Nicolai Hartmann

First published Sun Jul 1, 2012; substantive revision Mon Jul 18, 2016

Nicolai Hartmann (1882–1950) was one of the leading German philosophers of the first half of the twentieth century. While Hartmann was in many respects a classic philosopher and wrote book-length works scrutinizing and developing all the major fields of philosophy, including the philosophy of history, ethics and aesthetics, his leading interest was ontology. He systematically developed a comprehensive and rich theory of categories, which set out his thought on ontological modalities, the difference between the spheres of real and ideal being, the fundamental categories of reality, the ontological levels in which reality is structured, and cosmological categories.

1. Introduction

Nicolai Hartmann (b. Riga, 1882, d. Göttingen, 1950; for biographical information, see Harich 2000, Heiss 1961 and F. Hartmann 1978) was recognized in the first half of the twentieth century as one of the leading German philosophers, on a par with Husserl or Heidegger. After the Second World War, Hartmann was elected President of the German Philosophical Association for both the acknowledged value of his philosophical ideas and his apparent lack of any improper compromise with Nazism. The only paper in English published by Hartmann during his lifetime appeared in Mind in 1949, and it was written in his capacity as President of the German Philosophical Association. Its purpose was to inform the philosophical community about the results achieved by German philosophers in the years before the Second World War. After Hartmann’s death in 1950, however, his ideas attracted no further attention. The sixty years that have passed since the war have seen waves of interest in a number of thinkers, such as Brentano or Meinong, who have never been part of mainstream philosophy. But Hartmann’s ideas have never again been a topic of discussion. It is difficult to determine why things have gone this way. Some aspects of Hartmann’s style may provide the beginnings of an answer. He systematically adopted a non-speculative style of analysis, admitting only the minimum of metaphysics needed to frame the problems that ontology proves unable to address. His language was clear, and his method was rigorous, almost pedantic, proceeding punctiliously step by step, without anticipating solutions or taking anything for granted. His writings are so precisely organized that their reader is held in check and feels unable to foresee the next step in the argumentation.

Serious research is required to explain the neglect of Hartmann’s thought. The recent establishment of the Nicolai Hartmann Society has shown that scholars interested in Nicolai Hartmann and his ideas are present everywhere, not only in North America and Europe but also in South America and Asia. The proceedings of the first international conference on Nicolai Hartmann (Poli, Scognamiglio, Tremblay 2011) and this entry provide information on Hartmann’s thought that may contribute to open evaluation of his contributions to philosophy.

Thus far, only two book-length works by Hartmann have been translated into English, the three volumes of the Ethics and the short New Ways of Ontology. Two more books are presently under translation: Possibility and Actuality and Aesthetics (both are scheduled to appear in 2013, see Hartmann 2013a,b). The translation of one of his papers has also been completed and will soon be published (Hartmann 2012). English readers can rely on only five book-length presentations of Hartmann’s thought (two published in 2011): Poli, Scognamiglio and Tremblay’s The Philosophy of Nicolai Hartmann (2011); Kelly’s Material Ethics of Value—Max Scheler and Nicolai Hartmann (2011); Werkmeister’s Nicolai Hartmann’s New Ontology (1990), Cadwallader’s Searchlight on Values: Nicolai Hartmann’s Twentieth-century Value Platonism (1984), and Mohanty’s older Nicolai Hartmann and Alfred North Whitehead. A Study in Recent Platonism (1957).

In many respects, Hartmann was a classic philosopher: he wrote book-length works scrutinizing and developing all the major fields of philosophy. Plato’s Logic of Being (1909) paved the way for his understanding of the sphere of ideal (or abstract) being, while The Problem of Spiritual Being (1933), the three volumes of Ethics (1926) and the Aesthetics (1953) delved into the many intricacies of the spiritual stratum of reality (on which see Section 6 below), an inquiry prepared for by his systematic analysis of German Idealism (The Philosophy of German Idealism, 2 vols., 1923 and 1929). Hartmann addressed the problem of knowledge and the connections between epistemology and ontology in his Metaphysics of Knowledge (1921). His leading interest was ontology, however. All his works—Ethics and Aesthetics included—have an unmistakably ontological bent. The overall architecture of his ontology was set out in four books: Foundations of Ontology (1935), Possibility and Actuality (1938), The Construction of the Real World (1940), and Philosophy of Nature (1950). New Ways of Ontology (En. tr. 1953) is a simplified and highly compressed presentation of the overall framework. Preliminary to the four-volume ontological set is the already-mentioned Metaphysics of Knowledge. Put briefly, Metaphysics of Knowledge discusses the interaction between epistemology and ontology and the inevitable dependence of any epistemology on ontology.

Foundations of Ontology paved the way for a systematic treatment of ontology by introducing (1) the difference between modes of being (the modalities of possibility, necessity and actuality), spheres of being (real and ideal) and ways of being (Dasein and Sosein), and (2) a treatment of emotional transcendent acts as constituting the requisite pre-conceptual acquaintance with the harshness of reality.

The main thesis put forward by Hartmann in the Foundations of Ontology is that all ontological differences are articulations of being, not differences between being and non-being. Parts and wholes are both authentic aspects of being; independent and dependent entities are similarly aspects of being; physical, biological, psychological and spiritual types of being are all manifestations of being, and none of them is “more being” than any other. From the point of view of ontology, no part, aspect, or moment of reality is “more being” than any other part, aspect or moment of it. The fact that, say, the existence of biological entities depends on that of physical entities does not imply that physics is “more ontologically real” than biology. Existentially dependent entities are as ontologically genuine as existentially independent ones. All entities, whatever their type, demand the same careful ontological scrutiny.

Hartmann’s analytic development of ontology begins with the theory of ontological modalities elaborated in Possibility and Actuality. The main purpose of this book is to demonstrate that modalities ground the differences between the two principal spheres of being (real and ideal) and the two secondary spheres of being (knowledge and logic). Finally, The Construction of the Real World and Philosophy of Nature present in detail the many categories within the real sphere of being. This entry specifically deals with (some parts of) the third and the fourth volumes of Hartmann’s ontological quadrilogy, making no more than passing mention of the first two volumes in the series. Since Possibility and Actuality will soon be available in English, we focus here on sources that are likely to be unavailable in English for a substantial amount of time. Furthermore, towards the end of the entry, there is a brief summary of Hartmann’s theory of values as presented in his Ethics and Aesthetics. This entry does not to discuss Hartmann’s historical works, such as his innovative interpretation of Plato (Luchetti 2011), or his role in the development of German Philosophical Anthropology (Fischer 2011).

Since Hartmann organized his bulky books into short chapters, subdivided into sections usually no longer than one or two pages, we follow his method of internal referencing by indicating the relevant chapters and sections. The following abbreviations will be used: E = Grundzüge der Metaphysik der Erkenntnis; S = “Systematische Philosophie in eigener Darstellung”; ET2 = Ethics. Vol 2. Moral Values; P = The Problem of Spiritual Being; G = Zur Grundlegung der Ontologie; M = Möglichkeit und Wirklichkeit; A = Der Aufbau der realen Welt; N = Philosophie der Natur; W = New Ways of Ontology; AE = Aesthetics. The chapters of Introduction will be referred to as “Intro”. Therefore “N.Intro5” and “N.3c” will respectively refer to Section 5 of the Introduction and Chapter 3, Section c of the Philosophy of Nature.

2. Preliminary sketches

This section summarizes some aspects of the theoretical background to Hartmann’s analysis of ontological categories.

2.1 Philosophical method

According to Hartmann, an unbiased philosophical inquiry moves through the three main stages of phenomenological, aporetic and theoretical development. The first stage is descriptive and requires the systematic collection of all the available evidence relevant to whatever is under scrutiny. More often than not, descriptions end up in conflicting theses, often in the form of aporias. More than anybody else, Hartmann rehabilitates the value of aporias (for two recent evaluations of Hartmann’s aporetic method see Schlittmaier 2011 and Rescher 2011). Aporias themselves are informative and should not be forced to disappear by fiat decisions, such as an a priori assumption on the overall consistency of reality or the assumption that we have a direct, transparent access to reality. The last phase of the philosophical method consists in using as few metaphysical assumptions as possible for the systematic coordination of the outcomes from the first two phases (E, S).

Metaphysical assumptions are necessary for the task of incorporating aporias into a framework able to make sense of them. Since metaphysical assumptions are not directly supported by descriptive data, it is advisable to keep them to a minimum, or to assume the weakest possible metaphysical assumptions.

