Philosophical Approaches to Work and Labor

First published Tue Jan 11, 2022

Work is a subject with a long philosophical pedigree. Some of the most influential philosophical systems devote considerable attention to questions concerning who should work, how they should work, and why. For example, in the ideally just city outlined in the Republic, Plato proposed a system of labor specialization, according to which individuals are assigned to one of three economic strata, based on their inborn abilities: the laboring or mercantile class, a class of auxiliaries charged with keeping the peace and defending the city, or the ruling class of ‘philosopher-kings’. Such a division of labor, Plato argued, will ensure that the tasks essential to the city’s flourishing will be performed by those most capable of performing them.

In proposing that a just society must concern itself with how work is performed and by whom, Plato acknowledged the centrality of work to social and personal life. Indeed, most adults spend a significant time engaged in work, and many contemporary societies are arguably “employment-centred” (Gorz 2010). In such societies, work is the primary source of income and is ‘normative’ in the sociological sense, i.e., work is expected to be a central feature of day-to-day life, at least for adults.

Arguably then, no phenomenon exerts a greater influence on the quality and conditions of human life than work. Work thus deserves the same level of philosophical scrutiny as other phenomena central to economic activity (for example, markets or property) or collective life (the family, for instance).

The history of philosophy contains an array of divergent perspectives concerning the place of work in human life (Applebaum 1992, Schaff 2001, Budd 2011, Lis and Soly 2012, Komlosy 2018). Traditional Confucian thought, for instance, embraces hard work, perseverance, the maintenance of professional relations, and identification with organizational values. The ancient Mediterranean tradition, exemplified by Plato and Aristotle, admired craft and knowledge-driven productive activity while also espousing the necessity of leisure and freedom for a virtuous life. The Christian tradition contains several different views of work, including that work is toil for human sin, that work should be a calling or vocation by which one glorifies God or carries out God’s will, and that work is an arena in which to manifest one’s status as elect in the eyes of God (the ‘Protestant work ethic’). The onset of the Industrial Revolution and the adverse working conditions of industrial labor sparked renewed philosophical interest in work, most prominently in Marxist critiques of work and labor that predict the alienation of workers under modern capitalism and the emergence of a classless society in which work is minimized or equitably distributed.

Philosophical attention to work and labor seems to increase when work arrangements or values appear to be in flux. For example, recent years have witnessed an increase in philosophical research on work, driven at least in part by the perception that is in ‘crisis’: Economic inequality in employment-centred societies continues to rise, technological automation seems poised to eliminate jobs and to augur an era of persistent high unemployment, and dissatisfaction about the quality or meaningfulness of work in present day jobs appears to be increasing (Schwartz 2015, Livingston 2016, Graeber 2018, Danaher 2019). Many scholars now openly question whether work should be treated as a ‘given’ in modern societies (Weeks 2011).

This entry will attempt to bring systematicity to the extant philosophical literature on work by examining the central conceptual, ethical, and political questions in the philosophy of work and labor (Appiah 2021).

1. Conceptual Distinctions: Work, Labor, Employment, Leisure

It is not difficult to enumerate examples of work. Hence, Samuel Clark:

by work I mean the familiar things we do in fields, factories, offices, schools, shops, building sites, call centres, homes, and so on, to make a life and a living. Examples of work in our commercial society include driving a taxi, selling washing machines, managing a group of software developers, running a till in a supermarket, attaching screens to smartphones on an assembly line, fielding customer complaints in a call centre, and teaching in a school (Clark 2017: 62).

Some contemporary commentators have observed that human life is increasingly understood in work-like terms: parenthood is often described as a job, those with romantic difficulties are invited to ‘work on’ their relationships, those suffering from the deaths of others are advised to undertake ‘grief work,’ and what was once exercise is now ‘working out’ (Malesic 2017). The diversity of undertakings we designate as ‘work’, and the apparent dissimilarities among them, have led some philosophers to conclude that work resists any definition (Muirhead 2007: 4, Svendsen 2015) or is at best a loose concept in which different instances of work share a ‘family resemblance’ (Pence 2001: 96–97).

The porousness of the notion of work notwithstanding, some progress in defining work seems possible by first considering the variety of ways in which work is organized. For one, although many contemporary discussions of work focus primarily on employment, not all work takes the form of employment. It is therefore important not to assimilate work to employment, because not every philosophically interesting claim that is true of employment is true of work as such, and vice versa. In an employment relationship, an individual worker sells their labor to another in exchange for compensation (usually money), with the purchaser of their labor serving as a kind of intermediary between the worker and those who ultimately enjoy the goods that the worker helps to produce (consumers). The intermediary, the employer, typically serves to manage (or appoints those who manage) the hired workers — the employees—, setting most of the terms of what goods are thereby to be produced, how the process of production will be organized, etc. Such an arrangement is what we typically understand as having a job.

But a worker can produce goods without their production being mediated in this way. In some cases, a worker is a proprietor, someone who owns the enterprise as well as participating in the production of the goods produced by that enterprise (for example, a restaurant owner who is also its head chef). This arrangement may also be termed self-employment, and differs from arrangements in which proprietors are not workers in the enterprise but merely capitalize it or invest in it. And some proprietors are also employers, that is, they hire other workers to contribute their labor to the process of production. Arguably, entrepreneurship or self-employment, rather than having a job, has been the predominant form of work throughout human history, and it continues to be prevalent. Over half of all workers are self-employed in parts of the world such as Africa and South Asia, and the number of self-employed individuals has been rising in many regions of the globe (International Labor Organization 2019). In contrast, jobs — more or less permanent employment relationships — are more a byproduct of industrial modernity than we realise (Suzman 2021).

