First published Thu Oct 26, 2017; substantive revision Fri Nov 3, 2023

One task of metaphysics is to carve reality into categories.[1] Some things could have failed to exist; they fall under the category contingent being. Some are events; they fall under event. And so on. One might well wonder—is there a category under which every thing falls? Offering an informative account of such a category is no easy task. For nothing would distinguish things that fall under it from those that don’t—there being, after all, none of the latter. It seems hard, then, to say much about any fully general category; and it would appear to do no carving or categorizing or dividing at all. Nonetheless there are candidates for such a fully general office, including thing, being, entity, item, existent, and—especially—object.[2]

It is not obvious that there is any fully general category (whether object or otherwise). Accordingly, not all accounts of object assign it to a fully general category, instead allowing that there are non-objects. On those views, object does indeed divide.

Accounts of object, then, differ with respect to whether there are non-objects. And this is not the only fault line. Other dimensions of difference include what objects there are and what objects are. Accordingly, this entry will survey three broad questions about the category object:

  1. What, if any, is its contrast or complement?
  2. What is its extension?
  3. What is its nature?

Each of these questions admits of various specifications and answers that we will consider in turn. Our focus will be largely theoretical and taxonomical, so we will only occasionally refer to historical sources. Our topic is abstract and broad, and touches on a number of issues in metaphysics that already enjoy coverage in this Encyclopedia. Our discussion of such topics will be brief; in those cases, we will recommend consultation of the extant entries for a more detailed treatment.

1. Contrast

The Contrast Question, as we shall call it, is this: what, if any, is the contrast or complement of the category object? With what, exactly, are objects to be contrasted? Put differently, are there non-objects, and if so, what kinds of things are they? Some related questions: if there are non-objects, do they form a natural class or collection? What might that class or collection be?

1.1 No Contrast: the Umbrella View

On one natural reading, the Contrast Question admits of an easy answer; fix—perhaps by stipulation—the content of ‘object’ and it will be obvious whether there are non-objects. Unsurprisingly, then, some philosophers suppose that there is a fully general category and simply define ‘object’ as picking it out. On this Umbrella View, as we shall call it, every thing is an object (perhaps by definition of ‘object’) and the category has no contrast—or, if it has a contrast or complement, the contrast is unfilled and the complement unrealized.

Is the Umbrella View true? Dispute here may appear merely verbal, to merely concern how to use the word ‘object’.[3] This is not quite right, however. So to clarify: the Umbrella View involves both a substantive metaphysical thesis and a semantic thesis. The metaphysical thesis is that there is a maximally general ontological category under which all things fall. The semantic thesis is that ‘object’—perhaps as a matter of stipulation—picks out this maximally general category. Disputes over the Umbrella View, then, are merely verbal in part. They are merely verbal insofar as they concern the semantic thesis. But disputes over the metaphysical thesis need not be—and in our view are not—merely verbal; they do not concern the English word ‘object’, but rather concern the existence and extent of a wholly general ontological category.

Note, too, that the component theses of the Umbrella View are logically independent. First, the semantic thesis does not entail the metaphysical thesis any more than the semantic thesis that ‘God’—by definition—picks out a maximally great being entails the metaphysical thesis that there is indeed such a being. Second, the metaphysical thesis does not entail the semantic thesis; that there is a maximally general category does not entail that it is picked out by any word at all, much less the English word ‘object’.

A consequence of the Umbrella View is that items that appear to have little in common—universals, particulars, gods, books, possibilities, colleges, works of music (if such there are)—are in fact all united under one category: object.

To be sure, not all who endorse the Umbrella View deploy the English word ‘object’ in explicating the view. Other candidates for the fully general office, instead, make an appearance. So Lowe:

‘Thing’, in its most general sense, is interchangeable with ‘entity’ or ‘being’ and is applicable to any item whose existence is acknowledged by a system of ontology, whether that item be particular, universal, abstract, or concrete. In this sense, not only material bodies but also properties, relations, events, numbers, sets, and propositions are—if they are acknowledged as existing—to be accounted ‘things’. (2005: 915)

And Russell:

I shall use as synonymous with [‘term’] the words unit, individual and entity. The first two emphasize the fact that every term is one, while the third is derived from the fact that every term has being, i.e. is in some sense. A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimera, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term (1903: 43)

And Strawson:

Anything whatever can be introduced into discussion by means of a singular, definitely identifying substantival expression…. Anything whatever can be identifyingly referred to; anything whatever can appear as a logical subject, an ‘individual’. (1959: 137, 227)

Finally, Tugendhat:

Now what is meant by the word ‘object’? This word too, in the comprehensive sense in which it is used in philosophy, is a term of art. In ordinary language we are inclined to call only material objects… objects, and not e.g. events or numbers… What is meant by ‘objects’ in philosophy has its basis in … what we mean by the word ‘something’… There is a class of linguistic expressions which are used to stand for an object; and here we can only say: to stand for something. These are the expressions which can function as the sentence-subject in so-called singular predicative statements and which in logic have also been called singular terms… (1976 [1982, 21–23])

Although they differ on which English word to assign to that category (i.e., ‘thing’, ‘term’, or ‘individual’, ‘something’), Lowe, Russell, Strawson, and Tugendhat all accept a fully general category under which all items fall and suppose that some word picks out that category. They accept, then, the Umbrella View.

Some features of the Umbrella View deserve explicit attention.

On the Umbrella View, it is unlikely that object can be analyzed in more fundamental terms or categories, especially if analysis of a condition or category involves specifying the complement of that condition. Object is, rather, a primitive of sorts. Frege affirms something along these lines when he notes of ‘object’ that “a regular definition is impossible, since we have here something too simple to admit of logical analysis” (1891 [1960: 32]).