An original way of distinguishing between ontology and metaphysics underlies the third stage of theoretical development. Ontology, for Hartmann, deals with what can be subsumed under at least partially representable categories (see Section 3 below). Two main consequences follow from this view of ontology: firstly, ontology is primarily a theory of categories, in the sense that all ontological distinctions have the form of categories (A.Intro1), and secondly, science in all its branches is the most successful and powerful ally of ontology. More precisely, for Hartmann science is ontological in all its ramifications (G.37a). This is rather at odds with the mainstream view of science as an eminently epistemological affair. This is one of the issues on which Hartmann firmly departs from the Kantian—to be precise, the Neo-Kantian—legacy. The claim that the main orientation of science is ontological immediately entails that scientific categories are further specifications and subdivisions of ontological categories. In other words, the contact with science is a characteristic feature of the theory of categories, and therefore of ontology (A.Intro1). The philosopher’s task is to unfold the first and most general articulations of the theory of categories, while scientists deal with their subsequent further specifications.

2.2 Knowledge from an ontological standpoint

Ontology is knowledge of being, and knowledge is an epistemological problem. In order to clarify the connection between the epistemological problem of categories and the ontological problem of categories, knowledge should be correctly defined. For Hartmann, the basic ontological assumption concerning knowledge is that it does not create or generate its objects. Ontologically speaking, knowledge grasps objects. If knowledge does not generate its objects, objects ontologically precede any effort to grasp them.

Objects are indifferent as to whether or not they are known. Whilst knowledge is relevant for the knower, it is of no importance for the object itself. Knowledge uncovers aspects, brings to light dimensions and properties of objects. Knowledge introduces a divide between that part of the object which has been captured by knowledge and that part which remains to be known. The former is usually typified and then represented by concepts. The divide between the full ontological object and the part that has been apprehended shifts as knowledge develops.

2.3 Being qua being

Ontology is the theory of being qua being, which results in the difference between Dasein and Sosein. These two terms can only imperfectly be translated as existence and being-thus (or determination). All entities—either real or ideal—have Dasein and Sosein, albeit in different ways. For instance, real existence (i.e., the existence of a real being) is a temporal determination, whilst ideal existence is compossibility.

The difference between Dasein and Sosein—and every other articulation that ontology is supposed to present—is characterized categorially. As a matter of fact, categories are the only tools available to an ontologist. Ontology, therefore, is a thoroughgoing theory of categories.

3. Ontological categories

Hartmann’s theory of categories entirely breaks with Kant’s or Hegel’s theories of categories by explicitly denying that categories are concepts. While we need concepts in order to refer to categories, concepts never capture categories entirely.

Categories deal with what is universal and necessary (A.Intro12). Categories articulate in particular the Sosein of entities; they specify configurations, structures and contents, not forms of existence (A.Intro7). Categories specify the fundamental determinations of being; they are principles of being (on principles see Section 4.1 below). As fundamental determinations of being, categories form the interior of entities. In this sense, categories are immanent to the world: they do not form a second world (A.16b). The categorial interior of entities has a layered organization: the most fundamental categories structure the innermost core of entities, while other categories, such as scientific ones, add progressively more superficial layers. Ontological categories are the lowest layer of being. They form the network of internal, dynamic determinants and dependencies which articulate the furniture of the world. One of the most interesting aspects of the theory of categories is that categories do not form a homogeneous continuum, but appear to be organized in groups (A.intro15; see below for details). Some categories belong to all the spheres of being, some to the entire real world, others to a specific level of reality. The first group of categories is analyzed in detail in Possibility and Actuality; the second group is analyzed in The Structure of the Real World, while the third group is analyzed in the Philosophy of Nature. The categories of the first group are called ‘modal categories’, those of the second group ‘fundamental categories’, and those of the third group ‘special categories’. Fundamental categories comprise (1) categories organized in pairs of opposites, such as principle-concretum, mode-structure, and form-matter; (2) level categories, such as those that distinguish inanimate, living, psychological and spiritual beings; and (3) the categories of intercategorial connections, or the group of categorial laws, such as the laws of coherence, stratification, and dependence among categories (see Section 6 below).

We come to know ontological categories through the objects that we come to know. However, our knowledge of ontological categories is even more provisional than our knowledge of objects. The difference between knowing objects and knowing categories explains why ontological categories are often confused with concepts. The problem is that categories do not allow direct acquaintance as objects do. Concepts are names of ontological categories, which implies that concepts are partial, static, separate representations of items that in themselves are both essentially dynamic and inseparable from other ontological categories.

Like the knowledge of objects, the knowledge of ontological categories also changes—when ontology develops, our understanding of ontological categories develops as well, so that we gain a deeper and better grasp of their articulation and subtleties. Some categories have countless variations, others only a few minor ones. The most general and schematic categories are those with the most meager content, and they are therefore those that change less (A.27b).

The two main aspects of categories are their generality and their character of determination. The latter is the feature that makes them principles. Principles exhaust themselves in this determining role. Principles are nothing in themselves. They only exist for something else; they are something only with respect to the concretum that they determine and are in. Principles are nothing without their concretum, and the concretum cannot exist without its principles (A.1a; 6b; 16b; and elsewhere).

The ontological aspect of the categories consists in some kind of determination of their concreta. It is apparent that principles do not determine their concreta as causes, reasons, or ends. Apart from denying these patently inadequate characterizations, it is difficult to specify any positive feature of the relation of determination, because it appears to be a sui generis relation. A positive unfolding of the moments characterizing the relation between principles and concreta is a task still to be accomplished (A.5a).

Categories as principles are independent from their concreta, not from other categories (A.11c). We will see that principles imply one another, and that all the categories characterizing a level of reality work together (A.15c; see Section 6 below).

Categories are far from being the only principles of entities. There are also highly particular principles structuring specific domains of being—such as natural laws or psychological laws—which are concreta with respect to general categories (A.25f). There is a gradation of principles from the most general categories to specific real cases. Empirical laws are concreta with respect to general principles, and they are principles with respect to individual instances.

4. Paired categories

Paired categories are the most general structural elements of being. As structural elements they have content, and there are composite relations among them (A.23b). Hartmann organizes the various pairs into two groups of six pairs, without implying that the list of paired oppositions is definitive:

  • Group 1. Principle-concretum, structure-modus, form-matter, inner-outer, determination-dependence, quality-quantity.
  • Group 2. Unity-manifoldness, harmony-conflict, opposition-dimension, discreteness-continuity, substratum-relation, element-complex.

Neither the two groups nor their internal order constitute a hierarchical order because there is no intrinsic order among the pairs (A.24a). It is apparent that some of these are easier to grasp than others. Apart from the relations within each categorial pair, there are relations among the members of a pair and those of others (A.26a). The collection of these external relations is also a constitutive element of the categories, on a par with the relations internal to the different pairs. Two cases are particularly relevant: the relation of the different paired categories to their common concretum, and the transverse relations among the contents of the different categories (A.26a). To provide a sample of Hartmann’s analysis, we now briefly describe some of the pairs (for more details see Werkmeister 1990, Poli 2011a).

4.1 The principle and its concretum

Concretum for Hartmann is what is determinate, that in which categories are embedded as their determinations. The concretum is not limited to real entities, but includes ideal ones as well. Furthermore, the concretum for Hartmann is not to be understood as limited to the individual instances of a principle because there can be different levels of concreta. For instance, level categories are concreta with respect to general categories. Both the concretum and its principles are categories.

Real categories contain all the universal determinations of their concreta; they contain what is needed for the structure of the concreta. A complete system of categories—not the incomplete one we are able to grasp—completely determines its concreta (A.4a). As natural laws exist only in the real processes of nature and are nothing outside of them, so real categories exist only as structural relations within the real world and are nothing in themselves (A.16c).

The principle-concretum determination is only one among a variety of types of determination, and in no way is it the most relevant in the real world. In fact, each real level has its own specific types of determination, such as the specific linear nexus (causal, final, etc.) that unifies the phases of the processes that unfold within a concretum. The following three moments characterize the essence of principles, and the three corresponding moments the essences of concreta:

  1. The epistemological relation: The principle is that through which the concretum is grasped.
  2. The first ontological relation: The principle is the archè of the concretum, the condition of its possibility or that on which the concretum rests.
  3. The second ontological relation: The principle has unconstrained validity for all the concreta that fall within its range (A.27c).

4.2 Modus and structure

Modus determines intermodal relations and in particular the special form of Dasein; structure refers to the Sosein and all the moments of its determination. All the remaining twenty-two oppositions are articulations of structure. Like the most general relations, the relation between principle and concretum is a structural relation (A.24b).

