First published Tue Jan 26, 2010; substantive revision Thu Oct 8, 2020

In the accounts we give of one another, claims about our abilities appear to be indispensable. Some abilities are so widespread that many who have them take them for granted, such as the ability to walk, or to write one’s name, or to tell a hawk from a handsaw. Others are comparatively rare and notable, such as the ability to hit a Major League fastball, or to compose a symphony, or to tell an elm from a beech. In either case, however, when we ascribe such abilities to one another we have the impression that we are making claims that, whether they are worth saying or not, are at least sometimes true. The impression of truth exerts a pressure towards giving a philosophical theory of ability. It is not an option, at least at the outset, to dismiss all our talk of ability as fiction or outright falsehood. A theory of ability can be reasonably expected to say what it is to have an ability in a way that vindicates the appearance of truth. Such a theory will deserve the name ‘philosophical’ insofar as it gives an account, not of this or that range of abilities, but of abilities generally.

This article falls into three parts. The first part, Sections 1 and 2, states a framework for discussing philosophical theories of ability. Section 1 will say more about the distinction between abilities and other powers of agents and objects. Section 2 will make some formal distinctions that are helpful for framing any theory of ability. The second part, Sections 3–5, surveys theories of ability that have been defended in the philosophical literature. Section 3 concerns the most prominent kind of theory, on which abilities are to be understood in terms of a hypothetical relating an agent’s actions to her volitions. Section 4 concerns theories that are not hypothetical in this way, but that nonetheless retain the basic reductive orientation of hypothetical theories. Section 5 then discusses various alternative theories of ability that have been proposed in the recent literature. The third part, Section 6, turns to the relationship between a theory of ability and the free will debates. Such debates often involve claims about agents’ abilities, and many have hoped that getting clearer on abilities themselves could resolve, or at least shed light on, such debates. The aim of this last section will be to assess whether these hopes are reasonable ones.

1. A taxonomy

What is an ability? On one reading, this question is a demand for a theory of ability of the sort described above. On another reading, however, this question simply asks for a rough guide to what sort of things we are speaking of when we speak of ‘abilities’. So understood, this question is not asking for a theory of ability, but for an explanation of what exactly a theory of ability would be a theory of. This section will offer an answer to this question on this second, more modest, reading.

1.1 Dispositions and other powers

It will be helpful to begin by considering a topic that is related to, but nominally distinct from, abilities: dispositions.

Dispositions are, at first pass, those properties picked out by predicates like ‘is fragile’ or ‘is soluble’, or alternatively by sentences of the form ‘x is disposed to break when struck’ or ‘x is disposed to dissolve when placed in water.’ Dispositions so understood have figured centrally in the metaphysics and philosophy of science of the last century (Carnap 1936 & 1937, Goodman 1954), and also in influential accounts of the mind (Ryle 1949). They are like abilities in many significant respects, in particular in the fact that they are properties of things that can exist even when not manifested: as a glass may be fragile even when it is not broken, so may a person have the ability to raise her arm even when she is not raising her arm.

While dispositions have been central to contemporary philosophical discussions, they do not exhaust the range of the possibilities inherent in things. Especially notable, for present purposes, are those that are intimately connected to agency. These include the susceptibility of things to be acted on in certain ways — such as the edibility of an apple, or the walkability of a trail — that the psychologist J.J. Gibson called affordances (Gibson, 1979). These include also the powers of action that we ascribe to things, of the kind observed by Thomas Reid: ‘Thus we say, the wind blows, the sea rages, the sun rises and sets, bodies gravitate and move’ (Reid 1788/2010, 16; Reid himself regarded these locutions as "misapplications" of active verbs, based on erroneous views of the grounds of powers). Finally, and crucially, these include the powers of agents themselves.

In light of this ontological diversity, it will be useful to have a term that encompasses all the possibilities inherent in things and in agents. Let us reserve the word ‘power’ for that general class. Dispositions, as defined above, are a proper subset of powers more generally. Affordances, as sketched above, are another one. And abilities, in a sense still to be defined, are yet another.

It may yet be that dispositions are especially privileged among the powers. For instance, they might be more fundamental than the other powers, in the sense that other powers may be reduced to them. It has been proposed, for instance, that affordances may be reduced to dispositions (Scarantino 2003). And we will consider in some detail, in Section 5.1, the proposal that abilities themselves may be reduced to dispositions. But our initial hypothesis is that dispositions are simply one member of the broader family of powers, albeit one that has received a great measure of attention in the philosophical literature.

1.2 Demarcating abilities

Abilities, then, are a kind of power. What kind of power, precisely, is an ability? As the term will be understood here, there are two additional conditions that a power must meet in order for it to be an ability. First, abilities are distinguished by their subjects. Abilities are properties of agents, rather than of things that are not agents. Objects have dispositions and affordances — as a glass is disposed to break when struck, or affords the drinking of liquid — but they do not have abilities. Being a power of an agent is not, however, a sufficient condition for being an ability. This is because agents have powers that are not abilities. Therefore, second, abilities need to be distinguished by their objects: abilities relate agents to actions.

Some examples may make the need for this second condition clear. Some powers, though properties of agents, do not intuitively involve any relation to action. Consider the power of understanding language. Understanding a sentence, while it is not wholly passive or arational, is not typically an action. In contrast, speaking a sentence is. Thus the power to understand French will not be an ability, on the present taxonomy. In contrast the power to speak French will be an ability, since it involves a relation to action. (See van Inwagen 1983, 8–13.)

So, as the term will be understood here, an ability is a power that relates an agent to an action. This way of demarcating abilities, while serviceable for our purposes, is not unproblematic. For it inherits the problems involved in drawing the distinction between actions and non-actions. First, there is the problem that the domain of action is itself a contentious matter. Second, there is the problem that, even if we have settled on an account of action, it is plausible that the domain of action will be vague, so that there are some events that are not definitely actions, but that are not definitely not actions either. Arguably both of these points about action apply, also, to the property of being an agent. If this is right, then the present account of ability, which is cashed out in terms of agency and action, will be correspondingly contentious and vague. Borderline cases may, in the end, generate problems for the theory of ability. But such problems will not be central here. For giving such a theory will be difficult enough even when we focus on paradigm cases of agency and action, and so on paradigm cases of ability.

Note there is a similarity between the present category of ability, as distinct from other powers, and the traditional category of active powers, where active powers are those that essentially involve the will (Reid 1788/2000). But it is not clear that these distinctions overlap exactly. For example, the power to will itself will clearly be an active power. It is less clear whether it will count as an ability, for the answer to that question will turn on the contentious question of whether willing is itself an action.

1.3 ‘Know how’ and the intelligent powers

Some will expect that an account of ability would also be an account of what it is to know how to perform an action, on the supposition that one knows how to perform a certain action just in case one has the ability to perform that action. This supposition, which we may call the Rylean account of know how (since it is most explicitly defended in Ryle 1949, 25–61), has been called into question by Jason Stanley and Timothy Williamson (Stanley and Williamson 2001). Let us briefly consider Stanley and Williamson’s argument and how it bears on the theory of ability.

