Compatibilism

First published Mon Apr 26, 2004; substantive revision Tue Nov 26, 2019

Compatibilism offers a solution to the free will problem, which concerns a disputed incompatibility between free will and determinism. Compatibilism is the thesis that free will is compatible with determinism. Because free will is typically taken to be a necessary condition of moral responsibility, compatibilism is sometimes expressed as a thesis about the compatibility between moral responsibility and determinism.

1. Free Will and the Problem of Causal Determinism

Compatibilism emerges as a response to a problem posed by causal determinism. But what problem is that? Well, suppose, as the thesis of causal determinism tells us, that everything that occurs is the inevitable result of the laws of nature and the state of the world in the distant past. If this is the case, then everything human agents do flows from the laws of nature and the way the world was in the distant past. But if what we do is simply the consequence of the laws of nature and the state of the world in the distant past—then we cannot do anything other than what we ultimately do. Nor are we in any meaningful sense the ultimate causal source of our actions, since they have their causal origins in the laws of nature and the state of the world long ago. Determinism therefore seems to prevent human agents from having the freedom to do otherwise, and it also seems to prevent them from being the sources of their actions. If either of these is true, then it’s doubtful that human agents are free or responsible for their actions in any meaningful sense.

These lines of argument, which have been regimented in the work of Ginet (1966), van Inwagen (1975, 1983), Wisdom (1934), Mele (1995), and Pereboom (1995, 2001), among many others, present a real problem for those who are inclined to think that we are free and responsible for our choices and actions and that the natural world might operate as a deterministic system (or if not completely deterministic, one in which an indeterminism is merely stochastic noise that is causally irrelevant at the level of human agency). How to respond to such arguments? On the one hand, incompatibilists accept (some version of at least one of) these arguments and so insist that our self-conception as free and responsible agents would be seriously misguided if causal determinism turns out to be true. Some incompatibilists argue for these conclusions indirectly—first by arguing that determinism precludes freedom or control and then second by arguing that such freedom is necessary for moral responsibility. Other incompatibilists argue directly that causal determinism precludes moral responsibility.

Compatibilists, on the other hand, claim that these concerns miss the mark. Some compatibilists hold this because they think the truth of causal determinism would not undermine our freedom to do otherwise (Berofsky 1987, Campbell 1997, Vihvelin 2013, etc.). As a result, these compatibilists tell us, the truth of causal determinism poses no threat to our status as morally responsible agents (notice the enthymematic premise here: the freedom to do otherwise is sufficient for the kind of control an agent must possess to be morally responsible for her actions). Other compatibilists show less concern in rebutting the conclusion that the freedom to do otherwise is incompatible with determinism. Compatibilists of this stripe reject the idea that such freedom is necessary for meaningful forms of free will (e.g., Frankfurt 1969, 1971; Watson 1975, Dennett 1984)—the “varieties of free will worth wanting,” (Dennett 1984). And even more notably, some compatibilists simply deny that freedom of this sort is in any way connected to morally responsible agency (e.g., Fischer 1994, Fischer & Ravizza 1998, Scanlon 1998, Wallace 1994, Sartorio 2016). What we see here is not a unified front in the face of the incompatibilist challenge(s). Instead, compatibilists have been careful to identify the precise elements of incompatibilists’ arguments that they take to be erroneous, and then build their respective theories of freedom and responsibility with that in mind.

To help better situate compatibilist theories, we will now consider in more detail the arguments that incompatibilists have advanced on behalf of their own theories, since it is these arguments that have shaped the contours of compatibilist theories. As we mentioned above, the truth of causal determinism apparently poses a problem for freedom and responsibility in at least two ways. First, it might entail that no one has the freedom to do otherwise, which is a kind of power or control over one’s actions that many have regarded as necessary for moral responsibility. Second, it might entail that no one is the ultimate casual source of his or her actions. That our actions originate in our free will and not in forces outside of us also seems like a plausible condition on morally responsible agency. We take each of these potential threats in turn.

1.1 Determinism and Alternative Possibilities

A natural way to think of an agent’s control over her conduct at a moment in time is in terms of her ability to select among, or choose between, alternative courses of action. This picture of control stems from common features of our perspectives as practical deliberators settling on courses of action. If a person is choosing between voting for Clinton as opposed to Trump, it is plausible to assume that her freedom with regard to her voting consists, at least partially, in her ability to choose between these two alternatives. On this account, acting with free will requires alternative possibilities. A natural way to model this account of free will is in terms of an agent’s future as a garden of forking paths branching off from a single past. A locus of freely willed action arises when the present offers, from an agent’s (singular) past, more than one path into the future. On this model of human agency, then, when a person acts of her own free will, she could have acted otherwise.

This conception of free will immediately invites the thought that determinism might be a threat. For determinism, understood in the strict sense characterized above, tells us that, at any time, given the facts of the past and the laws of nature, only one future is possible. But according to the conception of human agency under consideration, a freely willing agent could have acted other than she did and, hence, that more than one future is possible.

Here is an incompatibilist argument that codifies the considerations set out above:

  1. Any agent, x, performs an act a of x’s own free will iff x has control over a.
  2. x has control over a only if x has the ability to select among alternative courses of action to act a.
  3. If x has the ability to select among alternative courses of action to act a, then there are alternative courses of action to act a open to x (i.e., x could have done otherwise than a).
  4. If determinism is true, then only one future is possible holding fixed the actual past and the laws of nature.
  5. If only one future is possible holding fixed the actual past and the laws of nature, then there are no alternative courses of action to any act open to x (i.e., x could not have done otherwise than she actually does).
  6. Therefore, if determinism is true, it is not the case that any agent, x, performs any act, a, of her own free will.

For ease of reference and discussion throughout this entry, let us simplify the above argument as follows:

  1. If someone acts of her own free will, then she could have done otherwise (A-C).
  2. If determinism is true, no one can do otherwise than one actually does (D-E).
  3. Therefore, if determinism is true, no one acts of her own free will (F).

Call this simplified argument the Classical Incompatibilist Argument. According to the argument, if determinism is true, no one has access to alternatives of the sort you might plausibly think to be required for free will.

1.2 Determinism and Sourcehood

There is a second conception of the sort of control that might be necessary for morally responsible agency. This conception starts with the observation that an agent’s control seems to consist in her playing a crucial role in the production of her actions. Think in terms of the transparent difference between those events that are products of one’s agency and those that are merely bodily happenings. For instance, consider the choice to pick up a cup of coffee as opposed to the event of one’s heart beating or one’s blood circulating. In the latter cases, one recognizes events happening to one; in the former, one is the source and producer of that happening. On this model of human agency, control is understood in terms of being the source of one’s actions.

Fixing just upon this conception of agency, how might determinism pose a threat to free will? If determinism is true, then what happened in the distant past, when combined with the laws of nature, is causally sufficient for the production of every human action. But if this is so, then, while it might be true that an agent herself is crucially involved in the production of her action, that action actually has its source in causal antecedent that originate outside of her. Hence, she, as an agent, is not the ultimate source of her actions.

What is meant here by an ultimate source, and not just a source? An agent is an ultimate source of her action only if, at the very least, something necessary for her action originates within the agent herself. It cannot be located in places and times prior to the agent’s freely willing her action. If an agent is not the ultimate source of her actions, then her actions do not originate in her, and if her actions are the outcomes of conditions guaranteeing them, how can she be said to control them? The conditions sufficient for their occurrence were already in place long before she even existed!