4.3 Substratum and relation

All entities are determined by relations, both internal and external. This is why every isolation is secondary and exclusively due to acts of abstraction. Without relations, there is neither unity nor multiplicity; form and quality depend on relations (A.28a). While relations can have other relations as their arguments, at some point the series of relations within relations within relations etc., must end. Sooner or later, there must be a non-relational substratum, a substratum that is not the result of a relational construction (A.25c). A substratum, for Hartmann, is the argument of a possible relation. The term ‘substratum’ implies that what is at stake is the source or domain of an asymmetrical relation. Real categories are constituted by material moments. Moments with the character of substratum do not pertain to the mode of being of ideal entities (A.4a).

4.4 Quality and quantity

The quality-quantity pair is one of those where the character of opposition between the two constituting categories is less apparent. Hartmann sees quantities as determinations of real being and qualities as (within limits) determinations of the secondary sphere of knowledge (A.39a). Three pairs of oppositions are included under quality (positive and negative, general and individual, and identity and difference) and three different pairs of oppositions are included under quantity (one and many, part and whole, and finite and infinite).

4.5 Element and complex

Complexes are relational entities. (N.38c) explains that he prefers the term ‘complex’ (Gefüge) to the ‘outworn’ (verbrauchten) term ‘system’ (System). The elements of a complex are its members, not substrata. Elements are determined by the complex of which they are members (A.25c). Complexes have their own type of determination; but in each case, the determination extends across the complex’s elements and transforms them. A complex of elements is always a complex of relations and determinations. Elements are essentially determined by the positions they occupy within the complex’s total series of relations (A.33a). This explains why elements have functions within the complex. Within a complex, what matters are not the elements, but the relations that they maintain among themselves and with the complex.

The main difference between complex and class (Ganze; the terms ‘whole’ and ‘totality’ are used for other concepts, see Poli 2011a) is that a complex has some autonomy vis-à-vis its members, while a class has no autonomy vis-à-vis its parts. Classes depend on their parts, while elements depend on their complex. The two dependence relations proceed in opposite directions. This is not entirely correct, however. To some extent, a complex depends on its elements as well. A better formulation of the difference between classes and complexes runs as follows: within limits, if a class loses one of its parts, the class becomes different but the lost part remains the same; if a complex loses one of its elements, the complex remains the same but the element becomes different (A.33a).

An irregularly shaped stone, a grain of sand, a puddle, a mountain are not independent complexes, but fragments and parts of much wider formations that come into existence before them and within which they exist as subordinate moments (A.33c).

All natural complexes are complexes of forces and processes. There is no reason to view their elements as simple or as analogous to material particles. If we assume that inorganic parts are elements of an organism, this way of understanding an organism is radically different from the idea that an organism is a dynamic complex able to survive the continuous substitution of its elements (A.33d). The former idea refers to a physical complex, while the latter refers to a biological complex, and the two are authentically different complexes. The inside of the complex of processes that constitutes an organism is the capacity of the complex to maintain its working conditions—what Hartmann calls the self-determination of the organism (A.34c).

4.6 Inner and outer

Not everything has an inside, and not everything is what results from its inner structure. Force does not need to be the exteriorization of anything else, and effects do not need to be the exteriorizations of causes. Only entities that have some ontic autonomy have an inside. In nature, dynamic and organic complexes are the best-known cases. Outer forces of lower-order entities are inner forces of higher-order entities: for instance, outer forces of nuclei are inner forces of atoms (A.34b). Determinations do not need to be internal to things (or to constitute their interiors). Most real nexuses are external determinations. Causality is the most obvious case (A.24e).

For all complexes, the inside of the complex is constituted by the relations among its members, while the outside of the complex is constituted by the relations between the complex and other complexes. Every outside can become the inside of a higher-order complex (A.25d).

5. Paired categories with positional value

We now turn from the many intricacies of paired categories to a patter we extract that governs the behavior of most pairs. We refer to this as the ‘positional aspect’ of paired categories. ‘Positional’ refers to the fact that the two categories composing a pair alternate with each other. It follows that some aspects of the content of each category depend on the position that the latter occupies with reference to its twin category. The simplest case is the matter-form opposition. The guiding idea is that every form is the form of some underlying matter, and it is the matter of some higher form; similarly all matter is the matter of some higher form and the form of some underlying matter (see Figure 1 below). This alternation exemplifies the sense in which matter and form are positional categories. Furthermore, matter and form enter into two different ties: horizontally, matter and form are moments of an individual being; vertically, matter and form connect different individuals (as parts and wholes or members and collectives). Hartmann generalizes this pattern and detects the occurrence of similar alternations for other paired categories as well. Let us consider Dasein and Sosein, which, as already said, can be approximately understood as existence and determination. Here is how Hartmann presents their positional alternation: The Dasein of a tree is the Sosein of a forest (G.19a); without the tree the forest would be different. Similarly, the Dasein of the branch is the Sosein of the tree. The Dasein of the leaf is the Sosein of the branch. The Dasein of the vein is the Sosein of the leaf. Things can be inverted, too: the Sosein of the leaf is the Dasein of the vein; the Sosein of the branch is the Dasein of the leaf, etc.

The fact that only a part of the Sosein of an entity X contributes to the Dasein of a different entity Y does not raise problems. The Dasein-Sosein series has two limits: towards the first, original Dasein and towards the last Sosein, the Sosein of the whole of reality.

The mainstream interpretation of Dasein and Sosein as entirely separate aspects of being depends on epistemological acts of isolation. Only when moments are separated do independent substances and dependent qualities appear, and it is for this reason that it seems that qualities do not have any Dasein and,  complementarily, that their bearers have no Sosein (G.20c).

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Figure 1.

The main difference between matter and form, on the one hand, and Dasein and Sosein on the other, is that the latter pair runs homogeneously through the whole of reality, while the matter-form stratification does not run homogeneously from the bottom to the highest layers of reality. Matter and form are always relative to a substrate, and the matter-form stratification stops when a new substratum appears (the section on levels of reality will explain why this is so).

6. Levels of reality

The next group after that of paired categories is the group of the categories of levels of reality. Like everything else, levels of reality are characterized (and therefore distinguished) by their categories. By definition, the categories characterizing levels of reality are not general, in the sense that they do not pertain to reality in its entirety, but only to specific families of real being. On the other hand, fundamental categories are the most general and simple categories, and for this reason they are contained in the special categories of levels of reality (A.21b). Levels are the true constructive framework of the real world. Whilst the latter has unity, its unity is the unity of neither a principle nor a center. The unity of the real world is instead provided by the order of the levels of reality (A.52a).

Four main levels of reality are distinguished by Hartmann: the inanimate, the biological, the psychological and the spiritual. This last includes all historical realities (history, language, customs, law, art, etc.). The underlying intuition is as follows: whilst the structure and the laws of history and other spiritual processes are different from the structure and laws of, say, inanimate beings, the former are not in any way less real than the latter (A.20a). The same intuition applies to the other levels as well: biological and psychological processes are as real as any other process, and they have their own specific groups of categories.

One of the most intriguing aspects of Hartmann’s theory of levels of reality is the question of what kinds of relation connect the levels to each other. From a categorial point of view, however, the problem of what relations connect levels can be easily solved. Leaving general categories aside, two main categorial situations can be distinguished: (a) Being A and B are categorially different because the categories upon which the former is founded are partially different from the categories upon which the latter is founded, in the sense that the latter is founded on new categories (which implies that the latter includes at least a novum, a new category not present in the former); (b) Being A and B are categorially different because the categories upon which the former is founded and those upon which the latter is founded form two entirely different (disjoint) groups of categories. Following Hartmann, the two relations can be termed respectively relations of super-formation (Überformung) and super-position (Überbauung) (A.51f).

Super-formation (the type (a) form of dependence) is weaker than super-position because it is partly grounded on already actualized categories, those of the level below. Suffice it to consider the super-formation between molecules and cells, i.e., between the physical and the biological levels of reality. In this regard, one can mention that even if organisms are unquestionably more complex than mechanisms, the behavior of organisms is in conformity with laws of mechanics (A.51b).

On the other hand, the psychological and spiritual levels are different, because they are characterized by an interruption in the categorial series and by the onset of new categorial series (relative respectively to the psychological and spiritual levels). The relations between the biological level and the psychological level, on the one hand, and the relation between the psychological level and the spiritual one, on the other, are both relations of super-position. By way of example, the group of categories embedded in psychological entities is different from the group of categories embedded in biological entities. Similarly, the group of categories embedded in spiritual entities is different from the group of categories embedded in psychological entities.

