John Langshaw Austin

First published Tue Dec 11, 2012; substantive revision Wed Jun 30, 2021

John Langshaw Austin (1911–1960) was White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy at the University of Oxford. He made a number of contributions in various areas of philosophy, including important work on knowledge, perception, action, freedom, truth, language, and the use of language in speech acts. Distinctions that Austin draws in his work on speech acts—in particular his distinction between locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary acts—have assumed something like canonical status in more recent work. His work on knowledge and perception places him in a broad tradition of “Oxford Realism”, running from Cook Wilson and Harold Arthur Prichard through to J.M. Hinton, M.G.F. Martin, John McDowell, Paul Snowdon, Charles Travis, and Timothy Williamson. His work on truth has played an important role in recent discussions of the extent to which sentence meaning can be accounted for in terms of truth-conditions.

1. Life and Work

Austin was born in Lancaster, England 26 March 1911 to Geoffrey Langshaw Austin and his wife Mary Austin (née Bowes-Wilson). The family moved to Scotland in 1922, where Austin’s father was Secretary of St. Leonard’s School, St. Andrews.

Austin took up a scholarship in Classics at Shrewsbury School in 1924, and, in 1929, went on to study Classics at Balliol College, Oxford. In 1933, he received a First in Literae Humaniores (Classics and Philosophy) in 1933 and was elected to a Fellowship at All Souls College, Oxford. He undertook his first teaching position in 1935, as fellow and tutor at Magdalen College, Oxford.

Austin’s early interests included Aristotle, Kant, Leibniz, and Plato (especially Theaetetus). His more contemporary influences included especially G.E. Moore, John Cook Wilson, and H.A. Prichard. (Austin attended Prichard’s undergraduate lectures with such vigour that Prichard is reported to have made an unsuccessful attempt to exclude him.) It’s plausible that some aspects of Austin’s distinctive approach to philosophical questions derived from his engagement with the last three. All three philosophers shaped their views about general philosophical questions on the basis of careful attention to the more specific judgments we make. And they took our specific judgments (for instance, in Moore’s case, “I know that I have hands”) to be, in general, more secure than more general judgments (for instance, again in Moore’s case, “I know things about external reality”). Moreover, there are some continuities of doctrine, especially with Cook Wilson and Prichard, which align Austin with an “Oxford Realist” school of philosophy. The core components of the latter view are, first, that perception and knowledge are primitive forms of apprehension and, second, that what we apprehend are ordinary elements of our environments that are independent of our apprehending them. (All three thinkers were at one or another time committed to versions of both components of the position but for complex reasons sometimes wavered about the second. See e.g., Travis and Kalderon 2013.)

During the Second World War, Austin served in the British Intelligence Corps. It has been said of him that, “he more than anybody was responsible for the life-saving accuracy of the D-Day intelligence” (reported in Warnock 1963: 9). Austin left the army in September 1945 with the rank of lieutenant colonel. He was honoured for his intelligence work with an Order of the British Empire, the French Croix de Guerre, and the U.S. Officer of the Legion of Merit.

Austin married Jean Coutts in 1941. They had four children, two girls and two boys.

After the War, Austin returned to Oxford. He became White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy in 1952. In the same year, he took on the role of delegate to Oxford University Press, becoming Chairman of the Finance Committee in 1957. His other administrative work for the University included the role of Junior Proctor (1949–50), and Chairman of the Sub-Faculty of Philosophy (1953–55). He was president of the Aristotelian Society 1956–57. He gave the William James Lectures in Harvard in 1955 (a version of the lectures was published as How to Do Things With Words – see 1962b in the Bibliography). He invented the card game CASE in 1951.

During this period, Austin edited H.W.B. Joseph Lectures on the Philosophy of Leibniz (1949) and produced a translation of Gottlob Frege’s Grundlagen der Arithmetik, so that it could be set as an exam (1950). Austin wrote little and published less. Much of his influence was through teaching and other forms of small-scale engagement with philosophers. He also instituted a series of “Saturday Morning” discussion sessions, which involved detailed discussions of a number of philosophical topics and works, including Aristotle’s Nichomachean Ethics, Frege’s Grundlagen, Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception, and Noam Chomsky’s Syntactic Structures.

Austin died in Oxford on 8 February 1960.

(For more detail about Austin’s life, work, and influences see Ayer 1978; Baldwin 2010; Berlin 1973b; Dancy 2010; Garvey 2014; Gustaffson 2011; Hacker 2004; Hampshire 1960; Travis and Kalderon 2013; Marion 2000a,b, 2009; Passmore 1957; Pears 1962; Pitcher 1973; Searle 2014; Urmson and Warnock 1961; Urmson 1967; Warnock 1963, 1973a; Warnock 1989: 1–10.)

2. Language and Truth

2.1 Language and Philosophy

In this section, we’ll look at Austin’s views about the role of the study of language in philosophy more generally. It is common to count Austin as an “Ordinary Language Philosopher”, along with, for example, Gilbert Ryle, P.F. Strawson, and Ludwig Wittgenstein. However, although each of these thinkers was sometimes concerned, in one or another way, with our use of ordinary language, it is far from clear what in addition to that the label is supposed to entail. And it is equally unclear that the various thinkers so-labelled deserve to be grouped together.

Austin cared about language for two main reasons. First, language use is a central part of human activity, so it’s an important topic in its own right. Second, the study of language is an aide—indeed, for some topics, an important preliminary—to the pursuit of philosophical topics. Many of Austin’s most distinctive reflections on the use of language arise in the course of discussion of other topics (see especially his “A Plea for Excuses” 1957).

One route to understanding Austin’s general approach to philosophy is provided by reflection on the following comment by Stuart Hampshire:

[Austin] was constitutionally unable to refrain from applying the same standards of truth and accuracy to a philosophical argument, sentence by sentence, as he would have applied to any other serious subject-matter. He could not have adopted a special tone of voice, or attitude of mind, for philosophical questions. (Hampshire 1960: 34)

In short, it mattered to Austin that, in attempting to make out positions and arguments, philosophers should meet ordinary standards of truth, accuracy, and so forth. On the one hand, this presented a general challenge to philosophers, a challenge that they might easily fail to meet. The challenge is either to make use of an ordinary vocabulary, or ordinary concepts, in order to make claims or judgments that are, according to ordinary standards, at least true (or accurate, etc.); or to do the serious work required to set up an appropriate technical vocabulary and then use it to say things that are by appropriate standards true (accurate, etc.). On the other hand, it provided Austin with what he took to be a reasonably secure approach to general philosophical questions: first, find a connection between those general philosophical questions and the more specific claims or judgments that we ordinarily make and take ourselves to be secure in making; second, make sufficiently many of the relevant claims or judgments, in a sufficient variety of circumstances, in order to address the general philosophical questions.

Austin held that, in their hurry to address general philosophical questions, philosophers have a tendency to ignore the nuances involved in making and assessing ordinary claims and judgments. Among the risks associated with insensitivity to the nuances, two stand out. First, philosophers are liable to miss distinctions that are made in our ordinary use of language and that are relevant to our concerns and claims. Second, failure to exploit fully the resources of ordinary language can make philosophers susceptible to seemingly forced choices between unacceptable alternatives. Here Austin warns:

It is worth bearing in mind…the general rule that we must not expect to find simple labels for complicated cases…however well-equipped our language, it can never be forearmed against all possible cases that may arise and call for description: fact is richer than diction. (1957: 195)

On Austin’s view, language is likely to be well designed for the ends to which it is ordinarily put. But special, or especially complicated, cases may require special treatment. This is apt to be an especial liability when it comes to the question whether a sentence can be used in a particular circumstance to state something true or false:

We say, for example, that a certain statement is exaggerated or vague or bold, a description somewhat rough or misleading or not very good, an account rather general or too concise. In cases like these it is pointless to insist on deciding in simple terms whether the statement is “true or false”. Is it true or false that Belfast is north of London? That the galaxy is the shape of a fried egg? That Beethoven was a drunkard? That Wellington won the battle of Waterloo? There are various degrees and dimensions of success in making statements: the statements fit the facts always more or less loosely, in different ways on different occasions for different intents and purposes. (1950a: 129–130)

Austin makes two points here. First, when faced with a putative choice of this sort, we should not insist on deciding in simple terms whether a statement is true or false (or whether an expression applies or fails to apply to something). Some cases are complicated, and, in some of those cases, we are capable of meeting some of the complications by saying more: “Well, it is true that Belfast is north of London if you understand that claim in the following way….” Second, the complications can take different forms, and can matter in different ways, on different occasions. Given the prior course of our conversation, and our specific intents and purposes in discussing the issue, it might be manifest that, on that particular occasion, we will understand the complications, without a need for their articulation, so that the following is fine as it stands: “Yes, it is true that Belfast is north of London.”

Austin’s summarised his view of the role of attention to ordinary language in philosophy thus:

First, words are our tools, and, as a minimum, we should use clean tools: we should know what we mean and what we do not, and we must forearm ourselves against the traps that language sets us. Secondly, words are not (except in their own little corner) facts or things: we need therefore to prise them off the world, to hold them apart from and against it, so that we can realize their inadequacies and arbitrariness, and can re-look at the world without blinkers. Thirdly, and more hopefully, our common stock of words embodies all the distinctions men have found worth drawing, and the connexions they have found worth making, in the lifetimes of many generations: these surely are likely to be more sound, since they have stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest, and more subtle, at least in all ordinary and reasonably practical matters, than any that you or I are likely to think up in our arm-chairs of an afternoon—the most favoured alternative method. (1957: 181–182)[1]

Austin holds, then, that an important preliminary to philosophising on at least some topics—for instance, where the topic is “ordinary and reasonably practical”—would be the detailed study of the language we use to speak on that topic, and of the way that we use it.

Austin didn’t think that the investigation of language was more than a preliminary to theorising, either in philosophy or science. He wasn’t averse to theory construction, even if its outcome were potentially revisionary (see e.g., 1957: 189). His concern was only that such theorising should be properly grounded, and that it should not be driven, for example, by an initial failure to keep track of distinctions that we mark in our ordinary use of language. Further, Austin draws an important distinction between “words and facts or things,” and he seems to suggest that we have ways of investigating the world—that is, facts and things—which can bypass the “blinkers” sometimes imposed on us by our words. We’ll return to Austin’s distinction between the world, including facts—which Austin thinks of as particular or concrete—and words, including the statements we make in using words, in section 2.2. And we’ll return to Austin’s idea that we can have unblinkered awareness of the world—unblinkered, that is, by the linguistic or judgmental capacities that we bring to bear on what we experience—in section 3.1.

