Moral Epistemology

First published Tue Feb 4, 2003; substantive revision Sun May 12, 2024

How is moral knowledge possible? This question is central in moral epistemology and marks a cluster of problems. The most important are the following.

  1. Sociological: The best explanation of the depth of moral disagreements and the social diversity that they reflect is one of two things. (a) No moral facts exist to be known, since moral disagreements exemplify merely clashes in moral sensibility rather than differences about matters of fact. (b) Moral knowledge exists, but moral facts are relative to the social group in which moral sensibility is formed with the result that no moral truths are known to hold universally.
  2. Psychological: Moral judgments are intrinsically motivating. Judgments about matters of fact, on the other hand, are never motivating just in themselves. Since to constitute moral knowledge a moral judgment must be made about some moral fact, moral knowledge is not possible.
  3. Ontological: Moral knowledge is about moral reality. How is that reality constituted? Three general possibilities present themselves. (a) Moral reality might be theological in nature, pertaining to (say) the will of God. (b) It might be a non-natural realm that is neither theological nor natural, but sui generis. (c) It might be comprehensible as a part of the natural world studied by science. Each of these possibilities, however, is beset with difficulties, and no viable fourth alternative has been conceived.
  4. Evolutionary: Where do human morals come from? A familiar and widely accepted answer is that human morals are in essence, despite their modern variations, Darwinian adaptations. As such morals are about survival and reproduction and have nothing to do with moral truth. Moreover, while the intuitive, emotional basis of moral judgments was useful to our ancestors, this basis is out-dated and unreliable in modern industrial society and thus current moral thought in such society, which inevitably embeds this basis, is without rational foundation.
  5. Methodological: Traditionally philosophers have sought to explain the possibility of knowledge by appeal to at least some principles that can be grasped and defended a priori and thus independently of natural science. A new and revolutionary epistemology introduced by Quine seeks to explain the possibility of knowledge through science itself. “Naturalized epistemology” has been immensely popular since its inception in the 1960s, largely because it promises to make epistemology consistent with a scientific world-view. At the same time the new methodology appears to make it more difficult to explain the possibility of moral knowledge. Two allied methodologies that seek to find moral truth in a reflective equilibrium of judgments or in applications of rational choice theory are much less restrictive but open to the objection that they are morally conservative. A recent methodology allied to naturalized epistemology is pragmatic naturalism. Taking its inspiration from examples of transforming the moral status quo, it is less vulnerable to the charge of moral conservatism. However, by understanding moral knowledge as mainly a matter of knowing how to live well interdependently with others by resolving issues collectively as they arise, this methodology may not offer a conception of moral truth appropriate to genuine moral knowledge.
  6. Moral: Feminists among others are often critical of traditional epistemologies as well as the innovative recent methodologies on the moral ground that the standards found there are unjustly biased against women and other marginalized groups. For example, feminists often reject the standard of impartiality contained in these forms of epistemology because it renders invisible important knowledge possessed by women and thereby contributes to their oppression. If, for reasons to be given, the criticism has merit, then it presents an apparent paradox within feminist moral epistemology, since it appears to reject the ideal of impartiality on the ground that it is not itself impartial. The Marxist complaint that the standard of impartiality is unjustly biased against the working class because it renders invisible their exploitation gives rise to the same contradiction. Resolution of the paradox is important for both evaluating such criticisms and understanding in general how to evaluate moral criticisms of epistemic standards.

Arguably, these issues, as central and broad as they are, do not cover all of moral epistemology. To keep the subject manageable, this entry is limited in the following five ways.

First, the entry ignores global skepticism, which doubts the possibility of anyone’s having any knowledge at all. Thus, it ignores the threat of an unstoppable regress in justifications and Cartesian evil demon scenarios. Nor does it take up the debates between foundationalists and coherentists about the structure of justification. These issues (with an exception to be noted) do not raise problems special to moral epistemology. But see the entry for Moral Skepticism.

Second, in keeping with the last restriction, the entry takes for granted that our capacity to have other kinds of knowledge is not in question. Indeed, the six problems above arise in part because of the implications of having other kinds of knowledge.

Third, the entry assumes that moral knowledge entails (roughly) justified true moral belief. This assumption commits me to the position that moral knowledge is incompatible with non-cognitivism (the view that moral claims lack cognitive value, such as truth-value). A non-cognitivist, however, may seek to explain how the attitudes or prescriptions expressed in moral claims are justified. (See Hare 1981, Campbell 1985, Gibbard 1990, and Blackburn 1998 for theories of moral justification compatible with non-cognitivism and the entry on moral skepticism for a discussion of moral justification in general.) Indeed, an expressivist may invoke a deflationary conception of truth to support the idea that we can speak of justified moral beliefs that are “true” — without implying that justified moral beliefs accurately represent moral reality. Moral justification is discussed below, however, only as it pertains to putatively reliable representations of moral reality.

Fourth, many important epistemological issues arise in the context of considering specific normative theories or types of normative theory. (Can virtue ethics explain how we can know what course of action is morally acceptable for a situation demanding the exercise of conflicting virtues?) The focus in this entry is on issues that are special to moral epistemology but not tied to a particular type of normative theory. The feminist criticism cited, though it arises from specific normative concerns, is no exception, since it raises general worries about how moral knowledge is possible.

Fifth, the discussion of the history of moral epistemology is limited to philosophers, such as Kant and Hume, who have had the most to say about these issues and whose responses have been most influential. Other historical positions and additional analysis of the possibility of a priori moral knowledge will be covered in other SEP entries.

My plan is to examine in turn each of the six clusters of challenges to the possibility of moral knowledge in Sections 1–6 and then, in Sections 7–10, to reflect on the underlying assumption that moral knowledge consists in the justified true moral belief of a single individual.

1. Sociological: Moral Disagreement and Social Diversity

People disagree about all kinds of things, from whether any milk is left in the refrigerator to whether there is global warming. Some of these disagreements are easily settled; others take a long time, even a hundred years or more, to reach resolution. Moral disagreement is no exception. That disagreement exists regarding moral questions is a sociological fact that is beyond question. Moral disagreements, however, appear to be particularly recalcitrant to resolution. Take the morality of euthanasia or that of capital punishment. Each has been a subject of moral disagreement for a long time. Moreover, it appears that people often disagree even when they agree on non-moral facts. People can, for example, disagree about whether capital punishment is ever morally justified, even when they agree that it has no general deterrence value, because one party believes it is a punishment that “fits” certain crimes, no matter what its other consequences may be.

It would be a mistake to exaggerate the extent of moral disagreement. There is considerable psychological and anthropological evidence that a small number of core moral values are espoused universally, such as: benevolence (avoiding harm to others and offering aid when the costs are not high); fairness (reciprocating help and sharing goods); loyalty (especially to family and community); respect for authority (of one’s parents and community leaders, when it is exercised responsibly); personal purity in body and mind (notably as it reflects moral character); and freedom (especially from oppressive control by others). See Haidt 2012; Haidt & Joseph 2004. Thus, when there is no conflict in moral values, as in Peter Singer’s famous example of rescuing a toddler from drowning in a shallow pond by wading into it and ruining one’s new suit, there is universal agreement about what a person ought to do across all cultures (Singer 1972).

Nevertheless, these values are often interpreted and applied differently not only across cultures but also across time within roughly the same cultures. For instance, until recently the dominant view in the United States and Europe has been that homosexuality is a morally impure state but now the dominant view is that gay sex is not inherently morally impure or unacceptable. What accounts for this change? Moreover, the core moral values can conflict, as when loyalty to family or religious authority demands that one not show benevolence toward a despised outsider. What if the toddler to be rescued is from the wrong tribe? Or take the extreme divide separating the politically left and right over issues of freedom and fairness. Though each side espouses the core values listed, they interpret them differently and give them different priorities in cases of moral conflict. It is far from clear how these kinds of moral disputes can ever be resolved.

These considerations lead to the following worry. If it is a sociological fact that moral disagreements are generally more recalcitrant to resolution than disputes which do not involve differences about moral value — as I will assume for the sake of argument — what explains this fact? A possible explanation is that there is no fact of the matter about whether the practice in question is morally right. People agree or disagree in their moral attitudes, but there are no moral truths about which they can be mistaken. Hence, nothing about which they have conflicting attitudes is or can be a proper object of knowledge. In short, moral disagreements often resist resolution, however intelligent, informed, and respectful the disputants may be, because moral knowledge is impossible.

The style of argument here is that of inference to the best explanation (Harman 1965). Even if the sociological premise is granted, the conclusion is not guaranteed to be true. Rather we have reason to believe the conclusion, assuming the premise is true, provided that no other explanation better accounts for the truth of the premise. This style of argument can be successful when no other explanation can account for the truth of the premise. It may seem, however, that there are plausible alternative explanations that are compatible with the possibility of moral knowledge. Two main kinds of explanation are particularly salient.

One explanation arises from cases of moral disagreement where the prospects of resolution appear most remote. When the disputants are from different cultures and their disagreement reflects a divergence in values between the cultures in which the disputants were raised, there may appear to be insufficient common ground on which to effect a resolution. A moral relativist can explain this commonplace observation with a theory of moral knowledge. A moral relativist can say that the lack of resolution is to be explained by the fact that the moral knowledge expressed by each disputant is relative to the culture in which the person learned his or her values. Thus, when someone from a culture in which women must veil their faces in public defends this practice as morally appropriate and indeed required, the relativist would interpret the defense as expressing knowledge of what is acceptable and not acceptable in his or her culture. Similarly, when the person coming from a culture in which the practice is not appropriate or required disagrees, he or she is simply expressing knowledge of what is acceptable morally in his or her culture. Each has moral knowledge, despite the clash in their opinions, but their knowledge has to be understood relative to the culture in which the knowledge has its roots.

The brief description of moral relativism just given belies the immense variety of forms in which it can be stated. Moral relativism can be formulated to take account of differences in moral outlook between different people within the same society to explain the difficulty of reaching resolution when the general culture of the disputants is the same. It can also be formulated to avoid reference to an overarching non-relative moral claim and to allow criticism of one’s own culture. (See Harman 1975, 1978, and 1985; Lyons 1976; Wong 1984; Wiggins 1988; Sayre-McCord 1991; Braybrooke et al. 1995; Copp 1995.) Nevertheless, can any view that makes moral truth relative to culture or personal point of view save the possibility of moral knowledge? An objection to relativism made famous by G. E. Moore is telling in the present context (Moore 1912). If the meaning of the claims were as described, so that each disputant would be saying something true or possibly true of his or her own culture (or point of view), there would be the notable logical consequence that they would not be disagreeing with each other. Rather they would be talking about different things. Moore takes it to be obvious that real disputants would be disagreeing, since each claim should be taken to be the contradictory of the other. Hence, since relativism implies that no moral disagreement exists in this case, he rejects moral relativism as being unable to account for the fact of moral disagreement.

As a general objection to moral relativism, the objection is unsuccessful, since it is possible to formulate moral relativism without the assumption that moral judgments express true or false claims. Thus, Charles Stevenson, who takes them to be expressions of attitude, holds that people can disagree in attitude even if their moral views have no truth-value and cannot be logically inconsistent in the sense that Moore intended (Stevenson 1944 and 1963). The objection is successful, however, against the attempt to save the possibility of moral knowledge by interpreting the moral claims as being true or false claims about different cultures or points of view. If each disputant, in taking issue with the other, is disagreeing about what is true, then the disputants cannot be making claims about different things and hence cannot have knowledge of the kind the moral relativist supposes. If they did, neither could be disagreeing about the truth of the other’s moral claim. In the next section we will return to the position that moral claims are merely expressions of attitude, a position consistent with the fact of moral disagreement. For now we should concede that moral relativism does not offer a satisfactory explanation of how moral knowledge is possible in cases of radical moral disagreement between people of different cultures of subcultures.

Is there another way we might explain the fact of moral disagreement without conceding the impossibility of moral knowledge? Any theory that implies that moral knowledge is possible must face this question, but in general a range of considerations is available that might provide an alternative explanation depending on the nature of the disagreement. They divide into three kinds: (a) disagreements about non-moral facts, (b) factors that distort judgment, and (c) disagreements about certain complex empirical facts that are also moral facts. In the first category are disagreements about religious facts, such as whether God exists. We will consider below the relevance of theology to moral epistemology. For the present it is sufficient to note that people with deep moral disagreements, say regarding abortion, euthanasia, and capital punishment, may have different religious views. To the extent that these can be considered non-moral views, for example, that God’s will is unambiguously expressed in the Bible, these differences may be able to explain the moral disagreement. Moreover, if it is possible to know whether these non-moral views are true, then we may be able explain moral disagreement without conceding the impossibility of moral knowledge. Other kinds of disagreements also fall into category (a). People with different moral outlooks frequently disagree about the psychological nature of humans and other animals or about large-scale economic and social theories relevant to assessing the consequences of economic and social policy. Disagreements about these difficult non-moral questions, assuming that these are issues about which objective knowledge is possible, could explain the absence of moral agreement. Unless these explanations can be eliminated, the inference from persistent moral disagreement to the impossibility of moral knowledge is on shaky ground. In category (b) we can place such things as having personal bias because of the implications of the issue at hand, being in the grip of a social ideology, and feeling abnormally depressed or fearful. A person, for example, who faces the death penalty for a crime, or someone who has strong feelings of vengeance, may not be able to form an objective view of the morality of capital punishment. Again we have a possible alternative way to explain moral disagreement. Finally, in category (c), if moral facts are extremely complex empirical facts (see the discussion of moral naturalism below), it is possible for moral disagreement to persist for the same reason that disagreement over complex scientific questions can persist.(For further discussion regarding moral disagreement see Miller 1992. For recent empirical work suggesting that moral disagreement cannot be explained away by one of the above means, see Doris and Plakias 2008.)

