First published Thu Sep 23, 1999; substantive revision Wed Feb 17, 2016

Properties (also called ‘attributes,’ ‘qualities,’ ‘features,’ ‘characteristics,’ ‘types’) are those entities that can be predicated of things or, in other words, attributed to them. Moreover, properties are entities that things are said to bear, possess or exemplify. For example, if we say that that thing over there is an apple and is red, we are presumably attributing the properties red and apple to it, and, if the attribution is veridical, the thing in question exemplifies this property. Thus, properties can be characterized both as predicables and as exemplifiables. Relations, e.g., loving and between, can also be viewed as predicables and exemplifiables. More generally they can be treated in many respects on a par with properties and indeed they may even be viewed as kinds of properties. Accordingly, this entry will also discuss them to some extent, although they are treated in more detail in another entry: relations.

Questions about the nature and existence of properties are nearly as old as philosophy itself. Interest in properties has ebbed and flowed over the centuries, but it has undergone a resurgence since at least the second half of the last century and keeps flourishing. The recent collections by Galluzzo & Loux (2015) and Marmodoro & Yates (forthcoming) well testify this trend. This entry will focus primarily on what has been done in this field in the last few decades (taking up where Loux’s (1972) earlier review of the literature leaves off).

Philosophers who argue that properties exist almost always do so because they think properties are needed to solve certain philosophical problems, and their views about the nature of properties are strongly influenced by the problems they think properties are needed to solve. So a good deal of discussion here will be devoted to the tasks properties have been introduced to perform and the ways in which these tasks influence accounts of the nature of properties.

In §1 we introduce some distinctions and terminology that will be useful in subsequent discussion. In §2 we deal with the central topic of what it is for properties to be exemplified. §3 contains a discussion of traditional attempts to use properties to explain phenomena in metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of language. §4 focuses on the three areas where contemporary philosophers have offered the most detailed accounts based on properties: philosophy of mathematics, the semantics of natural languages, and topics in a more nebulous area that might be called naturalistic ontology. We then turn to issues about the nature of properties, including their existence conditions (§5), their identity conditions (§6), and the various sorts of properties there might be (§7). §8 provides an introductory, informal discussion of formal theories of properties.

1. Distinctions and Terminology

1.1 Properties: Basic Ideas

Not all philosophers acknowledge properties in their ontological inventory and even those who agree that properties exist often disagree about which properties there are. This means that it is difficult to find wholly uncontroversial examples of properties. For example, someone might claim that apple is a natural kind and that natural kinds are not properties (Summerford 2003).

Once properties are accepted, however, one would typically say that they characterize objects or, conversely, that objects instantiate or exemplify them (as we shall see in more detail in §2). To illustrate, if apple is recognized as a property, it is a property that characterizes all apples.

A fundamental question about properties—second only in importance to the question whether there are any—is whether they are universals or particulars. To say that properties are universals is to say that the selfsame property can be instantiated by numerically distinct things, at least in typical cases. (Exceptions are unexemplifiable properties, e.g., round and square, and properties that can only be exemplified by a single thing, e.g., identical to Socrates.) On this view it is possible for two different apples to exemplify exactly the same color, a single universal.

It appears then that a universal property can be in two completely different places (i.e., in two different instances) at the same time, but ordinary things can never be separated from themselves in this way. There are scattered individuals (like the former British Empire), but they have different spatial parts in different places. Properties, by contrast, do not seem to have spatial parts; indeed, they are sometimes said to be wholly present in each of their instances. But how could a single thing be wholly present in widely separated locations? (Plato, Philebus, 15b-c and Parmenides, 13b.)

There are two typical lines of reply here (both of which commit us to fairly definite views about the nature of properties). One response is that properties are not located in their instances (or anywhere else), so they are never located in two places at once. The other response is that this objection wrongly judges properties by standards that are only appropriate for individuals. Properties are a very different sort of entity, and they can exist in more than one place at the same time without needing spatial parts to do so (see Johansson 2013 for a recent discussion of this issue, with special emphasis on the special problems posed by relations.)

Despite these replies, this conundrum has worried some philosophers so much that they have opted for an alternative view, according to which properties are just as much individuals or particulars as concrete things such as apples and desks. No matter how similar the colors of two apples, their colors are numerically distinct properties, the redness of the first apple and the redness of the second. Such individualized properties are variously known as ‘perfect particulars,’ ‘abstract particulars,’ ‘quality instances,’ ‘moments,’ ‘modes,’and ‘tropes.’ Tropes have various attractions and liabilities, but since they are the topic of another entry, here we will construe properties as universals and limit ourselves to a few clarificatory remarks on tropes in §1.1.2. We thus presuppose a fundamental distinction between universals and particulars. This is typically accepted by supporters of universals, but is not uncontroversial (MacBride 2005).

1.1.1 Predication vs. exemplification

We have talked above in a way that might give the impression that predication is an activity that we perform, e.g., when we say or think that a certain apple is red. Although some philosophers might think of it in this way, predication is typically viewed as a special link that connects a property to a thing in a way that gives rise to a proposition, understood as a complex featuring the property and the thing as constituents with different roles: the latter occurs as logical subject or argument, as is often said, and the former as attributed to such an argument. A proposition is also typically viewed as a mind-independent entity that exists whether we think of it or not and that may be true or false (Carmichael 2010 argues from this conception of propositions to the existence of universals.) If a proposition is true (the predication is veridical), the argument instantiates (exemplifies) the property and is called an instance of that property. For example, if there is a red apple, the proposition in which the apple occurs as logical subject and the property red as attributed to it is veridical; the apple thus exemplifies this property and is an instance of it. It is often assumed nowadays that, when an object exemplifies a property, there is a further, complex, entity, a state of affairs or fact (Armstrong 1997), having the property (or perhaps some counterpart of it in the natural world; see §5.4) and the object as constituents (not all agree however with this compositional conception; see, e.g.. Bynoe 2011 for a dissenting voice). States of affairs are typically taken to fulfill the theoretical roles of truthmakers (the entities that make true propositions true) and causal relata (the entities connected by causal relations). Not all philosophers, however, distinguish between propositions and states of affairs; Russell (1903) acknowledges only propositions and, for a recent example, so does Gaskin (2008).

Properties are also often characterized as exemplifiables. But this terminology must be handled with care, because of the controversial issue of the existence of properties that cannot be instantiated, e.g., round and square. Other matters of controversy are whether properties can exist at all without being exemplified and whether some properties can be exemplified by other properties (in the way, perhaps, that redness exemplifies the property of being a color). There is almost universal consensus, however, on the idea that only properties can be predicated and exemplified. For example, ordinary objects like apples and chairs cannot be predicated of, and are not exemplified by, anything.

It is typically assumed that there is just one kind of predication and we will stick to this view here. It should be noted, however, that according to some philosophers who have revived Meinong’s account of nonexistent objects, there are two modes of predication, sometimes characterized as ‘external’ and ‘internal’ (Castañeda 1972; Rapaport 1978; Zalta 1983). Zalta (1983) traces back the distinction to Mally and uses ‘exemplification’ to characterize the former and ‘encoding’ to characterize the latter. Roughly, the idea is that a Meinongian object such as the winged horse is, in Zalta’s terminology, an abstract object that encodes the properties winged and horse, but does not exemplify them; such properties can only be exemplified by concrete objects such as birds and horses in the spatiotemporal realm. These concrete objects do not encode properties at all, they can only exemplify them. In contrast, abstract objects can exemplify some properties, e.g., abstract or thought by someone. Other Meinongians have kept predication univocal and have rather invoked a distinction between two kinds of properties: ‘nuclear,’ such as red and round and ‘extra-nuclear’ such as existent and thought by someone (Parsons 1980).

1.1.2 Universals vs. Tropes

According to some philosophers, universals and tropes may coexist in one ontological framework (see, e.g., Lowe 2006 for a well-known general system of this kind, and Orilia 2006a, for a proposal based on empirical data from quantum mechanics). However, nowadays they are typically seen as alternatives, with the typical supporter of universals (‘universalist’) trying to do without tropes and the typical supporter of tropes (‘tropist’) trying to dispense with universals (see, e.g., Armstrong 1997 and Maurin 2002; Benovsky 2014 is a recent attempt to show that deciding between these two frameworks may be a hard and perhaps insurmountable matter). In order to better clarify how differently they see matters, we may take advantage of the notion of state of affairs that we have just introduced. Both parties may agree, say, that there are two red apples, a and b. They will immediately disagree, however, for the universalist will add (a) that there are two distinct states of affairs, that a is red and that b is red, (b) that the former has a and the universal red as constituents, and (c) that the latter also has the universal red as constituent (and differs from the former only by having b rather than a as additional constituent). The tropist will rejoinder that there are no such states of affairs and universals and rather urge that there are entities such as the redness of a and the redness of b, i.e., two distinct tropes. Tropes are understood as simple entities, but the little exchange that we have just imagined suggests that they are meant to play a theoretical role analogous to the one that the universalist would invoke for complex entities, i.e., states of affairs. Hence, tropists typically claim that tropes can be causal relata (Williams 1953) and truthmakers (Mulligan, Simons and Smith 1984).

That tropes, in spite of their simplicity, can play the role of states of affairs, depends on the fact that universals combine two theoretical roles, only one of which is fulfilled by tropes. On the one hand, universals are characterizers, inasmuch as they characterize concrete objects. On the other hand, they are also unifiers, to the extent that different concrete objects may be characterized by the very same universal, which is thus somehow shared by all of them; when this is the case, there is, according to the universalist, an objective similarity among the different objects (see §3.1). In contrast, tropes are only characterizers, for they cannot be shared by distinct concrete objects. Given its dependency on one specific object, say, the apple a, a trope can do the work of a state of affairs with a as constituent. But for tropes to play this role, the tropist will have to pay a price and introduce additional theoretical machinery to account for objective similarities among concrete objects. To this end, she will typically resort to the idea that there are objective resemblances among tropes, which can then be grouped together in resemblance classes. These resemblance classes play the role of unifiers for the tropist. Hence, from the tropist’s point of view ‘property’ is ambiguous, since it may stand for the characterizers (tropes) or for the unifiers (resemblance classes) (in the terminology of §6.4 of the entry on mental causation). Similarly, ‘exemplification’ and related words may be regarded as ambiguous insofar as they can be used either to indicate that an object exemplifies a certain trope or to indicate that the object relates to a certain resemblance class by virtue of exemplifying a trope in that class.

The disagreement between the universalist and the tropist is operative at a very basic ontological level. One may wonder however whether divergencies at this foundational layer have some impact on more specific philosophical issues and indeed it has been claimed that this is the case in philosophy of mind, in particular as regards mental causation and the tenability of reductive physicalism (Robb 1997; §6.4 of the entry on mental causation; Gozzano & Orilia 2008).

1.1.3 Properties and Relations

Properties are usually distinguished from relations. For example, a specific shade of red or a rest mass of 3 kilograms is a property, while being smaller than or between are typically regarded as relations. Relations are usually taken to have a ‘degree’ (‘adicity’, ‘arity’), which depends on the number of objects that they can relate, or, to put it otherwise (somewhat metaphorically), on the number of ‘places’ they come with. They are thus called ‘dyadic’ (‘two-place’), ‘triadic’ (‘three-place’), and so forth, depending on their degree. For example, being smaller than and between are usually viewed as dyadic (of degree 2) and triadic (of degree 3), respectively. In line with this classification, properties can be called ‘monadic’ (of degree 1). (See Van Inwagen 2015 for a recent example of this way of seeing matters). This terminology is also applied to predicates. For example, the predicates ‘red’ and ‘smaller than’ are monadic and dyadic, respectively.

Relations can also be considered predicable and exemplifiable entities, although, at least in typical cases, they are attributed simultaneously not to single objects, but to a plurality of objects. These objects can be said to jointly instantiate the relation in question, if the attribution is veridical (in which case, one may add, the objects, i.e., the relata, and the relation are constituents of a state of affairs). Thus, except where otherwise noted or where the context indicates otherwise, we will use ‘property’ as a generic term to cover both monadic (one-place, nonrelational) properties and (polyadic, multi-place) relations (i.e., properties of degree higher than one). It should be noted, however, that relations can hardly be said to jointly instantiate certain objects simpliciter; it seems necessary to also specify how the instantiation occurs. This comes to the fore in particular with non-symmetric relations such as loving. For example, if John loves Mary, then loving is jointly instantiated by John and Mary in a certain way, whereas if it is Mary who loves John, then loving is instantiated by John and Mary in another way. Thus, one often hears that relations are exemplified by their relata in a certain order, or even that relations are exemplified by ordered sets of items. How this relational order should be understood is a complex issue, which has been discussed more and more in recent years; see §7.4.

1.1.4 Properties vs. Sets

Properties are often compared to sets and sometimes even assimilated to them. Just as properties can have instances, sets can have members, and it is typically assumed that, given a property, there is a corresponding set, called the extension of the property, having as members exactly those things that exemplify the property. But it is important to note a fundamental difference between the two. Sets have clear-cut identity conditions: they are identical when they have exactly the same members. In contrast, the identity conditions of properties are a matter of dispute. Everyone who believes there are properties at all, however, agrees that numerically distinct properties can have exactly the same instances without being identical. Even if it turns out that exactly the same things exemplify a given shade of green and circularity, these two properties are still distinct. For these reasons sets are called extensional and properties are often said to be intensional entities. Precisely because of their intensional nature properties were dismissed by Quine (1956) as ‘creatures of darkness’ and just a few decades ago many philosophers concurred with him. But philosophers now widely invoke properties without guilt or shame.