Stanley and Williamson argue, on broadly linguistic grounds, that our default view of know how ought to be rather different from Ryle’s. Part of the argument for this is that standard treatments of embedded questions (‘know who’, ‘know where’, and so forth; see Karttunen 1977) suggest a rather different treatment. On this treatment, to know how to A is to know a certain proposition. At first pass, in Stanley and Williamson’s presentation, for S to know how to A is for S to know, of some contextually relevant way of acting w, that w is a way for S to A. Stanley and Williamson develop and defend such a treatment, and offer independent considerations for rejecting Ryle’s own arguments for the Rylean view. On their view, then, to know how to A is not to have an ability.

Stanley and Williamson’s arguments are far from widely accepted (see Noë 2005), but they tell at the very least against simply assuming that an account of ability will also be an account of know how. So we will leave questions of know how to one side in what follows. It is also reasonable to hope that an account of ability, while it may not simply be an account of know how, will at least shed light on disputes about know how. For so long as we lack a theory of what an ability is, the precise content of the Rylean view (and of its denial) remains unclear. So it may be that getting clear on abilities may help us, perhaps indirectly, to get clear on know how as well. (Additional discussion of these questions may be found in Stanley’s book-length development of his and Williamson’s initial position (Stanley 2011), as well as the papers collected in (Bengson and Moffett 2011).

Whatever our view of ability and know how, there is a further question at the intersection of these topics that bears consideration. This is how to accommodate those powers of agents that appear to be especially closely connected to practical intelligence, such as skills and talents — which we might collectively call the intelligent powers. Are the intelligent powers simply a species of ability, or do they demand an independent treatment? There are a number of recent proposals to be considered here. (Robb forthcoming) proposes a dispositionalist theory of talent, on which a talent is a disposition to maintain and develop a skill. (McGeer 2018) emphasizes the significance of a distinctive kind of intelligent power, which she (following Ryle) calls an ‘intelligent capacity,’ and of which she too offers a broadly dispositionalist account. These proposals suggest a more general program of dispositionalism about the intelligent powers, which has suggestive parallels to the dispositionalism about ability that we will consider in Section 5.1. Still more generally, accurately accounting for the nature of the intelligent powers, and the relationship of these to abilities and to the powers more generally, remains an open and intriguing problem.

2. Two fundamental distinctions

If one wants to give a theory of ability of the sort described at the outset, it is helpful for that theory to observe some formal distinctions that have been marked in the literature. This section canvasses two of the most important formal distinctions.

2.1 General and specific ability

The previous section was primarily concerned with distinguishing abilities from other powers. But there is also a distinction to be made within the class of abilities itself. This is the distinction between general and specific abilities (Honoré 1964, Mele 2002).

The distinction between general and specific abilities may be brought out by way of example. Consider a well-trained tennis player equipped with ball and racquet, standing at the service line. There is, as it were, nothing standing between her and a serve: every prerequisite for her serving has been met. Such an agent is in a position to serve, or has serving as an option. Let us say that such an agent has the specific ability to serve.

In contrast, consider an otherwise similar tennis player who lacks a racquet and ball, and is miles away from a tennis court. There is clearly a good sense in which such an agent has the ability to hit a serve: she has been trained to do so, and has done so many times in the past. Yet such an agent lacks the specific ability to serve, as that term was just defined. Let us say that such an agent has the general ability to serve.

The concern of this article will be general abilities in this sense, and unqualified references to ‘ability’ should be read in that way. But specific abilities will also be at issue. This is for at least two reasons.

The first is one of coverage: many of the proposals that are relevant to the understanding of ability, especially the classical ‘conditional analysis’ (discussed in Section 3.1 below), are naturally read as proposals about specific ability in the present sense, and a suitably broad conception of ability lets us keep these proposals within our domain of discussion.

The second reason is more properly philosophical. If we accept the distinction between general and specific abilities, then we want for our account of ability to accommodate both of them, and ultimately to explain how they are related to each other. For this distinction is not plausibly diagnosed as mere ambiguity; it rather marks off something like two modes of a single kind of power. There are at least two kinds of proposals one may make here. One, arguably implicit in many of the ‘new dispositionalist’ approaches to ability, is that general ability is in some sense prior to specific ability: to have a specific ability is simply to have a general ability and to meet some further constraint, such as having an opportunity. Another proposal (suggested in Maier 2015) is that specific ability is in some sense prior to general ability: to have a general ability is simply to have a specific ability under a certain range of circumstances.

The idea that there is some sort of bipartite distinction to be made between abilities has been a prominent theme in contemporary work on ability. It has been endorsed and developed, in different contexts, by Glick (2012), Vihvelin (2013), and Whittle (2010). It is an open question whether the bipartite distinctions in ability introduced by these authors are the same as one another, or the same as the one introduced here. It could be that there are several bipartite distinctions to be made in this area, or that we simply have one distinction under several names.

2.2 Abilities and ability-ascriptions

Much philosophical discussion of ability has taken place in the formal, as opposed to the material, mode. Thus we are often asked to distinguish senses of ‘ability’, or to think about what ‘can’ means. This subtle shift between discussing ability and discussing the ascription of ability is often harmless. Nonetheless, it is important to bear in mind the distinction between these questions, and to mark this distinction explicitly at the outset.

On the one hand, there are questions about ability itself. The central question here to give an account of what an ability is, in the sense foregrounded at the outset. Subsidiary questions here include, for example, whether abilities may exist when they are unexercised, whether abilities are intrinsic or extrinsic features of their bearers, and whether agents have abilities in deterministic worlds. These are, broadly speaking, questions about the metaphysics of ability.

On the other hand, there are questions about ability-ascriptions. Abilities are characteristically ascribed (in English) with sentences involving the modal auxiliaries ‘can’ and ‘is able to.’ Accordingly, the central question here is to give a semantics for sentences involving those expressions. Subsidiary tasks include resolving certain open problems in the semantics of these expressions, such as the ‘actuality entailment’ observed in (Bhatt 1999), and integrating a semantics for agentive modals with a semantics for modal expressions more generally. These are, broadly speaking, questions about the semantics of agentive modality.

On certain conceptions of the philosophical enterprise, the project of giving a theory of ability and that of giving a semantics for ability-ascriptions are closely connected, and even collapse into each other. Nonetheless, there is at least a methodological distinction to be marked here. Having marked that distinction, this discussion will primarily be concerned with the first of these projects, the project of giving a theory of ability. Nonetheless, the project of giving a semantics for ability-ascriptions will also frequently be relevant. As with the distinction between general and specific abilities, this is for two reasons, one of coverage and one more properly philosophical.

The first reason, that of coverage, is the following. Many of the most prominent theories of ability defended in the philosophical literature have in fact been, in the first place, theories of ability-ascriptions. Indeed, the central thought in much work on ability in the analytic tradition has been a kind of semantic deflationism, on which we may give a semantics for ability-ascriptions that does not quantify over abilities themselves. This is arguably the main theme of the hypothetical theories to be considered in Section 3, and the modal theories to be considered in Section 4. Given this tendency in thinking about ability, an overview of philosophical work on ability that neglected the role of ability-ascriptions would be seriously incomplete.