But it does not follow from the Umbrella View that nothing at all can be said about the category object. For the above proponents of the Umbrella View, there is clearly a connection between being an object and being a candidate for reference (see entry) or thought—something that can be referred to or thought about (witness Russell’s use of ‘term’ above, for example). We will discuss this connection—and the account of the nature of object that it suggests—in more detail in §3.1.

Finally, note that there may be reason to be wary of any fully general category (whether expressed by ‘object’, ‘thing’, ‘entity’, or whatnot.). There may be reason, that is, to doubt the metaphysical conjunct of the Umbrella View. First and perhaps most importantly, there are paradoxes and puzzles associated with talking about. or ‘quantifying over’, literally every thing.[4] Second, any fully general category lacks a contrast or complement. So it may appear to be idle with respect to classification or carving or dividing—the central theoretical tasks of categories, one might think—thus inviting suspicion on the grounds that it is of no theoretical use.

If there are non-objects, some obvious topics to pursue include what they are and what they are like. Here we may appeal to various distinctions metaphysicians have offered across disparate projects. These distinctions may not map precisely onto an object/non-object divide and may not have been formulated explicitly in those terms. But they can still offer insight into what the contrast or complement of object might be and in turn shed light on what the category of object might amount to.

We will now survey several such distinctions; in each case there is a purportedly exclusive and exhaustive classification of items into two non-empty categories, one of which intuitively maps onto object and the other onto non-object.

1.2 Contrast: Objects vs. Properties

Consider these platitudes: there are things, and there are ways those things are (we might call the latter ‘properties’). There appear to be, for example, tall trees; there also appear to be properties had by those trees, such as being tall.[5] There appear to be, again, both things and properties. Perhaps there is, then, an important distinction between things and properties. And if there is such a distinction, it would appear to mark an important metaphysical divide. For it operates at a very high level of abstraction and promises to exhaustively and exclusively divide reality into categories—with trees, people, planets (for example) falling under thing and green, tall, itchy, and kind (for example) falling under property. The thesis that there is such a divide, we note, is distinct from purely semantic theses about whether to use the words ‘object’ and ‘property’ to pick out each side of that divide. Our focus here is on the metaphysical question of whether there is such a contrast in the first place, not on which words might express it.

Here’s how Armstrong expresses the intuitive contrast:

It is natural to distinguish a thing, an individual, a token, from any particular properties that the thing happens to have. The table is hard, brown, rectangular, and so on. But it is not identical with its hardness, brownness, rectangularity. These properties are rather naturally taken to be things it merely has… With things and properties thus distinguished, even if very intimately connected, we have what may be called a substance-attribute view. (1989: 60)

These platitudes and the close connection we have already observed between object and thing suggest a hypothesis: perhaps the object/non-object distinction just is the thing/property distinction. One intriguing consequence of this identity hypothesis is that informative content may given to the object/non-object divide—namely, by appeal to informative theories about the thing/property divide.

With this identity hypothesis in mind, we will now survey some theories about what the thing/property distinction might amount to and how exactly it divides reality.

Our topic in this section is the thing/property or object/non-object (henceforth, the ‘object/property’) distinction—as opposed to the precise nature of either objects (see §3) or properties. We will thus elide some terminological details. Instead of treating only theories of the object/property distinction phrased precisely in those terms, we will canvas several attempts to make sense of other nearby distinctions as well—most notably the substance/attribute distinction and the universal/particular distinction.

Russell offers a classic treatment of the object/property (in his hands, the ‘particular/universal’) divide and various ways in which it may be described:

We have thus a division of all entities into two classes: (1) particulars, which enter into complexes only as the subjects of predicates or the terms of relations, and, if they belong to the world of which we have experience, exist in time, and cannot occupy more than one place at one time in the space to which they belong; (2) universals, which can occur as predicates or relations in complexes, do not exist in time, and have no relation to one place which they may not simultaneously have to another. (1911: 23–24)

Russell’s remarks suggest at least three explications of the object/property distinction—in terms of subject/predicate structure, existence in space and time, and multiple-location. We will consider these three theories in that order, and then some others that have been offered.[6]

1.2.1 Objects are Subjects; Properties are Predicates

One way to make the distinction between objects and properties is to look to expressions that refer to them. In first-order logic, there are (among other things) subjects and predicates. And predicates are predicated of subjects. Following Aristotle’s remarks on substance (Categories 1a20–4b19; see also the section on category theory in the entry on Aristotle and the entry on classical logic), Russell (1911) thought that these logical/linguistic reasons were the most persuasive reasons for positing an object/property distinction. He says:

Predication is a relation involving a fundamental logical difference between its two terms. Predicates may themselves have predicates, but the predicates of predicates will be radically different from the predicates of substances. (1911: 23)[7]

So, on this way of marking the contrast, objects can be referred to only by subjects, and properties can be referred to by subjects or predicates.

1.2.2 Objects are in Space and Time; Properties are Not

Perhaps there is a particular shade of red that no object has right now, but some objects had and other objects will have. If there is such a shade of red—if it didn’t go out of existence when the last object that had it stopped having it—one naturally wonders where it is. And a natural answer is that it isn’t (and has never been nor ever will be) anywhere. More generally, universals are nowhere. Objects, by contrast, are somewhere; they are to be found within space and time, and in this respect stand in stark and categorial contrast to universals.[8]

1.2.3 Objects are Singly-Located; Properties May Multiply Locate

It seems that many properties are shared among objects. Our copies of Objects: Nothing out of the Ordinary are the same shape, and the gold hue of Knute Rockne’s helmet is the same as Joe Montana’s. But there isn’t just one copy of Objects: Nothing out of the Ordinary that is multiply located; there are many copies that share a shape. There isn’t one Notre Dame football helmet; there are hundreds. The books and helmets are many; each of their properties is, perhaps, one.