1.1.5 Realism, Nominalism, and Conceptualism

The deepest question about properties is whether there are any. Textbooks feature a triumvirate of answers: realism, nominalism, and conceptualism. There are many species of each view, but the rough distinctions come to this. Realists hold that there are universal properties, understood as mind-independent entities. Nominalists deny this (though some hold that there are tropes). And conceptualists urge that words (like ‘honesty’) which might seem to refer to properties really refer to concepts, understood as mind-dependent entities. Nominalism and conceptualism often come together and often are assimilated to the extent that they both involve a non-realist stance about universals (and some would say even an idealist rejection of a mind-independent world; Hochberg 2013). Such a stance is typically coupled with an attempt to reduce universals to other entities such as sets or classes of their instances or, as Lewis (1986) has proposed, to sets of all their possible instances. The former option suffers from notorious problems (Armstrong 1978). The latter can hardly be disentangled from Lewis’s realism about possible worlds; it is thus unpalatable to most philosophers and affected by its own technical problems (Egan 2004).

A few contemporary philosophers have defended conceptualism (cf. Cocchiarella 1986, ch. 3; 2007), and recent empirical work on concepts bears on it, but it is not a common view nowadays. Nominalism has many supporters, but the pros and cons of its various forms are treated extensively in other entries (e.g., nominalism in metaphysics and tropes). We will then focus on realism here (but see §5.1.4).

It is important to note that the realist house is a divided one; in broad outline it is useful to distinguish between those of a Platonist orientation and those whose views trace back to Aristotle. The former view universals as transcendent, ante rem in traditional terminology, capable of existing uninstantiated (see §5.2), but somehow related by instantiation to the objects that happen to exemplify them. In contrast, the latter takes universals to be in rebus, rooted in the spatio-temporal world and thus incapable of uninstantiated existence (see §5.1.4) and intimately related, some say as constituents, to the objects that exemplify them (for a recent take on this old dispute see the essays by Loux, Van Inwagen, Lowe and Galluzzo in Galluzzo & Loux 2015).

1.2 Talking about Properties

Philosophers do not have a settled idiom for talking about properties. Often they make do with a simple distinction between singular terms and predicates. Singular terms are words and phrases that can occupy subject positions in sentences and that purport to denote or refer to a single thing. Examples include proper names like ‘Bill Clinton’ and ‘Chicago,’ definite descriptions like ‘the first female Supreme Court Justice’ and indexicals or demonstratives like ‘I’ or ‘that.’ Predicates, by contrast, can be true of things and are usually taken to express, or (as some friends of properties may say) denote, a property. Expressions such as ‘is a philosopher,’ ‘is wise,’ ‘walks,’ ‘loves’ and the like are typically considered predicates. When we represent a sentence like ‘Quine is a philosopher’ in a standard formal language as ‘P(q),’ we absorb the entire expression ‘is a philosopher’ into the predicate ‘P.’ There is dispute over whether ‘is a philosopher’ as a whole expresses a property or it is rather ‘philosopher’ by itself that does. Frege viewed the meanings of predicates as ‘unsaturated,’ as somehow endowed with ‘holes’ that have to be filled by meanings of singular terms to generate thoughts. Philosophers who are influenced by Frege in this respect tend to prefer the former option. Others are more inclined to prefer the latter and regard the copula ‘is’ as the expression of an exemplification link (Strawson 1959; Bergmann 1960). For these philosophers it might be more appropriate to consider ‘philosopher’ and ‘wise’ as predicates. It will be convenient for us to use ‘predicate’ for expressions of both kinds and view all of them as ways of expressing properties.

Predicates can be nominalized by means of appropriate suffixes such as ‘-ity’ or ‘-ness,’ or via gerundive or infinitive phrases. Nominalization generates singular terms that at least prima facie denote properties. For example, ‘triangular’ and ‘is triangular’ can be turned into ‘triangularity’ and ‘being triangular’; ‘drunk’ and ‘is drunk’ into ‘drunkness,’ ‘being drunk’ or ‘to be drunk’; ‘gives’ and ‘gives a kiss to Mary’ into ‘giving’ and ‘to give a kiss to Mary’ (some think that ‘being F’ and ‘F-ness’ stand for different kinds of property (Levinson 1991), but we will not pursue this line here). It seems also possible to have definite descriptions and perhaps even indexicals that refer to properties. If Mary happens to prefer wisdom to any other property ‘Mary’s favorite property’ seemingly refers to wisdom. Moreover, though more controversially, if someone points to a red object while saying: ‘that shade of red is a beautiful color,’ then the demonstrative ‘that shade of red’ denotes a property (Heal 1997).

Frege (1892) and Russell (1903) had different opinions regarding the ontological import of nominalization. According to the former, nominalized predicates stand for a ‘correlate’ of the unsaturated entity that the predicate stands for (in Frege’s terminology they are a ‘concept correlate’ and a ‘concept,’ respectively). According to the latter, who speaks of ‘inextricable difficulties’ in Frege’s view (Russell 1903, §49), they stand for exactly the same entity. Mutatis mutandis, they had the same difference of opinion regarding singular terms such as ‘Mary’s favorite property.’ There is some prima facie grammatical evidence in favor of Frege’s view: it is perfectly grammatical to say ‘Monica is honest’ or ‘Honesty is a virtue,’ but your old English teacher will cringe if you say ‘Honest is a virtue’ or ‘Monica is honesty.’ But it is not clear that ontological conclusions can be drawn from grammar here or that other compelling reasons can be found (see Parsons 1986 for a good discussion); moreover, it would be desirable to avoid multiplying entities and semantic relations beyond necessity (distinguishing properties and their correlates on the one hand and denoting and expressing on the other hand). And so here we will be fairly cavalier about property terms, using terms such as ‘honesty’ and ‘honest’ indifferently to refer to (express) the same property. It should be noted, however, that some philosophers still support Frege’s view or at least take it very seriously (see Cocchiarella 1986 and Landini 2008).

2. Exemplification

We saw right at the outset that objects exemplify properties. More generally, we may say, items of all sorts, including properties themselves, exemplify properties, or, in different terminology, they instantiate, bear, have or possess properties. To reverse order, we can also say that properties characterize, or inhere in, the items that exemplify them. There is then a very general phenomenon of exemplification to investigate, which has been labeled in various ways, as the variety of terms of art just displayed testifies. All such terms, including ‘exemplification’ itself, have often been given special technical senses in the rich array of different explorations of this territory since Ancient and Medieval times up to the present age (see, e.g., Lowe 2006, 77), explorations that can hardly be disentangled from the task of providing a general ontological picture with its own categorial distinctions. In line with what most philosophers do nowadays, we choose ‘exemplification,’ or, equivalently, ‘instantiation’ (and their cognates), to discuss this phenomenon in general and to approach some different accounts that have been given of it in recent times. It should be borne in mind that this sweeping use of these terms is to be kept distinct from the more specialized uses of them that will surface below (and to some extent have already surfaced above) in describing specific approaches by different philosophers with their own terminologies.

Some philosophers deem it important to distinguish different kinds of exemplification, typically in relation to the categorial distinctions that they put forward in their ontology, whereas others are content with just one exemplification, applying indifferently to different categories of entities. The latter option may be considered the default one and a typical recent case of a philosopher who goes with it is Armstrong (1997). He distinguishes three basic categories, particulars, properties or relations, and states of affairs, and takes exemplification as cutting across them: properties and relations are exemplified not only by particulars, but by properties or relations and states of affairs as well. For instance, we may have two states of affairs exemplifying the relation of causation or laws of nature consisting of two properties exemplifying a necessitation relation.

The above-considered Meinongians may perhaps be attributed different kinds of exemplification corresponding to the different sorts of predication that they admit (see, e.g., Monhagan’s (2011) discussion of Zalta’s theory). A more typical example of the multifarious alternative is however provided by Lowe (2006), who distinguishes ‘instantiation,’ ‘characterization’ and ‘exemplification’ in his account of four fundamental categories: objects, and three different sorts of properties, namely kinds (substantial universals), attributes and modes (tropes) (‘property’ is being used here as elsewhere in this entry in a most generic sense, possibly not in line with Lowe’s more restricted usage of it): (i) kinds and attributes are instantiated by objects and modes, respectively, (ii) kinds and objects are characterized by attributes and modes, respectively; (iii) attributes are exemplified by objects, whether dispositionally or occurrently. Exemplification is dispositional to the extent that the exemplifying objects instantiate kinds characterized by the attributes in question, while it is occurrent when the exemplifying objects are characterized by modes that instantiate the attributes in question. Thus, for example, Fido is a dog insofar as it instantiates the kind dog, D, which in turn is characterized by the attribute of barking, B. Hence, when Fido is barking, it exemplifies B occurrently by virtue of being characterized by a barking mode, b, that instantiates B; and, when it is silent, it exemplifies B dispositionally, since D, which Fido instantiates, is characterized by B. (see Gorman 2014 for a critical discussion of this sort of view).

2.1 Is Exemplification Analyzable?

It might be thought that once a bundle theory of objects is endorsed, one automatically has an analysis of exemplification in terms of ‘compresence,’ the relation that ties properties together in such a way that they come to constitute a particular object (Russell 1948, Pt. IV, ch. 8): a particular’s exemplifying a property amounts to the property’s being compresent with other properties, those that constitute the particular in question (recently there have been on offer mereological interpretations of this; see Paul 2002 and Shiver 2014). Nevertheless, to the extent that the relation of compresence is itself taken to be jointly exemplified by the properties that constitute a given bundle, as it should seemingly be, there is no real analysis here.

There have been attempts to analyze instantiation even without (explicitly) endorsing a bundle theory. According to Cowling (2014), for instance, one can put forward, for at least some properties, an account in terms of occupying a location. A more well-known assay is provided by Baxter (2001, 2013), who relies on the notion of aspect and on the relativization of numerical identity to counts, as we shall now see. In his view, both particulars and properties have aspects, which can be similar to distinct aspects of other particulars or properties. For example, ‘Hume insofar as he is human’ denotes an aspect had by Hume, and it is similar to the aspect denoted by ‘Rousseau insofar as he is human,’ had by Rousseau. Further, ‘humanity insofar as it is had by Hume,’ denotes an aspect had by humanity, and it is similar to the other aspect had by humanity that is denoted by ‘humanity insofar as it is had by Rousseau.’ Both particulars and universals have different aspects. For example, Hume has also an aspect denoted by ‘Hume insofar as he is even-tempered,’ which differs from his other above-considered aspect, since, say, the former accounts for his being a rational mammal, whereas the latter accounts for his gentle manners. Yet, both aspects are numerically identical to the extent that the same particular has them. Similarly, different aspects of the same property are numerically identical. Thus, Leibniz’s law (telling us that what is true of x is also true of y, if x and y are numerically identical), while retained for properties and particulars, fails for aspects. The numerical identity of aspects is relative to standards for counting, counts, which allow us to group items together. Two counts are specifically relevant for instantiation: the particular count, which allows us to group particulars together; and the universal count, which allows us to group universals together. There can then be a cross-count identity, which holds between an aspect in a collection generated by a certain count, and an aspect in a collection generated by another count. For example, humanity insofar as it is had by Hume, to be found in the collection generated by the universal count, is cross-count identical to Hume insofar as he is human, to be found in the collection generated by the universal count. When there is a cross-count identity of this sort, the universal and the particular in question are taken to be partially identical. Instantiation then amounts to the partial identity of a universal and a particular. Thus, for example, Hume and humanity are partially identical and accordingly Hume instantiates humanity (he is human). As one can see, the theoretical and ontological costs of this analysis are very high and one may well have the feeling, as Baxter himself worries (2001, 449), that instantiation has been traded off for something definitely more obscure, such as aspects and an idiosyncratic view of identity. It can also be suspected that particulars’ and properties’ having aspects is presupposed in this analysis and that this having is a relation rather close to exemplification itself.

Baxter’s analysis has inspired a related approach by Armstrong (2004), who, however, has tried to do without aspects. At first glance it seems as if Armstrong analyzes exemplification, for he takes the exemplification of a property (a universal) by a particular to be a partial identity of the property and the particular; as he puts it (2004, 47),‘[i]t is not a mere mereological overlap, as when two streets intersect, but it is a partial identity.’ However, when we see more closely what this partial identity amounts to, the suspicion arises that it presupposes exemplification. For Armstrong appears to identify a particular via the properties that it instantiates and similarly a property via the particulars that instantiate it. So that we may take a particular, x, to be something like a bundle of properties qua instantiated by x, say Fx + Gx + Hx + … + Px + Qx + …; and a property, P, as something like a bundle of particulars qua instantiating P, say Pa + Pb + … + Px + Py + … By putting things in this way, we can then say that a particular is partially identical to a property when the bundle which the particular is has an element in common with the bundle that the property is. To illustrate, the x and the P of our example are partially identical because they have the element Px in common. Now, the elements of these bundles are neither properties tout court nor particulars tout court, which led us to talk of properties qua instantiated and particulars qua instantiating. But this of course presupposes instantiation. Alternatively (going very much beyond what Armstrong explicitly say), we can perhaps take these elements to be particularized properties, abstract particulars or tropes, which perfectly resemble each other when the bundle that they constitute is a property (a resemblance class playing the role of a universal); and which are compresent, when the bundle that they constitute is a concrete particular (say, an ordinary object). In any case, there is the unwelcome consequence that the world becomes dramatically less contingent than we would have thought at first sight, for neither a concrete particular nor a property-universal can exist without it being the case that the former has the properties it happens to have, and that the latter is instantiated by the same particulars that actually instantiate it; we get, as Mumford puts it (2007, 185), ‘a major new kind of necessity in the world.’

