least as great as their degree of belief towards \(q\), and likewise \(des(p)\geq{}des(q)\) just in case the subject desires that \(p\) at least as much as they desire that \(q\)

In other words, Ramsey assumes that our preferences conform to the rule of expected utility maximisation, where the expected utility of a gamble is given by the weighted average of the utilities of its outcomes, the weights being provided by the subject’s degrees of belief. While Ramsey recognised that these assumptions involve some idealisation, he justifies them by noting that the development of any measurement process ‘cannot be accomplished without introducing a certain amount of hypothesis or fiction’ (1926a, [FM] 168), and that the assumptions come close enough to the truth to render them still useful (1926a, [FM] 173).

The reasoning by which we go from preferences to a numerical representation of utilities is complicated, and in Ramsey’s paper mostly left unstated. It begins with the notion of an ethically neutral proposition, which can here be defined as:

Ethical Neutrality: \(p\) is ethically neutral for a subject iff, for all worlds \(\omega\) consistent with \(p\) and \(\neg{p}\), the subject is indifferent between \(\omega\), \(\omega \amp p\), and \(\omega \amp \neg{p}\).

That is, a proposition \(p\) is ethically neutral if the truth or falsity of \(p\) is a matter of indifference to the subject, regardless of the wider context in which its truth or falsity obtains. Having characterised ethical neutrality in terms of preferences, Ramsey uses it to construct a definition (in terms of preferences over gambles) for when the difference in utility between two worlds \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\) is equal to the difference in utility between \(\omega_3\) and \(\omega_4\).[2] This equal differences in utility definition provides Ramsey with the resources needed to sketch a representation theorem, which constitutes the centrepiece of his paper. According to this theorem, the subject’s preferences over worlds and gambles will satisfy eight relatively simple conditions (or ‘axioms’) only if there exists at least one function, \(des\), which represents the subject’s preferences over worlds in the sense that \(\omega_1\) is weakly preferred to \(\omega_2\) if and only if \(des(\omega_1) \geq des(\omega_2)\). Moreover, this function will be unique up to positive linear transformations – that is, for any other function \(des^*\) with the same property, \(des^*(x) = des(x)r+c \) (for some positive real number \(r\) and constant \(c\)). As such, \(des\) is an interval scale representation: a numerical scale in which intervals of differences are meaningful. For instance, the difference in utility between \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\) is at least as great as that between \(\omega_3\) and \(\omega_4\) just in case \(des(\omega_1) - des(\omega_2) \geq des(\omega_3) - des(\omega_4) \). (Other examples of interval scales include temperatures as measured in degrees Celsius or Fahrenheit, and yearly dates as measured in the A.D. and Buddhist or Hindu systems.) Given Ramsey’s background ‘general psychological theory’, the implication is that the subject’s preferences will satisfy Ramsey’s eight axioms only if this function \(des\) represents her utilities on an interval scale.

Included among Ramsey’s eight axioms are some obvious coherence conditions, such as that preferences ought to be transitive. But the axioms also include some less obvious conditions, for instance that for any pair of worlds \(\omega_1\), \(\omega_2\), there’s a further world \(\omega_3\) whose utility is exactly halfway between that of \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\). There has been very little empirical investigation into Ramsey’s axioms, primarily due to the widespread opinion that his representation result has been superseded by the results of Savage (1954) and later decision theorists (see, e.g., Fishburn 1981). However, Ramsey’s assumption that there exists an ethically neutral proposition (needed for the definition of equal differences in utility to make sense) has attracted substantial critical discussion. Ramsey does not discuss any reasons to believe that even one ethically neutral proposition exists, still less that their existence is a precondition for the consistency of partial beliefs. For more discussion, including on why ethically neutral propositions are problematic for Ramsey’s proposal and whether they’re necessary for it, see Sobel 1998, Bradley 2001, Eriksson & Hájek 2007, and Elliott 2017. A further question concerns whether this stage of Ramsey’s procedure presupposes the controversial ‘deliberation crowds out prediction’ thesis, according to which an agent deliberating about an action cannot have meaningful degrees of belief regarding whether she will perform that action; see Liu & Price (2020) for discussion and Rabinowicz (2002) for a critique of the thesis.

The third and final stage of Ramsey’s measurement procedure takes us from the subject’s utilities to a definition of her degrees of belief:

Having thus defined a way of measuring value we can now derive a way of measuring belief in general. If the option of [\(\omega_2\)] for certain is indifferent with that of [‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) otherwise’], we can define the subject’s degree of belief in \(p\) as the ratio of the difference between [\(\omega_2\)] and [\(\omega_3\)] to that between [\(\omega_1\)] and [\(\omega_3\)]. (1926a, [FM] 179)

In a footnote, Ramsey adds that \(\omega_1\) must imply \(p\), and \(\omega_3\) must imply \(\neg{p}\). The definition follows from the background assumption of the ‘general psychological theory’ mentioned above: the world \(\omega_2\) has the same utility as the gamble ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) otherwise’ just in case

\[des(\omega_2) = bel(p)des(\omega_1) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_3)\]