Here is an incompatibilist argument that codifies the considerations set out above:

  1. Any agent, x, performs an any act, a, of her own free will iff x has control over a.
  2. x has control over a only if x is the ultimate source of a.
  3. If x is the ultimate source of a, then some condition, b, necessary for a, originates with x.
  4. If any condition, b, originates with x, then there are no conditions sufficient for b independent of x.
  5. If determinism is true, then the facts of the past, in conjunction with the laws of nature, entail every truth about the future.
  6. If the facts of the past, in conjunction with the laws of nature, entail every truth about the future, then for any condition, b, necessary for any action, a, performed by any agent, x, there are conditions independent of x (in x’s remote past, before x’s birth) that are sufficient for b.
  7. If, for any condition, b, necessary for any action, a, performed by any agent, x, there are conditions independent of x that are sufficient for b, then no agent, x, is the ultimate source of any action, a. (This follows from C and D.)
  8. If determinism is true, then no agent, x, is the ultimate source of any action, a. (This follows from E, F, and G.)
  9. Therefore, if determinism is true, then no agent, x, performs any action, a, of her own free will. (This follows from A, B, and H.)

For ease of reference and discussion throughout this entry, let us simplify the above argument as follows:

  1. A person acts of her own free will only if she is its ultimate source (A-B).
  2. If determinism is true, no one is the ultimate source of her actions (C-H).
  3. Therefore, if determinism is true, no one acts of her own free will (I).

Call this simplified argument the Source Incompatibilist Argument. It is important to see that the demand for alternative possibilities is not (at least not obviously) relevant to this incompatibilist argument. Suppose that a putatively freely willing agent had access to the relevant sort of alternative possibilities. According to the Source Incompatibilist Argument, a further condition is that she must have been the ultimate source of her freely willed actions. That is, the sourcehood theorist denies that alternative possibilities are enough to guarantee freedom.

1.3 Compatibilists Replies

In response to these arguments, compatibilists have denied that freedom requires the ability to do otherwise; that causal determinism precludes the ability to do otherwise; and that freedom or control require sourcehood. [Compatibilists have only rarely denied Premise 2 of the Source Incompatibilist Argument (McKenna 2008 and perhaps Bjornsson & Persson 2012 are important exceptions.] But compatibilists’s denials of these premises have not been flatfooted. Instead they are grounded in attractive conceptions of human agency. So in what follows, we’ll turn to the details of such theories, and in so doing, uncover just how distinct compatibilist theories answer the incompatibilist arguments set out above.

2. Classical Compatibilism

Compatibilism’s place in contemporary philosophy has developed in at least three stages. The first stage involves the classical form of compatibilism, which was developed in the modern era by the empiricists Hobbes and Hume, and reinvigorated in the early part of the twentieth century. The second stage involves three distinct contributions in the 1960s, contributions that challenged many of the dialectical presuppositions driving classical compatibilism. The third stage involves various contemporary forms of compatibilism, forms that diverge from the classical variety and that emerged out of, or resonate with, at least one of the three contributions found in the second transitional stage. This section is devoted to the first stage, that of classical compatibilism.

2.1 Freedom According to Classical Compatibilism

According to one strand within classical compatibilism, freedom is nothing more than an agent’s ability to do what she wishes in the absence of impediments that would otherwise stand in her way. For instance, Hobbes offers an exemplary expression of classical compatibilism when he claims that a person’s freedom consists in his finding “no stop, in doing what he has the will, desire, or inclination to doe [sic]” (Leviathan, p.108). On this view, freedom involves two components, a positive and a negative one. The positive component (doing what one wills, desires, or inclines to do) consists in nothing more than what is involved in the power of agency. The negative component (finding “no stop”) consists in acting unencumbered or unimpeded. Typically, the classical compatibilists’ benchmark of impeded or encumbered action is compelled action. Compelled action arises when one is forced by some external source to act contrary to one’s will.

For the classical compatibilist, then, free will is an ability to do what one wants. It is therefore plausible to conclude that the truth of determinism does not entail that agents lack free will since it does not entail that agents never do what they wish to do, nor that agents are necessarily encumbered in acting. Compatibilism is thus vindicated.

But how convincing is the classical compatibilist account of free will? As it stands, it cries out for refinement. To cite just one shortcoming, various mental illnesses can cause a person to act as she wants and do so unencumbered; yet, intuitively, it would seem that she does not act of her own free will. For example, imagine a person suffering from a form of psychosis that causes full-fledged hallucinations. While hallucinating, she might “act as she wants unencumbered,” but she could hardly be said to be acting of her own free will. Consequently, the classical compatibilist owes us more. To see how it might be supplemented, we turn to a distinctively incompatibilist way of undermining classical compatibilism

2.2 The Classical Compatibilist Conditional Analysis

Consider the following incompatibilist objection to the classical compatibilist account of free will:

If determinism is true, and if at any given time, an unimpeded agent is completely determined to have the wants that she does have, and if those wants causally determine her actions, then, even though she does do what she wants to do, she cannot ever do otherwise. She satisfies the classical compatibilist conditions for free will. But free will requires the ability to do otherwise, and determinism is incompatible with this. Hence, the classical compatibilist account of free will is inadequate. Determinism is incompatible with free will and moral responsibility because determinism is incompatible with the ability to do otherwise.

The classical compatibilist account of freedom set out thus far can be thought of as accounting for one-way freedom, which fixes only on what a person does do, not on what alternatives she had to what she did. The incompatibilist challenge at issue here is that such freedom, even if necessary, is insufficient in the absence of a further freedom to do other than as one does.

Classical compatibilists have responded by arguing that determinism is compatible with the ability to do otherwise. To show this, they attempted to analyze an agent’s ability to do otherwise in conditional terms (e.g., Hume, Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, p.73; Ayer 1954; or Hobart 1934). Since determinism is a thesis about what must happen in the future given the actual past, determinism is consistent with the future being different given a different past. So the classical compatibilists analyzed any assertion that an agent could have done otherwise as a conditional assertion reporting what an agent would have done under certain counterfactual conditions. These conditions involved variations on what a freely willing agent wanted (chose, willed, or decided) to do at the time of her freely willed action. Suppose that an agent freely willed X. According to the classical compatibilist conditional analysis, to say that, at the time of acting, she could have done Y and not X is just to say that, had she wanted (chosen, willed, or decided) to do Y and not X at that time, then she would have done Y and not done X. Her ability to have done otherwise at the time at which she acted consisted in some such counterfactual truth.

But given that a determined agent is determined at the time of action to have the wants that she does have, how is it helpful to state what she would have done had she had different wants than the wants that she did have? Assuming the truth of determinism, at the time at which she acted she could have had no other wants than the wants that her causal history determined her to have.

In response, the classical compatibilist holds that that the conditional analysis brings into relief a rich picture of freedom. In assessing an agent’s action, the analysis accurately distinguishes those actions she would have performed if she wanted, from those actions she could not have performed even if she wanted. This, the classical compatibilist held, effectively distinguishes those alternative courses of action that were within the scope of the agent’s abilities at the time of action, from those courses of action that were not. This just is the distinction between what an agent was free to do and what she was not free to do. This is not at all a superficial freedom; it demarcates what persons have within their control from what falls outside that purview.