There is also the second, more philosophical, reason. Any account of abilities owes us, among other things, an account of ability-ascriptions. This is perhaps true of philosophical topics generally, but it is true of ability in particular. Even philosophers who are explicit in their ‘refusal to take language as a starting point in the analysis of thought and modality’ (Lewis 1986, xi) are prone to make explicit appeal to language when the topic turns to ability, as occurs in (Lewis 1976) or (Taylor 1960). This is for any number of reasons, but perhaps especially because it is difficult to even identify the topic under consideration without using or mentioning certain phrases, notably ‘can’ and ‘is able to.’

Happily, the topic of ability-ascriptions is one on which linguists and philosophers have made significant progress. While there has long been considerable philosophical interest expressions such as ‘can’ and ‘is able to,’ there is nothing recognizable as a rigorous semantic theory of such terms prior to the foundational work of Angelika Kratzer, recently revised and collected in (Kratzer 2012). Kratzer’s work has been central to natural language semantics, and its significance for philosophical work is still being appreciated. The question of whether it is correct as an account of the semantics of agentive modality is an open one: important challenges include (Hackl 1998) and, more recently, (Mandelkern, Schultheis, and Boylan, 2017), (Schwarz 2020), and (Willer forthcoming). The Kratzer semantics, and a view of ability on which that semantics plays a foundational role, will be considered in some detail in Section 4. The more methodological point being made here is that any adequate account of ability ought to provide an account of ability-ascriptions, and as such may want to reckon with this ongoing debate in the semantics of modal expressions.

3. Hypothetical theories of ability

The bulk of theories of ability that have been defended in the historical and contemporary literature have been what we might call hypothetical theories. On such views, to have an ability is for it to be the case that one would act in certain ways if one were to have certain volitions. One arrives at different theories depending on how one understands the volitions in question and how exactly these actions would hypothetically depend on them, but nonetheless these views constitute something like a unified family. Given their prominence and unity, it is natural to begin our survey of theories of ability with them.

3.1 The conditional analysis

The most prominent hypothetical theory of ability is what has come to be called the ‘conditional analysis’. In this section, we will survey that form of analysis, the problems for it, and alternatives to it that are supposed to overcome those problems.

The conditional analysis of ability has at least two aspects. First, S has an ability to A just in case a certain conditional is true of her. Second, that conditional has the following form: S would A if S were to have a certain volition. The precise form such an analysis will take will depend on, first, how we interpret this conditional and, second, which volition figures in the antecedent.

It has been standard in the literature, when this first question has been raised, to understand the conditional as a subjunctive conditional (Ginet 1980), and we will assume in what follows that this is the best form of the conditional analysis. There has been some disagreement about whether it is a might or a would conditional that is relevant (for an account of this distinction, see Lewis 1973, 21–24), as well as about which volition is relevant. In the following, we will take the relevant conditional to be a would conditional, and the relevant volition to be trying, though nothing will hang on these selections, and the points to be raised would apply also to other forms of conditional analysis, mutatis mutandis.

We thus arrive at the following form of the conditional analysis:

(CA) S has the ability to A iff S would A if S tried to A.

If (CA) were true, it would constitute a theory of ability in that it would say under exactly what conditions some agent has the ability to perform some action without making reference to the idea of ability itself. (Note that a variant on (CA) that is sometimes discussed, according to which S has the ability to A iff S could A if S tried to A, would not meet this standard, since the ‘could’ seems to make a claim about S’s abilities. So such a view is not really a conditional analysis. Indeed, it is not even clear that it involves a genuine conditional, for reasons discussed in Austin 1970 (211–213).

The conditional analysis so understood has been subject to a fair amount of criticism, which will be reviewed in the following section. It bears noting, however, just how apt an account of ability it seems at first pass. It satisfies, at least at first approximation, the extensional constraints: there are many actions with respect to which a typical agent satisfies the relevant conditional, and also many actions with respect to which she does not, and these roughly correspond to her abilities. This imposes a demand even on those who wish to reject (CA), namely to explain why, if (CA) is simply false, it so closely approximates to the truth about abilities.

Its approximate satisfaction of the extensional constraints is also plausibly a reason why something like (CA) has found so many thoughtful advocates. It is at least strongly suggested, for example, by the following remarks from Hume’s Enquiry:

For what is meant by liberty, when applied to voluntary actions? We cannot surely mean that actions have so little connexion with motives, inclinations, and circumstances, that one does not follow with a certain degree of uniformity from the other, and that one affords no inference by which we can conclude the existence of the other. For these are plain and acknowledged matters of fact. By liberty, then, we can only mean a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will; this is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may. Now this hypothetical liberty is universally allowed to belong to every one who is not a prisoner and in chains. (8.1; Hume 1748, 72)

Of course, Hume and many of those who have followed him have been attempting to do something rather more than to offer a theory of ability. Hume’s intent was to show that disputes over ‘question of liberty and necessity, the most contentious question of metaphysics’ have been ‘merely verbal’ (8.1; Hume 1748, 72). Whatever we may think of this striking claim, however, there is a dialectical gap between it and the alleged truth of (CA). To anticipate a theme that will be central in what follows, we must be careful to distinguish between, on the one hand, the adequacy of various views of ability and, on the other, the more contentious metaphysical questions about freedom to which they are doubtlessly related. It is the former that will be our concern in this section.

3.2 Problems for the conditional analysis

(CA) says that satisfying a certain conditional is both sufficient and necessary for having a certain ability. There are two kinds of counterexamples that may be brought against (CA): counterexamples to its sufficiency, and to its necessity. Let us take these in turn.

Counterexamples to the sufficiency of (CA) have been most prominent in the literature. Informally, they are suggested by the question: ‘but could S try to A?’ There are a variety of ways of translating this rhetorical question into a counterexample. We may distinguish two: global counterexamples, according to which (CA) might always get the facts about ability wrong, and local counterexamples, according to which (CA) might sometimes get the facts about ability wrong.

Begin with global counterexamples. Let us say that determinism is true at our world. Familiar arguments purport to show that, if this is the case, then no one has the ability to do anything, except perhaps for what she actually does (for several developments of such an argument, see van Inwagen 1983, 55–105). But if (CA) is true, then agents would have the ability to perform various actions that they do not actually perform. For it is plausible that the conditionals in terms of which (CA) analyzes ability would still be true in a deterministic world. But then, since it makes false predictions about such a world, which for all we know may be our own, (CA) is false.

The difficulties involved in this sort of counterexample are clear. The proponent of (CA) will reject the arguments for the incompatibility of ability and determinism as unsound. Indeed, it is precisely her thought that such arguments are unsound that has typically led her to take ability to be analyzed in terms like those of (CA). So global counterexamples, while they may be successful, are dialectically ineffective relative to the range of questions that are at issue in the debates over ability.