Where \(des(\omega_1) \neq des(\omega_3)\), this equality can be rearranged to give a definition of \(bel(p)\)as follows:

\[bel(p) = \frac{des(\omega_2) - des(\omega_3)}{des(\omega_1) - des(\omega_3)}\]

As Ramsey notes,

This amounts roughly to defining the degree of belief in \(p\) by the odds at which the subject would bet on \(p\), the bet being conducted in terms of differences of value as defined. (1926a, [FM] 179–80)

Ramsey’s definition of conditional probability (1926a, [FM] 180) follows an essentially similar strategy. Having thus outlined his strategy for defining degrees of belief, Ramsey proves that from his preference conditions and subsequent definitions, the following ‘laws of probability’ follow:

\[\begin{align} &bel(p) + bel(\neg p) = 1\\ &bel(p \,|\, q) + \bel(\neg p \,|\, q) = 1\\ &bel(p \amp q) = bel(p)bel(q \,|\, p)\\ &bel(p \amp q) + bel(p \amp \neg q) = bel(p)\\ &bel(p \,\vee\, q) = bel(p) + bel(q), \text{where }p\amp q\text{ is impossible} \end{align}\]

Ramsey goes on to say:

These are the laws of probability, which we have proved to be necessarily true of any consistent set of degrees of belief. Any definite set of degrees of belief which broke them would be inconsistent in the sense that it violated the laws of preference between options… (1926a, [FM] 182)

In this passage we find an early version of what has come to be known as a representation theorem argument for probabilistic norms on partial belief and for expected utility theory, of the kind later made popular by Savage. (See also Skyrms 1987, Hajek 2008, and the entry on normative theories of rational choice: expected utility, §2.2, for discussion). It is dubious, however, that Ramsey ‘proved’ that the stated laws must be true of any consistent set of partial beliefs, even where ‘consistency’ is understood as being tied to the ‘laws of preference’ in the manner that Ramsey suggests. Among the axioms of his representation theorem are some (like those regarding the ethically neutral proposition) which are not plausible as conditions of the consistency on those preferences. Furthermore, Ramsey’s ‘proof’ requires substantive psychological assumptions about the connection between partial beliefs and preferences, which Ramsey admits are idealizations. Even if those assumptions happen to be true as a matter of fact, though, or close to the truth, they are presupposed in the derivation and require independent justification.

Immediately following, Ramsey also states that:

If anyone’s mental condition violated these laws, his choice would depend on the precise form in which the options were offered him, which would be absurd. He could have a book made against him by a cunning better and would then stand to lose in any event. (1926a, [FM] 182)

The reasoning behind this claim is never made explicit, though it is evident that Ramsey was putting forward what has come to be known as a Dutch Book Argument, later made more precise by de Finetti (1937; see the entry on Dutch book arguments for details).

Having established what he takes to be the conditions of consistency for partial beliefs, Ramsey concludes his paper with a lengthy discussion on what (in addition) might make a set of partial beliefs reasonable (as opposed to just consistent). He proposes a condition of calibration, or fit with known frequencies:

Let us take a habit of forming opinion in a certain way; e.g. the habit of proceeding from the opinion that a toadstool is yellow to the opinion that it is unwholesome. Then we can accept the fact that the person has a habit of this sort, and ask merely what degree of opinion that the toadstool is unwholesome it would be best for him to entertain when he sees it… And the answer is that it will in general be best for his degree of belief that a yellow toadstool is unwholesome to be equal to the proportion of yellow toadstools which are in fact unwholesome. (This follows from the meaning of degree of belief.) (1926a, [FM] 195)

So, for example, if 1 in 100 yellow toadstools is unwholesome, then ceteris paribus one should believe that this toadstool is unwholesome, given that it is yellow, to degree \(0.01\).Something like this condition has reappeared in a number of later works (e.g., Shimony 1988; Lewis 1980); see the entry on Interpretations of Probability, §3.3.4, for more discussion.

It would be hard to understate the importance of the above ideas to the subjectivist tradition. It is a major testament to the originality of Ramsey’s essay that it contains not only the first appearances of two of the main contemporary arguments for probabilistic norms on partial belief, but also an influential case for a normative link between partial beliefs and known frequencies. Furthermore, most attempts to characterise degrees of belief in the subjectivist tradition have made central appeal to their connection with preferences. (See de Finetti 1937, Savage 1954, Anscombe & Aumann 1963, Maher 1993, Elliott 2021; for criticisms of the approach, see Joyce 1999, §1.3; Eriksson & Hájek 2007; Meacham & Weisberg 2011; Stefánsson 2017.) Indeed, in much of philosophy, economics and psychology still today, the default or orthodox way to operationalise degrees of belief is in terms of choices, along essentially the same lines that Ramsey put forward.

7. Laws and Theories

Ramsey’s main contributions to the philosophy of science stem from three posthumously published papers written in 1928 and 1929, one on theoretical terms in theories and two on the distinction between (in modern terminology) laws of nature and accidental generalizations.