Employees and proprietors are most often in a transactional relationship with consumers; they produce goods that consumers buy using their income. But this need not be the case. Physicians at a ‘free clinic’ are not paid by their patients but by a government agency, charity, etc. Nevertheless, such employees expect to earn income from their work from some source. But some instances of work go unpaid or uncompensated altogether. Slaves work, as do prisoners in some cases, but their work is often not compensated. So too for those who volunteer for charities or who provide unpaid care work, attending to the needs of children, the aged, or the ill.

Thus, work need not involve working for others, nor need it be materially compensated. These observations are useful inasmuch as they indicate that certain conditions we might presume to be essential to work (being employed, being monetarily compensated) are not in fact essential to it. Still, these observations only inform as to what work is not. Can we say more exactly what work is?

Part of the difficulty in defining work is that whether a person’s actions constitute work seems to depend both on how her actions shape the world as well on the person’s attitudes concerning those actions. On the one hand, the activity of work is causal in that it modifies the world in some non-accidental way. As Bertrand Russell (1932) remarked, “work is of two kinds: first, altering the position of matter at or near the earth’s surface relatively to other such matter; second, telling other people to do so.” But work involves altering the world in presumptively worthwhile ways. In this respect, work is closely tied to the production of what Raymond Geuss (2021:5) has called ‘objective’ value, value residing in “external” products that can be “measured and valued independently of anything one might know about the process through which that product came to be or the people who made it.” By working, we generate goods (material objects but also experiences, states of mind, etc.) that others can value and enjoy in their own right. In most cases of work (for example, when employed), a person is compensated not for the performance of labor as such but because their labor contributes to the production of goods that have such ‘objective’ value. Note, however, that although work involves producing what others can enjoy or consume, sometimes the objective value resulting from work is not in fact enjoyed by others or by anyone at all. A self-sufficient farmer works by producing food solely for their own use, in which case the worker (rather than others) ends up consuming the objective value of their work. Likewise, the farmer who works to produce vegetables for market that ultimately go unsold has produced something whose objective value goes unconsumed.

Geuss has suggested a further characteristic of work, that it is “necessary” for individuals and for “societies as a whole” (2021:18). Given current and historical patterns of human life, work has been necessary to meet human needs. However, if some prognostications about automation and artificial intelligence prove true (see section 4 on ‘The Future of Work’), then the scarcity that has defined the human condition up to now may be eliminated, obviating the necessity of work at both the individual and societal level. Moreover, as Geuss observes, some work aims to produce goods that answer to human wants rather than human needs or necessities (that is, to produce luxuries), and some individuals manage to escape the necessity of work thanks to their antecedent wealth.

Still, work appears to have as one of its essential features that it be an activity that increases the objective (or perhaps intersubjective) value in the world. Some human activities are therefore arguably not work because they generate value for the actor instead of for others. For instance, work stands in contrast to leisure. Leisure is not simply idleness or the absence of work, nor is it the absence of activity altogether (Pieper 1952, Walzer 1983: 184–87, Adorno 2001, Haney and Kline 2010). When at leisure, individuals engage in activities that produce goods for their own enjoyment largely indifferent to the objective value that these activities might generate for others. The goods resulting from a person’s leisure are bound up with the fact that she generates them through her activity. We cannot hire others to sunbathe for us or enjoy a musical performance for us because the value of such leisure activities is contingent upon our performing the activities. Leisure thus produces subjective value that we ‘make’ for ourselves, value that (unlike the objective value generated from work) cannot be transferred to or exchanged with others. It might also be possible to create the objective value associated with working despite being at leisure. A professional athlete, for instance, might be motivated to play her sport as a form of leisure but produce (and be monetarily compensated for the production of) objective value for others (spectators who enjoy the sport). Perhaps such examples are instances of work and leisure or working by way of leisure.

Some accounts of work emphasize not the nature of the value work produces but the individual’s attitudes concerning work. For instance, many definitions of work emphasize that work is experienced as exertion or strain (Budd 2011:2, Veltman 2016:24–25, Geuss 2021: 9–13). Work, on this view, is inevitably laborious. No doubt work is often strenuous. But defining work in this way seems to rule out work that is sufficiently pleasurable to the worker as to hardly feel like a burden. An actor may so enjoy performing that it hardly feels like a strain at all. Nevertheless, the performance is work inasmuch as the actor must deliberately orient their activities to realize the objective value the performance may have for others. Her acting will not succeed in producing this objective value unless she is guided by a concern to produce the value by recalling and delivering her lines, etc. In fact, the actor may find performing pleasurable rather than a burden because she takes great satisfaction in producing this objective value for others. Other work involves little exertion of strain because it is nearly entirely passive; those who are paid subjects in medical research are compensated less for their active contribution to the research effort but simply “to endure” the investigative process and submit to the wills of others (Malmqvist 2019). Still, the research subject must also be deliberate in their participation, making sure to abide by protocols that ensure the validity of the research. Examples such as these suggest that a neglected dimension of work is that, in working, we are paradigmatically guided by the wills of others, for we are aiming in our work activities to generate goods that others could enjoy.