Despite these proposals, it seems safe to say that most philosophers, whether tacitly or overtly, take exemplification to be a primitive and unanalyzable phenomenon. The difficulties encountered by approaches such as those we have just considered (but see also, e.g., Forrest 2013) can perhaps be taken to confirm that there is some wisdom behind the majority view.

2.2 Two Crucial Problems: Bradley’s Regress and Self-exemplification

One important motivation, possibly the main one, behind attempts at analysis such as the ones above is the worry to avoid the so-called Bradley’s regress regarding exemplification (Baxter 2001, 449; Munford, 2007, 185). One construal of the regress that has passed into the literature goes like this (although it is not clear to what extent Bradley himself had this version in mind; for references to analogous regresses prior to Bradley’s, see Gaskin 2008, ch. 5, §70). Suppose that the individual a has the property F. For a to instantiate F it must be linked to F by a (dyadic) relation of instantiation, I1. But this requires a further (triadic) relation of instantiation, I2, that connects I1, F and a, and so on without end. At each stage a further connecting relation is required, and thus it seems that nothing ever gets connected to anything else. This regress has traditionally been regarded as vicious (see, e.g., Bergmann 1960), although philosophers such as Russell (1903, §55) and Armstrong (1997, 18–19) have argued that it is not. In doing so, however, they seem to take for granted the fact that a has the property F (pretty much as in the brute fact approach; see below) and go on to see a’s and F’s instantiating I1 as a further fact that is merely entailed by the former, which in turn entails a’s, F’s and I1’s instantiating I2, and so on. This way of looking at the matter tends to be regarded as a standard response to the regress. But those who see the regress as vicious assume that the various exemplification relations are introduced in an effort to explain the very existence of the fact that a has the property F. Hence, from their explanatory perspective, taking the fact in question as an unquestioned ground for a chain of entailments is beside the point (cf. Loux 2006, 31–36; Vallicella 2002). It should be noted, however, that this perspective suggests a distinction between an ‘internalist’ and an ‘externalist’ version of the regress (in the terminology of Orilia 2006a). In the former, at each stage we postulate a new constituent of the fact, or state of affairs, s, that exists insofar as a has the property F, and there is viciousness because s can never be appropriately characterized. In the latter, at each stage we postulate a new, distinct, state of affairs, whose existence is required by the existence of the state of affairs of the previous stage. This amounts to admitting infinite explanatory and metaphysical dependence chains, but, according to Orilia (2006, §7), since no decisive arguments against such chains exist, the externalist regress should not be viewed as vicious. An extensive defense of a similar approach can be found in Gaskin 2008. See Maurin 2015 for a sustained criticism.

A typical line for those convinced that the regress is vicious has consisted in proposing that instantiation is not a relation, at least not a normal one. Some philosophers hold that it is a sui generis linkage that hooks things up without intermediaries. Strawson (1959), following W. E. Johnson, calls it a non-relational tie and Bergmann (1960) calls it a nexus. Broad likened instantiation to metaphysical glue, noting that when we glue two sheets of paper together we don’t need additional glue, or mortar, or some other adhesive to bind the glue to the paper (Broad 1933, 85). Glue just sticks. And instantiation just relates. It is metaphysically self-adhesive. An alternative line has been to claim that there is no such thing as instantiation at all and that talk of it is just a misleading figure of speech. At this point it is natural to resort to metaphors like Frege’s claim that properties have gaps that can be filled by objects or the early Wittgenstein’s suggestion (if we read him as a realist about properties) that objects and properties can be hooked together like links in a chain. Although most realists about properties nowadays still tend to adopt one or another of these strategies, Vallicella (2002) has offered a penetrating criticism of them. His basic point is that, if a has property F, we need an ontological explanation of why F and a happen to be connected in such a way that a has F as one of its properties (unless F is a property that a has necessarily). But none of these strategies can provide this explanation. For example, the appeal to gaps is pointless: F has a gap whether or not it is filled by a (for example, it could be filled in by another object), and thus the gap cannot explain the fact that a has F as one of its properties.

Before proposing the above-discussed account of exemplification as partial identity, Armstrong (1997, 118) has claimed that Bradley’s regress can be avoided by taking a state of affairs, say x’s being P, as capable by itself of holding together its constituents, i.e. the object x and the property P. Thus, there is no need to invoke a relation of exemplification linking x and P in order to explain how x and P succeed in giving rise to a unitary item, namely the state of affairs in question. There seems to be a circularity here for it appears that we want to explain how an object and a property come to be united in a state of affairs by appealing to the result of this unification, namely the state of affairs itself. But perhaps this view can be interpreted as simply the idea that states of affairs should be taken for granted in a primitivist fashion without seeking an explanation of their unity by appealing to exemplification or otherwise; this brute fact approach, as we may call it, seems to be Van Inwagen’s standpoint (1993, 37).

Lowe (2006) has tried to tackle Bradley’s regress within his multifarious approach to exemplification. In his view, characterization, instantiation and exemplification, qua ‘formal,’ are to be sharply distinguished from garden-variety relations such giving or loving, which guarantees that characterization, instantiation and exemplification do not give rise to Bradley’s regress (Lowe 2006, 30, 80, 90). In explaining this, Lowe vacillates between taking them to be internal and declaring them non-existent, (Lowe 2006, 111, 167). Perhaps, they are considered non-existent precisely because internal, but separating internality from non-existence may be a better choice, since after all formal relations are in Lowe’s ontological inventory. Moreover, it is really their internality, rather than lack of existence, that is appealed to in the attempt to avoid Bradley’s regress, as shall now illustrate by turning back to the above Fido example. What a mode instantiates and what it characterizes belongs to its essence. In other words, a mode cannot exist without instantiating the attribute it instantiates and characterizing the object it characterizes. Hence, mode b, by simply existing, instantiates attribute B and characterizes Fido. Moreover, since exemplification (the occurrent one, in this case) results from “composing” characterization and instantiation, b’s existence also guarantees that Fido exemplifies B. According to Lowe, we thus have a bunch of truths, that b characterizes Fido, that b instantiates B, and that Fido exemplifies B (i.e., is barking), all of which are made true by b. Hence, there is no need to postulate as truthmakers states of affairs with constituents, Fido and b, related by characterization, or b and B, related by characterization, or Fido and B, related by exemplification. This, in Lowe’s opinion, eschews Bradley’s regress, since this arises precisely because we appeal to states of affairs with constituents in need of a glue that contingently keep them together. Nevertheless, there is no loss of contingency in Lowe’s world picture, for an object need not be characterized by the modes that happen to characterize it. Thus, for example, mode b might have failed to exist and there could have been a Fido silence mode in its stead, in which case the proposition that Fido is barking would have been false and the proposition that Fido is silent would have been true. One may wonder however what makes it the case that a certain mode is a mode of just a certain object and not of another one, say another barking dog. Even granting that is essential for b to be a mode of Fido, rather than of another dog, it remains true that it is of Fido, rather than of the other dog, and since b might have failed to exist, one may still think that this being of is also a contingent glue. The suspicion then is that the problem of accounting for the relation between a mode and an object has been traded for the Armstrongian one of what makes it the case that a property-universal P and an object x make up the state of affairs x’s being P. But the former problem, one may urge, is no less thorny than the latter (for a take on Bradley’s regress analogous to Lowe’s and worries along the lines of those voiced here, see Simons 2011 and MacBride 2011, respectively).

As it should be clear from this far from exhaustive survey, Bradley’s regress deeply worries ontologists and the attempts to tame it keep flowing (see, e.g., Peacock 2012, for an approach resorting to Russell’s notion of a relating relation, as opposed to a relation that is not doing its relating work; Tegtmeier 2013, for a view according to which a fact itself grounds its unity; Schneider 2013 for an appeal to ‘unrepeatable nexuses’ in the context of an Aristotelian framework in the spirit of the one defended in Lowe 2006).

We have dealt primarily, more or less explicitly, with the exemplification of properties by items other than properties, e.g., ordinary objects. But presumably properties may also exemplify properties. For example, if properties are abstract objects, as is usually thought, then seemingly every property exemplifies abstractness. But then we should also grant that there is self-exemplification, i.e., a property exemplifying itself. For example, abstractness is itself abstract and thus exemplifies itself. Self-exemplification however has raised severe perplexities since the early days of Plato.

In various passages throughout his dialogues Plato appears to hold that all properties exemplify themselves, when he claims that Forms (which are often taken to be his version of properties) participate in themselves. This claim serves as a premise in what is known as his third man argument which, he seems to think, may show that the very notion of a Form is incoherent (Parmenides, 132ff). But it is not clear why we should hold that all properties exemplify themselves (Armstrong 1978, 71). For instance, why should we think that honesty itself is honest?

A more serious worry related to self-exemplification is Russell’s famous paradox. If every predicative expression corresponds to a property, then the expressions ‘is a property that does not instantiate itself’ should do so. This raises the question: does this property instantiate itself? Suppose that it does. Then it is a property that does not instantiate itself; so if it does instantiate itself, it doesn’t instantiate itself. Now suppose that it does not instantiate itself. Then it is one of those properties that do not instantiate themselves; so it does instantiate itself. Such a property, which instantiates itself if and only if it does not instantiate itself, appears to defy the laws of logic, at least classical logic. This puzzle and related conundrums still occupy logicians and no consensus on how to eschew them is in sight; see on this §§7.2 and 8.

3. Traditional Explanations

Properties are typically introduced to help explain or account for phenomena of philosophical interest, especially in doing ontology. The existence of properties, we are told, would explain qualitative recurrence or help account for our ability to agree about the instances of general terms like ‘red.’ In the terminologies of bygone eras, properties save the phenomena; they afford a fundamentum in re for things like the applicability of general terms. Nowadays philosophers make a similar point when they argue that some phenomenon holds because of or in virtue of this or that property, that a property is its foundation or ground, or that a property is the truthmaker for a sentence about it. These expressions signal explanations (for a defense of the legitimacy of ontological explanations, cf. Swoyer 1999; for qualms about an explanatory recourse to properties, see Quine 1961, 10; Quinton 1973, 295).

In seeking explanations in ontology (as in other disciplines) we must frequently weigh tradeoffs between various desiderata, e.g., between simplicity and comprehensiveness, and even between different kinds of simplicity. But one tradeoff is so pervasive that it deserves a name, and we will call it the fundamental ontological tradeoff. The fundamental ontological tradeoff reflects the perennial tension between explanatory power and epistemic risk, between a rich, lavish ontology that promises to explain a great deal and a more modest ontology that promises epistemological security. The more machinery we postulate, the more we might hope to explain—but the harder it is to believe in the existence of all the machinery. As we shall see in the following, the inevitability of this tradeoff keeps playing a crucial role in current discussions of properties.

Properties keep being invoked to explain a very wide range of phenomena. Insofar as each of the explanations is plausible, it serves as part of a cumulative case for the existence of properties. In the following subsections we shall survey several of the most common explanations philosophers have asked properties to provide (for a longer list see Swoyer 1999, §3). In the next section we shall discuss more novel attempts to appeal to properties in providing explanations.

3.1 Resemblance and Recurrence

There are objective similarities or groupings in the world. Some things are alike in certain ways. They have the same color or shape or size; they are protons or lemons or central processing units. A puzzle, sometimes called the problem of the one over the many, asks for an account of this. Possession of a common property (e.g., a given shade of yellow) or a common constellation of properties (e.g., those essential to lemons) has often been cited to explain such resemblance. Similarly, different groups of things, e.g., Bill and Hillary, George and Barbara, can be related in similar ways, and the postulation of a relation (here being married to) that the members of each group jointly instantiate is often cited to explain this similarity. Finally, having different properties, e.g., different colors, is often said to explain qualitative differences. A desire to explain qualitative similarity and qualitative difference has been a traditional motivation for realism with respect to universals, and it continues to motivate many realists today (e.g., Butchvarov 1966; Aaron 1967, ch. 9; Armstrong 1984, 250).

3.2 Recognition of New and Novel Instances

Many organisms easily recognize and classify newly encountered objects as yellow or round or lemons or rocks, they can recognize that one new thing is larger than a second, and so on. One may thus think that that this ability is based partly on the fact that the novel instances have a property that the organism has encountered before—the old and new cases share a common property—and that the creature is somehow attuned to recognize it.