Despite the classical compatibilists’ ingenuity, their analysis of could have done otherwise failed decisively. The classical compatibilists wanted to show their incompatibilist interlocutors that when one asserted that a freely willing agent had alternatives available to her—that is, when it was asserted that she could have done otherwise—that assertion could be analyzed as a conditional statement, a statement that is perspicuously compatible with determinism. But as it turned out, the analysis was refuted when it was shown that the conditional statements sometimes yielded the improper result that a person was able to do otherwise even though it was clear that at the time the person acted, she had no such alternative and therefore was not able to do otherwise in the pertinent sense (Chisholm 1964, in Watson (ed.) 1982, pp.26–7; or van Inwagen 1983, pp. 114–9). Here is such an example:

Suppose that Danielle is psychologically incapable of wanting to touch a blond haired dog. Imagine that, on her sixteenth birthday, unaware of her condition, her father brings her two puppies to choose between, one being a blond haired Lab, the other a black haired Lab. He tells Danielle just to pick up whichever of the two she pleases and that he will return the other puppy to the pet store. Danielle happily, and unencumbered, does what she wants and picks up the black Lab.

When Danielle picked up the black Lab, was she able to pick up the blond Lab? It seems not. Picking up the blond Lab was an alternative that was not available to her. In this respect, she could not have done otherwise. Given her psychological condition, she cannot even form a want to touch a blond Lab, hence she could not pick one up. But notice that, if she wanted to pick up the blond Lab, then she would have done so. Of course, if she wanted to pick up the blond Lab, then she would not suffer from the very psychological disorder that causes her to be unable to pick up blond haired doggies. The classical compatibilist analysis of ‘could have done otherwise’ thus fails. According to the analysis, when Danielle picked up the black Lab, she was able to pick up the blonde Lab, even though, due to her psychological condition, she was not able to do so in the relevant respect. Hence, the analysis yields the wrong result.

So even if an unencumbered agent does what she wants, if she is determined, at least as the incompatibilist maintains, she could not have done otherwise. Since, as the objection goes, freedom of will requires freedom involving alternative possibilities, classical compatibilist freedom falls.

2.3 The Lasting Influence of the Conditional Analysis

The classical compatibilists failed to answer the Classical Incompatibilist Argument. What they attempted to do by way of the conditional analysis was deny the claim that if determinism is true, no one can do otherwise. But, given their failure, it was incumbent upon them to respond to the argument in some manner. It is only dialectically fair to acknowledge that determinism does pose a prima facie threat to free will when free will is understood as requiring the ability to do otherwise. The Classical Incompatibilist Argument is merely a codification of this natural thought. In light of the failure of the classical compatibilists’ conditional analysis, the burden of proof rests squarely on the compatibilists. How can the freedom to do otherwise be reconciled with determinism? As we’ll see below, contemporary compatibilists attempt to speak to this issue.

3. Compatibilism in Transition

In the 1960s, three major contributions to the free will debate radically altered it. One was an incompatibilist argument that put crisply the intuition that a determined agent lacks control over alternatives. This argument, first developed by Carl Ginet, came to be known as the Consequence Argument (Ginet 1966). Another contribution was Harry Frankfurt’s argument against the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP), a principle stating that an agent is morally responsible for what she does only if she can do otherwise (Frankfurt 1969). Finally, P.F. Strawson defended compatibilism by inviting both compatibilists and incompatibilists to attend more carefully to the central role of interpersonal relationships and the reactive attitudes in understanding the concept of moral responsibility (Strawson 1962). Each of these contributions changed dramatically the way that the free will problem is addressed in contemporary discussions. No account of free will, compatibilist or incompatibilist, is advanced today without taking into account at least one (if not more) of these three pieces.

3.1 The Consequence Argument

This argument invokes a compelling pattern of inference (one that is perhaps lurking in the background of the Classical Incompatibilist Argument) regarding claims about what is power necessary for a person. Power necessity, as applied to true propositions (or facts), concerns what is not within a person’s power. Or, put differently, it concerns facts that a person does not have power over. To say that a person does not have power over a fact is to say that she cannot act in such a way that the fact would not obtain. To illustrate, no person has power over the truths of mathematics. That is, no person can act in such a way that the truths of mathematics would be false. Hence, the truths of mathematics are, for any person, power necessities.

The intuitive pattern of inference applied to these claims is this. If a person has no power over a certain fact, and if she also has no power over the further fact that the original fact has some other fact as a consequence, then she also has no power over the consequent fact. Powerlessness, it seems, transfers from one fact to its consequences. For example, if poker-playing Diamond Jim, who is holding only two pairs, has no power over the fact that Calamity Sam draws a straight flush, and if a straight flush beats two pairs (and assuming Jim has no power to alter this fact), then it follows that Jim has no power over the fact that Sam’s hand beats Jim’s. This general pattern of inference is applied to the thesis of causal determinism to yield a powerful argument for incompatibilism. The argument requires the assumption that determinism is true, and that the facts of the past and the laws of nature are fixed. Given these assumptions, here is a rough, non-technical sketch of the argument:

  1. No one has power over the facts of the past and the laws of nature.
  2. No one has power over the fact that the facts of the past and the laws of nature entail every fact of the future (i.e., determinism is true).
  3. Therefore, no one has power over the facts of the future.

According to the Consequence Argument, if determinism is true, it appears that no person has any power to alter how her own future will unfold.

This argument shook compatibilists, and rightly so. The classical compatibilists’ failure to analyze statements of an agent’s abilities in terms of counterfactual conditionals left the compatibilists with no perspicuous retort to the crucial second premise of the Classical Incompatibilist Argument. And the Consequence Argument provides powerful support for this argument’s second premise. If, according to the Argument, determinism implies that the future will unfold in only one way given the past and the laws, and if no one has any power to alter its unfolding in that particular way, then it seems that no one can do other than she does.

It is fair to say that the Consequence Argument earned the incompatibilists an important dialectical advantage. Compatibilists owe us an account of what’s was wrong with the Consequence Argument, and perhaps also, some positive account of the ability to do otherwise. So even though many compatibilists are committed to thinking that the Consequence Argument is unsound, it nevertheless set the agenda for many contemporary compatibilist theories of free will and moral responsibility.

3.2 A Challenge to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities

One compatibilist strategy for responding to the Classical Incompatibilist Argument is to concede that perhaps the Consequence Argument provides us with good reason for thinking that determinism rules out the ability to do otherwise while maintaining that such an ability is not necessary for free will. In other words, the compatibilist might sidestep the issues raised by the Consequence Argument by directly attacking the first premise of the Classical Incompatibilist Argument, which states is if a person acts of her own free will, then she could have done otherwise. This compatibilist response rejects a conception of human agency that locates control in the ability to do otherwise. Alternatively, it seeks to ground an agent’s control over his action in other features of his or her agency. In “Alternate Possibilities and Moral Responsibility,” (1969) Harry Frankfurt powerfully develops an argument that gives compatibilists the resources to argue in just this way.

Frankfurt’s argument was directed against the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP):

PAP: A person is morally responsible for what she does do only if she can do otherwise.

Central to Frankfurt’s attack on PAP are a class of examples in which an agent is morally responsible for her conduct, but could not, at the time of the pertinent action, do otherwise. Here is a close approximation to the example Frankfurt presented in his original paper:

Jones has resolved to shoot Smith. Black has learned of Jones’s plan and wants Jones to shoot Smith. But Black would prefer that Jones shoot Smith on his own. However, concerned that Jones might waver in his resolve to shoot Smith, Black secretly arranges things so that, if Jones should show any sign at all that he will not shoot Smith (something Black has the resources to detect), Black will be able to manipulate Jones in such a way that Jones will shoot Smith. As things transpire, Jones follows through with his plans and shoots Smith for his own reasons. No one else in any way threatened or coerced Jones, offered Jones a bribe, or even suggested that he shoot Smith. Jones shot Smith under his own steam. Black never intervened.