2. The Value of Work

The proposed definition of work as the deliberate attempt to produce goods that others can enjoy or consume indicates where work’s value to those besides the worker resides. And the value that work has to others need not be narrowly defined in terms of specific individuals enjoying or consuming the goods we produce. Within some religious traditions, work is way to serve God and or one’s community.

But these considerations do not shed much light on the first-personal value of work: What value does one’s work have to workers? How do we benefit when we produce goods that others could enjoy?

2.1 The Goods of Work

On perhaps the narrowest conception of work’s value, it only has exchange value. On this conception, work’s value is measured purely in terms of the material goods it generates for the worker, either in monetary terms or in terms of work’s products (growing one’s own vegetables, for instance). To view work as having exchange value is to see its value as wholly extrinsic; there is no value to work as such, only value to be gained from what one’s work concretely produces. If work only has exchange value, then work is solely a cost or a burden, never worth doing for its own sake. Echoing the Biblical tale of humanity’s fall, this conception of work’s value casts it as a curse foisted upon us due to human limitations or inadequacies.

But work is often valued for other reasons. One powerful bit of evidence in favour of work’s being valued for reasons unrelated to its exchange value comes from studies of (involuntary) unemployment. Unemployment usually adverse economic effects on workers, inasmuch as it deprives them, at least temporarily, of income. But prolonged unemployment also has measurable negative effects on individuals’ health, both physical and mental (Calvo et al 2015, Margerison-Zilko et al. 2016, Helliwell et al 2017), as well as being among the most stressful of live events. (Holmes and Rahe 1967). That being deprived of work is evidently so detrimental to individual well-being indicates that work matters for many beyond a paycheck.

Many of the goods of work are linked to the fact that work is nearly always a social endeavour. As Cynthia Estlund (2003:7) observes, “the workplace is the single most important site of cooperative interaction and sociability among adult citizens outside the family.” Individuals thus seek out many social goods through work. Gheaus and Herzog (2016) propose that in addition to providing us wages, work fulfills various social roles. For example, work is a primary means by which individuals can achieve a sense of community. In working with others, we can establish bonds that contribute to our sense of belonging and that enable us to contribute to a distinctive workplace culture. In a similar vein, communitarian theorists often argue that work, by embedding us in shared practices or traditions, is essential to social life (Walzer 1983, Breen 2007). MacIntyre (1984:187) defines a practice as a “any coherent and complex form of socially established cooperative activity through which goods internal to that form of activity are realised in the course of trying to achieve those standards of excellence which are appropriate to, and partially definitive of, that form of activity.” Those working together in (say) a bakery are cooperating to produce the goods internal to that activity (bread), with the result that they extend their capacities and enrich their appreciation of the goods they cooperatively produce.

Many philosophers have closely linked work’s value to different aspects of human rationality. For instance, philosophers inspired by thinkers such as Aristotle have underscored work’s ability to allow us to perfect ourselves by developing and exercising our rational potential in worthwhile ways. On this picture, work is a central arena for the realization of our natures across our lifetimes (Clark 2017). Marxists typically agree that work allows us to develop and exercise our rational powers, but add that work’s value also resides in how it enables us to make those powers visible by imparting human form to a natural world that would otherwise remain alien to us. Hence, for Marxists, work is an expression of our active nature, a pathway to self-realization inasmuch as work creates products that “objectify” the human will. Work thus represents a counterweight to the passive consumption characteristic of modern societies (Elster 1989, Sayers 2005).

Another value associated with work is meaningfulness. Philosophical inquiry into meaningful work often parallels philosophical inquiry into the meaning of life. One central dispute about meaningful work is whether it is fundamentally subjective (a matter of how a worker feels about her work), fundamentally objective (a matter of the qualities of one’s work or of the products one makes), or both (Yeoman 2014, Michaelson 2021). Some accounts of meaningful work are broadly Kantian, seeing meaningful work as grounded in the value of autonomy (Schwartz 1982, Bowie 1998, Roessler 2012). Such accounts judge work as meaningful to the extent that it is freely entered into, affords workers opportunities to exercise their own independent judgment, and allows them to pursue ends of their own that are to some extent distinct from the ends mandated by their employers. Other accounts locate the meaningfulness of work in its potential to enhance our capabilities, to manifest virtues such as pride or self-discipline, or to emotionally engage our sense of purpose (Beadle and Knight 2012, Svendsen 2015, Yeoman 2014, Veltman 2016).

At the same time, some argue that meaningful work is in turn a precondition of other important goods. John Rawls, for example, proposed that a lack of opportunity for meaningful work undermines self-respect, where self-respect is the belief that our plan for our lives is both worth pursuing and attainable through our intentional efforts. Meaningful work, as Rawls understood it, involves enjoying the exercise of our capacities, particularly our more complex capacities. Given that meaningful work is a “social basis” for self-respect, a just and stable society may have to offer meaningful work by serving as an “employer of last resort” if such work is otherwise unavailable (Rawls 1996, Moriarty 2009).