So one might make the distinction between objects and properties. Objects are restricted to one space-time region, while properties are not. Most objects will occupy many space-time regions by having parts at those regions, though. So it is better to say that objects can be wholly located at only one region, while properties can be wholly located at many disjoint regions.[9]

1.2.4 Objects are Concrete; Properties are Abstract

Another attempt to analyze the object/property distinction is to subsume it under the concrete/abstract distinction. According to some, some things are concrete and others are abstract. Some have it that there are concrete objects and abstract objects (see entry). The former are usually described as material and having causal powers (see entry on the metaphysics of causation), while the latter are usually thought to be immaterial and lack causal powers. While usually the latter are classified as objects, it is a sensible view that the concrete things are objects, and the abstracta are otherwise.

But the concrete/abstract distinction seems no more perspicuous than the object/property distinction, and itself cries out for explication. Nearly everyone can agree on the things that belong in each category, but precisely in virtue of what they belong in that category remains a matter of debate. Perhaps this is a reason to rest content with thinking of the object/property distinction as the abstract/concrete distinction. The latter seems intuitive, and resists analysis in more fundamental terms.[10]

1.2.5 Objects don’t obey the Identity of Indiscernibles; properties do

Two laws are associated with Leibniz. The first is the Indiscernibility of Identicals: for any two objects, if they’re identical, then any property that one has, the other has. The second is the Identity of Indiscernibles (see entry): for any two objects, if it’s the case that for any property one has, the other has it, then the objects are identical.[11]

The Indiscernibility of Identicals is pretty much universally accepted. The Identity of Indiscernibles is controversial. The Identity of Indiscernibles seems to entail, for example, that there cannot be two spheres that have the same color, shape, and density, and have all their other properties in common as well.

Many people think there can be two exactly similar spheres. But it doesn’t seem that there could be two exactly similar properties of sphericality that aren’t identical. Properties, one might think, are individuated by their properties, whereas objects are individuated by some further thing. If a property has all the same properties as another, then the two are identical.

This is one way of marking the distinction. The Indiscernibility of Identicals is true of properties, but false of objects.

1.2.6 Objects are Sense-Perceptible; Properties are Not

Strawson marks the distinction in the following way:

There is, for example, the suggestion that general, unlike particular, things cannot be perceived by means of the senses… It is not with the eyes that one is said to see hope. But one can quite literally smell blood or bacon, watch cricket, hear music or thunder. (1954: 235)

So properties (like hope) are the things that cannot be perceived, and objects (like bacon) are the things can be perceived. Presumably every thing is such that either it can be perceived or it can’t be, and nothing both can be perceived and can’t, so the division is exclusive and exhaustive.

But bacon also has a color and a shape, which seem to be perceived when one perceives bacon. One who marks the distinction this way must say that we perceive only the bacon, and not its color and shape. But why do we believe that the bacon is rectangular, if we don’t see its rectangularity? Presumably we believe it because we perceive the bacon, and the bacon is rectangular.[12]

1.2.7 Objects are Uninstantiated; Properties are Instantiated

The final view of the object/property contrast to consider is the view that properties are instantiated, and objects are not. This is, as it were, a metaphysical correlate of the linguistic view discussed in §1.2.1. and enjoys similar motivations. Instantiation is generally taken as primitive, but some things can be said about it. On one view, it’s a two-place relation (see entry on relations), and the relata are an object and a property, or a property and a property. On another view, it’s a “non-relational tie” that “glues” properties to objects and other properties (see, e.g., Strawson 1959). Objects can only be the things that instantiate; they cannot be instantiated. Properties, by contrast, can both instantiate and be instantiated.[13]

1.3 Contrast: Objects vs. Subjects

In surveying the possible contrasts or complements of object, we have thus far emphasized the intuitive grouping of items into categories like object (substance, individual, particular, etc.) on the one hand and property (or attribute, universal, feature, etc.) on the other. These are standard metaphysical categories, and they suggest that the proper contrast or complement of object includes properties or other property-like items.

But there is another compelling usage (both in and out of philosophy) of the English word ‘object’ and its cognates that suggests a rather different kind of contrast. Here, the divide is between object and subject. Each object is, roughly, an ‘it’, and each subject is a ‘you’. On this usage, it is items like us that stand in contrast to objects. We are subjects; trees, universals, colleges, colors, and—well, all things not like us in relevant respects—are objects.

But what are the relevant respects that group us together to the exclusion of trees, universals, colleges, and colors? Here the answer must involve subjectivity or experience. To be a subject in this sense is, roughly, to experience or to be conscious (see entry). We are subjects because we experience or enjoy consciousness. But what is it to be an object and not a subject in the sense at hand? Reflection on this question suggests two answers and thus uncovers two rather different subject/object divides. They differ in what category they assign to object and thus in what they contrast with subject.

On the first divide, the relevant objectual category is just the complement of subject; to be an object, then, is to neither experience nor be conscious. You are a subject and so am I. But an unfeeling rock is not, and so it is an object. Since every thing would appear to be either a subject in the relevant sense or not, this divide would appear to exhaustively and exclusively classify reality.

On the second divide, the relevant objectual category is object of experience, or what is experienced (see entry on the contents of perception). You—a subject—plunge your hand into a bucket of ice water. You feel just how cold the water—the object of your experience—is. As Bliss puts things:

The subject is that to which objects appear, have appeared, or may appear… The object, existing external to and independent of subjects, may appear to any subject that is so qualified and so related as to apprehend it. (1917: 406–408, emphasis original)

This second subject/object divide would appear to be neither exhaustive nor exclusive; a subject may also be the object of experience (whether her own or someone else’s), and some items may well be neither experiencers nor objects of experience (an unfeeling star outside the light cone of any subject, for example).