Although the possibility of these alternative explanations does not establish that moral knowledge is possible, anyone arguing to the opposite conclusion by inference to the best explanation needs to make a plausible case that they can all be eliminated. Moreover, as defenders of moral knowledge point out, unless such a case is made out, the default position should be that we know some moral truths. Defenders note that moral language is formulated as if moral claims can be true and that we worry about whether to believe certain moral claims just as if truth is at stake. When challenged we appeal to evidence just as we do in the instance of straightforwardly factual claims, and we make logical inferences that conform to logical systems based on claims having truth-values. Though these points are not decisive, they underline the importance of eliminating alternative explanations of moral disagreement before concluding that moral knowledge is impossible.

2. Psychological: Moral Motivation

An argument of David Hume provides a more direct threat to the possibility of moral knowledge based on the fact that morals excite our passions and motivate us to act. If morals are based on reason so that they consist in true or false ideas, they would have to be in themselves incapable of having this direct influence on our actions (Hume, Treatise, Book III, Part I, Section I, Paragraph 6.) As he famously said, it is not contrary to reason to prefer the destruction of the whole world to the scratching of a finger (Book II, Part III, Section III, Paragraph 6). The argument can be rendered for our purposes as a valid deductive argument from three premises: (1) If moral knowledge is possible, then some moral judgments are beliefs. (2) Our moral judgments by themselves necessarily give us some motivation to act, even without the accompaniment of already existing desires. (3) A belief by itself, unaided by already existing desires, can never give us any motivation to act. Therefore, moral judgments are not beliefs. Therefore, moral knowledge is impossible. Since the argument is manifestly valid in form, we need to examine the premises to see if we should be persuaded.

Premise (1) appears to follow directly from the nature of knowledge. If one knows that something is the case, then one must have some belief or judgment about it and what one believes must truly be the case. If one doesn’t have any opinion about it or if one’s opinion about it is not true, then one doesn’t know it. To say this much, of course, is not to say that true opinion is sufficient for knowledge, but that one’s judgment is true has seemed to many philosophers to be a minimally necessary condition for knowledge. Premise (2) states what many take to be a minimally necessary condition for something to be a moral judgment. If one claims that something is morally wrong, for example, but one feels no disinclination to do it or to persuade others not to do it, then either one is being insincere or else one is not really making a moral claim. Notice that the premise does not imply that one must act in accordance with the motivation felt. One can be overcome by temptation or fear or have some other counterbalancing motivation that leads one not to act in accordance with one’s moral claim. The premise says only that some motivation to act must exist. This view, called “internalism”, entails that it is a logical or conceptual truth that some degree of motivation is internal to the moral judgment itself. Finally, premise (3), sometimes called “Hume’s dictum”, is the view that judgments of fact, apart from desires that might accompany them, do not move us in any way. This view follows from the widely held understanding of motivation as consisting of two kinds of mental state: belief and desire (Davidson 1963 and 2001). Without a belief to guide it, desire is blind. A desire for food will, for example, not move one to eat unless one has identified something that one believes is food. On the other hand, believing that food is before one won’t move one to eat, even in the slightest, if one has no desire at all to eat. In sum, each premise has at least an initial plausibility. In fact, however, the literature contains objections to each one. Let us turn to the objections, taking the premises in reverse order.

Those who attack the third premise (but accept the other two premises) see moral judgments as having the cognitive content of a true or false judgment of fact and still being able to motivate the persons making the judgment, independently of their antecedent desires. To judge an action to be morally wrong, on their view, is to form a true (or false) belief about a (supposed) moral fact. It is also to be motivated to some degree to act on the basis of this judgment, not because of some antecedent desire, but just because of the belief that the action is wrong. Those who take this position sometimes allow that motivation involves desire (for example, not to do the act). Thus they can accept the general view of motivation as involving both belief and desire, but they hold that the desire in this case arises purely from the belief that the act is wrong. It is the moral belief itself that accounts for the desire—and hence the motivation—without the support of any desire that is already existing. They would claim, moreover, that this picture comports well with the way moral demands are perceived. We see something is wrong, even though we may have wanted to do it before this point, and then we find ourselves wanting not to do it because we see it as wrong. (See, for example, McNaughton 1988, Dancy 1993, Smith 1994, Little 1997.)

Premise (3) may not be so easily refuted. It derives support not just from the view that motivation requires both belief and desire, but also from a basic distinction made by Elizabeth Anscombe about the different tasks performed by the states of belief and desire. Anscombe asks us to think of a list of groceries that might serve either as an inventory of the food in a grocery store or as a shopping list (Anscombe 1963). In the first case it merely describes, truly or falsely, what is in the store. If it is a good inventory, the list conforms to the items of food in the store. In the second case the list remains a good shopping list even if the items are not in the shop; in this case it is the store, not the list, that needs to change. Beliefs are like inventories; desires are like shopping lists. They have different and opposite “direction of fit.” We want our beliefs to fit the world and to change when they don’t. But we want the world to fit our desires and to change when it doesn’t. In light of this distinction, it may seem that to reject premise (3) for the reasons given is to suppose that moral judgments necessarily have both directions of fit simultaneously. Is this view of moral judgment coherent? In the case of lack of fit between the moral judgment and the moral facts, the view seems to imply that the moral judgment should change and not change. (For more on direction of fit, see Smith 1987 and Copp and Sobel 2001.)

The matter does not rest here, however. The critic of premise (3) can point out that moral beliefs are unlike grocery inventories, since the part of the world that they are designed to fit is the part that tells us how we ought to be morally, rather than the part that tells how we are non-morally. Therefore, the moral reality that a moral judgment is designed to fit is distinct from the non-moral part of the world (our behavior) that may need to change in order to fit the moral judgment. Both directions of fit apply, in other words, but they relate moral beliefs to different parts or aspects of reality, moral in one case and non-moral in the other. Contradiction is thus avoided. Nevertheless, if moral judgments have both directions of fit in the manner suggested, then there must be moral facts that are inherently prescriptive, demanding that we change ourselves to conform to them. Such facts would be ontologically strange, as John Mackie has noted, very unlike anything studied in science (Mackie 1977). The critic of premise (3) may, however, be prepared to live with this result. (We will take up this ontological issue in the next section.) What may be more difficult to live with is rejection of recent results in neuroscience. Timothy Schroeder (2004) argues that, except for its content, moral motivation is not different in its neurobiological basis from other kinds of deliberative motivation. In particular, moral representations of right and wrong move us through projections on the orbitofrontal cortex in the same way that representations of favorite foods move us. That is, they do not move us directly through projections on our motor centers independently of our desire for the things represented (as is the case with behavioral tics).

Let us turn now to premise (2). A critic of internalism can allow that moral beliefs are normally associated with some desire to conform to them but would deny that the link between belief and desire in such cases is anything more than contingent. To take a simple example to convey the general idea, imagine a utilitarian interpretation of the content of moral judgments. Suppose, that is, that to judge that an act is wrong is to imply that the act leads to a lower net balance of happiness over unhappiness (summed over everyone affected) than some alternative act would. It is possible from an externalist perspective to judge an act wrong but feel no disinclination to perform it. This result might obtain even if the act leads to horrible suffering on the part of everyone else and the person who makes the judgment is fully aware of this fact and of the content of the judgment. Such cases are admittedly pathological, but the point is that they are at least logically possible contrary to premise (2). Normally, people aren’t like that. In fact, an externalist can argue that most people are socialized so that they have some feeling for the feelings of others. For this reason they will feel some motivation to act in accord with their moral judgments on a utilitarian interpretation of their content. The connection between the content of the judgment and the motivation, however, is external, in the sense that the connection is mediated by the contingent fact that people are normally socialized to care to some degree about others (Brink 1989).

The internalists can make at least two kinds of reply. First of all, while they will concede the existence of people who feel no motivation to do what they say they “ought” to do, they can deny that these people have made genuine moral judgments. There is a manner of speaking in which we can say that something is wrong but mean only that this is what is considered wrong around here or in the culture under discussion. The trouble is that disputes over whether the examples in question are cases of genuine moral judgment can easily degenerate into exercises in stipulative definition and the trading of intuitions tutored by divergent theories. It is moot whether anything can settle this matter (Fenske 1997). A more promising line of reply is to point out that the externalist’s theory of moral motivation does not sit comfortably with the way we learn to receive moral criticism and make moral judgments. From an early age we learn to respond to moral judgments made by our elders and to form them ourselves through learning how to respond emotionally to various morally important situations. We learn to feel badly about types of things judged by others to be wrong, like being unkind or dishonest, and then express negative attitudes toward these things when we make moral judgments ourselves. In these cases it would appear that the disinclination to do what is wrong and the inclination to discourage others from doing it are not mediated by an appreciation of the abstract content of the judgment and its bearing on things that we independently find displeasing. The tie between moral judgment and motivation appears to be direct, much like that suggested by the internalist.

We can see another way to view this problem by moving to an assessment of premise (1). This premise presupposes that if someone has moral knowledge, then this person makes a moral judgment the content of which is a true proposition. It appears, then, that the premise presupposes that the moral judgment in such cases is a moral belief rather than a desire or an emotion or something else that cannot be literally true. This position has indeed been the view of the internalists who reject premise (3) but accept premises (1) and (2). They agree that the moral judgment leads directly to a desire, but they maintain that it is in its content simply a belief. Should the critics of this argument accept this presupposition? Here is an important reason to question it.

We can view “belief” and “desire” as distinct functional descriptions that tell us how mental states falling under one label or the other work in interaction with other mental states and issue in behavior. The previous talk of directions of fit can be taken to illustrate these distinct functions. We might then think of a moral judgment as a complex mental state that normally exemplifies both functions (Campbell 1998 and 2007). Moral judgment might be thought of as a natural kind in which the two functions comprise a homeostatic unity (Kumar 2015). In its primitive form moral judgment might have functioned simply to motivate conformity to norms learned in early socialization, accounting for the apparent direct association of moral judgments with motivation. It might later have evolved to take on higher cognitive functions that incline many people to think of it as a moral belief. On this view it is normally both, contrary to the presupposition that moral judgments are essentially beliefs. As such, moral judgments would not be disbarred from exemplifying moral knowledge. At the same time the position would not run afoul of Hume’s dictum. In fact, it would be a kind of externalism, allowing that in abnormal cases one function or the other would not be present. For example, if one is raised to believe that gay sex is wrong, one may at first continue to feel one’s former emotions and motivations in this regard even after forming the considered belief that gay sex is not wrong. Or one may judge something not to be wrong but feel deep resentment or indignation, say when one is a woman who is unfairly passed over for a promotion but one does not believe at first that one has been treated unfairly. In this case one’s emotional and motivational response, if it is sustained and leads one to form a new belief, that one has been treated unfairly, may constitute a negative moral judgment, even before the change in belief. (We return to this example in 4.3 and 4.4 below.) Although these few remarks hardly demonstrate the viability of this hybrid view, anyone defending premise (1) on the assumption that moral judgments are essentially beliefs needs to consider this alternative and rule it out.

The hybrid conception of moral judgment is not inconsistent with premise (1), if we are prepared to interpret it as implying only that for moral knowledge to be possible moral judgments are sometimes (true) beliefs, not that they are always nothing but beliefs. Recall premise (1): If moral knowledge is possible, then our moral judgments are beliefs. If moral judgments are normally combinations of belief, emotion, and motivation, but are sometimes just beliefs and sometimes just emotional and motivational responses, then it is possible to accept premises (1), (2), and (3) and the possibility of moral knowledge. The reason is that one can accept that moral judgments can be true, without either denying that moral judgments normally motivate directly or implying that moral beliefs sometimes motivate directly independently of antecedent desires. This hybrid conception must be distinguished from internalist theories that construe moral judgments as “besires” (things that are necessarily beliefs and desires—see Altham 1987). Unlike these theories the above hybrid conception allows these elements to separate, as in the examples of changing one’s moral judgment about gay sex or a failed promotion. It must also be distinguished from theories that allow that moral judgments have both functions but give priority to either the belief side (Copp 2001) or the expressive side (Ridge 2006). The first variety would deny that responses that are emotional and motivational but are not beliefs could be moral judgments, however moral in character those responses might be. The second would deny that responses that are only beliefs could be moral judgments in themselves. Which hybrid theory of moral judgment is preferable, if any, is a matter of controversy.

3. Ontological: Moral Facts and Moral Naturalism

The most direct challenge to moral knowledge is to question whether anything exists that could possibly serve as a suitable object of such knowledge. If no conception of what moral reality would have to be like fits our understanding of the kinds of things that exist, then moral knowledge is not possible. In general, the candidates for possible objects of moral knowledge divide into three categories: natural (objects that are knowable only through experience), non-natural (but not supernatural), and theological (or supernatural). We will assess reasons for thinking that none of these categories provide suitable objects of moral knowledge, treating them in reverse order.

3.1 Theological Facts

An ancient view still popular today is that moral knowledge must ultimately be based on the will or commandments of the Creator. This view faces two major problems. First, there is the obvious difficulty that skepticism about God’s existence is at least as difficult to lay to rest as skepticism about moral knowledge. Since arguments for and against the existence of God are assessed elsewhere in this Encyclopedia, I will not stop to rehearse them here. Second, there is the further difficulty that even if we are confident about God’s existence, it is not clear how we can interpret the will or commandments of God without first having moral knowledge, thus making this reply to the skeptic question-begging.