3.3 The Meaning of General Terms

Our ability to use general terms (like ‘yellow,’ ‘lemon,’ ‘heavier than,’ and ‘between’) provides a linguistic counterpart to the epistemological phenomenon of recognition and to the metaphysical problem of the One over the Many. Most general terms apply to some things but not to others, and in many cases competent speakers have little trouble knowing when they apply and when they do not. Philosophers have often argued that possession of a common property (like redness), together with certain linguistic conventions, explains why general terms apply to the things that they do. For example, Plato noted that ‘we are in the habit of postulating one unique Form for each plurality of objects to which we apply a common name’ (Republic, 596A; see also Phaedo, 78e; Timaeus, 52a; Parmenides, 13; and Russell 1912, 93). At least for those who attach metaphysical weight to the distinction between expressing (predicates) and referring (singular terms), questions about the meanings (now often known as the ‘semantic values’) of singular terms like ‘honesty’ and ‘hunger’ and ‘being in love’ may be even more pressing. Since the chief task of singular terms is to refer to things, the semantic values of ‘honesty,’ ‘hunger’ and the like are presumably the things they refer to. But what could a word like ‘honesty’ refer to? If there are properties, it could refer to the property honesty.

4. Recent Explanations

In addition to the traditional ones discussed above, there are other tasks for which properties have been invoked. For example, the above-mentioned bundle theory attempts to reduce particulars to properties. In spite of well-known problems (Van Cleve 1985) this view keeps having supporters (Casullo 1988; Curtis 2014). Moreover, it has also been proposed that possible worlds can be reduced to properties (Forrest 1986) or that fictional characters can be viewed as properties (Orilia 2012).

Leaving these issues aside, we shall however concentrate on three areas where properties are often invoked today: philosophy of mathematics, semantics (the theory of meaning), and naturalistic ontology. These areas are useful to consider, because if properties can explain things of interest to philosophers who don’t specialize in metaphysics, things like mathematical truth or the nature of natural laws, then properties will seem more interesting. Unlike the substantial forms derided by early modern philosophers as dormitive virtues, properties will pay their way by doing interesting and important work.

4.1 Mathematics

Philosophers of mathematics have focused much of their attention on number theory (arithmetic). Number theory is just the theory of the natural numbers, 0, 1, 2, …, and the familiar operations (like addition and multiplication) on them. Many sentences of arithmetic, e.g. ‘7 + 5 = 12,’ certainly seem to be true, but such truths present various philosophical puzzles and philosophers have tried to explain how they could have the features they seem to have, in particular that they are objective, necessary and knowable a priori.

Most attempts to use properties to explain these features are versions of identificationism, the reductionist strategy that identifies numbers with things that initially seem to be different. This approach is familiar from the original versions of identificationism, where numbers were identified with sets, but it is straightforward to adapt this earlier work to identify numbers with properties rather than with sets. For example, the sequence of natural numbers 0, 1, ... could be identified with a sequence of second-order properties such as the property of having no instance, the property of having exactly one instance, etc. (see, e.g., Cocchiarella 1989, §4).

The most compelling defense of the use of properties in the philosophy of mathematics urges that, when we step back and consider the big picture, we see that a rich-enough stock of properties can do all the work of sets and numbers (or that we can use them to define sets and numbers) and that properties can do further things that sets simply cannot. For example, it has been argued that properties can be used to give accounts of the semantics of English or explain the nature of natural laws. The appeal of sets, in short, results from a metaphysical myopia, but, once we adopt a larger view of things, we find that properties provide the best global, overall explanation.

The identification of numbers with properties has sometimes been offered in an attempt to resurrect logicism, roughly the thesis, championed by Frege and Russell, that classical mathematics, or at least arithmetic, can be reduced to logic (Bealer 1982; Cocchiarella 1986a; Orilia 2000). Logicism of course raises the difficult issue of what exactly counts as logic and not all identificationists embrace it (Pollard and Martin 1986). In any case, once numbers are identified with properties, we can explain various things of philosophical interest about truths of arithmetic. They can be objectively true, because they describe an objective realm of mind-independent properties. Moreover, given that the properties identified with numbers are ones that exist necessarily, and that they necessarily stand in their arithmetical relations, the truths of arithmetic will be necessarily true, as one should expect.

However, taken alone, property-based identificationism does not explain mathematical knowledge and substantive auxiliary hypotheses about human cognitive faculties are presumably needed. Identificationists typically propose to identify numbers with putative objects that lie outside the spatio-temporal, causal order. As argued by Benacerraf (1973), however, since we are physical organisms living in a spatio-temporal world, it is not clear how we can interact causally (or in any other discernible way) with abstract, causally inert things so as to have epistemic access to them. A few philosophers, e.g., Linsky & Zalta (1995), have taken this problem seriously and proposed solutions that do not involve mysterious cognitive faculties. Others have even argued that certain universals can play the role of sense-data and should thus be considered objects of perception (Forrest 2005). Philosophers remain divided on this issue, but it is safe to say that if the problem of epistemic access cannot be overcome, it in turn undermines identificationist attempts to use properties to explain arithmetic truth. Here we face the fundamental ontological tradeoff: A richer ontology offers to explain many things that might otherwise be mysterious. But in the view of many philosophers, it engenders epistemological mysteries of its own.

Some recent accounts identify numbers with properties that seem less other-worldly than those invoked by mainstream identificationists such as those mentioned above. For example, Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) argue that rational numbers are higher-order relations—ratios—among certain kinds of first-order relations.

The gravest threats to identificationism are posed by what might be called the Benacerraf problem. As Benacerraf (1965) noted, if there is one way to identify the natural numbers with sets, there are countless ways, e.g., Frege’s, Zermelo’s, von Neumann’s, etc. There is a similar arbitrariness in any particular identification of numbers with properties (as the fact that different property theorists identify numbers with different properties shows; we have seen one proposal above, but another way to go could be this: define first a successor relation à la Frege and then identify 1 with the successor of the property of having no instance, 2 with the successor of 1, and so on (cf. Bealer 1982, §6)). Authors who defend such accounts are aware of these difficulties and some have proposed various responses to them, but the problems are serious and no solutions are generally accepted.

There are also non-identificationist accounts of mathematical truth that make use of properties, such as that by Linsky and Zalta (1995) (further developed in Zalta 1999; 2000). It is based on Zalta’s (1983; 1988) theory of abstract objects, a theory designed to explain a wide range of phenomena, which is particularly relevant here because it is developed alongside a rich formal account of properties.

4.2 Semantics and Logical Form

Language and logic have long been an important source of data for ontologists. Many philosophers have contented themselves with fairly informal appeals to various features of language to support their claim that properties exist, but in the last two decades some philosophers (along with a few linguists and even computer scientists) have employed properties as parts of detailed accounts of the semantics of large fragments of natural languages like English or Choctaw, and some of these accounts contain the most detailed formal theories of properties ever devised. Some property theorists are motivated almost exclusively by a desire to give a semantic account of natural language (e.g., Chierchia and Turner 1988), others hold that this is but one of several motivations for developing an account of properties (e.g., Bealer 1982; Zalta 1988) (but it should be noted that still others, e.g., Jubien 1989; Armstrong 1997; Mellor 1991, 180ff doubt that properties have any serious role to play in semantics at all).

The basic idea that motivates this work is the following. If we allow for a rich-enough stock of properties, we can provide a semantic value for every predicate and abstract singular term of English (or at least for those that could have a semantic value without leading to paradox) and thus account for many linguistic phenomena.

We explain the meanings of general terms like ‘honest’ by claiming that they denote (or express) properties (like honesty), that a sentence like ‘Tom is honest’ has the logical form of a simple subject-predicate sentence, and that it is true just in case the individual denoted by ‘Tom’ is in the extension of the property denoted (or expressed) by the predicate ‘honest,’ which requires that there be a property expressed by this predicate (see Hochberg 1968 for a good discussion of related issues).

We can also argue that abstract singular terms like ‘honesty’ denote the property that the associated predicate (‘honest’) denotes or expresses, that sentences like ‘Honesty is a virtue’ have the simple logical form of a subject-predicate sentence, and that the sentence is true exactly when the word ‘honesty’ denotes a property that is in the extension of the property denoted by the verb phrase ‘is a virtue.’

Once we take these steps, it is also straightforward to explain the validity of arguments such as ‘Clinton is self-indulgent; therefore, there is at least one vice that Clinton has’: The logical form of the premise is that of a simple subject-predicate sentence and the logical form of the conclusion is that of an existential quantification with a standard objectual quantifier. If the first sentence is true, then ‘self-indulgent’ expresses a property, and this property (which can be assumed to have the property of being a vice) satisfies the open sentence ‘Clinton is X.’ Hence, just as in standard first-order logic, the existential quantification is true.

What we discussed so far at most requires, one may think, simple properties without any internal structure. Bu there are some more complex phenomena that appear to require “compound” properties and propositions. They include the following:

  1. Various English constructions are quite naturally interpreted as complex predicates: ‘Tom is a boring but honest brother of Sam’ is straightforwardly construed as containing a compound predicate, ‘is a boring but honest brother of Sam,’ that is predicated of the noun ‘Tom’ (and that could be predicated of other nouns too, e.g., ‘Wilbur’). Other constructions are very naturally interpreted as complex singular terms (as in ‘Being a boring but honest brother of Sam is no bed of roses’). Furthermore, these complex expressions are related to simpler expressions in systematic ways. For example, ‘Tom is a boring but not dishonest brother of Sam’ should entail ‘Tom is not dishonest.’
  2. English is full of intensional or intentional idioms like ‘necessarily,’ ‘believes’ and ‘imagines’ that cannot be handled by any extensional semantics.

In recent years a number of philosophers (e.g., Bealer 1982; 1994; Cocchiarella 1986; 2007; Zalta 1983; 1988; Chierchia & Turner 1988; Menzel 1993; Orilia 2000) have developed intricate accounts of properties that deal with these phenomena. They include formal languages whose semantics provide systematic ways of forming compound properties (e.g., loving Darla) to serve as semantic values of complex predicates (‘loves Darla’) or complex singular terms (‘loving Darla’). Moreover, they appeal to propositions, which they treat as zero-place properties, to deal with intensional and intentional idioms. For this to be done properly, properties must be very finely individuated, probably as finely individuated as the linguistic expressions that denote or express them. For example, Tom’s grasp of logic may be so tenuous that he believes of Ortcutt that he is a spy and an auditor for the IRS but doubts that he is an auditor for the IRS and a spy. This is sometimes taken to suggest that being a spy and an auditor for the IRS is distinct from the (necessarily coextensive) property being an auditor for the IRS and a spy. To be sure, few people are guilty of such blatant lapses, but we can certainly make mistakes when necessarily coextensive properties are described in more complicated ways (such errors are routine in mathematics and logic).

On the plausible (though not inevitable) assumption that the structure of many of our thoughts is similar to the structure of the sentences we use to describe the contents of those thoughts (‘Sam thinks Tom is boring but not dishonest’), we might also hope to use properties in an account of mental content that would in many ways parallel an account of the semantics of the more intensional fragments of English.

Before the explicit appeal to properties in formal semantics in works such as those cited above, there has been important work in formal semantics that treats the semantic values of noun phrases and verb phrases as intensions. Intensions are functions that assign sets to predicates at each possible world (or related set-theoretic devices that encode the same information). On such accounts, for example, the semantic value of ‘red’ is the function that maps each possible world to the set of things in that world that are red. Montague (1974) and linguists and philosophers inspired by his work have devised systems based on this idea that have great elegance and power. Nevertheless, finely individuated properties are more useful in semantics than intensions as used by Montague because intensions are still too coarse-grained to explain many semantic phenomena involving intensional idioms. For example, semantic accounts that employ intensions would most naturally treat ‘circle’ and ‘locus of points equidistant from a point’ as having the same meaning (since they have the same intension). This makes it difficult to deal with the so-called paradox of analysis, which asks us to explain how it could be true, e.g., that ‘Tom believes something is a circle, but does not believe that it is a locus of points equidistant from a point’. If ‘circle’ and ‘locus of points equidistant from a point’ have the same meaning an explanation is hard to find. In contrast, with finely individuated properties, we get an account based on the idea that the complex expression ‘locus of points equidistant from a point’ and the simple one ‘circle’ have different properties as meanings, a compound one and a simple, or at least simpler, one, in a way that reflects the different complexity of the two terms in question (cf. Bealer 1982 and, for a variation on this theme, Orilia 1999). It should be noted here that a prima facie similar problem arises with simple terms such as ‘gorse’ and ‘furze’: could not Tom believe that the flower picked by Mary is a gorse without believing that it is a furze? To deal with such cases an appeal to finely individuated compound properties won’t help, since presumably ‘gorse’ and ‘furze’ stand for the same simple property, and accordingly one may want to move from the semantic to the pragmatic level to account for them (Bealer 1982, §39).

Creswell (1985) has shown how to attribute within a Montague-style intensionalist framework two different semantic values to expressions of different complexity such as ‘circle’ and ‘locus of points equidistant from a point’, precisely with the intent of addressing issues concerning beliefs and other propositional attitudes. But then another problem with intensions is this: it is unlikely that they can perform tasks in areas outside semantics (like naturalistic ontology) that properties may be able to do. It is natural, for example, to suppose that things have the capacities that they do (e.g., the capacity to exert a force on a distant object) because of the properties they possess (e.g., gravitational mass). But it seems most unlikely that huge set-theoretic intensions would be able to explain things like this.

Some philosophers have construed intensions as providing a reduction of properties to intensions (properties are nothing over and above functions from the class of possible worlds to classes of objects). This view keeps having supporters (see, e.g., Egan 2004). Given what we noted above, however, it seems much better to view properties (including relations, and perhaps propositions) as irreducible entities.