It seems, however, that we can show that (CA) is false even relative to premises that are shared between various disputants in the free will debates. This is what is shown by local counterexamples to (CA). One such example is given by Keith Lehrer:

Suppose that I am offered a bowl of candy and in the bowl are small round red sugar balls. I do not choose to take one of the red sugar balls because I have a pathological aversion to such candy. (Perhaps they remind me of drops of blood and … ) It is logically consistent to suppose that if I had chosen to take the red sugar ball, I would have taken one, but, not so choosing, I am utterly unable to touch one. (Lehrer 1968, 32)

Such an example shows that (CA) is false without assuming anything contentious in debates over freedom. It turns rather on a simple point: that psychological shortcomings, just as much as external impediments, may undermine abilities. (CA), which does not recognize this point, is therefore subject to counterexamples where such psychological shortcomings become relevant. We may, if we like, distinguish ‘psychological’ from ‘non-psychological’ ability, and claim that (CA) correctly accounts for the latter (this sort of strategy is suggested, for example, by Albritton 1985). But our ordinary notion of ability, that of which we are attempting to give a theory, seems to involve both psychological and non-psychological requirements. And if that is correct, then Lehrer’s example succeeds as a counterexample to (CA) as a theory of our ordinary notion of ability.

Counterexamples to the necessity of (CA) have been less frequently discussed (though see Wolf 1990), but they also raise important issues about ability. Consider a case where a good golfer misses an easy putt. Given that this golfer tried to make the putt and failed to, it is false that she would have made the putt if she had tried to; after all, she did try it and did not make it. (This thought is vindicated by standard views of subjunctive conditionals; see Bennett 2003, 239). But, as a good golfer, she presumably had the ability to make the putt. So this seems to be a case where one can have an ability without satisfying the relevant conditional, and hence a counterexample to the necessity of (CA).

Here the defender of (CA) might avail herself of the distinction between specific and general abilities. (CA), she might say, is an account of what it is to have a specific ability: that is, to actually be in a position to perform an action. The golfer does lack this ability in this case, as (CA) correctly predicts. It is nonetheless true that the golfer has the general ability to sink putts like this. But (CA) does not purport to be an analysis of general ability, and as such is compatible with the golfer having that sort of ability. Again, the plausibility of this response will hang on the viability of the distinction between specific and general abilities.

We have seen that (CA) faces serious problems, especially as a sufficient condition for ability, even once we set to one side contentious claims about freedom and determinism. If this is correct, then (CA) must either be modified or rejected outright. Let us first consider the prospects for modification.

3.3 The conditional analysis: some variations

The guiding idea of hypothetical accounts is that abilities are to be defined in terms of what someone would do were he in certain psychological conditions. There are a number of ways of developing this idea that do not fit into the form of (CA). At least two such proposals deserve attention here.

Donald Davidson takes concerns about the sufficiency of (CA), especially as developed in Chisholm 1964, to tell decisively against it. More specifically, he takes the lesson of this problem to be is that:

The antecedent of a causal conditional that attempts to analyze ‘can’ or ‘could’ or ‘free to’ must not contain, as its dominant verb, a verb of action, or any verb which makes sense of the question, Can someone do it? (Davidson 1980, 68)

Davidson suggests that we may overcome this difficulty at least by endorsing:

A can do x intentionally (under the description d) means that if A has desires and beliefs that rationalize x (under d), then A does x. (Davidson 1980, 68)

Davidson proceeds to consider a number of further problems for this proposal and for the causal theory of action generally, but he takes it to suffice at least to overcome standard objections to the sufficiency of (CA).

The trouble is that it is not at all clear it does so. For these objections did not essentially depend on a verb of action figuring in the antecedent of the analyzing conditional. Consider Lehrer’s case again. It seems true that if Lehrer’s imagined agent has desires and beliefs that rationalized that action under the description ‘eating a red candy’—namely, adopting the analysis of Davidson 1963, a desire for a red candy and a belief that this action is a way of eating a red candy—she would eat a red candy. But the trouble is precisely that, in virtue of her psychological disability, she is incapable of having this desire, and so cannot perform this action intentionally. For this reason it does not seem that Davidson’s proposal successfully overcomes the sufficiency problem, at least not on Lehrer’s way of developing that problem.

A second and rather different approach to modifying (CA) has been taken in recent work by Christopher Peacocke. Peacocke accepts that (CA) is insufficient in light of counterexamples like Lehrer’s. But he argues that we might supplement (CA) in order to overcome these difficulties. In the terms of the present discussion, Peacocke’s proposal is: S has the ability to A just in case: (i) (CA) is true of S and (ii) the possibility in which S tries to A is a ‘close’ one. The closeness of a possibility as it figures in (ii) is to be understood, at first pass, in terms of what we can reasonably rely on: a possibility is a distant one just in case we can reasonably rely on it not obtaining; otherwise it is a close one (Peacocke 1999, 310). To modify one of Peacocke’s examples, the possibility of toxic fumes being released into a train car that is safely insulated is a distant one; on the other hand, the possibility of toxic fumes being released into a train car where they just happen to be blocked by a fortuitous arrangement of luggage is a close one.

Peacocke’s thought is that this suffices to overcome the sufficiency objection: though Lehrer’s agent satisfies (i), she does not satisfy (ii): given the facts about his psychology, the possibility that he tries to A is not a close one. The trouble, however, is that Peacocke’s proposal is subject to modified versions of Lehrer’s counterexample. Consider an agent whose aversion to red candies is not a permanent feature of her psychology, but an unpredictable and temporary ‘mood’. Consider the agent at some time when she is in her aversive mood. This agent satisfies (i), for the same reason as above, and she also satisfies (ii): given the fragility of her mood, the possibility of her trying is a close one in the relevant sense. Yet such an agent lacks the ability to eat a red candy, in precisely the same way as she does in Lehrer’s original example.

It is an interesting question how we might develop other ‘supplementation’ strategies for (CA) (such strategies are also suggested by Ginet 1980), though the track record of this method of analysis in other domains (for instance, the project of ‘supplementing’ the analysis of knowledge in terms of justified true belief, in response to (Gettier 1963)) does not inspire confidence.

4. Modal theories of ability

There is a surprising disconnect between the way abilities have been discussed in the philosophical literature in the tradition of Hume and the way that they have been approached in more recent work in logic and linguistics. Here, ability claims are understood as categorical possibility claims: claims about what some agent does in some non-actual state of affairs (or ‘possible world’). Let a modal theory of ability be any theory on which claims about an agent’s abilities are understood in terms of claims about what that agent in fact does at some possible world (or set of worlds). The idea that some such modal theory of ability must be true is a presumption of much formal work on ability and ability-ascriptions. Yet there are serious challenges to the idea that ability is in this sense a modality.

4.1 The modal analysis

Intuitively, claims about ability are claims about possibility. It is in some sense a truism that someone is able to perform some act just in case it is possible for her to perform it.

To develop this purported truism, begin with the thought that for S to have an ability to A it is necessary, but not sufficient, that it be possible that S does A. This claim will be contentious for various more specialized sorts of possibility, such as nomic possibility. But if we may help ourselves to the idea of possibility simpliciter (‘metaphysical possibility,’ on at least one reading of that phrase), then this claim appears plausible. (We will survey some historical and contemporary challenges to it below in Section 4.2.) On the other hand it seems implausible that this sort of possibility is a sufficient condition: there are any number of acts that that are metaphysically possible to perform that an agent might nonetheless not be able to perform.

This suggests a natural hypothesis. To have an ability is for it to be possible to A in some restricted sense of possibility. As nomic possibility is possibility relative to the laws of nature, and epistemic possibility is possibility relative to what an agent knows, so may ability be possibility relative to some independently specifiable set of conditions.