Recent years have witnessed a resurgence of interest in the dignity of work. Christian thought, and Catholicism in particular (John Paul II 1981), has long advocated that work manifests the dignity inherent in human beings. The claim that “all work has dignity,” regardless of its nature or of how much social esteem it enjoys, rests on egalitarian ideals about labor, ideals articulated by Black American thinkers such as Booker T. Washington and Martin Luther King, Jr. As Washington expressed it, “there is as much dignity in tilling a field as in writing a poem” (Washington 1901:220). At the same time however, this tradition has also deployed the notion of dignity as a critical concept, to highlight labor injustice and to decry exploitative forms of work (including slavery) that fail to serve or uplift humanity (Washington 1901: 148, King 2011: 171–72, Veltman 2016: 29–31). This position thus seems to assert that work as such has dignity but that work can also vary in its dignity depending on workers’ economic conditions or social status. More recent philosophical scholarship on the dignity of work has investigated its relationship to human rights. For instance, Paolo Gilabert (2018) distinguishes between dignity as a status and dignity as a condition. Status dignity is grounded in certain valuable capacities that individuals have, capacities that in turn that require workers be treated with respect and concern. Condition dignity is achieved when individuals are treated in accordance with the ‘dignitarian’ norms mandated by such respect or concern. Gilabert’s distinction may allow the affirmation both of the inherent dignity of work, inasmuch as work gives evidence of human capacities worthy of respect, and of the claim that failing to provide decent working conditions is at odds with (but does not undermine) dignity.

2.2 Opposition to Work and Work-centred Culture

That work is a potential source of income, social and personal goods, meaning, or dignity, does not entail that work in fact provides these goods or that work is good for us on balance. Since the Industrial Revolution in particular, many philosophers and social theorists have been sceptical about the value of work and of the work-centred cultures typical of contemporary affluent societies (Deranty 2015).

Crucially, much of the scepticism surrounding the value of work is not scepticism about the value of work per se but scepticism about the value of work in present day social conditions or scepticism about the veneration of work found in the “Protestant work ethic” (Weber 1904–05) or in work-centred societies. Sceptics about work-centred culture question whether popular enthusiasm for work is rational or well-informed or whether it gives adequate credence to alternatives to work-centred culture (Cholbi 2018b, Sage 2019). Indeed, many critics of contemporary work arrangements essentially argue that good or desirable work is possible but rarer than we suppose. In “Useful Work versus Useful Toil,” (1884), for example, the socialist activist William Morris rejects “the creed of modern morality that all labor is good in itself” and argues for a distinction between work that is “a blessing, a lightening of life” and work that is “a mere curse, a burden to life,” offering us no hope of rest, no hope of producing anything genuinely useful, and no hope of pleasure in its performance. Similarly, the anarchist Bob Black opens his essay “The Abolition of Work” (1985) as follows:

No one should ever work. Work is the source of nearly all the misery in the world. Almost any evil you’d care to name comes from working or from living in a world designed for work. In order to stop suffering, we have to stop working.

But Black proceeds to define work as “forced labor, that is, compulsory production.” His ‘abolition’ of work is thus compatible with individuals voluntarily engaging in economically productive activities, which (as we have seen) can resemble work in its essentials.

Danaher (2019:54) allows that work can contribute to human well-being, but as presently organized, the world of work is “structurally bad” and unlikely to change in these respects:

The labor market in most developed countries has settled into an equilibrium pattern that makes work very bad for many people, that is getting worse as a result of technical and institutional changes, and that is very difficult to reform or improve in such a way as to remove its bad-making properties.

Thus, even those espousing stridently ‘anti-work’ positions usually target not work as such, but work as it has been organized or understood in the contemporary world. Indeed, much of their ire is directed at current conditions of employment, which (as noted earlier) is only one prominent species work can take.

The sceptical case against work or work culture has many dimensions, but can be fruitfully analysed as having four strands:

  1. Goods not realized: While work can be a source of various goods, many people’s working lives fail to provide them these goods. Popular enthusiasm for work thus seems misplaced, according to work sceptics, for “the moral sanctity of work is painfully out of step with the way that a vast proportion of people actually experience their jobs” (Frayne 2015: 62–63).

    With respect to the exchange value of work, work is often poorly compensated or insecure. Contemporary economies are increasingly characterized by a ‘hollowing out’ of middle class labor, wherein wages continue to increase for those at the upper end of the wage scale, wages stagnate at the bottom end of the scale, and the number of workers in the middle strata shrinks. This has resulted in the emergence of a class of ‘working poor,’ individuals who lack sufficient income to pay for basic needs such as housing or food despite being employed.

    Many of the other potential goods of work are enjoyed by some workers, but many receive little social recognition or do not achieve a greater sense of community through their work. A good deal of socially valuable or ‘essential’ work is largely invisible to its beneficiaries. Many jobs are dull or unchallenging, contributing little to the development or exercise of our more sophisticated human capacities. It is difficult to envision, for instance, that toll booth workers find their jobs or stimulating or challenging (aside from testing their ability to withstand repetition or boredom).

    Modern work has been oriented around the division of labor, i.e., the increasing separation of productive processes into ever smaller tasks. (The factory assembly line provides the model here.) The division of labor results in workers becoming hyper-specialists, who repetitively perform narrow or simple tasks. Although the division of labor increases overall economic productivity, critics such as the classical economist Adam Smith worried that it eventually makes workers “as stupid and ignorant as it is possible for a human creature to become.” (Smith 1776 [1976]: V.1.178) As to meaning or dignity, a wide swath of human work neither engages workers nor allows them to exercise their autonomous judgment, and many work in oppressive or exploitative conditions seemingly at odds with the dignity of the work they perform.