The latter problem arises from a dilemma posed in Plato’s Euthyphro. In this dialogue Euthyphro tries to explain to Socrates that piety is what the gods love. Socrates then asks Euthyphro whether the gods love the pious because they are good or whether the pious are good because the gods love them. To put the dilemma in terms relevant to the present context, consider the view that genocide is wrong because it is contrary to God’s will. (The argument doesn’t change if we talk about commandments or love instead of will.) We can ask of this view whether God forbids genocide because it is wrong, or whether it is wrong because God forbids it. In the latter case God’s will appears to be arbitrary or at least not based on an appropriate moral reason. For believers who regard God as supremely moral, the latter possibility would be unacceptable. In the former case, however, God’s will would be based on the wrongness of genocide, conceived as being separate from and logically prior to the concept of God’s will. Hence, in this case the appeal to God’s will does not provide an answer to the skeptic, but rather presupposes that we already have an answer. In sum, unless we are prepared to suppose that what God wills, loves, or commands has no moral basis, the attempt to base the possibility of moral knowledge on knowledge of God’s will or love or commandments is, like Euthyphro’s explanation of piety, viciously circular. (For discussion of other versions of the objection, see Chandler 1984 and Westmoreland 1996. Also see the entry on theological voluntarism.)

3.2 Non-natural Facts

One might suppose that the obvious alternative is to think of moral reality as embedded in the natural world as opposed to the supernatural. However, for reasons that we will turn to shortly, many philosophers have strongly resisted this option and have proposed that moral knowledge has its basis in non-natural aspects of the world that can be apprehended only through a faculty of moral intuition or reason that is independent of sense experience. Moral reality, so conceived, is posited as sui generis, reducible to neither the natural nor the supernatural and requiring a mode of apprehension comparable to mathematical intuition.

An immense variety of views fall within this category. At one extreme is the idea that we can apprehend a priori a general principle from which we can derive particular moral claims using non-moral facts as minor premises. According to Henry Sidgwick (Sidgwick, The Methods of Ethics, 1907), we know a priori several self-evident axioms that are objectively true, including axioms of benevolence and justice, and that lead together to the conclusion that each of us ought to do what will bring about the best consequences when their value is known by the ratio of pleasure over pain in them viewed impartially. (See de Lazari-Radek & Singer, 2014, for an up-to-date exposition and defense of Sidgwick’s famous work in light of current issues in moral philosophy and Sidgwick’s struggle to do justice to Egoism.) Sidgwick’s ethical theory, a form of utilitarianism, contrasts with Kant’s deontological theory, according to which we know, again a priori, that we ought to treat each person as an end, never merely as a means (Kant, Groundwork of the Metaphysic of Morals, 1785). Both imply specific moral conclusions, such as that a given promise ought to be kept, once we understand what is involved in breaking and keeping the promise, either regarding their consequences (Sidgwick) or regarding what is entailed in the will to do either act (Kant). The important point is that the derivations depend on assuming as a premise something that can be known only a priori.

At the other extreme are forms of moral particularism, according to which one directly intuits the moral rightness or wrongness of an act once one has understood its particular natural features (see the entries on intuitionism in ethics and moral particularism). As in the previous case it is necessary to comprehend the non-moral features of the situation before a specific moral judgment can be made and known to be true. In making this judgment, however, one must rely not merely on knowledge of these non-moral features but on one’s ability to intuit the moral significance of these features. The difference between the cases is only that in the first we appeal to a general principle, while in the second we intuit the moral truth directly. In both, moral intuition is essential to arriving at moral knowledge. W. D. Ross provides an example of a mixed form of moral intuitionism (Ross 1930). On his theory we have an intuitive grasp of principles that tell us what we ought to do “other things being equal” (e.g., one ought to be kind, other things being equal). Then we must use moral intuition again to decide in a given case, which may involve conflicting principles, what action we ought to perform, all things considered.

One concern about all forms of moral intuitionism is the fact that people can continue to disagree about the moral facts when they appear to agree on the non-moral facts. If we all possess the same faculty of moral intuition, should such disagreement be possible at all? But the moral intuitionist can counter this objection in the way suggested earlier when we considered the argument against the possibility of moral knowledge based on disagreement. There are too many other factors that may explain disagreement without giving up the assumption that we share a faculty of moral intuition. Another concern is that we learn what is right and wrong initially from examples and advice of our elders. Isn’t this fact about moral development inconsistent with the idea that morals are based ultimately on a priori intuition? It appears not. We begin to learn mathematics in a similar way, using concrete examples and relying on authority. Then, as we develop understanding, we are eventually able to grasp relevant truths, such as that 2 + 2 = 4, in a way that is not dependent on the vagaries of experience. If we put two oranges in a hat and then add two more and subsequently find five there, we assume an extra one was there to begin with or that it is a trick hat or that the oranges can mysteriously reproduce themselves. We don’t doubt that 2 + 2 = 4. Similarly, it may be argued, once we grasp the wrongness of treating another person merely as a means, finding many examples of this treatment or many people who think the treatment is right won’t in the least alter, or even seem relevant to, our perception of its wrongness. (See, however, Sinnott-Armstrong 1988, and the reply by Shafer-Landau 1988.)

A less superficial objection is that it is possible to explain both the origin and usefulness of our moral perceptions without supposing that any non-natural moral realm exists as an object of moral knowledge. This objection is similar to the last in that it emphasizes our dependence on examples and authority in acquiring moral perceptions that are stable once the relevant non-moral facts are at hand, but the claim is not that this dependence is inconsistent with the existence of a non-natural moral reality. Rather the claim is that postulating the latter reality is unnecessary to comprehending all the facts about moral development and the social usefulness of moral codes. We don’t need to assume such a reality in order to explain all that is beyond doubt and hence don’t need to postulate a faculty of moral intuition of any of the kinds just canvassed. Moral intuition and the moral knowledge it is presumed to make possible are redundant hypotheses that we can safely discard. It is largely this dismissal of moral intuitionism that has given rise in the second half of the last century to moral naturalism as the dominant moral theory among those who continue to believe that moral knowledge is possible. (For further discussion see the entry on moral non-naturalism.)

3.3 Natural Facts

Moral naturalism (as a form of cognitivism) maintains that, while a distinction can be drawn between moral facts and other kinds of facts, moral facts are among the natural facts of the world. An advantage of this position for explaining the possibility of moral knowledge is that nearly everyone who rejects global skepticism grants that knowledge of natural facts is possible. The moral naturalist, therefore, is in a position to argue that moral knowledge should not be more problematic than other kinds of knowledge of the natural world. A moral naturalist can, moreover, reply to the charge that moral facts are redundant for explaining the facts of the natural world by pointing out that the burden of proof is on the critic to demonstrate that those natural facts that are also moral facts have no explanatory power. Certainly they cannot be said to lack explanatory power for the reason that they are not part of the natural world. Nor can they be said to be inaccessible to empirical study, since as part of the natural world they are knowable through experience (Copp 1995, p. 27).

3.3.1 Identity, supervenience, and redundancy

It is important, however, to distinguish in this regard between two different kinds of moral naturalism. One kind maintains that moral properties are identical with certain natural properties specified by combinations of non-moral terms found in the natural and social sciences (Brandt 1979, Railton 1986, Copp 1995). To take an oversimplified example, suppose that the property of being a wrong act is identical with the property of having as a consequence a lower quotient of pleasure over pain for all affected by the act than an alternative act would. Here a moral property of being a wrong act is held to be one and the same property as a complex utilitarian property specified in the non-moral terms of consequence, pleasure, and pain. Given this identity, an act having this moral property cannot be less open to empirical study nor can it have less explanatory power than an act’s having the property of not maximizing pleasure over pain. For instance, if a group avoids a certain kind of action, the correct explanation, given the identity and the role of pleasure and pain in learning, could be that this kind of act is wrong. Whether it is or not would be an empirical question.

The situation is more complex, however, for the other form of moral naturalism. It maintains that moral facts are natural facts but denies that they are specifiable using the language of the natural and social sciences (Kim 1978, Sturgeon 1985, Brink 1989). Moral facts are said to be natural facts in that they are discoverable empirically and provide causal explanations of events in the natural world. At the same time, they are a unique category that defies identification in non-moral terms. As such, they raise again the issue of redundancy. Do we really need this special category of natural facts in order to understand the natural world? In this view some natural facts are supposed to supervene on others. That is to say, moral facts are dependent on distinct natural facts specifiable in non-moral terms in the following way: if the moral facts were otherwise, necessarily the distinct non-moral facts on which they depend would have to be different. Take a deliberate act of cruelty done just for fun. This act is wrong in virtue of being a deliberate act of cruelty done just for fun. The fact that it is a wrong act and the fact that it is deliberately cruel done for fun are distinct facts, but the first depends on the second. Necessarily, if what was done had not been wrong, it would not have been a deliberate act of cruelty done for fun. Once this relation of supervenience is recognized, it is possible to defend the non-redundancy of moral facts by pointing out parallel relations of supervenience in the non-moral natural world and arguing that the redundancy objection proves too much, asking us to reject other non-moral categories that appear ontologically sound. For example, genetic facts obtaining at the cellular level are said to supervene on genetic facts at the molecular level without one being simply identical with the other (Kitcher 1984), yet it would be absurd from a scientific perspective to deny the existence of facts at the cellular level. Whether this defense is ultimately successful remains to be seen, but at the present time it is far from clear that either form of naturalism can be rejected on grounds of redundancy (Sayre-McCord 1988).

3.3.2 Reasoning from experience?

We began with an objection to moral naturalism that applies as well to moral non-naturalism, noting that the former is in a better position to meet it. Let us now direct our attention to an important objection that applies specifically to moral naturalism. Kant argues (Groundwork of the Metaphysic of Morals, Chapter 2, paragraph five) that moral knowledge cannot be based on experience of the natural world. We might interpret one of his arguments as having the following structure. (a) If we have moral knowledge at all, we must know a general moral truth from which we can deduce specific conclusions. But (b) we could know this general truth on the basis of experience only by generalizing from examples of right and wrong that we encounter in experience. Consider then, as a specific example, an act of deliberate cruelty done for fun. How would we know that this is a wrong act or a right act? We must infer it from a general moral truth, according to (a), but to explain how we know a general moral truth, we must, given (b), experience specific examples of right and wrong, and now we are back where we began. To avoid this circle, we must assume that we know a priori that some act or kind of act is wrong. In general, it follows that no moral knowledge is based solely on experience. Moral naturalism cannot, therefore, provide an appropriate ontology for moral knowledge.

Kant’s argument is particularly powerful because the assumptions on which it is built are fairly weak, indeed much weaker than they might at first appear to be. At times Kant argues that moral knowledge cannot be based on experience because it requires knowledge of absolutely universal truths that transcend all earthly experience, but this argument does not need that strong assumption. In fact, the argument would work even if (contrary to Kant) the most basic moral principle has many exceptions and is true only some of the time. Arguably we would still need to appeal to examples if we are to learn from experience when the principle applies and when it doesn’t, and then we would need some way to determine the moral status of the examples. But, again, it would be question begging to assume that knowledge of their moral status comes from experience rather than a priori, since the possibility of this is what is at issue.

The essence of the argument can be put in more general terms. Both forms of moral naturalism entail that facts that are specifiable in non-moral terms determine the moral facts, where the determination involves either identity or else supervenience without identity. But which moral facts do they determine? Most philosophers will grant that natural facts (or properties) that are specifiable non-morally can be experienced. The problem is in making the step from the latter kind of fact to a moral fact just to establish the moral fact in even one example. Appeal to experience, it may seem, cannot completely account for this step without circularity.

A difficulty for the argument, however, is that it turns on a narrow conception of reasoning from experience. The argument assumes that reasoning from experience must begin with clear cases of knowledge, at least regarding the things observed in experience, and then infer more general knowledge. This way of thinking about empirical reasoning has a long tradition and was dominant among empiricist philosophers in the first half of the twentieth century. In the second half, thinking about reasoning in science changed dramatically. One prominent alternative view is that general hypotheses offer explanations of experience, and that we reason from experience by inferring the best explanation of our data against a background of theoretical assumptions that are subject to tests on other occasions and in other contexts. Two important differences are that we don’t begin with firm knowledge and, second, that we rely on background information to determine the best explanation. The relevance for moral knowledge is clear enough. We can begin with mere moral beliefs and feelings (rather than moral knowledge) yet reason to a conclusion implying moral knowledge if the conclusion provides the best explanation of the beliefs and feelings (Sturgeon 1985). Since the starting points are not assumed to be cases of moral knowledge, the problem of circularity does not arise in the way implied by the above argument. Whether the background information contains moral knowledge is a further issue (to be taken up in section 5), but nothing in this alternative conception of reasoning from experience necessitates that the reasoning assumes moral knowledge. Unless this alternative conception can be eliminated, the Kantian argument is at best inconclusive.

3.3.3 The naturalistic fallacy and the open question argument

The last suggestion turns on a step in reasoning that moves from facts that can be specified non-morally and are taken on all sides to be open to empirical study to moral facts. This step has been claimed by numerous philosophers to be a fallacious step in deductive reasoning. Some of these philosophers hold that the moral claims are not true or false and hence cannot express moral knowledge (Ayer 1946, Stevenson 1944 and 1963, Hare 1952 and 1981, Gibbard 1990, Blackburn 1984 and1998). Others, such as Kant and G. E. Moore, hold that moral knowledge is possible but not deducible from experience of the natural world. Moore’s argument, however, is worth considering in its own right, since it has had significant influence since he first articulated it in 1903 and differs from Kant’s. For Moore, what would have to be the case to allow the reasoning to go through would be the identity of a moral property with a property specifiable in terms describing the natural world. For example, if the property of being morally good is the same as the property of being pleasurable, then from the empirically ascertainable fact that an activity is pleasurable one can deduce that the activity is morally good. Moore thought, however, that no naturalistically specifiable property, such as being pleasurable, could possibly be the same as a moral property. In fact, his position was more general. He called it a “naturalistic fallacy” to suppose that a moral property is the same as some natural property, however the latter property might be specified. In his language, moral naturalism, in either to the two forms considered, would be an example of the naturalistic fallacy.