To render this hypothesis precisely, we may help ourselves to the formal framework of ‘possible worlds,’ which offers an elegant and powerful semantics for modal language. On this framework, a proposition is possible just in case it is true at some possible world. We can then say an agent is able to A just in case she performs that act at some world (or set of worlds) that satisfy some independently specifiable set of conditions.

We thus arrive at the modal analysis of ability:

(MA) S has the ability to A iff S does A at some world (or set of worlds) satisfying condition C.

(MA) is actually not itself an analysis but rather a template for a general family of analyses. Different members of this family will be distinguished by the different candidates they might propose for C, as well as whether they quantify over individual worlds or sets of worlds. Nonetheless, these analyses demonstrate sufficient theoretical unity that they may be viewed, at an appropriate level of abstraction, as a single approach to the analysis of ability.

Two points about (MA) bear noting. First, ‘modal’ here is being used in a relatively strict and narrow way. Sometimes ‘modal’ is used loosely to describe phenomena that are connected to possibility (and necessity) in some way or other. As noted above, it is a truism that there is some connection between ability and necessity, and so that ability is in this loose sense ‘modal.’ The proponent of (MA) is concerned with modality in a stricter sense: she proposes that ability may be analyzed in terms of the precise framework of propositions and possible worlds just adumbrated. The opponent of (MA), in turn, grants that ability has something to do with possibility but denies that any such analysis succeeds.

Second, while (MA) has been presented as an alternative to (CA), (CA) is arguably just one particular version of (MA). For, as noted above, (CA) appeals to a subjunctive conditional, and the standard semantics for the subjunctive conditional (developed in slightly different ways in Stalnaker 1968 and Lewis 1973) is told in terms of quantification over possible worlds. Specifically (on Stalnaker’s version) a subjunctive conditional is true just in case its consequent is true at the world where its antecedent is true that is otherwise maximally similar to the actual world. In these terms, (CA) is roughly equivalent to the following:

(CAmodal) S has the ability to A iff S does A at a world at which S tries to A that is otherwise maximally similar to the actual world.

This is patently a version of (MA), with ‘S tries to A and is otherwise maximally similar to the actual world’ serving as condition C.

If this is correct, then most discussions of the analysis on ability in the twentieth century have focused on a special and somewhat idiosyncratic case of a much broader program of analysis, namely the program of giving a modal analysis of ability. The considerations brought forth in the remainder of this section, in contrast, are concerned with the general case.

4.2 The modal analysis: logical considerations

There are two questions that might be raised for this proposal about ability. First, does ability indeed admit of some kind of modal analysis? Second, if it does, how exactly are we to spell out the details of that analysis — in particular, how are we to articulate condition C? Let us begin with the first, more basic, question.

According to (MA), performing an act at some possible world (or set of worlds) is both necessary and sufficient for having the ability to perform that act. One way of challenging this claim is to deny the necessity claim: that is, to argue that it is sometimes the case that an agent is able to perform an act that she does not perform at any possible world.

This is an argument that has in fact been made by several authors. Descartes, for one, appears to have argued that God is such an agent (Curley 1984). A genuinely omnipotent being, one might argue, should be able to perform any act whatsoever, even the impossible ones. This view of omnipotence is contentious, but it is not clear that it should be ruled out formally, by the very analysis of ability, as (MA) does. Spencer (2017) argues that even non-omnipotent agents may sometimes have the ability to perform acts that they do not perform at any possible world.

Let us grant, however, that the possibility of performing an act is a necessary condition for performing that act, and that in this sense an attribution of ability entails a possibility claim. One might nonetheless resist the view that ability admits of a modal analysis in the manner suggested by (MA).

That is the kind of argument developed in a prescient discussion by Anthony Kenny (Kenny 1975; the presentation of Kenny here is indebted to the discussion in Brown 1988). Kenny argues that, if something like (MA) is indeed true, then ability should obey the principles that govern the possibility operator in standard modal logics. Kenny claims that ability fails to satisfy the following two principles:

(1) \(A \to \Diamond A.\)

Informally, (1) expresses the principle that if an agent performs an action, then she has the ability to perform this action. This is, Kenny argues, false of ability.

(2) \(\Diamond(A \lor B) \to (\Diamond A \lor \Diamond B).\)

Informally, (2) expresses the principle that if an agent has the ability to perform one of two actions, then she has the ability to perform either the first action or the second action. This is, Kenny argues, false of ability.

Let us begin with (1). Kenny claims that this principle is false in light of cases like the following: ‘A hopeless darts player may, once in a lifetime, hit the bull, but be unable to repeat the performance because he does not have the ability to hit the bull’ (Kenny 1975, 136). This kind of ‘fluky success’ has been extensively discussed in the philosophical literature — perhaps most famously in Austin (1956) — in order to make a variety of points. Kenny’s insight is to observe that these simple cases tell against the modal analysis of ability, as they violate an axiom of many modal logics, namely any system as strong as the system T.

A simple response to this point is to deny that T (or any stronger logic) is the correct logic for ability. To deny this is still to allow for a treatment of ability within the framework of possible worlds. Notably, the modal logic K is one that fails to validate (1). A natural response to Kenny’s first point, then, is to say that K, rather than T or some stronger system, is the correct modal logic of ability.

This response is not available, however, in response to Kenny’s second objection. Recall that objection was that (2) is true of possibility but not of ability. Here the retreat to weaker modal logics will not work, since (2) is provable on the weakest standard modal logic, namely K. Yet the parallel claim does not seem true of ability. Kenny gives the following example:

Given a pack of cards, I have the ability to pick out on request a card which is either black or red; but I don’t have the ability to pick out a red card on request nor the ability to pick out a black card on request. (Kenny 1975, 137)

This then appears to be a case where S has the ability to A or B but lacks the ability to A and lacks the ability to B. So it appears that (2) is false of ability. In light of this Kenny concludes that ‘if we regard possible worlds semantics as making explicit what is involved in being a possibility, we must say that ability is not any kind of possibility’ (Kenny 1975, 140).

To appreciate Kenny’s conclusion, it is instructive to work through why precisely this is a counterexample to (MA). Consider an agent S who has the ability to pick a red card or a black card, but does not have the ability to pick a red card or the ability to pick a black card. According to (MA), S has the ability to A iff S does A at some world (or set of worlds) satisfying condition C. Consider the case where (MA) appeals to a single world, not a set of worlds. If S has the ability to pick a red card or pick a black card, then by (MA) there is a world w satisfying condition C where S picks a red card or black card. Then either S picks a red card at w or S picks a black card at w. Then, applying (MA) now in the other direction, S has the ability to pick a red card or S has the ability to pick a black card. But that, by assumption, is not the case. Since (MA) is the only substantive premise appealed to that argument, (MA) must be rejected.