We note, finally, that these specifications of an object/non-object distinction are not in competition with the others surveyed above.

2. Extension

One question to ask about the category of object is to ask what falls under it—what is in its extension? This is the Extension Question. The extension of some categories is obvious. The extension of the category electron is all the electrons and no non-electrons. The extension of the category number is all and only the numbers. The extension of the category composite things is all and only the things that have proper parts.[14] For some categories, difficult questions arise. Some of those questions involve the question of whether certain things are in the extension of the category, e.g., is the Pope in the extension of the category bachelor? Is a fetus in the extension of the category person? Some questions concern the nature of the things falling under the category. The extension of the category book includes all and only the books. Does it include ebooks? Does it include some particular and well-loved copy of Material Beings, with its stained pages and cover, or the abstract type of which this particular copy is a token? Answering the Extension Question leaves many other questions unsettled, one of which is the nature of the things that are in the extension. But knowing which things are in the extension is a good start toward figuring out their nature.

So, one important question to ask of the category object is which things are in its extension. This question will admit a variety of answers. And depending on whether there is a contrast class, it will have a variety of interpretations. If object has no contrast class and every thing is in its extension—if both the metaphysical and semantic theses of the Umbrella View are correct—then the question of the extension of object is equivalent to the ontological question (see below). If object has a contrast class—if at least one of the metaphysical and semantic theses of the Umbrella View is false—then the question of the extension of object is not equivalent to the ontological question. Instead, it asks, “Of all the things there are, which ones are the objects?” If the contrast class of object is property, then the Extension Question is, “What things are there that aren’t properties?” If the contrast class is universal, the question is, “What things are there that aren’t universals?” If the contrast class hasn’t been specified, and one is starting from what ordinary people accept, then the Extension Question is, “What ordinary objects are there?”

2.1 The Ontological Question

It widely-held that a central question in ontology—what is often called ‘the ontological question’—is “What is there?” Though many have asked this question, it was Quine (1948) who drew explicit attention to it. He also said it could be answered in one word—“everything”.[15]

If the answer to the ontological question is ‘everything’, if there is a category under which all things fall and if that category is picked out by ‘object’ by definition (as per the Umbrella View), then there is one shared answer to both the extension and the ontological questions. This is one consequence of the Umbrella View. But it might turn out that every thing is an object, even if not by definition. A physicalism according to which every thing is a material object, for example, would appear to entail that every thing is an object. But this entailment need not hold because of the definition of ‘object’; it might hold, instead, on substantive and general theoretical grounds having nothing to do with definitions at all.

The point is this: on at least the Umbrella View, answering the ontological question is closely related, if not identical, to answering the Extension Question. We will therefore briefly survey several highly abstract answers to the ontological question, with the understanding that many will think that by giving such an answer, they are thereby answering the Extension Question.

2.1.1 Existence Nihilism

Perhaps the most surprising answer to the ontological question is ‘Nothing’, according to which the extension of object is empty. It’s not clear whether anyone sincerely endorses the thesis that there is nothing. However, it has been defended several times over.[16]

Hawthorne and Cortens (1995) speak for the nihilist thus: “the concept of an object has no place in a perspicuous characterization of reality” (p. 143). They suggest three theories on which there are no objects. The first that there are just stuffs everywhere, but no objects. The second that there is just one big mass of stuff.[17] The third is that there just isn’t anything at all. This last option is what Hawthorne and Cortens defend. They do so using what they (following Strawson) call a “feature-placing language”. They model a potential nihilist program on sentences like “it is raining”, “it is snowing now”, and “it is cold here”. Such sentences do not quantify over anything and have no logical subject (‘it’ functions as a dummy pronoun), and so do not ontologically commit one to anything. The nihilist may then paraphrase sentences that apparently require objects (such as “there is a computer here”) with those that do not (such as “it is computering here”). In short, the nihilist turns every putative noun into an adverb, making judicious use of spatial, temporal, and numerical adverbs too. It may seem that the results are plainly wrong. For our ordinary sentences appear to say that objects have properties (“the computer is running”, for example); and they appear, furthermore, to be about those objects. But on the feature-placing view at hand, they are not about anything at all (there being no computers for them to be about, for example). According to Azzouni (2017: xi–xii; see also all of Chapter 7), this appearance is not dispositive evidence against the feature-placing nihilist; it is instead the result of a cognitive illusion. We are systematically and incorrectly tempted to take our ordinary sentences to be about things, even when we know those things don’t exist.

Turner (2011) agrees with Hawthorne and Cortens that the chief task of the ontological nihilist is to give paraphrases of ordinary language that don’t contain quantification over objects:

With this in mind, we demand the following of our Ontological Nihilist: give us a systematic recipe for taking any sentence of a first-order language (with predicates assumed to be predicates of our best science) and cooking up the ontologically innocent claim it was supposed to be getting at all along. (2011: 11)

These strategies by which to eliminate object-talk suggest a defensive move available to nihilists: paraphrase apparently true sentences that appear to require objects into sentences that do not. Such a strategy may neutralize objections to nihilism. But another question remains; is there reason to affirm nihilism in the first place?

One such reason may derive from nihilism’s economy. Dasgupta (2009) thinks that objects (he calls them “individuals”) are physically redundant and empirically undetectable. More precisely, he thinks that every physical theory considered over the past 400 years entails that objects are physically redundant and empirically undetectable. They’re empirically undetectable because two situations differing only in their individualistic facts are indistinguishable. And they’re physically redundant because two systems that only differ with respect to their individualistic facts will continue to only differ with respect to those facts. And given two theories—the only difference between the two being that one posits physically redundant and empirically undetectable things—we should prefer the one that does not.