It is worth noting an important respect in which Moore’s argument differs from Kant’s. While Kant’s argument is about the nature of reasoning to moral conclusions, Moore’s is focused directly on the identity of moral properties, however they might be known. Moore thinks that moral properties are not natural and therefore cannot be known by experience. Kant, reasoning in the reverse, thinks that moral properties cannot be known by experience and hence cannot be natural properties. Since natural properties are known through experience and at issue is whether moral properties are natural properties, it is easy to miss this critical difference. Whether Moore’s reasons for thinking that moral properties are not natural turn out to be good reasons, he succeeded in focusing the debate on the strictly ontological issue of identity.

Why does Moore think that the identity in question is impossible, apart from our methods of reasoning? Moore’s answer is his “open question argument” (Moore, 1903). Moore reasons, if the identity illustrated in the last example were to hold, it would be odd to ask, “I know this activity is pleasurable, but is it morally good?” After all, if being pleasurable just is the property of being morally good, then to ask this would be like asking, “I know this activity is pleasurable, but is it pleasurable?” Since the original question is “open,” rather than silly or self-answering, the identity must not obtain. Since exactly the same point can be made regarding any putative identity between a moral property and a natural property, Moore concludes that no such identity is possible.

The open question argument has not been persuasive for several reasons. Two are especially notable. Moore’s target was the moral naturalist who thought that the identities in question might be established on the basis of conceptual analysis. It has been pointed out, however, that the question might still be open for someone provided that this person is not aware of the identity, not having carried out the analysis (Brandt 1959). Current versions of moral naturalism, moreover, do not propose that the identity would be known by a priori reasoning. The identity is conceived instead to be analogous to those identities discovered in the sciences, such as the identity claimed to exist between genes and strings of DNA or the well-accepted identity between water and H2O. Obviously, whether genes are DNA or whether water is H2O have been open questions at one time. In the case of DNA the question is still open for some. The reason is that these identities are established a posteriori. Perhaps Moore is right to deny the putative identity, but his open question argument fails to establish that he is.

3.3.4 Moral reasoning from the first-person perspective

Despite the failure of Moore’s argument, the question of the identity of moral properties with natural properties remains a hotly contested issue. Many believe that if Moore gave the wrong reason for disputing the possibility of these identities, he was still right to draw our attention to the apparent difference between a property that describes a natural feature of the world and a property that has prescriptive or normative significance for us. The latter tells us how things ought to be rather than telling us how things are. How could properties that play such different roles in our reflections about the world be the same?

This question may be interpreted in different ways. We might emphasize the immediate relevance of moral properties for our motivation to act, contrasting it with the merely indirect relevance of natural properties. This interpretation, however, would take us back to the debate between internalists and externalists that we have already explored. A quite different interpretation focuses on the perceived role of moral properties in moral reflection and judgment from the perspective of someone engaged in moral reflection and judgment. Two cases are particularly relevant. Suppose, to take Harman’s example, that I suddenly see hoodlums setting a cat on fire (Harman 1977). I may form an immediate judgment, without any conscious reflection, that what they are doing is wrong. In another case I may find myself perplexed about whether euthanasia is wrong and begin to reflect on why I should regard it one way or another. Each case presents an apparently strong contrast to the style of thinking that engages me if I were suddenly to recognize the presence of a cat or were to reflect on whether a certain contested property of a natural system really exists. Let us explore these cases in turn.

When we make an immediate moral judgment that the hoodlums are doing wrong, we might be said to be making an inference, however unconscious. We infer from our belief that the hoodlums are engaged in an act of cruelty, done for fun, that what they are doing is wrong. Grant for the sake of argument that there is an inference here. Clearly it is not an inductive inference, such as an inference to the best explanation of their setting the cat on fire. The judgment that their act is wrong does not explain what they are doing, nor would we likely say that their torturing the cat for fun provides empirical evidence that they are doing wrong. Our thinking in this case simply does not resemble, at least not as seen from the inside, anything like an inductive inference, as the identity thesis of moral naturalism would appear to require. Moreover, if someone did not reach the conclusion that the hoodlums were acting wrongly, even though she believed that they were torturing the cat for fun, we would think her guilty of moral insensitivity. We would not charge her with having made some perceptual error or a mistake in reasoning. The latter could be appropriate criticism, however, if she were making an inductive inference based on her perception. The kind of criticism that is appropriate for failing to make the correct judgment is different in each case, contrary to what we should expect if the identity thesis is true.

The objections here may not be decisive, however. (See Copp 2000 for the following rebuttal.) The best explanation of how we reason in judging the hoodlums to be doing wrong is that we think in general that acts of deliberate cruelty done for fun are wrong and subsume this case under that general rule. The moral judgment is the result of a simple inference from the fact that the hoodlums are committing such an act. For this reason our thinking contrasts sharply with inductive reasoning. We are, in fact, reasoning deductively. It is important to notice, however, that although our reasoning is deductive, nothing says that the premises of our reasoning are not empirical. Similar reasoning occurs frequently in science. I may notice a copper wire and immediately infer that it conducts electricity on the basis of my knowledge that in general copper is a good conductor of electricity. The main premise is obviously empirical, even though I am reasoning deductively. Such examples are a dime a dozen. The example need not, therefore, force us to the conclusion that non-inductive reasoning in the moral case is different in some basic way. Analogues to moral sensitivity exist in cases where people’s interests and training make them sensitive to horticultural, fiscal, and emotional facts. Moral sensitivity is a heightened tendency to notice morally relevant features of situations. But some people have a heightened awareness of plants or financial trends or the emotional states of others. We do not want to conclude that these objects of heightened awareness are not natural features of the world.

Consider finally the case where we are puzzling about the morality of euthanasia. If we are puzzled, we do not leap to a conclusion. Instead we reflect upon similar examples and general moral principles, trying to arrive at a balanced view of the morally relevant features of the case at hand. Perhaps there are analogues to how we would behave when puzzled about a scientific question. Notice, however, that most people would not engage in the type of investigation that we should expect if moral wrongness were a property that is identical to a complex natural property whose presence is open to empirical study. Consider the following summary account of the natural property that Copp takes to be identical to that of being wrong. On his theory to claim that something is wrong is to ascribe to it the property of violating a standard or norm that would be a justified moral standard for the relevant society. “A moral standard is relevantly justified just in case (roughly) its currency in the social code of the relevant society would best contribute to the society’s ability to meet its needs — including its needs for physical continuity, internal harmony and co-operative interaction, and peaceful and co-operative relations with its neighbors.” (Copp 2000, pp. 47–8) Surely, when people engage in moral reflection to resolve their puzzlement about a moral issue, they do not attempt an empirical study of the kind that would be called for if the puzzlement were about whether this complex natural property obtains.

The general objection, it should be stressed, is not limited to Copp’s theory. The objection can be put equally forcefully for any of the other prominent theories of moral naturalism. Copp has a rebuttal, however, that would apply generally for the other naturalistic moral theories that entail an identity of the kind under attack. Consider a piece of paper that has the property of being a U.S. dollar bill. To state in the terms of economic theory the truth conditions for a piece of paper having this property would be a task beyond the competence of most people. It would involve minimally the dispositions of relevant officials and the rest of the U.S. population to exchange goods and services for the price of one dollar. The task would not end here, however, since we would need to spell out in empirically testable terms who counts as a relevant official, who counts as part of the U.S. population, and what it means for something to be “priced at one dollar.” On the other hand, most people would know whether a piece of paper is a U.S. one dollar bill and would know it at once just by inspection. Moral naturalists can contend, indeed, that most people on seeing a U.S. dollar bill would arrive correctly and reliably at the conclusion that it is one. Moreover, they would be able do this as easily as they would conclude correctly and reliably that the hoodlums are doing something horribly wrong on seeing them set a cat on fire (Copp 2000).

Now imagine that we are puzzled about whether a piece of paper is a U.S. one dollar. Perhaps we have heard on the radio that counterfeit U.S. one dollar bills have been recently exchanged in our neighborhood. We would try to compare it to bills that have come from elsewhere that we are sure are not counterfeit or perhaps get the advice of an expert. We would likely not, however, appeal to the general theoretical identity mentioned earlier and attempt to verify the authenticity of the bill by reference to it. We should, it can thus be argued, reject the inference that identities of the kind in question do not exist because we would not appeal to them when we are puzzled about specific cases. The non-moral analogue undermines the inference from the case of euthanasia. The identities can come into play when foundational issues are raised. If the question is whether to devalue the U.S. dollar or whether it should be tied to the gold standard, then the theoretical specification of what constitutes a U.S. dollar may come into play and may be important to explain the force of certain arguments pro or con. But, similarly, the moral naturalist can argue that for foundational moral issues, such as whether animals or human fetuses have rights, the theoretical identities, concerning say what it is for something to have a moral right, become directly relevant to discussion. In sum, unless the non-moral cases can be shown to be disanalogous to the moral ones, the objection does not defeat moral naturalism.

4. Evolutionary: Biological Explanations of Why Morals Evolved

It is worth noting that the last three objections to moral naturalism are advanced by those who believe moral knowledge is possible but reject the idea that it is knowledge of the natural world. Of course, should those objections be successful, the upshot could be a victory for the moral skeptic, since the objections to thinking of moral knowledge as theological or as knowledge of a non-natural world may be just as successful. The problems for the possibility of moral knowledge, in short, must be seen holistically in view of the interlocking implications of the objections and replies. The following discussion of the implications of biological explanations of morals is no exception.

Some moral skeptics argue that Darwinian explanations of the origins and persistence of morals among humans undermine the likelihood that moral beliefs are true and hence undermine the possibility of moral knowledge. These “debunking” arguments are discussed under three headings. In each case we suppose, as Darwin suggested (Darwin 1982 [1871]), that human morality originated and persisted among our ancestors primarily as an adaptation fashioned by natural selection. This supposition is compatible with cultural evolution playing an enormous role in bringing us from proto-morals to modern forms of morality in all their striking variation. The basic thought, however, is that primitive moral inclinations, such as toward helping family and avoiding harm even to strangers, remain with us as prima facie reasons for action, even when contrary moral considerations may override these core inclinations. Thus, even though modern moralities have evolved culturally, they are, on this premise, constructed from certain core adaptations. That thought is well-developed in current accounts of the evolution of morals (see Copp 2008, pp. 187–90, and Campbell 2009, and Kumar and Campbell 2022). While it is not beyond criticism (see the entry on Morality and Evolutionary Biology), I will assume this premise, for the sake of argument, without further elaboration. Strikingly, this premise, if granted, is enough to give weight to the three debunking arguments that follow.

4.1 The Debunking Argument from Parsimony, Clarity, and Non-circularity

Some debunkers argue that the Darwinian explanation of core moral beliefs is in direct competition with the commonsense view that these core beliefs are true and that we believe them because their truth is obvious. They argue, however, that the Darwinian explanation of our core moral beliefs is superior, since it is more parsimonious, clearer, and better supported by the evidence (Ruse 1986; Joyce 2006; Street 2006: Kahane 2011). The Darwinian explanation is better, first of all, because it does not need to postulate the existence of any moral truth. We have seen in the preceding section how difficult it is to explain in uncontested ontological terms what moral truth might consist in. The things whose existence is fundamental in the Darwinian story, on the other hand, are neither mysterious nor contentious, such as the tendency to reciprocate kindness and extend help to those in need. Moreover, the mechanism of natural selection is, in general terms at least, very well-understood and could be applied to the altruistic tendencies mentioned. Core moral “beliefs” would be taken to express just such heritable tendencies. Individuals in groups with more of these tendencies than other groups would do better at survival and reproduction than those in other groups so that the tendencies would in time spread among groups in the larger population (Kitcher 1993; Sober and Wilson 1998; Bowles and Gintis 2011). By contrast, theories about how our ancestors were able to grasp moral truth, say by means of rational intuition or religious faith, are comparatively unclear and do not cohere with current science. Of course, we are assuming just for the sake of argument, that the evidence that supports the Darwinian explanation is cogent. To be fair, could we not make a parallel assumption about the evidence for the truth of core moral beliefs? Unfortunately, it is far from clear what that evidence would be unless it includes the truth of some of the very core beliefs whose nature we are trying to explain, apparently rendering the explanation circular. In sum, the commonsense story of why we have the core moral beliefs that we do is inferior to the simpler, clearer, and non-question-begging Darwinian explanation.

An immediate difficulty with this debunking argument is that it assumes that moral beliefs are not about moral properties that are also natural properties and hence are empirically knowable and can interact causally with other natural properties (compare Sturgeon’s reply to Harman in Sturgeon 1985; see also Campbell 1996, on Ruse). Consideration of moral naturalism, that is, opens up the possibility that those of our ancestors who tended to respond positively to moral properties had an advantage in survival and reproduction, because these properties are causally connected with mutual well-being. There are many forms of moral naturalism that allow this approach to the compatibility of moral truth and Darwinian moral evolution (Brandt 1979; Sturgeon 1985; Railton 1986; Boyd 1988; Brink 1989; Copp 1995, 2008; Churchland 1998, 2000; Sober and Wilson 1998; Rottschaefer 1998; Casebeer 2003; de Waal 2006; Campbell 1998, 2009; Kumar 2017; Kumar and Campbell 2022). Though the success of such theories depends on the details, they cannot be dismissed on the ground of parsimony, since moral truths would not presuppose properties of a special or non-natural kind. While the truths might be viewed as suspect in other respects, for example, they would be both normative and natural (Joyce 2006), we have already addressed such worries in the sub-section 3.3 on moral naturalism. They are not new problems occasioned by evolutionary theory. Finally, there is no special epistemic problem of circularity when it comes to understanding evidence for such a theory, other than what we have already discussed in 3.3. In short, the debunking evolutionary argument from parsimony, clarity, and non-circularity is by itself no threat to moral naturalism.