In this example, Jones shot Smith on his own, and did so unencumbered — did so freely. But, given Black’s presence in the scenario, Jones could not have failed to shoot Smith (i.e., he could not have done otherwise). Hence, we have a counterexample to PAP.

If Frankfurt’s argument against PAP is sound, the free will debate has been systematically miscast through much of the history of philosophy. If determinism threatens free will and moral responsibility, it is not because it is incompatible with the ability to do otherwise. Even if determinism is incompatible with a sort of freedom involving the ability to do otherwise, it is not the kind of freedom required for moral responsibility.

Perhaps not surprisingly, an enormous (and intricate) literature has emerged around the success of Frankfurt’s argument and, in particular, around the example Frankfurt offered as contrary to PAP. The debate is very much alive, and no clear victor has emerged (in the way that the incompatibilists can rightly claim to have laid to rest the compatibilists’ conditional analysis strategy (see section 3.3)). Regardless, what is most relevant to this essay is that Frankfurt’s argument inspired many compatibilists to begin thinking about accounts of freedom or control that unabashedly turn away from alternative possibilities.

3.3 Focus upon the Reactive Attitudes

In “Freedom and Resentment” (1962), P.F. Strawson broke ranks with the classical compatibilists. Strawson developed three distinct arguments for compatibilism, arguments quite different from those the classical compatibilists endorsed. But more valuable than his arguments was his general theory of what moral responsibility is, and hence, what is at stake in arguing about it. Strawson held that both the incompatibilists and the compatibilists had misconstrued the nature of moral responsibility. Each disputant, Strawson suggested, advanced arguments in support of or against a distorted simulacrum of the real deal.

To understand moral responsibility properly, Strawson invited his reader to consider the reactive attitudes one has towards another when she recognizes in another’s conduct an attitude of ill will. The reactions that flow naturally from witnessing ill will are themselves attitudes that are directed at the perpetrator’s intentions or attitudes. When a perpetrator wrongs a person, she, the wronged party, typically has a personal reactive attitude of resentment. When the perpetrator wrongs another, some third party, the natural reactive attitude is moral indignation, which amounts to a “vicarious analogue” of resentment felt on behalf of the wronged party. When one is oneself the wronging party, reflecting upon or coming to realize the wrong done to another, the natural reactive attitude is guilt.

Strawson wanted contestants to the free will debate to see more clearly than they had that excusing a person — electing not to hold her blameworthy — involves more than some objective judgment that she did not do such and such, or did not intend so and so, and therefore does not merit some treatment or other. It involves a suspension or withdrawal of certain morally reactive attitudes, attitudes involving emotional responses. On Strawson’s view, what it is to hold a person morally responsible for wrong conduct is nothing more than the propensity towards, or the sustaining of, a moral reactive attitude like indignation. Crucially, the indignation is in response to the perceived attitude of ill will or culpable motive in the conduct of the person being held responsible. Hence, Strawson explains, posing the question of whether the entire framework of moral responsibility should be given up as irrational (if it were discovered that determinism is true) is tantamount to posing the question of whether persons in the interpersonal community — that is, in real life — should forswear having reactive attitudes towards persons who wrong others, and who sometimes do so intentionally. Strawson invites us to see that the morally reactive attitudes that are the constitutive basis of our moral responsibility practices, as well as the interpersonal relations and expectations that give structure to these attitudes, are deeply interwoven into human life. These attitudes, relations and expectations are so much an expression of natural, basic features of our social lives — of their emotional textures — that it is practically inconceivable to imagine how they could be given up.

4. Contemporary Compatibilism

Three major contributions in the 1960s profoundly altered the face of compatibilism: the incompatibilists’ Consequence Argument, Frankfurt’s attack on the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP), and Strawson’s focus upon the reactive attitudes. Every resultant compatibilist account in the contemporary literature is shaped in some way by at least one of these influences. This section will focus upon six of the most significant contemporary compatibilist positions. Those wishing to learn about cutting edge work can read the supplement on Compatibilism: The State of the Art.

4.1 Compatibilism about the Freedom to Do Otherwise

The Consequence Argument (section 4.1) makes a strong case for the incompatibility of determinism and the freedom to do otherwise. Assuming that determinism is true, it states that:

  1. No one has power over the facts of the past and the laws of nature.
  2. No one has power over the fact that the facts of the past and the laws of nature entail every fact of the future (i.e., determinism is true).
  3. Therefore, no one has power over the facts of the future.

Compatibilists who accept that alternative possibilities are necessary for moral responsibility must show what is wrong with this powerful argument. They also should offer some account of what John Martin Fischer (1994) has called regulative control—a form of control agents possess when they can bring about X and can refrain from bringing about X— that makes clear how it is possible even at a determined world. We will first consider three different compatibilist attempts to unseat the Consequence Argument. Then we will consider how some compatibilists, the so-called New Dispositionalists, explain regulative control, that is, how they might explain the freedom to do otherwise in a way that is compatible with causal determinism.

4.1.1 Challenging Power Necessity and the Past

Some compatibilists have argued against the first premise of the Consequence Argument by attempting to show that a person can act in such a way that the past would be different. Consider the difference between a person in the present who has the ability to act in such a way that she alters the past, as opposed to a person who has the ability to act in such a way such that, if she did so act, the past would have been different. Notice that the former ability is outlandish; it would require magical powers. But the latter ability is, at least by comparison, uncontroversial. It merely indicates that a person who acted a certain way at a certain time possessed abilities to act in various sorts of ways. Had she exercised one of those abilities, and thereby acted differently, then the past leading up to her action would have been different. To illustrate how comparatively mild such a claim about an agent’s ability and the past might be, think about a logically similar sort of claim that is simply about what would be required for an agent to act differently. For example, consider the claim, If I were dancing on the French Riviera right now, I’d be a lot richer than I am. Certainly this claim does not mean that if I go to the French Riviera to dance, I will thereby be made richer. It only means that were I to have gone there to tango, I would have to have had a lot more cash beforehand in order to finance my escapades. Some compatibilists (e.g., Saunders 1968; Perry 2010; Dorr 2016) have argued that incompatibilist defenders of the Consequence Argument rely upon the outlandish notion of ability in the first premise of their argument. But, these compatibilists maintain, the first premise is falsified when interpreted with a milder notion of ability.

4.1.2 Challenging Power Necessity and the Laws of Nature

Other compatibilists have argued against the first premise of the Consequence Argument in a parallel way by attempting to show that a person can act in such a way that a law of nature would not obtain. As with the distinction drawn regarding ability and the past, consider the difference between a person who has the ability to act in such a way that she violates a law of nature, as opposed to a person (at a deterministic world) who has the ability to act in such a way that, if she were to so act, some law of nature that does obtain would not. Notice that the former ability would require magical powers. According to the compatibilist, the latter, by contrast, would require nothing outlandish. It merely tells us that a person who acted a certain way at a certain time possessed abilities to act in various sorts of ways. Had she exercised one of those abilities, and thereby acted differently, then the laws of nature that would have entailed what she did in that hypothetical situation would be different from the actual laws of nature that did entail what she did actually do. This latter ability does not assume that agents are able to violate laws of nature; it just assumes that whatever the laws of nature are (at least at deterministic worlds), they must be such as to entail, given the past, what an agent will do. If an agent acts differently in some possible world than she acts in the actual world, then some other set of laws will be the ones that entail what she does in that world. Some compatibilists (most notably Lewis 1981, but see also Graham 2008 and Pendergraft 2011), fixing upon ability pertaining to the laws of nature, have argued that incompatibilist defenders of the Consequence Argument rely upon the outlandish notion of ability in the first premise of their argument. But, these compatibilists maintain, that first premise is falsified when interpreted with an uncontroversial notion of ability.