The category of the spirit is divided into personal, objective and objectivated spirit. Personal spirit is the spirit of the individual; objective spirit is the living spirit of communities; and objectivated spirit characterizes the products of spirit. The categorial moments of personal spirit are consciousness, will, foresight and teleological activity, liberty. None of them pass to objective spirit. There is no consciousness apart from individual consciousness, and the same applies to the other moments.

There are laws that are valid for all the levels: higher levels rest on lower ones; the lower level is the conditioning one; the higher level is independent from the lower one as to its conformation and its laws.

When the connecting relation is a relation of super-formation, some categories of the lower level return in the higher one. Returning categories interact with the categories of the higher level and are, so to speak, contaminated by them; some of their moments become different. Higher levels are never characterized by returning categories.

Each level has its novum, the category or group of categories that distinguish the level from the lower ones. The novum does not derive either from the elements of the level or from their synthesis (A.53c).

Each of the four levels of the world contains other levels, organized according to a variety of patterns. The sublevels of the main levels may present their own types of gradation and may work one next to the other or one above the other as the case may be. As soon as we pass from the four levels to their internal divisions, things become more complex. The nexuses of determination working within the intermediate sub-levels are even less well known than those working for the levels. From a categorial point of view, the differences among them may not be as rigorous and clear as the difference distinguishing the four main levels of real being (A.20e).

Two aspects characterize super-position relations: firstly, the categories embedded in the entities of the connected levels are entirely different; secondly, a relation of existential dependence links the higher level to the lower one. This latter aspect organizes the order of the levels, so that the spiritual level is founded on the psychological level, which in its turn is founded on the biological one. Conversely, the biological level is the bearer of the psychological level and the latter is the bearer of the spiritual level.

Not all the levels are equally well-known. Indeed, for most of the levels we know only some of their elements, possibly not the most important ones. In fact, we do not know the central categories of the biological level (A.51c); the same applies to the psychological and the spiritual levels. This lack of knowledge has dramatic consequences on our capacity correctly to grasp the concreta of the higher levels. To see what this means, consider the case of physical concreta, those that we know best.

The group that includes time, space, process, causality and substance, together with the effects that they mutually exert on each other, determines physical entities. A physical concretum cannot be temporal without being spatial, nor can it present any of the other determinations without being a process. A process cannot exist without a substantial basis, and space and time are impossible without process. Again, none of them can exist without being causally conditioned. All the determinations that pertain to a level work together, and together they constrain the concreta of the level (A.46b). Nothing like this can be repeated for any of the other levels.

The categories of higher levels have nothing to do with the concreta of lower levels; the categories of lower levels are not principles of the categories of higher levels (A.56c). Lower levels are the bases of higher levels, but the categorial essence of the former does not consist in their being the basis of the latter (A.57a). Lower levels are stronger, their laws cannot be modified by the laws of the higher levels (A.56b). Higher levels have richer structure and contents. While higher concreta cannot modify the laws of lower ones, they can use them for their own purposes. Human beings are the most vulnerable entities, the most conditioned and dependent; but they have knowledge, they can consciously adapt, and they can use other entities for their own purposes (A.56b; d; 60a). This means that causal processes can be modified, which in turn implies that categorial structures can accept extra-causal determinations. We will say that categorial nexuses can be super-formed (A.60f).

Hartmann acknowledges that the distinction between the psychological and the spiritual levels is problematic (Scognamiglio 2011). However, it appears that science provides some help here, especially with the distinction between the objects of psychology and the objects of the sciences of the spirit (linguistics, law, social and historical sciences). If we look at present-day sciences, the situation appears even clearer than in Hartmann’s time. Hartmann’s position, however, in this case is far from being crystal-clear. Two obvious problems arise from his analyses. Firstly, Hartmann accepts only psychological acts and does not consider the possibility of social acts. Furthermore, he maintains that contents as correlates of acts are always spiritual. “Psychological” contents form personal being; “social” contents form objective being.

Hartmann vacillates as to the delimitations of what is properly psychological. He assigns language, consciousness, and foresight alternatively to the psychological level or to the personal level of the spirit. He even claims that the same acts of consciousness pertain to both psychic and spiritual being and that only an exact clarification of the phenomenon of acts may solve the aporia. Two developments never considered by Hartmann are (1) the distinction between individual and collective forms of intentionality, and (2) a principled distinction between the complexes that are individual human beings and the complexes that are collectivities.

Hartmann specifies analytically the laws that govern the various levels of reality and their connection (for a short introduction see W; for a summary of the laws, see Poli 2011a).

7. Cosmological categories

The fourth volume of Hartmann’s quadrilogy, Philosophy of Nature, analytically presents the categories characterizing the two basic levels of reality (the inanimate and the animate). Today we would say that this is more a book of philosophy of science than ontology (it should be remembered, however, that for Hartmann science is ontological in all its ramifications, see the Introduction above). In the words of Hartmann, “philosophy of nature is not a metaphysics,” in the sense that “the problems of the philosophy of nature cannot be addressed without contact with the results of natural science” (N.Prologue). What is even more interesting is that the ontological theory of categories makes explicit the limitations of the scientific understanding of reality for at least two different reasons: firstly, because categories such as those of space and time are not limited to physics alone (N.Prologue); secondly, because at least some of the categories that apply to the lowest level of the real world—such as space and time—share the categorial moment of dimensionality, the categorial precondition for measurement. In fact, dimensionality—and its subsequent measurement—is the condition that makes natural science possible. To further indicate the difference between the scientific and the philosophical understanding of reality, Hartmann adds that “mathematical physics deals with reality qua measurable, not with reality as such” (N 24).

The categories of the lower stratum of real being are called cosmological categories. We have already seen that the group including time, space, process, causality and substance (together with the effects that they mutually exert on each other) determines physical entities. To give the reader an idea of Hartmann’s analysis of cosmological categories, we summarize his treatment of space, leaving aside the other cosmological categories. As a category, space presents the general features characterizing every other ontological category: to wit, it is a principle. As a principle, it does not exist. It is therefore mandatory to distinguish the category of space from the entities that are characterized by space as (one of) their precondition. As a category, space does not have any kind of existence independently of the things and processes of which space is a real dimension (N.1c; 7d, 11b and elsewhere). Existence is a determination that applies to things, substances, or living beings. It is things in space that exist, not space itself (N.6a). If real space were to exist, it would exist as a thing together with other things. Space is (one of) the general principles of things and other existing entities. Only what is extended in space exists spatially (N.4a). To repeat, space is not a ‘thing’ (entity, object, process), but a principle.

7.1 Categories and their basic determinations

In order to demonstrate the difference between a principle and its instances, Hartmann introduces the distinction between space and spatiality. While ‘space’ is the name of the category with the same name, ‘spatiality’ is the name of the basic determination of the entities that are in space. Things have spatiality and are in space, they do not have space (N.7a, N.12a).

The underlying idea is that space as a category is not a property of things, whilst spatiality is indeed a property of things. Real space is a categorial precondition of things. The claim that space categorially depends on things, masses, or forces is false. If anything, things, masses and forces categorially depend on space.

As already said, Hartmann sharply distinguishes the category of space from what is in space. The moments characterizing space are different from the determinations of the entities that are in space. The attribution to space of determinations that pertain exclusively to what may eventually be in space is a serious category error.

Whereas things are extended in space, space in itself is neither extended nor has extension. Space is the medium in which what is extended extends itself (N.4a). For instance, position, distance, movement, length, width, and height are spatial determinations. They are in space, but space itself has no position, distance, movement, length, width or height (N.4a). It is not space that is extended; rather, distances are extended in space (N.4c). Extension is not a determination of a dimension, but a determination of the entity that is extended in a given dimension. For space, only what is extended is properly real (N.12d).

One further issue concerning space should be mentioned, namely the question of the curvature of the dimensions of space. What is the essential nature of a curvature? Not dissimilarly from either Brentano or Whitehead, Hartmann answers that the essence of a curvature is the collection of dimensions “in which” the curvature bends. If space dimensions bend, there must be other dimensions in which the former dimensions bend. Mathematically speaking, however, things can be different. From a mathematical point of view, one can introduce a measure of curvature without resorting to other, underlying dimensions. The internal consistency of mathematical formulas is sufficient for mathematics. Ontology requires more (N.5b).