Dasgupta says that if there are no individuals, then the fundamental facts are all general facts, like \(\exists xFx\), \(\exists x\exists yGxy\), and the like (see also Dasgupta 2016). But what do the variables range over in those sentences? Individuals? Objects? To bypass such questions, we must construct a language that doesn’t quantify over objects. Dasgupta uses a version of predicate functorese, which replaces individuals with predicates and a defined adicity. So instead of “x is round”, “something is round”, or “something loves someone”, we have “Round1 obtains”, “cRound1 obtains”, and “ccLoves2 obtains”. In systematically doing this for all sentences, we can do away with all reference to objects, replacing them with general states of affairs. And since individuals are physically redundant and empirically undetectable, this is a good thing.

The aforementioned authors all seem to agree that if first-order logic, which quantifies over objects, can be replaced with a logic that doesn’t so quantify, or one can give a translation of every intuitively true sentence of first-order logic into another language that doesn’t quantify over objects, then ontological nihilism is vindicated. That is, if one can give an “ontologically innocent” (that is, one that doesn’t quantify over anything) paraphrase of every sentence, or a scheme for so doing, then ontological nihilism is on good footing.

2.1.2 Existence Monism

Existence Monism, chiefly sponsored in recent times by Horgan and Potrč, says that there is exactly one object.[18] (Or at least, exactly one concrete object, or one concrete physical object.) The one thing (which Horgan and Potrč call ‘the blobject’) is huge, and very complex, though it does not have any parts. Rather, it has different properties in various spatiotemporally local ways (2008: 177–178).

On Horgan and Potrč’s view, common-sense statements are true, but not made true by any thing(s) other than the only thing there is—the blobject. So truth isn’t direct correspondence between propositions and the parts of the world they’re about, but rather between propositions and the entire world—indirect correspondence (2000: 250–51).

One compelling argument for existence monism (2000: §2.4, also Schaffer (2007)) is that the complete causal story of the world can be told in terms of the world and the laws without appeal or reference to parts of the world. So, if there were parts of the world, they would be redundant and/or epiphenomenal (see entry). But we shouldn’t posit explanatorily redundant or epiphenomenal things. So, we shouldn’t posit parts of the world. So, only one object—the world—exists.

One compelling argument against existence monism takes a Moorean shape. Russell (1918 [1985: 36]) says,

I share the common-sense belief that there are many separate things; I do not regard the apparent multiplicity of the world as consisting merely in phases and unreal divisions of a single indivisible Reality.

If the multiplicity of things is really this obvious, the point may be extended: the rejection of one of the premises of any valid argument that has as a conclusion that there is only one concrete object will always be more plausible than accepting the conclusion.[19]

2.1.3 Existence Pluralism

Existence pluralism is the view that there is more than one thing. Certainly existence pluralism is the standard view—even among metaphysicians. Indeed, most people think that there are a great many things. The conjunction of the Umbrella View and existence pluralism entails that there is more than one object. But if one thinks there are a great many things, one might also think that they are not all objects. And so existence pluralists may want to try to treat the ontological question as distinct from the Extension Question (for them, see §2.2).


One exception is nominalism; or at least, one version of nominalism is an exception. Although nominalism is widely discussed in ontology, precisely what the view is differs. Some say that nominalism is the view that there are no abstracta or universals. Others say that nominalism is the view that the correct answer to the ontological question is ‘particulars’, or ‘concrete things’, or ‘objects’.

For the proponent of the latter formulation of nominalism, the Extension Question is the ontological question; if she thinks there are only objects, then she’ll think that whatever is in the extension of object is all there is. (But not because she holds the Umbrella View.) The proponent of the former formulation may countenance non-abstracta or non-universals that aren’t objects. And so she might pursue the ontological question and the Extension Question separately.


There are other views of what there is that are less general than existence nihilism, existence monism, existence pluralism, or nominalism. For example, possibilism is the view that there are merely possible objects (see the section on possibilist realism in the entry on possible objects). This view doesn’t say that every thing is a merely possible thing; it just says that the answer to the ontological question ought to include merely possible things. Mereological universalism says that whenever you have two or more things, there is an object composed of all and only those things (see the section on permissivism in the entry on ordinary objects). It doesn’t tell you that every thing is a composite thing; it just says that the answer to the ontological question needs to include such objects. Perdurantism says that objects are composed of temporal parts—at each time at which an object exists, there is an instantaneous object composed of all its parts at that time and is a part of it at that time, so those objects ought to be in the extension of the answer to the ontological question (see entry on temporal parts). Meinongianism says that there are non-existent objects, so they would include those objects in the extension of the answer to the ontological question (see entry on nonexistent objects). The views canvassed so far in this paragraph may be thought of as positing surprising additions to being, on which there are more things than one might have otherwise thought. They may be usefully contrasted with views that posit surprising subtractions from being, on which there are fewer things than one might have otherwise thought.

These views are partial answers to the ontological question. They are partial answers because they tell us what there is, but they don’t tell us everything there is.

2.2 The Extension Question

If—contra the Umbrella View—it is not true by definition that ‘object’ picks out a maximally general category, then there may be things that are not objects. So the Extension Question may turn out to have a different answer than the ontological question. And even if one and the same class or collection is identified as the correct answer to each question, it does not follow that the questions are the same; even if everything is an object, it need not be true by definition that the extension of ‘object’ is just what there is. So we will also survey answers to the Extension Question that have it that object picks out (at least intensionally) a different group of things than one’s answer to the ontological question.