4.1.3 Challenging the Inferences Based upon Power Necessity

Michael Slote (1982) attempted to refute the Consequence Argument by showing that its central inference is invalid. The central point towards which Slote works is that notions like unavoidability (or power necessity) are sensitive to contexts in a way that only “selectively” permits the sort of inference at work in the Consequence Argument. Let us work with the idea of unavoidability. According to Slote, when we say that something is unavoidable for a person, we have in mind “selective” contexts in which the facts pertaining to the unavoidability have nothing to do with that person — the facts bypass that person’s agency altogether (Slote 1982, p.19). It is unavoidable for me, for instance, that Caesar crossed the Rubicon, or that most motor vehicles now run on gasoline. Nothing about my agency — about what I can do — can alter such facts. This suggests that unavoidability is misapplied when it concerns aspects of a person’s own agency. But notice that in the Consequence Argument unavoidability (or power necessity) trades between a context in which the notion is appropriately applied, and one in which, according to Slote, it is not. The first premise cites considerations that have nothing to do with a person’s agency — facts prior to her birth, and the laws of nature. It is claimed that these facts are unavoidable for a person, but from this a conclusion is drawn that the very actions a person performs are unavoidable for her. Yet this, Slote and other compatibilists (such as Dennett 1984a; McKay & Johnson 1996) have suggested, is to draw incompatibilist conclusions illicitly from reasonable claims regarding unavoidability.

4.1.4 Accounting for the Freedom to Do Otherwise

Even if some compatibilist reply proves that the Consequence Argument is unsound, this alone would not amount to a positive argument for compatibilism. It would merely mean that one key argument for the incompatibility of determinism and regulative control is untenable. But that is consistent with the incompatibility of determinism and regulative control. Indeed, some argue for this incompatibility without relying upon the potentially problematic assumptions about power necessity at work in the Consequence Argument (Fischer 1994; and Ginet 1990, 2003). Furthermore, even if the compatibilist could discredit all current arguments for the incompatibility of determinism and regulative control, it still behooves her to offer a positive argument demonstrating the compatibility of determinism and regulative control. Compatibilists wishing to defend regulative control, such Berofsky (1987, 1995, 2012), Campbell (1997), Nelkin (2011), and Vihvelin (2013), still have their work cut out for them.

4.1.5 The New Dispositionalism

Recently several compatibilists have offered a positive account of regulative control (e.g., Fara 2008; M. Smith 2003; and Vihvelin 2004, 2013). Call the view these compatibilists advance, the new dispositionalism.

In advancing a compatibilist thesis, Vihvelin speaks of the ability to do otherwise (and especially choose otherwise) in terms of a bundle of dispositions (2004, p. 429). Likewise, Fara proposes a dispositional analysis of the ability to do otherwise. And Smith speaks of the rational capacities to believe and desire otherwise (and so, presumably, do otherwise) in terms of a “raft of possibilities” (2003, p.27). For Fara, Vihvelin, and Smith, we assess claims about the disposition constitutive of the ability to do otherwise, or the dispositions in the bundle, or the possibilities in the raft, by attending to the intrinsic properties of an agent in virtue of which she acts when she tries (Fara 2008, p.861), or the causal bases of the pertinent dispositions (Vihvelin 2004, p. 436), or the underlying structure of a rational capacity (Smith, p. 29). How so? Fara does not say, though it seems likely he would agree to something like the proposals offered by Vihvelin and Smith. According to them, we hold fixed the relevant causal base or underlying structure of an agent’s disposition to, say, wave hello to a friend, or tell the truth under interrogation, and we consider various counterfactual conditions in which that causal base or underlying structure operates unimpaired. Does the agent in an appropriately rich range of such counterfactual conditions wave hello or tell the truth? If she does, then even if in the actual world she does not wave hello or tell the truth, she was able to do so. She had at the time of action the pertinent agential abilities or capacities. And this is true even if that world is determined (see, e.g., Vihvelin 2004, 437). Why? Because there is no basis for contending that when we test the relevant dispositions at other possible worlds, we have to restrict the worlds to ones in which we hold fixed the past and the laws. Note how the problems with the classical compatibilists’ counterfactual analysis are circumvented. If we are attending to the causal base of the relevant dispositions, we can easily see how Danielle’s relevant causal base is ill-equipped for picking up blond haired dogs.

The new dispositionalism clearly improves upon classical compatibilism. But how does the it fare in its own right? Do we have here a compelling positive account of the ability—and so the freedom—to do otherwise that is compatible with determinism? One slippery matter has to do with the way the relevant worlds are identified in the preceding paragraph. We have to restrict our attention to possible worlds in which the causal base of, or underlying structure for, the ability operates unimpaired. Some will claim that this restriction is not dialectically innocent. Consider a Frankfurt example (section 4.2). Suppose Jones freely shoots Smith, but if he were about to do otherwise, Black would cause Jones to do so against his (Jones’s) will. When Jones shoots Smith on his own, he does so freely and is morally responsible, despite the fact that, due to Black’s presence, he was not free to do otherwise. Fara (2008, pp.854–5), Nelkin (2012), Smith (2003, p. 19), and Vihvelin (2000, 2004, pp.445–8, 2013) say otherwise. They say Jones could have done otherwise, was able to do otherwise, and was free to do otherwise when he shot Smith on his own. Why? Roughly, because if we fix on the underlying causal structure implicated in Smith’s shooting Jones on his own, and if we go only to other worlds in which that causal structure operates unimpeded, we will rule out worlds in which the counterfactual intervener Black is at play. Then we will be able to specify a range of true counterfactuals in which an agent had some reason, for instance, to do otherwise, and she did otherwise. The delicate question here, one which we will not attempt to resolve, is whether in accounting for the freedom to do otherwise the new dispositionalists are entitled to restrict attention only to worlds in which the relevant casual base operates unimpeded.

Other compatibilists, most notably, John Martin Fischer (1994), and Fischer and Mark Ravizza (1998) (see section 5.5 below), have appealed to similar restrictions. But in doing so, they only mean to explain the nature of the freedom or control exhibited in how the agent did act—that is, what Fischer has termed her guidance control. In striking contrast to how the new dispositionalists reason, they do not think they are thereby entitled to claim that an agent in a Frankfurt example is free to do otherwise. So it is possible that what the new dispositionalists have identified with the pertinent counterfactuals they fix upon is not the freedom to do otherwise, but instead, a freedom located in what an agent does do (which is a matter of guidance control, not regulative control). This, at least, is how compatibilists like Fischer and Ravizza would reason. [For a lively debate over just this issue, see the exchange between Fischer (2008) and Vihvelin (2008).]