7.1 Laws

In both papers on laws, Ramsey (1928b, §2; 1929b, [FM] 237–38) considers accidental generalization to be conjunctions ([NP], n. 40; cf. Ramsey 1927a, [FM] 152–53) and thus normal propositions (for the relation to Wittgenstein, see §2). In “Universals of Law and Fact”, Ramsey (1928b, §12) considers laws of nature to be propositions with a special status:

[E]ven if we knew everything, we should still want to systematize our knowledge as a deductive system, and the general axioms in that system would be the fundamental laws of nature. The choice of axioms is bound to some extent to be arbitrary, but what is less likely to be arbitrary if any simplicity is to be preserved is a body of fundamental generalizations, some to be taken as axioms and others deduced.

Thus laws of nature are the axioms and theorems in the simplest axiomatization of all of our knowledge. And while we currently do not know everything, we can still find the simplest axiomatization for what we do know and what we expect to come to know (§16). Following Lewis (1973 [1986], §3.3), a similar view of laws has been developed and discussed as the “Best System” account of laws, which, however, does not demand that we find the simplest axiomatization of all our knowledge, but rather of as much of our knowledge as is possible while retaining a high enough level of simplicity (see also Carroll 2016, §2).

“General Propositions and Causality”, written in the summer of 1929 (Braithwaite 1931, xiii) and with additional notes from September 1929 ([NP] note 74), explicitly retracts the view that laws (here called ‘variable hypotheticals’) are propositions (1929b, [FM] 238; for the relation to Weyl, see §2). Rather (1929b, [FM] 241):

Variable hypotheticals are not judgments but rules for judging ‘If I meet a \(\phi\), I shall regard it as a \(\psi\)’. This cannot be negated but it can be disagreed with by one who does not adopt it.

Thus variable hypotheticals “form the system with which the speaker meets the future” in that “we trust [a conjunction of their instances] to guide us in a new instance” exactly because the conjunction is evidence for the variable hypothetical. Simplicity may still play a role, but not as constitutive of laws (as in the earlier, Best System account), rather only as epistemic justification for adopting a rule of judgment (1929b, [FM] 242). This allows again for the non-arbitrariness if not uniqueness of laws. Unknown laws are those rules of judgment whose adoption is justified by unknown facts (1929b, [FM] 243–45).

In both papers, ‘if … then …’ statements, called ‘conditionals’, are taken to differ from material implications in that they can be inferred from the system of laws (1928b, §15; 1929b, [FM] 248). Ramsey (1929b, [FM] 249) takes conditionals to encompass both the indicative and subjunctive mood (see §5 on Conditionals) and he identifies causal laws with conditionals in which the event described in the antecedent takes place before the event described in the consequent.

Ramsey’s earlier, Best System account of laws fits well with Humean constraints of metaphysics (Carroll 2016, §2), and Ramsey (1929b, [FM] 252–53; 254–55, n. 4) is explicit that his later, non-propositional account of laws avoids “real connections of universals” and is in the spirit of Hume. At first Ramsey (1928b, §15) even states that the material implication is all we practically need, while later acknowledging that conditionals are necessary for assigning praise and blame (1929b, [FM] 245–46).

7.2 Theories

His non-propositional account of laws, Ramsey (1929b, [FM] 254, n. 2) notes, renders theoretical laws twice removed from propositions:

[Laws] are used in the same way in a theoretical system as in a primary system; cause, too, if the theoretical system is temporal. Of course the theoretical system is all like a variable hypothetical in being there just to be deduced from; and a law in the theoretical system is at two removes of deduction.

In his paper “Theories” (1929a), written in the summer of 1929 (Braithwaite 1931, xiii), Ramsey calls the observational language ‘primary system’. The non-observational (theoretical) language is called ‘secondary system’ (see also §2). The paper is thoroughly instrumentalistic, since the factual content of theories consists only of their primary implications. This is made clear in a comment on the paper, written in August 1929 ([NP] 229, footnote removed; see also Ramsey (1931, [FM] 260):

The essence of a theory is that we make our assertions in a form containing a lot of parameters, which have to be eliminated in order to get our real meaning.

We mean to assert everything that can be deduced and does not contain a parameter.

The “parameters” here are the secondary terms. And Ramsey ([NP] 236) stresses in a note on the infinite in mathematics that their use does not entail any ontological commitment:

It is obvious that mathematics does not require the existence of an infinite number of things. We say at once that imaginary things will do, i.e. theoretical secondary terms. But there are no imaginary things, they are just words, and mathematicians and physicists who use the infinite are just manipulating symbols with some analogy to propositions.

To investigate the relation of the primary and the secondary system, Ramsey (1929a, [FM] 215–19) provides a primary system for an agent who, in discrete time intervals, can move forwards and backwards, open and close their eyes, and see blue, red, or nothing. In the secondary system, Ramsey formulates a toy theory that describes the movement of the agent among three locations and the sometimes changing color of the locations. A dictionary defines the primary terms in the secondary system so that, for instance, the agent sees blue if and only if situated at a blue location with open eyes.