4.2 The Debunking Argument from Moral Objectivism

In the past decade a new style of evolutionary debunking argument has emerged that pits moral objectivism against the Darwinian origins of morals. While moral naturalism in some forms may not be at odds with understanding core moral beliefs as having a biological basis, such beliefs, it is argued, cannot embody objective moral knowledge in a robust sense. We must in effect choose between the Darwinian explanation and fully objective moral knowledge. Sharon Street (2006) presses this dilemma with careful attention to possible replies. She acknowledges that the kind of moral naturalism advanced by Peter Railton (1986) is compatible with the evolutionary basis of our core moral beliefs but argues that the price of embracing such naturalism is to give up thinking of moral truths as having the kind of objective status that moral philosophers often attribute to them. She is happy to pay that price, but others have contended that the assumption of objectivity, in particular moral realism, is built into how moral knowledge is commonly understood (Mackie 1977, Joyce 2006).For the latter group the dilemma presents an attack on the existence of moral knowledge, as most of us understand the concept. Since the aim of this essay is to review the issues concerning whether genuine moral knowledge is possible, we need to assess the merits of this debunking argument, paying close attention to how the ideal of objectivity is understood in this context.

Exactly what does the required objectivity consist in? Street, following Russ Shafer-Landau (2003, p. 15), says that a moral truth (or fact) is objective in the sense required by morality when it is “stance-independent,” when, that is, it would hold independently of all our evaluative attitudes, taken collectively, whether we have them now or would have them on reflection under ideal conditions. Evaluative attitudes include “desires, attitudes of approval or disapproval, unreflective evaluative tendencies such as the tendency to experience X as counting in favor of or demanding Y, and consciously or unconsciously held evaluative judgments, such as judgments about what is a reason for what, about what one should do or ought to do, about what is good, valuable, or worthwhile, about what is morally right or wrong, and so on” (Street 2006, p. 110). An implication of this understanding of objectivity, as Street points out, is that it cannot be the case that what we now take to be moral truths or facts are objective in the required sense but could have been different, and still objectively true or factual, if humans had evolved differently. For example, the following cannot be objectively true: in general people are not morally required to sacrifice themselves for the entire community, but they would have been so required if we had evolved more on the model of social insects. If moral truths or facts were contingent on evolution in this way (as they would be, to give another example, if moral facts were identified with facts about which moral values would favor diversity in the human gene pool, Wilson 1978, p. 205), they could not be objective in the strict way demanded by Shafer-Landau. (See also Kahane 2011, on the role of moral objectivism in debunking morals.)

There are two ways to go if one wishes to defend the possibility of moral knowledge against the argument from moral objectivism. One is to reject the concept of stance-independent objectivity as a necessary condition on moral truth. Studies show that even young children after a certain age make an intuitive distinction between conventional demands and moral demands (Nichols 2004). Basic moral demands unlike conventional ones are taken to be independent of authority (for example, that of a teacher in a classroom) and to be independent of time and place (to apply universally to all persons). These features appear to capture at least part of what it is for a moral demand to be objective. Note, however, that these features are not enough to guarantee stance-independence. For example, physical pain, considered just in itself, is plausibly considered to be universally bad for the person experiencing it, apart from what any authority might decree, yet this moral truth is arguably not stance-independent. Why? An essential part of what constitutes the experience of physical pain is to have a sensation towards which one has a negative evaluative response. This last part of the experience is what makes it bad for the person suffering pain. But then, its being intrinsically bad is a truth that is stance-dependent. If this argument is sound, we must accept moral skepticism about the objective badness of pain for the person suffering it or else understand the intrinsic badness of pain for the person who has it not to be objective in this strong sense. (Street offers a more complex argument to the same conclusion: Street 2006, pp. 144–52.) Given this dilemma a possible line of defense is to argue that in light of such examples the objectivity of moral truth does not entail stance-independence.

The other option is to meet the challenge head-on and argue in the case of a particular moral theory that core moral truths in this theory would be stance-independent and also compatible with the Darwinian evolution of morals. David Copp (2008) pursues this course of argument using his society-centered moral theory sketched earlier. He argues that because moral truth on his theory concerns the needs of human society, one can expect that under propitious conditions the more biologically fit moral inclinations would tend to track (or “quasi-track,” his term) certain core moral truths. Copp’s argument is complex, but it presents a possible avenue of defense that is worth consideration. See also Collier & Stingl 2020.

4.3 The Debunking Argument from the Irrationality of Moral Emotions

The third line of thinking that puts the evolution of morals at loggerheads with moral knowledge arises from recent developments in moral psychology and neurobiology. In recent decades several prominent psychologists have applied the emerging dual process model of the brain to design experiments to reveal how we process moral judgments (Greene 2008, 2010 (Other Internet Resources), 2013; Haidt 2001; Cushman et al. 2006). One type of thinking (system 1) is fast, unconscious, automatic, intuitive, and guided by emotions. The other (system 2) is slow, conscious, deliberate, reflective, and devoid of emotion. Though there remains considerable controversy about the details (Berker 2009; Greene 2010 (Other Internet Resources), 2013), various experiments, including fMRI brain studies, suggest that deontological moral judgment, where one assesses the moral acceptability of actions apart from their consequences, is guided solely by system 1 thinking while consequentialist moral judgment engages system 2. Since processing in the latter case is unemotional, entailing reasoned comparison of possible consequences, only consequentialist thought is properly associated with the rational moral appraisal of actions. Notably, the latter thinking is regarded as less primitive from an evolutionary standpoint. By contrast, system 1 thinking, being tied to intuitive emotional judgments, represents an adaptation that was once useful but has by now largely lost its point given the challenges of life in modern technological society (Greene 2008, 2010 (Other Internet Resources), 2013; but see Gigerenzer 2008 and Railton 2014 for a contrary perspective on intuitive moral judgments). These claims, when taken together, form the basis of a psychological/evolutionary argument to debunk deontological moral thinking as unreliable and irrational.

The story taken just this far, whatever its merits, appears to allow the possibility of moral knowledge grounded in consequentialist reasoning. All the data used to draw negative conclusions about deontological moral thought, however, can be interpreted to support a broader debunking argument, since consequentialist thinking requires not only reasoned calculation of the probable effects of alternative actions, but also judgment about whether these effects are good or bad (Kahane 2011, pp. 119–20). In the latter respect, system 1 would play an essential role. If system 1 contaminates the rationality of deontological judgments, given its emotional and primitive evolutionary nature, the possibility of consequentialist moral knowledge would be undermined in the same way. Though one might reply that moral beliefs formed by thinking about the consequences of actions arise in part from reasoning, the core part of the belief, concerning whether the consequences are on the whole good or bad, is not itself rational but emotional (following the logic of the argument) and hence cannot qualify as rationally justified, as it would need to be in order to qualify as moral knowledge. In effect, the possibility of moral knowledge is foreclosed no matter what kind of moral belief is in question. (See Kahane 2011, for a careful elaboration and evaluation of the ensuring global normative skepticism.)

Though the question of whether the data support a dual process theory of brain activity and whether moral thinking divides up in the way described is hotly debated, a larger and equally serious problem concerns the assumed opposition between emotional and rational thinking. Many experimental studies of practical reasoning yield the opposite conclusion, namely, that emotional processing of information plays an essential role in prudential reasoning (de Sousa 1987; Damasio 1994; Woodward and Allman 2007; Bloom 2013; Railton 2014). Emotional processing is especially important when the relevant variables are too many and too complex to process entirely through conscious reasoning, so that rational thinking and rational behavior depend on the emotional capacity to feel one’s way through practical problems. There is no principled reason why the same would not be true in complex practical deliberation about moral issues (Allman and Woodward 2008). Research in this regard has only begun, but even now it is questionable to assume without argument that the reason-emotion dichotomy presupposed in the third type of debunking argument is trustworthy enough to rule out moral knowledge, even if all moral judgments have the emotional basis claimed.

Recent developments regarding moral consistency reasoning underline the role of emotion in moral reasoning (Campbell and Kumar 2012, 2013; Kumar and Campbell 2012, 2016, 2022; Campbell 2014, 2017 see also Wong 2002 on analogical moral reasoning). Return to Singer’s example of a man seeing a toddler about to drown in a shallow pond and knowing that the only cost of saving her life would be ruining his new suit. One can be expected to have feelings of strong disapproval toward anyone who did not try to save a child in any similar situation. Suppose, however, there is another situation, say one in which someone’s life is at stake and that person can be saved at no more cost than losing a new suit, say by giving funds for famine relief. If one does not feel as before about this new situation, then there should be a moral difference between them to explain the difference in emotional response, or else one is being morally inconsistent in one’s moral emotions. Moreover, this kind of moral inconsistency is morally culpable, revealing one not to be fully morally trustworthy as a moral agent. Singer argues, in fact, that one’s response to the opportunity to provide funds for famine relief (at least equivalent to the cost of a new suit) ought to be the same as in the pond case, since (he claims) there is no morally relevant difference. (He considers various candidates for difference but argues that thinking they are morally relevant results in further inconsistencies depending on the candidate.) When there are no relevant moral differences between two situations and the moral import of one’s response to them is different, both responses cannot be morally justified. Though Singer’s focus is on whether one’s moral obligation is the same, the logic of his argument would be the same whether the inconsistency is between moral beliefs or moral emotions. In general we are expected to be morally consistent in our moral beliefs and in our moral emotions.

Sometimes moral beliefs and moral emotions can diverge, yet it can be rational to trust the moral emotion rather than the moral belief. In Section 3 we discussed the hybrid conception of moral judgment that allows for this kind of separation of belief and emotion. One of the examples was that of a woman who feels strong moral resentment at having been passed over for promotion in favour of someone whose performance was inferior to hers. It is possible that she doesn’t believe that she has been wronged, perhaps because she believes the man performed better and her feelings are not trustworthy. Suppose that her resentment persists, despite her efforts to ignore it. Must her moral emotion then be irrational? Imagine that she feels resentment because in fact she can recognize no morally relevant difference between her case and that of the other that would explain why she wasn’t promoted. Even if she does not at first consciously think about it in this way, her resentment can arise because her emotions have been attuned to respond to other cases where a promotion has been granted unfairly and where in retrospect there is no doubt in anyone’s mind (like the pond case) what would have been the right thing to do. In short, her moral emotion may be rationally grounded, if there exists no morally relevant difference between her situation and one in which the morally right response is not in doubt from anyone’s perspective but is contrary to the decision made in her case.

The idea that emotion may enter unconsciously into good reasoning and yield a moral emotion that has a better rational basis than a person’s consciously held beliefs may seem surprising. However, there is a growing literature in cognitive science over the past decade that supports the cognitive sophistication of our affective system that operates largely unconsciously in practical decision-making. For an illuminating review of these developments that links insights of Aristotle and Kant to the unconscious cognitive work done by our evolved system of “affective attunement”, see Railton 2014. The lesson is not that belief and emotion do not generally cohere in moral judgment, but that emotion is itself cognitively complex and can make its own independent and rationally based contribution to moral judgment.

4.4 Can Other Animals Have Moral Knowledge?

We assumed in the beginning that moral knowledge is justified true moral belief. Since other animals appear not to have grammatically complex language, arguably they lack knowledge of the kind entailing propositional belief. It would follow, then, that they cannot have moral knowledge of the kind that entails propositional moral belief. Let us assume, for the sake of argument, that other animals lack such belief and ask whether they can, nevertheless, have moral knowledge. I will assume for reasons given by Hilary Kornblith (2002) that all animals have at least non-propositional non-moral knowledge, such as knowing how to find food.

Earlier we have allowed that humans can have moral knowledge without moral belief. Recall the case from Section 2 where a woman does not believe that she was wronged yet feels abiding resentment at being denied promotion. We suggested that her resentment could be rationally grounded in the fact that she has been wronged, so that she knows emotionally that she has been wronged and thus has moral knowledge in the absence of moral belief. Might animals that lack human moral beliefs, then, have a capacity for moral knowledge in the absence of moral belief? Might animals that lack human moral beliefs, then, have the capacity for moral knowledge when their emotions are rationally grounded in moral reality? How would that work?

Kristin Andrews conceives naive normativity as possible for other animals when members of a group voluntarily follow a pattern of behavior because they find it intrinsically attractive and oppose any member of the group that fails to follow the pattern (Andrews 2020; Vincent et al. 2018). Examples would be the protective circles that dolphins, musk ox, bison, and elephants form around vulnerable members of their group when danger threatens. Such normative behavior arguably counts as moral when the motivating emotions involve the moral emotions of sympathy and loyalty and the normative pattern significantly aids in successful interdependent living for the group (Kumar and Campbell 2022, chs. 1–5). Would the animals evince moral knowledge in such cases? If so, what exactly would they know?