2.2.1 Ordinary Objects

For those who don’t accept the Umbrella View, the Extension Question is distinct from the ontological question. What, then, does the Extension Question amount to? Presumably one who denies the Umbrella View thinks that there are objects, and non-objects. Put another way, her answer to the ontological question includes objects and other things. For her, the Extension Question is the following: of all the things there are, which ones are the objects? Those who deny the Umbrella View have a variety of ways of dividing the objects from the non-objects, which we discussed in §1.2.

Another way of dividing the objects from the non-objects is not by first answering the ontological question and then picking out the objects from all the things, or by answering the Contrast Question and then placing things into either object or its contrast class. Rather, one could simply start with the Extension Question—one could start by listing the obvious and ordinary candidates for the office of object (see entry on ordinary objects).

A common way to start would be by listing the things we ordinarily take to be objects in our pre-philosophical approach to the world. Recall the Tugendhat quotation from above: “In ordinary language we are inclined to call only material objects ‘objects’.” The view is that the extension of object is all and only the things we normally think about and talk about and refer to and use. These things are nameable, identifiable, stable, and persist through time. Examples include bees, erasers, pillows, and boats.

Two thoughts arise. First, such an answer to the Extension Question leads to many puzzles and problems. Second, simply listing all the things is pretty dissatisfying as an answer to the Extension Question. Better to give a general answer and then see what it entails—in particular, what entailments it has for the Extension Question. What follows is one method for giving a general answer to what objects there are.[20]

2.2.2 Special Composition Question

Most who have considered the Extension Question probably think there are such objects as photons, electrons, quarks and other things that science deals with—the fundamental physical particles. And those things seem to make up other things, like atoms, molecules, elements, cells, and so on up the size chain to medium-sized dry goods, large buildings, mountains, and planets.

So it seems that things are often composed of other things. But under what conditions does composition occur? van Inwagen (1990) calls this ‘The Special Composition Question’ (hereafter ‘the SCQ’). More precisely, the SCQ calls for filling in for Φ in the following sentence: For any xs, there exists a y such that the xs compose y iff Φ. An answer must be non-analytic and must have only ‘the xs’ free.[21]

Here are some candidate answers to the SCQ. Contact: ‘the xs are in contact’. Life: ‘the xs are caught up in a life’. Mereological Nihilism: ‘there is only one of the xs’. Mereological Universalism: ‘the xs are one or more in number’.

Anyone who denies the Umbrella View and who has an answer to the SCQ can consider that as a partial answer to the Extension Question. What objects are there? Contact says that there are the xs, and for any xs that are in contact, there’s another object (the one that’s composed of them). Life says that there are the xs, and for any xs that are caught up in a life, there’s another object (the one that’s composed of them). Mereological Nihilism says that there are just the xs, and no other objects. Mereological Universalism says that there are the xs, for any xs at all (no matter how they are arranged), there’s another object (the one that’s composed of them). And so on for other answers.

3. Nature

Thus far we have asked two questions of object: (i) what, if any, is its contrast? (ii) what things, if any, are in its extension? These questions might also be phrased as the questions of what non-objects there are and of what objects there are. We turn now to our final question: (iii) supposing there are objects, what are they like? What is their nature?

One way to specify the nature of a category is to note the theoretical role it plays or the role played by items within it. This is to say what items within the category do. Another is to give a real definition of the category (or the items within it), where a real definition attempts to identify the real essence of the members of the category. This is to say what items of within category are (see entries on theoretical terms in science and Locke on real essence and the section on real and nominal definitions in the entry on definitions).

In this section, we will consider attempts to state the nature of objects. As with our treatment of the Contrast Question, our discussion will elide some terminological details. Instead of treating only theories of the nature of objects phrased in precisely those terms, we will canvas several attempts to state the nature of nearby categories as well—most notably substance and particular—treating them as giving a theory of the nature of objects.

3.1 What Objects Do

One way to explain a thing or category is to mark out what it does—its role. Since object is, on any view at all, a highly abstract and general category, the relevant role by which object might be defined must itself be highly abstract and general.[22] Three examples:

First, various linguistic items, it seems, denote or refer. “Armstrong” denotes Armstrong, “redness” denotes redness, “the successor of zero” denotes the number 1, and so on. Reflection on these platitudes brings to the fore a role that we might call being an object of reference (or perhaps some related modal notion such as possibly being an object of reference or being eligible for reference).

Second, domains (classes or pluralities), it seems, are associated with quantifiers (expressions like “some” and “every”). “Everything is so-and-so” quantifies over all items within an inclusive domain (maximally inclusive, one thinks) and says of each of those items that it is so-and-so. Reflection on these platitudes brings to the fore a role we might call being quantified over, or perhaps some related modal notion such as possibly being quantified over or being a candidate for being quantified over.

Third, some thoughts are, it seems, about things. The thought that Aristotle was a philosopher is at least in part about a certain person—Aristotle. The thought that doing metaphysics is a fine pastime is at least in part about a certain activity. And the thought that Platonism is sensible is at least in part about a certain philosophical theory. Reflection on these platitudes brings to the fore a role we might call being an object of thought or being thought of, or perhaps some related modal notion such as being possibly thought of.[23]

These three examples isolate highly abstract or general roles—being an object of reference, being quantified over, or being thought of. These roles are specified, as it were, by form rather than content; the roles alone impose very few limitations or requirements on the kinds of things that fill them. Plausibly, for example, both concrete material objects and abstract propositions alike might satisfy any of these roles. These three examples involve roles specified in part by connection to thought or language. But these connections may be severed. We might, for example, specify the object role as being a bearer of properties (this would be a natural extension of the view discussed in 1.2.7, or a non-linguistic extension of the view discussed in 1.2.1).