Note that this argument turned essentially on adopting the version of (MA) which appealed to a single world, rather than a set of worlds. So one way of responding to this objection is by appealing to sets of worlds in the modal analysis of ability. This is precisely the proposal of Mark Brown, who argues that, if we take accessibility relations to hold between a world and a set of worlds, then we may capture talk of ability within a possible worlds framework that is broadly in the spirit of standard views (Brown 1988; see also Cross 1986). Alternatively, we may take this sort of point to militate in favor of a return to hypothetical theories of ability, since, at least on Lewis’s view of subjunctive conditionals, it may be that a disjunction follows from a counterfactual claim without either of its disjuncts following from that claim (Lewis 1973, 79–80). Modal accounts that appeal to sets of worlds are ‘non-normal’ in the sense that they do not satisfy the axiom K, but they remain true to the letter of (MA) as well as the spirit of modal analyses generally, insofar as they avail themselves only of possible worlds and quantification thereover.

4.3 The modal analysis: linguistic considerations

In the material mode, the modal analysis gives an account of what it is to have an ability in terms of quantification over possible worlds. In the formal mode, it gives a semantics for the ascription of ability — paradigmatically, sentences involving ‘can’ or ‘is able to’ — in terms of quantification over possible worlds.

This formal aspect of the modal analysis has been prominent in the philosophical and linguistic literature because the standard semantics for ability ascriptions is an explicitly modal one. This is the view developed in a series of papers by Angelika Kratzer (Kratzer 2012). Kratzer treats expressions such as ‘S can A’ and ‘S is able to A’ as possibility claims. That is, ‘S is able to A’ is true just in case there is a possible world w meeting certain conditions at which S does A. The conditions are that (i) w be accessible given some contextually-specified set of facts (the modal base) and (ii) that w be at least as good, according to a contextually-specified ranking of worlds (the ordering source), as any other accessible world. The Kratzer semantics is thus an instance of the modal analysis on its semantic formulation:

(MAsemantic) ‘S is able to A’ is true iff S does A at some world (or set of worlds) satisfying condition C.

A number of objection have been brought against the modal analysis in this latter, formal, aspect.

One objection prominent in the recent literature (Mandelkern et al. 2017; Schwarz 2020) is that Kratzer’s semantics, or any analysis of the form of (MAsemantic), appears to have trouble marking an intuitive distinction between what someone is able to do and what it is possible for her to do. Let us say that an unskilled darts-player is about to throw a dart. She utters:

(3) I am able to hit the bullseye

Intuitively, what she says is false: she is not able to hit the bullseye, as she is a poor darts-player. Yet there is an accessible and perfectly good possible world w at which she hits the bullseye — which is just to say, in the object language, that it is possible for her to hit the bullseye.

This case suggests the Kratzer semantics lacks the resources to capture the distinctively agentive force of a sentences such as (3). There are, in addition, a number of other outstanding empirical problems for Kratzer’s semantics for ability modals. One is the problem of accounting for ‘compulsion’ modals such as ‘I cannot but tell the truth’ (Mandelkern et al. 2017). Another is that of accommodating the ‘actuality entailment’ whereby, in many languages, certain ability sentences entail that the act in question was actually performed (Bhatt 1999; see also Hacquard 2009). Whatever our verdict on (MAsemantic), the semantics of ability-ascriptions remains an unresolved and potentially rich issue at the boundary of linguistics and the philosophy of action.

5. New approaches to ability

The foregoing has indicated serious concerns about the adequacy of the orthodox approaches to ability and its ascription: the conditional analysis (CA), and the modal analysis (MA), of which (CA) is arguably just a special case. This raises the question of what a non-hypothetical and non-modal account of ability and its ascription might look like.

Since abilities are, as noted in Section 1.1, a kind of power, one natural idea is to analyze abilities in terms of some other kind of power. This appeal may proceed in different ways. One is by appealing to dispositions, and by analyzing abilities in terms of this purportedly better-understood kind of power. Another is by departing more radically from the standard ontology of recent metaphysics, and analyzing ability in terms of some new and distinctive variety of power. We will consider these approaches in turn in Sections 5.1 and 5.2. Finally, in Section 5.3, we will turn to miscellaneous alternative approaches to ability, which reject the conditional and modal analyses, but which do not purport to analyze abilities in terms of powers either.

5.1 The ‘new dispositionalism’

In recent years several authors have revisited the thought that we may give a broadly hypothetical account of ability, without endorsing the problematic claim (CA). This is the view of ability that has been defended by Smith (2003), Vihvelin (2004, 2013), and Fara (2008). Following Clarke (2009), we may label this view the ‘new dispositionalism.’

What unifies the new dispositionalists is that they return to the conditional analysis of ability in light of two thoughts. The first thought is one already noted: that there is a variety of power, dispositions, that is similar in many respects to abilities. The second thought is that there are well-known problems of giving a conditional analysis of dispositions, in light of which many authors have been inclined to reject the long-assumed link between dispositions and conditionals. Taken together, these thoughts yield a promising new line on abilities: that though we ought to reject the conditional analysis of abilities, we may yet defend a dispositional account of abilities.

Why ought we reject the conditional analysis of dispositions? Consider the following analysis of the disposition to break when struck:

(CD) x is disposed to break when struck iff S would break if S were struck.

Despite the intuitive appeal of (CD), there appear to be at least two kinds of counterexamples to it. First, consider a crystal glass that, if it were about to be struck, would transform into steel. This glass is disposed to break when struck, but it is not true that it would break if struck—the transformation renders this false. This is a case of finking, in the language of Martin 1994. Second, consider a crystal glass stuffed with styrofoam packaging. This glass is disposed to break when struck, but it is not true that it would break if struck—the packaging prevents this. This is a case of masking, in the language of Johnston 1992. In light of such cases, it seems we ought to reject (CD).

The bearing of these points on our earlier discussion of the conditional analysis is the following. There appear to be quite general problems for giving a conditional analysis of powers. So it may be that the failures of the conditional analysis of ability were not due to any fact about abilities, but rather to a shortcoming of conditional analyses generally. One way of overcoming this problem, if this diagnosis is correct, is to analyze abilities directly in terms of dispositions.

Such an analysis is proposed by Fara 2008, who argues:

S has the ability to A in circumstances C iff she has the disposition to A when, in circumstances C, she tries to A. (Fara 2008, 848)

The similarity of this analysis to the hypothetical analyses canvassed earlier are clear. This raises several immediate questions, such as whether this analysis can overcome the problem of sufficiency that plagued those approaches (see Fara 2008, 851–852 for an affirmative answer, and Clarke 2009, 334–336 for some doubts). What is most striking about the new dispositionalists, however, is how they bring this sort of account of ability to bear on certain familiar cases.

Consider how the new dispositionalism bears on so-called ‘Frankfurt cases.’ These are cases due to Frankfurt 1969, where an agent chooses to and performs some action A while at the same time there is some other action B such that, had the agent been about to choose B, an ‘intervener’ would have altered the agent’s brain so that the agent would have chosen, and performed, A instead. One question about such cases is whether the agent, in the actual sequence of events, had the ability to B. Frankfurt’s intuition, and that of most others, is that she did not. Given the further claim that the agent is nonetheless morally responsible for doing A, this case appears to be a counterexample to the what Frankfurt calls the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP): an agent is morally responsible for Aing only if she had the ability to perform some action other than A.