It’s fair to say that Austin’s work has been caught up in the stampede away from broadly ordinary language-based approaches to philosophical questions. The work of Paul Grice, collected in his Studies in the Way of Words (1989), has played an important role in the negative assessment of such approaches, including aspects of Austin’s work. One central idea in Grice’s work is that the ways in which we use language—crudely, the pairings of situations and sentences that we find appropriate or inappropriate, or what we would or wouldn’t say in those situations—is not a simple function of the nature of the respective situations and the correctness conditions with which the sentences are associated. Rather, judgments about appropriateness are driven also by, for example, our sensitivities to the demands of rational co-operation with our conversational partners. And it has been thought that, in one or another way, ordinary language philosophers, including Austin, have been insensitive to the additional parameters to which judgments of appropriateness are beholden (for early attacks of this sort, see Ayer 1967 and Searle 1966). It is beyond the scope of this entry to attempt to assess either the extent to which Austin should really be seen as a target of such objections or, if he should, whether they demonstrate weaknesses in his work. However, in pursuing any such assessment, it is important to note that Austin’s exploitation of ordinary language is never driven by simple appeal to whether, in a situation considered as a whole, we would take it to be simply appropriate or inappropriate to use some sentence or other. Rather, Austin is—as we are—sensitive to more fine-grained appraisals of uses of bits of language and, when he judges that an utterance on an occasion would be false or nonsensical, he intends that judgment to contrast with less damaging negative appraisals—for example, about what it would be merely inappropriate or impolite to say. Moreover, Austin is sensitive to the specific features of situations upon which we base one or another more fine-grained appraisal of uses of sentences. As he stresses, “It takes two to make a truth” (1950a: 124 fn.1). And Austin is sensitive to the details of both participants in that and other forms of transaction between word and world.[2]

(For discussion of Austin’s approach to philosophical questions, with reference to his classification as an ordinary language philosopher, see Berlin 1973b; Cavell 1965; Garvey 2014; Grice 1989: 3–21; Gustafsson 2011; Hampshire 1960, 1965; Kaplan 2018: 1–39; Longworth 2018a; Marion 2009; Martin ms (Other Internet Resources); Pears 1962; Pitcher 1973; Putnam 1994; Quine 1965; Reimer 2018; Searle 1966; Soames 2003: 171–219; Travis 1991; Urmson 1965, 1967; Urmson and Warnock 1961; Warnock 1973a, 1989: 2–10; White 1967.)

2.2 Language and Truth

The topic of this section is Austin’s views about truth. Austin’s views about truth are scattered throughout his work, but his most explicit discussion of the topic is in the paper “Truth” (1950a) (see also 1953, 1954ms, 1956b, 1962b, 1962c). Amongst the distinctive claims Austin makes about truth are the following:

The predicate “is true” has a descriptive function: it serves to characterize the obtaining of a relation between statements and facts (1950a: 117–121).
The facts that figure in determining whether or not a statement is true are particulars, for example, things, features, events, and states of affairs (1950a: 121–124; 1954ms: passim).
The relation between statements and facts that underwrites the truth or falsity of statements is itself underwritten by relations between sentences and types of fact, and between episodes of stating and particular facts (1950a: 121–133).
Human judgment is involved in determining whether a particular fact makes true a statement. And judgment is involved in a way that is sensitive to the intents and purposes with which a statement is made. For that reason, truth is not a simple relation between types of sentences (given their meanings) and particular facts. A pair of statements made using the same sentence with respect to the same facts but on different occasions—given different intents and purposes—might differ in truth-value (1950a: 122 fn2; 1962a: 40–41, 62–77, 110–111; 1962b: 142–147).[3]
Despite (1), Austin appears to endorse a form of deflationism about truth—a view on which truth is a thin or non-explanatory notion. According to this form of deflationism, saying that a statement is true is just a way of saying that the statement has one or another of a range of more specific positive qualities—for example, that it is satisfactory, correct, fair, etc. (1950a: 130; 1956b: 250–251; 1957: 180).

Let’s start with (1)–(3). Austin 1950a is ostensibly responding to a proposal in Strawson 1949 according to which the function of the predicate “is true” is to facilitate the performance of acts of affirmation or agreement, and not to describe things—e.g., statements—as possessing the property of truth. For short, Strawson claimed that “is true” has a performative rather than a descriptive function. And he accused his opponents of committing the descriptive fallacy: the alleged fallacy of treating expressions, or aspects of the use of expressions, that really serve performative purposes as having (only) a descriptive purpose.[4] One of Austin’s aims was to defend the view that the predicate “is true” has a descriptive function (perhaps in addition to its having one or more performative functions). In pursuing that aim, Austin also made a number of distinctive proposals about the descriptive function of the truth predicate.[5]

Let’s turn, then, to the core of Austin’s account of truth. Austin presents his account of truth as an account of truth for statements. However, “statement” is at least two ways ambiguous, covering both historical episodes in which something is stated—what I’ll refer to as statings—and also the things or propositions that are stated therein—which I’ll refer to as what is stated. Austin isn’t especially careful about the distinction, but it’s possible to reconstruct much of what he says in a way that respects it (for discussion of the distinction see e.g., Cartwright 1962).

Austin’s primary interest appears to be the truth of statings. He writes of “statement” that it has “the merit of clearly referring to the historic use of a sentence by an utterer” (1950a: 121). However, statings are not ordinarily said to be true or false, except derivatively insofar as what is stated in them is true or false. Rather, statings are assessed as, for example, correct or incorrect, appropriate or inappropriate, and so forth. However, it is plausible that stating correctly is closely associated with making a statement that is true. And Austin’s account can be understood as an account of the conditions in which statings are such that what is stated in them is true.[6]

Austin presents the core of his account of truth in the following way:

When is a statement true? The temptation is to answer (at least if we confine ourselves to “straightforward” statements): “When it corresponds to the facts”. And as a piece of standard English this can hardly be wrong. Indeed, I must confess I do not really think it is wrong at all: the theory of truth is a series of truisms. Still, it can at least be misleading. (1950a: 121)

The two obvious sources of potential misdirection in the formula that Austin endorses here are its appeal to correspondence and its appeal to facts.[7] Austin attempts to prevent our being misled by explaining how those two appeals ought to be understood. Austin’s focus in his “Truth” (1950a) is mainly on the nature of correspondence. He deals more fully with facts in his “Unfair to Facts” (1954ms).

In giving an account of correspondence, Austin makes appeal to two types of (what he calls) conventions (as per (3) above):[8]

  • Descriptive conventions. These correlate sentences with types of situation, thing, event, etc., in the world.
  • Demonstrative conventions. These correlate statements (statings) with historic (particular, concrete) situations, things, events, etc., in the world. (1950a: 121–122)[9]

The descriptive conventions associate sentences with (types of) ways for things to be: ways for situations, things, events, etc. to be. For instance, the sentence “The cat is on the mat” is associated with a type of way for things to be in which the cat is on the mat. A variety of different historic situations might be of that type. For instance, one historic situation of that type might involve Logos (Derrida’s cat), while a different historic situation of the same type might involve Nothing (Sartre’s cat). Similarly, cat-mat pairings that took place at different times would be different historic situations or events and yet might be of the same type.

The demonstrative conventions, by contrast, associate particular statings—themselves historic events—with some amongst the accessible historic situations, things, events, etc. Consider, for example, the following simplified case. There are two accessible situations, one of which is of the cat-on-mat type and one of which is of the dog-on-linoleum type. The descriptive conventions governing the English sentence “The cat is on the mat” do not, and cannot, determine which of the two accessible situations a speaker aims to talk about on a particular occasion. In order to achieve that, the speaker must find a way of making manifest that their goal is to select, say, the dog-on-linoleum situation. They might achieve this by, for example, their use on a particular occasion of the present tense, or by pointing, etc. (1950a: 121–126).[10]

With this machinery in place, Austin continues:

A statement is said to be true when the historic state of affairs [or e.g., situation, thing, event] to which it is correlated by the demonstrative conventions (the one to which it “refers”) is of a type [footnote omitted] with which the sentence used in making it is correlated by the descriptive conventions. (1950a: 122)

What does “is of a type with which” mean? Austin expands on his account in the omitted footnote:

“Is of a type with which” means “is sufficiently like those standard states of affairs with which”. Thus, for a statement to be true one state of affairs must be like certain others, which is a natural relation, but also sufficiently like to merit the same “description”, which is no longer a purely natural relation. To say “This is red” is not the same as to say “This is like those”, nor even as to say “This is like those which were called red”. That things are similar, or even “exactly” similar, I may literally see, but that they are the same I cannot literally see—in calling them the same colour a convention is involved additional to the conventional choice of the name to be given to the colour which they are said to be. (1950a: 122 fn.2)

The English sentence “This is red” is correlated by the descriptive conventions with a type of way for things to be: a type instanced by all and only those historic situations or states of affairs in which a selected thing is red. According to Austin, a stating by use of that sentence would be correct if the thing selected in the stating via the demonstrative conventions were sufficiently like standard situations or states of affairs in which a selected thing is red. So, we rely on the existence of a range of standard instances that are assumed to be of the required type. We can see that the thing selected in this stating, via the demonstrative conventions, is now in various ways similar and dissimilar from those standard instances. The question we need to answer is this: Is this thing of the same type as the standard instances with respect to its colour? That is, is it the same colour as they are? According to Austin, we cannot answer that question simply by looking. In an at least attenuated sense we must make a decision as to whether the present instance is, in relevant respects, sufficiently similar to the standard instances as to mandate treating it as of the very same type.[11]

Notice that, on Austin’s view, states of affairs (etc.) do not per se mandate that they belong to one or another type. To that extent, they do not alone determine which propositional statements are true of them. The things to which true statings correspond, then, are (in at least that sense) particulars (see (2) above). The things to which statings correspond, then, appear to be quite different from facts as the latter are commonly understood by philosophers. For facts are often thought of as proposition-like—as exhaustively captured by instances of the form “The fact that p”. And it seems that elements of that type would mandate the correctness of one or another classification. Austin’s views about facts are developed a bit more fully in his “Unfair to Facts” (1954ms). There Austin makes clear, first, that he uses “facts”, with etymological precedent, to speak of particulars. Second, Austin sketches a view of propositional fact talk on which it is used as a way of indirectly denoting particulars as the elements that make the specified propositions true. However, Austin’s basic account of truth can for the most part be detached from his views about facts and fact-talk.[12]