The problem lies deeper than the difference between Euclidean as opposed to non-Euclidean spaces. In fact, the very distinction between straight and curved is secondary and can itself exist only within a dimensional framework. The real ontological issue is that dimensions themselves are neither straight nor curved. Even more generally, dimensions do not have spatial determinations. Dimensions, if anything, are the categorial preconditions of all possible spatial determinations. In this sense, dimensions are the lowest substrates of all extensions and measures. In themselves, dimensions are neither measures nor measurable, neither extensions nor extended (N.5b).

7.2 On the variety of spaces

Three articulations of the category ‘space’ are needed. We shall distinguish among ‘real space’, ‘ideal space’ (the space of geometry), and ‘intuitive space’ (the space of perceptions and cognitions). Real space is different from both the multiplicity of ideal spaces and from intuitive space. Two different criteria of distinction are at work here: (1) the difference between real and ideal space follows the deeper distinction between the spheres of real and ideal being; (2) the distinction between real and intuitive spaces lies entirely within the sphere of real being and concerns lower as opposed to higher strata of reality, in the sense that real space primarily categorizes the inanimate level of reality and intuitive space categorizes (aspects of) the psychological level of reality. This immediately raises the question of whether other regions of real space should be distinguished, such as biological and spiritual (e.g., historical) spaces.

The simplest way to analyze the analogies and differences among the three just-mentioned spaces is to proceed in the following order: ideal space → real space → intuitive space.

A general thesis propounded by Hartmann is that ideal being is incomplete being, and for this reason it is more general than real being (G.38; A.31a). It immediately follows from this thesis that ideal space is more general than real space (N.6b). It is therefore convenient to start by presenting the main features of ideal space, and only subsequently analyze the features of real and intuitive spaces.

The following are the main properties of ideal space (N.5d):

  1. Ideal space is a system of (extensive) dimensions. Dimensions do not have space.
  2. Ideal space is homogeneous; it is not a system of positions. Positions are related to what occupies them in space.
  3. Ideal space is continuous; therefore, it is infinitely divisible. The limit of the division of space is what lacks extension, the point. Points are unextended; they do not occupy space, but have positions in space. Although unextended, points are legitimate spatial entities.
  4. Ideal space is boundless.
  5. Ideal space is neither finite nor infinite. It does not have magnitude. Only something in space can be finite or infinite. Spatial magnitudes are not magnitudes of space, but magnitudes in space.
  6. For this reason, there is no limit to space, but only limits in space.
  7. Ideal space does not possess a unit of measurement. Only what is extended can be measured and may have units of measurement. Units of measurement depend on the nature of the dimension.

The first point above is the only one directly referring to dimensions. The following aspects clarify the nature of dimensions (N.5e):

  1. The dimensions of ideal space are homogeneous. Dimensions do not refer to a pre-established system of coordinates. From the point of view of space, every system of coordinates is arbitrary and extrinsic.
  2. Ideal space is isometric. A geometric figure can move and rotate without losing its shape.
  3. Dimensions can be characterized as reciprocally orthogonal.
  4. The system of dimensions of ideal space is not a system of coordinates. The latter system has its point zero, the origin of the coordinates. A system of dimensions does not have a point zero. Furthermore, ideal space has neither privileged direction nor privileged points.

Point 2 above hints at a possible shortcoming in Hartmann’s theory, in the sense that isometry is a rather strong constraint and surely not all mathematical spaces are isometric. Furthermore, while real and intuitive spaces may indeed be unique, the ideal declination of space is surely plural. Furthermore, we will see that the claim at point 4 is not valid for intuitive space, which does indeed have both privileged points and directions.

The most important outcome of the analysis of ideal space is possibly the explicit difference between dimensions and coordinates. Coordinates form a system of fundamental lines in space that enable the determination of the position of points and other spatial entities. In this sense, coordinates organize spatiality. Dimensions instead are internal constraints of space, for they are constitutive categorial moments of space. Distances refer only to coordinates, not to dimensions.

As already anticipated, some of the features of ideal space pertain to real space as well. The following are the most relevant (N.5f). Geometry has been often construed in stages in which lines result from the movement of points; surfaces from the movement of lines; and volumes from the movement of surfaces. Further iterations evade our capacity for visualization. While this dynamic image of the iteration of movements one over the other is acceptable, it is far from being acceptable as a description of the categorial genesis of space because it does not respect the internal dependences of space as a category. The real issue is that it is wrong to assume that points precede lines, or lines surfaces, etc. Categorially speaking, what comes first is the entire system of dimensions. Consequently, what come first are the moments that present the same number of dimensions as the whole dimensional system. For a three-dimensional space, volumes are categorially first. They are the reference entities. Volumes have position in space, surfaces have positions in volumes, lines in surfaces, and points in lines. One can obviously abstract from these categorial dependences and see surfaces, lines and points as directly positioned in space. In so doing, however, it is space as a whole that is implicitly assumed to be an overall body, which is another categorial error. For both ideal and real (three-dimensional) space, the correct categorial dependence is therefore volume → surface → line → point. We shall call this question the problem of extension. In short, the problem of extension claims that n-dim extended entities categorically precede n−1-dim extended entities.

Direction is the second categorial moment of space. Everything extended in space can extend in different directions. Here Brentano’s concept of plerosis may help. According to Brentano, a point within a body can move in every direction while remaining within the body. It is therefore said that the point has full plerosis. On the other hand, a point of the boundary of a body presents only a partial plerosis (Brentano 1981; for a reconstruction of Brentano’s theory of categories see Poli 2004; for a general reconstruction of Brentano’s philosophy see Albertazzi 2005).

Thirdly, the infinity of directions implies a continuous transition from one dimension to the next. One may call this rotation. Extension and direction are characterized by mutually irreducible types of magnitude and subsequent measurement. Measuring angles is different from measuring lengths. To this difference corresponds the presence in space of two different types of partial identity, namely identity and similarity of figures, or identity of shape vs. identity of angles. The former case concerns the identity of both shape and angles, while the latter concerns the identity of angles only.

Finally, while lengths have arbitrary units of measurement, angles have a natural unit of measurement. The change of direction in space has its natural basis of measurement: while the subdivisions into quadrants and the internal subdivision of a quadrant may be arbitrary, the basis provided by the full circle is fixed.

The ontological nature of points requires some attention. Two determinations are needed for something to be spatially real: being in space and being extended in space. Points are in space, but they are not extended in space. Therefore, since geometrical points are not extended in space, they fail to be ‘real’ spatial entities. Things are more intriguing than they appear, however. Recent mathematical developments show that the old idea of infinitesimals still has a role to play. In fact, synthetic differential geometry, also known as smooth analysis, shows that points defined as nilpotent entities respect the two categorial determinations mentioned above. A nilpotent entity x is an entity that is something (i.e. x ≠ 0) but such that all its powers are 0 (i.e., xn = 0, for all n > 1) (for a philosophically informed introduction to smooth analysis see Bell 1998).

Hartmann also notes that the claim according to which quantum mechanics implies that quantum processes are discontinuous confuses space with energy. Since the categories of space and energy are different, the problem of spatial quanta does not arise. Furthermore, the cosmos should not be confused with cosmic space. Space neither augments nor diminishes. Here Hartman treats physicists rather harshly, claiming that “physics has the guilt for all these incoherencies, because it ignores the fundamental categorial relations” (N.6d).

Real space has no magnitude, neither finite nor infinite (N.6e). If space were extension, it would either be finite or infinite. But space is not extension. If anything, it is the system of dimensions “in which” something has extension. It is not space that is extended; bodies, masses, distances and fields of force are extended, not space. Similarly, space has no magnitude; only what is in space has magnitude (N.6e).

Most of these discussions—whether space is finite or infinite, whether it is or it is not void, whether its dimensions are straight or curved, whether there are minimal spatial units—almost invariably result in serious categorial errors because space is usually imagined as if it were a spatial thing (N.6e, note).

As far as ideal space is concerned, there is no need to think that the various spatial formations are in different parts of space: geometrical bodies penetrate one another without resistance. Real bodies, though, cannot penetrate one another. This is, however, a law of matter, not a law of space. Impenetrability may be a property of what is extended in space, not of the system of dimensions that constitute space. This does not imply that real space has the character of Newtonian space. Real space is not determined by what is in space. Real space determines only the species of what is singularly spatial, not the ontological moment of singularity (N.7c).

Finally, space is not the union of what is in space. Behind this issue there lies the idea of viewing space as if it were time, interpreting spatial coexistence as contemporaneity. This is inexact because space is neither the being outside one another nor the union of the entities that are in space; space is their shared dimensional condition (N.5g).