Ramsey (1929a, [FM] 217–19) shows that all the theory’s implications in the primary system can be listed without the use of the secondary system and, contrary to “Russell, Whitehead, Nicod and Carnap” (220), that it is virtually impossible to define the secondary terms in the primary system:

[T]here is neither in this case nor in general any simple way of inverting the dictionary so as to get either a unique or an obviously preeminent solution which will also satisfy the axioms, the reason for this lying partly in difficulties of detail in the solution of the equations, partly in the fact that the secondary system has a higher multiplicity, i.e. more degrees of freedom, than the primary. (222)

Carnap (1923, 100) had already noted the additional degrees of freedom in the secondary system, but without appreciating the implication (obvious for Ramsey) regarding the inversion of the dictionary. Ramsey’s qualification that there is no simple inversion is needed to exclude the following case: Assume that all the models of the theory and the dictionary are finite and all objects have names in the primary system. Then in each model \(M_i\), each term \(T_j\) of the secondary system is co-extensional with a formula \(\phi_{i,j}\) in the primary system. If furthermore each model is named by a sentential constant \(C_i\) of the primary system, one can define each term \(T_jx_1\ldots x_n\) as the conjunction of the material implications \(C_i \to \phi_{i,j}(x_1,\ldots ,x_n)\) for all models \(M_i\) (220–21). However, Ramsey (1929a, [FM] 230) argues, apart from being cumbersome, definitions for secondary terms actually hinder scientific development because they require conceptual decisions based on fiat rather than further empirical discoveries (cf. Braithwaite 1953, 52–76). This criticism was later rediscovered by Carnap (1936, 449).

To avoid these problems, Ramsey (1929a, [FM] 231) suggests a way of applying a theory without defining the secondary terms:

The best way to write our theory seems to be this:
\((\exists \alpha, \beta, \gamma)\): dictionary \(\cdot\) axioms.

\(\alpha\), \(\beta\), and \(\gamma\) are variables for the terms of the secondary system and are interpreted purely extensionally, so that the theory states “There are extensions \(\alpha\), \(\beta\), and \(\gamma\) that satisfy the sentences of the dictionary and the axioms”. In contemporary presentations, the axioms are usually denoted \(T\) (for ‘theory’), the dictionary is denoted \(C\) (for ‘correspondence rules’), and the secondary terms \(T_1,\ldots ,T_n\) are treated as parameters in \(T\) and \(C\), so that the conjunction of axioms and dictionary is written as \(TC(T_1,\ldots ,T_n)\). What is now called the ‘Ramsey sentence’ \({TC}^R\) is then written as

\[ {TC}^R = \exists X_1,\ldots ,X_nTC(X_1,\ldots ,X_n), \]

that is, in the conjunction of all axioms and sentences of the dictionary, the theoretical terms \(T_1,\ldots ,T_n\) are replaced by variables \(X_1,\ldots ,X_n\) and bound by existential quantifiers. This procedure is now known as ‘Ramseyfication’ or ‘Ramsification’. If some of the theoretical terms are of the highest order (predicates or functions of \(n^{\mathrm{th}}\) order in \(n^{\mathrm{th}}\) order logic), then Ramseyfication increases the order of the theory by one. While higher-order existential quantification was commonly used to express consistency when Ramsey wrote “Theories”, he was the first to quantify on only some of the terms (Demopoulos 2003, 256). Crucially, the Ramsey sentence contains no theoretical terms while still entailing the same primary statements as \(TC\) (for a simple proof, see Bohnert 1967, 342–43). Since all of \(TC\)’s sentences are in the scope of the existential quantifiers introduced during Ramseyfication, \({TC}^R\) does not assign meaning to individual secondary sentences or terms. However, we can still reason with them by deriving primary propositions from them within the scope of the quantifiers, just as we can derive propositions from variable hypotheses (1929a, [FM] 232; Bohnert 1967, 344–47). Hence secondary universal sentences are “at two removes” from propositions, and secondary sentences and terms are only meaningful in the context of the theory to which they belong (1931, 260).

As an example, consider a simplification of Ramsey’s toy theory that states that being at a blue location with open eyes is followed by being at a red location with open eyes: \(\forall x(Bx \wedge Ox \to Rx' \wedge Ox')\), where \(x'\) is the successor of \(x\). ‘Blue’ (\(B\)), ‘red’ (\(R\)), and ‘open eyes’ (\(O\)) are theoretical terms. The correspondence rules define the observational terms ‘perceiving blue’ as ‘being at a blue location with open eyes’, \(\forall x(Px \leftrightarrow Bx \wedge Ox)\), and correspondingly ‘perceiving red’ \(\forall x(Qx \leftrightarrow Rx \wedge Ox)\). The Ramsey sentence of \(TC\) is then:

\[\begin{align} \exists X_1,X_2,X_3[& \forall x(Px \leftrightarrow X_1x \wedge X_2x) \;\wedge \\ & \forall x(Qx \leftrightarrow X_3x \wedge X_2x) \;\wedge \\ & \forall x(X_1x \wedge X_2x \to X_3x' \wedge X_2x')] \end{align}\]

This is equivalent to the observational sentence \(\forall x(Px \to Qx')\), which states that perceiving blue is followed by perceiving red. For any specific location \(a\), this variable hypothetical then becomes the proposition \(Pa \to Qa'\).