The role for human judgment or decision in mediating the classification of particulars leaves open that their correct classification as to type might vary depending on specific features of the occasion for so classifying them (see (4) above). It may be, for example, that for certain purposes an historic state of affairs involving a rose is sufficiently like standard situations involving red things as to warrant sameness of classification, while for different purposes its likeness is outweighed by its dissimilarities from the standard cases. Moreover, what are counted as standard cases may vary with the purposes operative in attempting to classify, and may shift as new cases come to be counted as of a specific type.[13]

The precise ways in which our statings depend for their correctness or incorrectness on the facts can vary with variation in specific features of the occasion, in particular with variation in the intents and purposes of conversational participants. As Austin puts it,

It seems to be fairly generally realized nowadays that, if you just take a bunch of sentences…impeccably formulated in some language or other, there can be no question of sorting them out into those that are true and those that are false; for (leaving out of account so-called “analytic” sentences) the question of truth and falsehood does not turn only on what a sentence is, nor yet on what it means, but on, speaking very broadly, the circumstances in which it is uttered. Sentences as such are not either true or false. (1962a: 110–111. See also 40–41, 65)

And the circumstances can matter in a variety of ways, not simply by supplying, or failing to supply, an appropriate array of facts:

…in the case of stating truly or falsely, just as in the case of advising well or badly, the intents and purposes of the utterance and its context are important; what is judged true in a school book may not be so judged in a work of historical research. Consider … “Lord Raglan won the battle of Alma”, remembering that Alma was a soldier’s battle if ever there was one and that Lord Raglan’s orders were never transmitted to some of his subordinates. Did Lord Raglan then win the battle of Alma or did he not? Of course in some contexts, perhaps in a school book, it is perfectly justifiable to say so—it is something of an exaggeration, maybe, and there would be no question of giving Raglan a medal for it…“Lord Raglan won the battle of Alma” is exaggerated and suitable to some contexts and not to others; it would be pointless to insist on its [i.e., the sentence’s] truth or falsehood. (1962b: 143–144, interpolation added)

It’s important here to separate two questions. First, is the sentence “Lord Raglan won the battle of Alma” true? Second, is what is stated in using that sentence on a particular occasion, true? In order for the first question to get an affirmative answer, every use of the sentence would have to be—or issue in a statement that is—true.[14] But although the sentence can be used in a schoolbook to make a statement that is true, it might also be used in a work of historical research, or in support of Raglan’s decoration, in making a false statement. Hence, the sentence doesn’t take the same truth-value on every occasion: the sentence per se is neither true nor false. By contrast, there is no reason to deny that the things that are stated in using the sentence on occasions are true: in particular, there is no reason to deny that what is stated by the schoolbook occurrence of the sentence is true. So, the second question can be given an affirmative answer, as long as we are willing to allow that a sentence can be used to make different statements on different occasions (see also Austin’s discussion of “real” in Sense and Sensibilia (1962a: 62–77) for an array of relevant examples).

We should avoid a possible misunderstanding of Austin here. His argument shows, at most, that whatever combines with the facts to determine a particular truth-value varies from occasion to occasion. That does nothing to dislodge the natural view that a sentence can carry its meaning with it from occasion to occasion, and thus possess a literal meaning. However, if we wish to retain that idea, we must give up on the idea that sentence meaning simply combines with the facts that are being spoken about to determine truth-value: we must reject the idea that sentence meanings determine truth-conditions. Plausibly, we should also give up the idea that meaning alone determines what is stated (at least insofar as the latter determines truth-conditions). In taking this line, we would reject views of meaning according to which it is given by appeal to truth-conditions.[15]

Austin’s account gives rise to the possibility of utterances in which no truth-evaluable statement is produced:

Suppose that we confront “France is hexagonal” with the facts, in this case, I suppose, with France, is it true or false? Well, if you like, up to a point; of course I can see what you mean by saying that it is true for certain intents and purposes. It is good enough for a top-ranking general, perhaps, but not for a geographer… How can one answer this question, whether it is true or false that France is hexagonal? It is just rough, and that is the right and final answer to the question of the relation of “France is hexagonal” to France. It is a rough description; it is not a true or a false one. (1962b: 143)

What Austin characterises in his final denial is the sentence “France is hexagonal”, in relation to France. He needn’t, and doesn’t, deny that on occasion, for particular intents and purposes, one might use the sentence to state a truth. However, he suggests that, in some cases, the circumstances of utterance may be such that no truth-evaluable statement is made by the use of a sentence.

Suppose, for example, that someone uttered “France is hexagonal” out of the blue, without making manifest any intents and purposes. In that case, there would be nothing to go on, in seeking to establish whether the utterance was true or false, other than the words used, given their meanings. But those words might have been used to make a variety of statements, statements whose truth or falsehood depends on the facts in a variety of ways. Hence, unless we are willing to allow that the utterance is both true and false, we should withhold that mode of assessment: although such an utterance would involve a perfectly meaningful sentence, it would fail to be either true or false. Austin thought that our uses of words are always liable to that sort of failure, especially when we are doing philosophy. When used in cases that are out of the ordinary, or in the absence of the background required to sustain the statement of truths or falsehoods, words might—in that sense—fail us.

Austin makes no claims to generality for the account of truth that he sketches. However, it’s natural to wonder to what extent the account can naturally be extended in order to take in types of statement that he doesn’t explicitly attempt to bring within its purview. Potential pressure points here include statements whose expression involves negation (see 1950a: 128–129, 129 fn.1), quantification (see 1962b: 144), or conditionals, and statements of necessary truths. The three main options open to the defender of Austin here are the following. First, an attempt might be made to bring some cases within the purview of a natural generalization of Austin’s account (see, for example, Warnock 1989: 56–61). Second, it might be allowed that some such cases require distinctive treatment, but argued that they can still be connected with the account Austin offers as further species of the truth-genus. Third, an attempt might be made to argue that some such cases are so distinctive that the forms of positive appraisal that are appropriate to them are not really forms of appraisal as to truth.[16]

Let’s turn to (5), the question of the extent to which Austin endorses a deflationary account of truth. The promiscuity of the classifier “deflationist” has a tendency to render the question difficult to discuss in a useful way. However, we can at least consider some ways in which Austin might be thought to give an explanatory role to truth, or to deny it such a role. It’s clear that Austin wishes to reject Strawson’s very strong form of deflationism, according to which the function of truth is exhaustively performative: saying that a statement is true amounts, precisely, to endorsing that statement oneself. Moreover, there is no sign that Austin thinks an account can be given of the expression of statements by statings that isn’t bound up with consideration of the conditions in which their stating would be subject to one or another form of positive appraisal—at the most general level, consideration of their correctness-conditions. However, Austin often characterizes truth and falsity themselves as, in effect, mere labels for positive and negative poles, respectively, in a variety of more specific forms of appraisal.

We become obsessed with “truth” when discussing statements, just as we become obsessed with “freedom” when discussing conduct. So long as we think that what has always and alone to be decided is whether a certain action was done freely or was not, we get nowhere: but so soon as we turn instead to the numerous other adverbs used in the same connexion (“accidentally”, “unwillingly”, “inadvertently”, &c.), things become easier, and we come to see that no concluding inference of the form “Ergo, it was done freely (or not freely)” is required. Like freedom, truth is a bare minimum or an illusory ideal (the truth, the whole truth, and nothing but the truth about, say, the battle of Waterloo or the Primavera). (1950a: 130; see also 1956b: 250–251, 1957: 180)

Austin’s idea here seems to be the following. There are numerous specific forms of positive appraisal that we employ with respect to statings: they might be fair, reasonable, accurate, precise, adequate, satisfactory and so forth. (Recall that Austin would have taken each form of assessment to be occasion-bound: a matter, for example, of what would be fair and reasonable to judge on this particular occasion.) In saying that what is stated in a stating is true, we are in effect saying that the stating meets the “bare minimum” condition of being susceptible to one or another of those specific forms of positive appraisal. It’s consistent with this type of view that our conception of the natures of what we state, and of how our statings come to be expressions of those things, is bound up with our conception of the conditions in which our statings, and what we thereby state, are susceptible to one or another form of positive appraisal. To that extent, it differs from some stronger forms of deflationism on which no truth-related mode of positive appraisal plays a non-derivative explanatory role. Moreover, the view can take more or less radical forms. Its most radical form treats truth as a mere disjunction of the more specific modes of positive appraisal, with no uniform underlying commonality amongst those specific modes. That view would be a distinctive form of deflationism about truth, since it would reject the idea that truth per se plays an essential role in explanation. Its less radical form allows that truth might impose a uniform necessary condition on the specific modes of positive appraisal, and thereby play an essential role, through its government of the specific modes, in the explanation of what is stated in statings. The latter form of view wouldn’t count as an interesting form of deflationism, although it might well be an interesting position in its own right.

Austin discusses an important range of ways in which assessment as to truth can cover a variety of more fine-grained modes of appraisal in his “How to Talk” (1953). See also the discussions of this paper in Chisholm 1964 and Warnock 1989: 47–56.

(For discussion of Austin’s account of truth, see Barwise and Etchemendy 1987; Bennett 1966; Crary 2002; Davidson 1969; Grice 1989: 3–40; Hansen 2014; Kirkham 1995: 124–140; Mates 1974; Narboux 2011; Putnam 1994; Recanati 1994: 1–5, 121–130, 141–153; Searle 1966; Strawson 1950, 1965; Travis 1991, 2005, 2008: 1–18, 2011; Warnock 1973c, 1989: 45–64, 135–145, 163–4 fn.74; White 1967; C.J.F. Williams 1973.)

2.3 Speech Acts and Truth

In this section, we’ll consider some aspects of Austin’s treatment of speech acts—things done with words (the main sources here are: 1962b, 1956b, and 1963; see also 1946: 97–103, 1950a: 130–133, 1953). The topics we’ll consider are the following.