The following moments specify the main aspects of the dimensions of real space (N.6g):

  1. The dimensions of real space are homogeneous.
  2. Real space is isometric. Magnitudes move from one dimension to the next without alterations.
  3. Dimensions are orthogonal. Through their orthogonality, dimensions are connected together.
  4. Real space is not a system of coordinates, because it is neither a system of places nor a system of dimensions. Space is that in which dimensions and places are.

So far we have dealt with preliminary, descriptive, clarifications. We shall now address the basic problem of space as a category. The following are the basic moments of real space (N.6d):

  1. Real space is homogeneous.
  2. Real space is continuous.
  3. Real space is infinitely divisible.
  4. Real space is boundless without being extended. Only what is in space can have extension.

Furthermore, the following are the main properties of being determined in space (N.7c):

  1. Space has neither magnitude nor measure. Similarly, space is neither big nor small. Distances between nebulae are not big, nor are the distances between atomic nuclei small. Physical orders of magnitude are neither big nor small. The relativity of magnitudes concerns what is spatial, not space itself.
  2. Real space lacks a basis to which the positions of bodies can make reference. In real space there are neither absolute positions nor absolute places. All the positions and all the places are relative to each other. If space had limits, it would have a centre and the latter could become the zero point of a system of coordinates.
  3. Every direction in real space is relative to other directions.

Movement in real space follows the same criteria. If space were a system of coordinates, movement would be absolute. A few ‘simple’ relativity issues ensue from the categorial nature of space (N.7d):

  1. Direction and velocity are spatially relative.
  2. The same body simultaneously moves in different directions and with different velocities; these different movements are authentically spatial movements and do not depend on our perceptions.
  3. What applies to straight movement is valid for rotation too.

By way of a summary, real space is a condition of movement, but not a determination of movement as to either its direction or velocity.

Besides the categorial errors already seen in regard to ideal and real spaces, the understanding of intuitive space suffers from further errors of this kind. The first major issue to be addressed is the tension between the non-spatial nature of consciousness and the possibility itself of intuitive space. Intuitive space is a space of consciousness, which in itself is a non spatial entity (N.7f; 8b). Mental imagery is not spatial, but space is in the images of mental imagery. While contemporary cognitive science knows the problem well (Tym 1990), Hartmann’s capacity clearly to see the problem long before the birth of cognitive science is remarkable. His analysis of the problem follows the same basic categorical distinctions that we have already seen: properly speaking, what is intuitive is not space but rather the objects in it. Intuitive space is the form of contents, the way in which external objects are presented to the mind (N.8a). Contents are intuitive, not (real) objects. Furthermore, space as a form of intuition has many variations connected to the variations of the knowing consciousness. It follows that intuitive space is not a kind of real space, but a category of the contents of consciousness (N.8d). The following summary lists the most important aspects shared by real and intuitive space (N.9a).

  1. Both real and intuitive space are unique. Intuitive space is unequivocally Euclidean. Non-Euclidean space is not intuitive and can be thought only in abstracto.
  2. Intuitive space is three-dimensional.
  3. Dimensions of intuitive space have the character of substrates. In the end, they are substrates of extensive magnitudes.
  4. Intuitive space is neither the substance nor accident of intuited objects; it is what in which intuited objects appear extended, configured and localized.
  5. Dimensions are orthogonal to each other.
  6. The magnitude of extension and the magnitude of the angle cannot be reduced to each other.
  7. Intuitive space represents in the clearest way how spatial objects are external to and connected with each other.

Today, the claim that intuitive space is “unequivocally Euclidean” (repeated in N.5b) is much less clear than it was at the time when Hartmann wrote Philosophy of Nature. Very recent experimental results raise doubts about the Euclidean characterization of intuitive space, at least as far as visual space is concerned; see Koenderink et al. 2010 for details.

The following are the main differences between real and intuitive space:

  1. Intuitive space is not as homogeneous as real space. The position occupied by the subject makes a difference (N.9b).
  2. Intuitive space is not continuous (N.9b).
  3. Intuitive space is not bounded by limits that can be indicated. All the limits that can be indicated are limits within space, not limits of space. The best we can say is that intuitive space is finite within evanescent limits. Thinking can proceed to the infinite, but only in abstracto (N.9c).
  4. Intuitive space always has a horizon (9c).
  5. Intuitive space always has a particular finite magnitude (9d). This latter moment is in patent contrast with real space, which has neither limits nor magnitudes. From this follows an explicit categorial incongruence of intuitive space, which is both a spatial principle and a spatial sector (9c).

Furthermore (9e):

  1. The homogeneity and isometricity of intuitive space is not absolute. Visual space, for instance, shows that there are differences between vertical and horizontal extensions. This is a datum well known from perception studies, see Ebbinghaus 1902; Jäger and Grasso 1991; Albertazzi 2006.
  2. Intuitive space has a system of natural coordinates. The subject is the natural center of intuitive space.
  3. Whilst every change in real space is relative, the same is not true of intuitive space. Similarly, while in real space magnitude, position, distance and direction are relative, in intuitive space they are all connected to movement, to both the movements of objects and the movements of the subject.

The thesis has frequently been propounded that there are different types of space: the space of physical forces, the vital space of organisms, and the space of historical events (N.3d). Here Hartmann denounces the occurrence of a major ontological error.

In fact, for Hartmann the above-mentioned spaces are not different species of the genus space but domains internal to the unique real space. The source of the error is the attribution to space of properties that characterize spatial entities. It is the entities that are physical, biological, or social, not space that is separated into different subspecies (N.3d). Levels of reality have their own categories, and a general category, within the various levels, interacts with different groups of level categories (Poli 2011a). This applies to space as well (N.7e). However, it should be borne in mind that the source of the variation lies primarily in the concreta. The variation is first of all a variation of spatiality, not of space itself. Real space—with all its fundamental categorial moments—remains the same.

The case of the space of concepts is different from the other mentioned subdomains of space because conceptual spaces pertain to intuitive space, which is not a subdomain of real space (N.3d). Relevant in the case of intuitive space are not the dimensions of things, but the dimensions of representations of things.

8. On the variety of determining moments

There are many real moments without corresponding ideal moments. The most obvious case is represented by causality. If causality were nothing more than a law, it would be entirely legitimate to view the law of causality as an essence and therefore as an ideal entity. According to Hartmann, however, causality is the nexus that connects the phases of a process, the dynamic series of the production of the stages one from the other within the unity and the irreversibility of the process. Whatever kinds of determination and dependence are valid for ideal entities, causality is not one of them (A.4b).

The real sphere contains two different types of determinations: the hierarchical type of determination—the genus-species structure—is shared with the ideal sphere, while the horizontal type of determination connects individuals with individuals and in particular the successive stages of real processes one to another. All the moments resulting from the hierarchical nature of categories—including their moments having the character of substratum and all the dimensional moments—will never exhaust the fullness of an individual being. A second series of moments is needed: the horizontal series articulating the totality of the actual reality (A.31b). This implies that the principle-concretum type of determination is far from being the only determination shaping the whole of reality; a second type of determination—of a non-categorial nature—should be included: a determination of the concretum-concretum type (A.6b, 44c). The ideal sphere does not contain the latter type of determination.

The various causal chains do not unfold as isolated and mutually irrelevant processes. On the contrary, they influence each other in the totality of the transversal nexus that connects them.

Substance is another case of a real determination without corresponding ideal moments. Hartmann views substance as that which remains constant through changes, what in the flow of events resists their succession. It follows that only in the real world can there be substances. Even more importantly, the category of substance presupposes time and the dynamic flow of events. Again, ideal being does not contain any of this. In short, temporality is what radically distinguishes real categories from ideal categories. The interplay of change and persistence, causing and being caused by, exists only within the flow of time.

Apart from time, individuality is the second moment distinguishing real being from ideal being. Everything ideal is general, and everything real is individual. The latter must be assumed in the most rigorous sense: everything real is unique and it exists only once. There are things that we are unable to discern. We may not be able to distinguish one real entity from the next, but it would be an error to take the limitations of our perceptual and cognitive capacities as if they were universal laws of the sphere of real being.

The general in reality is real only “in” individuals (A.37e). While the general is a dominant category in the ideal sphere and a subordinate category in the sphere of the real, individuality is a category of the sphere of real being only. In the realm of essences there is no individual.