  2. Internal tensions among work goods: A characteristic of work-centred societies is that their members look to work to provide them with many different goods. But work (and employment in particular) may be ill-suited to provide this package of goods, i.e., work may be capable of providing some of these goods but only at the expense of others. For instance, many of the professions that individuals view as offering the greatest opportunities for meaningful work (such as education, counseling, or care for the sick, young, or disabled) are among the poorest paid professions. Contemporary labor markets thus seem to offer a workers the opportunity for an inadequate income or meaningful work, but rarely both. The psychologist Barry Schwartz argues (2015) that our non-material motivations for work, such as seeking meaningfulness, social engagement, and opportunities for autonomy, are in motivational competition with the monetary incentives associated with work. The monetary incentives distort workplace attitudes and behaviours so that the non-material goods we seek in work are crowded out by a focus on productivity and the economic goods work makes available. That labor markets are competitive may also undermine the social benefits of work, for even those who succeed in the labor market do so by being ‘pitted against’ other workers in ways that reduce solidarity among them, turning fellow citizens into rivals who are indifferent (or even hostile to) each other’s interests (Hussain 2020).

  3. Unrecognized bads or costs: Sceptics also point to ‘bads’ or costs associated with work that tend to go unrecognized. The most obvious of these is the opportunity costs resulting from the amount of time spent working. Typically, full-time workers spend 1,500–2,500 hours per year on the job, equivalent to around nine to fifteen weeks annually. These are hours that, were they not allocated to working, could be devoted to leisure, sleep, exercise, family life, civic and community engagement, and so on (Rose 2016). These hours do not include the considerable amount of time that workers expend on training or educating themselves for work or on commuting to and from workplaces. Nor does it include the hours that many salaried workers are expected to be ‘connected’ or ‘on call’ by their employers. Formal employment also tends to preclude workers from work other than that performed for their employers, with the result that workers often end up paying other workers for that labor. Such costs include the hiring of housekeepers, child care providers, maintenance experts and landscapers, etc. And while unemployment seems to have adverse effects on our physical and mental well-being, working is not free of adverse health effects either, including stress, emotional frustration, and physical ailments from repetitive work tasks or ergonomic deficiencies in workplace design.

    Sceptics also argue that when work fails to deliver certain kinds of goods, workers suffer certain psychological bads. Three such classes of bads merit particular attention:

    • Marx’s critique of work under capitalism rests on the notion that work often lacks goods whose absence gives rise to the further bad of alienation. Marx (1844) proposed that work under capitalism alienates workers from what they produce, inasmuch as workers have little if any say over what is produced and how; from the act of work itself, inasmuch as workers are compelled by economic necessity to work and so do not take intrinsic satisfaction in working; from their own human nature or “species-essence,” inasmuch as workers do not witness their own agency or intentions “objectified” in the products of their work; and from other workers, inasmuch as capitalism treats workers as interchangeable inputs of production and pits worker against worker. In terms of our earlier enumeration of the goods of work, Marx’s appeal to alienation suggests that the absence of these goods is not merely a lack or a deprivation but is a positive bad of work in its own right (Elster 1989, Brudney 1998, Kandiyali 2020).
    • Many work sceptics emphasize how work may distort our priorities or values. The value of work, in their eyes, has come to be an unquestioned ethical dogma. “The economists and the moralists have cast a sacred halo over work,” according to Paul LaFargue (1883), instilling us in the “delusion” of the “love of work.” (See also Frayne 2015.) Bertrand Russell (1932) argued that the veneration of work has eroded our appreciation of the value of leisure and idleness. (See also O’Connor 2018.) Economists such as Keynes (1930) observed that the dramatic increases in economic productivity have often not led to reductions in work time, a development he attributes to a work ethic that stymies our capacity to enjoy leisure and abundance.
    • The social cachet of work may end up warping our moral relationship to ourselves, treating ourselves not as intrinsically valuable but as mere instruments of production. Hannah Arendt (1958) argued that conceiving of ourselves primarily as workers leads to a sort of instrumental stance on ourselves and other human agents, in which we come to view ourselves purely as resources for production or sites of consumption. More recent critics have proposed that work-centred cultures encourage us to view the self as a commodity to be ‘branded’ or marketed to prospective employers (Davis 2003).

    Lastly, work can have costs to others besides workers themselves. The aforementioned opportunity costs deriving from time devoted to work may worsen workers’ relationships with others or bar their communities from making use of those workers’ skills for socially worthwhile purposes. Some work arguably makes workers complicit in harmful or unjust practices, such as the sale of tobacco or unhealthy foods. Workers may also impose negative externalities through their work. For example, working outside the home typically results in a greater environmental impact, including contributions to the carbon outputs responsible for global climate change (James 2018).

  4. Alternatives sources of work-related goods: A last thread in ‘anti-work’ thinking is that, even to the degree that work is good, it is not obviously uniquely situated to provide the goods it provides. A sense of social recognition or identity can be rooted in domains of human life besides employment, such as volunteer work, family life, religion, or friendship. “Ludic” activities, i.e., play, can offer opportunities to exercise and hone our rational capacities (Black 1985, Nguyen 2019). Some have proposed that virtual reality will provide us simulacra of work-like activities that could thereby substitute for work itself. Contrary to Gheaus and Herzog (2016) then, work may not be a “a privileged context” for realizing the goods we associate with work.