In his work on speech acts, Austin presents a different reason for why sentences, given their meanings, do not combine with the facts to determine truth-values. The second reason is based on the fact that any sentence can be used in performing a variety of linguistic acts. Although in stating, we typically produce statements that are assessable as true or false, in performing other linguistic acts, we need not produce things that are assessable in that way. The second reason depends, then, on two sub-claims: first, that whether a sentence is used on an occasion to make a statement—more generally, something truth-assessable—is dependent on more than just what it means; second, that some uses of sentences to perform linguistic acts other than the making of statements are not properly assessable as true or false.
Connected with (1) is Austin’s discussion of a distinction between constative utterances—broadly, utterances of a type suitable to be appraised as to truth—and performative utterances—broadly, utterances that are suitable only for other forms of appraisal (1962b: 1–93).
In addition to discussing the putative constative-performative distinction, Austin sketches a distinction amongst speech act types, between locutionary acts, illocutionary acts, and perlocutionary acts—broadly, the distinction between saying anything at all, saying something with a specific force (e.g., making a statement, asking a question, making a request), and the further effects of saying something with a specific force (e.g., getting an audience to believe something, getting them to tell you something, or getting them to do what you request). The need to draw such a distinction is now very widely accepted and probably amounts to Austin’s central contribution to more recent work (1962b: 83–164).
Austin makes some cryptic suggestions about the wider significance of his discussion of topic (3), concerning their bearing on, for example, what he calls “the true/false fetish” and “the value/fact fetish” (1962b: 148–164).

A topic that has figured in some recent discussions, but that we won’t discuss here, is this:

In the course of discussing his main topics, Austin sometimes makes use of a distinction between serious and non-serious uses of language, and suggests that non-serious uses of language are derivative from serious uses. (Roughly, the distinction is a generalisation of distinctions between genuine assertions and mock assertions in fiction or on the stage. See e.g., Austin 1962b: 104.) Jacques Derrida challenged the standing of the distinction and the priority that Austin seemed to accord to some of what he counted as serious uses. John Searle responded to Derrida and the issue has become a source of some attempts at engagement between those sympathetic to Searle’s more “Analytic” approaches to issues in this area and those sympathetic to more “Continental” approaches. (See Derrida 1977 and Searle 1977. For recent discussion of aspects of the controversy see de Gaynesford 2009, A.W. Moore 2000, Richmond 1996, Ricks 1992.)

Austin presents the second reason for why sentences do not conspire with the facts to determine truth-values in considering whether there is a useful distinction to be drawn between (indicative) sentences that are used to make statements—which Austin labels constatives—and sentences that are useable in the performance of some act—which Austin labels performatives (or sometimes performatory) (topic (2) above).[17] Austin’s opening list of examples of putative performatives includes: “I take … to be my lawfully wedded …”—as uttered in the course of the marriage ceremony; “I name this ship the Queen Elizabeth”—as uttered when smashing a bottle against the stern; “I give and bequeath my watch to my brother”—as occurring in a will; “I bet you sixpence it will rain tomorrow” (1962b: 5). About these examples, Austin writes:

In these examples it seems clear that to utter the sentence (in, of course, the appropriate circumstances) is not to describe my doing of what I should be said in so uttering to be doing…[fn. Still less anything that I have already done or have yet to do.]…or to state that I am doing it. None of the utterances cited is either true or false: I assert this as obvious and do not argue it. (1962b: 6)

Austin is sometimes read as seeking to defend this view of performatives. However, four features of his presentation suggest that his view is not so straightforward. First, Austin presents the issue as concerning the classification by use of utterances of types of sentence, and we have already seen that he is in general sceptical about alleged associations between sentences and their occasional uses. Second, Austin fails here, and elsewhere, to offer serious arguments for his assertion that none of the cited utterances is either true or false. Third, Austin’s assertion is made using the apparently performative form, “I assert … ”—a form that appears, moreover, to falsify the generalisation that performatives lack truth-values. Finally, Austin issues the following warning in a footnote, two pages earlier: “Everything said in these sections is provisional, and subject to revision in the light of later sections” (1962b: 4 fn.1).

Austin goes on to discuss two apparently quite different modes of assessment for utterances of the two apparently different types. Constatives, as already noted, are assessed along the dimension of truth and falsehood. By contrast, performatives are assessed along dimensions of happiness and unhappiness, or felicity and infelicity. Taking the example of an utterance of “I take … to be my lawfully wedded … ”, and simplifying Austin’s discussion, there are two main sorts of unhappiness, or infelicity, to which this performative is liable. First, there are misfires:

…if we…utter the formula incorrectly, or if…we are not in a position to do the act because we are…married already, or it is the purser and not the captain who is conducting the ceremony, then the act in question, …marrying, is not successfully performed at all, …[it] is not achieved. (1962b: 15–16)

Second, there are abuses: in these cases, the act is performed, but insincerely, perhaps for example in instituting a marriage of convenience.

It’s important to see that, even if it were true, in general, that some things done using performatives—e.g., marrying, naming, bequeathing, and betting—are neither true nor false, but rather are subject to assessment as happy or unhappy, it would not follow that truth is out of the picture. That would depend, not only on the basic claim that actions of those types per se are not true or false, but also on the claim that particular actions of those types are not also of other types that are assessable as true or false. And Austin recognised that actions can be of more than one type (or, perhaps, that distinct actions might be performed simultaneously):

To say that I believe you ‘is’ on occasion to accept your statement; but it is also to make an assertion, which is not made by the strictly performatory utterance “I accept your statement”. (1950a: 133)

In the examples that Austin cites, things are done that are not assessable as true or false—marrying, naming, betting, etc. But as Austin points out, those examples might also involve other things being done—e.g., the making of statements—that are, or involve things that are, assessable as true or false. However, even though this undermines Austin’s provisional characterisation of performatives, the possibility that we might sometimes do more than one thing in using a performative puts pressure on the idea that there is a simple connection between sentences and the various things we do in using them.

I’ve suggested that Austin’s view of the putative distinction between performatives and constatives is less straightforward than it might at first seem. And the structure of Austin (1962b) bears out that assessment. Although much of the book seems to be devoted to pursuit of a distinction between performatives and constatives, none of the attempts succeeds. It is possible, but implausible, that in the course of the lectures Austin found that he was unable to draw a distinction that he thought should be drawn. A more plausible interpretation is that Austin’s purpose is not to draw such a distinction. Rather it is to argue—through the failures of various attempts to draw the distinction—that there is no such simple distinction—no sorting of sentences into those apt for performative, and those apt for constative, use.

Austin argues against the distinction by appeal to the fact that the same forms of assessment are applicable to utterances apparently of both sorts:

…unhappiness…seems to characterize both kinds of utterance, not merely the performative; and…the requirement of conforming or bearing some relation to the facts, different in different cases, seems to characterize performatives… (1962b: 91)

Attempts to make a statement are liable both to misfires and abuses. For example, an attempt to make a statement using “France is hexagonal” might misfire if there were no such country as France, or (as discussed above) if no suitable intents and purposes were manifest (1962b: 47–52). And an attempt might be an abuse if the speaker failed to believe that France was hexagonal. Attempts at performative utterance are liable to assessment either in terms of truth or falsehood, or in terms similarly dependent on conformity with the facts: my utterance of “I warn you that the bull is about to charge” may be liable to criticism as mistaken rather than unhappy if the bull is not about to charge (1962b: 55). More generally, it is often impossible to decide, just from the words a speaker uses, whether their utterance is susceptible to one or another form of assessment. And there are cases like “I state that …” which seem to satisfy all formal and lexical requirements for being performative, and yet are used in utterances “…which surely are the making of statements, and surely are essentially true or false” (1962b: 91). (Austin’s ideas here also bear on topic (4) above.)

(For discussion of Austin’s views about performative utterances, see Bach 1975; G. Bird 1981; Black 1963; Cohen 1964, 1974; Forguson 1966; Heal 1974; Hornsby 1988, 2006; Jack 1981; Lemmon 1962; Lewis 1972; Schiffer 1972; Sinnott-Armstrong 1994; Tsohatzidis 2018; Urmson 1977; Warnock 1973b, 1989: 105–151.)

From the wreckage of the initial distinction, Austin assembles a new model (topic (3) above). The new model is founded on distinctions among various kinds of thing speakers do—various acts they perform—when they produce an utterance.

  • The locutionary act: the production of an utterance that can be classified by its phonetic, grammatical, and lexical characteristics, up to sentence meaning (the phatic act). It is also the performance of an act that can be classified by its content (the rhetic act)—a feature distinctively of acts of speech. If I promise that I’ll be home for dinner and then promise that I’ll work late, my actions are instances of two different locutionary acts: one with the content that I’ll be home for dinner, and one with the content that I’ll work late (1962b: 94–98).
  • The illocutionary act: an act classifiable not only by its content—as with the locutionary act—but also by its force (stating, warning, promising, etc.). If I promise that I’ll be home for dinner and later state that I’ll be home for dinner, my actions are instances of the same locutionary act: both actions involve the content that I’ll be home for dinner. However, my actions are instances of different illocutionary acts: one has the force of a promise, while the other has the force of a statement (1962b: 98–101).
  • The perlocutionary act: an act classifiable by its “ … consequential effects upon the feelings, thoughts, or actions of the audience, or of the speaker, or of other persons … ”. If I warn that the ice is thin, and so perform one illocutionary act, I may thereby perform a variety of perlocutionary acts: I may persuade someone to avoid it, or encourage someone to take a risk, and so forth (1962b: 101).

Austin’s interest in the types of act so distinguished was “…essentially to fasten on the second, illocutionary act and contrast it with the other two…” (1962b: 103). What did Austin think was important about the illocutionary act? And what did he think were the dangers inherent in failing to mark it off from the other types?

Austin appears to have thought that the various modes of assessment that he discusses—e.g., true/false, happy/unhappy—apply most fundamentally to the illocutionary act, rather than the locutionary or the perlocutionary act.[18] One point is that Austin thought that philosophers have had a tendency to view some assessments as to happiness (or felicity) as really applying to perlocutionary acts, so as not bearing on the specifically linguistic things that speakers are up to. Another point—and perhaps the point of primary importance—is that Austin thought that philosophers have had a tendency to view assessments as to truth as applying most fundamentally to locutionary acts. Moreover, he thought that philosophers had conceived locutionary acts, not as abstractions from illocutionary acts, but rather as things that might be done without any illocutionary purpose, just by virtue of the linguistic expressions employed or their meanings. By contrast, Austin held that locutionary acts are abstracted from instances of illocutionary acts, and that assessment as to truth is directed most fundamentally to the illocutionary act. (We’ll consider below a stronger and a weaker reading of the idea that assessment as to truth applies most fundamentally to the illocutionary act.)