9. Hartmann’s Ethics

Hartmann’s ethics includes both a general theory of values and a penetrating description of the experience of values. Below, we summarize some of the basic aspects of Hartmann’s ethical theories, namely (1) the use of ontology as a device for understanding values; (2) the two-dimensional structure of values; (3) values as demand; and (4) the structural articulation of character. The recent Kelly 2011a,b and Kinneging 2011 discuss further aspects of Hartmann ethics.

9.1 Ontology and ethics

Values, for Hartmann, are ideal entities. Given the thesis that there are at least two main types of ideal entities, namely mathematical entities and values, the question arises: what else, apart from atemporality, is shared by the entities included in the sphere of ideal being. In fact, it does not seem at first sight that sets and values have much in common, apart from their both being atemporal entities. On closer inspection, however, something further emerges. Hartmann consider the following three general features.

  • The overall geography of both mathematical entities and values is unknown. The constant efforts of the best minds and the accumulated experience of humankind have been able to explore some of their territories, and partially to map their landmarks. The overall shape of mathematics and the overall shape of the territory of values, however, are far from being charted.
  • Both the region of mathematical entities and the region of values extend beyond the boundaries of real being. Many mathematical structures are far from being exemplified in reality and some will never be. The same patently applies to values.
  • Both mathematics and ethics claim universality. This is part of their nature as ideal beings. On the other hand, neither mathematics nor ethics are able to capture—from their own point of view—the whole of reality. There is no single mathematical model of the world, and there are no good reasons to believe that there will ever be one. Similarly, there is no single ethical understanding of the whole of human experience and there are no good reasons to believe that there will ever be one. This last issue is of especial importance from an ontological point of view, because it shows that the universality of both mathematics and ethics is different from the universality of ontology (Poli 2009a,b).

9.2 The two-dimensional structure of values

Values belong to different families, and not just in the sense that, say, aesthetic values are different from ethical values. A number of further subdivisions can be made within each family.

As to the organizing principles of values, two of them seem of especial importance: that of strength and that of height. The strength of a value indicates the gravity of its violation. The height of a value expresses the merit deriving from its fulfillment. These two principles operate in opposite directions: the strongest values are also the lowest values, whilst the highest values are the least strong ones. Usually, lower values are simpler (that is, they possess less intuitable content) while higher values are more complex.

The laws of strength and height have significant consequences, the two most important of which are the following:

  • Violating a lower value is a more serious evil than violating a higher value.
  • Fulfilling a higher value is a greater good than fulfilling a lower value.

In Hartmann’s words, “Sinning against lower values is ignominious, shameful, revolting, but their fulfillment only reaches the level of decency, without rising above it. Offending against higher values, by contrast, does indeed have the character of moral failure, but nothing of the directly degrading, while fulfillment of these values may have something uplifting, liberating, indeed thrilling about it” (ET2.28e). By way of example: “heroism warrants admiration, but a lack of heroism arouses neither contempt nor indignation”. On the other hand, whilst trustworthiness warrants respect, “a lack of trustworthiness warrants contempt or even indignation” (ET2.63d).

Offending against life is a grave offence, whilst respecting it has very little merit. But the fulfillment of spiritual goods is a merit much greater than the merit corresponding to respect for more elementary goods. Those who violate lower goods are wicked; but the reverse does not hold: a person who violates higher goods, someone who fails to fulfill them, “is not on that account a bad man; his conduct threatens no one; it merely lacks the higher moral content” (ET.63f).

It is also well known from basic moral experience that respect for more elementary goods is often the condition for acceding to higher goods.

Structuring by levels is important, not only because it furnishes us with the tectonic laws governing values, but also because it provides us with criteria with which to distinguish, at least in some cases, authentic values from bogus ones. If the architecture of values is based on levels of dependence, then the authentic elevation of value is also divided into levels; it develops through intrinsic stages from the lower values to the higher ones. Although the situation may still lack full theoretical analysis, it is well known in practice. A person whose behavior is oriented to a higher value, but who does not simultaneously respect the values that support it, is structurally discordant. The higher values to which s/he refers are not credible. Loving with distrust or giving with cowardice are not authentically virtuous behaviours (ET2.63f). Values are constructed step by step from the most elementary levels upwards.

9.3 Values as Demands

Values as ideal entities do not change. What may change is our access to values. The individual capacity to “see” values changes with age and axiological maturity. Groups and communities change by following different guiding values. This latter case shows how historical and social conditions are at work in shaping the territory of accessible values.

The interplay between individuals and the groups to which they belong finds moments of stability in the mutually adjusted selection of shared values. This is one of the reasons why the firmament of values “cannot be peopled by passing meteors, whose place and brightness changes rapidly: its contents must be constant, and must have registered themselves slowly on an exposed sensitive plate” (Findlay, 1961, p. 209).

Repeated acts of valuation tend to produce stable or fixed orders of individual and social preferences, whose guiding values press to be realized. These values have the ontological nature of demands. They do not work as laws of reality, which in fact comprises both values and disvalues. The demands made by values work in a twofold manner according to the already mentioned laws of the strength and height of values. New visions and corresponding behaviors can be and usually are rejected, or they may occasionally be accepted and contribute to behaviors shaped by different values.

A more developed understanding of values may require consideration of further laws besides those of the strength and height of values. We find higher forms of value difficult to achieve. They resist our efforts. As far as values are concerned, Christianity’s most important result has possibly been the discovery that the path to the highest values entails frustration and pain.

Providing that this understanding of values is correct, the consequences that derive from it are of the utmost importance. If the path to the highest values does indeed entail frustration and pain, this means that the empirical realization of higher values is flanked by disvalues as one of its structural features.

The possible presence of disvalues embedded in the empirical realization of values (at least of the highest ones) immediately requires specification of the correct proportion between values and implied disvalues. By way of example, there is neither merit nor justification in risking one’s life to rescue a lady’s pocket-handkerchief (the example is Meinong’s). More seriously, for each value, the proportion between values and implied disvalues constrains the degree of disvalue that can be accepted as correct. There are cases in which “it is more meritorious to realize a lower value at a given level of difficulty … than to realize a higher one” (Findlay, 1961, p. 381).

9.4 The structural articulation of character

It is widely agreed that values are accessed through emotional or egological acts. These are structured in levels of depths, ranging from acts conveying more superficial information to ones conveying more intimate information. Phenomenologists distinguish three different levels (Poli 2009a,b). The most external (superficial) layer concerns information about how we sense our body. Feeling cold, warm, just ok are some of the most typical cases. Let us call them sensorial feelings. The next layer comprises information about our moods. Feeling bored, excited, relaxed, angry, and exhausted make up only a tiny section of the rich and highly articulated field of moods. Feelings pertaining to this second group are typically twofold: they have a more bodily-oriented side and a more psychologically-oriented one. By default, they merge, but they may diverge and their manifestation may follow different routes according to a variety of conditioning factors, from social to individual. Let us call this second group of feelings mood feelings. The third and deepest-lying layer is our personal style, the way in which we react to what happens to us. Suppose that something hurts you. You may resist the pain, tolerate it, combat it, accept it, or even enjoy it. Let us denote this third group of feelings with the term character.

A character is defined by a number of different parameters, each of which ranges from a maximum to a minimum (ET2.36):

  1. The first dimension varies from activity to passivity. By ‘activity’ is meant stance-taking or commitment; by ‘passivity’, indifference, inertia or apathy.
  2. The second dimension centres on the opposition between a person’s strength and weakness. Strength and activity are not synonymous: also passivity may be strong. The stance-taking associated with activity may be strong or weak; and inertia may be strong in the sense of stubborn.
  3. The third dimension ranges from the capacity to suffer to the incapacity to suffer. The positive valence assigned to the capacity to suffer is signaled by the patent negativity of the incapacity to suffer. The former consists of resistance against the adversities of life, the tempering of a person’s character through suffering; the latter consists of inner fragility.
  4. The fourth dimension is anticipation: a more or less broad vision of the future to which the person may accede. In this case, the opposition takes the common-sense form of the difference between a broad and narrow outlook on the future.
  5. The fifth dimension is the ability to select goals and to find the means with which to achieve them. We may call this ability “purposefulness”.

Put slightly differently, and by way of summary:

  1. Openness/closure towards the environment and other agents (no agent can be either entirely closed or entirely open, for the agent has a more or less porous boundary; openness means taking a stance or being committed; closure means indifference, inactivity or apathy).
  2. Self-modification (capacity of the agent to modify its own settings; an agent may be open and have a very low capacity for self-modification, or vice versa; 1 and 2 are different dimensions).
  3. Other-modification (capacity of the environment or other agents to modify the setting of the agent; having a character means that one’s modification by others should be infrequent).
  4. Horizon (having broad or narrow views; the window an agent has upon his future can be more or less wide).
  5. Purposiveness (ability to set oneself purposes, to choose goals and find the means to achieve them).