The new dispositionalists disagree. Let us focus on Fara’s diagnosis of the case. The question of whether the agent had the ability to B turns, for Fara, on the question of whether she was disposed to B when she tried to B. Fara claims that she does have such a disposition. The presence of the intervener is, on Fara’s view, like the aforementioned styrofoam packaging in a crystal glass. It masks the disposition of the glass to break when struck, but does not remove that disposition. Similarly, Fara argues, the presence of the intervener masks the agent’s disposition to B when she tries to B, but does not remove that disposition. (There is some disagreement among the new dispositionalists about whether this is a case of finking or masking; see Clarke 2009, 340 for discussion). So, pace Frankfurt, the agent does have the ability to B after all. And so we have, in this case at least, no counterexample to PAP.

A natural worry at this point is that the new dispositionalist has simply changed the subject. For it seems clear that, in a perfectly ordinary sense of ability, Frankfurt’s agent lacks the ability to do otherwise. An account of ability which denies this seems to be speaking of some other concept altogether. One way of bringing out what is missing is the idea that there seems to be a connection between my abilities, in the sense of ability that is relevant to free will, and what is up to me. Clarke claims that this sort of connection fails on the new dispositionalist view of ability:

Although the presence of a fink or mask that would prevent one’s Aing is compatible with having a general capacity (the unimpaired competence to A), there is an ordinary sense in which in such circumstances an agent might well be unable to A … If there is something in place that would prevent me from Aing should I try to A, if it is not up to me that it would so prevent me, and if it is not up to me that such a thing is in place, then even if I have a capacity to A, it is not up to me whether I exercise that capacity. (Clarke 2009, 339)

Thus the objection is that, while the new dispositionalist has perhaps offered a theory of something, it is not a theory of ability.

How should the new dispositionalist respond? One thought is that we are here again encountering the distinction between general and specific abilities. The new dispositionalist might contend that, while the agent in a Frankfurt case may lack the specific ability to do otherwise, she has the general ability to do otherwise, and that it is this general ability of which the new dispositionalist is giving an account.

This response, however, postpones a crucial and much broader question. The question is this: should ‘ability’ in (PAP) be understood as general ability, or specific ability? If general ability is what matters, then Frankfurt cases may indeed not tell against (PAP), for the agent retains the general ability to do otherwise. If it is specific ability that matters, however, the challenge to (PAP) stands (see also Whittle 2010). This is a vital question for understanding the purported connection between agents’ abilities and questions of moral responsibility, whatever our verdict on new dispositionalism itself. (See Cyr and Swenson 2019 for a helpful recent discussion of these issues).

5.2 Abilities as distinctive powers

As noted in Section 1.1, dispositions are simply one member of the broader family of powers, albeit one that has figured prominently in recent metaphysics. An alternative account of abilities might give an account of abilities in terms of some other kind of power, perhaps one better-suited to the distinctive aspects of abilities.

One account of this kind is developed in a series of works by Barbara Vetter (especially Vetter 2015). Vetter proposes that our basic modal notion should be potentiality. On a traditional view (which Vetter rejects) dispositions involve a dyadic relation between a stimulus and a manifestation (for example: a glass is disposed to break when struck). In contrast, potentials involve a monadic relation to a manifestation (for example: a glass has the potential to break). This makes potentials especially well-suited to give an account of abilities, which also appear to involve a monadic relation to an act, namely the act denoted by the complement of an ability-ascription (for example: I am able to play tennis). To have an ability, Vetter argues, is simply to have a certain kind of potentiality. Vetter also provides an explicit semantics for agentive modality in terms of the ascription of potentiality (Vetter 2013), which constitutes a systematic alternative to (MA).

Yet another view is suggested by recent work by Helen Steward emphasizing the traditional idea of a ‘two-way power’ (Steward 2012, Steward 2020; see also Alvarez 2013). Steward argues that actions are exercises of two-way powers — ‘powers which an agent can exercise or not at a given moment, even holding all prior conditions at that moment fixed’ (Steward 2020, 345). These are to be contrasted with one-way powers, which manifest whenever their manifestation conditions are realized, as a fragile glass breaks whenever it is struck. Unlike both the new dispositionalists on the one hand and Vetter on the other, Steward sees a fundamental asymmetry between agents, who are bearers of two-way powers, and mere objects, who are are bearers only of one-way powers. It is natural then to think that what it is to have an ability is to have a two-way power of a certain kind, and that a theory of ability should follow from an account of agency and the two-way powers.

We thus have at least three ‘power-based’ views of abilities: the new dispositionalism, Vetter’s potentiality-based view, and Steward’s two-way power-based view. It is instructive to consider how these three accounts differ with respect to two larger philosophical projects.

One is the project of giving an analysis of modal language, including ability-ascriptions, in terms of possible worlds. The new dispositionalist rejects (CA) and (MA) but she is still, in principle, sympathetic with that project, insofar as she allows that disposition ascriptions themselves may be ultimately understood in terms of quantification over possible worlds. This kind of view is explicitly endorsed, for instance, by Smith (2003). In contrast, Vetter is explicitly opposed to this project, while Steward’s view appears neutral on this question.

Another is the project of arguing that agents’ abilities are, or are not, compatible with the possibility of determinism. This is a question we touched on briefly in Section 5.1. As noted there, the new dispositionalists are motivated, in part, by the project of arguing for compatibilism. In contrast, Steward is explicitly concerned to defend incompatibilism. (Vetter appears to be neutral on this question.) The question of how the analysis of ability bears on the free will debates looms over many of these discussions, and we will confront it directly and at some length below in Section 6.

5.3 Other approaches

Still other approaches to ability reject (CA) and (MA) while rejecting also the thought that some appeal to power — be it a disposition, a potentiality, or a two-way power — is needed to account for abilities.

One recurrent thought is that, despite the various challenges that have been brought against it, ability is still intimately connected to some kind of relation between an agent’s volitions (tryings, intendings) and her actions. One semantically sophisticated development of this thought is Mandelkern et al, 2017, which proposes to take as basic a notion of ‘practically available actions,’ and to develop in terms of these a semantics for agentive modality, one on which conditionals linking volitions to actions continue to play an essential role. Another approach, in a recent book-length treatment of ability (Jaster 2020), proposes that abilities should be thought of in terms of proportions of cases where an agent successfully does what she intends to do (compare the approach to dispositions advocated in Manley and Wasserman 2008). Both of these approaches are explicit in their denial of (CA), but they share — with the new dispositionalists — the thought that the analysis of ability should somehow appeal to a pattern of dependence between volition and action.

This is not surprising. The conditional analysis is a redoubtable proposal, endorsed by many of the major figures in English-language philosophy. In light of that, it seems reasonable to try to discard the letter of (CA), but retain its spirit. For it may be that the historical failure of (CA) is due to difficulties and oversights that our perhaps firmer grasp of technical issues allows us to overcome. This is a sensible and well-motivated project, though it remains to be seen whether it will be, in the end, a successful one.

There remain still other accounts that do not fit easily into the taxonomy provided here. These include primitivist proposals, which take ability or some closely related notion as analytically fundamental. One development of this idea is Maier 2015, who proposes, contrary to most authors, that specific ability is fundamentally prior to general ability. He argues that we should give an account of general ability in terms of specific abilities, which he calls ‘options’: roughly, an agent has the general ability to A iff she normally has A as an option. Options, in turn, are primitives. Much here will hang on saying more about options, and in what sense they figure as primitives in the theory of agency.