For Austin, then, assessment as to truth is of a piece with various forms of assessment as to happiness, etc., and like those forms it is the assessment of an act with respect to its goodness or badness. Thus Austin’s discussion of illocutionary acts is bound up with his other discussions of the ways in which assessment of utterances as to truth is dependent upon specific features of the circumstances of utterance. He writes:

The truth or falsity of statements is affected by what they leave out or put in and by their being misleading, and so on. Thus, for example, descriptions, which are said to be true or false or, if you like, are “statements”, are surely liable to these criticisms, since they are selective and uttered for a purpose. It is essential to realize that “true” and false’, like “free” and “unfree”, do not stand for anything simple at all; but only for a general dimension of being a right and proper thing to say as opposed to a wrong thing, in these circumstances, to this audience, for these purposes and with these intentions. (1962b: 144–145)

According to Austin, there is more involved in any such assessment than a simple comparison of requirements imposed by linguistic meaning with the facts. Reflection on the assessment of actions in which we speak and the speech acts that classify them indicates two things: first, the distinction between assessment as to happiness and assessment as to truth is ultimately unprincipled; and, second, some mixture of various types of assessment applies to all, or nearly all, utterances. These ideas appear to be the basis for a cryptic claim of Austin’s (mentioned above as topic (4)). Exploiting the various modes of appraisal to distinguish five very general classes of speech act verbs, Austin writes that

They are…quite enough to play Old Harry with two fetishes which I admit to an inclination to play Old Harry with, viz. (1) the true/false fetish, (2) the value/fact fetish. (1962b: 151)

Austin’s cryptic suggestion appears to be to the effect that, in one or another way, classifications of utterances along the true-false dimension, or according to whether they are expressions of fact or expressions of value, is—for at least some purposes—too crude. The suggestion is susceptible of a weaker and a stronger reading. On the weaker reading, the suggestion is to the effect that, when the assessment of an utterance is at issue, it is essential to consider the force or forces that attach to the illocutionary act or acts thereby performed. Since various such acts may have been performed, and since assessment of each act involves consideration of a mix of facts and values, there is no clean way of sorting utterances on the basis either of whether or not their primary mode of assessment is on the true-false dimension, or of whether their primary function is the expression of fact, rather than the expression of value. That leaves open that, with respect to at least some speech acts, a locutionary core—a proposition, or propositions, or propositional-like element—may be assessed in a way that makes no reference to force, for example, along the true-false dimension. On the stronger reading, the claim would be that it is not possible to detach a locutionary core from the force with which it is expressed in such a way that that core can be assessed without reference to force. On its stronger reading, Austin’s suggestion would have to contend with an aspect of what is known as the Frege-Geach problem: the challenge of explaining logical connections amongst speech acts with different forces where those connections appear to depend upon their sharing (elements of) a locutionary core (see Geach 1965).

(For discussion of Austin’s distinction amongst locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary acts see Bach 1975; Bach and Harnish 1979; G. Bird 1981; Black 1963; Cerf 1966; Chisholm 1964; Cohen 1964, 1974; Fiengo 2018; Forguson 1966, 1973; Furberg 1969; Garvey 2014; Geach 1965; Hornsby 1988, 1994, 2006; Katz 1986; Moltmann 2018; Schiffer 1972; Searle 1968, 1969; Strawson 1964a, 1973; Urmson 1977; Vendler 1972; Warnock 1973b, 1989: 105–151. For discussion specifically of the interaction of Austin’s views about the natures of speech acts with his views about truth, see Crary 2002; Quine 1965; Travis 2011; Warnock 1989: 140–150, 163–164 fn. 74.)

3. Knowledge and Perception

Austin’s main discussions of knowledge and perception take place in “Other Minds” (1946) and Sense and Sensibilia (1962a; see also “Unfair to Facts” [1954ms], which overlaps with parts of the lecture series on which Sense and Sensibilia was based that are excised from the book, and “Ifs and Cans” [1956a: 230]).[19] Stated more baldly than would have been acceptable to Austin, and reconstructing slightly, his distinctive views in this area include the following.

Knowledge is a basic form of apprehension of how things are, rather than a hybrid of belief conjoined with additional conditions. Knowing provides a sort of guarantee about one’s environment. That is, in at least some sense, the following is true: “If you know, you can’t be wrong.” What a subject’s knowledge guarantees can include truths about the environment that are independent of the subject (1946: 77–78, 84–103; 1962a: 104–131). Austin’s commitment to (1) aligns him with the tradition of “Oxford Realism” (see Travis and Kalderon 2013; Marion 2000a,b, 2009; Martin ms (Other Internet Resources); Williamson 2000).
Knowledge arises through the successful exercise of judgmental capacities in propitious circumstances—that is, through a combination of acumen and opportunity (1946: 79–97; 1962a: 20–61).
Like all other human capacities, human judgmental capacities are inherently limited and fallible. The capacities are inherently limited in that there are bound to exist cases with respect to which they are insufficiently reliable to give rise to knowledge. And they are inherently fallible in that, even in the most propitious circumstances, it is possible that their exercise is unsuccessful. (The risk of fallibility is liable to increase, of course, as the capacities approach the limits within which their application is reliable.) (1946: 90–97; 1962a: 104–131)
The fact that capacities that are essentially involved in the acquisition of knowledge are inherently limited and fallible is consistent with their operating successfully in a variety of circumstances so as to give rise to knowledge (1946: 83–103; 1962a: 104–131).

A consequence of (3) and (4) is that foundationalism is undercut: there are no foundational claims that are especially infallible; and there are no non-foundational claims that are distinctively fallible. It is possible for our judgmental capacities to misfire with respect to any subject matter, including e.g., our own feelings or experiences. And it’s possible for their exercise to be sufficiently reliable to give rise to knowledge about ordinary matters, e.g., that there is a pig before one.

In order for exercises of capacities to make perception-based judgments to sustain knowledge about the subject-independent environment, perception must put the perceiver in contact with that environment, rather than being restricted in its reach to sense-data (1946: 86–97, 1962a: 10). Again, this commitment aligns Austin with “Oxford Realism” (see Hinton 1973; Travis and Kalderon 2013; Marion 2000a,b, 2009; Martin ms (Other Internet Resources), 1997; Snowdon 1981).
Some standard forms of argument that perception cannot put the perceiver in the required type of contact with their environment—arguments that have been presented in support of the claim that our basic form of perceptual contact is with sense-data (e.g., the so-called “argument from illusion”)—are, at best, unconvincing (1962a: passim).

Three further side claims that have assumed some importance in recent work are the following.

Austin stresses that being told something by someone who knows it can put one in a position to know that thing (1946: 81–83, 97–103, 114–115).
Connected with (7), Austin sketches a view on which claims to the effect that someone knows something can serve as assurances, on the basis of which others are entitled to act, form beliefs, or claim to know (1946: 97–103).
Austin sketches a view on which utterances of the form “I know that such-and-such” serve a performative and not a descriptive function. According to this view, the function of “I know” is very similar to the function of “I promise”: both serve as ways of giving one’s word, the first (typically) about how things are, the second (typically) about how one intends them to be (1946: 97–103).

3.1 Knowledge

Let’s begin with some of what Austin says in support of (1). In his “Other Minds” (1946), Austin sketches a distinction between knowing and believing through appeal to the different kinds of challenges that are appropriate to claims to know versus claims to believe. First, Austin points out that one who claims to know may be challenged to explain how they know, while someone who claims to believe may be challenged to explain why they believe. The consequences of failing adequately to meet those challenges are also different: in the first case, the consequences might include that the subject does not know; in the second, the consequence might include, not the subject doesn’t believe, but that they oughtn’t to believe. Later, Austin indicates a further basis for the distinction between knowing and believing:

…saying “I know”…is not saying “I have performed a specially striking feat of cognition, superior, in the same scale as believing and being sure, even to being quite sure”: for there is nothing in that scale superior to being quite sure. (1946: 99)

Importantly, and moving on to claim (2), Austin holds that knowledge is the upshot of the successful exercise of judgmental capacities—which he thinks of as essentially language involving—in appropriate circumstances: the successful exercise of (judgmental) acumen given (perception- or testimony-based) opportunity. The following two passages are central to understanding Austin’s views in this area:

Any description of a taste or sound or smell (or colour) or of a feeling, involves (is) saying that it is like one or some that we have experienced before: any descriptive word is classificatory, involves recognition and in that sense memory, and only when we use such words (or names or descriptions, which come down to the same) are we knowing anything, or believing anything. But memory and recognition are often uncertain and unreliable. (1946: 92).

…sensa [the things we sense or perceive] are dumb, and only previous experience enables us to identify them. If we choose to say that they “identify themselves” (and certainly “recognizing” is not a highly voluntary act of ours), then it must be admitted that they share the birthright of all speakers, that of speaking unclearly and untruly. (1946: 97)

We perceive various things, features, events, and states of affairs. The things we perceive are not presented to us as already classified into types. Yet propositional knowledge essentially involves classification: for example, we know that that thing is a pig. In order to know, we must exercise judgmental capacities, taking stands with respect to the ways the things, features, events, and states of affairs are. We must classify the elements into types based on their similarities with elements that we have already classified into types. (Notice that Austin’s view that these elements are particulars, articulated in his “Truth” (1950a) and “Unfair to Facts” (1954ms), figures essentially here.)

Returning to (1), let’s consider what Austin says about the conditions in which a subject would fail to know. Austin’s discussion is haunted by the following condition: “If I know, I can’t be wrong”. He never quite endorses the condition. He admits at one point that its third person counterpart makes sense, but characterizes the sense it makes by appeal to a prohibition on saying “I know it is so, but I may be wrong” (1946: 98).

It’s clear that Austin would reject the claim that it is a necessary condition on knowing that it be impossible for one to have been wrong—impossible, that is, for one to have exercised the same capacities in the same circumstances and to have judged incorrectly. For given that he holds that judgmental capacities are inherently fallible ((3) above), it would follow that we can never know anything.