While sentences of any order can be Ramseyfied, many technical discussions (e.g., the overview by van Benthem 1978) treat the special case in which axioms and dictionary are of first order and the Ramsey sentence is of second order. In this case, the class of models of the observational first-order implications of \(TC\) can be a proper superset of the class of models of \({TC}^R\). This has been known at least since 1941 as the difference between elementary and pseudoelementary classes (Hodges 1993, 207, 260) and is regularly rediscovered in philosophy (see Demopoulos 2011, 179). It entails that \({TC}^R\) can be false in a structure even though all the first order implications of \(TC\) are true. Specifically, \(TC\) may only have tautological observational implications even though the Ramsey sentence is not logically true; this situation is one version of the distinction between syntactic and semantic conservativeness known from definition theory (Gupta 2015, §2.3; Przełęcki 1969, 52–53).

Carnap (1963, §24.D) used the Ramsey sentence for distinguishing between the analytic and synthetic components of higher-order theories (Uebel 2016, §3.5), and Lewis (1970) significantly modified the Ramsey sentence to arrive at explicit definitions of secondary terms (Andreas 2017, §4.4). This Ramsey-Lewis sentence has become central in the philosophy of mind (Levin 2017, §4.1) and philosophical methodology (Papineau 2016, §2.3).

In current terminology, the semantics of the Ramsey sentence is the following: \({TC}^R\) is true in a structure \(S\) for the primary terms if and only if it is possible to add interpretations for the secondary terms to \(S\) such that \(TC\) is true (Przełęcki 1969, ch. 6; Andreas 2017, §4.2). Sneed (1971, 106) modified the semantics of the Ramsey sentence for the use in structuralism (Schmidt 2014, §2.2.1; Stegmüller 1976, 88–89). Maxwell (1970, 186–88) identified the Ramsey sentence with its semantics to argue that the Ramsey sentence expresses structural realism (see also Ladyman 2016, §3.2). Dewar (2019) argues that this is misguided.

8. Contributions to Mathematics

Despite being employed as a mathematician at Cambridge Ramsey only published one paper (1930) firmly in that subject, though two ideas he introduced in his more philosophical papers (1926a, 1929b), also led eventually to new lines of mathematical research. Each of these three contributions has proved seminal and they are now rightly associated with his name.

Of these three Ramsey is best known within philosophy for his somewhat sketchy description of what later became known as the Dutch Book argument or theorem, see Vineberg 2016. In his unpublished paper “Truth and Probability” (1926a), Ramsey proposed a set of axioms and assumptions, his Laws of Preference, which enable a subject to correlate the value of options \(\alpha, \beta, \gamma\) and the preference relation between them with real numbers under the standard ordering. Using \(\alpha\) etc. as Ramsey does to denote both the option and its correlated real number allows a subject in turn to equate their degree of belief in a proposition \(p\) with the ratio

\[\bel(p)= \frac{\alpha- \gamma}{\beta - \gamma}\]

when, as far as the subject is concerned, the option

\[ \alpha \text{ (for certain)} \]

and the option

\[ \beta \text{ if } p \text{ is true, } \gamma \text{ if } p \text{ is false} \]

are equally preferable.

Ramsey then asserted that for partial belief (i.e. not certain belief) “This amounts roughly to defining the degree of belief in \(p\) by the odds at which the subject would bet on \(p\), the bet being conducted in terms of differences of value as defined”. In making this rough identification then Ramsey draws on the already “old-established” idea of measuring one’s degree of belief in a proposition \(p\) in terms of ones willingness to bet on its being true (1926a, [FM] 172). While he does not elaborate further on this connection it is implicit in the derivations that follow that Ramsey concludes that there is a number \(x\) such that for any option \(\xi\) and any stake \(t\) (positive or negative), \(\xi\) for certain is equivalent to:

\[\begin{align} \xi + \text{receive } (1-x)t, &\text{ if } p \text{ is true} \\ \xi + \text{receive } -xt, &\text{ if } p \text{ is false} \end{align}\]

As above this gives \(\bel(p)=x\), from which we might surmise that Ramsey intends \(\bel(p)\) to be that number for which the options:

\[\begin{align} \text{receive } (1-\bel(p))t, &\text{ if } p \text{ is true} \\ \text{receive } {-}\bel(p)t, &\text{ if } p \text{ is false} \end{align}\]

are all equally acceptable to the subject. (There is an assumption here that the stake \(t\) is not so great as to incur “diminishing marginal utility”.)

With this definition of the function \(\bel(p)\) and its further extension \(\bel(p\mid q)\) to conditional belief in \(p\) given \(q\), for which Ramsey claims credit, he argues that if a subject’s degrees of belief are consistent in the sense of obeying these Laws of Preference (alternatively, as Ramsey simply states, do not allow a [Dutch] book to be made against him by which he would lose in any event) then \(Bel\) must satisfy the “fundamental laws of probable belief (degrees of belief between 0 and 1)”, which he gives as:

\[\begin{align} &\bel(p) + \bel(\neg p) = 1, \\ &\bel(p\mid q) + \bel(\neg p\mid q) = 1, \\ &\bel(p \wedge q) = \bel(q\mid p) \cdot \bel(p), \\ &\bel(p \wedge q) + \bel(p \wedge \neg q) = \bel(p). \end{align}\]

Ramsey also states, again without proof, the converse (1926a, [FM], 183):

Having degrees of belief obeying the laws of probability implies a further measure of consistency, namely such a consistency between the odds acceptable on different propositions as shall prevent a book being made against you.