Anti-work theorists typically call for work to be re-valued such that individuals will ‘work to live, not live to work,’ as well as policies (such as reductions in the mandated weekly working time) to minimize the influence of work on our quality of life. That work is both unavoidable and seemingly necessary but frustrating might suggest the wisdom of an ironic stance toward work (de Botton 2010).

3. Justice and the Politics of Work

Human societies can be seen as cooperative endeavours aimed at securing their members’ interests. If so, then social justice will be centrally concerned with those practices within societies by which individuals cooperate to produce goods for one another’s use. Work is therefore a central concern of social justice. Questions of work and justice arise both with respect to the design of institutions and the choices of individuals.

3.1 Distributive Justice

Most accounts of justice assume that a large number of individuals within a given society will engage in paid work. A crucial moral question, then, is what individuals are entitled to with respect to both the benefits and the harms of work. How, in other words, are the goods and bads of work justly distributed?

One possible answer to this question is that each worker is entitled to whatever benefits their talents and abilities enable them to secure in a labor market governed purely by supply and demand. This answer entails that those whose talents or abilities are in high demand and/or short supply will command greater benefits from prospective employers than those whose talents or abilities are in low demand and/or generously supplied (Boatright 2010). (This same logic would apply to those who use their labor to produce goods for sale rather than those in employment arrangements.)

After the early decades of the twentieth century, many nations implemented policies at odds with this ‘pure market’ vision of work and labor. Most have wage regulations, for example, mandating a minimum level of pay. But the justice of minimum levels of pay is disputed, with some theorists arguing that disallowing a person to sell her labor at a price she judges adequate infringes on her personal liberty. According to many libertarian thinkers, our labor is an exercise of our bodies or our talents, each of which we own in a way akin to our ownership of private property. To disallow someone the right to sell their labor even at a very low cost thus infringes on their rights of self-ownership. (Mack 2002) The fairness of wage differentials is also disputed. Should wages track the economic value of a worker’s contributions or their effort, or are wages primarily an incentive to encourage worker commitment and motivation? (Heath 2018, Moriarty 2020) Some theorists have proposed that inequalities in pay ought to be eliminated altogether (Örtenblad 2021), while some supporters of an unconditional basic income, in which individuals receive regular payments regardless of their working status, see it an alternative way to ensure a sufficient minimum income, one immune to workers becoming unemployed (van Parijs and Vanderbroght 2017).

Distributive justice also pertains to various protections against harms or wrongs associated with work. Again, most societies place legal limitations on various conditions of work. These include protections against overwork via limitations on the length of the workday or workweek; bans on discrimination in hiring or promotion based on race, gender, religion, or other social categories; assurances that workplace risks and dangers are mitigated; and, at a wider societal level, prohibitions aimed at ensuring that individuals lives are not dominated by work at particular life stages (bans on child labor and provisions to make retirement possible). One important moral question about these protections is whether workers should have the right to bargain away some of these protections either for increased pay (as when employees negotiate higher wages in exchange for performing more dangerous jobs) or for enhancements in other protections.

3.2 Contributive and Productive Justice

The questions of distributive justice addressed in the previous section concern what goods workers receive from work if they work at all. But critical questions about justice also pertain to whether workers are entitled to work and whether they are obligated to do so. Work thus raises questions of contributive and productive justice respectively.

For one, do workers have a right to work in the first place? The Universal Declaration of Human Rights states as much, assuring each individual “the right to work, to free employment, to just and favorable conditions of work and to protection against unemployment.” (United Nations 1948, Article 23) A right to work would presumably be more than a negative liberty, i.e., not simply a right that others not interfere with one’s attempts to work, secure employment, etc., but a claim to be provided work if one wishes (Schaff 2017). The right to work has been defended both for specific populations (such as the disabled; see Kavka 1992) or for the populace writ large (Tcherneva 2020). If there is such a right, it will presumably be because work is an essential (or at least the prevailing) means for the acquisition of vital goods. Elster (1988) proposes a job guarantee on the grounds that work is essential to self-realization. Gomberg (2007) argues that work is a key social good because it is the primary path by which to make a socially validated contribution to one’s wider community, a contribution that can provide us recognition and a sense of meaning. Two crucial questions that arise in connection with the putative right to work are (a) against whom is this right held, i.e., who must provide work if workers have a right to it, or (b) whether work provided so as to honour this right will in fact provide the goods on which the right to work is based (e.g., the work provided under a government-provided job guarantee could prove unfulfilling).

A right to work would mean that any person (or at least any adult) who wished to work would be able to do so. But do individuals have a right not to work, or is work in any sense morally obligatory? The most obvious basis for such an obligation appeals to notions of fair play or reciprocity: Individuals act wrongly when they fail to contribute to social enterprises from which they benefit, and since the productive economy benefits most everyone in a society, individuals have an obligation to contribute to the productive economy by working. (Becker 1980, White 2003) Opponents of this fair play rationale argue that the conditions for just reciprocal relations between societies and particular groups (e.g., the ghetto poor; see Shelby 2012) do not obtain, thereby exempting members of such groups from the obligation to work, or that contemporary economic developments fail to provide the background conditions for the obligation to apply (Cholbi 2018a). Other opponents of an obligation to work argue that it represents a violation of the state’s duty to treat citizens equally; citizens who are compelled to work are made to pursue a conception of the good life with which they may not agree, and a just state should treat citizens as equals by remaining neutral among rival conceptions of the good life (van Parijs 1991, Levine 1995). An obligation to work would in effect amount to the state’s endorsement of the ‘work ethic’ and the rejection of ways of life (e.g., being a beachcomber) that themselves oppose the work ethic. Other opponents of a duty to work argue that requiring individuals to work is likely to stand in the way of self-realization for particular people (Maskivker 2012).