The human intellect and senses are, indeed, inherently fallible and delusive, but not inveterately so. Machines are inherently liable to break down, but good machines don’t (often). It is futile to embark on a “theory of knowledge” which denies this liability: such theories constantly end up by admitting the liability after all, and denying the existence of “knowledge”. (1946: 98)

What Austin says here is consistent with the operation of the capacities being reliable in some circumstances, and with their reliable operation being such as to give rise to knowledge. So it is open to Austin to hold a view on which knowledge requires that the particular exercises of the capacity to judge on which they are based couldn’t have occurred and yet the output judgment be mistaken. And it is open to him to hold that if the exercise of judgmental capacities is to give rise to knowledge, those capacities must be reliable in the circumstances in which they are exercised and given the way they are exercised on that occasion (e.g., carefully). However, Austin doesn’t make fully explicit that his view about knowledge includes either component. And some of what he says—especially in discussion of his performative proposal about the use of “I know”—is in tension with the first claim, on which knowing is incompatible with being mistaken.[20] (It’s possible that Austin viewed his “Ifs and Cans” (1956a) discussion of abilities as providing further illumination concerning the proper understanding of the formula “If one knows, one can’t be wrong”.)

One potential consequence of Austin’s account concerns foundationalism. Foundationalism typically involves the following three claims. First, many of the ordinary judgments that we make—for example, judgments to the effect that there is a pig here—are inherently risky in the following sense. It’s possible for us to make such judgments mistakenly, even in cases in which we operate as carefully as possible. Second, some of the judgments we make, or could make, are not inherently risky: for example, where we are careful only to judge about how things presently appear to us, the judgments we make carry no risk of error. Third, then, if our aim is to achieve absolute security, we should avoid judgments of the first sort except insofar as they are securely based upon judgments of the second sort. (On one view of this type, the second sort of judgment would be taken to provide evidence on which judgments of the first sort are based.) Austin’s account undermines the first two components of this view. The first component is undermined because, although it is always possible to judge incorrectly, there are ordinary cases in which our judgments about our environment are, in fact, absolutely secure ((4) above):

…if I watch or some time an animal a few feet in front of me, in a good light, if I prod it perhaps, and sniff, and take note of the noises it makes, I may say, “That”s a pig’; and this too will be “incorrigible”, nothing could be produced that would show that I had made a mistake…if the animal then emerges and stands there plainly in view, there is no longer any question of collecting evidence; its coming into view doesn’t provide me with more evidence that it’s a pig, I can now just see that it is, the question is settled. (1962a: 114–115)

The second component is undermined because there is no type of judgment, and no type of subject matter, with respect to which error is impossible ((3) above). In order to have propositional knowledge even about what I am experiencing right now, I must classify it together with other things of the same type. And that requires the exercise of capacities that are inherently fallible: I may not have had enough experiences of things of the same sort to classify this one securely; I may not have attended to what I am experiencing with sufficient care; I may fail adequately to remember similar things that I experienced earlier; and so forth (1946: 90–97; 1962a: 104–131).

Ordinary challenges to judgments or claims, including claims to know, are sometimes invitations to detail our credentials—our possession of appropriate acumen in making judgments of the type in question. Sometimes, however, they are invitations to detail our facts—the features of the circumstance that figure in our judging in the way that we do. For example, we might claim to know that that presented thing is a goldfinch “by the shape of its head”. If we were to detail our facts in that sort of way, then we might be open to further challenge: someone might claim that that’s not enough of a basis on which to judge that the presented thing is a goldfinch. In addition to emphasizing the role of special acumen in this type of case—not just anyone can tell a goldfinch by the shape of its head—Austin makes two important claims about such potential challenges to our facts. First, Austin claims that, in order for such a challenge to be appropriate, the challenger must have in mind some more or less definite lack, for example by pointing out that birds other than goldfinches have heads of that shape. Second, Austin writes:

Enough is enough: it doesn’t mean everything. Enough means enough to show that (within reason, and for present intents and purposes) it “can’t” be anything else, there is no room for an alternative, competing description of it. It does not mean, for example, enough to show it isn’t a stuffed goldfinch. (1946: 84.)

There are at least three, non-exclusive ways of reading Austin’s claim here. The first is as the claim that what suffices for this here to be a goldfinch may not be enough with respect to anything in any circumstance. There may be other birds, or other things, with heads of the same shape. However, we might still know full well that there are no such birds, and no such things, here; or we may know enough about this thing to know it isn’t a bird of that sort, or one of those other things, even though we haven’t specified how we know in answer to the initial challenge. That is, we may know that this isn’t a stuffed goldfinch—given the rest of what we know, and the circumstances in which we judge—even though what we explicitly point to in answer to challenges doesn’t alone rule out the possibility. The second way of reading Austin here is as allowing that we can know that this is a goldfinch, even though we know that if it’s a stuffed goldfinch, then it is not a goldfinch, and we don’t know that it isn’t a stuffed goldfinch. We are entitled—either in general, or in circumstances of this sort—to assume or rely upon its not being a stuffed goldfinch, even though that is something we can’t rule out and don’t know (see Kaplan 2011 for development of the second way of reading Austin’s views in this area). The third way of reading the passage is as claiming that the range of possibilities can vary from occasion to occasion for judging or claiming that one knows that this is a goldfinch. On the third reading, it might be impossible, on this occasion, for the presented thing to be a stuffed goldfinch, even though there are other occasions on which it would be a possibility. Hence, our facts do not need to foreclose on that possibility on this occasion, although there might be other occasions on which our facts would need to do so. (Travis 2005 develops the third approach. See Millar 2005 for objections.)

Let’s turn, then, to (7)–(9), focusing attention on (9), the view that utterances of the form “I know that such-and-such” serve a performative and not a descriptive function. This is puzzling for at least two reasons: first, the claim that “I know” lacks a descriptive function is apt to seem obviously false; and second, it is unclear what, if any, function the claim has in Austin’s account as a whole.

The main focus of objection to Austin here isn’t the claim that “I know that such-and-such” can, on occasion, serve distinctive performative functions. Rather, the concern with Austin’s proposal is focused on two more specific claims. First, it is focused on the claim that “I know that such-and-such” always and only serves a distinctive performative function and so is never at the service of self-description. Second, it is focused on the claim that, in cases in which “I know that such-and-such” is used to serve a performative function, neither the felicity conditions of using the sentence in that way, nor the truth of what, if anything, one thereby states, depend in turn on whether the speaker knows that such-and-such.

Austin is misled here, I think, due to three factors. First, he is misled by similarities between saying “I know that such-and-such” and saying “I promise that such-and-such” or “I swear that such-and-such”. But the cases are importantly different. For example, unlike the case of promising, in which saying “I promise…” in appropriate circumstances makes it so that one has promised…, saying “I know that such-and-such” does not make it so that one knows. Now, as Austin later saw, it is possible to develop an account on which saying “I know that such-and-such” can serve more than one purpose and so can function well with respect to one such purpose while functioning poorly with respect to others (see e.g., 1950a: 133 and 1962b). Accordingly, it would be possible to develop a view on which, for example, saying “I know that such-and-such” in cases in which one does not know would be improper qua statement (since saying it doesn’t remove the deficit by making it so that one knows), while properly serving the purpose of giving an audience one’s assurance. However, and this is the second reason for which Austin is misled, he had not in “Other Minds” (1946) yet attained the later perspective on which that is a clear possibility. Since he nonetheless believes that “I know that such-and-such” serves purposes other than statement making, he is forced to efface its statement-making function. Finally, and more speculatively, it seems that Austin is misled due to his attempting to build into his account a response to a doctrine, common to his Oxford Realist predecessors Cook Wilson and Prichard, according to which whether one knows or merely believes something is transparent to one. (For discussion of that feature of Cook Wilson’s and Prichard’s views, see Longworth 2018b, Travis and Kalderon 2013 and Travis 2005.) Although Austin rejects the letter of the doctrine, he retains its spirit in attempting to provide an account on which avowals of the form “I know that such-and-such” can never be false. (For further discussion of Austin’s performative proposal, see Warnock 1989: 24–33, Lawlor 2013.)

(For critical engagement with Austin’s work on knowledge, see Ayer 1967; Baz 2011; Chisholm 1964; Hetherington 2018; Kaplan 2011, 2018; Lawlor 2013, 2018; Leite 2011; Longworth 2018b, Marion 2000a,b; Martin ms (Other Internet Resources); Millar 2005; Putnam 1994; Soames 2003: 171–193; Stroud 1984: 39–82; Travis 2005; Travis and Kalderon 2013; Warnock 1989: 32–44; M. Williams 1996: 135–171.)

3.2 Sensory perception

Let’s turn now to Austin’s views specifically about perception ((5) and (6) above). Once we have detailed the facts on which a perception-based judgment of ours relies, a more general challenge arises concerning our access to those facts. In order to exploit the bird’s head shape as the basis for our judgment that it is a goldfinch, it is arguable that we must be able to see (or perhaps feel) the bird and its shape. On some views of perception, however, birds and their shapes are not amongst the things that one can perceive. Austin’s main aim in Sense & Sensibilia is to undermine considerations that have been offered in favour of the general doctrine that, as he puts it,

…we never see or otherwise perceive (or “sense”), or anyhow we never directly perceive or sense, material objects (or material things), but only sense-data (or our own ideas, impressions, sense, sense-perceptions, percepts, &c.). (1962a: 2)

Central to those considerations are those organized by versions of what is known as the argument from illusion ((6) above).[21] The version of the argument that Austin criticizes can be reconstructed as follows. (i) There are cases of illusion in which we have a sensory experience as of seeing something of some sort with specific features but in which nothing has those specific features. This might be because, although we experience something of the sort in question, the thing we experience lacks the features in question; or it might be because we don’t experience a thing of the sort in question at all. (ii) In those cases, there must be something we experience that has the features in question. Call the things we experience in such cases sense-data. (iii) Since the cases in which we experience sense-data include cases in which no material things of the sort in question, or with the features in question, are experienced, it follows that sense-data are not (in general) material things, or elements in the environment independent of the individual experiencer. It follows that, in the cases in question, we experience things (or directly experience things) that are distinct from material things and we do not thereby experience (or directly experience) material things. (iv) Now it is a general principle about experiences that if we cannot discriminate the objects of two experiences on the basis of introspection, then those experiences must have objects of the same sort. Hence, if one experience has only sense-data as its objects, and not material things, and a second experience has as its objects something that we cannot discriminate on the basis of introspection from the objects of the first experience, then the second experience also has sense-data rather than material things as its objects. (v) Since every experience stands in the required relation to an experience with only sense-data as its objects, every experience has sense-data rather than material things as its objects. Hence, we never experience—or never directly experience—material things

Austin objects to every step in the argument just reconstructed. Amongst other complaints, he argues that key terms in the argument have not been properly defined or explained—for instance, “material thing” and “sense-data” (1962a: 4, 7–14, 55), and “directly” (1962a: 14–19). And he objects to the general principle, to which appeal was made in (iv), pointing out that there are no grounds for thinking that we cannot have experiences with different kinds of object that we nonetheless can’t discriminate on the basis of introspection. For instance, we might experience a bar of soap that looks just like a lemon, and be in a position where we couldn’t discriminate the soap from the lemon on the basis of introspection. Nonetheless, we would hold that the two experiences have different kinds of objects (1962a: 50–52).[22] However, what are perhaps his most important complaints target (i) and (ii) by exploiting the distinction, initially articulated in “Other Minds” (1946), between two elements in perceptually based judgment: the opportunity afforded by sensory perception and judgmental acumen.