Current property-based semantic theories do not accommodate vagueness. This is a serious shortcoming, because vague predicates (like ‘bald’) and vague nominalizations (like ‘baldness’) are the rule rather than the exception. Recent empirical work on concepts reinforces the point that many concepts (and, with them, predicates) have a graded membership and goes on to stress the importance of phenomena like typicality. On most current psychological accounts, concepts involve features and similarity relations. Since features (e.g., having feathers, having a beak) are properties, there is no reason why current property theories could not be emended and extended to make contact with such accounts, and it seems likely that this will be a fruitful line of inquiry in the future (see Margolis & Laurence 1999 for a useful selection of papers on concepts).

4.3 Naturalistic Ontology

In recent years properties have played a central role in philosophical accounts of scientific realism, measurement, causation, dispositions, and natural laws. This is a less unified set of concerns than those encountered in the previous two subsections, but it is still a clearly recognizable area, and we will call it naturalistic ontology. Let us see how properties enter the picture in this field.

Even quite modest and selective versions of scientific realism are most easily developed with the aid of properties. Most importantly, this is so because claims that appear to quantify over properties are common in science, as these examples show:

  1. If one organism is fitter than a conspecific, then there is at least one property the first organism has that gives it a greater propensity to reproduce than the second.
  2. There are many inherited characteristics, but there are no acquired characteristics that are inherited.
  3. Properties and relations measured on an interval scale are invariant under positive linear transformations, but this isn’t true of all properties and relations measured on ordinal scales.
  4. In a Newtonian world all fundamental properties are invariant under Galilean transformations, whereas the fundamental properties in a special-relativistic world are those that are invariant under Lorentz transformation.

No one has any idea how to paraphrase most of these claims in a non-quantificational idiom, and they certainly seem to assert (or deny) the existence of various sorts of properties; natural properties, one may say in the terminology of Lewis (1983), who takes naturalness as coming in degrees, so that we may speak of perfectly natural properties, perhaps negatively charged, less than perfectly natural properties such as metallic, and completely unnatural ones, e.g., Goodman’s notorious grueness (see Dorr & Hawthorne 2013 for a detailed analysis of what naturalness amounts to).

Many important properties invoked in science, like being a simple harmonic oscillator, being a gene, being an edge detector, or being a belief, are often thought to be functional properties. To say that something exemplifies a functional property is, roughly, to say that there are certain properties that it exemplifies and that together they allow it to play a certain causal role. For example, DNA molecules have certain properties that allow them to transmit genetic information in pretty much the way described by Mendel’s laws. Here again, we have quantifications over properties that seem unavoidable.

Much explanation in science is causal explanation, and causal explanations often proceed by citing properties of the things involved in causal interactions. For example, electrons repel one another in the way that they do because they have the same charge.

In naturalistic ontology we often hear claims that one sort of thing is reducible to a second or (more frequently nowadays) that one sort of thing supervenes on another. Such claims make the best sense if we take them to involve properties. For example the claim that the psychological realm supervenes on the physical realm involves mental and physical properties.

Some philosophers of science, most notably Feyerabend and Kuhn, argue that theoretical terms such as ‘mass’ draw their meaning from the theories within which they occur. Hence, they conclude, a change in theory causes a shift in the meanings of all of its constituent terms, and so different theories simply talk about different things, they are ‘incommensurable.’ The common realist rejoinder is that the reference of terms can remain the same even when the surrounding theory shifts. But for this response to work a theoretical term must refer to something, and the most plausible candidate for this is a property.

Various features of measurement in science are most easily explained by invoking properties. For example, estimates of the magnitude of measurement error are typically reported along with measurement results. Such talk makes little sense unless there is a fact about what a correct measurement would be. But the very notion of correct measurement seems to imply that objects exemplify magnitude properties such as rest mass of 4kg. Moreover, nowadays measurement units are often specified directly in terms of properties. For instance, we now specify the meter in terms of something that can in principle be instantiated anywhere in the world, e.g., as the length equal to a certain number of wavelengths (in a vacuum) of a particular color of light emitted by krypton 86 atoms (Mundy 1987; Swoyer 1987).

Some philosophers have employed properties in reductive accounts of causation (cf. Tooley 1987; Fales 1990). It would take us too far afield to explore this work here, but it is worth noting that it is never a single, undifferentiated amorphous blob of an object (or blob of an event) that makes things happen. It is an object (or event) with properties. Furthermore, how it affects things depends on what these properties are. The liquid in the glass causes the litmus paper to turn blue because the liquid is an alkaline (and not because the liquid also happens to be blue). This suggests that at least some properties are causal powers.

Properties have played a central role in several recent accounts of natural laws. This is particularly evident in what we will call N-relation theories, according to which a natural law is a second-order relation of nomic necessitation (N, for short) holding among two or more first-order properties. Hence the logical form of a statement of a simple law is not ‘All Fs are Gs’; in the case of a law involving two first-order properties, it is a second-order atomic sentence of the form ‘N(F,G)’ (see, e.g., Armstrong 1978a; 1983; Dretske 1977; Tooley 1977).

In the more exact sciences the relevant first-order properties (our Fs and Gs) will typically be determinate magnitudes like a kinetic energy of 1.6 × 10−2 joule or a force of 1 newton or an electrical resistance of 12.3 ohms (rather than mass or force or resistance simpliciter; Knowles 2015 argues interestingly for the controversial view that these properties are relations to numbers). Hence the laws specified by an equation are really infinite families of specific laws. For instance, Newton’s second law tells us that each specific, determinate mass m (a scalar, and so a monadic property) and total impressed force f (a vector, and so a relational property) stand in the N-relation to the appropriate relation (vector) of acceleration a (= f/m).

The dominant accounts of laws during much of the last century were regularity theories, according to which laws are simply contingent regularities and there is no metaphysical difference between genuine laws and accidentally true generalizations. N-relation theories were originally devised to avoid perceived shortcomings of these earlier accounts, such as their failure to account for the modal force and the objective character of natural laws. Many laws seem to necessitate some things and to preclude others. Pauli’s exclusion principle requires that two fermions occupy different quantum states and the laws of thermodynamics show the impossibility of perpetual motion machines. But, N-relation theorists insist, since regularity theorists forswear everything modal, they can never account for the modal aspects of laws. Moreover, according to N-relation theories, laws are objective because the N-relation relates those properties it does quite independently of our language and thought (in the case of properties that don’t specifically involve our language or thought). By contrast, the epistemic and pragmatic features used by regularity theorists to demarcate laws from accidental generalizations are too anthropocentric to account for the objectivity of laws.

N-relation theories are not without difficulties (Van Fraassen 1989). First, it is not clear how to extend N-relation accounts to deal with several important kinds of laws, most prominently conservation laws and symmetry principles. Second, even in the case of laws that can be coaxed (or crammed) into the N-relation scheme, the account involves a highly idealized notion whose connection to the things that go by the name ‘law’ in labs and research centers is rather remote (attempts to remove this gap typically rely on Cartwright 1983; 1989). However, if N-relation accounts are on the right track, there is a reasonably rich realm of properties that is structured by one or more nomic relations.

The work discussed in this subsection suggests that properties include determinate physical magnitudes like mass of 3.7 kg and electrical resistance of 7 ohms. Furthermore, such properties typically form families of ordered determinates (e.g., the family of determinate masses) that have a definite algebraic structure (Mundy 1987; Swoyer 1987). It also suggests that a fundamental feature of at least many properties is that they confer causal capacities on their instances. Work on naturalistic ontology doesn’t entail detailed answers to every question about the nature of properties, but it does suggest answers to some of them.

4.4 Lessons About Properties

The material covered in the three previous subsections offers us some insights on the nature of properties. One can notice a fundamental way in which the general conception of properties that emerges from naturalistic ontology differs from many of the conceptions discussed in relation to mathematics and semantics. On those earlier conceptions, in invoking properties there appear to be strong reasons for viewing them as finely individuated; we saw that even being a circle and being a locus of points equidistant from a point are regarded as different properties and of course we may add that for similar reasons properties like being water and being an aggregate of molecules of H2O are also regarded as distinct. Moreover, the broadly a priori character of the investigations on which these conceptions are based may easily lead to view properties of this sort as other-worldly necessary beings: abstract entities that exist outside space and time and accordingly are causally inert. If these is what they are, presumably they cannot causally interact with us and thus the task of explaining how we may possibly have knowledge of them is highly problematic.

By contrast, in naturalistic ontology we can learn what properties there are and what they are like through empirical investigation in which we causally interact with them, and accordingly they are treated as contingent entities intimately related to the causal, spatio-temporal order. From this perspective, they can hardly be viewed as finely individuated like the meanings of the other conception, for it is possible to discover a posteriori that a property conceived of in one way (e.g., the property of being water) is identical with a property conceived in some quite different way (e.g., the property of being an aggregate of molecules of H2O). It might be misleading to call such properties ‘concrete’ (the standard antonym of the slippery word ‘abstract’), but it isn’t quite right to call them ‘abstract’ either. Indeed, the stark dichotomy between abstract and concrete is probably too simple to be useful here. This conflict between different conceptions of properties is somehow reflected in the different views about the existence and identity conditions for properties, which will be discussed in the next two sections.

5. Existence Conditions

What properties are there? Under what conditions does a property exist? These questions can hardly be disentangled from the issue of the identity conditions for properties, to be discussed in the next section. Before turning to it, it will be useful to look at the array of views about the existence conditions of properties as a continuum, with claims that the realm of properties is sparse over on the right (conservative) end and claims that it is abundant over on the left (liberal) end. Here we are following Lewis’s (1986) well-known terminology, which acknowledges a sparse and an abundant conception of properties. We will focus on three views in this continuum, the two extreme ones and another that holds a middle ground. We will then turn to a hybrid view that tries to combine the two ends of the spectrum by admitting two radically distinct kinds of property.

5.1 Minimalism

According to minimalist conceptions of properties, the realm of properties is sparsely populated. This is a comparative claim (it is more thinly populated than many realists suppose) rather than a claim about cardinality. Indeed, a minimalist could hold that there is a large infinite number of properties, say, that there are at least as many properties as real numbers. This would be a natural view, for example, for a philosopher who thought that each value of a physical magnitude is a separate property and that field theories of such properties as gravitational potentials are correct in their claim that the field intensity drops off continuously as we move away from the source of the field.

The best-known contemporary exponent of minimalism is David Armstrong (e.g., 1978; 1978a; 1984), although he came to make a distinction between ‘first-class properties’ (universals), identified from a minimalist perspective, and ‘second-class properties’ (supervening on universals), which go far beyond minimalist strictures (1997; see Orilia 2016, for a discussion of this). Another supporter of minimalism is Swoyer (1996). Specific reductionist motivations (e.g., a commitment to physicalism) can lead to minimalism, but here we will focus on more general motivations. These motivations typically involve some combination of the view that everything that exists at all exists in space and time (or space-time), a desire for epistemic security, and a distrust of modal notions like necessity. Hence, a minimalist is likely to subscribe to at least most of the following four principles.

5.1.1 The Principle of Instantiation

The principle of instantiation says that there are no uninstantiated properties. For properties: to be is to be exemplified. Taken alone, the principle of instantiation doesn’t enforce a strong version of minimalism, since it might be that a wide array of properties are exemplified. For example, someone who thinks that numbers or individual essences or other abstract objects exist would doubtlessly think that a vast number of properties are exemplified. So it is useful to distinguish two versions of the principle of instantiation.

Weak Instantiation: All properties are instantiated; there are no uninstantiated properties.

Strong Instantiation: All properties are instantiated by things that exist in space and time (or, if properties can themselves instantiate properties, each property is part of a descending chain of instantiations that bottoms out in individuals in space and time).

Armstrong (1978) holds that properties enjoy a timeless sort of existence; if a property is ever instantiated, then it always exists. A more rigorous minimalism holds that properties are mortal; a property only exists when it is exemplified. This account has an admirable purity about it, but it is hard pressed to explain very much; for example, if laws are relations among properties, then a law would seem to come and go as the properties involved do.

5.1.2 Properties are Contingent Beings

Philosophers who subscribe to the strong principle of instantiation are almost certain to hold that properties are contingent beings. It is a contingent matter just which individuals exist and what properties they happen to exemplify, so it is a contingent matter what properties there are.

5.1.3 The Empirical Conception of Properties

A natural consequence of the view that properties are contingent beings is that questions about which properties exist are empirical. There are no logical or conceptual or any other a priori methods to determine which properties exist.

5.1.4 Properties are Coarse-grained

Those who hold that properties are very finely individuated will be inclined to hold that the realm of properties is fairly bountiful. For example, if the relation of loving and the converse of its converse (and the converse of the converse of that, and so on) are distinct, then properties will be plentiful. Minimalists, by contrast, are more likely to hold that properties are coarse-grained (see §6 Identity Conditions): they are identical just in case they necessarily have the same instances or just in case they bestow the same causal powers on their instances.

The strong principle of instantiation opens the door to the claim that properties are literally located in their instances. This is a version of the medieval doctrine of universalia in rebus, which was contrasted with the picture of universalia ante rem, the view that properties are transcendent beings that exist apart from their instances. With properties firmly rooted here in the spatio-temporal world, it may seem less mysterious how we could learn about them, talk about them, and use them to provide illuminating explanations. For it isn’t some weird, other-worldly entity that explains why this apple is red; it is something in the apple, some aspect of it, that accounts for this. It is easier, however, to think of monadic properties as located in their instances than it is to view relations in this way (this may be why Aristotle and the moderate realists of the Middle Ages understood relations in terms of accidents that inhere in single things (see the entry on medieval theories of relations). Nevertheless, the general feeling that transcendent properties couldn’t explain anything about their instances has figured prominently in many debates over properties.