4.2 Hierarchical Compatibilism

On the back of his rejection of the Principle of Alternative Possibilities, Harry Frankfurt (1971) developed a compatibilist theory that does not appeal to regulative control in any way. Frankfurt’s hierarchical mesh theory can instead be seen as a development of classical compatibilist attempts to understand freedom in terms of an agent’s unencumbered ability to get what she wants (see Section 3.1.). More precisely, Frankfurt explains freely willed action in terms of actions that issue from desires that suitably mesh with hierarchically ordered elements of a person’s psychology. The key idea is that a person who acts of her own free will acts from desires that are nested within more encompassing elements of her self. On this view, when a freely willing agent acts, her actions emanate from her rather than from something foreign.

4.2.1 Higher-Order Desires and Free Will

Frankfurt distinguishes between first-order and second-order desires. This serves as the basis for his hierarchical account of freedom. The former desires have as their objects actions, such as eating a slice of cheesecake, taking in a movie, or gyrating one’s hips to the sweet sounds of B. B. King. The latter are desires about desires. They have as their objects, desires of the first-order, such as the desire to have the motivation to exercise daily (something that, regrettably, too many of us lack): “If only I wanted to go to the gym today, then it would be easy for me to get my tail off this couch!”

Amongst the first-order desires that a person has, some are ones that do not move her to action, such as one’s (unsatisfied) desire to say to her boss what she knows that she should not. Other first-order desires, however, do move a person to action, such as one’s (satisfied) desire to follow through on her boss’s request. Frankfurt identifies an agent’s will with her effective first-order desire, the one moving a person, as Frankfurt puts it, “all the way to action” (1971, p. 84).

Frankfurt also distinguishes between different sorts of second-order desires. Some are merely desires to have first-order desires, but not that those first-order desires would comprise her will. Frankfurt uses the example of a psychotherapist who wishes to experience a desire for narcotics so as to understand a patient better. The therapist has no wish that this desire be effective in leading her to action (1971, pp.84–5). She wants to know what it is like to feel the craving for the drug; she has no wish to take it. On the other hand, other second-order desires that a person has are desires for effective first-order desires, desires that would comprise her will, and would thereby be effective in moving her all the way to action. For instance, the dieter who is constantly frustrated by her sugar cravings might desire a more effective desire for health, one that would be more effective in guiding her eating habits than it often is. These second-order desires Frankfurt calls second-order volitions. There is no theoretical limit to how highly-ordered one’s desires might be. The dieter in the above example might develop a third-order desire for her second-order desire (regarding her desire for health) not to play such a dominant role in her daily deliberations. Other things, she might reason, are of more importance in life than concerning herself with her dietary motivations.

Once this conceptual apparatus is in place, Frankfurt contrasts different sorts of addicts to illustrate his concept of free will. Consider first the unwilling addict, who is someone that has both a first-order desire to take the drug, and a first-order desire not to take the drug. Crucially, however, the unwilling addict also has a second-order volition that her first-order desire to take the drug not be her will. This is the basis for her unwillingness. Regrettably, her irresistible addictive desire to take the drug constitutes her will. Next, consider the case of the willing addict. The willing addict, like the unwilling addict, has conflicting first-order desires as regards taking the drug to which she is addicted. But the willing addict, by way of a second-order volition, embraces her addictive first-order desire to take the drug. She wants to be as she is and act as she does.

It is now easy to illustrate Frankfurt’s hierarchical theory of free will. The unwilling addict does not take the drug of her own free will since her will conflicts at a higher level with what she wishes it to be. The willing addict, however, takes the drug of her own free will since her will meshes with what she wishes it to be. Frankurt’s theory can now be set out as follows:

One acts of her own free will if and only if her action issues from the will she wants.

It might seem strange that Frankfurt’s willing addict acts of her own free will since, due to her addiction, she could not do otherwise. But recall that Frankfurt does not believe that freedom involving alternative possibilities is required for moral responsibility. Frankfurt instead believes that the freedom pertinent to moral responsibility concerns what an agent does do and her actual basis for doing it. That is, Frankfurt believes that it is, to again return to Fischer’s helpful distinction, guidance control that is necessary for moral responsibility, not regulative control. The willing addict possesses the sort of freedom required for moral responsibility because the will leading to her action is the one that she wishes it to be; she acts with guidance control.

4.2.2 Two Problems for a Hierarchical Theory

Frankfurt’s hierarchical theory has faced intense scrutiny. Here we consider two objections that emerge from structural aspects of it. One has to do with its hierarchical nature. The other has to do with its relying exclusively upon a mesh between different features of an agent’s psychology. (For a discussion of Frankfurt’s attempts to respond to these problems, see section A of the supplement, Compatibilism: The State of the Art.)

Consider the hierarchical problem. According to Frankfurt, a person facing a problem with regard to her will’s freedom faces a situation in which she is conflicted about one (or more) of her first-order desires. Which desire “speaks for” the agent? With which desire can she be identified? To resolve conflicts between first-order desires (or between an agent’s attitudes about a specific first-order desire), Frankfurt tells us that a person forms a second-order desire that has as its object the first-order desire(s) she wants to move her to action. By this means, an agent endorses or identifies with one of the first-order desires and, if all goes smoothly, that one becomes her will. Through this process, she draws within the sphere of her self one sort of desire and alienates another. But here, a problem arises. A person cannot be identified with her first-order desires because she can be alienated from them. Yet she can also be alienated from second, or even at higher-orders (Watson 1975). After all, she might find herself both wanting that some specific first-order desire be her will and horrified at the thought (i.e., not want it to be the case that that particular first-order desire be her will). Hence, the problem of an agent’s free will can reappear at these ever ascending stages. If this is correct, Frankfurt’s view is incomplete. Maybe his account of free will does articulate a necessary condition for acting of one’s own free will, but it appears not to be sufficient. It needs supplementing so as to avoid the problem of a spiraling reoccurrence of challenges to an agent’s freedom.

Next consider the mesh problem. According to Frankfurt, if freely willed action for which an agent is morally responsible wholly depends on the relation between an agent’s will and her second-order volitions, then it does not matter in any way how an agent came to have that particular mesh. But cases can be constructed that seem to suggest that it does matter how an agent came to have a particular mesh between her first-order and her second-order desires. (For example, see Slote 1980; and Fischer & Ravizza 1998, pp. 194–206). Using Frankfurt’s own example of the willing addict, suppose that the addict’s second-order willingness is itself caused by the effects of the drug use. Suppose that the drug use has impaired her evaluations or preferences arising at a second-order of reflection on her own mental states. Or, setting this sort of case aside, imagine that an agent is brainwashed or manipulated through some means or another, say by hypnosis, or by aliens zapping a person into having a different set of psychological preferences than those that she would otherwise have. In all of these cases—just call them manipulation cases—Frankfurt seems committed to the view that such agents act of their own free will and are morally responsible so long as the appropriate psychological mesh is in place, no matter what sort of (merely apparent) freedom and responsibility-undermining history gave way to an agent’s having that particular mesh.

This highlights the real difficulty Frankfurt’s view faces in light of the Source Incompatibilist Argument. Since Frankfurt holds that what matters for moral responsibility is the relationship between an agent’s effective first-order desire and her second-order volition, and not the source of those respective desires, he is committed to thinking that even if the desires are implanted by some alien force, the agent can still be responsible for acting on them. But many have found it dubious that an agent could be responsible for an action that flows from motives that can be traced back to forces outside of the agent. In response, Frankfurt must show that being the source of one’s motives is not needed for moral responsibility. If he cannot, then it seems that the source incompatibilist has the upper hand. She can straightforwardly argue that, if one sort alien causal history that gives rise to the Frankfurtian mesh undermines agents’ freedom and responsibility, then why wouldn’t a deterministic history do the same?