The distinction between sensory perception and judgmental acumen enables Austin to distinguish between central cases of illusion and central cases of delusion, and also to sketch explanations of what is going on in those cases that do not make appeal to sense-data. Austin takes the defender of (i) and (ii) to argue as follows. First, consider an illusion, for example a stick that looks bent but really isn’t. Such an illusion has two key features. First, it clearly involves a distinctive sensory experience. Second, the distinctive sensory experience that it involves is apt to give rise to an erroneous perceptual judgment, to the effect that the stick is bent. Now one way of explaining the erroneous perceptual judgment is to view it as dictated by the sensory experience—that is, to view it as accurately representing features presented in the experience: the bent-ness of that which is experienced. Since the stick is not in fact bent, and that which is experienced is bent, we have reason to claim that that which is experienced is not identical with the stick. What we experience is sense-data rather than a stick. Moreover, we might also consider more extreme cases in which we make erroneous perceptual judgments: cases of delusion or hallucination. For example, there is the case in which an alcoholic person judges that pink rats are visible, when in fact there are none. Now, given the proposed account of the case of illusion, that case cannot be distinguished from the case of delusion by appeal to the fact that, in the former, an environmental feature is experienced while, in the latter, there is no suitable environmental feature to be experienced. It therefore seems natural to treat the two cases as of the same basic type, and to offer the same type of explanation for both. Thus, one might be tempted to view the rat-delusion as having the following three features. First, it involves a distinctive sensory experience. Second, the distinctive sensory experience that it involves dictates an erroneous perceptual judgment to the effect that pink rats are visible. Third, that judgment is dictated because it accurately represents features present in the experience.

Austin responds as follows. First, he exploits the role of judgmental acumen in perceptual judgment in order to provide an alternative explanation of cases of illusion (or more generally of things looking ways that they are not). He allows that some things really do look the way they are sometimes taken to be—the stick looks bent, even though it is not in fact bent. But he holds that those looks are not private features of individual’s experiences. For example, they are available to other perceivers and might be recorded in a photograph. (Austin discusses talk about how things look, and distinguishes it from talk about how things seem—which he associates with judgment rather than with experience, in Sense and Sensibilia (1962a: 33–43). See also Jackson 1977: 30–49; Martin 2010; Travis 2004.) However, the way the stick looks, just as much as features like the stick’s straightness, can be the basis for perceptual judgments. We can explain why someone is prone to judge that the stick is bent by appeal to the stick’s looking bent, rather to anything’s being bent, together with the ways in which exercises of judgmental acumen can respond erroneously to looks. More generally, there needn’t be anything in particular—any specific feature of what is experienced or any specific look—that figures in explaining why individuals are prone to make a specific type of judgment on the basis of the experience. For the explanation for each individual’s judgment will depend, not only on what they experience, but also on the types of judgmental capacities that they have. In support of this form of explanation, Austin notes that not everyone would be inclined to judge that the stick is bent. For example, noting the presence of water, those whose judgmental capacities are sufficiently well trained might withhold judgment about the stick’s shape (Hinton 1973: 114ff includes a useful discussion of some of Austin’s claims about illusions).

Standard cases of illusion or misleading appearance of the sort we’ve just considered involve sensory experiences of ordinary things and their features, including their looks, feels, and so forth. However, because the connection between what is experienced and what one judges on its basis is not straightforward—because judgmental acumen is involved in moving from one to the other—there is no general way to read back from the judgments someone is prone to make to specific features of their sensory experiences. Because such cases of illusion involve experience of ordinary things, while standard cases of delusion do not, we thus have a ground on which to distinguish the two sorts of case. For example, we have grounds to distinguish the case in which someone erroneously judges that a submerged stick is bent from the case of the alcoholic person who judges that pink rats are visible. But having distinguished the cases in that way, we are liable to become open to two new questions. First, should we allow that the judgment in the delusory case is based on sensory experience? Perhaps, for example, some cases of delusion involve dysfunction in the systems responsible for perceptual judgment of a sort that give rise to perceptual judgments in the absence of any sense-experiential basis for those judgments. Second, even if we allow that a particular delusory judgment is based upon sensory experience, should we allow that it involves sensory experience of anything other than elements that are present in the deluded subject’s environment? Perhaps some cases of delusion involve dysfunctional judgmental responses to what is seen or heard. For example, an alcoholic subject judgment that a pink rat is visible might be a disordered response to an experience of a shadow. Unless we are forced to answer both questions affirmatively, we lack the basis for an argument that the deluded subject experiences anything distinct from the ordinary things and features that they can see, hear, etc.

Austin doesn’t suggest that there could be no grounds for giving affirmative answers to either of those questions. Moreover, it is very plausible that such grounds can be provided. It is plausible, for example, that there are distinctive sensory experiences involved in what we call seeing double, or seeing afterimages, that cannot be explained simply by appeal to what is present in subjects’ environments. And it is plausible that genuine sensory hallucinations are possible—indeed, it is plausible that such hallucinations might figure in explaining the alcoholic person’s judgment. However, although the style of response just considered is indecisive against such additional developments of the argument, the resources that it deploys will surely figure in serious engagement with those developments. Austin sketches an approach to issues raised by such experiences by attempting to give an account of the reports we are inclined to make in such cases—“I see two pieces of paper”, “I see pink rats”. Austin’s sketch aims to explain how such reports can be non-committal about the nature of the experiences so-reported, and in particular about whether such experiences have objects at all (1962a: 84–103). It is here in particular that Austin comes close to endorsing a form of disjunctivism about perception (see Soteriou 2009).

(For critical engagement with Austin’s work on perception, see Ayer 1967, 1969; Burnyeat 1979; Firth 1964; Forguson 1969b; Garvey 2014; Hinton 1973: 114ff; Hirst 1963; Jackson 1977; Travis and Kalderon 2013; Leite 2011; Longworth 2019, Marion 2000a,b; Martin ms (Other Internet Resources), 2000, 2010; Pears 1979; Putnam 1994; Schwartz 2004, 2018; Snowdon 2014; Soames 2003: 171–193; Thau 2004; Travis 2004; van Hulst and Cresswell 2016; Warnock 1989: 11–31.)

4. Action and Freedom

The core of Austin’s work on freedom and action is contained in “A Plea for Excuses” (1957) and developed in “Ifs and Cans” (1956a), “Three Ways of Spilling Ink” (1966), and “Pretending” (1958a). The three most distinctive features of his views in this area are the following.

Austin proposes that philosophers should attend to the details of the ways in which we talk about particular actions of specific types rather than attempting a more direct assault on general questions about freedom and action (1957: 175–181; 1966: 273).
Austin holds that in order for someone to count as responsible for an action, nothing more need be true than that the action is a normal or standard instance of something they do. For example, it need not be true of the actor, in addition, that they did what they did voluntarily or on purpose (1957: 189–204; 1966).
Austin is inclined to think that, insofar as he understands the thesis of determinism, it is incompatible with what we ordinarily take to be true of human action (1956a: 218 fn.1, 231).

4.1 Actions and Excuses

Let’s begin with (1). Austin holds that we can make progress on questions about freedom and action by descending from reflection at the general level—i.e., reflection on freedom and action, per se—to reflection on the more specific ways in which we characterize and appraise actions. Austin’s view about the general notions of acting, and of acting freely or responsibly, is structurally similar to his view about the general notion of truth: he thinks of such general notions as dimension words, grouping a range of more specific characterizations. The basic range here consists in the various specific ways in which we can characterize happenings as actions—for example, as someone running to the shop, or as their reading a book. In addition to that basic range are what Austin calls aggravations: the various specific ways in which we characterize someone as distinctively responsible for something that happens—for example, when we characterize someone as having done something on purpose, intentionally, or deliberately. The latter three aggravations are the topic of his “Three Ways of Spilling Ink” (1966).

In his “A Plea for Excuses” (1957), Austin argues that the minimal requirement for an agent to be responsible for an action of theirs is that it be incorrect to characterize the action in one or another way as something for which they were not fully responsible—as something for which they have an excuse. We might, for example, characterize a happening as an accident, a mistake, involuntary, unintentional, inadvertent, or as due (in part) to clumsiness, lack of appreciation of circumstances, or incompetence. Where an act is performed, and where no excuse is available, the action is one for which the actor counts as fully responsible. Where one or another type of excuse is available, the specific type of excuses that are available mitigate in one or another specific way the subject’s responsibility for the occurrence of an action or its consequences, and so the extent to which the action is to be counted as free. An excuse may do this by mitigating in various ways the subject’s responsibility either for an action considered as a whole, or for proper sub-components of the action, or for consequences of the action, or by indicating ways in which a happening is not (a paradigmatic case of) an action. The varieties of pretending that Austin discusses in his “Pretending” (1958a) are of importance to him, at least in part, because they provide for some distinctive forms of excuse. For instance, one might seek to excuse what appeared to be an action of type A by claiming that the agent was only pretending to A, pretending to be A-ing, or pretending that they were A-ing. (One of Austin’s aims in the paper is to distinguish those ways of pretending.)