Minimalists must pay a price for their epistemic security (there’s no escaping the fundamental ontological tradeoff). They will have little hope of finding enough properties for a semantic account of even a modest fragment of any natural language and they will be hard pressed (though Armstrong 1997 does try) to use properties to account for phenomena in the philosophy of mathematics. Minimalists may not be greatly bothered by this, however, for many of them are primarily concerned with issues in naturalistic ontology. Moreover, they might perhaps agree that there are concepts, understood as mind-dependent entities, and let them play the theoretical role assigned by maximalists to properties in dealing with semantics and mathematics (e.g., along the lines proposed in Cocchiarella 2007).

5.2 Maximalism

At the other, left, end of the spectrum we find maximalist conceptions of properties. Borrowing a term from Arthur Lovejoy, maximalists argue that properties obey a principle of plenitude. Every property that could possibly exist does exist. For properties: To be is to be possible (Linsky & Zalta 1995; cf. Jubien 1989). If one accepts the view that properties are necessary beings, then it is a simple modal fact that if a property is possible it is necessary and, hence, actual.

Just as the principle of instantiation alone does not guarantee minimalism, the principle of plenitude alone does not guarantee maximalism. One can endorse the former while holding that all sorts of properties are instantiated, and one can endorse the latter by holding that very few properties are possible (an actualist who subscribes to the strong principle of instantiation might hold this). So, to get to the maximalist end of the spectrum, we need to add the claim that a vast array of properties is possible. This can be achieved by means of various formal principles, e.g., a strong comprehension principle (as in Zalta 1988) or axioms ensuring very finely-individuated properties (as in Bealer 1982, 65, or Menzel 1986, 38)(see §8).

Maximalist accounts are often propounded by philosophers who want to explain meaning and mental content, but, since such accounts postulate so many properties, maximalists have the resources to also offer accounts of other things (e.g., phenomena in the foundations of mathematics), and many do. Indeed, the great strength of maximalism is that its enormously rich ontology offers the resources to explain all sorts of things.

Epistemology is the Achilles heel of maximalism. At least some philosophers find it difficult to see how our minds could make epistemic contact (and how our words could make semantic contact) with entities lying outside the spatio-temporal, causal order. But maximalism has its advantages. Those maximalists who are untroubled by epistemic angst typically remain maximalists. By contrast, philosophers who begin as minimalists sometimes feel pressure to move to a richer conception of properties, either to extend their explanations to cover more phenomena or, sometimes, even just to adequately explain the things they started out trying to explain (e.g., Armstrong’s more recent work is somewhat less minimalist than his earliest work).

5.3 Centrism

There is a large middle ground between extreme minimalism and extreme maximalism. For example, several philosophers primarily concerned with physical ontology have urged that a limited number of uninstantiated properties are needed to account for features of measurement (Mundy 1987), vectors (Bigelow and Pargetter 1990, 77), or natural laws (Tooley 1987). These approaches can, like minimalism, treat properties as contingent, fairly coarsely individuated, and too sparse to satisfy any general comprehension principles (e.g., they may deny that there are negative or disjunctive properties). One can also arrive at a centrist position by endorsing a comprehension principle, but adding that it only guarantees the existence of properties built up from an sparse initial stock of simple properties (cf. Bealer 1994, 167). Another option is to hold that all the properties there are are those that can be possibly exemplified, where the possibility in question is causal or nomic possibility (Cocchiarella 2007, ch. 12).

Being moderate isn’t always easy, and it can be difficult to stake out a position in the center that doesn’t appear arbitrary. Once any uninstantiated properties are admitted, we are in much the same epistemological boat as the maximalist. No doubt the minimalist will see this as a reason to reject any uninstantiated properties, while the maximalist (who believes that epistemological problems can be overcome) will see it as a reason to admit as many of them as possible.

5.4 Dualism

The contrast between the different perspectives on properties brought to light in §4 gives us some reason to think that accounts in different fields (e.g., semantics and natural ontology) may call for entities with different identity conditions; for example, semantics requires very finely individuated properties, whereas naturalist ontology may need more coarsely individuated ones. If this is so, then no single kind of entity could do both kinds of jobs. The minimalist is likely to conclude that it is a mistake to employ properties in semantics. But less squeamish philosophers may instead conclude that there are (at least) two different sorts of property-like entities. This dualist view, as we may call it, is developed most explicitly in Bealer 1982, where two kinds of properties are admitted: the type I properties, also called concepts, are the fine-grained properties that can function as meanings and as constituents of mental contents; the type II properties, also called qualities or connections, are the coarse-grained properties required by naturalistic ontology (it should be noted that Bealer does not use ‘concept’ to mean the mind-dependent entities typically postulated by conceptualists; his concepts are mind-independent universals and he even suggests (p. 186) that simple concepts can be identified with qualities and connections). Orilia (1999) has followed Bealer’s dualist approach and adopted the same terminology. A form of dualism can perhaps also be attributed to Lewis (1983; 1986, 60) when he distinguishes between the sparse and the abundant conception of properties.

Dualism might look like a happy hybrid, but it won’t satisfy everyone: minimalists (and some centrists) will reject the view that there are any type I or abundant properties. However, the pull toward some sort of distinction along dualist lines is strong, as testified, one may think, by Armstrong’s above-mentioned recognition of second-class properties.

6. Identity Conditions

What are the identity conditions for properties? An answer would give us necessary and sufficient conditions for the properties x and y to be one and the same property. In other words, it would tell us how finely individuated properties are. We find a spectrum of options on this matter.

  • Infra-coarse: Properties with the same extension are the same properties. This claim might perhaps be associated with Frege, if one identifies his referents of predicates (‘concepts’) with properties. But all contemporary property theories reject this view.

  • Medium coarse: Properties are identical just in case they necessarily have the same extension (the precise import of this condition depends on which notion of necessity is at play). This seems to transpose the identity conditions for sets into an appropriately intensional key, and this is precisely how identity conditions for properties work in accounts that treat them as intensions (as functions from possible worlds to sets of objects therein) (Montague 1974). Bealer also views this as the identity condition for his type II properties. Although necessary coextension may be the most-discussed candidate identity condition for properties, many realists reject it because it doesn’t comport well with the explanations they want to develop. On the one hand, this proposal is in tension with the idea that necessarily coextensive properties may be distinct since they can confer different causal powers on their instances (Sober 1982 contains a strong argument that this can happen, though the jury is probably still out on this issue). On the other hand, in semantics we need properties that are individuated much more finely than the necessary-coextension condition allows.

  • Medium Fine: Properties are identical just in case they confer the same causal or, more generally, the same nomological powers on their instances. This view has been endorsed by various philosophers who work primarily in scientific ontology (see §7.18).

  • Ultra-fine: Properties are individuated almost as finely as the linguistic expressions that express them. Thus, for example, even red and square and square and red are different properties. This conception is typically developed in the context of a rich formal theory of properties that allows for complex properties built up from simpler ones by means of operations such as negation, conjunction, etc. A natural way to proceed in this approach is to develop an account of the analysis of a property and to hold that properties are identical just in case they have the same analysis (cf. Bealer’s (1982) account of type I properties; Menzel 1993). This view seems to offer the kind of properties needed in semantics, once one realizes that properties conceived of as intensions are not fine-grained enough to account, e.g., for belief sentences. The ultra-fine-grained properties are then often called ‘hyperintensional.’ Suited as they may be for semantics, hyperintensional properties however also raise certain difficult questions. For example, what is the difference between the property being red and square and the distinct property being square and red, and what allows us to link the right complex predicate (say ‘is red and square’) to the right property (being red and square) rather than to the wrong one (being square and red)? If properties literally had parts corresponding to the parts of the linguistic expression, an answer could be forthcoming, but few philosophers are willing to admit this. We will return briefly to such matters in §8.

An alternative way to offer identity conditions for properties is available to those philosophers who admit two modes of predication (see §1.1). This alternative has been developed by Zalta (1983; 1988). On this account, two properties are identical just in case they are encoded by the same abstract objects. Thus, properties that necessarily have the same encoding extensions are identical, but properties that necessarily have the same exemplification extensions may be distinct. To see the difference, note that the property of being a round square and the property of being a round triangle necessarily have the same exemplification extension. This approach has the virtue of expressing the identity conditions for properties in terms of one of their most fundamental features, namely that they are predicable entities. The price is that it requires us to hold that there are two modes of predication and abstract objects. Moreover, since abstract objects are identified via the properties that they encode, one may suspect that there is some dangerous circularity in providing identity conditions for properties in terms of abstract objects (Greimann 2003). An appeal to Gupta and Belnap’s theory of circular definitions may be of interest here.

7. Kinds of Properties

Most realists agree that there are various sorts of properties, and in this section we will review the main kinds of properties they have proposed. But many realists are also selective; they believe that some, but not all, of these kinds of properties exist. Indeed, almost none of the putative kinds of properties discussed here is accepted by all realists, but to avoid constant qualifications (like ‘putative kind of property’) we will present each sort of property as though it were unproblematic.

7.1 First-order vs. Higher-order Properties

The first set of issues we will examine involve the most fundamental logical or structural features of properties. We will begin with a picture of a hierarchy of properties arranged according to order (or level). First-order properties and relations are those that can only be instantiated by individuals. For example, redness can be instantiated by apples and cherries and being married to can be jointly instantiated by Bill and Hillary, but no properties can be red or married. It is natural to suppose, however, that at least many first-order properties and relations can themselves have properties and relations. For example, redness might be thought to exemplify the property of being a color and being married to might be thought to exemplify the property of being a symmetrical relation. Once we think of second-order properties, it is natural to wonder whether there are third-order properties (properties of second- or, perhaps in cumulative fashion, of second- and first-order properties), and so on up through ever-higher orders. This metaphysical picture finds a formal parallel in higher-order logics, wherein predicate variables of different orders can be bound by quantifiers.

Realists differ over which niches in this proposed hierarchy of orders are occupied. Proponents of the empirical conception of properties will hold that it is an empirical question whether there are second- or fourth- or fifty-seventh-order properties. The issue for them is likely to be whether putative higher-order properties confer any causal powers over and above those already conferred by lower-order properties. But it is also possible to have less empirically motivated views about which parts of the hierarchy are occupied.

Elementarism (Bergmann 1968) is the view that there are first-order properties but no properties of any higher order. There are first-order properties like various shades of red, but there is no higher-order property (like being a color) that such properties share nor are they related by any higher-order relations (like being darker than).

Elementarism has sometimes been defended by appealing to something like Russell’s principle of acquaintance, understood as the tenet that only things with which we are acquainted should be thought to exist, together with the claim that we are acquainted with first-order properties but not with those of any higher orders. To the extent that first-order properties are able to perform all of the tasks that properties are called on to do, elementarism could also be defended on grounds of parsimony. But it is now widely acknowledged, even by minimalists, that at the very least some higher-order relations are needed to confer structure on first-order properties.

7.2 Typed Properties

The discovery of his paradox (and then the awareness of related puzzles) led Russell to introduce a theory of types which institutes a total ban on self-exemplification by a strict segregation of properties into levels that he called ‘types’ (cf. Copi 1971). Actually his account involves a distinction of types and orders and is thus more complex and restrictive than this. More details can be found in the entry on Russell’s paradox (for a detailed reconstruction of how Russell reacted to the paradox, cf. Landini 1998).

7.3 Untyped Properties

Type theory has never gained unanimous consensus and its many problematic aspects are well-known (see, e.g., Fitch 1952, Appendix C; Bealer 1989). Just to mention a few, the type-theoretical hierarchy imposed on properties appears to be highly artificial and multiplies properties ad infinitum (e.g., since presumably properties are abstract, for any property P of type n, there is an abstractness of type n+1 that P exemplifies). Moreover, many cases of self-exemplification are innocuous and common (at least for realists who are not minimalists or conservative centrists). For example, the property of being a property is itself a property, so it exemplifies itself. There also seem to be transcendental relations. A transcendental relation like thinks about is one that can relate quite different types of things: Hans can think about Vienna and he can think about triangularity. But typed theories cannot accommodate transcendental properties without several epicycles.

Several recent accounts are thus type-free and treat properties as entities that can exemplify themselves. From this perspective, the picture of a hierarchy of levels is fundamentally misguided, if it is interpreted too rigidly; there are simply properties (which can be exemplified—in many cases by other properties, even by themselves) and individuals (which cannot be exemplified). One challenge here is to develop formal accounts that allow as much self-exemplification as possible without teetering over the brink into paradox (see §8).