Nowadays, this result is commonly attributed to John Kemeny (1955) and independently Sherman Lehman (1955).

Such casual allusions to important new mathematical results without further explanation seems to have been a feature of Ramsey’s writing.

Unaware of Ramsey’s result, Bruno de Finetti published (1931) a detailed direct proof that if a subject’s (unconditional) degrees of belief \(\bel(p)\) do not allow such a book, he calls such a subject coherent, then \(\bel\) must satisfy what would later become know as Kolmogorov’s Axioms (1933) for a finitely additive probability function and conversely. In consequence of this fuller explication the forward direction of the Dutch Book argument for belief as probability is commonly attributed to de Finetti alone.

In recent times Dutch Book arguments have become an established topic in philosophy and mathematics in terms of analysing and extending the original argument to other logics, see Vineberg 2016.

A second important mathematical contribution of Ramsey is based on the following brief footnote in his otherwise philosophical paper General Propositions and Causality (1929b, [FM] 247):

If two people are arguing ‘If \(p\) will \(q\)?’ and are both in doubt as to \(p\), they are adding \(p\) hypothetically to their stock of knowledge and arguing on that basis about \(q\); so that in a sense ‘If \(p\), \(q\)’ and ‘If \(p\), not \(q\)‘ are contradictories.

Starting with Robert Stalnaker (1968) this has been (mis)interpreted (see the section on Conditionals) as a bridge between logics of (indicative) conditionals (Edgington 2014, Arlo-Costa 2016) and logics of belief revision (Hansson 2017). In the former the interest is in formalising the properties of conditional assertions such as if \(p\) then \(q\), denoted \(p>q\), their semantics and the rules and constraints that, arguably, they should obey. For the latter the focus is on capturing the rules and constraints that, again arguably, should apply when an agent’s set of beliefs \(K\), is to be revised, to \(K*p\) say, on receipt of new information \(p\) which, in particular, may not even be consistent with the original \(K\).

The above footnote has been formalised within this notation as the so called Ramsey’s Test:

An agent with belief set \(K\) should accept \(p \gt q\) iff \(q \in K*p\)

Through this recipe then any logic of conditionals generates a logic of belief revision, and conversely. In this way it can act as a test of the appropriateness of a logic of conditionals by opening up the corresponding logic of belief revision to scrutiny, and again conversely.

Not surprisingly then Ramsey’s Test, in this or in its many amended forms, has been hugely influential in the formal development of the logics of conditionals and belief revision in recent years, in philosophy and equally in artificial intelligence.

Despite its important contribution however Ramsey’s Test has in certain guises fallen foul of so called Triviality Theorems, starting with Gärdenfors (1986), which show that under certain conditions and apparently reasonable constraints on the belief revision Ramsey’s Test can only apply to a very limited family of belief sets \(K\). That is, agents who satisfied Ramsey’s Test could only consistently subscribe to very limited and trivial belief sets. In particular this can happen if we allow \(>\) to freely appear in the logical language from which the sentences \(p,q\) etc. are formed since then it would seem that the Ramsey Test would equally amount to:

Ramsey Test (RT):
For an agent with belief set \(K\), \((p>q) \in K\) iff \(q\in K * p\)

From this it follows that \(*\) must be monotonic in the sense that if \(K \subseteq K'\) then \(K*p \subseteq K'*p\), since if \(q \in K*p\) then \((p>q) \in K\) by (RT) so \(K \subseteq K'\) gives \((p>q) \in K'\) and hence by (RT) again \(q \in K'*p\). But this is a conclusion which goes against intuition, and unless the allowed belief sets \(K\) are severely limited, contradicts ostensibly reasonable assumptions about \(*\), including in particular that if \(p\) is consistent with \(K\) then \(K*p\) should be simply the logical consequences of \(K \cup\{p\}\).

Ramsey’s third contribution, and the one most directly important for mathematics, consists of two closely related theorems proved in the paper On a Problem of Formal Logic (1930) which was read to the London Mathematical Society on the 13th December 1928. This material is uncompromisingly aimed at mathematicians and with apologies its explication herein requires some necessary technicalities.

The first of these theorems says that if \(n,r\) are finite positive numbers and \(X\) is an infinite set and we partition the set of subsets of \(X\) of size \(n\) into \(r\) parts then there is an infinite subset \(Y\) of \(X\) such that every subset of \(Y\) of size \(n\) is in the same part. The second theorem gives a version of the first, but for finite sets of sufficiently large size. It says that, for any finite positive numbers \(m,n,r\) there is a finite positive \(k\) such that if \(X\) has at least \(k\) elements, and we partition the sets of subsets of \(X\) of size \(n\) into \(r\) parts, then there is a subset \(Y\) of \(X\) with at least \(m\) elements such that every subset of \(Y\) of size \(n\) is in the same part of the partition. Ramsey gave an upper bound on such a \(k\) in terms of \(m,n,r\) but even today the actual value of the least such \(k\), known as the Ramsey Number \(R_n(m,r)\), is unknown in all but a handful of cases for small \(n,m,r\). These two results are now referred to as the Infinite and Finite Ramsey Theorems, respectively. They can be viewed as generalizing Dirichlet’s much earlier Schubfachprinzip or Pigeon Hole Principle (1832).