Recall David Copp’s characterization (3.3.4 above) of how moral norms could best promote successful interdependent living: “[They] would best contribute to the society’s ability to meet its needs--including its needs for physical continuity, internal harmony and cooperative interaction, and peaceful and co-operative relations with its neighbors” (Copp 2000, pp. 47–8). Meeting these needs would be a natural moral property of the norms that is open to empirical confirmation. Hence, humans could rationally believe that their moral norms share that property and thus have moral knowledge. But what about other animals? They could have evolved by natural selection to be intrinsically attracted to similar norms, such as the moral norm requiring the stronger to form circles around the vulnerable among them for protection in the face of danger. If Copp is right, their strong emotional attraction to such norms would be grounded in empirical moral fact and, in this way, provide them the moral know-how to survive collectively. They would have, in effect, factually grounded moral knowledge about how to act, despite the absence of motal belief.

The three preceding sections focused on reasons to doubt knowledge of moral facts, given that moral norms can be explained by Darwinian natural selection without any reference to moral facts. Now we have suggested a Darwinian defense of moral knowledge, arguing that natural selection can explain the evolution of moral facts that can be known by human and other animals. Let us grant that other animals lack the intellectual sophistication to reflect on their own moral agency, but this truth about their naive moral agency need not undermine their capacity to be moral agents (Rowlands 2012; see also the entry on the moral status of animals). Moreover, it need not, for the reasons given, undermine their capacity to have moral knowledge. Of course, if they do have this capacity, humans have it too, however more sophisticated they may be as moral agents. This topic is too large to pursue here, but it should now be clear that the relevance of Darwinian evolutionary theory to moral knowledge need not be primarily negative. For work that defends a realist conception of moral knowledge based on Darwinian evolution, see Collier and Stingl 2020.

5. Methodological: Epistemology Naturalized, Reflective Equilibrium, Rational Choice, and Pragmatic Naturalism

Thus far we have not addressed directly the question of methodology in looking at the question whether moral knowledge is possible. In the past several decades, however, four new methodologies have gained prominence and the import of each for the possibility of moral knowledge has been widely debated. Some who support the movement to naturalize epistemology, for example, endorse the possibility of moral knowledge; others do not. Either way, the new philosophical methodology contained in the movement raises new issues for moral epistemology to resolve.

5.1 Epistemology Naturalized

What is this new methodology? Quine, who introduced naturalized epistemology five decades ago (Quine 1969a), urges epistemologists to renounce the project of explaining knowledge a priori, from first principles, thus independently of science. The traditional approach to knowledge had been to reason about the possibility of knowledge and about the kinds of things that can be known without assuming from the outset that we already possess considerable knowledge through science. Even the classical empiricists, who argued that knowledge derives ultimately from sense experience, defended this perspective without relying primarily on scientific theories to establish their conclusions. Hume, in particular, was led to a skeptical conclusion regarding the possibility of justifying the methods used in reasoning from experience. He thought any justification of inductive reasoning that uses such reasoning would be circular (Hume, An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Book I, Sections IV-V). Quine, however, dismisses such circularity as a problem for two reasons. First, the prospect of reasoning independently of all empirical assumptions is a will-o-the-wisp, and second, the most troubling source of skepticism arises from the present scientific understanding of how perception works and hence should be resolved by science itself. Thus, Quine advocates that epistemology be carried out within science.

Though this suggestion is highly controversial and not all who follow Quine’s lead are prepared to endorse the radical form of naturalized epistemology in which epistemology becomes part of science, the idea of enlisting science in the task of understanding how knowledge is possible has gained wide acceptance (Kornblith 1994). We need to consider, then, what the implications are for moral epistemology in particular. Does naturalized epistemology logically entail moral naturalism? In fact, their relationship is more complex. It is possible to accept the former but reject the latter without evident contradiction. Many philosophers who are attracted to naturalized epistemology believe that the natural world is morally neutral in itself. From their standpoint the project of naturalizing epistemology is only to understand how non-moral knowledge is possible by drawing on the resources of science. Quine himself is in this category. On the other hand, it is possible to believe that moral properties are natural properties but hold that the principles of reasoning that allow one to reach this conclusion are not themselves to be explained by science. It is one thing to think, for example, that acting rightly is the same as maximizing pleasure over pain; it is quite another to think that science can tell us whether these properties of actions are at bottom the same.

Nevertheless, while naturalized epistemology and moral naturalism are logically distinct, it is arguable that anyone who subscribes to naturalized epistemology and believes that moral knowledge is possible should be a moral naturalist. For if moral knowledge is part of knowledge and all knowledge is to be explained within science, then moral knowledge itself must be explainable within science, and that would be possible, it would seem, only if moral properties were natural properties that we learn to identify empirically. There exist, however, several major problems for anyone who endorses both moral naturalism and naturalized epistemology, at least in the radical form advocated by Quine. The reason is that the strategies that seem promising for addressing standard objections to naturalized epistemology are in tension with the possibility of moral knowledge. Consideration of two standard objections shows how strategies for coping with them can lead to difficulty.

5.1.1 Losing the normative dimension of moral knowledge

One standard objection to including epistemology within science is that science is committed to providing only an adequate description of the natural world and cannot tell us the world ought to be. Epistemology, in marked contrast, is a normative enterprise. It is supposed to tell us how we ought to reason from evidence and how we ought to justify our beliefs, not merely tell us how we do reason or how we do go about justifying them. By including epistemology within science, therefore, we rob it of normative content that is essential to its being epistemology (Kim 1988). A promising reply is to dispute the assumption that science is merely a descriptive enterprise, lacking in any normative content. It may be argued that in science the normative and the descriptive are both present. Not only are normative assumptions implicit in scientific practice, but these assumptions can be the subject of intense debate and reflection within science. Indeed, any adequate description of scientific practice bears out this sociological observation. The objection rests on a false premise (Campbell 1998).

The problem is to work out this line of reply for naturalized moral epistemology. What is often a matter of intense debate is what standards of evidence are appropriate for testing a certain type of theory. Normative concerns are present in the form of worries about epistemic standards, such as the role of statistical significance in psychological experiments. But epistemic standards are not moral standards. To develop a parallel defense to the charge that the moral dimension is missing from naturalized moral epistemology, we would have to argue that moral values are operating in science and further that we can decide which moral values are appropriate for science through scientific debate. Many would agree that moral values, such as honesty, trust, and loyalty, do operate in science, but not many are prepared to concede that matters critical to moral epistemology can be decided by the methods of science. Can science tell us, for example, how we would know when honesty should be sacrificed for the sake of loyalty?

In the face of this challenge it may be tempting for a believer in the possibility of moral knowledge simply to reject the project of naturalizing moral epistemology. An immediate difficulty in taking this way out is the close connection between this project and moral naturalism, together with the role that the latter theory plays in addressing the ontological problems raised in section 3. Earlier we noted how the naturalizing project in moral epistemology can lead a believer in moral knowledge toward moral naturalism. The reverse is also true for a person who accepts a naturalized epistemology for non-moral knowledge. If such a person thinks that moral features of the world can be found among its natural properties and that these properties can be investigated empirically, she will have a hard time explaining why science is incapable of explaining what these moral properties are and how we can know them. In sum, we may need moral naturalism to address the ontological problems for moral knowledge, but then we are led to a naturalized moral epistemology and to the challenge now before us.

One source of resistance to moral epistemology being part of science may be the picture of scientists trying to decide moral questions by reference to graphs, lab reports, and print-outs from machines, as if the answer to moral questions might be read off of data sheets. We have already noted that his picture of scientific practice is excessively narrow. It fails to reflect the fact that scientists debate the implications of their data and debate the merits of the epistemic standards used in their debates. The key issue then is whether it is possible to draw a line between these debates and moral ones and to declare moral debates to lie outside of science proper. Although Quine apparently thought this possible, his holistic approach to matters of evidence suggests otherwise. If moral beliefs have truth-value, as moral naturalism implies, then the “web of belief” to which Quine often alludes would include moral beliefs (White 1986, Jack Nelson 1996). Recall that a moral naturalist will invoke moral facts to explain certain non-moral facts, for example, the fact that American chattel slavery was so morally repugnant to explain, in part, the extent of the resistance to it at the time of the American civil war (Sturgeon 1985). If this kind of interaction between the moral and the non-moral is on the cards, it would be odd to preclude moral questions a priori from scientific discussion.

A number of recent articles and books have defended a holistic approach to the place of moral value within scientific and other empirical investigations, recognizing moral claims as being epistemically interdependent with claims about non-moral facts (White 1981, Sturgeon 1985, Miller 1992, Lynn Nelson 1996, Rottschaefer 1998, Campbell 1998). Though a review of that literature is beyond the scope of this essay, it is worth stressing that this conception of science is not widely held and that if it were generally accepted by scientists, then the practice of science would change significantly. The position that is entertained here in response to the last difficulty is not that current science routinely and effectively engages in moral discussion, much less that current science provides a model for such discussion. The point is that there may be no principled reason to exclude this possibility for the future direction of science and that there may be principled reasons to allow it, given the epistemological implications of moral naturalism.

5.1.2 Global skepticism and the problem of circularity

A second standard objection to naturalized epistemology is that it gives up the project of answering the global skeptic and as a consequence fails to address, much less resolve, a central issue in epistemology. It must surrender this project because by operating within science it assumes that we already have some knowledge and hence begs the question against the global skeptic. For example, Quine appeals to Darwin to explain why our native inductive tendencies (used say in tracking the location of middle-sized objects moving in our immediate vicinity) must do better than chance in getting the right answer or else the tendencies would have been selected against long ago (Quine 1969b). Yet in assuming that we have good inductive grounds to believe Darwin’s theory of evolution, we justify induction by assuming that it is justified and thereby reason in a circle.

Two kinds of replies to this objection are worth considering. The first, suggested in the brief statement of Quine’s new methodology, is to reject the old problem as based on the false presupposition that one can vindicate scientific and other knowledge on the basis of propositions that are knowable a priori. The difficulty with this response is that it raises the difficult issues of whether a priori knowledge is possible and whether we can determine an answer to that question a posteriori. Another reply, perhaps more in keeping with the spirit of naturalized epistemology, is not to dismiss global skepticism out of hand, but to allow science to attempt to explain science within its own terms, recognizing that the effort will be circular but defending its legitimacy. The effort is legitimate, it might be argued, because the circularity does not guarantee the success of the effort. The appeal to Darwin, for example, may not succeed, either because Darwin’s theory is overthrown or because a necessary background assumption (say that our native inductive tendencies are gene linked) is contradicted by the evidence. In fact, Quine allowed that the project to explain science from within science could defeat itself, in the end vindicating the skeptic (Quine 1981, p. 22). On this approach knowledge claims are always open to questioning and perhaps rejection down the road. Any justification that is offered for induction or claims of knowledge based on induction is ultimately fallible and revisable.

Can this kind of answer to the circularity charge be extended to naturalized moral epistemology? Can we offer the moral skeptic the same kind of reply? It may be that we cannot, since the two cases appear to be importantly different. While we may consider global skepticism an interesting theoretical challenge, few of us feel the need to address it before getting on with our lives. We may be content to follow the advice that we assume that we already know many things and then (if we are so inclined) attempt to explain how we know so much, relying on what we already think we know. With moral skepticism the situation appears different. Most of us are far more prone to doubt the possibility of moral knowledge than we are to question whether we know anything at all. Moral doubts affect our confidence in making daily moral decisions. Thus, to follow the former advice and assume for now that we know what we believe we know in order to justify our decisions may seem to be illegitimately circular. The need for justification is more pressing in the moral case; hence, the methodology of justifying our moral beliefs by allowing ourselves to believe about moral matters what we have been raised to believe is more questionable (Campbell and Hunter 2000).

The defender of naturalized moral epistemology can reply that however urgent justification may be, no alternative exists to relying on background assumptions when we try to justify specific claims. At times the justification of non-moral knowledge claims can be similarly urgent, as in deciding political, economic, or environmental policy. What is in doubt need not be the moral importance of, for example, preventing certain harms, but rather the means to achieve this end. In these cases we will seek statistical and other evidence to support our beliefs, but there exists now a firm consensus among philosophers of science that the justification provided by evidence for a hypothesis will depend for its credibility on theoretical background assumptions. These in turn may require defense, but in general there is no way to proceed but to assume something that we think we know until we have sufficient reason to reject the assumption. In this respect, the defender of naturalized epistemology can say that moral knowledge and non-moral knowledge are on a par. This response is of a piece with the reply to the last challenge in that it appeals to the holistic nature of justification. Unless this appeal is blocked somehow, moral knowledge remains a viable possibility when moral epistemology is naturalized.

5.2 Reflective Equilibrium and Rational Choice

Two allied methodologies need to be mentioned that arose along side of naturalized epistemology in the last century. Goodman introduced the concept of a reflective equilibrium in addressing the problem of justifying induction (Goodman 1955). Rules of inference would be formulated to explain what one takes to be valid scientific reasoning, much as one might formulate deductive inference rules to explain valid inferences of mathematicians. Application of these rules may, however, yield conclusions that are contrary to one’s considered judgment in a given case. Then a choice is necessary between revising one’s judgment to bring it into line with the systematic implications of the other specific judgments, or else revising the rules (with the possible consequence that a similar problem will arise in another quarter). One proceeds until reaching (for the time being) a reflective equilibrium in considered judgments, including judgments about the rules that best explain one’s inferences. The proposed methodology is like that of naturalized epistemology. It begins by taking for granted, at least initially, that the methods of science are sound and then attempts to formulate the principles that explain it by working within science, revising the principles or the practice as necessary to achieve a more coherent overall understanding. A significant difference is that the method seeks explicitly to arrive at acceptable normative principles.