Another possibility is that even if there is not a general obligation to work, we might be subject to limitations on our work-related liberties in order to satisfy demands of distributive justice. Many of the goods provided by a just society, including education and health care, are labor-intensive. But societies often face shortfalls of workers in the very occupations that provide these goods. Some philosophers have argued that the demands of distributive justice may permissibly constrain our work choices, and in fact, may license governments conscripting labor in order to secure workers to provide these goods, on the model of the military draft during wartime. (Fabré 2008, Stanczyk 2012). Similar concerns arise concerning socially necessary but undesirable ‘dirty’ work.(Walzer 1983, Schmode 2019). Conversely, if justice can require individuals to perform certain kinds of work, this might speak against a right to strike (Borman, 2017, Gourevitch 2018), particularly on the part of essential workers (Munoz 2014).

How one’s choice of work contributes to justice and the overall good is a moral question that individuals face as well. Some jobs (hired assassin, for example) seem immoral as such. But to what extent, if any, are we obligated to choose careers or jobs that promote justice or the welfare of others? On the one hand, choice of jobs and careers does not appear exempt from moral considerations, inasmuch as the work one performs affects others and society at large, and given the often dismal state of the world, perhaps we are obligated to choose jobs and careers for moral reasons rather than solely on the basis of self-interest. Norman Care (1984:285) proposes “that in today’s world morality requires that service to others be put before self-realization in the matter of career choice.” In contrast, some philosophers who believe that individuals (and not merely institutions) within a society are subject to demands of justice nevertheless accord individuals discretion in their choices of occupation. G.A. Cohen, for instance, asserts that we should each enjoy a “personal prerogative” that allows us to be something more than an “engine for the welfare of other people” or “slaves to social justice.” (2008:10) We might likewise worry that requiring that our job or career choices be optimal from the standpoint of justice or social welfare is excessively demanding in light of how such choices both reflect and shape our identities (Cholbi 2020).

3.3 Equality and Workplace Governance

In recent years, egalitarian philosophers have begun to critique typical workplace arrangements as antagonistic to requirements of equal relations among individuals in society. Particularly influential here is Anderson’s suggestion that many workplaces amount to a form of “private government,” at least as authoritarian as many forms of state government.

Imagine a government that assigns almost everyone a superior whom they must obey. Although superiors give most inferiors a routine to follow, there is no rule of law. Orders may be arbitrary and can change at any time, without prior notice or opportunity to appeal. Superiors are unaccountable to those they order around. They are neither elected nor removable by their inferiors. …The government does not recognize a personal or private sphere or autonomy free from sanction. It may prescribe a dress code and forbid certain hairstyles. Everyone lives under surveillance, to ensure that they are complying with orders. …The economic system of the society run by this government is communist. The government owns all the nonlabor means of production in the society it governs. It organizes production by means of central planning. The form of the government is a dictatorship (Anderson 2017: 37–38).

The ‘society’ Anderson invites us to imagine is of course the contemporary workplace, at least as it stands in the United States and many other nations. Anderson and other relational egalitarians view the relationships defined by the powers that employers usually have over their employees as oppressive and unjust. Workers are subject to employers’ ‘governance,’ but this governance consists in employees being arbitrarily and unaccountably subject to the wills of employers. The relational egalitarian thus concludes that workplaces, as presently constituted, do not involve employees and employers relating as genuine equals. And while employees will generally have the right to exit employment relationships, this may be little protection against oppression if most workplaces are organized in the way Anderson illustrates.

To some degree, the inequalities to which Anderson points are products of labor law and policies specific to different nations. There are, however, ways of altering the relationships between employers and workers so as to potentially prevent or address these (and other) inequalities.

Perhaps the most familiar such method is unionization or collective bargaining. Worker unions amplify the power of individual workers in relation to their employers by compelling employers to negotiate contracts with workers as a body. Unions may organize workers within a particular profession, within many professions, or within a single workplace or firm. Societies vary considerably in the degrees to which their workers are unionized and their labor laws friendly to union formation and power. Unions are presumptively justified on the grounds that workers who consensually form or join unions are exercising their right to freely associate with others with whom they share interests in order to promote those interests (Lindblom 2019), though if union membership is required in order to be employed in a particular workplace or industry, unionization may violate individuals right not to associate with others or to associate with (in this instance, to enter into an employment relationship) any party of their choosing (White 1998).Appealing to “republican liberty,” Mark Reiff (2020) has argued that unions should be viewed as a basic institution of society that protects workers’ liberty from exploitation by employers. On Reiff’s view, unionization should therefore be universal and compulsory.

Other methods for redressing the seemingly unequal and oppressive relations between employers and employees involve breaking the monopoly on decision making that management typically has within a given firm or employment arrangement. Typical workplaces are hierarchical rather than democratic. Many egalitarian critics of work call for the workplace to be more democratized, with workers having a greater say not only concerning their own working conditions but also concerning decisions usually reserved for management. Advocates for workplace democracy often argue that it is likely to be the most effective workplace organization in protecting workers’ interests. (González-Ricoy 2014). Others emphasize that the workplace is a microcosm of larger society and hence serves as a training ground for the development of virtues needed to live in a larger democratic society (Pateman 1970, Estlund 2003). But perhaps the most basic argument for workplace democracy is that firms are analogous to states, and so if the state ought to be governed democratically, so too should firms and other workplaces (Dahl 1986, Mayer 2000, Landemore & Ferreras 2016). Workplace democracy would seem to render the workplace more just inasmuch as it makes workers’ conditions a partial byproduct of their consent and a reflection of their autonomy (Schaff 2012).