A character is defined by the position it assumes along each of these dimensions. Each dimension consists of a continuum ranging from an extreme of value to an extreme of disvalue. Furthermore, each dimension also has points of breakdown where values change directly into disvalues (different from disvalues as complements). Consider the capacity to suffer. It is true that suffering tempers the character, so that the person is able to achieve higher thresholds of value. However, if the suffering exceeds the ability to withstand it, the person is destroyed and the suffering changes directly into disvalue. Note that the various dimensions are different but not orthogonal: indeed, a modification in one dimension may reverberate on the other dimensions.

Furthermore, behind the structure just outlined there lies the choice of certain values that orient the person from within. These choices concern, for instance, the options between altruism and egoism or between individualism and solidarism.

The two laws of the height and strength of values work together and constrain the relation of preference. The expanded version of the relation of preference is then: A is preferable to B as to their heights, or as to their strengths. The asymmetry between strength and height results in two different articulations of the relation of preference, which we can respectively distinguish as the SH-kind of preference (Strength first, Height after) and the HS-kind of preference (Height first, Strength after). SH-preference states: for values at a given level of strength, it is correct to prefer those that are higher. HS-preference states instead: for values at a given level of height, it is correct to prefer those that are stronger. Furthermore, if the third dimension represented by the effort or pain involved in achieving a value is included, the degree of effort involved for each of the two articulations of the relation of preference should be considered, and the appropriate balance should be sought between levels of effort and the height of the value pursued.

10. Aesthetics

Hartmann discusses aesthetic issues in different places (including P and G) and was working on his masterly Aesthetics (AE) during the last years of his life. As with the case of ethics, one of the main features of Hartmann’s aesthetics is the close interplay with ontology. In particular, levels of reality have a bearing on the problem of the levels of a work of art too. The theme of the aesthetic object is a particular subdivision of ontology—a subdivision, moreover, which may shed light on several aspects of ontology. In the Introduction to Foundations of Ontology, Hartmann asserts that “the problematic [of art] belongs to the area of problems in which the ontological problem is rooted.”

Hartmann intentionally focuses his aesthetics on the problem of the aesthetic object. He sets aside investigation of the correlated acts. In his words, “the aesthetics of today still concentrates mainly on analysis of the act, and this is why the stratification relationship, although it has often been noted, is not yet familiar to it” (P.47a). Keeping the focus on the object is therefore mandated by the theory of levels of reality (see Section 6 above).

Hartmann distinguishes two levels in the aesthetic object, which he calls the foreground level and the background level. The foreground level comprises the real, concrete and sensible dimensions of the object, everything that is independent of the presence of a subject who addresses the object and seeks to understand it. The background levels vary with the kinds of content the foreground level lets appear. The background level exists only for the subject who grasps it. This level is typically organized into many distinct sub-levels. Following Hartmann, we may therefore state that “according to its manner of being, the artistic object necessarily has two levels” (those of foreground and background), while “according to the overall structure of its content—that is to say, according to its inner form (i.e. the background level)—it has many levels” (AE; Poli 1998). A theory of this kind obviously has two critical points: first, the problem of how the relationship between the two levels is articulated; second, the problem of how the relationship among the sublevels of the background level is articulated. In the former case, Hartmann talks of a “relationship of manifestation” on the basis of which—as has been pointed out on innumerable occasions—the foreground (i.e. the matter of the object) imposes constraints on the background.

More interesting is that part of the theory which concerns the typical stratification of the background. Different aesthetic objects display different articulations of the background level. In the case of literary works, for example, Hartmann distinguishes at least six different levels for more sophisticated genres like epic narratives or novels, while other genres have fewer levels. This applies to lyrical poems, for example, whose expressiveness is articulated into fewer levels because of the constraints imposed on the admissible expressive forms.

Hartmann cites the portrait as an example of a visual aesthetic object. He distinguishes the following levels in its background level: the three-dimensional space in which the subject of the portrait and some elements of the setting appear; the movement of the subject’s apparent corporeality; the subject’s character; his or her individual idea, or the idea that the person portrayed has of him/herself; the symbolic, or the universal content manifested by the portrait.

11. Conclusion

This entry has only scratched the surface of Hartmann’s theory of categories. Even from such a preliminary and mainly reconstructive presentation of his theory, however, it is evident that it is a comprehensive and rich theory of categories. To conclude, we note some of the problems that require discussion.

The overall architecture of the theory of levels of reality, or the question of the relations among the biological, the psychological and spiritual levels requires closer examination. Put briefly, if the psychological level ends up including what psychology and cognitive sciences acknowledge as psychological phenomena, the dividing line between the psychological and the spiritual levels should be located elsewhere, and what Hartmann calls personal spirit will become the higher layer of the psychological level. Three comments are in order: first, this way of addressing the issue is entirely concordant with Hartmann’s constant respect for what science can teach a philosopher; second, the reorganization of the boundary between the two levels does not raise major problems because all the relevant relations are of the super-position type; third, the reorganization suggested enables construction of an entirely different architecture of the three levels, one that passes from a strictly linear organization (one level after the other) to a non-linear architecture such as the one suggested by application of the one-many dichotomy: the (newly defined) psychological and spiritual levels super-pose together from their underlying existential basis; furthermore, they super-pose each other. This triangular architecture is a major departure from Hartmann’s original framework.

The question of ‘complex formations’. Whilst Hartmann asserts that human beings, collectivities and history are stratified formations (e.g., A.55a), he never discusses the nature of these complex formations in detail. Indeed, the multidimensional, rich categorial framework discussed by Hartmann does not appear to have a proper place for the category of whole—what he calls ‘formation’. Complex wholes are complex (or stratified) formations. In this regard, Hartmann’s ontology is in need of further developments. He acknowledges that formations are the real furniture of the world, and he occasionally interprets levels through them. For instance, he does so when he claims that psychological life is not to be understood as the internal conscious and unconscious world together with its acts and their contents, but that it should rather be seen as a single complex together with corporeal life and the physical conditions of life. The same is true for the spiritual level: the life of spirit is not only ethos, language, art, knowledge, etc.; it is also a single complex possessing the psychological life of acts, organic life, and the physical conditions within the individuals that are its subjects. Hartmann also states that higher levels do not present themselves as soul and spirit, but as human being and collectivity, or as human being and history (A.52c). To emphasize the importance of these passages, Hartmann adds that “This vision is absolutely necessary”. On the other hand, however, Hartmann is unclear about how complex formations should be categorized. On occasion, he denies that defining levels according to the complex formations in which they appear is the correct strategy, because the essences of levels are different from the essences of formations, and the limits of levels and formations would collide with each other (A.20c). Hartmann also emphasizes that working with formations, rather than with categories, fails properly to articulate the differences among the levels of being (A.55a). While these latter claims are entirely acceptable, the problem is why formations should not have their own categorial moments. Furthermore, while the categorial study of levels is needed for analytical distinctions among their moments and the relations among them, the categorial study of formations helps us understand how complex formations are synthetically constituted. The theory of categories is, for Hartmann, restricted to the relations of stratification and to the levels of being as such. It does not deal with the gradation of the total formations of thing, living being, human being, and collectivity. Hartmann’s attitude oscillates between the hope that the problem of complex formations will be solved once the theory of categories has been completed, and the fear that the problem of how heterogeneous levels can be so tightly connected within a human being—or within a collectivity, a people, or history, or works of art—is a major metaphysical problem that will forever escape ontology’s capacity to solve it (A.52c). As a matter of fact, he developed the first parts of a theory of complex formations in the final chapters of his Philosophy of Nature and returned to the topic in the Aesthetics, his last book, left unfinished and published only posthumously. From these analyses it emerges that room should be created, within the categorial framework of a well-elaborated ontology, for the category of complex formations or wholes—as I prefer to call them—and that specification should be made of types of wholes and the forms of synthesis that operate on them. In fact, Hartmann did some preliminary work in this direction with his category of complex. From the unfinished state of the theory of complexes it is difficult to see whether the category of complex formations should be treated on a par with all the many other categories or assume a role as important as the one performed by the theory of levels of reality.


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Other Internet Resources


I thank Joachim Fischer, Eugene Kelly and Keith Peterson for their comments to a previous version of this paper.

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Roberto Poli <>

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