And each role suggests, in turn, a theory of what objects are: (i) to be an object just is to be a referent, (ii) to be an object just is to be quantified over, and (iii) to be an object just is to be an object of thought.[24] van Inwagen offers a version of (i) here (note the use of “can” indicating that it is a modal role that objects play, namely being possible referents; we here presuppose the already mentioned tight connection between ‘object’ and ‘thing’):

The most general metaphysical category is the category “thing”. I use ‘thing’ as the most general count-noun. Everything is a thing. A thing is anything that can be referred to by a third-person singular pronoun—as when I say, “The following is true of everything, that it is identical with itself.” The category “thing” comprises everything there is, everything that exists (for I take a stern anti-Meinongian line about non-existents: non-existents simply don’t exist: the number of them is 0). (2007: 199)

These role-theoretic specifications of what it is to be an object will have consequences with respect to the Extension Question and the Contrast Question. If literally every thing at all is eligible for reference or quantification or thought, for example, then literally every thing would be an object, a thesis in line with the Umbrella View. If, on the other hand, some items are not eligible for reference or quantification or thought, then such items would fall under non-object, and the category object would turn out to have a contrast or complement. Similarly, if , say, both concrete material objects, abstract propositions are eligible for reference or quantification or thought, then items of both sorts would fall under the extension of object.[25]

3.2 What Objects Are

Some think there’s more to being an object than playing a particular theoretical role. On this view, what it is for something to be an object is a matter of that thing’s intrinsic character or nature. One way of giving the intrinsic nature of a thing is by giving a real definition. Says Dasgupta (2014), a real definition is:

a statement of what something is… For example, when one says that {Socrates} is the unique singleton containing Socrates, one is defining what the set is—that is, giving its real definition. Or, equivalently, one is stating its essence or nature… (2014: 577)

Statements of what something is—of a thing’s essence or nature—could take a variety of forms. One says what it is to be that thing; the real definition of x might be put: to be x is to be y. Or the real definition of a category F: to be an F is to be a G. When one says, “To be a bachelor is to be an unmarried male”, one is giving the real definition of bachelorhood.

Another way is to say what is essential to an object or category, as suggested by Fine (1995): It is essential to x that Φ. Or, it is essential to Fs that Φ.

In any case, the task at hand is not to write a section about what it is to be a real definition, but rather how the notion relates to object.

If one thinks real definitions best get at the nature of things, and one is interested in stating the nature of object or of objects, there are two options. One is to substitute for Φ in the following: To be an object is to be Φ. The second is to substitute for Φ in the following: It is essential to objects that Φ.

Note the difference between this method and the method of giving necessary and sufficient conditions: x is an object iff Φ. If one has a contrast class in mind, then presumably one can substitute for Φ the negation of that contrast class, e.g., “x is an object iff x is not a property”. But that isn’t what it is to be an object. A real definition demands more.

One might think that object doesn’t have a real definition. It may be that the contrast class (property, say) is a natural class, but object is not.

Ontologies—roughly, abstract and systematic catalogues of the kinds of things there are—divide on the question of how objects relate to their properties. On constituent ontologies, properties are parts or constituents or components of the objects that have them or that they characterize (see entry on mereology). So on constituent ontologies, a tall tree has tall, somehow, as a part or constituent or component. On relational ontologies, properties are not in any sense parts or constituents or components of the objects that have them or that they characterize. So on relational ontologies, though a tall tree bears an interesting relationship to tall (perhaps it bears the instantiation relation to that property), tall is not among the tree’s various parts or constituents or components.[26]

We will canvas three theories of objects that draw from constituent ontologies, and then describe a relational alternative.

3.2.1 Constituent Ontologies

Constituent ontologists agree that objects have properties or property-like items as constituents or parts. They disagree, however, over whether objects have additional non-property-like items as constituents or parts and over how the constituents or parts of objects are related.

Bundle theory

According to the bundle theory, objects are bundles of properties. Different theories of properties will make for different versions of the bundle theory. The most common theories of properties for bundle theorists to hold are trope theory (see entry on tropes) and immanent universals.

On the immanent universal version of the bundle theory, objects are bundles of universals, and those universals are located in space and time. When some universals are compresent, however compresence is to be understood (and perhaps when some other condition is satisfied), there is an object that is the bundle of those universals. (For some bundle theorists, not just any group of immanent universals forms a bundle.) The way it’s often put is that objects are bundles of coinstantiated universals, where the coinstantiation relation may be a primitive relation.[27]

On the trope version of the bundle theory, objects are bundles of tropes. Like the immanent universal version, not just any collection of tropes forms a bundle which is an object; the tropes have to be compresent. The compresence relation is taken to be primitive.[28]

The bundle theory is a theory about objects according to which objects are composed of items of a different kind or category (namely, properties).[29] So the bundle theory suggests that object has a contrast or complement. The bundle theory also suggests this broad answer to the Extension Question: whenever there is a bundle of coinstantiated universals (or, alternatively, compresent tropes), there is an object. The extension of object includes all and only the bundles, and what bundles there are is determined by which immanent universals or tropes stand in the coinstantiation or compresence relation.[30]

Bare particularism

Like the bundle theory, bare particularism maintains that objects have their properties as constituents. But bare particularism adds that there’s something else too. In addition to its properties, every object has as a constituent a bare particular (or ‘thin particular’ or ‘substratum’) that instantiates those properties. Bare particulars are ‘bare’ in at least this sense: unlike objects, they have no properties as parts.