One of Austin’s central aims in considering the variety of excuses and aggravations is to shed light on the inner composition of responsible action: the division between an action and its consequences; the decomposition of an action into its various sub-components or phases; and what Austin calls the machinery of action:

…the detail of the complicated internal machinery we use in “acting”—the receipt of intelligence, the appreciation of the situation, the invocation of principles, the planning, the control of execution and the rest. (1957: 179)

Turning now to (2), Austin thinks that there is a range of normal or standard cases of attributions of action with respect to which modification, by appeal either to aggravations or excuses, is impermissible. With respect to such normal or standard cases, it suffices, in order to characterize the agent’s role within them, simply to say what the agent did. To add that the agent did the thing, for example, either voluntarily or involuntarily would be inappropriate, incorrect, or even senseless. Austin summarizes this idea in the slogan, “No modification without aberration”. Amongst the supporting examples he gives are the following:

I sit in my chair, in the usual way—I am not in a daze or influenced by threats or the like: here, it will not do to say either that I sit in it intentionally or that I did not sit in it intentionally, nor yet that I sat in it automatically or from habit or what you will. It is bedtime, I am alone, I yawn: but I do not yawn involuntarily (or voluntarily!), nor yet deliberately. To yawn in any such peculiar way is just not to just yawn. (1957: 190)[23]

Austin holds that modifiers like “voluntarily” and “involuntarily” are used to assert the respective presence and absence of specific elements in the general machinery of action. (He suggests that such apparent pairs do not invariably target the very same specific elements. See 1957: 189–193.) Austin thinks that philosophers have tended to assume that, given that someone has done a specific thing, it will always be a further question whether those pieces of machinery are present or absent. Moreover, philosophers have aligned that question with the question whether the actor was responsible for what they did or acted freely. Those philosophers have in effect been making the following pair of assumptions. They’ve assumed, first, that there is a single type of piece of machinery such that for any action, the action will be free and responsible just in case it involves that machinery. Second, they’ve assumed that the various aggravations serve indiscriminately to mark the presence of the required type of machinery, while the various excuses serve to mark its absence.

Characteristically, Austin suggests that the situation is more complicated. In particular, although he thinks that, in normal or standard cases, actors are responsible for what they do and act freely, he holds that what makes that so can vary from case to case: different types of machinery can account for freedom and responsibility with respect to different types of action. He holds moreover that different aggravating and excusing modifiers target different pieces of machinery. And, finally, he holds that the appropriate use of a modifier doesn’t depend only upon the presence or absence of instances of the type of action-machinery that it targets. In addition, it depends upon whether the targeted machinery figures in normal cases of actions of the type in question.[24]

(For discussion of Austin’s views about actions and excuses see Forguson 1969a; Heintz 1981; Holdcroft 1969; Laugier 2018; Narboux 2011; New 1966; Petrie 1971; Searle 1966; Zimmerman 2004; Warnock 1989: 65–79; White 1967.)

4.2 Freedom and Ability

Let’s turn now to Austin’s discussion of whether determinism is compatible with free action ((3) above). One general form of excuse for doing something would be that one couldn’t avoid doing it. Similarly, a general excuse for failing to do something—failing to apply one’s brakes, for example—would be that one couldn’t do it. Excuses of that general type have figured centrally in discussions of human freedom and the bearing of determinism on whether we ever act freely. Suppose that, wherever an excuse of this form is correctly applicable, we are not responsible for the action targeted by the excuse and did not act freely. If this supposition were correct, a demonstration that there are no things that we do that we could have avoided doing, and no things that we do not do that we could have done, would amount to a demonstration that we are never responsible for doing, or refraining from doing, what we do and, so, never act freely. And some philosophers have held that determinism provides the basis for such a demonstration.

Such a demonstration might take the following form. The all-in claim that someone could have done something at t requires that the circumstances at t are consistent with their doing that thing at t. But according to determinism, the circumstances, C, at t determine that one set of events, E, occurs at t rather than any others. That is, according to the thesis of determinism, it couldn’t be that (C & not-E). Now, given that what the individual in question in fact did at t (/refrained from doing at t) is a member of E, it couldn’t have been that C and yet they failed to do it (/failed to refrain from doing it). Hence, because of C, it’s not the case that they could have avoided doing what they did (/refraining from doing it).

Austin considers this issue in his “Ifs and Cans” (1956a). There, he discusses and rejects attempts in G.E. Moore 1912 and Nowell-Smith 1954 to provide accounts of what we can do on which it being true that we can do things (/refrain from doing them) is compatible with its being determined by our circumstances that we don’t in fact do them (/refrain from doing them). Austin thinks that his objections to the accounts on which he focuses provide partial support to the view that our ordinary claims about what we can do are incompatible with determinism.

The first proposal of Moore’s that Austin considers is that the claim that someone, S, can do something, A, is equivalent to the following claim: S will A, if S chooses to A. Austin argues that Moore’s first proposal is based on a mistaken view about the functioning of the claims of the form: “S can A, if S chooses”.[25] The second proposal of Moore’s that Austin considers is the claim that “S can A” is equivalent to a claim of the form “If it were that C, then S would B”. For example, “I could have holed the putt” might be taken to be equivalent to “If I had tried to hole the putt, I would have succeeded in holing the putt.” Here again, it seems that the proposal might be of service in sidestepping the challenge posed by determinism. Suppose that in actual circumstances C, I don’t try to hole the putt. According to determinism, it follows that it is impossible that (C and I do try to hole the putt). But that is consistent both with its being possible, in slightly different circumstances, that I try to hole the putt, and with it being the case that, if I were to try, I would succeed. Austin doesn’t pursue the proposal in detail, though his discussion of Nowell-Smith pursues connected issues (219–230). However, in a footnote, Austin presents an important putative counterexample:

Consider the case where I miss a very short putt and kick myself because I could have holed it. It is not that I should have holed it if I had tried: I did try, and missed. It is not that I should have holed it if conditions had been different: that might of course be so, but I am talking about conditions as they precisely were, and asserting that I could have holed it. There is the rub. (1956a: 218 fn.1)

Austin’s thought here is that attributions of this sort manifest our belief that,

…a human ability or power or capacity is inherently liable not to produce success, on occasion, and that for no reason (or are bad luck and bad form sometimes reasons?). (218: 218 fn.1)

Now a committed determinist would claim that the events that constitute such failures must be determined—and in that sense explained—by the circumstances at and before the failure. But Austin believes—for reasons in effect considered above—that the existence of such an explanation would make it the case that, in fact, the golfer could not have made the putt in the circumstances as they precisely were.

We have here, then, a point at which Austin expresses his view that ordinary attributions of ability, power, and capacity are incompatible with the thesis of determinism. In response, the compatibilist is forced, I think, to deny that its being true that a golfer could have holed the putt, or even that he could have holed the putt in precisely the same conditions, entails that he would have holed the putt in a perfect duplicate of the actual world. Leaving that issue to one side, Austin presents the proposed analysis with a case of masking—a case in which, although ability is retained, successful exercise of the ability is somehow precluded, for instance by outside interference (for discussion of masking, see A. Bird 1998; Clarke 2009; Fara 2008; and Johnston 1992). The challenge facing the defender of the analysis is to spell out the analysis so as to cope with masking. Arguably, meeting the challenge depends upon provision of a non-circular specification of all possible masks. Austin would, I think, claim that it is impossible to meet the challenge. For on his view, abilities are sometimes masked brutely, without any specifiable mask. Even if he is wrong about that, it remains an open question whether the challenge can be met, or whether the endless heterogeneity of potential masks makes it impossible to provide an explanatory specification.

(For discussion of Austin views about freedom and ability see Ayers 1966; Clarke 2009; Kaufman 1963; Locke 1962; New 1966; Nowell-Smith 1960; Pears 1973; Thalberg 1969; Warnock 1989: 80–97.)


Primary Literature

(Where a paper of Austin’s is contained in Austin 1979, page references in the text are to that volume.)

  • Austin, J.L., 1930s–1940s, “The Line and the Cave in Plato’s Republic”, reconstructed from notes by J.O. Urmson, in Austin 1979: 288–304. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0013
  • –––, 1939ms/1967, “Agathon and Eudaimonia in the Ethics of Aristotle”, in J.M.E. Moravcsik (ed.) Aristotle, New York: Doubleday: 261–296; reprinted in Austin 1979: 1–31. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0001
  • –––, 1939, “Are There A Priori Concepts”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 18: 83–105; reprinted in Austin 1979: 32–54. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0002
  • –––, 1940ms, “The Meaning of a Word”, in Austin 1979: 55–75. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0003
  • –––, 1946, “Symposium: Other Minds II”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 20: 148–187; reprinted as “Other Minds 1” in Austin 1979: 76–116. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0004
  • –––, 1950a, “Truth”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 24: 111–128; reprinted in Austin 1979: 117–133. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0005
  • –––, 1950b, “Intelligent Behaviour: A Critical Review of The Concept of Mind”, Times Literary Supplement, Supplementary Volume 24: 111–128; reprinted in Oscar P. Wood and George Pitcher (eds.), 1970, Ryle: A Collection of Critical Essays, New York: Doubleday, pp. 48–51.
  • –––, 1952a, “Critical Notice: Aristotle’s Syllogistic by Jan Łukasiewicz”, Mind, 61(243): 395–404. doi:10.1093/mind/LXI.243.395
  • –––, 1952b, “Report on Analysis ‘Problem’ no. 1: ‘What sort of ‘if’ is the ‘if’ in ‘I can if I choose’?’” Analysis, 12(6): 125–126. doi:10.1093/analys/12.6.125a
  • –––, 1953, “How to Talk—some simple ways”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 53: 227–246; reprinted in Austin 1979: 134–153. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/53.1.227 and doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0006
  • –––, 1954ms, “Unfair to Facts”, in Austin 1979: 154–174. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0007
  • –––, 1956a, “Ifs and Cans”, Proceedings of the British Academy 42: 109–132; reprinted in Austin 1979: 205–232. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0009
  • –––, 1956b, “Performative Utterances”, corrected transcript of an unscripted radio talk delivered in the Third Programme of the BBC, in Austin 1979: 233–252. doi:10.1093/019283021X.003.0010
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Other Internet Resources


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