Rawls self-consciously applies the concept of reflective equilibrium in explaining the method of justification underlying his theory of social justice (Rawls 1971). Rawls applies the methodology, of course, to justify considered moral judgments found outside of science. However, he takes no judgments to be established simply a priori. The claims about justice are justified in part by their implications when taken together with what we assume to be known in psychological, social, and economic theory. Others have elaborated this methodology so that a “wide reflective equilibrium” would be reached only after consideration of relevant background assumptions, regarding such things as personal identity and rational choice, as well as relevant alternative theories (Daniels 1976). Still others argue that wide reflective equilibrium reasoning should not be confused with a different but complementary reasoning that directly compares opposing moral judgments about particular but similar cases without reference to general principles. Moral consistency reasoning, as it is called, can support but it can also undermine wide reflective equilibrium reasoning. Both may be needed to reach morally defensible conclusions (Campbell 2014).

A complication is that the justification of moral claims in Rawls proceeds also by arguing that rational persons in a hypothetical “original position” of freedom and equality would be rational to choose certain principles of social justice. Though in this appeal to rational choice Rawls is explicitly engaged in a social contract theory of justice and thus a particular type of normative theory, the implications are more general. The larger suggestion is that moral truth is based significantly on which moral norms can be rationally chosen by members of a given society as norms under which they would be prepared to live. (Compare the accounts of moral truth in Brandt 1979, Copp 1995, and Braybrooke 2001, none of which defend social contract theory, but all of which base moral truth on rational choice. Gauthier 1986 appeals to rational choice to determine which moral norms are justified but without supposing that moral judgments have truth value.)

The methodology of basing moral truth on rational choice and the methodology of invoking the ideal of a reflective equilibrium of considered judgments both endeavor to square moral knowledge with a scientific world view and as such are allied with naturalized epistemology. Both, however, explicitly make room for normative claims and so avoid the charge that the normative dimension is missing from their account of moral knowledge. Unfortunately they face the charge of making moral truth more likely than not to reflect the moral status quo. Let us allow that a person may come to revise many beliefs, including many moral beliefs, before reaching a wide reflective equilibrium in judgments. Why should we think that the most stubborn moral judgments in a given reflective equilibrium are more likely to be true than the ones that gave way to them in the process of reaching a reflective equilibrium (Copp 1985)? The reply may be that this approach is no worse off than naturalized epistemology, since we must take some moral claims for granted, at least tentatively, and proceed until there is reason to revise our judgments given their lack of fit with everything else we think we know. Moral conservatism is also a problem for the methodology that bases moral truth on rational choice, since rational choice turns on individual preferences and these are inevitably shaped by the moral status quo (Babbitt 1996 and Campbell 1998). For more information, see the entry on reflective equilibrium.

5.3 Pragmatic Naturalism

Building on the pioneering work of American pragmatists, notably William James (James 1907) and John Dewey (Dewey 1922; Dewey & Tufts 1932), Philip Kitcher (Kitcher 2011a) has recently revitalized the pragmatic, naturalistic approach to moral knowledge evident in earlier thinkers. (For his general defence of pragmatism, see his papers in Kitcher 2012.) Like naturalized epistemology, “pragmatic naturalism”, to use his term, eschews appeal to a priori knowledge but also rejects the ideal of moral knowledge of a reality to be discovered in nature that is static and not under human control. Pragmatic naturalism is thus distinct from ontological naturalism already discussed above in 3.3. Though principles of rational choice can play a role in moral learning on this view, all principles are open to revision and, more importantly, grounds for moral change need not appeal to a reflective equilibrium of principles and judgments. Instead, moral knowledge is part of a long cultural evolutionary process of humans working out among themselves how they can live together, initially in small groups, through imposing constraints on their interactions and setting goals consistent with them that they can strive toward collectively. Moral knowledge is moral “know-how” that emerges first out of primitive tendencies fashioned by natural selection and from cooperative efforts within groups to live peacefully while competing for resources with other groups. Alliances between groups form when necessary and in some cases codes of conduct apply to allied groups. Humans achieve moral progress, not by discovering truth that exists apart from their societies, but by fulfilling the various functions of ethical norms as these functions gradually emerge through engagement in “the ethical project”.

Such pragmatic naturalism, as moral epistemology, has strong affinities with the methodologies just canvassed and shares many of their virtues. For example, when discussing cases of moral progress, such as the abolition of slavery in the United States and improvement over the last century in civil status of women in Europe and the United States, Kitcher focuses on the reasons for moral change that were in fact operating in these cases rather than on principles that might rationalize the changes without necessarily explaining them. Like naturalized epistemology the focus is on looking for the reasons that are also causes. Like reflective equilibrium theory and rational choice theory, the focus is sensitive to tensions within moral perspectives both theoretical and practical, such as the apparent contradiction of maintaining the view that women as wives and mothers should not be educated while having to concede, as Mary Wollstonecraft argued (Kitcher 2011a, 148–50), that they would better fulfill their role in their families if they were educated or, as John Woolman pointed out (Kitcher 2011a, 158–61), maintaining a Christian view of the equal worth of every human while tolerating chattel slavery. Kitcher’s argument in these and similar cases is that improvement in moral knowledge was not achieved through the use of general abstract principles but has depended instead on reconciling conflicts of moral values so that their emerging functions are better served. See also Elizabeth Anderson’s discussion of how people learned that slavery is wrong (Anderson 2016). At the same time, because pragmatists, such as Kitcher and Anderson, focus on cases of radical moral change from the status quo, the charge of moral conservatism that faces reflective equilibrium and rational choices theories of moral knowledge tends to be undercut.

We have to ask, however, whether pragmatic naturalism is a method that yields genuine moral knowledge, since it seems to replace reference to knowledge of moral truth with knowledge of the practical means for resolving human conflict. Are not the two very different? Is not this pragmatic understanding of moral knowledge, for all its virtues, an impostor that really fails to signify something that has the transcendent moral authority that we intuitively associate with genuine moral truth? There is ample experimental work confirming that all of us, including children, are able to distinguish conventional authority from moral authority, where the latter is understood to take precedence over what is claimed to be right by those in positions of authority within a society or what current norms viewed as authoritative are thought to imply (Nichols 2004). If that were not so, it would have made no sense for advocates of moral change to hold that conventional moral authority was violating the moral rights of humans treated as property or unworthy of education. Kitcher tries to address this problem by arguing that pragmatic naturalism allows a robust conception of moral truth but one that is not prior to our understanding of moral progress (Kitcher 2011a, 245–9). Another way to address the problem would be to conceive of moral truth so that it does not imply a realist conception of moral truth but one that is robustly objective in that it allows the possibility of massive moral error among would-be knowers despite all efforts to know the truth (Campbell & Kumar 2013). Truth has been a central concern to pragmatism from its inception (Misak 2013) and the problem of moral truth bears critically on the viability of pragmatic naturalism as a methodology for understanding the possibility of moral knowledge.

6. Moral: Feminist Epistemology and the Bias Paradox

Another relatively recent development in epistemology is the movement to view epistemology from the perspective of feminism (Jaggar 1983 and 1989, Code 1991, Anderson 1995, Alcoff 1996). The growth of interest in this approach to epistemology is exceeded only by that in naturalizing epistemology and at times the two perspectives are engaged simultaneously (Antony 1993, Duran 1994, Nelson 1990 and 1996, Nelson and Nelson 1996, Campbell 1998 and 2003). At first glance the prospect of a feminist epistemology may appear to be a contradiction in terms. Feminism is a political movement aimed at eliminating the subordination of women to men, while the goal of epistemology is to establish and defend, from a disinterested and impartial point of view, systematic standards for knowledge or justified belief. How can a political movement that is partial regarding the interests of women in relation to men be disinterested and impartial? The idea of a feminist epistemology, not to say a feminist moral epistemology, may therefore appear incomprehensible.

Feminists have not been slow to recognize this challenge and have made a variety of replies. (See Harding 1986 and 1995 for a comparative study.) Postmodern feminists call into question the concepts of knowledge, truth, and impartial justification. Others, however, would agree with the assumption of this essay that it is possible to have non-moral knowledge and to offer justifications that adequately support the truth of non-moral beliefs. They maintain that a feminist perspective is able to enhance rather than diminish the accuracy of non-moral beliefs. For example, studies of coronary heart disease were carried out for a long time only on men, based on the belief that the results would apply equally well to women (Mastroianni et al. 1994, 64–66). In fact, significant differences exist, but they came to light only after pressures to broaden the studies. It is agreed on all sides, at this point, that the new studies give a more objective picture of the development of coronary heart disease in men and women. Notice, though, that this result is entirely compatible with the change in the studies being motivated by interest in women’s health. The conclusion to draw is not that political motivation is necessarily advantageous for achieving more reliable theories but rather that it can be. Moreover, feminist motivations can lead to the discovery of forms of partiality that have distorted the truth and prevented access to relevant evidence. At a still deeper level, feminists who accept the possibility of knowing the truth have argued that epistemology itself can be transformed through a better understanding of the ways in which partiality can increase or decrease our chances of knowing the truth. They have argued that it is important to understand how partiality can increase or decrease the chances of knowing the truth when the truths in question concern the subordination of women to men.

Feminists who accept the concept of truth are motivated, of course, not simply by the desire to discover the truth about the subordination of women (what forms it takes, how it comes about, where it has become part of the practice of epistemology). They are also motivated by the desire to stop it. This motivation is justified, most feminists would say, by their knowing that the subordination is unjust and hence morally wrong. At this juncture, one may want to ask how such feminist epistemology could create a problem for the possibility of moral knowledge. It would seem, on the contrary, that epistemology that is so motivated depends for its rationale on moral knowledge.

The problem is that feminist criticism of knowledge claims that reinforce injustice extends to claims of moral knowledge. Some examples may help to clarify this point. Some libertarians have taken it to be self-evident that each of us owns his or her own body and whatever is produced through its labor, provided that the goods used in the labor are freely and justly acquired so that their acquisition does not leave others worst off than they were prior to the acquisition (Nozick 1974). This premise is a basic building block for some moral and political theories of justice. Okin (1989) argues, however, that the premise leads to absurdity when one takes into account the power of women to produce humans through their physical labor, using sperm that they may freely and justly acquire through purchase without leaving anyone worst off than before. An absurd consequence of the theory would be that women own their children as property whom they can dispose of at will. Not only is this result morally absurd, but there is the further consequence that mothers being the products of mothers both do and do not own themselves. She argues that an inconsistency can also be produced for Rawls’ theory of justice, since it is so structured that justice does not apply within families yet at the same time the theory requires it to apply there in order for justice as fairness to be feasible (Okin 1989). In both cases Susan Moller Okin, a feminist moral and political philosopher, has criticized the foundations of a theory of justice by arguing that its basic premises are gender-biased in ways that reinforce the subordination of women to men. In one case, gender-bias occurs by failing to count reproductive labor as genuine labor, in the other by failing to recognize how injustice within the family is a major force in creating and maintaining the subordination of women to men in the public domain. (For discussion of related problems that arise from the quest for impartial moral knowledge when it ignores human embodiment, see Walker 1998, Bach 2012, and Babbitt 2014.)

In order to see how feminist critiques of bias in prominent theories of justice lead to paradox, recall the feminist rejection of impartiality as an epistemic ideal. As noted, feminist have defended this rejection by noting that partiality can lead to more accurate accounts of reality just as it can lead to distortion and misrepresentation. Partiality that is positive in its results, as in the discovery of the different development of coronary heart disease in women, should not be rejected. In the heart disease example, however, it is possible to ascertain the worthiness of the result independently of the bias. Whatever led to the broader study of coronary heart disease, the results of the study can be independently verified by feminist and non-feminists alike. Compare partiality in the moral case. Is it possible to know that the resulting feminist theories of justice are more objective, less distorting in their representations of justice than the theories under criticism? It may be hard to see how the truth of the new feminist theory can be recognized independently of the sense of justice that motivated the critique. Does the feminist sense of justice constitute a partiality that leads to a more objective, less distorting representation of moral reality? That depends on whether the justice in question is identifiable independently of the feminist sense of justice. If there is no understanding of true justice that is independent of the partiality that motivates the critique of the traditional theory, then the appeal to true justice appears question-begging and self-serving.

What seems to have gone wrong is that feminists are in the position of rejecting impartiality as a general epistemic and moral ideal, but at the same time they want to reject gender bias because it obviously fails to measure up to the ideal of impartiality. Louise Antony has called this inconsistency “the bias paradox” (Antony 1993). It is a paradox or at least has the appearance of one because there are principled reasons for rejecting the ideal of complete impartiality. Not only are there the reasons already given, but evolutionary reasons exist as well for rejecting impartiality. Natural selection has equipped us with the means to sort through massive amounts of sensory information so that we can pick out and interpret quickly information relevant to our survival. Without built-in “biases” of this nature we could not begin to know anything about the world around us. Yet we also want to reject biases that produce a “biased” (in a pejorative sense, i.e., distorted) representation of the truth. Feminists and non-feminists are in a bind, unless a principled way exists to separate good biases from bad ones. Antony suggests that epistemically good biases are ones that lead to finding out the truth, while epistemically bad biases lead away from the truth. Although other epistemologists have suggested that good epistemic standards may be distinguished from bad ones by how well they lead to finding out the truth, Antony’s proposal is more radical, since she allows political biases to have positive epistemic status when they are truth-conducive. But she grants that much work remains to be done to make this resolution clear and generally acceptable.