4.3 The Reason View

In Freedom within Reason (1990), as well as in several provocative papers (1980, 1987), Susan Wolf develops a theory of free will and moral responsibility that highlights a mesh between an agent’s action and what she (correctly) regards as valuable. For Wolf, free will concerns an agent’s ability to act in accord with the True and the Good. Unlike Frankfurt’s, the conditions of Wolf’s mesh theory require an anchor external to the agent’s internal psychological states (the True and the Good). The crucial question for Wolf concerns whether an agent able to act upon moral reasons. Hence, Wolf embraces the title, The Reason View. A related, though importantly different version of the Reason View has more recently been defended by Nelkin (2011).

In her effort to make free will track moral reasons, Wolf (and later Nelkin) develops a surprising asymmetry thesis according to which praiseworthy conduct does not require the freedom to do otherwise but blameworthy behavior does (1980; and 1990, pp.79–81). Put in terms of guidance and regulative control, only blameworthy conduct requires regulative control. Guidance control is sufficient for praiseworthy conduct. Wolf’s reasoning is that, if an agent does act in accord with the True and the Good, and if indeed she is so psychologically determined that she cannot but act in accord with the True and the Good, her inability to act otherwise does not threaten the sort of freedom that morally responsible agents need. For how could her freedom be in any way enhanced simply by adding an ability to act irrationally? But blameworthy behavior, Wolf reasons, does require regulative control since, if an agent acts contrary to the True and the Good, but is so psychologically determined that she cannot act in accord with it, then, being unable to act as reason requires, it would be unreasonable to blame her.

Because Wolf’s asymmetrical view requires regulative control in the case of blameworthy actions, her compatibilism is open to refutation by incompatibilist arguments designed to show that determinism is incompatible with freedom involving alternative possibilities. As a result, Wolf argues that physical determination does not entail psychological determination. She then argues that physical determination is consistent with the ability to do otherwise because the relevant ability is one that only requires the falsity of psychological determinism, which is a thesis she takes to have no support. (Interestingly, this means that although Wolf is a compatibilist about blameworthiness and physical determinism, she is an incompatibilist about blameworthiness and psychological determinsim.)

What about the Source Incompatibilist Argument? On Wolf’s view, if an agent does act from reasons, and if her reasons are (or are susceptible to) the True and the Good, then she as an agent is a source of conduct that carries with it (or is able to carry with it) the stamp of moral reason. Enough said. But what about the Source Incompatibilist Argument, and the premise concerning ultimacy that seems to plague most every brand of compatibilism: A person acts of her own free will only if she is its ultimate source? Like Frankfurt’s mesh theory, Wolf’s too is endangered by the thought that an agent could be artificially manipulated in a responsibility-undermining manner into satisfying the mesh Wolf’s theory demands. And mightn’t such manipulation be no different than the manner in which a deterministic world shapes an agent to have the psychological structure and motives she has? Does not the prospect of manipulation cases show that without ultimacy, an agent cannot be the proper source of her action? So it appears that Wolf is at the same crossroads as is Frankfurt. Either she must show what is defective in the manipulation cases so as to distinguish agents so manipulated from the sort of proper mesh demanded by her theory, or she must bite the same bullet and accept that these sorts of manipulated agents, by the conditions of her theory, do act of their own free wills and are morally responsible for their conduct.

4.4 Reasons-Responsive Compatibilism

Several compatibilists have suggested that freely willed actions issue from volitional features of agency that are sensitive to an appropriate range of reasons (see Dennett 1984a; Fingarette 1972; Gert & Duggan 1979; Glover 1970; MacIntyre 1957; Neely 1974; and Nozick 1981). Agents who are unresponsive to appropriate rational considerations (such as compulsives or neurotics) do not act of their own free wills. But agents who are responsive to some range of rational considerations do. This view has been artfully refined in recent years by Fischer (1987, 1994), and subsequently, Fischer and Ravizza (1998). (For a more advanced discussion of Fischer and Ravizza’s view, which many regard as the gold standard for contemporary compatibilism, see section B of the supplement Compatibilism: The State of the Art.)

A reasons-responsiveness theory turns upon dispositional features of an agent’s relation to reasons issuing in freely willed action. Appropriately reasons-responsive conduct is sensitive to rational considerations. Importantly, the view is not merely that an agent would display herself in some counterfactual situations to be responsive to reasons, but rather that her responsiveness to reasons in some counterfactual situations is evidence that her actual conduct itself — the causes giving rise to it — is also in response to rational considerations. (Amendments need to be added to accommodate cases of spur-of-the-moment, or impulsive freely willed action).

4.4.1 Agent-Based Reasons-Responsiveness

The most natural way to understand a reasons-responsive theory is in terms of an agent’s responsiveness to reasons. To illustrate, suppose that Frank Zappa plays the banjo of his own free will. According to a reasons-responsive theory, his playing the banjo freely at that time requires that if, in at least some hypothetical cases, he had reason not to, then he would refrain from playing the banjo. For instance, if Jimi Hendrix were to have stepped into Frank’s recording studio and asked Frank to play his electric guitar, Frank would have wanted to make Jimi happy and thus would have gladly put his banjo aside and picked up his electric guitar. It seems, then, that for Frank to play the banjo of his own free will, Frank — the agent — must have regulative control and not merely guidance control over his playing. His freedom must consist partially in his ability to act upon alternatives.

4.4.2 A Tension between Reasons-Responsiveness and Frankfurt Examples

Notice that, because Frankfurt examples challenge the incompatibilists’ demand for regulative control, they also challenge an agent-based reasons-responsive theory (Fischer & Ravizza 1998, pp. 34–41). Imagine that the benevolent demon Jerry Garcia wants Frank to play the banjo at the relevant time. Jerry would much prefer that Frank play the banjo on his own. But worried that Frank might elect not to play the banjo, Jerry covertly arranges things so as to manipulate Frank if the need arises. If Frank should show any indication that he will not play the banjo, Jerry will manipulate Frank so that Frank will play the banjo. Hence, when Frank does play the banjo uninfluenced by Jerry’s possible intervention, he does so of his own free will. But he has neither regulative control, nor does he seem to be reasons-responsive, with respect to his banjo playing. Due to Jerry’s presence, he cannot but play the banjo even if Jimi Hendrix were to ask Frank to play his guitar.

To alleviate the tension between a reasons-responsive theory and Frankfurt examples, Fischer argued that reasons-responsive compatibilism can be cast in such a way that it involves only guidance control. Consider the example with Frank, Jimi, and Jerry. Frank did not have regulative control over his playing the banjo since Jerry’s presence ensured that Frank play the banjo even if Jimi were to ask Frank to play his guitar. The scenario in which Jimi asks Frank not to play his banjo is one that Frank normally would find to be a compelling reason to refrain from his banjo playing. Hence, by his own lights, Frank would find Jimi’s request compelling. Yet, due to Jerry’s presence, Frank is not responsive to such a weighty reason. What would be required to illustrate responsiveness would be to subtract Jerry from the scenario. This would do the trick. So suppose that Frank plays the banjo of his own free will, even with Jerry passively standing by. How can it be shown that Frank’s conduct was, in some manner, reasons-responsive? How can it be shown that what he actually did was in response to a reason? Well, if Jimi Hendrix had asked Frank not to play the banjo but the guitar instead, and if Jerry’s presence were to be subtracted from the situation, then Frank would respond to Jimi’s request and play the guitar and not the banjo. This suggests that Frank does play the banjo of his own free will even in the actual situation in which Jerry is passively standing by.