3.4 Gender, Care, And Emotional Labor

Work’s role in justice is further complicated by the fact that work is a highly gendered phenomenon in many societies. For one, women typically perform much of the housekeeping and child care that traditionally have not been recognized with monetary compensation. Within the formal labor market, many societies have a wage gap wherein women are paid less than men for similar work, and there are significant differences in gender representations in different professions (traditionally, women highly represented in fields such as primary school teaching, nursing, and social work, men highly represented in fields such as engineering and finance). Feminist philosophers have detected in these differentials an undervaluation of the kinds of work, particularly care work, that women have often performed (Gurtler and Smith 2005) as well as a blind spot in philosophical theorizing about justice wherein ‘relational’ goods that matter to our life prospects but are usually not provided via market exchange are ignored (Gheaus 2009). One intricate set of issues here is understanding the underlying relations of cause and effect: Are women in societies with sexist norms pushed toward low pay or low prestige jobs because they are women, or are these low pay or low prestige jobs because women tend to perform them (or both)? In a similar vein, we may wonder how norms of gender intersect with the gendered division of labor (whether, for example, the stereotype that women are more eager to care for children feeds the gendered division of labor or whether the gendered division of labor reinforces that stereotype, or both).

The gendered division of labor is open to objections of different kinds: On the one hand, it appears to result in distributions of work-related goods (such as income, free time, etc.) in which women are systematically shortchanged. In addition, the gendered division of labor may be unjust because it contributes to hierarchies between the genders that render them unequal. (Hartley and Watson 2018) Schouten (2019) argues that, although many individuals embrace traditional gender norms and the gendered division of labor these entail, those who instead favour gender-egalitarian ways of life have a reasonable ground to complain when societies create institutions and policies that support expectations — the gendered division of labor chief among these — that serve as impediments to such ways of life. According to Schouten then, a just society will regulate work time, family leave, and dependent care so as to foster gender-egalitarian ways of life and a non-gendered division of labor. (See also Wright and Brighouse 2008, Gheaus 2012.)

A further strand in feminist thought about work arises from Hochschild’s scholarship (2012) on emotional labor. Some work involves intensive monitoring or management of one’s own emotions in order to engage or manipulate the emotions of others. Although Hochschild offers examples of such emotional labor undertaken both by women and men, some professions in which women predominate are saturated with emotional labor. Hochschild notes that female flight attendants, for instance, are subject to a wide array of emotional expectations vis-à-vis air travellers (smiling, friendly banter, interest in travellers’ destinations or professions, etc.). Scholars have highlighted a number of ethically salient features of emotional labor (see Barry, Olekalns, and Rees 2019 for a useful overview), but the phenomenon has been subject to little systematic philosophical analysis. Hochschild primarily emphasizes the detrimental effects of emotional labor on workers themselves, arguing that it can estrange workers from their own emotions and lead to struggles to identify or express authentic emotion both within and outside the workplace. Furthermore, when emotional labor results in employees’ “surface acting,” that is, displaying emotions at odds with their own internal feelings, employees’ health suffers. Other ethical concerns are more interpersonal — for example, that emotional labor is deceptive or lacks integrity. Barry, Olekalns, and Rees (2019) offer a useful starting point by noting that emotional labor raises the prospect of conflicts between workers’ rights and the rights of their employers, between workers’ rights and workers’ duties, and between employer rights and employer duties.

4. Work and its Future

A number of social commentators have predicted that economic and technological trends will soon culminate in societies become increasingly ‘post-work,’ that is, far fewer individuals will engage in paid work, work hours will dramatically decrease, and work will have a far smaller role among individuals’ values or concerns.(Frey and Osborne 2013, Thompson 2015, Brynjolofsson and McAfee 2014). Whether this prospect should be welcomed or avoided depends to a large extent on issues addressed earlier in this article: how good work in fact is, whether there are other avenues for attaining the goods associated with work, etc.

Some welcome a post-work future as liberating (Livingston 2016, Chamberlain 2018, James 2018, Danaher 2019), arguing that diminutions in the centrality of work will afford us greater leisure, freedom, or community, especially if activities such as play or the appreciation of the natural worlds supplant work. Others worry that the decline of work will deprive us of a central arena in which to realize goods central to our natures (Deranty 2015) or will instigate high levels of inequality or economic distress (Frase 2016). Others express concern about individuals’ ability to psychologically transition from a work-centred to a work-optional society (Cholbi 2018b).

5. Conclusion

Work and labor bear intrinsic philosophical interest. But their centrality to the human condition also entail that work and labor intersect with still broader philosophical questions about the human good and the just organization of human societies. Ongoing and anticipated changes to the world of work should provide rich fodder for philosophical inquiry in coming decades. Philosophy is likely to have a special role to play in addressing what Appiah (2021:7) has called the “hard problem,” to determine “how to produce the goods and services we need, while providing people with income, sociability, and significance.”


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