7.4 Relations

What we now usually regard as genuine multi-place relations were not recognized as such by philosophers for quite a long time, or so it seems. Apparently, Aristotle and the Scholastics found no place for genuine irreducible relations in their ontology (see the entry on medieval theories of relations) and Leibniz is usually viewed as a philosopher who, in line with this tradition, tries to show effectively how relations can be reduced to monadic properties (Mugnai 1992). An accurate analysis of Leibniz’s technical use of expressions such as ‘insofar as’ (‘quatenus’) and ‘by the same token’ (‘et eo ipso’) in sentences such as ‘Paris loves and by the same token Helen is beloved’ suggests, however, that he did acknowledge somehow the existence of irreducibly relational facts (Orilia 2000a). Be this as it may, it was not before the second half of the 19th century (with the work of De Morgan, Schroeder, Peirce and, somewhat later, Russell) that irreducible relations began to be generally acknowledged. Some philosophers still hold that relations are reducible to properties in that they supervene on the monadic properties of their relata in a very strong sense that shows that relations are not actually real (some trope theorists hold this view; it is defended at length in Fisk 1972). But no one has been able to show that all relations do supervene on monadic properties, and there are strong reasons for thinking that at least some sorts of relations, e.g., spatio-temporal ones, do not. The view that there are relations but no monadic properties, or at least that the former have ontological priority over the latter, has also been considered. It is defended in different forms by Dipert 1997 and by various authors in the context of ontic structural realism (see, e.g., French & Ladyman 2003, Esfeld 2003 and §6 of the entry on structural realism). This view is far, however, from having gained some consensus (Ainsworth 2010). In sum, all in all most contemporary realists hold that there are both genuine monadic properties and genuine relations. (see, however, Marmodoro & Yates forthcoming, a collection of papers most of which deal in depth with all these issues).

In standard first-order logic predicates come with a fixed degree and in line with this relations are usually taken to have a fixed degree themselves (on abundant conceptions of properties, there are relations of every finite number of argument places, but on sparse conceptions it is an empirical question whether there are relations of any particular degree). In contrast with this, however, many natural language predicates appear to be multigrade or variably polyadic; they can be true of various numbers of things. For example, the predicate ‘robbed a bank together’ is true of Bonnie and Clyde, Ma Barker and her two boys, Patti Hearst and three members of the Symbionese Liberation Army, and so on. Multigrade predicates are very common (e.g., ‘work well together,’ ‘conspired to commit murder,’ ‘are lovers’). Moreover, there is a kind of inference, called ‘argument deletion,’ that also suggests that many predicates that prima facie could be assigned a certain fixed degree are in fact multigrade. For example, ‘John is eating a cake’ suggests that ‘is eating’ is dyadic, but since, by argument deletion, it entails ‘John is eating,’ one could at least tentatively conclude that ‘eating’ is also monadic and thus multigrade. Often one can resist the conclusion that there are multigrade predicates by resorting to one stratagem or another. For example, it could be said that ‘John is eating’ is simply short for ‘John is eating something.’ But it seems hard to find a systematic and convincing strategy that allows us to maintain that natural language predicates have a fixed degree. This has motivated the construction of logical languages that feature multigrade predicates in order to provide a more appropriate formal account of natural language (Gandy 1976; Graves 1993; Orilia 2000a; the latter two show that this can be done by appealing to thematic roles). Although any leap from language to ontology must be handled with care, all this suggests that relations, or at least some of them, are variably polyadic. Turning to naturalistic ontology, some support for this conclusion comes from the ingenious treatment of measurement in Mundy (1990), which is based on multigrade relations. In sum, it seems that a truly flexible account of properties should abandon not only the restrictive hierarchy of types but also the constraint that all properties come with a fixed number of argument places.

Relations pose a special problem, that of explaining from a very general, ontological, point of view the nature of the difference between states of affairs, such as Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard, that at least prima facie involve exactly the same constituents, namely a non-symmetric relation and two other items (loving, Abelard, and Eloise, in our example). Such states of affairs are often said to differ in ‘relational order’ or in the ‘differential application’ of the non-symmetric relation in question, and the problem then is that of characterizing what this relational order or differential application amounts to. Russell (1903, §218) attributed an enormous importance to this issue and has attacked it repeatedly. In spite of this, until a few years ago, only a small number of other philosophers have confronted it systematically (e.g., Bergmann 1992; Hochberg 1987) and their efforts have been pretty much neglected. However, Fine (2000) has forcefully brought the issue on the agenda of ontologists and proposed a novel approach that has received some attention. Fine identifies a standard and a positionalist view (analogous to two views defended by Russell at different times (1903; 1984); cf. Orilia 2008). According to the former, relations are intrinsically endowed with a ‘direction,’ which allows us to distinguish, e.g., loving and being loved: Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard differ, because they involve two relations that differ in direction (e.g., the former involves loving and the latter being loved). According to the latter, relations have different ‘positions’ that can somehow host relata: Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard differ, because the two positions of the very same loving relation are differently occupied (by Abelard and Eloise in one case and by Eloise and Abelard in the other case). Fine goes on to propose and endorse an alternative, ‘anti-positionalist’ standpoint, according to which, relations have neither direction nor positions. The literature on this issue keeps growing and there are now various proposals on the market, including attempts to rescue positionalism from Fine’s criticism, and primitivism, according to which differential application cannot be analyzed (see the entry on relations for details).

7.5 Propositions

In ancient and medieval times propositions were not seen as a special kind of property and many contemporary philosophers who focus on physical ontology or philosophy of mathematics do not regard propositions as a kind of property (many of them doubt that there are any such things). But some, especially those who work on the semantics of natural language, often postulate the existence of propositions, noting that we can think of them as a limiting case of a property (see, e.g., Bealer 1982 and Van Inwagen 2015). Consider a two-place property like loves and think of plugging one of its open places up with Darla to obtain the one-place property loves Darla. If we can do this, it is sometimes argued, then we can plug the remaining (last) open place up with Sam to get the zero-place property, or proposition, that Sam loves Darla.

7.6 Structured vs. Unstructured Properties

Some philosophers (e.g., Grossman 1983, §§58–61) argue that all properties are simple. Others argue that there is a distinction between simple properties and compound properties, that some compound properties exist, and that they have a structure that involves or incorporates simpler properties.In one way of looking at this matter the compound properties result from simpler ones by means of logical connectives such as negation, disjunctions and conjunctions (or ontological counterparts thereof). Logical aspects of this conception are discussed below in the section on formal theories of properties. But the issue is also ontological and has to do with whether or not we have reasons for postulating such complex properties in explanations such as those discussed in §§3 and 4. A well-known inquiry on this comes from Armstrong (1978a, 1997), who ends up with a mixed stance: acceptance of conjunctive properties and rejection of disjunctive and negative ones. Those who abide by a sparse conception of properties typically demurs about the former and follow him regarding the latter. The issue is however extremely controversial and can be taken up from different perspectives; for example, rather than simply denying that there are negative properties, one could try and argue that they are less real than positive ones (Zangwill 2011). Armstrong (1978a, 1997) also admits structured properties that cannot be straightforwardly understood in terms of logical connectives. They are instantiated by an object, when it has appropriately arranged parts that instantiate simpler properties. For example, that methane is exemplified by a certain molecule depends on the molecule having parts instantiating carbon and hydrogen. Lewis (1986a) has argued that the very idea of a structured property of this kind is incoherent, but there are rejoinders that propose different ways of making sense of it (Wetzel 2009; Hawley 2010; Davis 2014).

7.7 Tensed Properties

In the philosophy of time (see the entry on time) there is a growing interest in presentism, the view according to which whatevever exists is present. Presentists have the problem of providing truthmakers for true statements about the past, e.g., that Caesar crossed the Rubicon. In an effort to tackle these problems many presentists have appealed to tensed properties or relations (Bigelow 1996; Brogaard 2006), which can be expressed only by making an essential use of tenses. For example, according to Bigelow, there is the property being such that Caesar crossed the Rubicon, which the universe as a whole exemplifies now, despite the fact that neither Caesar nor the event of his crossing the Rubicon exist.

7.8 Sortal vs. non-sortal Properties

Some properties, typically expressed by count nouns like ‘table’ and ‘cat,’ provide counting principles, or principles of identity, in the sense that they allow us to count objects. For example, the properties of being a table and being a cat are properties of this kind; there are definite facts of the matter as to how many tables are in the kitchen and how many cats are on those tables. They have been called sortal universals (by Strawson (1959, Ch. 5, §2) and particularizing universals (by Armstrong (1978, Ch. 11, §4), but the ideas involved here have a long history. Strawson borrows the word ‘sortal’ from Locke, and at least some sortal properties correspond closely to Aristotle’s secondary substances. There seem to be also sortal properties of events, e.g., intervention and bombing.

Sortal properties are naturally contrasted with characterizing properties, typically expressed by adjectives like ‘red’ and ‘triangular.’ Characterizing properties, like redness and triangularity, do not divide the world up into a definite number of things. To the extent that a property like redness allows us to count red things, it is because we are relying on the umbrella count noun ‘thing’ to help with the count. Sortal properties may also be contrasted with mass properties, like water, gold, and furniture. They apply to stuff and thus, like characterizing properties, do not divide the world up into definite numbers of things.

7.9 Genus and Species

Although the notions of genus and species play a relatively small role in contemporary metaphysics, they figured prominently in Aristotle’s philosophy and in the many centuries of work inspired by it. When we construe these notions as properties (rather than as linguistic expressions), a genus is a general property and a species is a more specific subtype of it. The distinction is typically thought to be a relative one: being a mammal is a species relative to the genus being an animal, but it is a genus relative to the species being a donkey. It has usually been assumed that in such chains there is a top-most, absolute genus, and a bottom-most, absolute species.

It was traditionally supposed that a species could be uniquely specified or defined in terms of a genus and a differentia. For example, the property being a human is completely determined by the properties being an animal (genus) and being rational (differentia). It is difficult, by today’s lights, to draw a principled distinction between genera and differentiae, but the idea that species properties are compound, conjunctive properties remains a natural one. For example, the property of being a human might be identified with the conjunctive property being an animal and being rational. But it is now rarely assumed, as it was for many centuries, that all compound properties are conjunctive.

7.10 Determinables and Determinates

The concepts of determinables and determinates were popularized by the Cambridge philosopher W. E. Johnson. Properties like color and shape are determinables, while more specific versions of these properties (like redness and octagonality) are determinates. Similarly, rest mass and rest mass of 3 kilograms are a determinable and a determinate, respectively. Like the distinction between genus and species, the distinction between determinables and determinates is a relative one; redness is a determinate with respect to color but a determinable with respect to specific shades of red. But determinates are not definable in terms of a determinable and a differentia; indeed, they are not conjunctive properties of any obvious sort. The distinction between determinables and determinates has played a larger role in recent metaphysics than the more venerable distinction between genus and species. See the entry on determinates vs. determinables for more details.

7.11 Natural Kinds

Though not all view natural kinds as properties, for many philosophers they are important properties that carve nature at its joints (Campbell et al. 2011). Paradigms include the property of being a specific sort of elementary particle (e.g., the property of being a neutron), chemical elements (e.g., the property of being gold), and biological species (e.g., the property of being a jackal). Natural kinds are often contrasted with artificial kinds (e.g., being a central processing unit). The chief issue here is whether there are any natural kinds or whether our classifications are primarily a matter of cultural and linguistic conventions that represent just one of many ways of classifying things (so that joints are a result of the way that we happen to carve things up).

In recent years a good deal of work has been done on the ontology of natural kinds and the semantics of natural kind terms (involving such issues as whether they are rigid designators), as can be seen from the entry on natural kinds.

7.12 Purely Qualitative Properties

Some properties involve or incorporate particulars. The properties of being identical with Harry and being in love with Harry involve Harry. Even those who think that lots of properties exist necessarily often believe that non-qualitative properties like these are contingent; they depend upon Harry, and they only exist in circumstances in which he exists. By contrast, purely qualitative properties (like being a unit negative charge or being in love) do not involve individuals in this way. The distinction between properties that are purely qualitative and those that are not is usually easy to draw in practice, but a precise characterization of it is elusive.

7.13 Essential Properties and Internal Relations

Essential properties are contrasted with accidental properties, properties that things just happen, quite contingently, to have (see the entry on essential vs. accidental properties). My car is red, but it could have been blue (had I painted it), so its color is an accidental property. In contrast, it is sometimes suggested, natural kinds provide examples of essential properties; for instance, being human is an essential property of Saul Kripke (although some acknowledge natural kinds without taking them to be essential properties). According to some philosophers, there are also individual essences, essential properties that characterize individuals univocally (Plantinga 1974). According to tradition, an essential property of an individual is so defined: it is such that, necessarily, if that individual exists, then it has the property in question. Fine (1994) criticizes this conception by noting that, for example, Socrates cannot exist without the property of being a member of the singleton of Socrates, and yet this property seems to have nothing to do with his essence. He then takes the notion of being an essential property as primitive.

Internal relations are usually understood as the relational analogues of essential (monadic) properties. For example, if a bears the relation R to b, then R internally relates a to b just in case, necessarily, if they both exist, then a bears this relation to b. Relations that are not internal, that contingently link their relata, are external. See the entry on relations for details.

7.14 Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

Some properties are instantiated by individuals because of the relations they bear to other things. For example, the property being married is instantiated by Bill Clinton because he is married to Hillary Clinton. Such properties are sometimes called extrinsic or relational properties. Objects have them because of their relations to other things. By contrast, intrinsic or non-relational properties are properties that a thing has quite independently of its relationships to other things. See the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties for details.