4.4.3 A Mechanism-Based Reasons-Responsive Theory

Illustrating reasons-responsiveness in a Frankfurt example seems to require recognizing counterfactual conditions in which an agent acts otherwise in response to reasons. But in a Frankfurt example, one has to subtract from those conditions the presence of the ensuring conditions (the counterfactual intervener) designed to guarantee that the agent not act otherwise. How can this move be legitimate? How is it not just an arbitrary addendum to cram together two compatibilist themes that otherwise appear to be at odds (reasons-responsiveness and Frankfurt examples)? It is not arbitrary, and here is why. Think about what happens in the actual scenario of a Frankfurt example. As things unfold, the demon is inactive. The agent acts for her own reasons. But now, focusing solely on what the agent does in this actual scenario, and the reasons that give her a basis for doing what she does, consider what deliberative features of her agency played the causal role in the actual sequence of events bringing about her action. So, just fix upon whatever constitutes that narrower range of agential characteristics within the wider spectrum of all of the features that made up Frank Zappa, the agent. Since it is only that narrower spectrum that we propose to identify with the causal production of Frank’s conduct, just call it the mechanism that produces his action.

Once we have located the mechanism of action that is at work in the actual causal sequence of a Frankfurt example, we can turn our attention to understanding the dispositional features of it as a casual mechanism. If other reasons bear upon it, then it would be sensitive to some of those reasons. It would produce different conduct in some reasonable range of cases. If it would, then that very mechanism is responsive to reasons. Confirming that that very mechanism is responsive to reasons would not merely illustrate that, in scenarios other than the actual, the agent acts upon a mechanism sensitive to reasons. It would also illustrate that in the Frankfurt scenario in which the agent really does act, what does play a role in the actual causal sequence of her action is some feature of her agency (a mechanism) that itself is in fact a response to a reason.

Fischer offers an actual-sequence, mechanism-based, reasons-responsive analysis of guidance control. He maintains that his analysis of guidance control is compatible with determinism. According to Fischer, an agent, and the mechanism of her action, can be entirely determined in the actual sequence of events in which she acts. Yet the actual manner in which her mechanism responds to reasons could be appropriately sensitive to reasons such that, if different reasons were to bear upon it, it would respond differently, and the agent whose mechanism it is would act differently than she does act.

Recently, however, Carolina Sartorio (2016) has argued that actual-sequence compatibilist do not need to appeal to mechanisms in order to vindicate their theories. According to Sartorio, we can explain Frank’s responsibility by appeal to the actual causes of his behavior, which are, she claims, much richer than has previously been realized. Not only is his behavior caused by his sensitive to reasons there are, on Sartorio’s view, it is also caused by the absence of other reasons (in this case, e.g., the absence of Jimi’s request is itself a cause in the actual-sequence).

4.4.4 Assessing Reasons-Responsive Compatibilism

Fischer’s reasons-responsiveness compatibilist starts by rejecting the key premise of the Classical Incompatibilist Argument, in that it rejects the thesis that freedom of the sort required for moral responsibility requires the ability to do otherwise. But how does Fischer’s view stack up against the Source Incompatibilist Argument? The challenge Fischer faces here, which is pushed forcefully by Pereboom (2001) and Mele (2019), is the same as that faced by Frankfurt and Wolf. The source incompatibilist maintains that it is a necessary condition of free will that one be an ultimate source of her action, and determinism is incompatible with one’s being an ultimate source of her action. The compatibilist’s task is to show that her treatment of the source of an agent’s conduct is sufficient for free will. But the source incompatibilist will point to manipulation cases that suggest that some causal histories giving rise to compatibilist-friendly psychological structures, such as reasons-responsive mechanisms, are freedom and responsibility undermining. If so, then why is determinism any different from a manipulation case? The burden, it seems, is on the compatibilist to show how it is that manipulation cases differ from a normal deterministic history. The compatibilist’s only other strategy is simply to deny that the pertinent manipulated agents are not free and morally responsible. This problem is not lost on reasons-responsiveness compatibilists, of course (see Fischer 2004 for one attempt to address these issues).

4.5 Strawsonian Compatibilism

Finally, let’s consider views inspired by Strawson’s compatibilism.

Several contemporary philosophers have advanced Strawsonian themes. For example, Gary Watson (1987) sought to elaborate these themes by thinking of our moral responsibility practices, and in particular the morally reactive attitudes, along the lines of a communication-based theory in which a morally responsible agent’s competence turns in some way upon being a potential interlocutor to moral conversations between her and the moral community in which she operates. On this view, the control condition for moral responsibility would have to fit the capacity to communicate morally through word and deed with members of the moral community.

In a somewhat different development of Strawson’s thought, John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza hold that an account of guidance control aids in providing the conditions of application for the concept of moral responsibility, a concept that they maintain is Strawsonian (1998, pp.1–27). Fischer and Ravizza intend their Strawsonian theory as an amendment to Strawson’s suggestion that moral responsibility is to be associated with the reactions of those within the moral community to members of the community. They advise that moral responsibility be developed by thinking in terms of the propriety conditions for the morally reactive attitudes.

Susan Wolf defends (with significant reservations) the Strawsonian thesis that the interpersonal viewpoint (that permits access to the morally reactive attitudes) is one that a freely willing agent cannot give up (1981). Wolf diverges at points with Strawson’s own manner of defending this. But Wolf’s central thesis is Strawsonian. A person cannot fully forswear the point of view of the interpersonal attitudes, and this point of view is the point of view from whence our morally reactive attitudes gain their force and figure in our conduct. (Related defenses of the Strawsonian thesis are also found in Shabo (2012) and Coates (2018))

Paul Russell (1995) has also defended a form of Strawsonian compatibilism, the central features of which he finds anticipated in Hume’s writings on free will and moral responsibility. According to Russell, we can learn from Hume, as Strawson did, to understand our moral responsibility practices as fundamentally a matter of our sentiments and our social expectations as structured and sustained by these sentiments. Fixing on our moral natures, as we should, dispels any presumption that determinism would somehow pose a threat to our conceptions of freedom and moral responsibility.

R. Jay Wallace (1994) offers an extension of Strawson’s general strategy in terms of moral norms of fairness for holding responsible reflected in our moral responsibility practices (1994, pp.103–9). From these moral norms—and not from the mere naturalistic facts that we have these practices—Wallace proceeds to uncover the conditions required for being responsible. Wallace’s position has emerged as a serious alternative to the sorts of approaches to the free will problem that take as their theoretical starting point the nature of persons, or the action-theoretic characteristics of the process issuing in freely willed action.

And finally, perhaps the most detailed recent defense of Strawsonian compatibilism is due to David Shoemaker (2017). Shoemaker argues for a response-dependent account of moral responsibility first by defending a response-dependent account of amusement. He then argues the norms of humor are tightly parallel to those of responsibility-entailing emotions like anger. And from there, he builds his response-dependent account of moral responsibility.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

For helpful editorial and philosophical advice on an earlier version of this entry, Michael McKenna would like to thank Carl Ginet, Ish Haji, Robert Kane, Sean McKeever, Al Mele, Jason Miller, Derk Pereboom, Paul Russell, Edward Zalta, and two subject editors of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, John Fischer and J. David Velleman.

Copyright © 2019 by
Michael McKenna <msmckenna@u.arizona.edu>
D. Justin Coates <djcoates@uh.edu>

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