Ramsey then uses the finite theorem in this paper to show that for each sentence, from a relational language with equality, of the form

\[\exists z_1, \ldots, z_m \forall x_1, \ldots, x_n \, \theta(z_1, \ldots, z_m,x_1, \ldots, x_n),\]

where \(\theta\) is quantifier free, one could effectively decide if it was satisfiable in some structure of cardinality \(\kappa\). Ramsey achieved this by showing that one can write down a natural number \(k\) such that for any cardinal \(\kappa \geq k\) this sentence can be satisfied in some structure of cardinality \(\kappa\) just if it can be satisfied in some structure of cardinality \(k\), and to determine this latter just requires checking its satisfiability in one of the finitely many such structures. An important innovation in his proof was the notion of indiscernibles which was to reappear, apparently independently, three decades later in Model Theory. It was subsequently employed in the proof of Michael Morley’s seminal Categoricity Theorem (1965) and later in the proof of the Paris-Harrington Theorem (Paris & Harrington 1977).

This result of Ramsey’s improved on earlier joint work of Paul Bernays and Moses Schönfinkel (1928) and solves the prospective Spectrum Problem (Scholz 1952), for sentences of the above form, now referred to as the Bernays-Schönfinkel-Ramsey Class. That is, for such sentences it enables us to determine the class of cardinalities of structures in which that sentence can be satisfied. As a corollary it gives that one can effectively decide if a sentence in this class is satisfiable in some structure. However it seems clear from the accompanying discussion that Ramsey was aware that there was also a direct and simple proof of this fact.

This corollary would seem to justify Ramsey’s stated aim in this paper to provide a step towards a positive solution to Hilbert’s Entscheidungsproblem though it is possible that the aim he actually had in mind was the related Spectrum Problem. Hilbert’s goal was later shown to be not achievable by the undecidability results of Alonzo Church (1936) and independently Alan Turing (1937). In fact Ramsey’s positive contribution turned out to be the best possible in the sense that decidability fails once the order of the blocks of existential and universal quantifiers is reversed, see Kalmár & Surányi 1950, and Mortimer 1975.

Ramsey’s Theorems were later popularised in an influential paper of Paul Erdős and George Szekeres (1935) and initiated in the early 1970s the establishment of Ramsey Theory as a major subdiscipline of Combinatorics. The basic aim in this subdiscipline is to show that mathematical structures of a certain type and size (and generally non-uniform) must have within them uniform substructures of a certain type and size, see Katz & Reimann 2018, Nešetřil & Rödl 1990, and Spencer & Graham 1990.

Ramsey’s Theorems themselves have yielded numerous important applications, generalizations and concepts in other branches of mathematics. For example the notion of a Ramsey Cardinal, \(\kappa\), where we require that for a set \(X\) of cardinality \(\kappa\) and any partition of the finite subsets of \(\kappa\) into two sets there is a subset \(Y\) of \(X\), also of cardinality \(\kappa\), such that any two finite subsets of \(Y\) of the same size are in the same part of the partition. Ramsey Cardinals were one of the first examples of large cardinals, a central area of research in Set Theory. One feature of such cardinals is that they are so large that their existence cannot be proved within ZFC.

In addition to these contributions to mathematics Frank Ramsey (1925a) devoted much effort to addressing what were by then seen as problems in Whitehead & Russell’s attempt in their Principia Mathematica (1910–1913), to base mathematics on formal logic, an enterprise which Ramsey initially strongly supported though he ultimately became disappointed with his efforts to correct its shortcomings, see Paul 2012 (232). Since then this approach to the foundations of mathematics has been very largely overshadowed amongst mathematicians by the practically simpler device of assuming as a foundation Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory.


A. Works by Ramsey

1. Collections of Ramsey’s Works

[FM] The Foundations of Mathematics and Other Logical Essays, R.B. Braithwaite (ed.), with a preface by G.E. Moore, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner, & Co., 1931.
[EP] Foundations: Essays in Philosophy, Logic, Mathematics and Economics, D. H. Mellor (ed.), Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1978.
[PP] F.P. Ramsey: Philosophical Papers, D. H. Mellor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990.
[OT] On Truth: Original Manuscript Materials (1927–1929) from the Ramsey Collection at the University of Pittsburgh, N. Rescher and U. Majer (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
[NP] Notes on Philosophy, Probability, and Mathematics, Maria Carla Galavotti (ed.), Naples: Bibliopolis, 1991.