7.15 Primary vs. Secondary Properties

The distinction between primary and secondary properties goes back to the Greek atomists. It lay dormant for centuries, but was revived by Galileo, Descartes, Boyle, Locke, and others during the seventeenth century. Locke’s influence is so pervasive that such properties still often go under the names he gave them, primary and secondary qualities. The intuitive idea is that primary properties are objective features of the world; on many accounts they are also fundamental properties that explain why things have the other properties that they do. Early lists of kinds of primary properties included shape, size, and (once Newton’s influence was absorbed) mass. Today we might add charge, spin or the four-vectors of special relativity. By contrast, secondary properties somehow depend on the mind; standard lists of secondary properties include colors, tastes, sounds, and smells.

7.16 Supervenient and Emergent Properties

Supervenience is sometimes taken to be a relationship between two fragments of language (e.g., between psychological vocabulary and physical vocabulary), but it is increasingly viewed as a relationship between pairs of families of properties. To say that psychological properties supervene on physical properties, for example, is to say that, necessarily, everything that has any psychological properties also has physical properties and any two things that have exactly the same physical properties will have exactly the same psychological properties. There are no differences in psychological properties without some difference in physical properties. Supervenient properties are sometimes distinguished from emergent properties.

7.17 Linguistic Types

It is commonplace to contrast linguistic types and tokens. For example, the word ‘dog,’ qua abstract repeatable entity, is a type, but any concrete written or oral realization of it is a token. Admittedly, it is typical to attribute properties to a linguistic type, e.g. being short to the word ‘dog’, but not to attribute the type to one of its tokens; we do not normally say, e.g., that ‘dog’ is possessed by a concrete ink-made mark that we see on a piece of paper. Hence, some may resist the idea that linguistic types are properties whose instances are linguistic tokens. Yet, it is a quite natural view, and if one follows it, such properties should seemingly be conceived of as possibly structured, since words and sentences have parts (Wetzel 2009; Davis 2014).

7.18 Categorical Properties vs. Causal Powers

In naturalistic ontology, one can see two conceptions of properties at play: properties as powers or dispositions to act or being acted upon, and properties as categorical or manifest qualities, mere ways in which objects happen to be. It seems clear that having a property often amounts to having a certain causal power and in some cases the only informative things we can say about a property are what powers (capacities) it confers on its instances. For example, the things we know about determinate charges have to do with the active and passive powers they confer on particles that instantiate them, their effects on the electromagnetic fields surrounding them, and the like. In the light of examples such as this, some philosophers have urged that all properties are causal powers (e.g., Achinstein 1974; Armstrong 1978, ch. 16; Shoemaker 1984, chs. 10 and 11; Hawthorne 2001; Bird 2005, 2007; see Tugby 2013 for an attempt to argue from this sort of view to a Platonist conception of properties). In such an extreme view the very distinction between having a power (which might not be exercised) and manifesting it is lost and thus Martin (1993) and Armstrong (2005), while maintaining that all properties bestow causal powers, thereby having a ‘dispositional side,’ acknowledge that they also have a ‘qualitative side.’ Martin (1997) and Heil (2003) have proposed to understand the relation between these two sides as identity, but Armstrong demurs (2005, 315) and prefers an account in terms of his own N-relation theory of natural laws. Supporters of the idea that properties and powers must go hand in hand keep flourishing: Yates (2013) relies on Kit Fine’s (1994) essentialism to explain how bestowing powers is essential to properties and Ingthorsson (2013) assays how properties can be both qualitative and dispositional.

Some philosophers, however, insist that there must be categorical properties irreducible to powers (Ellis 2001, 2010; Molnar 2003). Bird (2005) has disparagingly called such categorical properties ‘quiddities,’ and argued that they would be unknowable and indistiguishable from one another, but Ellis (2010) has responded that properties that we would intuitively regard as categorical, such as ‘shape, size, orientation, speed, handedness, direction, angular separation,’ can be recognized via ‘common patterns of spatio-temporal relations’ and thus after all ‘there is nothing wrong with quiddities.’

8. Formal Theories of Properties

Formal property theories are formal systems that aim at formulating ‘general noncontingent laws that deal with properties’ (Bealer & Mönnich 1989, 133). They thus allow for terms corresponding to properties, in particular variables that are meant to range over properties and that can be quantified over. This can be achieved in two ways. Either (option 1; Cocchiarella 1986) the terms standing for properties are predicates or (option 2; cf. Bealer 1982) such terms are subject terms that can be linked to other subject terms by a special predicate that is meant to express a predication relation (let us use ‘pred’) pretty much as in standard set theory a special predicate, ‘∈’, is used to express the membership relation. To illustrate, given the former option, an assertion such as ‘there is a property that both John and Mary have’ can be rendered as ‘∃P(P(j) & P(m))’. Given the second option, it can be rendered as ‘∃x(pred(x,j) & pred(x,m))’. (The two options can somehow be combined as in Menzel 1986; see Menzel 1993 for further discussion).

Whatever option one follows, in spelling out such theories one typically postulates a rich realm of properties. Traditionally, this is done by a so-called comprehension principle which, intuitively, asserts that, for any well-formed formula (‘wff’) A, with n free variables, x1, …, xn, there is a corresponding n-adic property. Following option 1, it goes as follows:

(CP) ∃Rnx1…∀xn(Rn(x1,…,xn)↔A).

Alternatively, one can use a variable-binding operator, λ, that, given an open wff, generates a term (called a ‘lambda abstract’) that is meant to stand for a property. This way to proceed is more flexible and is followed in the most recent versions of property theory. We will thus stick to it in the following. To illustrate, we can apply ‘λ’ to the open formula, ‘R(x) & S(x)’ to form the one-place complex predicate ‘[λx(R(x) & S(x))]’; if ‘R’ denotes being red and ‘S’ denotes being square, then this complex predicate denotes the compound, conjunctive property being red and square. Similarly, we can apply the operator to the open formula ‘∃y(L(x,y))’ to form the one-place predicate ‘[λxy(L(x,y))]’; if ‘L’ stands for loves, this complex predicate denotes the compound property loving someone (whereas ‘[λyx(L(x,y))]’ would denote being loved by someone). To ensure that lambda abstracts designate the intended property, one should assume a ‘principle of lambda conversion.’ Given option 1, it can be stated thus:

(λ-conv) [λx1xnA](t1, …, tn) ↔ A(x1/t1, …, xn/tn).

A(x1/t1, …, xn/tn) is the wff resulting from simultaneously replacing each xi in A with ti (for 1 ≤ in), provided ti is free for xi in A.) For example, given this principle, [λx(R(x) & S(x))](j) is the case if and only if R(j) & S(j) is also the case, as it should be.

Standard second-order logic allows for predicate variables bound by quantifiers. Hence, to the extent that these variables are taken to range over properties, this system could be seen as a formal theory of properties. Its expressive power is however limited, since it does not allow for subject terms that stand for properties. Thus, for example, one cannot even say of a property F that F = F. This is a serious limitation if one want a formal tool for a realm of properties whose laws one is trying to explore. Standard higher order logics beyond the second order obviate this limitation by allowing for predicates in subject position, provided that the predicates that are predicated of them belong to a higher type. This presupposes a grammar in which predicates are assigned types of increasing levels, which can be taken to mean that the properties themselves, for which the predicates stand for, are arranged in a hierarchy of types. Thus, such logics appropriate one version or another of the type theory concocted by Russell to tame his own paradox and related conundrums. If a predicate can be predicated of another predicate only if the former is of a type higher than the latter, then self-predication is banished and Russell’s paradox cannot even be formulated. Following this line, we can construct a type-theoretical formal property theory. The simple theory of types, as presented, e.g., in Copi 1971, can be seen as a prototypical version of such a property theory (if we neglect the principle of extensionality assumed by Copi). A type-theoretical approach is also followed in the property theory embedded in Zalta’s (1983) theory of abstract objects.

However, for reasons sketched in §7.3, type theory is hardly satisfactory. Accordingly, many type-free versions of property theory have been developed over the years. Of course, without type-theoretical constraints, given (λ-conv) and classical logic (CL), paradoxes such as Russell’s immediately follow (to see this, consider this instance of (λ-conv): [λx ~x(x)]([λx ~x(x)]) ↔ ~[λx ~x(x)]([λx ~x(x)])). In formal systems where abstract singular terms or predicates may (but need not) denote properties (cf. Swoyer 1998), formal counterparts of (complex) predicates like ‘being a property that does not exemplify itself’ (formally, ‘[λx ~x(x)]’) could exist in the object language without denoting properties; from this perspective, Russell’s paradox would merely show that such predicates do not stand for properties. But we would like to have general criteria to decide when a predicate stands for a property and when it does not. Moreover, one may wonder what gives these predicates any significance at all if they do not stand for properties. There are then motivations for building type-free property theories in which all predicates stand for properties. We can distinguish two main strands of them: those that weaken CL and those that circumscribe (λ-conv) (some of the proposals to be mentioned below are formulated in relation to set theory, but can be easily translated into proposals for property theory).

An early example of the former approach was offered in a 1937 paper by the Russian logician D. A. Bochvar (Bochvar 1981), where the principle of excluded middle is sacrificed as a consequence of the adoption of what is now known as Kleene’s weak three-valued scheme. An interesting recent attempt based on giving up excluded middle is Field 2004. A rather radical alternative proposal is to embrace a paraconsistent logic and give up the principle of non-contradiction (Priest 2006). A different way of giving up classical logic is followed by Fitch, Prawitz and Tennant, who in practice give up the transitivity of logical consequence (see Rogerson 2007, for a recent analysis of these attempts). The problem with all these approaches is whether their underlying logic is strong enough for all the intended applications of property theory, in particular to natural language semantics and the foundations of mathematics.

As for the second strand (based on circumcribing (λ-conv)), it has been proposed to read the axioms of a standard set theory such as ZFC, minus extensionality, as if they were about properties rather than sets (Schock 1969; Bealer 1982; Jubien 1989). The problem with this is that these axioms, understood as talking about sets, can be motivated by the iterative conception of sets, but they seem rather ad hoc when understood as talking about properties (Cocchiarella 1985). An alternative can be found in Cocchiarella 1986, where (λ-conv) is circumscribed by adapting to properties the notion of stratification used by Quine for sets. This approach is however subject to a version of Russell’s paradox derivable from contingent but intuitively possible facts (Orilia 1996) and to a paradox of hyperintensionality (Bozon 2004) (see Landini 2009 and Cocchiarella 2009 for a discussion of both). Orilia 2000 has proposed another strategy for circumscribing (λ-conv), based on applying to exemplification Gupta’s and Belnap’s theory of circular definitions.

Independently of the paradoxes (Bealer & Mönnich 1989, 198 ff.), there is the issue of providing identity conditions for properties, specifying when it is the case that two properties are identical. If one thinks of properties as meanings of natural language predicates and tries to account for intensional contexts, one will be inclined to assume rather fine-grained identity conditions, possibly even allowing that [λx(R(x) & S(x))] and [λx(S(x) & R(x))] are distinct. Presumably it will be at least maintained that two notational variants such as ‘[λx(R(x) & S(x))]’ and ‘[λy(R(y) & S(y))]’ stand for the same property. On the other hand, if one thinks of properties as causally operative entities in the physical world, one will want to provide rather coarse-grained identity conditions. For instance, one might at least require that [λx A] and [λx B] are the same property if it is contingent that it is physically necessary that ∀x(AB) (although one will have to digest the idea that the identity [λx A] = [λx B] is only contingently true, if it is physically necessary that ∀x(AB)). Bealer 1982 tries to combine the two approaches (see also Bealer & Mönnich 1989).

Formal systems of property theory are often provided with an algebraic semantics that associates primitive predicative terms of the language with ‘basic’ properties and the lambda abstracts with complex properties obtained from the basic ones by means of operations that generate new properties from given ones (Bealer 1973, 1982; McMichael & Zalta 1981; Leeds 1978; Menzel 1986; Swoyer 1998; Zalta 1983). Thus, for example, one assumes that there is an operation, &, that maps each pair of properties, P and Q, to the conjunctive property P & Q. If ‘P’ and ‘Q’ stand for P and Q, respectively, then ‘[λx(P(x) & Q(x))]’ will stand for P & Q. For another example, it is typically assumed that there is an operation, PLUG1, that, given a two-place relation R and an object d, generates the monadic property PLUG1(R,d). If ‘R’ and ‘d’ denote R and d, respectively, then the property PLUG1(R,d) will be denoted by the lambda term ‘[λx R(d,x)].’ The property in question is the one that something has when d bears the relation R to it.

This way of talking certainly suggests that there are complex, structured properties that really have ‘parts’ or constituents pretty much like the linguistic expressions that we use to speak about them. However, although some philosophers are willing to take this road (Armstrong (1978, 36–39, 67f), Bigelow and Pargetter 1989; Orilia 1998), many others (Bealer 1982; Cocchiarella 1986) believe that the appearance that some properties are literally structured is an artifact of our use of structured terms to denote them. But our use of structured terms and structural metaphors doesn’t mean that the properties themselves are genuinely structured or that they literally have parts (Swoyer 1998, §1.2).


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Other Internet Resources


In July 2011, Francesco Orilia became a coauthor on this entry and revised the previous version of this entry by Chris Swoyer. Orilia wishes to thank Laura Celani and Michele Paolini Paoletti for their help in revising the bibliography for the 2011 and 2016 updates, respectively. Orilia also thanks the following people for providing useful comments and suggestions: Christopher von Bülow (on the 2011 update), Donald Baxter, Michele Paolini Paoletti, and especially Gideon Rosen (on the 2016 update).

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Francesco Orilia <>
Chris Swoyer

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