Finally, an outline of a proposal by David Lewis (dated to 2001 but only recently published as Lewis 2020) offers an altogether different approach to ability. Lewis is motivated, like many proponents of (CA), by the goal of defending compatibilism, but he takes (CA) to be unsatisfactory. He therefore proposes a non-conditional analysis of ability. His analysis, roughly, is that S has the ability to perform an action B just in case there is some basic action A such that (i) S’s doing A would cause or constitute S’s doing B and (ii) there is no obstacle to S’s doing A. The problem of giving a theory of ability then becomes the problem of giving a theory of obstacles, something at which Lewis, in his outline, makes a beginning. (See Beebee et al 2020 for additional discussion).

Lewis’s proposal is an inspiration for further research in at least two ways. First, it indicates that Lewis, a systematic philosopher of modality, saw the problem of giving an analysis of ability as a significant outstanding project. Second, it demonstrates that genuinely novel approaches to ability remain available, and the project of giving a theory of ability may yet be in its early stages.

6. Abilities and the free will debates

Thus far our questions about abilities have been formal ones: we have been asking what it is to have an ability without concerning ourselves with the substantive work that a theory of ability might have to do. But there is much work to be had for a theory of ability: abilities have figured as unexplained explainers in a range of philosophical theories, for example in accounts of concepts (Millikan 2000), of knowledge (Greco 2009, Sosa 2007), and of ‘knowing what it’s like’ (Lewis 1988). Perhaps the most prominent substantive role for a theory of ability has been the uses to which accounts of ability have been put in the free will debates. So let us close with a brief survey of what work a theory of ability might be expected to do in those debates.

Questions about abilities have figured most prominently in debates over compatibilism. ‘Compatibilism’ is used in many ways, but let us understand it here as the thesis that the ability to perform actions one does not perform is compossible with the truth of determinism, which we may take to be the view that the facts about the past and the laws jointly determine the facts about the present and all future moments. (We should sharply distinguish this view, which we might call classical compatibilism, from more recent views such as the ‘semi-compatibilism’ of Fischer and Ravizza 1998). Insofar as compatibilism, so understood, has been explicitly defended, these defenses have made appeal to theories of ability, notably the conditional analysis and its variants, as well as the dispositionalist analysis favored by the new dispositionalists.

In the discussion of the conditional analysis, we distinguished between global and local counterexamples to hypothetical theories of ability, where the former appealed to the fact that any such theory would render ability compatible with determinism which, according to the objector, it is not. There we noted the dialectical limitations of such counterexamples, namely the contentiousness of their main premise. But compatibilists have often been guilty of what seems to be the opposite mistake. Namely, they have offered theories of ability which show abilities to be compatible with determinism, and have argued from this to the claim that such abilities are indeed compatible with determinism.

The shortcomings of this strategy are nicely diagnosed by Peter van Inwagen. After surveying the local counterexamples that arise for various hypothetical theories of ability, van Inwagen imagines that we have arrived at the best possible hypothetical theory of ability, which he labels ‘the Analysis’. van Inwagen then writes:

What does the Analysis do for us? How does it affect our understanding of the Compatibility Problem? It does very little for us, so far as I can see, unless we have some reason to think it is correct. Many compatibilists seem to think that they need only present a conditional analysis of ability, defend it against, or modify it in the face of, such counter-examples as may arise, and that they have thereby done what is necessary to defend compatibilism. That is not how I see it. The particular analysis of ability that a compatibilist presents is, as I see it, simply one of his premisses; his central premiss, in fact. And premisses need to be defended. (van Inwagen 1983, 121)

van Inwagen’s point is that, provided the incompatibilist has offered arguments for the claim that such abilities are incompatible with determinism—as, in van Inwagen’s presentation, the incompatibilist has—the production of an analysis is as yet no answer to those arguments. For those arguments are also arguments, inter alia, against the compatibilist’s favored account of ability.

There are, then, several obstacles for the compatibilist who wishes to appeal to an account of ability in defense of compatibilism. First, there is the general difficulty of actually giving an extensionally adequate theory of ability. In addition, we have now turned up a couple of more specific challenges to the compatibilist. There is van Inwagen’s point just outlined, namely that arguments for the incompatibility of abilities and determinism are, inter alia, arguments against any theory of ability that is congenial to the compatibilist. And, finally, there is the point that we encountered in our discussion of the new dispositionalism in Section 5.1, which is that certain platitudes about ability — in particular, those involved in certain judgments about moral responsibility — may be recalcitrant to compatibilist treatments. Taken together, these points seem to pose a serious obstacle to any theory of ability that is both compatible with determinism and in accord with our ordinary judgments about what ability requires.

What is the compatibilist to say in light of these obstacles? One response is to make a distinction between two kinds of compatibilist project. (Compare Pryor 2000 on responses to skepticism). One project is to convince someone moved by the incompatibilist’s arguments to retreat from her position. Call this ambitious compatibilism. For precisely the reasons van Inwagen gives, it is doubtful that any theory of ability will suffice for a defense of ambitious compatibilism. There is another project, however, that the compatibilist might be engaging in. Let us say that, for some reason or other, she herself is not convinced by the incompatibilist’s argument. She is still left with an explanatory burden, namely to explain, if only to her own satisfaction, how it could be that abilities are compatible with the truth of determinism. Here the compatibilist’s aim is not to convince the incompatibilist of the error of her ways, but simply to work out a satisfactory conception of compatibilism. Let us call this modest compatibilism. This distinction is not often made, and it is not always clear which of these projects classical compatibilists are engaged in. If the latter project is indeed part of classical compatibilism, then we may grant many of the above points while still granting the theory of ability a central place in defenses of compatibilism. For it may be that, though a theory of ability is of no use to the ambitious compatibilist, it has a crucial role to play in the defense of modest compatibilism.

Even these compatibilist aspirations, however, may be overly optimistic, or at least premature. For in surveying theories of ability we have turned up serious difficulties, for both hypothetical and non-hypothetical approaches, which do not appear to turn on issues about determinism. So it may be that the best hope for progress is to pursue theories of ability while setting to one side the problems raised in the free will debates. For given the difficulties posed by abilities, and given the significance of theories of ability for areas of philosophy quite removed from the free will debates, there is something to be said for pursuing a theory of ability while embracing, if only temporarily, a certain quietism about the puzzles that determinism may pose.


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Other Internet Resources


I am very grateful to the many people who have provided feedback on this entry since its initial publication in 2009. I would like to particularly thank the editors of this entry for their work: Luca Ferrero (2020), and John Martin Fischer (2009, 2014). For additional feedback on the most recent revision (2020), I would like to thank: Vanessa Carr, Romy Jaster, Simon Kittle, and Barbara Vetter. I unfortunately do not have a comprehensive record of people who provided thoughts on earlier versions, but they include: John Bengson, Helen Steward, Kadri Vihvelin, and Ann Whittle. Thanks finally to the SEP Editors and Michael Nelson for their assistance.

Copyright © 2020 by
John Maier <john@jmaier.net>

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