2. Cited Works by Ramsey

  • 1923, Critical Notice of L. Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, Mind, 32(128): 465–78.
  • 1925a, “The Foundations of Mathematics”, Proceedings of the London Mathematical Society (Series 2), 25: 338–384; reprinted in [FM], pp. 1–61, doi:10.1112/plms/s2-25.1.338.
  • 1925b, “Universals”, Mind, XXXIV: 401–17.
  • 1926a, “Truth and Probability”, in [FM], 156–198; reprinted in [PP], pp. 52–94; also reprinted in Studies in Subjective Probability, H. E. Kyburg, Jr. and H. E. Smokler (eds.), 2nd edition, New York: R. E. Krieger Publishing Company, 1980, 23–52.
  • 1926b, “Universals and the ‘Method of Analysis’”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 6: 17–26.
  • 1926c, “Mathematical Logic”, The Mathematical Gazette, 13(184): 185–94.
  • 1927a, “Facts and Propositions”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (Supplementary Volume), 7 (1927): 153–170; reprinted in [FM], pp. 138–155; reprinted in [PP], pp. 34–51.
  • 1927b, “A Contribution to the Theory of Taxation”, The Economic Journal, 37(145): 47–61.
  • 1928a, “A Mathematical Theory of Saving”, The Economic Journal, 38(152): 543–559.
  • 1928b, “Universals of Law and of Fact”, in [EP], pp. 128–133; reprinted in [PP], pp. 140–144.
  • 1928c, “Further Remarks (Postscripts) to Truth and Probability”, in [FM], pp. 199–211 (‘Reasonable Degree of Belief’, ‘Statistics’, and ‘Chance’); reprinted with an additional 1929 postscript (‘Probability and Partial Belief’) in [PP], pp. 95–109.
  • 1929a, “Theories”, in [FM], pp. 212–236.
  • 1929b, “General Propositions and Causality”, in [FM], 237–255; reprinted in [PP], 145–163.
  • 1929c, “The Nature of Truth”, in [OT], pp. 6–24.
  • 1929d, “Arguments for the Coherence Theory of Truth Refuted”, in [OT], pp. 36–42.
  • 1930, “On a Problem of Formal Logic”, Proceedings of the London Mathematical Society (Series 2), 30: 264–286; reprinted in [FM], 82– 111, doi:10.1112/plms/s2-30.1.264
  • 1931, “Causal Qualities,” in [FM], pp. 260–262; original manuscript available online.

3. Other Published Works

  • “Mr. Keynes on Probability”, The Cambridge Magazine, 11(1) (1922): 3–5.
  • “The Douglas Proposal”, The Cambridge Magazine, 11(1) (1922): 74–6.
  • Review of W.E. Johnson’s Logic: Part II, The New Statesman, 19 (1922): 469–70.
  • Review of C. K. Ogden and I. A. Richard’ The Meaning of Meaning, Mind, 33(129) (1924): 108–9.
  • Review of A.N. Whitehead and B. Russell’ Principia Mathematica (Volume I, 2nd edition), Nature, 116(2908) (1925): 127–8.
  • Review of A.N. Whitehead and B. Russell’ Principia Mathematica (Volume I, 2nd edition), Mind, 34(136) (1925): 506–7.
  • “Mathematical Logic”, The Encyclopædia Britannica (13th edition, supplementary volume 2), 1926, 830–2.
  • “Foundations of Mathematics”, The Encyclopædia Britannica, 14th edition, volume 15 (1929), 82–4.
  • “Bertrand Arthur William Russell” (coauthor), The Encyclopædia Britannica, 14th edition, volume 19 (1929), 678.

4. Other Posthumously Published Works

Other short, posthumously-published works, all of which are reprinted in the collections listed in Subsection A.1 above:

  • “The ‘long’ and ‘short’ of it or a failure of logic”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 24(4) (1987): 357–59; reprinted in [OT], p. 125–127.
  • “Principles of Finitist Mathematics”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 6 (1989): 255–58; reprinted in [NP], p. 197–202.
  • “Weight or the value of knowledge”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 41 (1990): 1–3; reprinted in [NP], p. 285–287.

B. Secondary Sources

  • Acero, J., 2005, “Mind, Intentionality, and Language. The impact of Russell’s Pragmatism on Ramsey”, in Frápolli 2005b, pp. 7–40
  • Adams, E. W., 1965, “The Logic of Conditionals”, Inquiry, 8: 166–97.
  • –––, 1966, “Probability and the Logic of Conditionals”, in J. Hintikka and P. Suppes (eds.), Aspects of Inductive Logic, Amsterdam: North Holland, 256–316.
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  • Mellor, D. H., 1978, “Better Than the Stars”, radio broadcast (BBC Radio 3), 27 February 1978, available online.


The SEP editors would like to thank Fraser MacBride for helping us to organize the team of coauthors who contributed sections to this entry, and Sebastian Lutz for helping to organize a subsequent update. The contribution and acknowledgments of the coauthors are as follows. Section 1 (“Life and Work”) is by F. MacBride, who thanks Gary Kemp and Sam Lebens; Section 2 (“The Foundations of Logic and Mathematics”) is by M. Marion, who thanks Cheryl Misak and Jan von Plato for discussions related to his section; Section 3 (“Ontology”) is by F. MacBride, who thanks Frederique Janssen-Lauret, Cheryl Misak, Kevin Mulligan and Thomas Uebel; Section 4 (“Belief and Truth”) is by M. Frápolli; Section 5 (“Conditionals”) is by D. Edgington; Section 6 (“Partial Belief and Subjective Probability”) is by E. Elliott; Section 7 (“Laws and Theories”) is by S. Lutz; and Section 8 (“Contributions to Mathematics”) is by J. Paris.

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Fraser MacBride <>
Mathieu Marion <>
María José Frápolli <>
Dorothy Edgington <>
Edward Elliott <>
Sebastian Lutz <>
Jeffrey Paris

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