Does this suggestion help in averting the threat of circularity that we came upon one paragraph back in reviewing feminist moral critiques of gender bias in prominent theories of justice? Arguably it does, provided that we understand moral fact as being independent of our opinions about it and our procedures for trying to establish it (Campbell 2001). That is, the suggestion helps, provided that moral fact is understood either in the realist sense of fact (one not reducible to what we can agree upon or what our methods would determine) or in a sense of objective fact that allows for the possibility of massive moral error whatever the efforts to the contrary. At this point we may be inclined to ask whether it is possible to know such moral facts? We should remind ourselves, however, that the main reasons to doubt that we can know moral facts are precisely the reasons that we have already examined under the headings above. The objections labeled sociological, psychological, ontological, evolutionary, and methodological are not aimed against knowing moral facts in some non-literal sense of fact, but against knowing moral facts in the same sense that we appear to know other facts about the world. If the possible replies that we have canvassed are adequate responses to these objections, then it is arguable that we may avert the threat of circularity by Antony’s suggested resolution.

This result can be generalized, since it would apply to moral criticisms of impartiality that arise because of concerns about racial or class bias. (See Thomas 1992–3 for a discussion of the importance of moral deference to the testimony of those in oppressed groups.) If the resolution by appeal to realist fact is successful in averting circularity and paradox in the case of gender bias, there is no reason why it should not succeed in other cases in which an epistemic standard is rejected on other moral grounds. Would the resolution be relevant to the moral criticism of other epistemic standards? An example in point would be the criticism by feminists and non-feminists of purely individual-based standards of inquiry, especially in science (Longino 1990, Hardwig 1991, Goldman 1999, and Kitcher 2011b). Some of these critiques are partly moral, since they emphasize the need for democratic values and trust in the context of scientific inquiry. Arguably, they are also motivated by the perception that the individual-centered modes of inquiry are at a disadvantage in discovering the facts. (On this last point see the sections 7–10 to follow.) If we accept the proposed resolution of the bias paradox, we could argue that the change in epistemic standards is justified on both grounds. In the case where the inquiry is moral rather than scientific, can we imagine criticism of epistemic standards other than impartiality? An example might be criticism of the individual-based modes of moral inquiry presupposed in intuitionism. As before, we would need a strategy to avert circularity and paradox. If the strategy is to stick to a realist or sufficiently objective conception of moral fact, its success will depend on whether the problems canvassed above that confront the possibility of such moral knowledge can be resolved.

7. Moral Knowledge May Be Possible – But for Whom?

We have addressed six major clusters of problems that threaten the possibility of moral knowledge defined as someone having a justified true moral belief. For each cluster we have noted avenues of resolution worth further exploration. Nonetheless, the problems may suggest that our definition of moral knowledge misrepresents the inherently social nature of moral knowledge. Developments in the interdisciplinary literature on the evolution and psychology of morality reinforce this worry.

The psychologists Hugo Mercier and Dan Sperber challenge the assumption that complex knowledge resides in the beliefs of rational individuals (Mercier and Sperber 2017). Countless experiments over several decades have shown us to be on average very bad at reasoning on our own. One well-known case is the Wason selection test taken by thousands of subjects. In one version subjects have in front of them four cards with a number on one side and a letter on the other. They are asked which cards that show E, K, 2, or 7 would they turn over to determine the truth of the following statement: If a vowel is on one side there is an even number on the other. On average only 20% get the right answer. If they reason together in small groups, however, their success rate jumps to 80%. What accounts for this improvement?

Most people, including scientists, are subject to “confirmation bias” in that they look for data that are consistent with what they think might be true. Thus if they think the statement in the test is true, they might turn over the “2” card, since doing so cannot help but be consistent with the truth of the statement. What people tend not to search for is something that could disconfirm their hypothesis, such as finding out whether there is a vowel on the other side of card “7”. The groups that did well on this test turned over only cards “E” and “7”, since these are the only cards that could disconfirm the truth of the statement at issue. Mercier and Sperber suggest that the psychological dynamics of reasoning in groups guard against confirmation bias. Each member of a group can have an idea how to solve the problem at issue and put it to the group, but others in the group will tend to look critically at a proposal from someone else to see if the proposal has a flaw. There is in this way a division of cognitive labor within the group. While each member may suffer confirmation bias, as well as other biases, the whole group need not, since each member will try to disconfirm solutions offered by others. The upshot is that the group as a whole will tend to do well, unless everyone is biased in exactly the same way. The best groups comprise people who are cognitively diverse but listen well to each other.

Is there a lesson here for resolving moral problems through social interactive reasoning? Mercier and Sperber cite the abolition of slavery by the British Parliament in 1834 after some fifty years of debate at all levels of society. Abolitionists were at first in the minority. They asked how Christian moral norms of brotherly love and equality before God could be reconciled with enslaving Africans. Those defending slavery retorted that Africans were less intelligent and lacked integrity, but these claims were contradicted by the eloquence and evident moral character of former slaves who addressed public meetings and by Christian witnesses who had known slaves from personal experience. The economic consequences of abolition were also debated. In the end the majority of public opinion changed through discussions that permitted careful examination of diverse points of view from different parts of society over a long enough period to establish credible evidence about the negative consequences of slavery compared to the likely positive effects of its abolition.

This example suggests that, while people may have moral beliefs that initially few others share, free and interactive reasoning in a diverse group can reveal these moral beliefs to be the better justified among the alternatives. Many other examples, such as debates about women’’s right to education or their right to vote, convey the same message. The implication is that moral knowledge, to the extent that it is possible, is more likely to be achieved through interactive reasoning among those with diverse viewpoints who are open to criticism from each other.

8. Moral Knowledge Socially Embodied in Emotions

The philosophical movement of social epistemology supports this perspective. It understands knowledge to be primarily a social achievement (see entry for Social Epistemology). Moral knowledge may be still more deeply social than is generally recognized, even among those who grant that justifying moral beliefs involves a social process of interactive reasoning within a cognitively diverse group. When moral consistency reasoning is part of the social justification process, the reasoning entails efforts to eliminate emotional inconsistencies in thinking (Kumar and Campbell 2022, Chapter 5). In that case moral knowledge, if it were achieved, would be embodied not only in the beliefs of those seeking knowledge, but also in their motivations and feelings. Indeed, given the cognitive basis of moral emotions, it is possible for a society to know through their feelings of guilt that they have done morally wrong even when they believe otherwise for ideological reasons, parallel to the case of the women who cannot shake her feelings of resentment for being unfairly passed over for promotion in favour of a male colleague when she believes her feelings cannot justified given the lesser social status of women (Campbell 2007).

If moral knowledge can be emobodied in widely shared emotion, what about cases where putative moral knowledge thus embodied is an illusion? One important kind of case involves the emotion of fear. Fear can be widely shared even when its intentional object is mistaken for its cause and is not real. For example, people often fear that migrants will take non-migrant jobs, will burden their country’s welfare system, and will commit violent crimes and property theft, when what is feared has no statistical support and is an illusion created for political reasons (Harbin 2023, pp. 63–67). We might think that coming to see no statistical support for our fears would cause those fears to evaporate, but that sadly is not usually what happens. How then are we to gain emotional moral knowledge about what to fear? Ami Harbin argues that the best way to create rationally grounded fear is to work together with those who share our fears toward a new collective response in which we come to understand collectively why we fear as we do. Her proposal offers, in effect, a new direction in moral social epistemology—where we learn, by feeling and reasoning together, how we can fear better, eventually knowing collectively how to fear what is worth fearing (Harbin 2023). Presumably, we could also learn how to be collectively angry, empathetic, loyal, and so on, toward objects that morally warrant these emotions.

9. Epistemological Exclusion

New research on moral evolution accords with the above social view of moral knowledge. Michael Tomasello (2016) makes the case that human moral norms have their origin in the phenomenon of “shared intentionality” that binds diverse individuals to a common project in which they see each other as equal partners. When moral norms conflict each person in a group that is motivated by these norms is an equal partner in the shared project of resolving the moral conflict. If morality is a shared project in this way, the cost of excluding some persons from the process of resolving moral conflict can be significant. Such exclusion can undermine achieving moral knowledge that depends on input from diverse individuals acting as equals.

This understanding of moral knowledge reflects moral concerns of many feminists. For example, Miranda Fricker (2007) examines the “epistemic injustice” of being wrongfully denied recognition as a potential knower due to one’s race, gender, or other identity. See also Kristie Dotson (2011) on the epistemic injustice of silencing caused by violence against women. Other feminists point out that non-moral knowledge claims can be unfairly biased when they are based only on experience of men or neglect the social structures that unjustly bias the perception of causation. For example, it is sometimes thought that the burden of childrearing is biologically determined. Sarah Baffer Hrdy (2009), however, offers a new evolutionary perspective on the shared responsibility for childcare among early humans. Cordelia Fine (2017) challenges the familiar view that gender roles are hormonally determined. Kate Manne (2018) shows how patriarchy tends to undermine socially our ability to reason freely about gender discrimination. Even when reasoning is conceived explicitly as being social and equal, as in social contract theory, the moral upshot of reasoning can reflect racial bias when reasoning is abstracted from actual social context (Charles Mills 2017) or when the causal effects of social structures, like de facto segregation, are ignored (Elizabeth Anderson 2010).

10. The Six Clusters of Problems: Any Progress?

How do these considerations bear on the possibility of moral knowledge? In particular, does a group-centered conception of moral knowledge that is based on social interactive reasoning help to address the six main clusters of problems raised earlier about the possibility of moral knowledge? My answer is positive but qualified. Consider the clusters of problems in order.

The first cluster concerns the sociological reality of moral disagreement. Obviously the group-centered conception of moral knowledge does not eliminate differences in moral outlook, but it may alter how we should think about these differences. I said early on that I would assume that we have knowledge of some non-moral truths. An example would be knowledge that the Earth is round rather than flat. There are pockets of people who still believe that the Earth is flat. Should most remain confident in knowing that the Earth is round? The reason they should is the social interactive reasoning about the issue over centuries from diverse perspectives leading to near universal agreement. Can a similar conclusion be drawn in certain important cases of moral agreement, for example, about moral progress?

Allen Buchanan and Russell Powell (2018) cite ten examples of moral progress. Among them are these four: “…the large reduction, beginning with the British abolition, of the incidence of the most extreme forms of slavery…the increasing recognition and institutionalization of the equal rights of women in some countries, better treatment of some non-human animals, abolition of at least the cruellest punishments” (p. 47). While not everyone would agree even with these examples, there exists, parallel to the non-moral case, extremely broad agreement among diverse groups who have reasoned freely and interactively over extended periods. As Buchanan and Powell make clear, moral progress in such cases goes hand in hand with moral regress in many areas and unresolved deep moral differences about other issues. On the other hand, if what is in question is the bare possibility of moral knowledge, a positive answer seems warranted.

The second, psychological cluster of problems focuses on the dual function of moral judgment as motivation and belief. The problem is how a judgment can be both at once. A resolution that we examined is that moral judgment can be a hybrid of the two states. That suggestion is much easier to defend for moral knowledge when it is embodied in a group of individuals who have distinct beliefs and motivations. The group as a whole is motivated by a collection of internalized moral norms that the group believes to be justified. Even if no mental state of an individual in a group performs both functions at once, the group as a whole can serve both functions of belief and motivation as they are differently embodied in the mental states of its members.

The ontological cluster is a different matter. While the subjective part of knowledge shifts from individual judgment to the internalization of norms within the group and a reasoned consensus that the norms are justified, the reality that the knowledge is about remains a difficult issue: Is moral truth to be treated as theological, non-natural, or natural? There is, however, a subtle difference. The truth in question is about whether the emotionally embodied norms can withstand the scrutiny of the whole group under sustained interactive reasoning in light of relevant non-moral knowledge. Some will complain that such rendering of the object of moral knowledge is too subjective, since it turns moral knowledge into a form of group self-knowledge. A similar worry was noted when we discussed group-based justification (Copp 1995) and pragmatic naturalism (Kitcher 2011). We should concede that such worries need to be answered.

The fourth, fifth, and sixth clusters concerning evolutionary, methodological, and moral problems are easier to address, since the new understanding of moral knowledge is based on (a) current knowledge of evolution, (b) the methodologies of (i) naturalized epistemology, (ii) reflective equilibrium when expanded to include moral consistency reasoning (Campbell 2014, 2017), and (iii) pragmatic naturalism, and (c) moral concerns raised by feminists. When moral knowledge is interpreted to be consistent with psychological and evolutionary studies of morality, these studies and the methodologies listed tend to reinforce the group-centered conception of moral knowledge. Issues will remain, such as the ontological one just noted, but on balance the problems for moral knowledge are diminished. The moral problems of bias raised in feminist epistemology are no exception, since the feminist literature cited above emphasizes the social nature of moral knowledge. That said, resolution of the bias paradox in feminist epistemology may require a realist moral ontology (as noted in section 6) and it may be unclear how to provide it. Our view that moral knowledge is possible is therefore qualified.

11. Conclusion

This entry has addressed six major clusters of problems that threaten the possibility of moral knowledge. Subject to the constraints noted at the outset, the aim has been to examine these problems with an eye to their complexity, especially their mutual ramifications, and to explore avenues of possible resolution that are evident in the philosophical and interdisciplinary literature. From this survey, we can see that for each cluster of problems there are avenues of resolution worth further exploration, especially given interdisciplinary research implying that moral knowledge is deeply social.


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I am grateful to David Copp, a subject editor for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, and to David Braybrooke, Victor Kumar, and Duncan MacIntosh, who read a previous draft in full and caught numerous mistakes and unclarities. I am also grateful to colleagues and students in the Philosophy Department of Dalhousie University for their vigorous discussion of parts of this entry.

Copyright © 2024 by
Richmond Campbell <Richmond.Campbell@Dal.CA>

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