Bare particularism, then, is the conjunction of two theses. First, every object has at least two kinds of constituents: its properties and its bare particular. Second, every object has its properties by having as constituents properties that are instantiated by another of its constituents: its bare particular.

Bare particulars play two important roles in the theory at hand. First, they are the subjects of properties or the items to which the properties are attached by instantiation or exemplification. Thus Alston:

We must ask concerning any situation involving this relation (e.g., a exemplifying [Greenness]) what the relata are. One of them is a universal. What is the other? It will obviously not do to reply—a grum (defined as an instance of [greenness]); for this would amount to saying that the relatum in question is that which stands in the instancing relation to [Greenness]; true enough but hardly enlightening. It still leaves open the question—what is it that stands in the instancing relation to [Greenness]? …the only alternative left appears to be a ‘bare’ particular, or what I prefer to call a substratum. Once we see the need for supplying an entity to which the universal involved bears the relation of being exemplified, we can see that only a bare particular would do the job. (1954: 255)

Second, bare particulars individuate. Consider two objects that are exactly alike in relevant respects (they are both royal blue, weigh 1kg, and so on); what could make them two and not one? What might explain their distinctness? Since they are exactly alike in relevant respects no appeal to differences in their property-like constituents (being royal blue, weighing 1 kg, and so on) would seem to do the trick. So, the bare particularists maintain, there must be non-property-like constituents by virtue of which they are distinct.[31]


According to hylomorphism, objects consist of matter and form (see entry on form vs. matter). Objects are comprised of various parts: electrons and upquarks, for example. In addition to these ordinary material parts, objects have rather special components or constituents—forms—property-like items that inform the matter of their host substance. Forms give objects structure and shape and are what make each object the kind of thing it is. Forms account for the character or nature of objects; they are property-like in that respect. Socrates, for example, is a human animal comprising form and matter; and Socrates is a human animal because he has a certain form as a constituent.

Hylomorphism may be thought of as a special case of or variation on the bare particular view. For on hylomorphism, an object has both a property-like constituent (in this case, form) that bears a special tie to non-property-like constituents (in this case, matter).[32]

3.2.2 Relational Ontologies

We turn now to relational ontologies. Constituent ontologies, recall, have it that objects have properties as parts or constituents. Relational ontologies accept that the extension of both object and property is not empty[33]—but for them, no object has any property as a part or constituent. Objects are, one might say with Armstrong, blobs (1989: 76–77). Most relational ontologists will be perfectly happy to say that objects have parts—it’s just that none of those parts are properties; they’re other objects.

Objects as blobs

In contrast to the constituent ontologies surveyed above, relational ontologies posit no internal structure to objects beyond ordinary mereological structure. Objects are not layer-cakes of thin particulars and properties (or layer-cakes of matter and form); they are blobs instead. Put this way, the blob view of objects has only negative content; it tells us what objects are not. It offers, then, a partial account of the nature of objects, and thus invites supplementation.[34]

We will now consider two relational ontologies and their implications for the theory of objects.


The Platonist view of properties is that they are transcendent universals. They exist independently, and are outside of space and time, unchanging, and causally inert. Clearly such things cannot be parts of ordinary material objects which are inside space and time, change, and participate in causal chains. But objects still are red, large, heavy, and the like—and this in virtue of standing in some relation to the transcendent universals. That relation is usually called exemplification or instantiation, and it is taken as primitive. But, importantly, it is external—objects are related to things outside of themselves—whereas the relation between object and property on constituent ontologies is internal.

So, while Platonism is primarily a view about the nature of properties, it has implications for the nature of objects. In particular, it entails that they don’t have properties as parts. As Armstrong puts the point:

It is interesting to notice that a separate-realm theory of universals permits of a blob as opposed to a layer-cake view of particulars. For on this view, what is it for a thing to have a property? It is not the thing’s having some internal feature, but rather its having a relationship, the instantiation relationship, to certain universals or Forms in another realm. The thing itself could be bloblike. (Armstrong 1989: 76–77)

As it turns out, Platonism is not the only account of properties that sits well with an unstructured or bloblike view of objects.

Class Nominalism

On class nominalism, properties are classes of things or classes of possible things. The property being green is the class of all green things, the property being wise is the class of all wise things, the relation is the sister of is the class of ordered pairs the first member of which is the sister of the second member, and so on. [35]

For an object to have (or exemplify, or instantiate, or whatever) a property, on this view, is for it to belong to a class of things. Class membership, like set membership, is an external relation; so class nominalism sits best with a blob view of objects. van Inwagen explains this connection as follows:

According to Lewis [a class nominalist], a property is a set of possible objects. (Something is a property if and only if it is a set all of whose members are possible objects.) The property of being a pig or porcinity, Lewis says, is simply the set of all possible pigs—a set far larger than the set of actual pigs. Consider an actual pig, Freddy. Freddy of course has porcinity. And what is this relation “having” that holds between the pig and the property? Why, simply set-membership. And the relation that a set of possibilia bears to its individual members is certainly not constituency. Freddy is no doubt in some sense a constituent of the set of all possible pigs—‘constituent’ is a very flexible word, and it is probably flexible enough to permit that application —, but there is no conceivable sense in which the set of all possible pigs is a constituent of Freddy. (2011: 392–393)


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Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Henry Laycock, author of the original SEP entry for ‘Object’; we learned much from his entry, especially his research into primary sources on the topic. Thanks also to Yale-NUS College (Bailey) and the Templeton Religion Trust (Rettler) for generous research support; the statements made in this entry are those of the author and are not necessarily endorsed by Yale-NUS College or the Templeton Religion Trust.

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Bradley Rettler <rettlerb@gmail.com>
Andrew M. Bailey <wrathius@gmail.com>

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